Biological Altruism

First published Tue Jun 3, 2003; substantive revision Sun Jul 21, 2013

In evolutionary biology, an organism is said to behave altruistically when its behaviour benefits other organisms, at a cost to itself. The costs and benefits are measured in terms of reproductive fitness, or expected number of offspring. So by behaving altruistically, an organism reduces the number of offspring it is likely to produce itself, but boosts the number that other organisms are likely to produce. This biological notion of altruism is not identical to the everyday concept. In everyday parlance, an action would only be called ‘altruistic’ if it was done with the conscious intention of helping another. But in the biological sense there is no such requirement. Indeed, some of the most interesting examples of biological altruism are found among creatures that are (presumably) not capable of conscious thought at all, e.g. insects. For the biologist, it is the consequences of an action for reproductive fitness that determine whether the action counts as altruistic, not the intentions, if any, with which the action is performed.

Altruistic behaviour is common throughout the animal kingdom, particularly in species with complex social structures. For example, vampire bats regularly regurgitate blood and donate it to other members of their group who have failed to feed that night, ensuring they do not starve. In numerous bird species, a breeding pair receives help in raising its young from other ‘helper’ birds, who protect the nest from predators and help to feed the fledglings. Vervet monkeys give alarm calls to warn fellow monkeys of the presence of predators, even though in doing so they attract attention to themselves, increasing their personal chance of being attacked. In social insect colonies (ants, wasps, bees and termites), sterile workers devote their whole lives to caring for the queen, constructing and protecting the nest, foraging for food, and tending the larvae. Such behaviour is maximally altruistic: sterile workers obviously do not leave any offspring of their own—so have personal fitness of zero—but their actions greatly assist the reproductive efforts of the queen.

From a Darwinian viewpoint, the existence of altruism in nature is at first sight puzzling, as Darwin himself realized. Natural selection leads us to expect animals to behave in ways that increase their own chances of survival and reproduction, not those of others. But by behaving altruistically an animal reduces its own fitness, so should be at a selective disadvantage vis-à-vis one which behaves selfishly. To see this, imagine that some members of a group of Vervet monkeys give alarm calls when they see predators, but others do not. Other things being equal, the latter will have an advantage. By selfishly refusing to give an alarm call, a monkey can reduce the chance that it will itself be attacked, while at the same time benefiting from the alarm calls of others. So we should expect natural selection to favour those monkeys that do not give alarm calls over those that do. But this raises an immediate puzzle. How did the alarm-calling behaviour evolve in the first place, and why has it not been eliminated by natural selection? How can the existence of altruism be reconciled with basic Darwinian principles?

1. Altruism and the Levels of Selection

The problem of altruism is intimately connected with questions about the level at which natural selection acts. If selection acts exclusively at the individual level, favouring some individual organisms over others, then it seems that altruism cannot evolve, for behaving altruistically is disadvantageous for the individual organism itself, by definition. However, it is possible that altruism may be advantageous at the group level. A group containing lots of altruists, each ready to subordinate their own selfish interests for the greater good of the group, may well have a survival advantage over a group composed mainly or exclusively of selfish organisms. A process of between-group selection may thus allow the altruistic behaviour to evolve. Within each group, altruists will be at a selective disadvantage relative to their selfish colleagues, but the fitness of the group as a whole will be enhanced by the presence of altruists. Groups composed only or mainly of selfish organisms go extinct, leaving behind groups containing altruists. In the example of the Vervet monkeys, a group containing a high proportion of alarm-calling monkeys will have a survival advantage over a group containing a lower proportion. So conceivably, the alarm-calling behaviour may evolve by between-group selection, even though within each group, selection favours monkeys that do not give alarm calls.

The idea that group selection might explain the evolution of altruism was first broached by Darwin himself. In The Descent of Man (1871), Darwin discussed the origin of altruistic and self-sacrificial behaviour among humans. Such behaviour is obviously disadvantageous at the individual level, as Darwin realized: “he who was ready to sacrifice his life, as many a savage has been, rather than betray his comrades, would often leave no offspring to inherit his noble nature” (p.163). Darwin then argued that self-sacrificial behaviour, though disadvantageous for the individual ‘savage’, might be beneficial at the group level: “a tribe including many members who...were always ready to give aid to each other and sacrifice themselves for the common good, would be victorious over most other tribes; and this would be natural selection” (p.166). Darwin's suggestion is that the altruistic behaviour in question may have evolved by a process of between-group selection.

The concept of group selection has a chequered and controversial history in evolutionary biology. The founders of modern neo-Darwinism—R.A. Fisher, J.B.S. Haldane and S. Wright—were all aware that group selection could in principle permit altruistic behaviours to evolve, but they doubted the importance of this evolutionary mechanism. Nonetheless, many mid-twentieth century ecologists and some ethologists, notably Konrad Lorenz, routinely assumed that natural selection would produce outcomes beneficial for the whole group or species, often without even realizing that individual-level selection guarantees no such thing. This uncritical ‘good of the species’ tradition came to an abrupt halt in the 1960s, due largely to the work of G.C. Williams (1966) and J. Maynard Smith (1964). These authors argued that group selection was an inherently weak evolutionary force, hence unlikely to promote interesting altruistic behaviours. This conclusion was supported by a number of mathematical models, which apparently showed that group selection would only have significant effects for a limited range of parameter values. As a result, the notion of group selection fell into widespread disrepute in orthodox evolutionary circles; see Sober and Wilson 1998, Segestrale 2000, Okasha 2006, Leigh 2010 and Sober 2011 for details of the history of this debate.

