Units and Levels of Selection

First published Mon Aug 22, 2005; substantive revision Fri Apr 14, 2017

The theory of evolution by natural selection is, perhaps, the crowning intellectual achievement of the biological sciences. There is, however, considerable debate about which entity or entities are selected and what it is that fits them for that role. This article aims to clarify what is at issue in these debates by identifying four distinct, though often confused, concerns and then identifying how the debates on what constitute the units of selection depend to a significant degree on which of these four questions a thinker regards as central.

1. Introduction

When we think of evolutionary theory and natural selection, we usually think of organisms, say, a herd of deer, in which some deer are faster than others at escaping their predators. These swifter deer will, all things being equal, leave more offspring, and these offspring will have a tendency to be swifter than other deer. Thus, we get a change in the average swiftness of deer over evolutionary time. In a case like this, the unit of selection, sometimes called the “target” of selection, is the single organism, the individual deer, and the property being selected, swiftness, also lies at the organismic level, in that it is exhibited by the intact and whole deer, and not by either parts of deer, such as cells, or groups of deer, such as herds. But there are other levels of biological organization that have been proposed to be units or targets of selection—levels at which selection may act to increase a given property at that level, and at which units increase or decrease as a result of selection at that specific level of biological organization.

But for over thirty years, some participants in the “units of selection” debates have argued that more than one issue is at stake. The notions of “replicator” and “vehicle” were introduced, to stand for different roles in the evolutionary process (Dawkins 1978, 1982a,b). In this case, the individual deer would be called the “vehicles” and their genes that make them tend to be swifter would be called the “replicators.” The genic selection argument proceeded to assert that the units of selection debates should not be about vehicles, as they formerly had been, but about replicators. It was then asserted that the “replicator” actually subsumes two distinct functional roles, which can be broken up into “replicator” and “interactor”:

Dawkins…has replicators interacting with their environment in two ways—to produce copies of themselves and to influence their own survival and the survival of their copies. (Hull 1980: 318)

The new view would call the individual deer the “interactors.” It was then argued that the force of this distinction between replicator and interactor had been underappreciated, and if the units of selection controversies were analyzed further, that the question about interactors should more accurately be called the “levels of selection” debate to distinguish it from the dispute about replicators, which should be allowed to keep the “units of selection debate” title (Brandon 1982; Mitchell 1987).

The purpose of this article is to delineate further the various questions pursued under the rubric of “units and levels of selection.”[1] Four quite distinct questions will be isolated that have, in fact, been asked in the context of considering, what is a unit of selection? In section 2, these distinct questions are described. Section 3 returns to the sites of several very confusing, occasionally heated debates about “the” unit of selection. Several leading positions on the issues are analyzed utilizing the taxonomy of distinct questions.

This analysis is not meant to resolve any of the conflicts about which research questions are most worth pursuing; moreover, there is no attempt to decide which of the questions or combinations of questions discussed ought to be considered “the” units of selection question.

2. Four Basic Questions

Four basic questions can be delineated as distinct and separable. As will be demonstrated in section 3, these questions are often used in combination to represent the units of selection problem. But let us begin by clarifying terms (see Lloyd 1992, 2001). (See the entry on the biological notion of individual for more on this topic.)

The term replicator, originally introduced in the 1970s but since modified by philosophers in the 1980s, is used to refer to any entity of which copies are made (Dawkins 1976, 1982a,b; Hull 1980; Brandon 1982). Replicators were originally described using two orthogonal distinctions. A “germ-line” replicator, as distinct from a “dead-end” replicator, is “the potential ancestor of an indefinitely long line of descendant replicators” (Dawkins 1982a: 46). For instance, DNA in a chicken’s egg is a germ-line replicator, whereas that in a chicken’s wing is a dead-end replicator. Note that DNA are, but chickens are not, replicators, since the latter do not replicate themselves as wholes. An “active” replicator is “a replicator that has some causal influence on its own probability of being propagated,” whereas a “passive” replicator is never transcribed and has no phenotypic expression whatsoever (Dawkins 1982a: 47). There is special interest in active germ-line replicators, “since adaptations ‘for’ their preservation are expected to fill the world and to characterize living organisms” (Dawkins 1982a: 47).

The original terminology of “replicator” was introduced along with the term “vehicle”, which is defined as

any relatively discrete entity…which houses replicators, and which can be regarded as a machine programmed to preserve and propagate the replicators that ride inside it. (Dawkins 1982b: 295)

On this view, most replicators’ phenotypic effects are represented in vehicles, which are themselves the proximate targets of natural selection (Dawkins 1982a: 62).

In the introduction of the term “interactor”, it was observed that the previous theory has replicators interacting with their environments in two distinct ways: they produce copies of themselves, and they influence their own survival and the survival of their copies through the production of secondary products that ultimately have phenotypic expression (Hull 1980). The term “interactor” was suggested for the entities that function in this second process. An interactor denotes that entity which interacts, as a cohesive whole, directly with its environment in such a way that replication is differential—in other words, an entity on which selection acts directly (Hull 1980: 318). The process of evolution by natural selection is

a process in which the differential extinction and proliferation of interactors cause the differential perpetuation of the replicators that produced them. (Hull 1980: 318; see Brandon 1982: 317–318)

One challenge to the term, “interactor,” was that “interacting is not conspicuous during the process of elimination that results in natural selection” (Mayr 1997: 2093). It’s difficult to imagine why anyone would say this, given the original description of the interactor as “an entity that directly interacts … in such a way that replication is differential”. Perhaps more interestingly, the “target of selection” language is rejected because selection is seen as more of an elimination process; thus, it would be misleading to call the “leftovers” of the elimination process the “targets” of selection. The term “selecton”, was proposed, which is defined as

a discrete entity and a cohesive whole, an individual or a social group, the survival and successful reproduction of which is favored by selection owing to its possession of certain properties. (Mayr 1997: 2093)

This seems remarkably similar to an interactor, with the difference that no differential reproduction, and thus no evolution, is mentioned.

At the birth of the “interactor” concept, the concept of “evolvers” was also introduced, which are the entities that evolve as a result of selection on interactors: these are usually called lineages (Hull 1980). So far, no one has directly claimed that evolvers are units of selection. They can be seen, however, to be playing a role in considering the question of who owns an adaptation and who benefits from evolution by selection, which we will consider in sections 2.3 and 2.4.

2.1 The Interactor Question

In its traditional guise, the interactor question is, what units are being actively selected in a process of natural selection? As such, this question is involved in the oldest forms of the units of selection debates (Darwin 1859 [1964], Haldane 1932, Wright 1945). In an early review on “units of selection”, the purpose of the article was claimed as: “to contrast the levels of selection, especially as regards their efficiency as causers of evolutionary change” (Lewontin 1970: 7). Similarly, others assumed that a unit of selection is something that “responds to selective forces as a unit—whether or not this corresponds to a spatially localized deme, family, or population” (Slobodkin & Rapoport 1974: 184).

Questions about interactors focus on the description of the selection process itself, that is, on the interaction between an entity, that entity’s traits and environment, and on how this interaction produces evolution; they do not focus on the outcome of this process (see Wade 1977; Vrba & Gould 1986). The interaction between some interactor at a certain level and its environment is assumed to be mediated by “traits” that affect the interactor’s expected survival and reproductive success. Here, the interactor is possibly at any level of biological organization, including a group, a kin-group, an organism, a gamete, a chromosome, or a gene. Some portion of the expected fitness of the interactor is directly correlated with the value of the trait in question. The expected fitness of the interactor is commonly expressed in terms of genotypic fitness parameters, that is, in terms of the fitness of combinations of replicators. Hence, interactor success is most often reflected in and counted through, replicator success, either through simple summation of the fitnesses of their traits, or some more complicated relation. Several methods are available for expressing the correlation between interactor trait and (genotypic or genic) fitness, including partial regression, variances, and covariances.[2]

In fact, much of the interactor debate has been played out through the construction of mathematical genetic models—with the exception of work on group selection and on female-biased sex ratios (Wade 1980, 1985, 2016; D.S. Wilson & Colwell 1981; see especially Griesemer & Wade 1988). The point of building such models is to determine what kinds of selection, operating at which levels, may be effective in producing evolutionary change.

It has been widely held, for instance, that the conditions under which group selection can effect evolutionary change are quite stringent and rare. Typically, group selection was seen to require small group size, low migration rate, and extinction of entire demes.[3] Some modelers, however, disagree that these stringent conditions are necessary, and show that in the evolution of altruism by group selection, very small groups may not be necessary (Matessi & Jayakar 1976: 384; contra Maynard Smith 1964). Others also argue that small effective deme size is not a necessary prerequisite to the operation of group selection (Wade & McCauley 1980: 811). Similarly, another shows that strong extinction pressure on demes is not necessary (Boorman 1978: 1909). And finally, there was an early group selection model that violates all three of the “necessary” conditions usually cited (Uyenoyama 1979; see Wade 2016).

