Fakhr al-Din al-Razi

First published Sun Feb 5, 2023

Fakhr al-Dīn al-Rāzī (1149–1210) was one of the most innovative and influential thinkers in the first stage of what is sometimes called “post-classical” Islamic thought. Along with other major thinkers of the Islamic East in the twelfth century, notably Abū l-Barakāt al-Baghdādī and al-Suhrawardī, Fakhr al-Dīn reacted critically to the philosophy of Ibn Sīnā (Avicenna). He produced a voluminous corpus that is often elusive in terms of conveying Fakhr al-Dīn’s own considered opinions, but is packed with subtle philosophical argumentation on pretty well every aspect of Ibn Sīnā’s thought. Fakhr al-Dīn did also stake out distinctive positions of his own, for example with respect to the problem of providing real definitions, the distinction between essence and existence, the principles of physics, the unity of the human soul, and the source of ethical norms. This abundant output in philosophy was only one part of his life’s work, which includes texts on Islamic law, theology, astrology, and one of history’s most important commentaries on the Quran.

1. Life and Works

Fakhr al-Dīn al-Rāzī’s life was shaped by the political situation in central Asia in the generations just before the Mongol conquest of that region. He was born in the Persian city of Rayy, near modern-day Tehran, in 1149 CE (544 of the Muslim calendar). The name “Rāzī” refers to this birthplace, leading to potential confusion with other philosophers from Rayy, including the earlier Abū Bakr al-Rāzī (d. 920) and the later Quṭb al-Dīn al-Rāzī (d.1364). Fakhr al-Dīn did not stay in Rayy, but traveled widely throughout Persia and central Asia for the rest of his life in search of education, patronage, and worthy intellectual opponents. In fact, he did not need to venture far for his initial education. His father was an expert in Islamic theology and law, a second-generation student of the major Ashʿarite thinker al-Juwaynī (d.1085). Thus the young Fakhr al-Dīn was from early on trained in the rational theology (kalām) of the Ashʿarite school and the legal system of his father’s Shāfiʿī school. He went on to study in Nishapur, where he first encountered the works of al-Fārābī (d.950–51) and Ibn Sīnā (Avicenna, d.1037). Responding to the latter would become the central project of his own philosophical career. At Marāgha, he studied with the teacher Majd al-Dīn al-Jīlī (d. after 1175). Al-Suhrawardī (d. 1191), the famous founder of the “Illuminationist” philosophical tradition, was also a student of al-Jīlī’s.

The mature career of Fakhr al-Dīn has been divided into three phases in a recent detailed overview of his life (Griffel 2021: 264–303; see also Street 1997, Griffel 2007, Altaş 2013a and 2013b, Shihadeh 2022). These phases were marked by patronage relationships with two political powers who were vying for dominance in central Asia, the Khwārazm-Shāhs and the Ghūrids. Fakhr al-Dīn first enjoyed the support of the Khwārazm-Shāhs for about two decades, before joining the Ghūrids in 1197 after a military defeat of the Khwārazm-Shāhs at the hands of the Ghūrids. By all accounts this led to great wealth and standing, as Fakhr al-Dīn became an ornament to the Ghūrid court and a close companion and teacher of the sultan Ghiyāth al-Dīn (d.1203). This did not mean he could stay above the political fray, though. He was accused of lingering loyalty to the enemies of the court and was also involved in a religious rivalry between Ashʿarism and the more literalist, less rationalist Karrāmite theological movement. His travels in Transoxania seeking out debates with other jurists and theologians have similarly been explained as an attempt to promote Ashʿarite kalām against Maturīdī opponents, and Shāfiʿī legal thought against Hanbalī opponents (for his legal thought see, e.g., Opwis 2012, Başoğlu 2014). In a record of these encounters around the year 1186, called Debates (Munāẓarāṭ), Fakhr al-Dīn presents himself as “the only respectable scholar among a swarm of dimwits” (Griffel 2021: 296; for this work see Kholeif 1966). At the end of his life, we see a third phase of patronage as he rejoins the Khwārazm-Shāhs after they take the city of Herat from the Ghūrids. Fakhr al-Dīn died two years later in that city, in 1210 CE (606 of the Muslim calendar).

Despite his extensive travels and political maneuvering, Fakhr al-Dīn found time to compose a startlingly large body of work. Many will associate his name most immediately with his titanic Great Commentary on the Quran (also called Keys to the Hidden: Mafāṭih al-ghayb). The modern printing runs to no fewer than 32 volumes (here it is almost obligatory to cite Ibn Taymiyya’s barb that the work “contains everything apart from exegesis of the Quran”). Fakhr al-Dīn wrote extensively on law, theology, and “occult sciences” like magic and astrology. As can be learned from studies of his Quranic commentary (Jaffer 2015) and a treatise of his on the occult disciplines (Noble 2021), every work of Fakhr al-Dīn al-Rāzī can be profitably read with his philosophical interests in mind. But in this overview we will largely restrict our focus to the theological-philosophical treatises that are of most evident importance for the historian of philosophy. Scholars sometimes refer to these as summae, which suggests a parallel with Latin scholastic works like those by Thomas Aquinas. The comparison is not misleading, insofar as Fakhr al-Dīn was avowedly a theologian, but one who pursued philosophical problems at length and with great sophistication.

A couple of problems confront anyone who is trying to come to grips with his writings in this area. First, the sheer quantity of material. His first summa, entitled Eastern Points of Investigation on Metaphysics and Physics (al-Mabāḥith al-mashriqiyya fī ʿilm al-ilāhiyyāt wa-l-ṭabīʿiyyāt) is more than 1200 pages long in the modern printing. His final summa, written in his final years and arguably best representing his own views on a wide range of topics, is the similarly titled Exalted Topics of Inquiry within Divine Science (al-Maṭālib al-ʿāliya min al-ʿilm al-ilāhī) and is printed in nine books bound in five volumes. In between these two works we have, among other texts, the shorter but highly innovative and influential Mulakhkhaṣ al-ḥikma (Epitome of Philosophy) and not one but two exegetical works devoted to Ibn Sīnā’s Pointers and Reminders (al-Ishārāt wa-l-tanbīhāt), a critical abridgment from 1201 (Lubab al-Ishārāt) and an earlier, and very extensive, line-by-line critical commentary (Sharḥ al-Ishārāt).