The major weakness of group selection as an explanation of altruism, according to the consensus that emerged in the 1960s, was a problem that Dawkins (1976) called ‘subversion from within’; see also Maynard Smith 1964. Even if altruism is advantageous at the group level, within any group altruists are liable to be exploited by selfish ‘free-riders’ who refrain from behaving altruistically. These free-riders will have an obvious fitness advantage: they benefit from the altruism of others, but do not incur any of the costs. So even if a group is composed exclusively of altruists, all behaving nicely towards each other, it only takes a single selfish mutant to bring an end to this happy idyll. By virtue of its relative fitness advantage within the group, the selfish mutant will out-reproduce the altruists, hence selfishness will eventually swamp altruism. Since the generation time of individual organisms is likely to be much shorter than that of groups, the probability that a selfish mutant will arise and spread is very high, according to this line of argument. ‘Subversion from within’ is generally regarded as a major stumbling block for group-selectionist theories of the evolution of altruism.

If group selection is not the correct explanation for how the altruistic behaviours found in nature evolved, then what is? In the 1960s and 1970s a rival theory emerged: kin selection or ‘inclusive fitness’ theory, due originally to Hamilton (1964). This theory, discussed in detail below, apparently showed how altruistic behaviour could evolve without the need for group-level selection, and quickly gained prominence among biologists interested in the evolution of social behaviour; the empirical success of kin selection theory contributed to the demise of the group selection concept. However, the precise relation between kin and group selection is a source of ongoing controversy (see for example the recent exchange in Nature between Nowak, Tarnita and Wilson 2010 and Abbot et. al. 2011). Since the 1990s, proponents of ‘multi-level selection theory’ have resuscitated a form of group-level selection—sometimes called ‘new’ group selection—and shown that it can permit altruism to evolve (cf. Sober and Wilson 1998). But ‘new’ group selection turns out to be mathematically equivalent to kin selection in most if not all cases, as a number of authors have emphasized (Grafen 1984, Frank 1998, West et al. 2007, Lehmann et al. 2007, Marshall 2011); this point was already appreciated by Hamilton (1975). Since the relation between ‘old’ and ‘new’ group selection is itself a point of controversy, this explains why disagreement about the relation between kin and group selection should persist.

2. Kin Selection and Inclusive Fitness

The basic idea of kin selection is simple. Imagine a gene which causes its bearer to behave altruistically towards other organisms, e.g. by sharing food with them. Organisms without the gene are selfish—they keep all their food for themselves, and sometimes get handouts from the altruists. Clearly the altruists will be at a fitness disadvantage, so we should expect the altruistic gene to be eliminated from the population. However, suppose that altruists are discriminating in who they share food with. They do not share with just anybody, but only with their relatives. This immediately changes things. For relatives are genetically similar—they share genes with one another. So when an organism carrying the altruistic gene shares his food, there is a certain probability that the recipients of the food will also carry copies of that gene. (How probable depends on how closely related they are.) This means that the altruistic gene can in principle spread by natural selection. The gene causes an organism to behave in a way which reduces its own fitness but boosts the fitness of its relatives—who have a greater than average chance of carrying the gene themselves. So the overall effect of the behaviour may be to increase the number of copies of the altruistic gene found in the next generation, and thus the incidence of the altruistic behaviour itself.

Though this argument was hinted at by Haldane in the 1930s, and to a lesser extent by Darwin in his discussion of sterile insect castes in The Origin of Species, it was first made explicit by William Hamilton (1964) in a pair of seminal papers. Hamilton demonstrated rigorously that an altruistic gene will be favoured by natural selection when a certain condition, known as Hamilton's rule, is satisfied. In its simplest version, the rule states that b > c/r, where c is the cost incurred by the altruist (the donor), b is the benefit received by the recipients of the altruism, and r is the co-efficient of relationship between donor and recipient. The costs and benefits are measured in terms of reproductive fitness. The co-efficient of relationship depends on the genealogical relation between donor and recipient—it is defined as the probability that donor and recipient share genes at a given locus that are ‘identical by descent’. (Two genes are identical by descent if they are copies of a single gene in a shared ancestor.) In a sexually reproducing diploid species, the value of r for full siblings is ½, for parents and offspring ½, for grandparents and grandoffspring ¼, for full cousins 1/8,  and so-on. The higher the value of r, the greater the probability that the recipient of the altruistic behaviour will also possess the gene for altruism. So what Hamilton's rule tells us is that a gene for altruism can spread by natural selection, so long as the cost incurred by the altruist is offset by a sufficient amount of benefit to sufficiently closed related relatives. The proof of Hamilton's rule relies on certain non-trivial assumptions; see Frank 1998, Grafen 1985, 2006, Queller 1992a, 1992b, Boyd and McIlreath 2006 and Birch forthcoming for details.