That different researchers reach such disparate conclusions about the efficacy of group selection is partly because they are using different models with different parameter values. Several assumptions, routinely used in group selection models, were highlighted, that biased the results of these models against the efficacy of group selection (Wade 1978). For example, many group selection models use a specific mechanism of migration; it is assumed that the migrating individuals mix completely, forming a “migrant pool” from which migrants are assigned to populations randomly. All populations are assumed to contribute migrants to a common pool from which colonists are drawn at random. Under this approach, which is used in all models of group selection prior to 1978, small sample size is needed to get a large genetic variance between populations (Wade 1978: 110; see discussion in Okasha 2003, 2006).

If, in contrast, migration occurs by means of large populations, higher heritability of traits and a more representative sampling of the parent population will result. Each propagate is made up of individuals derived from a single population, and there is no mixing of colonists from the different populations during propagule formation. On the basis of further analysis, much more between-population genetic variance can be maintained with the propagule model (Slatkin and Wade 1978: 3531). Thus, by using propagule pools as the assumption about colonization, one can greatly expand the set of parameter values for which group selection can be effective (Slatkin and Wade 1978, cf. Craig 1982).

Another aspect of this debate that has received a great deal of consideration concerns the mathematical tools necessary for identifying when a particular level of biological organization meets the criteria for being an interactor.[4] Overall, while many of the suggested techniques have had strengths, no one approach to this aspect of the interactor question has been generally accepted and indeed it remains the subject of debate in biological circles (Okasha 2004b,c). Detailed work on two of the major techniques, the Price equation and contextual analysis, has indicated that neither approach is universally applicable, on the grounds that neither provides a proper causal decomposition in all varieties of selection (Okasha 2006). Specifically, it appears that while contextual analysis may be superior in most cases of multi-level selection, the Price equation may be more useful in certain cases of genic selection (Okasha 2006).

It is important to note that, even in the midst of deciding among the various methods for representing selection processes, these choices have consequences for the empirical adequacy of the selection models. This is true even if the models are denied to have a causal interpretation, as is done by those promoting a “statisticalist” interpretation of selection theory (Walsh, Lewens, & Ariew 2002). On this view, evolution is seen as a purely statistical phenomenon, and population genetics studies statistical relations estimated by census, and not causal relationships. The claim is that the “deeply uninteresting” units of selection problem has been dissolved, whereas in fact, it has simply been restricted to the interactor question (while ignoring the other three “units” questions entirely); the problem of how to deliver an empirically adequate selection model is not directly addressed (2002: 470–471). Instead, an unspecified method is assumed that “identifies classes [that] … adequately predict and explain changes in the structure of the population” (Walsh, Lewens, & Ariew 2002: 471), with no acknowledgment that this involves making a commitment to one or another of the above methods of determining an interactor, whether under a causal interpretation or not. Thus, the interactor problem has not been escaped, whether or not it is interpreted causally (see Otsuka 2016).

Note that the “interactor question” does not involve attributing adaptations or benefits to the interactors, or indeed, to any candidate unit of selection. Interaction at a particular level involves only the presence of a trait at that level with a special relation to genic or genotypic expected success that is not reducible to interactions at a lower level. A claim about interaction indicates only that there is an evolutionarily significant event occurring at the level in question; it says nothing about the existence of adaptations at that level. As we shall see, the most common error made in interpreting many of the interactor-based approaches is that the presence of an interactor at a level is taken to imply that the interactor is also a manifestor of an adaptation at that level.

2.2 The Replicator Question

The focus of discussions about replicators concerns just which organic entities actually meet the definition of replicator. Answering this question obviously turns on what one takes the definition of replicator to be. In this connection the revision of the original meaning of “replicator” turned out to be central. The revised meaning refined and restricted the meaning of “replicator,” which was defined as “an entity that passes on its structure directly in replication” (Hull 1980: 318). The terms replicator and interactor will be used in this latter sense in the rest of this entry.

The revised definition of replicator corresponds more closely than the original one to a long-standing debate in genetics about how large or small a fragment of a genome ought to count as a replicating unit—something that is copied, and which can be treated separately in evolutionary theory (see especially Lewontin 1970; Hull 1980). This debate revolves critically around the issue of linkage disequilibrium and led some biologists to advocate the usage of parameters referring to the entire genome rather than to allele and genotypic frequencies in genetical models (Lewontin 1974).[5] The basic point is that with much linkage disequilibrium, individual genes cannot be considered as replicators because they do not behave as separate units during reproduction. Although this debate remains pertinent to the choice of state space of genetical model, it has been eclipsed by concerns about interactors in evolutionary genetics.

This is not to suggest that the replicator question has been solved. Work on the replicator question is part of a rich and continuing research program; it is simply no longer a large part of the units debates. That this parting of ways took place is largely due to the fact that evolutionists working on the units problems tacitly adopted the original suggestion that the replicator, whatever it turned out to be, be called the “gene” (Dawkins 1982b, pp. 84-86; see section 3.3). This move neatly removes the replicator question from consideration. Exactly why this move should have met with near universal acceptance is to some extent historical, however the fact that the intellectual tools (largely mathematical models) of the participants in the units debates were better suited to dealing with aspects of that debate other than the replicator question which requires mainly bio-chemical investigation, surely contributed to this outcome.

There is a very important class of exceptions to this general abandonment of the replicator question. Developmental Systems Theory was formulated as a radical alternative to the interactor/replicator dichotomy (Oyama 1985; Griffiths & Gray 1994, 1997; Oyama, Griffiths, & Gray 2001). Here the evolving unit is understood to be the developing system as a whole, privileging neither the replicator nor the interactor.

There has also been a profound reconception of the evolution by selection process, which has rejected the role of replicator as misconceived. In its place the role of “reproducer” is proposed, which focuses on the material transference of genetic and other matter from generation to generation (Griesemer 2000a,b; see Forsdyke 2010; see section 3.5). On this approach, thinking in terms of reproducers incorporates development into heredity and the evolutionary process. It also allows for both epigenetic and genetic inheritance to be dealt with within the same framework. The reproducer plays a central role, along with a hierarchy of interactors, in work on the units of evolutionary transition (see Evolutionary Transition; Griesemer 2000c). This topic concerns the major transitions of life from one level of complexity to the next, for example, the transition from unicellularity to multicellularity. More recently, another notion was introduced of a “reproducer” that is more broadly inclusive, in that it relaxes the material overlap requirement and focuses on an understanding of “who came from whom, and roughly where one begins and another ends” (Godfrey-Smith 2009: 86).

These two definitions of “reproducer” disagree about retroviral reproduction, and what counts as a salient material bond between generations. On one side is the claim that there is no material overlap in the case of retroviral reproduction, and that the key is formal or informational relations (Godfrey-Smith 2009). On the other side, is a view that sees material overlap due to RNA strand hybridization guiding and channeling flows of information (Griesemer 2014, 2016). There is also the introduction of a notion of reproducer that involves only the copying of a property, with no substance overlapping involved (Nanay 2011). Like the second view of reproducer, it appeals to the case of retroviruses having no material overlap (cf. Griesemer 2014, 2016).

2.3 The Beneficiary Question

Who benefits from a process of evolution by selection? There are two predominant interpretations of this question: Who benefits ultimately in the long term, from the evolution by selection process? And who gets the benefit of possessing adaptations as a result of a selection process? Take the first of these, the issue of the ultimate beneficiary.

There are two obvious answers to this question—two different ways of characterizing the long-term survivors and beneficiaries of the evolution by selection process. One might say that the species or lineages (the previous “evolvers”) are the ultimate beneficiaries of the evolutionary process. Alternatively, one might say that the lineages characterized on the genic level, that is, the surviving alleles, are the relevant long-term beneficiaries. I have not located any authors holding the first view, but, for Richard Dawkins, the latter interpretation is the primary fact about evolution. To arrive at this conclusion, he adds the requirement of agency to the notion of beneficiary (see Hampe & Morgan 1988). A beneficiary, by definition, does not simply passively accrue credit in the long term; it must function as the initiator of a causal pathway (Dawkins 1982a,b). Under this definition, the replicator is causally responsible for all of the various effects that arise further down the biochemical or phenotypic pathway, irrespective of which entities might reap the long-term rewards (Sapienza 2010).

A second and quite distinct version of the beneficiary question involves the notion of adaptation. The evolution by selection process may be said to “benefit” a particular level of entity under selection, through producing adaptations at that level (Williams 1966, Maynard Smith 1976, Eldredge 1985, Vrba 1984). On this approach, the level of entity actively selected (the interactor) benefits from evolution by selection at that level through its acquisition of adaptations.

