Abstract Objects

First published Thu Jul 19, 2001; substantive revision Mon Feb 13, 2017

It is widely supposed that every entity falls into one of two categories: Some are concrete; the rest abstract. The distinction is supposed to be of fundamental significance for metaphysics and epistemology. This article surveys a number of recent attempts to say how it should be drawn.

1. Introduction

The abstract/concrete distinction has a curious status in contemporary philosophy. It is widely agreed that the distinction is of fundamental importance. And yet there is no standard account of how it should be drawn. There is a great deal of agreement about how to classify certain paradigm cases. Thus it is universally acknowledged that numbers and the other objects of pure mathematics are abstract (if they exist), whereas rocks and trees and human beings are concrete. Some clear cases of abstracta are classes, propositions, concepts, the letter ‘A’, and Dante’s Inferno. Some clear cases of concreta are stars, protons, electromagnetic fields, the chalk tokens of the letter ‘A’ written on a certain blackboard, and James Joyce’s copy of Dante’s Inferno.

The challenge is to say what underlies this dichotomy, either by defining the terms explicitly, or by embedding them in a theory that makes their connections to other important categories more explicit. In the absence of such an account, the philosophical significance of the contrast remains uncertain. We may know how to classify things as abstract or concrete by appeal to intuition. But in the absence of theoretical articulation, it will be hard to know what (if anything) hangs on the classification.

It should be stressed that there need not be one single “correct” way of explaining the abstract/concrete distinction. Any plausible account will classify the paradigm cases in the standard way, and any interesting account will draw a clear and philosophically significant line in the domain of objects. Yet there may be many equally interesting ways of accomplishing these two goals, and if we find ourselves with two or more accounts that do the job rather well, there will be no point in asking which corresponds to the real abstract/concrete distinction. This illustrates a general point: when technical terminology is introduced in philosophy by means of examples but without explicit definition or theoretical elaboration, the resulting vocabulary is often vague or indeterminate in reference. In such cases, it is normally pointless to seek a single correct account. A philosopher may find himself asking questions like, ‘What $$is$$ idealism?’ or ‘What $$is$$ a substance?’ and treating these questions as difficult questions about the underlying nature of a certain determinate philosophical category. A better approach is to recognize that in many cases of this sort, we simply have not made up our minds about how the term is to be understood, and that what we seek is not a precise account of what this term already means, but rather a proposal for how it might fruitfully be used in the future. Anyone who believes that something in the vicinity of the abstract/concrete distinction matters for philosophy would be well advised to approach the project of explaining the distinction with this in mind.

2. Historical Remarks

The contemporary distinction between abstract and concrete is not an ancient one. Indeed, there is a strong case for the view that despite occasional anticipations, it played no significant role in philosophy before the 20th century. The modern distinction bears some resemblance to Plato’s distinction between Forms and Sensibles. But Plato’s Forms were supposed to be causes par excellence, whereas abstract objects are generally supposed to be causally inert in every sense. The original ‘abstract’/‘concrete’ distinction was a distinction among words or terms. Traditional grammar distinguishes the abstract noun ‘whiteness’ from the concrete noun ‘white’ without implying that this linguistic contrast corresponds to a metaphysical distinction in what these words stand for. In the 17th century this grammatical distinction was transposed to the domain of ideas. Locke speaks of the general idea of a triangle which is “neither Oblique nor Rectangle, neither Equilateral, Equicrural nor Scalenon [Scalene]; but all and none of these at once,” remarking that even this idea is not among the most “abstract, comprehensive and difficult” (Essay IV.vii.9). Locke’s conception of an abstract idea as one that is formed from concrete ideas by the omission of distinguishing detail was immediately rejected by Berkeley and then by Hume. But even for Locke there was no suggestion that the distinction between abstract ideas and concrete or particular ideas corresponds to a distinction among objects. “It is plain, …” Locke writes, “that General and Universal, belong not to the real existence of things; but are Inventions and Creatures of the Understanding, made by it for its own use, and concern only signs, whether Words or Ideas” (III.iii.11).