Though Hamilton himself did not use the term, his idea quickly became known as ‘kin selection’, for obvious reasons. Kin selection theory predicts that animals are more likely to behave altruistically towards their relatives than towards unrelated members of their species. Moreover, it predicts that the degree of altruism will be greater, the closer the relationship. In the years since Hamilton's theory was devised, these predictions have been amply confirmed by empirical work. For example, in various bird species, it has been found that ‘helper’ birds are much more likely to help relatives raise their young, than they are to help unrelated breeding pairs. Similarly, studies of Japanese macaques have shown that altruistic actions, such as defending others from attack, tend to be preferentially directed towards close kin. In most social insect species, a peculiarity of the genetic system known as ‘haplodiploidy’ means that females on average share more genes with their sisters than with their own offspring. So a female may well be able to get more genes into the next generation by helping the queen reproduce, hence increasing the number of sisters she will have, rather than by having offspring of her own. Kin selection theory therefore provides a neat explanation of how sterility in the social insects may have evolved by Darwinian means. (Note, however, that the precise significance of haplodiploidy for the evolution of worker sterility is a controversial question; see Maynard Smith and Szathmary 1995 ch.16, Gardner, Alpedrinha and West 2012.)

Kin selection theory is often presented as a triumph of the ‘gene's-eye view of evolution’, which sees organic evolution as the result of competition among genes for increased representation in the gene-pool, and individual organisms as mere ‘vehicles’ that genes have constructed to aid their propagation (Dawkins 1976, 1982). The gene's eye-view is certainly the easiest way of understanding kin selection, and was employed by Hamilton himself in his 1964 papers. Altruism seems anomalous from the individual organism's point of view, but from the gene's point of view it makes good sense. A gene wants to maximize the number of copies of itself that are found in the next generation; one way of doing that is to cause its host organism to behave altruistically towards other bearers of the gene, so long as the costs and benefits satisfy the Hamilton inequality. But interestingly, Hamilton showed that kin selection can also be understood from the organism's point of view. Though an altruistic behaviour which spreads by kin selection reduces the organism's personal fitness (by definition), it increases what Hamilton called the organism's inclusive fitness. An organism's inclusive fitness is defined as its personal fitness, plus the sum of its weighted effects on the fitness of every other organism in the population, the weights determined by the coefficient of relationship r. Given this definition, natural selection will act to maximise the inclusive fitness of individuals in the population (Grafen 2006). Instead of thinking in terms of selfish genes trying to maximize their future representation in the gene-pool, we can think in terms of organisms trying to maximize their inclusive fitness. Most people find the ‘gene's eye’ approach to kin selection heuristically simpler than the inclusive fitness approach, but mathematically they are in fact equivalent (Michod 1982, Frank 1998, Boyd and McIlreath 2006, Grafen 2006).

Contrary to what is sometimes thought, kin selection does not require that animals must have the ability to discriminate relatives from non-relatives, less still to calculate coefficients of relationship. Many animals can in fact recognize their kin, often by smell, but kin selection can operate in the absence of such an ability. Hamilton's inequality can be satisfied so long as an animal behaves altruistically towards other animals that are in fact its relatives. The animal might achieve this by having the ability to tell relatives from non-relatives, but this is not the only possibility. An alternative is to use some proximal indicator of kinship. For example, if an animal behaves altruistically towards those in its immediate vicinity, then the recipients of the altruism are likely to be relatives, given that relatives tend to live near each other. No ability to recognize kin is presupposed. Cuckoos exploit precisely this fact, free-riding on the innate tendency of birds to care for the young in their nests.

Another popular misconception is that kin selection theory is committed to ‘genetic determinism’, the idea that genes rigidly determine or control behaviour. Though some sociobiologists have made incautious remarks to this effect, evolutionary theories of behaviour, including kin selection, are not committed to it. So long as the behaviours in question have a genetical component, i.e. are influenced to some extent by one or more genetic factor, then the theories can apply. When Hamilton (1964) talks about a gene which ‘causes’ altruism, this is really shorthand for a gene which increases the probability that its bearer will behave altruistically, to some degree. This is much weaker than saying that the behaviour is genetically ‘determined’, and is quite compatible with the existence of strong environmental influences on the behaviour's expression. Kin selection theory does not deny the truism that all traits are affected by both genes and environment. Nor does it deny that many interesting animal behaviours are transmitted through non-genetical means, such as imitation and social learning (Avital and Jablonka 2000).

The importance of kinship for the evolution of altruism is very widely accepted today, on both theoretical and empirical grounds. However, kinship is really only a way of ensuring that altruists and recipients both carry copies of the altruistic gene, which is the fundamental requirement. If altruism is to evolve, it must be the case that the recipients of altruistic actions have a greater than average probability of being altruists themselves. Kin-directed altruism is the most obvious way of satisfying this condition, but there are other possibilities too (Hamilton 1975, Sober and Wilson 1998, Bowles and Gintis 2011, Gardner and West 2011). For example, if the gene that causes altruism also causes animals to favour a particular feeding ground (for whatever reason), then the required correlation between donor and recipient may be generated. It is this correlation, however brought about, that is necessary for altruism to evolve. This point was noted by Hamilton himself in the 1970s: he stressed that the coefficient of relationship of his 1964 papers should really be replaced with a more general correlation coefficient, which reflects the probability that altruist and recipient share genes, whether because of kinship or not (Hamilton 1970, 1972, 1975). This point is theoretically important, and has not always been recognized; but in practice, kinship remains the most important source of statistical associations between altruists and recipients (Maynard Smith 1998, Okasha 2002, West et al. 2007).