Fakhr al-Dīn’s decision to devote such a detailed commentary to a work by Ibn Sīnā is historically revealing. While his contemporary Sharaf al-Dīn al-Masʿūdī (d. before 1204) did compose a set of Doubts (Shukūk) on the same text, the commentary of al-Rāzī on al-Ishārāt seems to be the first lemmatized exegesis of an Arabic philosophical work (see also Wisnovsky 2013, Shihadeh 2014 and 2017), as had been devoted to Aristotle in late antiquity and earlier Arabic philosophy. Even a casual perusal of Fakhr al-Dīn’s corpus makes clear that he has identified Ibn Sīnā as the chief representative of falsafa, a word which is most naturally translated “philosophy” (since it is likewise derived from the Greek philosophia) but which really has a narrower meaning in this period, since it is so closely tied to Ibn Sīnā’s distinctive teachings. To be a faylasūf is to uphold such doctrines as the necessary and eternal emanation of the universe from God. (A more generic word for the discussion of such issues, without any particular doctrinal commitment, would be ḥikma, literally meaning “wisdom”; see Griffel 2021.) While Fakhr al-Dīn follows his famous predecessor and fellow Ashʿarite al-Ghazālī (d. 1111) in targeting Ibn Sīnā as the outstanding exponent of falsafa, he does not go along with al-Ghazālī’s idea that the falāsifa were heretics and apostates from Islam.

Instead, he seems to welcome the powerful challenge posed by Ibn Sīnā’s thought, since it gives him something worthy of his own considerable critical acumen and helps him to map out the wide range of issues tackled in his summae. These fall into the domains of logic, physics, psychology, ethics, and above all, metaphysics (general survey in Zarkān 1963). Indeed Fakhr al-Dīn used metaphysics to restructure the curriculum of the sciences, something we especially see in his Mulakhkhaṣ (Eichner 2007, 2009). This work adopts a new arrangement, which would be influential on later thinkers. Fakhr al-Dīn first tackles logic, then “generalities (al-umūr al-ʿāmma)”, then natural philosophy, and finally philosophical theology. The second and fourth parts of the project correspond to what is called general and special metaphysics in the Latin scholastic tradition, and the parallel does not end there. Like Duns Scotus, Fakhr al-Dīn offers an analysis of existence (the central case of a metaphysical “generality”) by way of disjunction, e.g., existence may be one or many, necessary or contingent, infinite or finite, self-sufficient or dependent, etc. While these contrasts are largely drawn from Ibn Sīnā, Fakhr al-Dīn innovates with his systematic use of the disjunctions to structure general metaphysics. This also means, as we will see below, that his discussions of metaphysics are by no means restricted to raising and answering questions about God, as we might expect from a “theologian”.

In fact, while Fakhr al-Dīn’s Ashʿarite sympathies are often evident, and he does also write works that summarize kalām teachings, he is not consistent in taking a clear stance in favor of Ashʿarite kalām and against Avicennan falsafa. Instead, the really stable feature of his work is a method that is, again, reminiscent of Latin scholasticism and its genre of disputed questions. His various summae are organized into topics for inquiry (hence the use of words like mabāḥith and maṭālib in the titles of the works), with arguments considered for and against every conceivable stance that could be adopted on each topic. (The famous Sufi poet al-Rūmī compared this approach to “tearing science apart like bread and feeding it to the birds”.) The fact that no actual historical figure or school has adopted a possible position will not prevent Fakhr al-Dīn from considering it.

By using this “dialectical” procedure (Wisnovsky 2004, Shihadeh 2005, Griffel 2011) Fakhr al-Dīn is able to stand in judgment over the whole historical tradition leading up to him. Alongside Ibn Sīnā and other philosophers, notably the slightly earlier Abū l-Barakāt al-Baghdādī (d. 1160s), the kalām tradition supplies him with a stock of positions and arguments to rehearse and critique. He will thus frequently refer in the third person to “theologians (mutakallimūn)”, as if this were a group that does not include him. The upshot is that Fakhr al-Dīn puts himself forward as the arbiter in debates that span the falsafa-kalām divide. If he is not consistent in adopting one or another teaching himself (many times, a lengthy investigation in his works ends with only a brief statement of the likeliest answer, or none at all, followed with a pious “but God knows best”), this is perhaps because the exhaustive method of testing arguments and doctrines is more important to him than the assertion of any one doctrine.

2. Logic and Epistemology

In the Islamic world, representatives of falsafa largely accept the traditional Aristotelian presentation of the manner of the acquisition of knowledge. This is the Peripatetic Organon, which starts from the predicables and moves through syllogistic to demonstrative science and essential definitions. Fakhr al-Dīn, however, presents a different structure for logic and epistemology, which leaves the traditional organization of the Organon behind. The new structure revolves around two ways of acquiring knowledge, conceptualization (taṣawwur) and assent (taṣdīq) (El-Rouayheb 2019: 29). “Conceptualization” stands for mentally entertaining a concept, such as “human” or “rational animal”, without ascribing any truth-value to it, while “assent” stands for claiming that the human is rational animal in the real world (Lameer 2006). Fakhr al-Dīn’s reorganization of logic and epistemology may have been one inspiration for later authors who re-define the subject matter of logic as “the objects of conception and assent” (El-Rouayheb 2012).