The abstract/concrete distinction in its modern form is meant to mark a line in the domain of objects or entities. So conceived, the distinction becomes a central focus for philosophical discussion only in the 20th century. The origins of this development are obscure, but one crucial factor appears to have been the breakdown of the allegedly exhaustive distinction between the mental and the material that had formed the main division for ontologically minded philosophers since Descartes. One signal event in this development is Frege’s insistence that the objectivity and aprioricity of the truths of mathematics entail that numbers are neither material beings nor ideas in the mind. If numbers were material things (or properties of material things), the laws of arithmetic would have the status of empirical generalizations. If numbers were ideas in the mind, then the same difficulty would arise, as would countless others. (Whose mind contains the number 17? Is there one 17 in your mind and another in mine? In that case, the appearance of a common mathematical subject matter is an illusion.) In The Foundations of Arithmetic (1884), Frege concludes that numbers are neither external ‘concrete’ things nor mental entities of any sort. Later, in his essay “The Thought” (Frege 1918), he claims the same status for the items he calls thoughts—the senses of declarative sentences—and also, by implication, for their constituents, the senses of subsentential expressions. Frege does not say that senses are ‘abstract’. He says that they belong to a ‘third realm’ distinct both from the sensible external world and from the internal world of consciousness. Similar claims had been made by Bolzano (1837), and later by Brentano (1874) and his pupils, including Meinong and Husserl. The common theme in these developments is the felt need in semantics and psychology as well as in mathematics for a class of objective (i.e., non-mental) supersensible entities. As this new ‘realism’ was absorbed into English speaking philosophy, the traditional term ‘abstract’ was enlisted to apply to the denizens of this ‘third realm’.

Philosophers who affirm the existence of abstract objects are sometimes called platonists; those who deny their existence are sometimes called nominalists. This terminology is lamentable, since these words have established senses in the history of philosophy, where they denote positions that have little to do with the modern notion of an abstract object. However, the contemporary senses of these terms are now established, and so the reader should be aware of them. (In Anglophone philosophy, the most important source for this terminological innovation is Quine. See especially Goodman and Quine 1947.) In this connection, it is essential to bear in mind that modern platonists (with a small ‘p’) need not accept any of the distinctive metaphysical and epistemological doctrines of Plato, just as modern nominalists need not accept the distinctive doctrines of the medieval nominalists. Insofar as these terms are useful in a contemporary setting, they stand for thin doctrines: platonism is the thesis that there is at least one abstract object; nominalism is the thesis that the number of abstract objects is exactly zero (Field 1980). The details of this dispute are discussed in the article on nominalism in metaphysics. (See also the entry on platonism in metaphysics.) The aim of the present article is not to describe the case for or against the existence of abstract objects, but rather to say what an abstract object would be if such things existed.

3. The Way of Negation

Frege’s way of drawing the abstract/concrete distinction is an instance of what Lewis (1986a) calls the Way of Negation, according to which abstract objects are defined as those which lack certain features possessed by paradigmatic concrete objects. Nearly every explicit characterization in the literature follows this model. Let us review some of the options.

According to the account implicit in Frege’s writings,

An object is abstract if and only if it is both non-mental and non-sensible.

Here the first challenge is to say what it means for a thing to be ‘non-mental’, or as we more commonly say, ‘mind-independent’. The simplest approach is to say that a thing depends on the mind when it would not (or could not) have existed if minds had not existed. But this entails that tables and chairs are mind-dependent, and that is not what philosophers who employ this notion have in mind. To call an object ‘mind-dependent’ in a metaphysical context is to suggest that it somehow owes its existence to mental activity, but not in the boring ‘causal’ sense in which ordinary artifacts owe their existence to the mind. What can this mean? One promising approach is to say that an object should be reckoned mind-dependent when, by its very nature, it exists at a time if and only if it is the object or content of some mental state or process at that time. This counts tables and chairs as mind-independent, since they might survive the annihilation of thinking things. But it counts paradigmatically mental items, like the purple afterimage of which I am now aware, as mind-dependent, since it presumably lies in the nature of such items to be objects of conscious awareness whenever they exist. However, it is not clear that this account captures the full force of the intended notion. Consider, for example, the mereological fusion of my afterimage and your headache. This is surely a mental entity if anything is. But it is not necessarily the object of a mental state. (The fusion can exist even if no one is thinking about $$it$$.) A more generous conception would allow for mind-dependent objects that exist at a time in virtue of mental activity at that time, even if the object is not the object of any single mental state or act. The fusion of my afterimage plus your headache is mind-dependent in the second sense but not the first. That is a reason to prefer the second account of mind-dependence.