2.1 A Simple Illustration: the Prisoner's dilemma

The fact that correlation between donor and recipient is the key to the evolution of altruism can be illustrated via a simple ‘one shot’ Prisoner's dilemma game. Consider a large population of organisms who engage in a social interaction in pairs; the interaction affects their biological fitness. Organisms are of two types: selfish (S) and altruistic (A). The latter engage in pro-social behaviour, thus benefiting their partner but at a cost to themselves; the former do not. So in a mixed (S,A) pair, the selfish organism does better—he benefits from his partner's altruism without incurring any cost. However, (A,A) pairs do better than (S,S) pairs—for the former work as a co-operative unit, while the latter do not. The interaction thus has the form of a one-shot Prisoner's dilemma, familiar from game theory. Illustrative payoff values to each ‘player’, i.e., each partner in the interaction, measured in units of biological fitness, are shown in the matrix below.

Player 2
Altruist Selfish
Player 1 Altruist 11,11 0,20
Selfish 20,0 5,5
Payoffs for (Player 1, Player 2) in units of reproductive fitness

The question we are interested in is: which type will be favoured by selection? To make the analysis tractable, we make two simplifying assumptions: that reproduction is asexual, and that type is perfectly inherited, i.e., selfish (altruistic) organisms give rise to selfish (altruistic) offspring. Modulo these assumptions, the evolutionary dynamics can be determined very easily, simply by seeing whether the S or the A type has higher fitness, in the overall population. The fitness of the S type, W(S), is the weighted average of the payoff to an S when partnered with an S and the payoff to an S when partnered with an A, where the weights are determined by the probability of having the partner in question. Therefore,

W(S) = 5 * Prob(S partner/S) + 20 * Prob(A partner/S)

(The conditional probabilities in the above expression should be read as the probability of having a selfish (altruistic) partner, given that one is selfish oneself.)

Similarly, the fitness of the A type is:

W(A) = 0 * Prob(S partner/A) + 11 * Prob(A partner/A)

From these expressions for the fitnesses of the two types of organism, we can immediately deduce that the altruistic type will only be favoured by selection if there is a statistical correlation between partners, i.e., if altruists have greater than random chance of being paired with other altruists, and similarly for selfish types. For suppose there is no such correlation—as would be the case if the pairs were formed by random sampling from the population. Then, the probability of having a selfish partner would be the same for both S and A types, i.e., P(S partner/S) = P(S partner/A). Similarly, P(A partner/S) = P(A partner/A). From these probabilistic equalities, it follows immediately that W(S) is greater than W(A), as can be seen from the expressions for W(S) and W(A) above; so the selfish type will be favoured by natural selection, and will increase in frequency every generation until all the altruists are eliminated from the population. Therefore, in the absence of correlation between partners, selfishness must win out (cf. Skyrms 1996). This confirms the point noted in section 2—that altruism can only evolve if there is a statistical tendency for the beneficiaries of altruistic actions to be altruists themselves.

If the correlation between partners is sufficiently strong, in this simple model, then it is possible for the condition W(A) > W(S) to be satisfied, and thus for altruism to evolve. The easiest way to see this is to suppose that the correlation is perfect, i.e., selfish types are always paired with other selfish types, and ditto for altruists, so P(S partner/S) = P(A partner/A) = 1. This assumption implies that W(A)=11 and W(S)=5, so altruism evolves. With intermediate degrees of correlation, it is also possible for the condition W(S) > W(A) to be satisfied, given the particular choice of payoff values in the model above.

This simple model also highlights the point made previously, that donor-recipient correlation, rather than genetic relatedness, is the key to the evolution of altruism. What is needed for altruism to evolve, in the model above, is for the probability of having a partner of the same type as oneself to be sufficiently larger than the probability of having a partner of opposite type; this ensures that the recipients of altruism have a greater than random chance of being fellow altruists, i.e., donor-recipient correlation. Whether this correlation arises because partners tend to be relatives, or because altruists are able to seek out other altruists and choose them as partners, or for some other reason, makes no difference to the evolutionary dynamics, at least in this simple example.

3. Conceptual Issues

Altruism is a well understood topic in evolutionary biology; the theoretical ideas explained above have been extensively analysed, empirically confirmed, and are widely accepted. Nonetheless, there are a number of conceptual ambiguities surrounding altruism and related concepts in the literature; some of these are purely semantic, others are more substantive. Three such ambiguities are briefly discussed below; for further discussion, see West et al. 2007, Sachs et al. 2004 or Lehmann and Keller 2006.