It is crucial to distinguish the question concerning the level at which adaptations evolve from the question about the identity of the ultimate beneficiaries of that selection process. One can think that organisms have adaptations without thinking that organisms are the “ultimate beneficiaries” of the selection process.[6] This sense of “beneficiary” that concerns adaptations will be treated as a separate issue, discussed in the next section.

2.4 The Manifestor-of-Adaptation Question

At what level do adaptations occur? Or, “When a population evolves by natural selection, what, if anything, is the entity that does the adapting?” (Sober 1984: 204).

As mentioned previously, the presence of adaptations at a given level of entity is sometimes taken to be a requirement for something to be a unit of selection.[7] Significantly, group selection for “group advantage” should be distinguished from group selection per se (Wright 1980). In fact, the combination of the interactor question with the question of what entity had adaptations had created a great deal of confusion in the units of selection debates in general.

Some, if not most, of this confusion is a result of a very important but neglected duality in the meaning of “adaptation” (in spite of useful discussions in Brandon 1978, Burian 1983, Krimbas 1984, Sober 1984). Sometimes “adaptation” is taken to signify any trait at all that is a direct result of a selection process at that level. In this view, any trait that arises directly from a selection process is claimed to be, by definition, an adaptation (e.g., Sober 1984; Brandon 1985, 1990; Arnold & Fristrup 1982). Sometimes, on the other hand, the term “adaptation” is reserved for traits that are “good for” their owners, that is, those that provide a “better fit” with the environment, and that intuitively satisfy some notion of “good engineering.”[8] These two meanings of adaptation, the selection-product and engineering definitions respectively, are distinct, and in some cases, incompatible.

Consider the peppered moth case: natural selection is acting on the color of the moths over time, and the population evolves, but no “engineering” adaptation emerges. Rather, the proportion of dark moths simply increases over time, relative to the industrial environmental conditions, a clear case of evolution by natural selection, on which a good fit to the environment is reinforced. Note that the dark moths lie within the range of variation of the ancestral population; they are simply more frequent now, due to their superior fit with the environment. The dark moths are a “selection-product” adaptation. Contrast the moth case to the case of Darwin’s finches, in which different species evolved distinct beak shapes specially adapted to their diet of particular seeds and foods (Grant & Grant 1989; Grant 1999). Natural selection here occurred against constantly changing genetic and phenotypic backgrounds in which accumulated selection processes had changed the shapes of the beaks, thus producing “engineering” adaptations when natural selection occurred. The finches now possess evolved traits that especially “fit” them to their environmental demands; their newly shaped beaks are new mechanisms beyond the original range of variation in the ancestral population (Lloyd 2015).

Some evolutionary biologists have strongly advocated an engineering definition of adaptation (e.g., Williams 1966). The basic idea is that it is possible to have evolutionary change result from direct selection favoring a trait without having to consider that changed trait as an adaptation. Consider, for example, Waddington’s (1956) genetic assimilation experiments. How should we interpret the results of Waddington’s experiments in which latent genetic variability was made to express itself phenotypically because of an environmental pressure (Williams 1966: 70–81; see the lucid discussion in Sober 1984: 199–201)? The question is whether the bithorax condition (resulting from direct artificial selection on that trait) should be seen as an adaptive trait, and the engineering adaptationist’s answer is that it should not. Instead, the bithorax condition is seen as “a disruption…of development,” a failure of the organism to respond (Williams 1966: 75–78). Hence, this analysis drives a wedge between the notion of a trait that is a direct product of a selection process and a trait that fits the stronger engineering definition of an adaptation (see Gould & Lewontin 1979; Sober 1984: 201; cf. Dobzhansky 1956).[9]

In sum, when asking whether a given level of entity possesses adaptations, it is necessary to state not only the level of selection in question but also which notion of adaptation—either selection-product or engineering—is being used. This distinction between the two meanings of adaptation also turns out to be pivotal in the debates about the efficacy of higher levels of selection, as we will see in sections 3.1 and 3.2.

2.5 Summary

In this section, four distinct questions have been described that appear under the rubric of “the units of selection” problem, What is the interactor? What is the replicator? What is the beneficiary? And what entity manifests any adaptations resulting from evolution by selection? There is a serious ambiguity in the meaning of “adaptation”; which meaning is in play has had deep consequences for both the group selection debates and the species selection debates (Lloyd 2001). Commenting on this analysis, John Maynard Smith wrote in Evolution:

[Lloyd 2001] argues, correctly I believe, that much of the confusion has arisen because the same terms have been used with different meanings by different authors … [but] I fear that the confusions she mentions will not easily be ended. (Maynard Smith 2001: 1497)

In section 3, this taxonomy of questions is used to sort out some of the most influential positions in five debates: group selection (3.1), species selection (3.2), genic selection (3.3), genic pluralism (3.4), as well as units of evolutionary transition (3.5).

3. An Anatomy of the Debates

3.1 Group Selection

The near-deathblow in the nineteen sixties to group panselectionism was, oddly enough, about benefit (Williams 1966). The interest was in cases in which there was selection among groups and the groups as a whole benefited from organism-level traits (including behaviors) that seemed disadvantageous to the organism (Wynne Edwards 1962; Williams 1966; Maynard Smith 1964). The argument was that the presence of a benefit to the group was not sufficient to establish the presence of group selection. This was demonstrated by showing that a group benefit was not necessarily a group adaptation (Williams 1966). Hence, here the term “benefit” was being used to signify the manifestation of an adaptation at the group level. The assumption was that a genuine group selection process results in the evolution of a group-level trait—a real adaptation—that serves a design purpose for the group. The mere existence however, of traits that benefit the group is not enough to show that they are adaptations; in order to be an adaptation, under this view, the trait must be an engineering adaptation that evolved by natural selection. The argument was that group benefits do not, in general, exist because they benefit the group; that is, they do not have the appropriate causal history (Williams 1966; see Brandon 1981, 1985: 81; Sober 1984: 262 ff.; Sober & Wilson 1998).

Implicit in this discussion is the assumption that being a unit of selection at the group level requires two things: (1) having the group as an interactor, and (2) having a group-level engineering-type adaptation. That is, the approach taken combines two different questions, the interactor question and the manifestor-of-adaptation question, and calls this combined set the unit of selection question. These requirements for “group selection” make perfect sense given that the prime target was a view of group selection that incorporated this same two-pronged definition of a unit of selection (see Borrello 2010 for a philosophically-oriented history of Wynne-Edwards and his views on group selection).

This combined requirement of engineering group-level adaptation in addition to the existence of an interactor at the group level is a very popular version of the necessary conditions for being a unit of selection within the group selection debates. For example, it was claimed that the group selection issue hinges on “whether entities more inclusive than organisms exhibit adaptations” (Hull 1980: 325). Another view states that the unit of selection is determined by “Who or what is best understood as the possessor and beneficiary of the trait” (Cassidy 1978: 582). Similarly, paleontological approaches required adaptations for an entity to count as a unit of selection (Eldredge 1985: 108; Vrba 1983, 1984).

The engineering notion of adaptation was also tied into the version of the units of selection question in other contexts (Maynard Smith 1976). In an argument separating group and kin selection, it was concluded that group selection is favored by small group size, low migration rates, and rapid extinction of groups infected with a selfish allele and that

the ultimate test of the group selection hypothesis will be whether populations having these characteristics tend to show “self-sacrificing” or “prudent” behavior more commonly than those which do not. (Maynard Smith 1976: 282)

This means that the presence of group selection or the effectiveness of group selection is to be measured by the existence of nonadaptive behavior on the part of individual organisms along with the presence of a corresponding group-level adaptation. Therefore, this approach to kin and group selection does require a group-level adaptation from groups to count as units of selection. As with the previous view, it is significant that the engineering notion of adaptation is assumed rather than the weaker selection-product notion;

[A]n explanation in terms of group advantage should always be explicit, and always calls for some justification in terms of the frequency of group extinction. (Maynard Smith 1976: 278; cf. Wade 1978; Wright 1980)

More recently, geneticists have attempted to make precise the notion of a group adaptation though the “Formal Darwinism Project” (Grafen 2008), in which the general concept of adaptation can be applied to groups (Gardner & Grafen 2009). However, it is unclear how the notion of adaptation developed within the formal Darwinism project relates to the previously discussed engineering notion of adaptation. Philosophers have offered a different analysis of group adaptation, one based on an earlier analysis of selection and adaptation (Okasha & Paternotte 2012; Grafen 2008). The key distinction, in the original view, is between a trait that is a trait that merely benefits the group, i.e., “fortuitous group benefit,” and one that is a genuine group adaptation, a feature evolved because it benefited the group, i.e., “for the right reason” (Okasha & Paternotte 2012: 1137). Contextual analysis, as well as the Price equation, can provide a formal definition of group adaptation, but both need to be supplemented by causal reasoning (Okasha & Paternoster 2012).