If we understand the notion of mind-dependence in this way, it is a mistake to insist that abstract objects be mind-dependent. To strike a theme that will recur, it is widely supposed that sets and classes are abstract entities—even the impure sets whose urelements are concrete objects. Any account of the abstract/concrete distinction that places set-theoretic constructions like $$\{$$Alfred, $$\{$$Betty, $$\{$$Charlie, Deborah$$\}\}\}$$ on the concrete side of the line will be seriously at odds with standard usage. With this in mind, consider the set whose sole members are my afterimage and your headache, or some more complex set-theoretic object based on these items. If we suppose, as is plausible, that an impure set exists at a time only when its members exist at that time, this will be a mind-dependent entity in the generous sense. But it is also presumably an abstract entity.

A similar problem arises for so-called abstract artifacts, like Jane Austen’s novels and the characters that inhabit them. Some philosophers regard such items as eternally existing abstract entities that worldly authors merely ‘describe’ or ‘encode’ but do not create. But of course the commonsensical view is that Austen created Pride and Prejudice and Elizabeth Bennett, and there is no good reason to deny this (Thomasson 1999; cf. Sainsbury 2009; see also the entry on fiction). If we take this commonsensical approach, there will be a clear sense in which these items depend for their existence on Austen’s mental activity, and perhaps on the mental activity of subsequent readers. These items may not count as mind-dependent in either of the senses canvassed above, since Pride and Prejudice can presumably exist at a time even if no one happens to be thinking at that time. (If the world took a brief collective nap, Pride and Prejudice would not pop out of existence.) But they are obviously mind-dependent in some not-merely-causal sense. And yet they are still presumably abstract objects. For these reasons, it is probably a mistake to insist that abstract objects be mind-independent. (For more on mind-dependence, see Rosen 1994.)

Frege’s proposal in its original form also fails for other reasons. Quarks and electrons are neither sensible nor mind-dependent. And yet they are not abstract objects. A better version of Frege’s proposal would hold that:

An object is abstract if and only if it is both non-physical and non-mental.

This approach may well draw an important line; but it inherits the familiar problem of saying what it is for a thing to be a physical object (Crane and Mellor 1990). For discussion, see the entry on physicalism.

3.1 The Non-Spatiality Criterion

Contemporary purveyors of the Way of Negation typically amend Frege’s criterion by requiring that abstract objects be non-spatial, causally inefficacious, or both. Indeed, if any characterization of the abstract deserves to be regarded as the standard one, it is this:

An object is abstract if and only if it is non-spatial and causally inefficacious.

This standard account nonetheless presents a number of perplexities.

Consider first the requirement that abstract objects be non-spatial (or non-spatiotemporal). Some of the paradigms of abstractness are non-spatial in a straightforward sense. It makes no sense to ask where the cosine function was last Tuesday. Or if it makes sense to ask, the only sensible answer is that it was nowhere. Similarly, it makes no good sense to ask when the Pythagorean Theorem came to be. Or if it does make sense to ask, the only sensible answer is that it has always existed, or perhaps that it does not exist ‘in time’ at all. These paradigmatic ‘pure abstracta’ have no non-trivial spatial or temporal properties. They have no spatial location, and they exist nowhere in particular in time.

However, some abstract objects appear to stand in a more interesting relation to space. Consider the game of chess, for example. Some philosophers will say that chess is like a mathematical object, existing nowhere and ‘no when’—either eternally or outside of time altogether. But that is not the most natural view. The natural view is that chess was invented at a certain time and place (though it may be hard to say exactly where or when); that before it was invented it did not exist at all; that it was imported from India into Persia in the 7th century; that it has changed over the years, and so on. The only reason to resist this natural account is the thought that since chess is clearly an abstract object—it’s not a physical object, after all!—and since abstract objects do not exist in space and time—by definition!—chess must resemble the cosine function in its relation to space and time. And yet one might with equal justice regard the case of chess and other abstract artifacts as counterexamples to the hasty view that abstract objects possess only trivial spatial and temporal properties.