3.1 Altruism, Co-operation, Mutualism

According to the standard definition, a social behaviour counts as altruistic if it reduces the fitness of the organism performing the behaviour, but boosts the fitness of others. This was the definition used by Hamilton (1964), and by many subsequent authors. However, there is less consensus on how to describe behaviours that boost the fitness of others but also boost the fitness of the organism performing the behaviour. As West et al. (2007) note, such behaviours are sometimes termed ‘co-operative’, but this usage is not universal; others use ‘co-operation’ to refer to behaviour that boosts the fitness of others irrespective of its effect on self; while still others use ‘cooperation’ as a synonym for altruism. (Indeed, in the simple Prisoner's dilemma game above, the two strategies are usually called ‘co-operate’ and ‘defect’.) To avoid this confusion, West et al. (2007) suggest the term ‘mutual benefit’ for behaviours that benefit both self and other, while Sachs et al. (2004) suggest ‘byproduct benefit’.

Whatever term is used, the important point is that behaviours that benefit both self and others can evolve much more easily than altruistic behaviours, and thus require no special mechanisms such as kinship. The reason is clear: organisms performing such behaviours thereby increase their personal fitness, so are at a selective advantage vis-a-vis those not performing the behaviour. The fact that the behaviour has a beneficial effect on the fitness of others is a mere side-effect, or byproduct, and is not part of the explanation for why the behaviour evolves. For example, Sachs et al. (2004) note that an action such as joining a herd or a flock may be of this sort; the individual gains directly, via his reduced risk of predation, while simultaneously reducing the predation risk of other individuals. By contrast with an altruistic action, there is no personal incentive to ‘cheat’, i.e., to refrain from performing the action, for doing so would directly reduce personal fitness.

Also indicative of the difference between altruistic behaviour and behaviour that benefit both self and others is the fact that in the latter case, though not the former, the beneficiary may be a member of a different species, without altering the evolutionary dynamics of the behaviour. Indeed, there are numerous examples where the self-interested activities of one organism produce an incidental benefit for a non-conspecific; such behaviours are sometimes called ‘mutualistic’, though again, this is not the only way that the latter term has been used (West et al. 2007). By contrast, in the case of altruism, it makes an enormous difference whether the beneficiary and the donor are con-specifics or not; for if not, then kin selection can play no role, and it is quite unclear how the altruistic behaviour can evolve. Unsurprisingly, virtually all the bona fide examples of biological altruism in the living world involve donors and recipients that are con-specifics. (Cases of so-called ‘reciprocal altruism’ are sometimes thought to be exceptions to this generalization; but see section 4 below.)

3.2 Weak and Strong Altruism

A quite different ambiguity concerns the distinction between weak and strong altruism, in the terminology of D.S. Wilson (1977, 1980, 1990). This distinction is about whether the altruistic action entails an absolute or relative fitness reduction for the donor. To count as strongly altruistic, a behaviour must reduce the absolute fitness (i.e., number of offspring) of the donor. Strong altruism is the standard notion of altruism in the literature, and was assumed above. To count as weakly altruistic, an action need only reduce the relative fitness of the donor, i.e., its fitness relative to that of the recipient. Thus for example, an action which causes an organism to leave an additional 10 offspring, but causes each organism(s) with which it interacts to leave an additional 20 offspring, is weakly but not strongly altruistic. The action boosts the absolute fitness of the ‘donor’, but boosts the absolute fitness of other organisms by even more, thus reducing the donor's relative fitness.

Should weakly altruistic behaviours be classified as altruistic or selfish? This question is not merely semantic; for the real issue is whether the conditions under which weak altruism can evolve are relevantly similar to the conditions under which strong altruism can evolve, or not. Many authors argue that the answer is ‘no’, on the grounds that weakly altruistic behaviours are individually advantageous, so can evolve with no component of kin selection or donor-recipient correlation, unlike strongly altruistic behaviours (Grafen 1984, Nunney 1985, West et al. 2007). To appreciate this argument, consider a game-theoretic scenario similar to the one-shot Prisoner's dilemma of section 4, in which organisms engage in a pair-wise interaction that affects their fitness. Organisms are of two types, weakly altruistic (W) and non-altruistic (N). W-types perform an action that boosts their own fitness by 10 units and the fitness of their partner by 20 units; N-types do not perform the action. The payoff matrix is thus:

Player 2
Weak Altruist Non
Player 1 Weak Altruist 30,30 10,20
Non 20,10 0,0
Payoffs for (Player 1, Player 2) in units of reproductive fitness

The payoff matrix highlights the fact that weak altruism is individually advantageous, and thus the oddity of thinking of it it as altruistic rather than selfish. To see this, assume for a moment that the game is being played by two rational agents, as in classical game theory. Clearly, the rational strategy for each individual is W, for W dominates N. Each individual gets a higher payoff from playing W than N, irrespective of what its opponent does—30 rather than 20 if the opponent plays W, 10 rather than 0 if the opponent plays N. This captures a clear sense in which weak altruism is individually advantageous.