Fakhr al-Dīn complements this picture with his critique of definitions, a rejection of the intentional acquisition of knowledge through conceptualization (Falaturi 1969, Ibrahim 2013, Özturan 2018, Jacobsen Ben Hammed 2020, Benevich 2022a). According to the traditional Aristotelian epistemology, wholly embraced by Ibn Sīnā, we know what a human is by acquiring a complete definition of the essence of what it means to be a human, through a combination of all inherent generic and specific aspects, for instance “being an animal” and “being rational”. Fakhr al-Dīn denies that this is how we learn what things are. For him, as for his contemporaries Abū l-Barakāt and al-Suhrawardī, the best that we can hope to achieve with the traditional Aristotelian-Avicennan approach is a nominal definition, the explication of a meaning we have in our minds (Muḥaṣṣal, 84; Mulakhkhaṣ: Manṭiq, 106). By defining humans as “rational animals”, we do not learn anything new about real humans. Rather, we just explain what we meant by “humans” in the first place.

Fakhr al-Dīn’s main argument against real definitions is a reapplication of an old epistemological problem that goes back to Meno’s paradox in Plato (Meno, 80d6–10). Al-Rāzī formulates it as follows:

If one is not aware of the object of inquiry, inquiry is impossible. For, if one is entirely unaware of something, the soul undertakes no inquiry into it. If on the other hand one is aware of it, inquiry is again impossible, since it is absurd to make something available when it is already available (taḥṣīl al-ḥāṣil).

If someone says: [the inquirer] is aware of [the object of inquiry] in some respect or other, I respond: the respect in which he is aware of it is distinct from the respect in which he is not aware of it. [82] He cannot inquire into the first [respect], since it is [already] available. Nor can he inquire into the second [respect], since he is absolutely unaware of it (Muḥaṣṣal, 81–82)

How can we learn something new if we do not even know what to look for; and if we already know what we are looking for, what sense does it make to learn something new about it? Al-Fārābī and Ibn Sīnā mostly accepted the Aristotelian solution to the paradox, namely that we can know something in one respect, and inquire into it and learn something new about it in another respect (Black 2008, Marmura 2009). Fakhr al-Dīn rejects this solution, on the grounds that the problem may be applied to each aspect individually. If we do not know one aspect but already know another aspect, new inquiry is impossible for both, with the two aspects falling prey to the two different horns of the paradox.

In his analysis of the acquisition of knowledge, Fakhr al-Dīn addresses the traditional epistemological distinction inherited from kalām between “necessary” (ḍarūrī) and “acquired” (iktisābī) knowledge. We receive “necessary” items of knowledge as a given, whether or not we want to do so. For instance, when I look at a red apple, I have no power over seeing that the apple is red. I cannot just decide to see it as blue. By contrast, acquired knowledge means that we are intentionally involved in the acquisition of knowledge. I might for instance try to learn why humans have certain features that belong to them, though I need not do so (see further Abrahamov 1993, Radhi Ibrahim 2013, Benevich 2022b). Fakhr al-Dīn goes against this standard kalām account by denying the second type of knowledge. According to him, we do not have any power over our conceptualization of things, nor over any beliefs that derive from conceptualization (Arbaʿīn, vol.1, 330–332). Rather, all items of conceptualization and assent are given to us, which in the occasionalist Ashʿarite framework means given directly by God (Jacobsen Ben Hammed 2020, Benevich 2022a). We are thus “forced” to have whatever knowledge we wind up having. The nature of the objects known is not so clear: it has been argued that for Fakhr al-Dīn we can only get to objects of phenomenal experience (Ibrahim 2013), and also that for him we can get at the things in themselves (Benevich 2022a). Either way, the necessary items of knowledge are the primary data for epistemic agents. We do not learn what humans are through an inquiry and by producing essential definitions. We know what humans are through direct experience, which is not up to us.

For someone who denies that we can voluntarily acquire knowledge through either conceptualization or assent, Fakhr al-Dīn devotes surprising effort to discussing the ways of acquiring assents. He introduces a few substantial innovations in the Avicennan theories of the types of propositions and syllogistics. In fact, Fakhr al-Dīn introduces several notions and distinctions that become standard in the subsequent history of Arabic logic. Most of them are rooted in Ibn Sīnā’s logical apparatus, but Fakhr al-Dīn makes great effort to critically revise and re-organize them, creating the foundations of what has been called “revisionist Avicennan logic” (El-Rouayheb 2019: 68–69). One of the most important innovations is Fakhr al-Dīn’s suggestion that Ibn Sīnā failed to distinguish between the alethic and temporal understanding of necessity. “Every A is necessarily B” does not need to mean the same as “Every A is always B”. With this distinction, Fakhr al-Dīn creates what Street has called “profusion of propositional types”, which would be extensively discussed in the later period of Arabic logic (Street 2014, 2016; see further Strobino & Thom 2016).

Another important contribution in logic is Fakhr al-Dīn’s distinction between two readings of the subject term of a proposition: externalist (khārijī) and essentialist (ḥaqīqī). When we say “Every A is B” on the externalist reading, we mean that every single thing which actually happens to be A in the real world is B. On the essentialist reading, “Every A is B” means “everything, were it to be described as A, would be B” (Mulakhkhaṣ: Manṭiq, 141–42). The distinction between the externalist and the essentialist reading is Fakhr al-Dīn’s response to the earlier Arabic discussions of the subject term by al-Farābī and Ibn Sīnā. Al-Farābī was credited with the ampliation of the subject term to the possible. In other words, for him, “Every A is B” means “everything that is possibly A, is B”. Ibn Sīnā was more restrictive: “Every A is B” means “everything that is actually A, is B”. This need not mean “everything that actually is A in the real world” but can also refer to whatever is actually described as A in the mind (Street 2005, 2010, 2014, and 2016, cf. Chatti 2016). Fakhr al-Dīn’s distinction between the essentialist and the externalist readings of the subject term may be a reaction to Ibn Sīnā’s ampliation of the subject term to include the mental realm. As we will see in Section 4, Fakhr al-Dīn denies mental existence, and hence requires different formulation for the readings of the subject term that do not refer to real-world actuality.