In contrast to the preceding approach, we can separate the interactor and manifestor-of-adaptation questions in our group selection models (Wright 1980; see Lewontin 1978; Gould & Lewontin 1979). This is done by distinguishing between what is called “intergroup selection,” that is, interdemic selection in the shifting balance process, and “group selection for group advantage” (Wright 1980: 840; see Wright 1929, 1931). The term “altruist” originally denoted, in genetics, a phenotype “that contributes to group advantage at the expense of disadvantage to itself” (1980: 840; Haldane 1932). This earlier debate is connected to the main group selection debate in the 1960s, in which the group selectionists asserted the evolutionary importance of “group selection for group advantage” (Wright 1980). The argument is that the primary kin selection model is “very different” from “group selection for the uniform advantage of a group”(1980: 841; like Arnold & Fristrup 1982; Damuth & Heisler 1988; Heisler & Damuth 1987). There are excellent summaries of the empirical and theoretical discoveries enabled by “intergroup” selection models (Goodnight & Stevens 1997; Wade 2016).

Those supporting a genic selection view in the 1970s were taken to task for mistakenly thinking that because they have successfully criticized group selection for group advantage, they can conclude that “natural selection is practically wholly genic”(Wright 1980: 841).

[N]one of them discussed group selection for organismic advantage to individuals, the dynamic factor in the shifting balance process, although this process, based on irreversible local peak-shifts is not fragile at all, in contrast with the fairly obvious fragility of group selection for group advantage, which they considered worthy of extensive discussion before rejection. (Wright 1980: 841)

This is a fair criticism of the genic selectionist view. The problem is that these authors failed to distinguish between two questions: the interactor question and the manifestor-of-adaptation question. The form of group selection that involves interdemic group selection models involves groups only as interactors, not as manifestors of group-level adaptations. More recently, modelers following Sewall Wright’s interest in structured populations have created a new set of genetical models that are also called “group selection” models and in which the questions of group adaptations and group benefit play little or no role.[10]

For a period spanning two decades, however, the genic selectionists did not acknowledge that the position they attacked, namely group selection as engineering adaptation, is significantly different from other available approaches to group selection, such as those that primarily treat groups as interactors. Ultimately, however, genic selectionists did recognize the significance of the distinction between the interactor question and the manifestor-of-adaptation question. In 1985, for example, we have progress towards mutual understanding:

If some populations of species are doing better than others at persistence and reproduction, and if such differences are caused in part by genetic differences, this selection at the population level must play a role in the evolution of the species.… [But] selection at any level above the family (group selection in a broad sense) is unimportant for the origin and maintenance of adaptation. (Williams 1985: 7–8)

And in 1987, we have an extraordinary concession:

There has been some semantic confusion about the phrase “group selection,” for which I may be partly responsible. For me, the debate about levels of selection was initiated by Wynne-Edwards’ book. He argued that there are group-level adaptations…which inform individuals of the size of the population so that they can adjust their breeding for the good of the population. He was clear that such adaptations could evolve only if populations were units of selection…. Perhaps unfortunately, he referred to the process as “group selection.” As a consequence, for me and for many others who engaged in this debate, the phrase cane to imply that groups were sufficiently isolated from one another reproductively to act as units of evolution, and not merely that selection acted on groups.

The importance of this debate lay in the fact that group-adaptationist thinking was at that time widespread among biologists. It was therefore important to establish that there is no reason to expect groups to evolve traits ensuring their own survival unless they are sufficiently isolated for like to beget like…. When Wilson (1975) introduced his trait-group model, I was for a long time bewildered by his wish to treat it as a case of group selection and doubly so by the fact that his original model…had interesting results only when the members of the group were genetically related, a process I had been calling kin selection for ten years. I think that these semantic difficulties are now largely over. (Maynard Smith 1987: 123).

Even the originator of the replicator/vehicle distinction also seems to have rediscovered the evolutionary efficacy of higher-level selection processes in an article on artificial life. In this article, the primary concern is with modeling the course of selection processes, and a species-level selection interpretation is offered for an aggregate species-level trait (Dawkins 1989a). Still, Dawkins seems not to have recognized the connection between this evolutionary dynamic and the controversies surrounding group selection because in his second edition of The Selfish Gene (Dawkins 1989b) he had yet to accept the distinction made so clearly by group selectionists in 1980 (Wright 1980). This was in spite of the fact that by 1987, the importance of distinguishing between evolution by selection processes and any engineering adaptations produced by these processes had been acknowledged by the workers he claimed to be following most closely (Williams 1985, 1992; Maynard Smith 1987). More recently, a related debate has fired up between genic selection and group selection in the journals, about the definitions of group and kin selection (E.O. Wilson 2008; see below). But this debate is bound for nowhere without tight enough definitions of these kinds of selection (Shavit & Millstein 2008). The adoption of Wade’s strict definitions would help, following the prescriptions of early group selectionists (Shavit & Millstein 2008).

There has been an even more recent challenge to the received understanding of kin selection, favoring a group selection interpretation, which has been rebutted by those defending a strict separation between kin and group selection (Nowak, Tarnita, & Wilson 2010; Hölldobler & Wilson 2009; rebutted by Gardner, West. & Wild 2011; Abbot et al. 2011). This view, has in turn, been rebutted by others (van Veelen et al. 2012; Allen, Nowak, & Wilson 2013; E.O. Wilson & Nowak 2014). Philosophers have offered a very useful analysis of these debates about kin and group selection (Birch & Okasha 2015). The basic prediction of kin selection theory is that social behavior, especially social behavior that benefits others, should correlate with genetic relatedness. This is commonly expressed through Hamilton’s rule, rb > c, where r is relatedness, b is the benefit that behavior offers the conspecific, and c is the cost to the actor (see Hamilton 1975 for an expansion to multilevel selection). The critics claiming that kin selection is a form of group selection, assert that Hamilton’s rule “almost never holds” (Nowak et al. 2010: 1059). That is, it almost never states the true conditions under which a social behavior will evolve by selection. Their opponents claim the opposite: that it is incorrect to claim that Hamilton’s rule requires restrictive assumptions, or that it almost never holds. On the contrary, they claim, it holds a great deal of the time (Gardner, West, & Wild 2011).

On a philosophical analysis, there are really three distinct versions of Hamilton’s rule, and thus three distinct versions of kin selection theory under discussion. One involves many substantial assumptions, including

weak selection, additive gene action, (i.e., no dominance or epistasis), and the additivity of fitness payoffs (i.e., a relatively simple payoff structure). (Birch & Okasha 2015: 23)

When these assumptions are weakened, we get more variants of Hamilton’s rule. Particularly important are the payoff parameters c and b. Sometimes these denote the values of a particular model, called HRS (Hamilton’s Rule, special), but other times, they denote averaging effects or partial regression coefficients, in the case of HRG (Hamilton’s Rule, general). A third approach, HRA (Hamilton’s Rule, approximate), which uses first-order approximates of regression coefficients, is the approach most commonly used in contemporary kin selection theory. The special version is very restrictive, while the general version allows a wide variety of cases. According to the philosophical analysis of the cases, Nowak et al. are using the special version of Hamilton’s rule when they say it “almost never holds,” whereas Gardner, West, and Wild are using the regression-based, general version of the rule, which allows a great deal of leeway in application. In other words, they are talking past each other (Birch & Okasha 2015). Significantly,

Neither [Nowak et al. nor Gardner, West, & Wild ] is referring to HRA, even though this approximate version of the rule is the version most commonly used by kin selection theorists. (Birch & Okasha 2015: 24)

On the same philosophical analysis, it is also argued that kin selection and multilevel selection represented using the Price equation are formally equivalent, and that preferences for kin selection models may not be justified as they are usually (Birch & Okasha 2015; cf. West et al. 2008). Some biologists, for example, have argued that kin selection is more easily applicable than group selection, and that kin selection can be applied whenever there is group selection (West, Griffin, & Gardner 2007, 2008). Moreover, they deny that kin selection is a form of group selection, despite formal similarities and derivations (West, Griffin, & Gardner 2007: 424). Problems about using multilevel selection models may stem from the group beneficiary problem arising from the early group selection context wherein group selection was assumed to involve both group benefit and group engineering adaptation (Birch & Okasha 2015).

[A]lthough kin and multilevel selection are equivalent as statistical decompositions of evolutionary change, there are situations in which one approach provides a more accurate representation of the causal structure of social interaction. (Birch & Okasha 2015: 30; see also Okasha & Paternotte 2012 vs. Gardner & Grafen 2009 on group adaptations)

Geneticists have offered an effective critique of the “Formal Darwinism Project” to units of selection and adaptation, arguing that the latter’s preferences for the level of individual organism is arbitrary, as is their bias against multilevel selection (Shelton & Michod 2014a).