In the context of evolutionary game theory, where the game is being played by pairs of organisms with hard-wired strategies, the counterpart of the fact that W dominates N is the fact that W can spread in the population even if pairs are formed at random (cf. Wilson 1980). To see this, consider the expressions for the overall population-wide fitnesses of W and N:

W(W) = 30 * Prob(W partner/W) + 10 * Prob(N partner/W)

W(N) = 20 * Prob(W partner/N) + 0 * Prob(N partner/N)

(As before, Prob(W partner/W) denotes the conditional probability of having a weakly altruistic partner given that one is weakly altruistic oneself, and so-on.) From these expressions, it is easy to see that W(W) > W(N) even if the there is no correlation among partners, i.e., even if Prob(W partner/W) = P(W partner/N) and P(N partner/W) = P(N partner/N). Therefore, weak altruism can evolve in the absence of donor-recipient correlation; as we saw, this is not true of strong altruism. So weak and strong altruism evolve by different evolutionary mechanisms, hence should not be co-classified, according to this argument.

However, there is a counter argument due to D.S. Wilson (1977, 1980), who maintains that weak altruism cannot evolve by individual selection alone; a component of group selection is needed. Wilson's argument stems from the fact that in a mixed (W,N) pair, the non-altruist is fitter than the weak altruist. More generally, within a single group of any size containing weak altruists and non-altruists, the latter will be fitter. So weak altruism can only evolve, Wilson argues, in a multi-group setting—in which the within-group selection in favour of N, is counteracted by between-group selection in favour of W. (On Wilson's view, the evolutionary game described above is a multi-group setting, involving a large number of groups of size two.) Thus weak altruism, like strong altruism, in fact evolves because it is group-advantageous, Wilson argues.

The dispute between those who regard weak altruism as individually advantageous, and those like Wilson who regard it as group advantageous, stems ultimately from differing conceptions of individual and group selection. For Wilson, individual selection means within-group selection, so to determine which strategy is favoured by individual selection, one must compare the fitnesses of W and N types within a group, or pair. For other theorists, individual selection means selection based on differences in individual phenotype, rather than social context; so to determine which strategy is favoured by individual selection, one must compare the fitnesses of W and N types in the same social context, i.e., with the same partner. These two comparisons yield different answers to the question of whether weak altruism is individually advantageous. Thus the debate over how to classify weak altruism is intimately connected to the broader levels of selection question; see Nunney 1985, Okasha 2005, 2006, Fletcher and Doebeli 2006, West et al. 2007, for further discussion.

3.3 Short-term versus Long-term Fitness Consequences

A further source of ambiguity in the definition of biological altruism concerns the time-scale over which fitness is measured. Conceivably, an animal might engage in a social behaviour which benefits another and reduces its own (absolute) fitness in the short-term; however, in the long-term, the behaviour might be to the animal's advantage. So if we focus on short-term fitness effects, the behaviour will seem altruistic; but if we focus on lifetime fitness, the behaviour will seem selfish—the animal's lifetime fitness would be reduced if it did not perform the behaviour.

Why might a social behaviour reduce an animal's short-term fitness but boost its lifetime fitness? This could arise in cases of ‘directed reciprocation’, where the beneficiary of the behaviour returns the favour at some point in the future (cf. Sachs et al. 2004). By performing the behaviour, and suffering the short-term cost, the animal thus ensures (or raises the chance) that it will receive return benefits in the future. Similarly, in symbioses between members of different species, it may pay an organism to sacrifice resources for the benefit of a symbiont with which it has a long-term relationship, as its long-term welfare may be heavily dependent on the symbiont's welfare.

From a theoretical point of view, the most satisfactory resolution of this ambiguity is to use lifetime fitness as the relevant parameter (cf. West et al. 2007) Thus an action only counts as altruistic if it reduces an organism's lifetime fitness. This stipulation makes sense, since it preserves the key idea that the evolution of altruism requires statistical association between donor and recipient; this would not be true if short-term fitness were used to define altruism, for behaviours which reduce short-term fitness but boost lifetime fitness can evolve with no component of kin selection, or donor-recipient correlation. However, the stipulation has two disadvantages: (i) it makes it harder to tell whether a given behaviour is altruistic, since lifetime fitness is notoriously difficult to estimate; (ii) it has the consequence that most models of ‘reciprocal altruism’ are mis-named.

4. Reciprocal Altruism

The theory of reciprocal altruism was originally developed by Trivers (1971), as an attempt to explain cases of (apparent) altruism among unrelated organisms, including members of different species. (Clearly, kin selection cannot help explain altruism among non-relatives.) Trivers' basic idea was straightforward: it may pay an organism to help another, if there is an expectation of the favour being returned in the future. (‘If you scratch my back, I'll scratch yours’.) The cost of helping is offset by the likelihood of the return benefit, permitting the behaviour to evolve by natural selection. Trivers termed with evolutionary mechanism ‘reciprocal altruism’.

For reciprocal altruism to work, there is no need for the two individuals to be relatives, nor even to be members of the same species. However, it is necessary that individuals should interact with each more than once, and have the ability to recognize other individuals with whom they have interacted in the past.[1] If individuals interact only once in their lifetimes and never meet again, there is obviously no possibility of return benefit, so there is nothing to be gained by helping another. However, if individuals encounter each other frequently, and are capable of identifying and punishing ‘cheaters’ who have refused to help in the past, then the helping behaviour can evolve. A ‘cheat’ who refuses to help will ultimately sabotage his own interests, for although he does not incur the cost of helping others, he forfeits the return benefits too—others will not help him in the future. This evolutionary mechanism is most likely to work where animals live in relatively small groups, increasing the likelihood of multiple encounters.