3. Physics

Fakhr al-Dīn’s treatment of the principles of physics provides an illuminating example of his philosophical method. In his various summae he addresses the same set of issues treated in Ibn Sīnā’s physics, which are ultimately those already addressed by Aristotle’s Physics. Thus we get considerations of body, motion, time, place, and void. Yet ideas from the kalām tradition are brought into the mix too, and sometimes allowed to prevail. Thus he usually upholds the atomism shared by both the Muʿtazilite and Ashʿarite schools of kalām against the continuism of Ibn Sīnā. In other cases, Fakhr al-Dīn seems to be following the lead of Abū Bakr al-Rāzī (who was himself an atomist), as he embraces a “Platonic” understanding of time and place, according to which these are independent principles rather than measurements and limits of bodies and their motions.

The fundamental distinction in kalām physics is that between the atomic substance (jawhar) or “indivisible part”, on the one hand, and the accidental properties (aʿrāḍ) that belong to these atoms, on the other hand (Dhanani 1994, Sabra 2006). As far back as the initial reception of Greek philosophy into Arabic, falāsifa like al-Kindī (in a lost work) had rejected atomism in favor of Aristotelian continuism. This is the view that every part of every body, no matter how small, can in principle be divided into yet smaller sub-parts. Ibn Sīnā was also a strong opponent of atomism (Lettinck 1988, McGinnis 2013, Dhanani 2015), and his arguments provoked discussion in a number of twelfth century authors (see, e.g., McGinnis 2019). Fakhr al-Dīn is thus joining a long-running debate when he addresses the cogency of atomism. His statements on the question present a typically confusing picture. He seems to reject atomism in his “philosophical” (falsafī, ḥikmī) works, only to accept it in his kalām works (Zarkān 1963: 67–98). However his late summa, the Maṭālib, may show that he came to embrace kalām atomism as his own considered view (Dhanani 2015; see also Setia 2004 and 2006, and Baffioni 1982: 211–75; for his opposition to hylomorphism see Ibrahim 2020).

As a decisive consideration in favor of atomism he here states that, if continuism were true, each body would have an infinity of parts, so that a mustard seed could be “stretched” to coincide with the whole universe (Maṭālib vol.6, 71; see Dhanani 2015: 102 for the passage). Another atomist argument is that if a true sphere were to meet a true surface, it would make contact at an indivisible point. We can further argue as follows:

Once it is established that the locus of contact is something indivisible, the existence of the individual atom must be acknowledged. For if we roll a sphere in a full circle on a plane surface, there can be no doubt that as soon as one point of contact ceases, contact is established with another (Maṭālib vol.6, 48–9).

As this argument shows, the atoms under consideration here are akin to geometrical points, rather than the very small, extended but indivisible bodies proposed in ancient Greek atomism and by the earlier Abū Bakr al-Rāzī. This itself an inheritance from the kalām tradition. Geometry was also used by some to rebut atomism, so in both the Maṭālib and a separate treatise dedicated to this issue (Altaş 2015), Fakhr al-Dīn sets out geometrical arguments against atomism and offers counter-refutations.

If he is indeed an atomist, it would make sense that he should believe in the possibility of void, since in both classical and kalām atomism these two doctrines are usually found together. Abū Bakr al-Rāzī and Abū l-Barakāt al-Baghdādī were also proponents of the void, and both were influential figures for Fakhr al-Dīn. On this topic, he seems to be fairly consistent in upholding the possibility of void against Aristotelian and Avicennan arguments for its impossibility (Adamson 2018a). For example, he rejects the Aristotelian argument that, if the speed of motion is inversely proportional to the density of the medium, then motion in a void would be infinitely fast:

If we assume that part of the [required] time is to accommodate the motion in itself, and part of it to accommodate the hindrance, then the motion in pure void will take place in that amount of time that is appropriate to the motion as it is in itself. Motion occurring in a plenum, meanwhile, will occur in that amount of time plus a further amount of time, as rendered appropriate by whatever is in the interval that offers [175] hindrance. So it is established that the conclusion they sought to force [on the proponent of void, sc. that motion in a void would be infinitely fast given the total lack of resistance] does not follow (Maṭālib, vol.5, 174.19–175.1).

In other words, the density of the medium only slows the intrinsic speed of the motion that it would have in a vaccuum, which is finite.

Void is defined either as a case in which two bodies fail to be in contact, with no body between them (Arbaʿīn vol.2, 32) or as a space that has nothing placed within it (Maṭālib vol.5, 155). Physical arguments provide evidence that void is in fact not just possible but actually occurs, as when two flat surfaces are pulled apart: it will take some time, however minimal, until air rushes in to fill the empty space (Arbaʿīn vol.2, 35). The second definition of void just mentioned brings us to Fakhr al-Dīn’s notion of space or place, and already suggests his view that place is not dependent on bodies, as Ibn Sīnā had claimed (Adamson 2017). For Ibn Sīnā, following Aristotle, place is the inner boundary of a containing body, for example the interior surface of a jug that surrounds the water placed in the jug (Lammer 2018: §5.3). Fakhr al-Dīn subjects this conception to a barrage of criticisms, for example that a jewel inside a bag would remain in the same “place” even as it is being transported between cities (Maṭālib vol.5, 147). Instead, place is for him indeed “space” (faḍāʾ, ḥayyiz), which is independent of bodies and may be either occupied by a body or not.

We find a parallel between this idea about space and his account of time (Setia 2008, Adamson 2018b, Adamson & Lammer 2020). For Ibn Sīnā time is a measure of motion (ʿAbd al-Mutaʿāl 2003, McGinnis 2003 and 2008). In the first instance it is the measure of the motion of the outermost heaven, since this is the fastest motion in the cosmos, which accounts for the apparent diurnal rotation of the fixed stars around the Earth. This, for Fakhr al-Dīn, is the “peripatetic” account of time. In his Maṭālib he refutes it and also a variant of the view found in Abū l-Barakāt, according to which time is the measure of existence rather than motion. Fakhr al-Dīn does at least agree that time is real. To establish this he cites an old kalām idea that time offers a coordination between independent events (Mabāḥith vol.1, 761; Maṭālib vol.5, 47), which is why it is possible for me to arrange to meet with you tomorrow (one event) when the sun rises (another event). But time’s existence is not supervenient on motions or cases of existence. Were that the case, then we would have multiple, simultaneous times for the various motions, which would need a superordinate time to coordinate them.