Should we then abandon the non-spatiotemporality criterion? Not necessarily. Even if there is a sense in which some abstract entities possess non-trivial spatiotemporal properties, it might still be said that concrete entities exist in spacetime in a distinctive way. If we had an account of this distinctive manner of spatiotemporal existence characteristic of concrete objects, we could say: An object is abstract (if and) only if it fails to exist in spacetime in that way.

One way to implement this approach is to note that paradigmatic concrete objects tend to occupy a relatively determinate spatial volume at each time at which they exist, or a determinate volume of spacetime over the course of their existence. It makes sense to ask of such an object, ‘Where is it now, and how much space does it occupy?’ even if the answer must sometimes be somewhat vague. By contrast, even if the game of chess is somehow ‘implicated’ in space and time, it makes no sense to ask how much space it now occupies. (To the extent that this does make sense, the only sensible answer is that it occupies no space at all, which is not to say that it occupies a spatial point.) And so it might be said:

An object is abstract (if and) only if it fails to occupy anything like a determinate region of space (or spacetime).

This promising idea raises several questions. First, it is conceivable that certain items that are standardly regarded as abstract might nonetheless occupy determinate volumes of space and time. Consider, for example, the various sets composed from Peter and Paul: $$\{$$Peter, Paul$$\}, \{$$Peter, $$\{$$Peter, $$\{\{$$Paul$$\}\}\}\}$$, etc. We don’t normally ask where such things are, or how much space they occupy. And indeed many philosophers will say that the question makes no sense, or that the answer is a dismissive ‘nowhere, none’. But this answer is not forced upon us by anything in set theory or metaphysics. Even if we grant that pure sets stand in only the most trivial relations to space, it is open to us to hold, as some philosophers have done, that impure sets exist where and when their members do (Lewis 1986a). It is not unnatural to say that a set of books is located on a certain shelf in the library, and indeed, there are some theoretical reasons for wanting to say this (Maddy 1990). On a view of this sort, we face a choice: we can say that since impure sets exist in space, they are not abstract objects after all; or we can say that since impure sets are abstract, it was a mistake to suppose that abstract objects cannot occupy space.

One way to finesse this difficulty would be to note that even if impure sets occupy space, they do so in a derivative manner. The set $$\{$$Peter, Paul$$\}$$ occupies a location in virtue of the fact that its concrete elements, Peter and Paul, together occupy that location. The set does not occupy the location in its own right. With that in mind, it might be said that:

An object is abstract (if and) only if it either fails to occupy space at all, or does so only in virtue of the fact some other items—in this case, its urelements—occupy that region.

But of course Peter himself occupies a region in virtue of the fact that his parts—his head, hands, etc.—together occupy that region. So a better version of the proposal would say:

An object is abstract (if and) only if it either fails to occupy space at all, or does so of the fact that some other items that are not among its parts occupy that region.

This approach appears to classify the cases fairly well, but it is somewhat artificial. Moreover it raises a number of questions. What are we to say about the statue that occupies a region of space, not because its parts are arrayed in space, but rather because its constituting matter occupies that region? And what about the unobserved electron, which according to some interpretations of quantum mechanics does not really occupy a region of space at all, but rather stands in some more exotic relation to the spacetime it inhabits? Suffice it to say that a philosopher who regards ‘non-spatiality’ as a mark of the abstract, but who allows that some abstract objects may have non-trivial spatial properties, owes us an account of the distinctive relation to space and spacetime that sets paradigmatic concreta apart.

Perhaps the most important question about the ‘non-spatiality’ criterion concerns the classification of the parts of space itself. Let us suppose that space or spacetime exists, not just as an object of pure mathematics, but as the arena in which physical objects and events are somehow arrayed. Physical objects are located ‘in’ or ‘at’ regions of space, and so count as concrete according to the non-spatiality criterion. But what about the points and regions of space itself? There has been some debate about whether a commitment to spacetime substantivalism is consistent with the nominalist’s rejection of abstract entities (Field 1980, 1989; Malament 1982). If we define the abstract as the ‘non-spatial’, this debate reduces to the question whether space itself is to be reckoned ‘spatial’. But surely that is a verbal question. We can extend existing usage so as to allow that points and regions of space are located ‘at’ themselves—or not, according to taste. The philosopher who thinks that there is a serious question about whether the parts of space count as concrete would thus do well to characterize the abstract/concrete distinction in other terms.