In an analysis of the contextual analysis and Price equation methods of representing hierarchical selection models, it was argued that contextual analysis is superior overall, except in cases of meiotic drive (Okasha 2006). However, it was recently argued that contextual analysis can even handle cases of meiotic drive, thus making it the superior approach to multilevel selection (Earnshaw 2015). In a separate and helpful analysis, the relationship between kin and multilevel models was spelled out using causal graphs (Okasha 2015). Just because the two models can produce the same changes in gene frequencies, it does not follow that they represent the same causal structure, which is illustrated using causal graph theory and examples from biology, such as group adaptation and meiotic drive (Okasha 2015; see Genic Selection: The Pluralists). This goes very much against the claims of equivalence of the two model types, kin and group selection (West, Griffin, & Gardner 2007, 2008; West & Gardner 2013), in which these technical equivalences are taken to signify total equivalence of the evolutionary systems (see also Frank 2013; Queller 1992; Dugatkin & Reeve 1994; Sober & Wilson 1998). Take, for instance, the claim: “There is no theoretical or empirical example of group selection that cannot be explained with kin selection” (West, Griffin, & Gardner 2008: 375),

It is good to keep in mind that there are dissenters from this claim of the equivalence between group and kin selection models (e.g., Lloyd, Lewontin, & Feldman 2008; van Veelen 2009; van Veelen et al. 2012; Hölldobler & Wilson 2009; Traulsen 2010; Nowak, Tarnita, & Wilson 2010, 2011; E.O. Wilson 2012). Those who claim full equivalence discuss the evolution of cooperation and altruism, arguing that only kin selection allows an easy solution to these evolutionary problems (West, Griffin, & Gardner 2008). From the more robust group selectionist point of view, the so-called free rider problems with kin and group selection—such as those that are contemplated by evolutionists puzzling over the evolution of altruism—are pseudo-problems based on misconceptions (Wade 2016; see also Bowles & Gintis 2011; Planer 2015; Sterelny 2012).

One approach notes that kin selection (either in its inclusive fitness form or the direct fitness approach) and multilevel selection “differ primarily in the types of questions being addressed” (Goodnight 2013: 1546). Whereas kin selection aims at identifying character states that maximize fitness, multilevel selection methods have the goal of looking at the effects of selection on trait changes. While the two have formal similarities, the kin selection models arose out of game theory and evolutionary stable strategies (ESS) and are used to identify the optimal solution, but they cannot be used to examine the process by which the population will achieve that optimum or equilibrium. In contrast, the multilevel selection methods, such as contextual analysis, which arise out of the quantitative genetics traditions, are used to describe the processes acting on the population in its current state.[11] Thus, the two methods are not the same, nor are they competing paradigms.

Rather they should be considered complementary approaches that when used together give a clearer picture of social evolution than either one can when used in isolation. (Goodnight 2013: 1547; cf. Maynard Smith 1976; Dawkins 1982b; West, Griffin, & Garnder 2007, 2008; Gardner & Grafen 2009)

In the laboratory, the hierarchical genetic approach of multilevel selection has been used to demonstrate that populations respond rapidly to experimentally imposed group selection, and that indirect genetic effects are primarily responsible for the surprising strength and effectiveness of group selection experiments, contra the full equivalence claims (Goodnight 2013; Goodnight & Stevens 1997; cf. West, Griffin, & Gardner 2007, 2008). Field studies using contextual analysis have shown that multilevel selection is far more common in nature than previously expected (Goodnight 2013; e.g., Stevens, Goodnight, & Kalisz 1995;Tsuji 1995; Aspi et al. 2003; Weinig et al. 2007; Eldakar et al. 2010; Wade 2016). There is much less emphasis on the evolution of altruism within the hierarchical genetic approach, as selection is observed as it is occurring, and this includes group selection going in the same direction as organismic selection, not just in opposition to it, contra early genic selectionist recommendations (Maynard Smith 1976). This sort of group selection of interactors is not based on group level engineering adaptations, although some still persist in confusing group selection itself with the combination of the two features, group selection and group engineering adaptation (e.g., Ramsey & Brandon 2011).

Most recently, a new topic has arisen in the context of multilevel selection, involving the evolution of “holobionts,” i.e., the combination of a eukaryotic organism with its microbiotic load (Zilber-Rosenberg & Rosenberg 2008). It has become clear that each “individual” human being is actually a community of organisms co-evolved for mutual benefit (Gilbert, Sapp, & Tauber 2012). Our microbiota (the collection of bacteria, viruses, and fungi living in our gut, mouth, and skin) is necessary for our survival and development, and our species is also needed in turn for their survival. Bacterial symbionts help induce and sustain the human immune system, T-cells, and B-cells (Lee & Mazamanian 2010; Round, O’Connell, & Mazamanian 2010), as well as providing essential vitamins to the host human being. Gut bacteria are necessary for cognitive development (Sampson & Mazamanian 2015), as well as for the development of blood vessels in the gut; lipid metabolism, detoxification of dangerous bacteria, viruses, and fungi; and the regulation of colonic pH and intestinal permeability (Nicholson et al. 2012).

The holobiont—the combination of the host and its microbiota—functions as a unique biological entity anatomically, metabolically, immunologically, and developmentally (Gilbert, Rosenberg, & Zilber-Rosenberg forthcoming; Gilbert 2011). Similarly, a holobiont is seen as an “integrated community of species, [which] becomes a unit of natural selection” (Gilbert, Sapp, & Tauber 2012: 334). That is, in essence, theorists claim that the holobiont can function as an interactor since it has features that bind it together as a functional whole in such a way that it can interact in a natural selection process. So what ties the different species together to produce an interactor? According to pioneering philosophical thought on holobionts and symbionts, it is the community’s common evolutionary fate, its being a “functioning whole,” that characterizes it as an evolutionary interactor, “objects between which natural selection selects” (Dupré 2012: 160; see also Dupré & O’Malley 2013; Zilber-Rosenberg & Rosenberg 2008). This community can also be described as a “team” of consortia undergoing selection (Gilbert et al. forthcoming). Others describe them as “collaborators” or “polygenomic consortia”, which has the advantage of encompassing both competition and cooperation within the holobiont (Dupré & O’Malley 2013: 314; Lloyd forthcoming; see also Huttegger & Smead 2011 on stag hunt game-theoretic results regarding the range of collaboration).

Holobionts can also be reproducers, where the host usually reproduces vertically and the microbiota reproduce either vertically, horizontally, or both. This situation has provoked discussion among philosophers (Godfrey-Smith 2009, 2011; Sterelny 2011; Griesemer 2014, 2016; Booth 2014; Lloyd forthcoming). Holobionts’ microbiota can reproduce outside the context of the original host organism, so some holobionts, e.g., the Hawaiian bobtail squid and its luminescent bacteria, are not “Darwinian populations” (Godfrey-Smith 2009, 2011), and therefore not units of selection (see Booth 2014). This approach contrasts with that of the original reproducer approach which would include the squid-bacteria system and also retroviruses excluded under the “Darwinian populations” account (Griesemer2000a, 2016).

As in [my book, Darwinian Populations and Natural Selection], I hold that it is a mistake to see things that do not reproduce as units of selection. (Godfrey-Smith 2011: 509; Booth 2014)

This exclusion rests on the merging of the interactor with the reproducer requirements, and as such will not hold sway over those who do not buy such a confounding of roles (e.g., Dupré & O’Malley 2013). This is yet another case wherein distinguishing the interactor question from the replicator/reproducer question can be “more illuminating” (Sterelny 2011: 496; see Dupré & O’Malley 2013; Gilbert, Sapp, & Tauber 2012; Lloyd forthcoming).

Finally, holobionts can also be manifestors of adaptations, as in the case of the evolution of placental mammals in the acquisition by horizontal gene transfer from a retrovirus of a crucial gene coding for the protein syncytin (Lloyd forthcoming; Dupressoir, Lavialle, & Heidemann 2012). Syncytin allows fetuses to fuse to their mother’s placenta, a role crucial to the evolution of placental mammals. Moreover, it seems that several retrovirally derived enhancers played critical roles in the formation of a key cell in the uterine wall, also crucial for maintaining pregnancy, enhancing the holobiont’s role as a manifestor of adaptation (Wagner et al. 2014).

There are several other significant entries into the group selection discussions, including the book, Unto Others: The Evolution and Psychology of Unselfish Behavior (Sober & Wilson 1998). Here, a case for group selection is developed based on the need to account for the existence of biological altruism. Biological altruism is any behaviour that benefits another organism at some cost to the actor. Such behavior must always reduce the actor’s fitness but it may (following the work on interdemic selection), increase the fitness of certain groups within a structured population. There was a big benefit to bringing the attention of the larger philosophical community to group selection models, and explaining them in an accessible fashion. It has thus brought this aspect of the units of selection controversy out onto the main stage of philosophical thought.