Fakhr al-Dīn’s discussions of time give us a nice example of how his views developed, even while circling around the same set of arguments (Adamson & Lammer 2020). In the Mabāḥith he expresses an an agnostic point of view:

I have not yet arrived at the realization of the truth about time, so let your expectation from this book be a thorough examination and report of whatever can possibly be said [about time] from all points of view (Mabāḥith vol.1, 761).

When he writes the Mulakhkhaṣ, by contrast, he is coming around to the view that beforeness and afterness are “items of consideration” (umūr iʿtibāriyya). Yet at the end of his career, he has adopted the contrary view. Now he endorses what he says is Plato’s view of time: it is “a substance subsisting in itself and independent in itself” (Maṭālib vol.6, 76). The allusion to Plato presumably refers to the Timaeus. He is apparently following his fellow philosopher of Rayy, Abū Bakr al-Rāzī, both in accepting the independence of time and place and in seeing Plato as an authority for that physical theory (Adamson 2021a: ch.5). One difference between the two Rāzīs, however, is that Fakhr al-Dīn makes it clear that time and place are both created by God, and not “eternal” principles. Thus his overall account of physics envisions a created spatio-temporal framework within which bodies may, but need not, exist.

4. Metaphysics

Just as “substance” (ousia) may rightfully be called the central notion of Aristotelian metaphysics, so is “existence” (wujūd) the core notion of Avicennan metaphysics. Ibn Sīnā’s metaphysics is a study of the relationship between different kinds of things and the mode of their existence, which ultimately results in identifying a special, necessary mode of existence, which belongs to one being alone, namely God (see, e.g., Bertolacci 2016). There are two core doctrines of Ibn Sīnā’s metaphysics, both widely discussed after him in the Islamic world, and both addressed by Fakhr al-Dīn in detail: the distinction between essence and existence, and the idea that God is sheer existence, necessary in all respects.

“Existence” refers for Ibn Sīnā to the very fact that things are, irrespective of what they are. For instance, it is one thing for a red apple to be a red apple, and it is a completely different thing for the red apple to be. To establish the distinction between what things are (that is, their essence), and whether they are (that is, their existence), Ibn Sīnā uses an argument from conceivability. We can conceive of a red apple without knowing whether it exists, hence its existence must be different from its essence (Išārāt, namaṭ 4, 266). But how should we understand this distinction between essence and existence? In the post-Avicennan tradition, there are two main answers to this question: the distinction between essence and existence is real (ḥaqīqī) or it is merely conceptual (iʿtibārī). The first answer requires that there are two different items outside the mind, which together make up the existent red apple. The second response means that there is just one item in the extramental world, the existent red apple; but we can analyse it conceptually into “existence” and “red apple” (Wisnovsky 2012, Eichner 2011b).

Within this debate, Fakhr al-Dīn seems to take the realist stance that essence and existence are distinct outside the mind (Benevich 2017). For instance, he feels compelled to address one of the most pressing issues for the realists. If essence and existence are distinct in reality, does this mean that all essences are already somehow out there before existence attaches to them? Fakhr al-Dīn is not puzzled by that difficulty:

The essence as such (min ḫayṯu hiya hiya) is an essence distinct from existence and non-existence. This does not imply the subsistence of something existent in something non-existent (Arbaʿīn, vol.1, 88).

The essence of the red apple as such (min ḥaythu hiya hiya) is indeed prior to its existence. The essences of things, considered as such, are in a different, third state of being, neither existent nor non-existent (Mabāḥith, vol.1, 129). Of course, this does not mean that there are essences of red apples hanging around before they even become existent. Just like Ibn Sīnā, Fakhr al-Dīn accepts that essence and existence are extensionally identical: all instances of essence are also instances of existence (Wisnovsky 2012). But Fakhr al-Dīn offers a realist take on the Avicennan distinction by introducing a clear priority of essence over existence; more recent interpreters disagree as to whether this is faithful to Ibn Sīnā’s own metaphysics (Bertolacci 2012, Benevich 2019b, Janos 2020).

Fakhr al-Dīn consistently uses his theory of the priority of essence over existence to discuss what Ibn Sīnā considered a special case, God. In Fakhr al-Dīn’s understanding, for Ibn Sīnā, God’s essence is just identical to His existence. For Ibn Sīnā, this would be the only way to guarantee that God exists necessarily. For, if there were any composition at all of A and B, A could fail to be B, and B could fail to attach to A; some further cause would be needed to guarantee the connection between the two. Thus, the only way to secure that A is necessarily B is just to say that A is B. That would mean that God’s essence is not even conceptually distinct from God’s existence. There is an obvious problem with this doctrine, however. If God’s essence is sheer existence, but existence also belongs to, for example, a red apple, how is the existence of the red apple different from the divine essence? Ibn Sīnā’s reply depends on the notion of the analogy or modulation (taskīk) of existence, whereby one kind of existence belongs to the red apple and another kind belongs to—or rather, just is—God (Treiger 2012, De Haan 2015, Druart 2014, Zamboni 2020, Janos 2021). But Fakhr al-Dīn, again much like Duns Scotus almost a century later, refuses to take this route. Instead, he insists on the univocity of existence. Everything that exists, does so in the same manner of existence. Thus Fakhr al-Dīn is also compelled to deny the identity of essence and existence in God’s case. God’s existence will still be necessary, because His essence is such that it implies its own existence. So in God essence is prior to existence. This priority should not bother or indeed surprise us, since we just have learned that all essences are prior to their existence. The upshot is that what is special about God is His essence, not a unique kind of existence (Muḥaṣṣal, 67; see further Mayer 2003, Benevich 2020a).