3.2 The Causal Inefficacy Criterion

According to the most widely accepted versions of the Way of Negation:

An object is abstract (if and) only if it is causally inefficacious.

Concrete objects, whether mental or physical, have causal powers; numbers and functions and the rest make nothing happen. There is no such thing as causal commerce with the game of chess itself (as distinct from its concrete instances). And even if impure sets do in some sense exist in space, it is easy enough to believe that they make no distinctive causal contribution to what transpires. Peter and Paul may have effects individually. They may even have effects together that neither has on his own. But these joint effects are naturally construed as effects of two concrete objects acting jointly, or perhaps as effects of their mereological aggregate (itself a paradigm concretum), rather than as effects of some set-theoretic construction. Suppose Peter and Paul together tip a balance. If we entertain the possibility that this event is caused by a set, we shall have to ask which set caused it: the set containing just Peter and Paul? Some more elaborate construction based on them? Or is it perhaps the set containing the molecules that compose Peter and Paul? This proliferation of possible answers suggests that it was a mistake to credit sets with causal powers in the first place. This is good news for those who wish to say that all sets are abstract.

(Note, however, that some writers identify ordinary physical events—causally efficacious items par excellence—with sets. For David Lewis, for example, an event like the fall of Rome is an ordered pair whose first member is a region of spacetime, and whose second member is a set of such regions (Lewis 1986b). On this account, it would be disastrous to say both that impure sets are abstract objects, and that abstract objects are non-causal.)

The idea that causal inefficacy constitutes a sufficient condition for abstractness is somewhat at odds with standard usage. Some philosophers believe in ‘epiphenomenal qualia’: objects of conscious awareness (sense data), or qualitative conscious states that may be caused by physical processes in the brain, but which have no downstream causal consequences of their own (Jackson 1982; Chalmers 1996). These items are causally inefficacious if they exist, but they are not normally regarded as abstract. The proponent of the causal inefficacy criterion might respond by insisting that abstract objects are distinctively neither causes nor effects. But this is perilous. Abstract artifacts like Jane Austen’s novels (as we normally conceive them) come into being as a result of human activity. The same goes for impure sets, which come into being when their concrete urelements are created. These items are clearly effects in some good sense; yet they remain abstract if they exist at all. It is unclear how the proponent of the strong version of the causal inefficacy criterion (which views causal inefficacy as both necessary and sufficient for abstractness) might best respond to this problem.

Apart from this worry, there are no decisive intuitive counterexamples to this account of the abstract/concrete distinction. The chief difficulty—and it is hardly decisive—is rather conceptual. It is widely maintained that causation, strictly speaking, is a relation among events or states of affairs. If we say that the rock—an object—caused the window to break, what we mean is that some event or state (or fact or condition) involving the rock caused the break. If the rock itself is a cause, it is a cause in some derivative sense. But this derivative sense has proved elusive. The rock’s hitting the window is an event in which the rock ‘participates’ in a certain way, and it is because the rock participates in events in this way that we credit the rock itself with causal efficacy. But what is it for an object to participate in an event? Suppose John is thinking about the Pythagorean Theorem and you ask him to say what’s on his mind. His response is an event—the utterance of a sentence; and one of its causes is the event of John’s thinking about the theorem. Does the Pythagorean Theorem ‘participate’ in this event? There is surely some sense in which it does. The event consists in John’s coming to stand in a certain relation to the theorem, just as the rock’s hitting the window consists in the rock’s coming to stand in a certain relation to the glass. But we do not credit the Pythagorean Theorem with causal efficacy simply because it participates in this sense in an event which is a cause. The challenge is therefore to characterize the distinctive manner of ‘participation in the causal order’ that distinguishes the concrete entities. This problem has received relatively little attention. There is no reason to believe that it cannot be solved. But in the absence of a solution, this standard version of the Way of Negation must be reckoned a work in progress.