As West et al. (2007) and Bowles and Gintis (2011) note, if altruism is defined by reference to lifetime fitness, then Trivers' theory is not really about the evolution of altruism at all; for behaviours that evolve via reciprocation of benefits, as described by Trivers, are ultimately of direct benefit to the individuals performing them, so do not reduce lifetime fitness. Despite this consideration, the label ‘reciprocal altruism’ is well-entrenched in the literature, and the evolutionary mechanism that it describes is of some importance, whatever it is called. Where reciprocal altruism is referred to below, it should be remembered that the behaviours in question are only altruistic in the short-term.

The concept of reciprocal altruism is closely related to the Tit-for-Tat strategy in the iterated Prisoner's Dilemma (IPD) from game theory. In the IPD, players interact on multiple occasions, and are able to adjust their behaviour depending on what their opponent has done in previous rounds. There are two possible strategies, co-operate and defect; the payoff matrix (per interaction) is as in section 2.1 above. The fact that the game is iterated rather than one-shot obviously changes the optimal course of action; defecting is no longer necessarily the best option, so long as the probability of subsequent encounters is sufficiently high. In their famous computer tournament in which a large number of strategies were pitted against each other in the IPD, Axelrod and Hamilton (1981) found that the Tit-for-Tat strategy yielded the highest payoff. In Tit-For-Tat, a player follows two basic rules: (i) on the first encounter, cooperate; (ii) on subsequent encounters, do what your opponent did on the previous encounter. The success of Tit-for-Tat was widely taken to confirm the idea that with multiple encounters, natural selection could favour social behaviours that entail a short-term fitness cost. Subsequent work in evolutionary game theory, much of it inspired by Axelrod and Hamilton's ideas, has confirmed that repeated games permit the evolution of social behaviours that cannot evolve in one-shot situations (cf. Nowak 2006); this is closely related to the so-called 'folk theorem' of repeated game theory in economics (cf. Bowles and Gintis 2011). For a useful discussion of social behaviour that evolves via reciprocation of benefits, see Sachs et al. 2004.

Despite the attention paid to reciprocal altruism by theoreticians, clear-cut empirical examples in non-human animals are relatively few (Hammerstein 2003, Sachs et al. 2004, Taborsky 2013). This is probably because the pre-conditions for reciprocal altruism to evolve- multiple encounters and individual recognition—are not especially common. However, one possible example is provided by blood-sharing in vampire bats (Wilkinson 1984, 1990, Carter & Wilkinson 2013). It is quite common for a vampire bat to fail to feed on a given night. This is potentially fatal, for bats die if they go without food for more than a couple of days. On any given night, bats donate blood (by regurgitation) to other members of their group who have failed to feed, thus saving them from starvation. Since vampire bats live in small groups and associate with each other over long periods of time, the preconditions for reciprocal altruism are likely to be met. Wilkinson and his colleagues' studies showed that bats tended to share food with their close associates, and were more likely to share with others that had recently shared with them. These findings appear to accord with reciprocal altruism theory.

Trivers (1985) describes an apparent case of reciprocal altruism between non con-specifics. On tropical coral reefs, various species of small fish act as ‘cleaners’ for large fish, removing parasites from their mouths and gills. The interaction is mutually beneficial—the large fish gets cleaned and the cleaner gets fed. However, Trivers notes that the large fish sometimes appear to behave altruistically towards the cleaners. If a large fish is attacked by a predator while it has a cleaner in its mouth, then it waits for the cleaner to leave before fleeing the predator, rather than swallowing the cleaner and fleeing immediately. Trivers explains the larger fish's behaviour in terms of reciprocal altruism. Since the large fish often returns to the same cleaner many times over, it pays to look after the cleaner's welfare, i.e., not to swallow it, even if this increases the chance of being wounded by a predator. So the larger fish allows the cleaner to escape, because there is an expectation of return benefit—getting cleaned again in the future. As in the case of the vampire bats, it is because the large fish and the cleaner interact more than once that the behaviour can evolve.

5. But is it ‘Real’ Altruism?

The evolutionary theories described above, in particular kin selection, go a long way towards reconciling the existence of altruism in nature with Darwinian principles. However, some people have felt these theories in a way devalue altruism, and that the behaviours they explain are not ‘really’ altruistic. The grounds for this view are easy to see. Ordinarily we think of altruistic actions as disinterested, done with the interests of the recipient, rather than our own interests, in mind. But kin selection theory explains altruistic behaviour as a clever strategy devised by selfish genes as a way of increasing their representation in the gene-pool, at the expense of other genes. Surely this means that the behaviours in question are only ‘apparently’ altruistic, for they are ultimately the result of genic self-interest? Reciprocal altruism theory also seems to ‘take the altruism out of altruism’. Behaving nicely to someone in order to procure return benefits from them in the future seems in a way the antithesis of ‘real’ altruism—it is just delayed self-interest.