Fakhr al-Dīn’s contribution to history of metaphysics recalls not only Duns Scotus but also Thomas Aquinas. Like Aquinas, he offers a taxonomy of proofs for God’s existence, which becomes standard in philosophy of the Islamic world after him. Fakhr al-Dīn distinguishes between four mains proofs for God’s existence available to him at his time: from the contingency of essences; from the temporal origination (ḥudūth) of essences; from the contingency of attributes; and from the temporal origination of attributes. The first argument may be easily identified with Ibn Sīnā’s proof for God’s existence, which establishes the existence of the Necessary Being by reasoning from the contingency of all beings in the world (Marmura 1980; Mayer 2001; Zarepour 2022). The second argument is the kalām cosmological argument. It argues for the existence of a Creator based on the fact that the world came to be at some point. The third argument, from the contingency of attributes, alludes to the fact that everything in the world exists in a certain way, while it could have easily been some other way. Therefore, there needs to be some agent that determined how things would exist. Finally, the fourth argument comes closest to what we would designate as a design argument. The attributes of things in the world are not just one way when they could have been different, but are in the best way possible. Hence, there must be a wise agent who chose these marvelous features for the world. Fakhr al-Dīn contends that the first argument, that is, Ibn Sīnā’s argument for the existence of a Necessary Being is more fundamental than all other arguments (Maʿālim, 42).

So, while disagreeing with Ibn Sīnā whether God’s essence and existence are identical, Fakhr al-Dīn does accept that God is a Necessary Being. Still, probably due to his kalām allegiances, he is not ready to accept that God is a necessary being in all respects. For instance, Ibn Sīnā’s God cannot know particular individuals. Knowledge of what is happening right now while you are reading this article would involve a change in God, since He would need to stop knowing that you are reading this sentence as soon as you move on to the next one. But if God changes, then He is not necessary in all respects, since necessity implies immutability. So the only way for God to know what happens in the world is to conceive of universal rules, laws of nature, and causation, without knowing which of those rules are being at work right now (Marmura 2005, Adamson 2005; cf. Acar 2004 and Nusseibeh 2009). Following Abū l-Barakāt and al-Ghazālī, Fakhr al-Dīn rejects this line of reasoning, on the grounds that change in God’s knowledge is merely relational (Arbaʿīn, vol.1, 198). Imagine that you are standing still and something passes by you from right to left; in such a case you do not change, but your relation to that moving thing does change. Now, we need to imagine the same with respect to God’s knowledge the chain of events: it passes by God and God observes it, without God essentially changing.

This account of divine knowledge requires a very specific understanding of knowledge and cognition. Fakhr al-Dīn al-Rāzī, again following Abū l-Barakāt and al-Ghazālī, defines cognition as a relational state (ḥāla iḍāfiyya). Fahr al-Dīn opposes this theory to the representationalist theory of cognition, commonly ascribed to Ibn Sīnā at this time:

Perception does not just come down to the making of an impression. The truth is rather that it is a relational connective state. For we know self-evidently that we have seen Zayd, given that our visual capacity faculty has a certain relation to him. Anyone who claims that the object seen is not Zayd, who exists extramentally and is not seen at all, and that the object seen is rather his representation (miṯāl) and likeness (šabaḥ), has put into doubt the most important and powerful items of necessary knowledge (Šarḥ al-Išārāt vol.2, 233).

According to representationalism, cognition involves the inherence of the cognized object in the object of cognition. For instance, when I think of a red apple, the idea of a red apple must be “imprinted” in my mind. For Fakhr al-Dīn, cognition is a direct relation between the agent of cognition and the object of cognition itself, that is, the red apple in itself. Representations—if there are any—are not the objects of cognition (Benevich 2019a, 2020b; Griffel 2021: 341–84).

One may wonder how this theory could explain the cognition of non-existent objects. To what does my mind relate when I think of a phoenix, or of a square circle? Ibn Sīnā introduced the notion of mental existence in response to this kind of question. The phoenix may fail to be existent outside the mind, but it exists in my mind while I am thinking about it, again being imprinted in my mind (Black 1997). Just as Fakhr al-Dīn rejects the representationalist theory of cognition, he consistently rejects the Avicennan notion of mental existence (wujūd dhihnī). For him, when I think of non-existent beings, I just think of elements that constitute those beings and are observable in the world. For instance, thinking of a square circle means thinking of a square and a circle as if they were combined (Benevich 2018; on the related issue of the “paradox of the unknown” see Lameer 2014).

With this relational theory of cognition in hand, Fakhr al-Dīn is able to resolve the puzzle of how God knows about changing things. Objects of cognition are external to the agent of cognition, so that change in those objects and the subsequent change in the process of cognition does not involve any change in the agent. Thus we can say that God is a necessary being, but not necessary in all respects, since His relational cognition of current events is constantly in the process of change. Yet this implies no change in God’s essence. Moreover, we have seen above that Ibn Sīnā suggests that God has knowledge of universal rules of causation and natural laws. Fakhr al-Dīn argues that precisely this kind of knowledge that Ibn Sīnā ascribes to God, that is, the knowledge of universal rules and causation, results in knowing every single event in the world at the time when it happens (Maṭālib, vol.3, 163–64).

Fakhr al-Dīn’s reasoning here presupposes a strictly determinist account of the world. There is a causal explanation for each event, and God knows it. And indeed, Fakhr al-Dīn is willing to embrace determinism fully. For instance, with respect to human actions, he argues that they are determined by the combination of our motivations, beliefs, and capacities. We do not have control over any of these (as we saw in Section 1, Fakhr al-Dīn insists that our beliefs are not up to us); so we do not have any control over our actions either (Maṭālib, vol.9, 35–43). There are two important premises underlying Fakhr al-Dīn’s determinism, both borrowed from Ibn Sīnā. One is that there must be, for everything that exists but could have failed to exist, some reason why it exists; this is said to “preponderate” the thing to exist rather than not existing. Second, when that reason is present, the phenomenon must inevitably happen. Therefore, in the presence of our capacities and motivations, we have no choice but to act, and do so necessarily (Maṭālib, vol.9, 21–23; Mabāḥith, vol.2, 517; on al-Rāzī’s theory of action see further Shihadeh 2006).