4. The Way of Example

In addition to the Way of Negation, Lewis identifies three main strategies for explaining the abstract/concrete distinction. According to the Way of Example, it suffices to list paradigm cases of abstract and concrete entities in the hope that the sense of the distinction will somehow emerge. If the distinction were primitive and unanalyzable, this might be the only way to explain it. But as we have remarked, this approach is bound to call the interest of the distinction into question. The abstract/concrete distinction matters because abstract objects as a class appear to present certain general problems in epistemology and the philosophy of language. It is supposed to be unclear how we come by our knowledge of abstract objects in a sense in which it is not unclear how we come by our knowledge of concrete objects (Benacerraf 1973). It is supposed to be unclear how we manage to refer determinately to abstract entities in a sense in which it is not unclear how we manage to refer determinately to other things (Benacerraf 1973, Hodes 1984). But if these are genuine problems, there must be some account of why abstract objects as such should be especially problematic in these ways. It is hard to believe that it is simply their primitive abstractness that makes the difference. It is much easier to believe that it is their non-spatiality or their causal inefficacy or something of the sort. It is not out of the question that the abstract/concrete distinction is fundamental, and that the Way of Example is the best we can do by way of elucidation. But if so, it is quite unclear why the distinction should make a difference.

5. The Way of Conflation

According to the Way of Conflation, the abstract/concrete distinction is to be identified with one or another metaphysical distinction already familiar under another name: as it might be, the distinction between sets and individuals, or the distinction between universals and particulars. There is no doubt that some authors have used the terms in this way. (Thus Quine 1953 uses ‘abstract entity’ and ‘universal’ interchangeably.) This sort of conflation is however rare in recent philosophy.

6. The Way of Abstraction

The most important alternative to the Way of Negation is what Lewis calls the Way of Abstraction. According to a longstanding tradition in philosophical psychology, abstraction is a distinctive mental process in which new ideas or conceptions are formed by considering several objects or ideas and omitting the features that distinguish them. For example, if one is given a range of white things of varying shapes and sizes; one ignores or ‘abstracts from’ the respects in which they differ, and thereby attains the abstract idea of whiteness. Nothing in this tradition requires that ideas formed in this way represent or correspond to a distinctive kind of object. But it might be maintained that the distinction between abstract and concrete objects should be explained by reference to the psychological process of abstraction or something like it. The simplest version of this strategy would be to say that an object is abstract if it is (or might be) the referent of an abstract idea, i.e., an idea formed by abstraction.

So conceived, the Way of Abstraction is wedded to an outmoded philosophy of mind. But a related approach has gained considerable currency in recent years. Crispin Wright (1983) and Bob Hale (1987) have developed an account of abstract objects that takes leave from certain suggestive remarks in Frege (1884). Frege notes (in effect) that many of the singular terms that appear to refer to abstract entities are formed by means of functional expressions. We speak of the shape of a building, the direction of a line, the number of books on the shelf. Of course many singular terms formed by means of functional expressions denote ordinary concrete objects: ‘the father of Plato’, ‘the capital of France’. But the functional terms that pick out abstract entities are distinctive in the following respect: Where ‘$$f(a)$$’ is such an expression, there is typically an equation of the form

$f(a) = f(b) \text{ if and only if } Rab,$

where $$R$$ is an equivalence relation. (An equivalence relation is a relation that is reflexive, symmetric and transitive.) For example:

The direction of $$a =$$ the direction of $$b$$ if and only if $$a$$ is parallel to $$b$$.

The number of $$F$$s = the number of $$G$$s if and only if there are just as many $$F$$s as $$G$$s.

Moreover, these equations (or abstraction principles) appear to have a special semantic status. While they are not strictly speaking definitions of the functional expression that occurs on the left hand side, they would appear to hold in virtue of the meaning of that expression. To understand the term ‘direction’ is (in part) to know that ‘the direction of $$a$$’ and ‘the direction of $$b$$’ refer to the same entity if and only if the lines $$a$$ and $$b$$ are parallel. Moreover, the equivalence relation that appears on the right hand side of the equation would appear to be semantically and perhaps epistemologically prior to the functional expression on the left (Noonan 1978). Mastery of the concept of a direction presupposes mastery of the concept of parallelism, but not vice versa.