The “Darwinian populations” view previously mentioned provides a considerably different view of the necessary conditions for group selection, one which rejects many of the currently accepted cases of the phenomenon. For a given selection story to be descriptively valid, a “Darwinian population” must exist at the level of selection being described, which requires the presence of both an interactor and a reproducer at that level, thus putting together what others have pulled apart (Godfrey-Smith 2009: 112). A Darwinian population is conceived as, at minimum,

a collection of causally connected individual things in which there is variation in character, which leads to differences in reproductive output (differences in how much or how quickly individuals reproduce), and which is inherited to some extent. (2009: 39)

There are further differentiations between paradigmatic, minimal, and marginal Darwinian populations based on a variety of criteria, such as the fidelity of heritability, continuity (the degree to which small shifts in phenotype correlate to small changes in fitness), and the dependence of reproductive differences on intrinsic features of individuals (Godfrey-Smith 2009: Chapter 3).

For example, under this view, the case of the evolution of altruism, which is commonly attributed to group selection, should not be considered as such, because of the lack of a true reproducer at the group level; the group level description depicts at best a marginal Darwinian population (Godfrey-Smith 2009: 119). Rather, the argument is that a neighborhood selection model, in which individuals are affected by the phenotypes of their neighbors but cannot be seen as “collectives competing at a higher level,” is fully capable of capturing the selective process involved, and represents a Darwinian population, in which the individuals are seen both as the interactors and the reproducers (2009: 118). This would seem to entail that many group selection accounts (e.g., Sober & Wilson 1998), as well as any models classified as Multi-level selection 1 (MLS1) models (Heisler & Damuth 1987), cannot be properly considered as such. This view grants that there are empirical examples in which a group-level reproducer clearly exists (for example, Wade & Griesemer 1998; Griesemer & Wade 2000; there is otherwise no discussion of Wrightian approaches to group selection). The approach using Darwinian populations and reproducers is claimed to present an advantage over other available analyses of units of selection because it can account for previously neglected examples such as epigenetic inheritance systems (Godfrey-Smith 2009). The question remains as to whether gaining an account to deal with these is worth rejecting an entire class of accepted group selection models, and whether such a loss is truly necessary to deal with epigenesis, given that we have an epigenetic account with reproducers that allows for group selection (see Griesemer 2000c).

3.2 Species Selection

Ambiguities about the definition of a unit of selection have also snarled the debate about selection processes at the species level. One response to the notion of species selection comes with a classic confusion: “It is individual selection discriminating against the individuals of the losing species that causes the extinction” (Mayr 1997: 2093). The individual death of species members is confused with extinction: “the actual selection takes place at the level of competing individuals of the two species” (Mayr 1997: 2093). Once we overcome such difficulties, and succeed in conceiving of species as unified interactors, we are still faced with two questions. The combining of the interactor question and the manifestor-of-adaptation question (in the engineering sense) led to the rejection of research aimed at considering the role of species as interactors, simpliciter, in evolution. Once it is understood that species-level interactors may or may not possess design-type adaptations, it becomes possible to distinguish two research questions: Do species function as interactors, playing an active and significant role in evolution by selection? And does the evolution of species-level interactors produce species-level engineering adaptations and, if so, how often?

For the early history of the species selection debate, these questions were lumped together; asking whether species could be units of selection meant asking whether they fulfilled both the interactor and manifestor-of-adaptation roles. For example, early species selection advocates used a genic selectionist treatment of the evolution of altruism as a touchstone in the definition of species selection (e.g., Vrba 1984). The relevant argument is that kin selection could cause the spread of altruistic genes but that it should not be called group selection (Maynard Smith 1976). Again, this was because the groups were not considered to possess design-type adaptations themselves. Some species selectionists agreed that the spread of altruism should not be considered a case of group selection because “there is no group adaptation involved; altruism is not emergent at the group level” (Vrba 1984: 319; Maynard Smith gives different reasons for his rejection). This amounts to assuming that there must be group benefit in the sense of a design-type group-level adaptation in order to say that group selection can occur. This species selection view was that evolution by selection is not happening at a given level unless there is a benefit or engineering adaptation at that level. The early species selection position explicitly equates units of selection with the existence of an interactor plus adaptation at that level (Vrba 1983: 388); furthermore, it seems that the stronger, engineering definition of adaptation had been adopted.

It was generally accepted among early species selectionists that species selection does not happen unless there are species-level adaptations (Eldredge 1985: 196, 134). Certain cases are rejected as higher-level selection processes overall because

frequencies of the properties of lower-level individuals which are part of a high-level individual simply do not make convincing higher-level adaptations. (Eldredge 1985: 133)

Most of those defending species selection early on defined a unit of selection as requiring an emergent, adaptive property (Vrba 1983, 1984; Vrba and Eldredge 1984; Vrba and Gould 1986). This amounts to asking a combination of the interactor and manifestor-of-adaptation questions. But the relevant question is not “whether some particle-level causal processes or other bear the causal responsibility,” but rather “whether particle-level selection bears the causal responsibility” (Okasha 2006: 107). An emergent character requirement conflates these two questions. Such a character may be the result of a selection process at the group/species level, but it should not be treated as a pre-condition of such a process.

But consider the lineage-wide trait of variability. Treating species as interactors has a long tradition (Dobzhansky 1956, Thoday 1953, Lewontin 1958). If species are conceived as interactors (and not necessarily manifestors of adaptations), then the notion of species selection is not vulnerable to the original anti group-selection objections from the early genic selectionists (Williams 1966).[12] The old idea was that lineages with certain properties of being able to respond to environmental stresses would be selected for, and thus that the trait of variability itself would be selected for and would spread in the population of populations. In other words, lineages were treated as interactors. The earlier researchers spoke loosely of adaptations where adaptations were treated in the weak sense as equivalent simply to the outcome of selection processes (at any level). They were explicitly not concerned with the effect of species selection on organismic level traits but with the effect on species-level characters such as speciation rates, lineage-level survival, and extinction rates of species. Some argued, including the present author, that this sort of case represents a perfectly good form of species selection, using so-called “emergent fitnesses,” even though some balk at the thought that variability would then be considered, under a weak definition, a species-level adaptation (Lloyd & Gould 1993; Lloyd 1988 [1994]). Paleontologists used this approach to species selection in their research on fossil gastropods (Jablonski 2008, 1987; Jablonski & Hunt 2006), and the approach has also been used in the leading text on speciation (Coyne & Orr 2004).

Early species selectionists also eventually recognized the advantages of keeping the interactor question separate from a requirement for an engineering-type adaptation, dropping the former requirement that, in order for species to be units of selection, they must possess species-level adaptations (Vrba 1989). Ultimately, the current widely-accepted definition of species selection is in conformity with a simple interactor interpretation of a unit of selection (Vrba 1989; see Damuth & Heisler 1988; Lloyd 1988 [1994]; Jablonski 2008).

It is easy to see how the two-pronged definition of a unit of selection—as interactor and manifestor of adaptation—held sway for so long in the species selection debates. After all, it had dominated much of the group selection debates for so long. Some of the confusion and conflict over higher-level units of selection arose because of an historical contingency—the early group selectionist’s implicit definition of a unit of selection and the responses it provoked (Wynne Edwards 1962; Borrello 2010).

3.3 Genic Selection: The Originators

One may understandably think that the early genic selectionists were interested in the replicator question because of the claims that the unit of selection ought to be the replicator. This would be a mistake. Rather, the primary interest is in a specific ontological issue about benefit (Dawkins 1976, 1982a,b). This amounts to asking a special version of the beneficiary question, and the answer to that question dictates the answers to the other three questions flying under the rubric of the “units of selection”.

Briefly, the argument is that because replicators are the only entities that “survive” the evolutionary process, they must be the beneficiaries (Dawkins 1982a,b). What happens in the process of evolution by natural selection happens for their sake, for their benefit. Hence, interactors interact for the replicators’ benefit, and adaptations belong to the replicators. Replicators are the only entities with real agency as initiators of causal chains that lead to the phenotypes; hence, they accrue the credit and are the real units of selection.

This version of the units of selection question amounts to a combination of the beneficiary question plus the manifestor-of-adaptation question. There is little evidence that they are answering the predominant interactor question; rather, the argument is that people who focus on interactors are laboring under a misunderstanding of evolutionary theory (Dawkins 1976, 1982a,b). One reason for thinking this might be that the opponents are taken to be those who hold a combination of the interactor plus manifestor-of-adaptations definition of a unit of selection (e.g., Wynne-Edwards). Unfortunately, leading genic selectionists ignore those who are pursuing the interactor question alone; these researchers are not vulnerable to the criticisms posed against the combined interactor-adaptation view (Dawkins 1982a,b; Williams 1966). Some insist that the early genic selectionists have misunderstood evolutionary selection, an argument that is based upon interpreting the units of selection controversy as a debate about interactors (Gould 1977; Istvan 2013); however, because the early genic selectionists say that the debate concerns the units of the ultimate beneficiary, they are arguing past one another (Istvan 2013). Section 3.4, Genic Selection: The Pluralists, addresses those who interpret themselves as arguing against the interactor question itself.