5. Psychology

A fundamental assumption of Aristotelian psychology is that the souls of all living things are characterized by a range of “powers” or “faculties” (Greek dunameis, Arabic quwan). These powers account for the distinction between plants, animals, and humans: plants have the “vegetative” powers of nutrition, growth, and reproduction; animals the powers of sensation, locomotion, and imagination; humans alone (among embodied beings) have the power of reason or intellect. Ibn Sīnā made significant alterations to this scheme, not least by introducing a theory of “internal senses” to account for cognitive capacities lying between sensation and full-blown intellection. But broadly speaking, he adhered to the tradition of faculty psychology. Fakhr al-Dīn’s earlier contemporary Abū l-Barakāt al-Baghdādī rejected this whole approach. For him the soul is a unity and is the single subject of all cognition (Kaukua 2016).

Fakhr al-Dīn agrees, and in several of his works offers arguments intended to confirm Abū l-Barakāt’s thesis. The most powerful of these is that the soul is capable of what we might call “hybrid judgments”. These are modeled on the sort of case considered already by Aristotle, that honey is both white and sweet: here vision and taste might seem to be making a judgment about the same object, suggesting that they belong to a single subject, which could be the entire soul. Such is Aristotle’s commitment to faculty psychology, though, that he instead introduces a new power within the soul (the “common sense”) to take responsibility for judgments that involve more than one sense modality. Or at least, this is how he was understood in the later tradition.

Fakhr al-Dīn argues, however, that the same pattern repeats across all the faculties. For example, Ibn Sīnā had drawn a strict contrast between the human intellect and the lower cognitive faculties, on the grounds that the former grasps universals while the latter powers—from sensation to imagination and memory—deal only with particulars. But, says Fakhr al-Dīn, we are able to apply a universal to a particular (“Zayd is human”). It must be the unified soul that is responsible for such judgments:

When we perceive a particular individual human, we know that he is a particular belonging to the universal “human” and not a particular belonging to the universal “horse”. That which judges a particular man to be a particular belonging to the universal “human” and not a particular belonging to the universal “horse”, must inevitably be perceptive of the particular man, the universal “human”, and the universal “horse”. And so that which perceives particulars is also that which perceives universals (Mabāḥith vol.2, 255; 345–6; Sharḥ al-Ishārāt vol.2, 265–7; the unity of the soul is discussed in depth at Maṭālib vol.7, 159ff).

Another point, which again is taken over from Abū l-Baghdādī, is that the human soul at least has a kind of “first person perspective” on its cognitive actions. It is capable of grasping itself directly—as argued by Ibn Sīnā himself in his famous “flying man” argument—and of grasping itself as the subject of all its cognitions. Note that, since these arguments all turn on active cognition, Fakhr al-Dīn is willing to exempt the non-cognitive vegetative powers from this unified soul (Mabāḥith vol.2, 256–7). But there is no division of powers distinguishing the “animal soul” from the rational soul that is distinctive of humans.

This does not stop Fakhr al-Dīn from using Ibn Sīnā’s method for proving that the human soul is an immaterial substance (Adamson 2021b, Alpina 2021). Ibn Sīnā’s proof inferred the rational soul’s nature from the nature of its objects: since it grasps indivisible intelligible forms, it must itself be indivisible, and therefore not a body. In this case Fakhr al-Dīn chooses not to refute the Avicennan line of argument but to improve upon it, by adding further arguments to show that intelligibles are indeed indivisible (Mabāḥith vol.2, 362–5, also Sharḥ vol.2, 285–8). He does still worry that the argument is incomplete: the rational soul could be indivisible but not immaterial if it were an atom (Maṭālib vol.7, 62), so the cogency of the argument will depend on showing that atomism is incoherent (see above, Section 3). And even if we reject atomism, Avicennan prime matter is arguably also indivisible (Sharḥ vol.2, 295). Still Fakhr al-Dīn seems to be at least well-disposed towards the idea that the soul’s ability to grasp intelligibles establishes its immateriality.

Since this ability belongs to the entire, unified soul and not is just one “faculty” that could exist on its own as a disembodied mind, this should secure immateriality, and hence the prospect of immortality, for the human soul. When he speaks about the nature of the human soul, he sometimes says that it is a luminous substance that fuses with the body like rosewater in rose petals or oil in sesame, which seems to make it a kind of very subtle body but not, he says, like those perceptible to the senses (for passages see Jaffer 2015: 192). But it other contexts, Fakhr al-Dīn seems to be ready to embrace full-fledged substance dualism. For this conclusion he typically uses argumentation based on introspection, such as his version of Ibn Sīnā’s Flying Man argument, or the immediate awareness of personal identity over time (see, e.g., Maṭālib, vol.7, 101; 105).

What about animal souls? The arguments presented so far clearly blur the sharp distinction that Ibn Sīnā and other falāsifa drew between human and animal souls. But Fakhr al-Dīn goes further. In both his Mulakhkhaṣ and his Maṭālib he suggests that non-human animals have intelligence that is not different in kind from human rationality (Adamson & Somma forthcoming, Virgi 2022). Animals are self-aware, know that they persist through time, grasp universals, and can make plans and solve problems. This does not necessarily mean that animals are equal to humans in their intelligence. Rather there may be a continuum of cognitive capacities, with some animals ranged further away from humans, others closer to them. But

if what is meant by “reason” is any of the types of intelligence, then this intelligence should be attributed to [non-human] animals. (Maṭālib vol.7, 311)

He may have found this view plausible in part because, again following Abū l-Barakāt, he is open to the idea that even just within the human “species” we have differences that amount to distinctions in quiddity (Maṭālib vol.7, 141). So from this point of view too, there is little reason to embrace a stark opposition between human and non-human animal nature.