This is a tempting line of argument. Indeed Trivers (1971) and, arguably, Dawkins (1976) were themselves tempted by it. But it should not convince. The key point to remember is that biological altruism cannot be equated with altruism in the everyday vernacular sense. Biological altruism is defined in terms of fitness consequences, not motivating intentions. If by ‘real’ altruism we mean altruism done with the conscious intention to help, then the vast majority of living creatures are not capable of ‘real’ altruism nor therefore of ‘real’ selfishness either. Ants and termites, for example, presumably do not have conscious intentions, hence their behaviour cannot be done with the intention of promoting their own self-interest, nor the interests of others. Thus the assertion that the evolutionary theories reviewed above show that the altruism in nature is only apparent makes little sense. The contrast between ‘real’ altruism and merely apparent altruism simply does not apply to most animal species.

To some extent, the idea that kin-directed altruism is not ‘real’ altruism has been fostered by the use of the ‘selfish gene’ terminology of Dawkins (1976). As we have seen, the gene's-eye perspective is heuristically useful for understanding the evolution of altruistic behaviours, especially those that evolve by kin selection. But talking about ‘selfish’ genes trying to increase their representation in the gene-pool is of course just a metaphor (as Dawkins fully admits); there is no literal sense in which genes ‘try’ to do anything. Any evolutionary explanation of how a phenotypic trait evolves must ultimately show that the trait leads to an increase in frequency of the genes that code for it (presuming the trait is transmitted genetically.) Therefore, a ‘selfish gene’ story can by definition be told about any trait, including a behavioural trait, that evolves by Darwinian natural selection. To say that kin selection interprets altruistic behaviour as a strategy designed by ‘selfish’ genes to aid their propagation is not wrong; but it is just another way of saying that a Darwinian explanation for the evolution of altruism has been found. As Sober and Wilson (1998) note, if one insists on saying that behaviours which evolve by kin selection / donor-recipient correlation are ‘really selfish’, one ends up reserving the word ‘altruistic’ for behaviours which cannot evolve by natural selection at all.

Do theories of the evolution of biological altruism apply to humans? This is part of the broader question of whether ideas about the evolution of animal behaviour can be extrapolated to humans, a question that fuelled the sociobiology controversy of the 1980s and is still actively debated today (cf. Boyd and Richerson 2006, Bowles and Gintis 2011, Sterelny 2012). All biologists accept that Homo sapiens is an evolved species, and thus that general evolutionary principles apply to it. However, human behaviour is obviously influenced by culture to a far greater extent than that of other animals, and is often the product of conscious beliefs and desires (though this does not necessarily mean that genetics has no influence.) Nonetheless, at least some human behaviour does seem to fit the predictions of the evolutionary theories reviewed above. In general, humans behave more altruistically (in the biological sense) towards their close kin than towards non-relatives, e.g. by helping relatives raise their children, just as kin selection theory would predict. It is also true that we tend to help those who have helped us out in the past, just as reciprocal altruism theory would predict. On the other hand, humans are unique in that we co-operate extensively with our non-kin; and more generally, numerous human behaviours seem anomalous from the point of view of biological fitness. Think for example of adoption. Parents who adopt children instead of having their own reduce their biological fitness, obviously, so adoption is an altruistic behaviour. But it does not benefit kin—for parents are generally unrelated to the infants they adopt—and nor do the parents stand to gain much in the form of reciprocal benefits. So although evolutionary considerations can help us understand some human behaviours, they must be applied judiciously.

Where human behaviour is concerned, the distinction between biological altruism, defined in terms of fitness consequences, and ‘real’ altruism, defined in terms of the agent's conscious intentions to help others, does make sense. (Sometimes the label ‘psychological altruism’ is used instead of ‘real’ altruism.) What is the relationship between these two concepts? They appear to be independent in both directions, as Elliott Sober (1994) has argued; see also Vromen (2012) and Clavien and Chapuisat (2013). An action performed with the conscious intention of helping another human being may not affect their biological fitness at all, so would not count as altruistic in the biological sense. Conversely, an action undertaken for purely self-interested reasons, i.e., without the conscious intention of helping another, may boost their biological fitness tremendously.

Sober argues that, even if we accept an evolutionary approach to human behaviour, there is no particular reason to think that evolution would have made humans into egoists rather than psychological altruists (see also Schulz 2011). On the contrary, it is quite possible that natural selection would have favoured humans who genuinely do care about helping others, i.e., who are capable of ‘real’ or psychological altruism. Suppose there is an evolutionary advantage associated with taking good care of one's children—a quite plausible idea. Then, parents who really do care about their childrens' welfare, i.e., who are ‘real’ altruists, will have a higher inclusive fitness, hence spread more of their genes, than parents who only pretend to care, or who do not care. Therefore, evolution may well lead ‘real’ or psychological altruism to evolve. Contrary to what is often thought, an evolutionary approach to human behaviour does not imply that humans are likely to be motivated by self-interest alone. One strategy by which ‘selfish genes’ may increase their future representation is by causing humans to be non-selfish, in the psychological sense.


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