In the next few paragraphs, two aspects of Dawkins’ specific version of the units of selection problem shall be characterized. I will attempt to clarify the key issues of interest to Dawkins and to relate these to the issues of interest to others.

There are two mistakes that Dawkins is not making. First, he does not deny that interactors are involved in the evolutionary process. He emphasizes that it is not necessary, under his view, to believe that replicators are directly “visible” to selection forces (1982b: 176). Dawkins has recognized from the beginning that his question is completely distinct from the interactor question. He remarks, in fact, that the debate about group versus organismic selection is “a factual dispute about the level at which selection is most effective in nature,” whereas his own point is “about what we ought to mean when we talk about a unit of selection” (1982a: 46). He also states that genes or other replicators do not “literally face the cutting edge of natural selection. It is their phenotypic effects that are the proximal subjects of selection” (1982a: 47). We shall return to this issue in section 3.4, Genic Selection: The Pluralists.

Second, Dawkins does not specify how large a chunk of the genome he will allow as a replicator; there is no commitment to the notion that single exons are the only possible replicators. He argues that if Lewontin, Franklin, Slatkin and others are right, his view will not be affected (see Replicators). If linkage disequilibrium is very strong, then the “effective replicator will be a very large chunk of DNA” (Dawkins 1982b: 89; Sapienza 2010). We can conclude from this that Dawkins is not interested in the replicator question at all; his claim here is that his framework can accommodate any of its possible answers.

On what basis, then, does Dawkins reject the question about interactors? I think the answer lies in the particular question in which he is most interested, namely, What is “the nature of the entity for whose benefit adaptations may be said to exist?”[13]

On the face of it, it is certainly conceivable that one might identify the beneficiary of the adaptations as—in some cases, anyway—the individual organism or group that exhibits the phenotypic trait taken to be the adaptation. In fact, some writers seem to have done just that in the discussion of group selection (see Williams 1966).[14] But the original genic selectionist rejects this move, introducing an additional qualification to be fulfilled by a unit of selection; it must be “the unit that actually survives or fails to survive” (Dawkins 1982a: 60). Because organisms, groups, and even genomes do not actually survive the evolution-by-selection process, the answer to the survival question must be the replicator. (Strictly speaking, this is false; it is copies of the replicators that survive. Replicators must therefore be taken in some sense as information and not as biological entities (see Hampe & Morgan 1988; cf. Griesemer 2005).

But there is still a problem. Although the conclusion is that “there should be no controversy over replicators versus vehicles. Replicator survival and vehicle selection are two aspects of the same process” (1982a: 60), the genic selectionist does not just leave the vehicle selection debate alone. Instead, the argument is that we do not need the concept of discrete vehicles at all. This is what we shall investigate in section 3.4 Genic Selection: The Pluralists.

The important point for now is that, on Dawkins’ analysis, the fact that replicators are the only survivors of the evolution-by-selection process automatically answers also the question of who owns the adaptations. Adaptations must be seen as being designed for the good of the active-germ-line replicator for the simple reason that replicators are the only entities around long enough to enjoy them over the course of natural selection. The genic selectionist acknowledges that the phenotype is “the all important instrument of replicator preservation,” and that genes’ phenotypic effects are organized into organisms (that thereby might benefit from them in their lifetimes) (1982b: 114). But because only the active germ-line replicators survive, they are the true locus of adaptations (1982b: 113; emphasis added). The other things that benefit over the short term (e.g., organisms with adaptive traits) are merely the tools of the real survivors, the real owners. Hence, Dawkins rejects the vehicle approach partly because he identifies it with the manifestor-of-adaptation approach, which he has answered by definition, in terms of the long-term beneficiary.

The second key aspect of genic selectionists’ views on interactors is the desire to do away with them entirely. Dawkins is aware that the vehicle concept is “fundamental to the predominant orthodox approach to natural selection” (1982b: 116). Nevertheless, he rejects this approach in The Extended Phenotype, claiming, “the main purpose of this book is to draw attention to the weaknesses of the whole vehicle concept” (1982b: 115). But this “vehicle” approach is not equivalent to “the interactor question”; it encompasses a much more restricted approach.

In particular, when arguing against “the vehicle concept,” Dawkins is only arguing against the desirability of seeing the individual organism as the one and only possible vehicle. His target is explicitly those who hold what he calls the “Central Theorem,” which says that individual organisms should be seen as maximizing their own inclusive fitness (1982b: 5, 55). These arguments are indeed damaging to the Central theorem, but they are ineffective against other approaches that define units of selection as interactors.

One way to interpret the Central Theorem is that it implies that the individual organism is always the beneficiary of any selection process. The genic selectionists seem to mean by “beneficiary” both the manifestor of adaptation and that which survives to reap the rewards of the evolutionary process. Dawkins argues, rightly and persuasively, I think, that it does not make sense always to consider the individual organism to be the beneficiary of a selection process.

But it is crucial to see that Dawkins is not arguing against the importance of the interactor question in general, but rather against a particular definition of a unit of selection. The view being criticized assumes that the individual organism is the interactor, and the beneficiary, and the manifestor of adaptation. Consider the main argument against the utility of considering vehicles: the primary reason to abandon thinking about vehicles is that it confuses people (1982b: 189). But look at the examples; their point is that it is inappropriate always to ask how an organism’s behavior benefits that organism’s inclusive fitness. We should ask instead, “whose inclusive fitness the behavior is benefiting” (1982b: 80). Dawkins states that his purpose in the book is to show that “theoretical dangers attend the assumption that adaptations are for the good of…the individual organism” (1982b: 91).

So, Dawkins is quite clear about what he means by the “vehicle selection approach”; it always assumes that the organism is the beneficiary of its accrued inclusive fitness. Dawkins advances powerful arguments against the assumption that the organism is always the interactor cum beneficiary cum manifestor of adaptations. This approach is clearly not equivalent to the approach to units of selection characterized as the interactor approach. Unfortunately, genic selectionists extend Dawkins’ conclusions to these other approaches, which he has, in fact, not addressed. The genic selectionists’ lack of consideration of the interactor definition of a unit of selection leads to two grave problems with this view.

One problem is the tendency to interpret all group selectionist claims as being about beneficiaries and manifestors of adaptations as well as interactors. This is a serious misreading of authors who are pursuing the interactor question alone.

Consider, for example, this argument that groups should not be considered units of selection:

To the extent that active germ-line replicators benefit from the survival of the group of individuals in which they sit, over and above the [effects of individual traits and altruism], we may expect to see adaptations for the preservation of the group. But all these adaptations will exist, fundamentally, through differential replicator survival. The basic beneficiary of any adaptation is the active germ-line replicator (Dawkins 1982b: 85).

Notice that this argument begins by admitting that groups can function as interactors, and even that group selection may effectively produce group-level adaptations. The argument that groups should not be considered real units of selection amounts to the claim that the groups are not the ultimate beneficiaries. To counteract the intuition that the groups do, of course, benefit, in some sense, from the adaptations, the terms “fundamentally” and “basic” are used, thus signaling what the author considers the most important level. Even if a group-level trait is affecting a change in gene frequencies, “it is still genes that are regarded as the replicators which actually survive (or fail to survive) as a consequence of the (vehicle) selection process” (Dawkins 1982b: 115). Thus, the replicator is the unit of selection because it is the beneficiary, and the real owner, of all adaptations that exist.

Saying all this does not, however, address the fact that other researchers investigating group selection are asking the interactor question and sometimes also the manifestor-of-adaptation question, rather than Dawkins’ special version of the (ultimate) beneficiary question. He gives no additional reason to reject these other questions as legitimate; he simply reasserts the superiority of his own preferred unit of selection. In sum, Dawkins has identified three criteria as necessary for something to be a unit of selection: it must be a replicator; it must be the most basic beneficiary of the selection process; and it is automatically the ultimate manifestor of adaptation through being the beneficiary.