6. Ethics

One passage which makes that point is found in his Book on the Soul and Spirit (Kitāb al-Nafs wa-l-rūḥ 86–7): humans differ so much in their character traits that one may suspect they do not all share the same essence. That exemplifies the approach of this separate treatise, which is to stage a joint inquiry into ethics and the soul. One theme addressed here is the improvement of our “character traits (akhlāq)”. This is hardly surprising: the centrality of this concept in Arabic moral thinking was such that ethics itself was referred to as ʿilm al-akhlāq (literally, “the science of character traits”). And philosophers both before Fakhr al-Dīn, like Miskawayh (d.1040) and Yaḥyā Ibn ʿAdī (d.974), and after him, like Naṣīr al-Dīn al-Ṭūsī (d.1274), put character traits in both the thematic focus of their writings on ethics and the titles of those writings. These works are part of a broadly Aristotelian tradition of virtue ethics, which encourages readers to pursue excellent rather than base character. Ibn Sīnā also contributed to this tradition, as in two short works called On Ethics (again, Fī l-ʿilm al-akhāq) and On Governance (Fī l-Siyāsa; for Ibn Sīnā’S influence on later practical philosophy see Kaya 2014).

Fakhr al-Dīn was of course aware of this approach to ethics, and took an interest in the topic of virtue (al-Shaar 2012). But he was no Aristotelian. Historically, we can say that he responds more to kalām ethics; philosophically, we can say that he was a consequentialist rather than a virtue theorist (for this the essential reading is Shihadeh 2006; see also his 2016). Taking the historical point first, as an Ashʿarite he is committed to what would now be called a “divine command theory”. That is, the right action is whatever is commanded by God, the wrong action is whatever is forbidden. The Ashʿarite stance emerged as a critique of the Muʿtazilite position, which holds that certain types of action are known to be wrong without recourse to revelation, for example lying. We can always imagine circumstances in which “intrinsically wrong” action types turn out to be right after all, like lying to a tyrant to avoid betraying a prophet (Arbaʿīn vol.1, 348). Therefore this Muʿtazilite theory is untenable.

Fakhr al-Dīn’s early works uphold a straightforward divine command theory. But he comes to pair this with a hedonist and consequentialist ethics, which assumes that pleasure is good for humans and pain bad. To avoid a regress of normative explanation, there must be some fundamental norm, and in Fakhr al-Dīn’s view hedonism provides that norm. The connection between hedonism and Ashʿarite ethics is that God has promised us pleasure if we follow His commands, and pain if we do not. Thus, the divine command theory turns out to be justified on egoistic, consequentialist grounds (Shihadeh 2016: 66). This also opens the prospect for determining what we should do in the absence of a divine command: whatever is “beneficial”, in other words pleasure-maximizing for the agent. Because pleasure is now so central to his ethical theory, he devotes significant attention to its nature, refuting the originally Platonic “restoration theory” according to which all pleasure is a return to a natural state from a harmful or painful state (Sharḥ vol.2, 552–4). This analysis might apply to the base pleasures of food or sex, but would not hold for higher pleasures like the grasping of knowledge (see his Epistle Censuring the Pleasures of this World, in Shihadeh 2016).

If we again take his late work, the Maṭālib, as our best evidence for Fakhr al-Dīn’s final philosophical views, then we can infer that he retained his commitment to consequentialism. Characteristically, he itemizes arguments against his own position and refutes them one by one (Maṭālib vol.3, 66–9). For example, you might encounter an ill person in a wasteland where no one else is around to see, and help them. What pleasure are you getting out of this? None, it would seem, yet you would and should do it nonetheless. Fakhr al-Dīn explains that you would be acting on the principle that, if you were in the same position as the unfortunate person, you would want to be treated in the same way. This is not an appeal to some kind of Kantian categorical imperative, but more like what we now call “rule utilitarianism”. That is, we should act in such a way that if people in general acted like this, pleasure would be maximized and pain minimized (for a similar interpretation see Shihadeh 2016: 80, who emphasizes that the motivation is “neither altruistic nor based on a sense of duty… but is a self-centred, prudential motivation”).

This example shows that Fakhr al-Dīn was not simply reacting to Avicennan falsafa by rehearsing an Ashʿarite kalām view (though he does also refute Ibn Sīnā’s proposal, inspired by Neoplatonism, that evils are cases of non-being). He also applied his philosophical acuity to reflect on, and modify, the Ashʿarite position. In the later tradition he was sometimes accused of adopting skepticism. A representative anecdote has him weeping after being disabused of something he had formerly taken as certain truth and lamenting, “what is there to prove that all my beliefs are not of this nature?” (quoted at Kholeif 1966: 18). The impression of skepticism could also be encouraged by his tendency to provide only a minimal verdict, or no verdict at all, at the end of a lengthy dialectical investigation of some issue. This is something else that annoyed later readers: the sheer accumulation of arguments he offered for unacceptable views was dangerous, even if refutations of these arguments were given thereafter. And it does seem that he saw certain demonstration as being impossible on many theological and philosophical issues. But he was not a global skeptic. As discussed above, he had views about what it would mean to have knowledge, and assumed that knowledge is indeed attainable. His massive and still inadequately explored corpus testifies to his determination to attain that knowledge like no one else in his time, and thus to supplant Ibn Sīnā as the indispensable thinker of the Islamic world.


For a full bibliography see:

  • Janos, Damien and Muhammad Fariduddin Attar, 2023, A Comprehensive, Annotated, and Indexed Bibliography of the Modern Scholarship on Fakhr al-Dīn al-Rāzī, (Handbook of Oriental Studies. Section 1 the Near and Middle East, 171), Leiden/Boston: Brill.

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Our thanks to Hanif Amin Beidokhti, Merve Boz, Damien Janos, Andreas Lammer, Michael Sebastian Noble, and Sarah Virgi for help with this article.

Copyright © 2023 by
Peter Adamson <peter.adamson@lrz.uni-muenchen.de>
Fedor Benevich <Fedor.Benevich@ed.ac.uk>

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