The availability of abstraction principles meeting these conditions may be exploited to yield an account of the distinction between abstract and concrete objects. When ‘$$f$$’ is a functional expression governed by an abstraction principle, there will be a corresponding kind $$K_f$$ such that:

$x \text{ is a } K_f \text{ if and only if, for some } y, x = f(y).$

For example, $$x$$ is a cardinal number if and only if for some concept $$F, x =$$ the number of $$Fs$$. The simplest version of this approach to the Way of Abstraction is then to say that

$$x$$ is an abstract object if (and only if) $$x$$ is an instance of some kind $$K_f$$ whose associated functional expression ‘$$f$$’ is governed by a suitable abstraction principle.

The strong version of this account—which purports to identify a necessary condition for abstractness—is seriously at odds with standard usage. As we have noted, pure sets are paradigmatic abstract objects. But it is not clear that they satisfy the proposed criterion. According to naïve set theory, the functional expression ‘set of’ is indeed characterized by a putative abstraction principle.

The set of $$F$$s = the set of $$G$$s if and only if, for all $$x, (x$$ is $$F$$ if and only if $$x$$ is $$G)$$.

But this principle is inconsistent, and so fails to characterize an interesting concept. In contemporary mathematics, the concept of a set is not introduced by abstraction. It remains an open question whether something like the mathematical concept of a set can be characterized by a suitably restricted abstraction principle. (See Burgess 2005 for a survey of recent efforts in this direction.) Even if such a principle is available, however, it is unlikely that the epistemological priority condition will be satisfied. (That is, it is unlikely that mastery of the concept of set will presuppose mastery of the equivalence relation that figures on the right hand side.) It is therefore uncertain whether the Way of Abstraction so understood will classify the objects of pure set theory as abstract entities (as it presumably must).

Similarly, as Dummett (1973) has noted, in many cases the standard names for paradigmatically abstract objects do not assume the functional form to which the definition adverts. Chess is an abstract entity. But we do not understand the word ‘chess’ as synonymous with an expression of the form ‘$$f(x)$$’ where ‘$$f$$’ is governed by an abstraction principle. Similar remarks would seem to apply to such things as the English language, social justice, architecture, and Charlie Parker’s style. If so, the abstractionist approach does not provide a necessary condition for abstractness as that notion is standardly understood.

More importantly, there is some reason to believe that it fails to supply a sufficient condition. A mereological fusion of concrete objects is itself a concrete object. But the concept of a mereological fusion is governed by what appears to be an abstraction principle:

The fusion of the $$F$$s = the fusion of the $$G$$s if and only if the $$F$$s and $$G$$s cover one another,

where the $$F$$s cover the $$G$$s if and only if every part of every $$G$$ has a part in common with an $$F$$. Similarly, suppose a train is a maximal string of railroad carriages, all of which are connected to one another. We may define a functional expression, ‘the train of $$x$$’, by means of an ‘abstraction’ principle: The train of $$x =$$ the train of $$y$$ iff (if and only if) $$x$$ and $$y$$ are connected carriages. We may then say that $$x$$ is a train iff for some carriage $$y$$, $$x$$ is the train of $$y$$. The simple account thus yields the consequence that trains are to be reckoned abstract entities.

It is unclear whether these objections apply to the more sophisticated abstractionist proposals of Wright and Hale, but one feature of the simple account sketched above clearly does apply to these proposals and may serve as the basis for an objection to this version of the Way of Abstraction. The neo-Fregean approach seeks to explain the abstract/concrete distinction in semantic terms: We said that an abstract object is an object that falls in the range of a functional expression governed by an abstraction principle, where ‘$$f$$’ is governed by an abstraction principle when that principle holds in virtue of the meaning of ‘$$f$$’. This notion of a statement’s holding in virtue of the meaning of a word is notoriously problematic (see the entry on the analytic-synthetic distinction). But even if this notion makes sense, one may still complain: The abstract/concrete distinction is supposed to be a metaphysical distinction; abstract objects are supposed to differ from other objects in some important ontological respect. It should be possible, then, to draw the distinction directly in metaphysical terms: to say what it is in the objects themselves that makes some things abstract and others concrete. As Lewis writes, in response to a related proposal by Dummett:

Even if this … way succeeds in drawing a border, as for all I know it may, it tells us nothing about how the entities on opposite sides of that border differ in their nature. It is like saying that snakes are the animals that we instinctively most fear—maybe so, but it tells us nothing about the nature of snakes. (Lewis 1986a: 82)

The challenge is to produce a non-semantic version of the abstractionist criterion that specifies directly, in metaphysical terms, what the objects whose canonical names are governed by abstraction principles all have in common.

One response to this difficulty is to transpose the abstractionist proposal into more metaphysical key. We begin with the idea that each Fregean number is, by its very nature, the number of some Fregean concept, just as each Fregean direction is, by its very nature, at least potentially the direction of some concrete line. In each case, the abstract object is essentially the value of an abstraction function for a certain class of arguments. This is not a claim about the meanings of linguistic expressions. It is a claim about the essences or natures of the objects themselves. (For the relevant notion of essence, see Fine 1994). So for example, the Fregean number two (if there is such a thing) is, essentially, by its very nature, the number that belongs to a concept $$F$$ if and only if there are exactly two $$F$$s. More generally, for each Fregean abstract object $$x$$, there is an abstraction function $$f$$, such that $$x$$ is essentially the value of $$f$$ for every argument of a certain kind.

Abstraction functions have two key features. First, for each abstraction function $$f$$ there is an equivalence relation $$R$$ such that it lies in the nature of $$f$$ that $$f(x) = f(y)$$ iff Rxy. Intuitively, we are to think that $$R$$ is metaphysically prior to $$f$$, and that the abstraction function $$f$$ is defined (in whole or in part) by this biconditional. Second, each abstraction function is a generating function: its values are essentially values of that function. Many functions are not generating functions. Paris is the capital of France, but it is not essentially a capital. The number of solar planets, by contrast, is essentially a number. The notion of an abstraction function may be defined in terms of these two features:

• $$f$$ is an abstraction function iff
• a. for some equivalence relation $$R$$, it lies in the nature of $$f$$ that $$f(x) = f(y)$$ iff $$Rxy$$; and
• b. for all $$x$$, if $$x$$ is a value of $$f$$, then it lies in the nature of $$x$$ that there is (or could be) some object $$y$$ such that $$x = f(y)$$.

We may then say that

$$x$$ is an abstraction if and only if, for some abstraction function $$f$$, there is or could be an object $$y$$ such that $$x = f(y)$$

And

$$x$$ is an abstract object if (and only if) $$x$$ is an abstraction.

This account tells us a great deal about the distinctive natures of these broadly Fregean abstract objects. It tells us that each is, by its very nature, the value of a special sort of function, one whose nature is specified in a simple way in terms of an associated equivalence relation. It is worth stressing, however, that it does not supply much metaphysical information about these items. It does tell us whether they are located in space, whether they can stand in causal relations, and so on. It is an open question whether this somewhat unfamiliar version of the abstract/concrete distinction lines up with any of the more conventional ways of drawing the distinction outlined above.

Putnam (1975) makes the case for abstract objects on scientific grounds. Field (1980, 1989) makes the case against abstract objects. Bealer (1993) and Tennant (1997) present a priori arguments for the necessary existence of abstract entities. Balaguer (1998) argues that none of the arguments for or against the existence of abstract objects is compelling, and that there is no fact of the matter as to whether abstract things exist. The dispute over the existence of abstracta is reviewed in Burgess and Rosen (1997). Fine (2002) is a systematic study of abstraction principles in the foundations of mathematics. A general theory of abstract objects is developed axiomatically in Zalta (1983; 2016 in Other Internet Resources). Wetzel (2009) examines the type-token distinction, argues that types are abstract objects while the tokens of those types are their concrete instances, and shows how difficult it is to paraphrase away the many references to types that occur in the sciences and natural language. (See the entry on types and tokens.) Moltmann (2013) investigates the extent to which abstract objects are needed when developing a semantics of natural language.

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