Finally, further work in the philosophy of biology brings the level of the unit of selection down even further than the original genic selectionists do (Rosenberg 2006). Higher level selection is reducible to more fundamental levels.[15] Taking a reductionist stance, which is taken to be necessary to avoid an “untenable dualism” in biology between physicalism and antireductionism, the argument is that the principle of natural selection (PNS) should be properly viewed as a basic law of physical science (specifically chemistry), which can operate at the level of atoms and molecules (Rosenberg 2006: 189–191). Different molecular environments would favor different chemical types, and those that “more closely approximate an environmentally optimal combination of stability and replication,” are thus the “fittest” and would predominate (2006: 190). This could then be applied at each step of the way from simple molecules to compounds, organelles, cells, tissues, and so on, such that

the result at each level of chemical aggregation is the instantiation of another PNS, grounded in, or at least in principle derivable from, the molecular interactions that follow the PNS in the environment operating at one or more lower levels of aggregation. (Rosenberg 2006: 192)

This approach addresses antireductionist arguments regarding group level properties. The claim is that this new envisioning of the PNS as a purely physical law allows us to better understand the lower level origins of apparently higher level causes, thus revealing that “the appearance of ‘downward causation’ is just that: mere appearance.” (Rosenberg 2006: 197) For example, the claim is that group level selection explanations, such as are commonly given for altruism, do not require an antireductionist stance, since physical laws, such as that second law of thermodynamics, can allow for local unfavorable changes (in this case, local decreases in entropy) as long as compensation is made elsewhere. With regard to the physical PNS,

groups of biological individuals may experience fitness increases at the expense of fitness decreases among their individual members for periods of time that will depend on the size and composition of the group and the fitness effects of their traits. What the PNS will not permit is long-term fitness changes at the level of groups without long-term fitness changes in the same direction among some or all of the individuals composing them. (Rosenberg 2006: 198)

In other words, this is supposed to show that there is no need to think in terms of irreducible group level interactors. Again, note that this analysis merges characteristics of interactors and replicators.

In the next section, we will consider some relatively more recent work in which genic selectionism is defended through a pluralist approach to modeling. What matters in the final analysis, though, is exactly what matters to the original genic selectionists, and that is the search for the ultimate beneficiary of the evolution by selection process.

3.4 Genic Selection: The Pluralists

As we saw in the previous section, the original genic selectionists had particular problems with their treatment of the interactor. While they admitted that the “vehicle” was necessary for the selection process, they did not want to accord it any weight in the units of selection debate because it was not the beneficiary, but rather an agent of the beneficiary. Soon, however, there emerged a new angle available to genic selectionists (Waters 1986).[16]

The new “genic pluralism” appears to let one bypass the interactor question, by, in effect, turning genes into interactors (Sterelny & Kitcher 1988). The proposal is that there are two “images” of natural selection, one in which selection accounts are given in terms of a hierarchy of entities and their traits’ environments, the other of which is given in terms of genes having properties that affect their abilities to leave copies of themselves (Sterelny & Kitcher 1988; see Kitcher, Sterelny, & Waters 1990, Sterelny 1996a,b; Waters 1986, 1991).[17] Something significant follows from the fact that hierarchical models or selection processes can be reformulated in terms of the genic level. These claims have been resisted on a variety of grounds (see objections in R.A. Wilson 2003, Stanford 2001, Van der Steen & van den Berg 1999, Gannett 1999, Shanahan 1997, Glennan 2002, Sober 1990, Sober & Wilson 1998, Brandon & Nijhout 2006, Sarkar 2008).

The big payoff of the genic point of view is:

Once the possibility of many, equally adequate, representations of evolutionary processes has been recognized, philosophers and biologists can turn their attention to more serious projects than that of quibbling about the real unit of selection. (Kitcher, Sterelny, & Waters 1990: 161)

By “quibbling about the real unit of selection,” here, the authors seem to be referring to the large range of articles in which evolutionists have tried to give concrete evidence and requirements for something to serve as an interactor in a selection process.

As an aside, it is important to note that none of the philosophers are advocating genic selectionism to the exclusion of other views. What interests them is a proposed equivalence between being able to tell the selection story one way, in terms of interactors and replicators, and to tell the same story another way, purely in terms of “genic agency”. Thus, they are pluralists, in that they are not ultimately arguing in favor of the genic view; they are, however, expanding the genic selectionist view beyond its previous limits.

The pluralists attack the view that “for any selection process, there is a uniquely correct identification of the operative selective forces and the level at which each impinges” (Waters 1991: 553). Rather, they claim, “We believe that asking about the real unit of selection is an exercise in muddled metaphysics” (Kitcher, Sterelny, & Waters 1990: 159). The basic view is that “the causes of one and the same selection process can be correctly described at different levels” (including the genic one) (Waters 1991: 555). Moreover, these descriptions are on equal ontological footing. Equal, that is, except for when Sterelny and Kitcher slip over into a genuinely reductionist genic view, when they state that it is an error to claim

that selection processes must be described in a particular way, and their error involves them in positing entities, “targets of selection,” that do not exist. (1988: 359)

Here they seem to be denying the existence of interactors altogether. If interactors don’t exist, then clearly a genic level account of the phenomena would be preferable to, not merely equivalent to, a hierarchical view.

The pluralists do seem to be arguing against the utility of the notion of the interactor in studying the selection process. Echoing the original genic selectionists, their idea is that the whole causal story can be told at the level of genes, and that no higher level entities need be proposed or considered in order to have an accurate and complete explanation of the selection process. But, arguably, the genic level story cannot be told without taking the functional role of interactors into account, and thus the pluralists cannot avoid quibbling about interactors, as they claim (see Lloyd 2005). Nor is the genic account adequate to all selection cases; the genic account fails when drift is factored in (Brandon & Nijhout 2006).

Let us recall what the interactor question in the units of selection debate amounts to: What levels of entities interact with their environments through their traits in such a way that it makes a difference to replicator success? As mentioned before, there has been much discussion in the literature about how to delineate and locate interactors among multilayered processes of selection. Each of these suggestions leads to slightly different results and different problems and limitations, but each also takes the notion of the interactor seriously as a necessary component to understanding a selection process.

The genic pluralists state that “All selective episodes (or, perhaps, almost all) can be interpreted in terms of genic selection. That is an important fact about natural selection” (Kitcher, Sterelny, & Waters 1990: 160). Thus, the functional claim of the pluralists is that anything that a hierarchical selection model can do, a genic selection model can do just as well. Much attention is paid to showing that the two types of models can represent certain patterns of selection equally well, even those that are conventionally considered hierarchical selection. This is argued for using both specific examples and schema for translating hierarchical models into genic ones. Let us consider one challenging case here.

Take the classic account of the efficacy of interdemic or group selection, the case that even G.C. Williams acknowledged was hierarchical selection. Lewontin and Dunn (Lewontin & Dunn 1960 and Lewontin 1962), in investigating the house mouse, found first, that there was segregation distortion, in that over 80% of the sperm from mice heterozygous for the t-allele also carried the t-allele, whereas the expected rate would be 50%. Second, they also found that male homozygotes (those with two t-alleles) tended to be sterile. (In several populations the t-alleles were homozygous lethal, but in the populations in question, homozygous males were sterile.) Third, they also found a substantial effect of group extinction based on the fact that female mice would often find themselves in groups in which all males were sterile, and the group itself would therefore go extinct. This, then, is how a genuine and empirically robust hierarchical model was developed.

What the pluralists want to note about this case is very narrow, that is

whether there are real examples of processes that can be modeled as group selection can be asked and answered entirely within the genic point of view. (Kitcher, Sterelny, & Waters 1990: 160)

Just as a warning to the unwary, the key to understanding the genic reinterpretation of this case is to grasp that the pluralists use a concept of genetic environment that their critics ignore.

The pluralists tell how to “construct” a genic model of the causes responsible for the frequency of the t-allele. We must first distinguish

genetic environments that are contained within female mice that are trapped in small populations with only sterile males from genetic environments that are not contained within such females. In effect, the interactions at the group level would be built in as a part of one kind of genetic environment. (Waters 1991: 563)

In other words, various very detailed environments would have to be specified for various different t-alleles and wild-type alleles. In order to determine the invariant fitness parameter of a specific allele, let’s call it “A” for example, we would need to know what kind of environment it is in at the allelic level, e.g., whether it is paired with a t-allele. Then we would need to know a further detailed layer of the environment of “A”, such as what the sex is of the “environment” it is in. If it is in a t-allele arrangement, and it is also in a male environment, the allelic fitness of “A” would be changed. Finally, we need to know the type of subpopulation or deme the “A” allele is in. Is it in a small deme with many t-alleles? Then it is more likely to become extinct. So, as we can see, various aspects of the allele’s environment are built up from the gene out, depending on what would make a difference to the gene’s fitness in that very particular kind of environment. If you want to know the overall fitness of the “A” allele, you add up the fitnesses in each set of specialized, detailed environments and weight them according to the frequency of that environment.

The idea is:

What appears as a multiple level selection process (e.g., selection of the t-allele) to those who draw the conceptual divide [between environments] at the traditional level, appears to genic selectionists of Williams’s style as several selection processes being carried out at the same level within different genetic environments. (Waters 1991: 571)

The “same level” here means the “genic level,” while the genetic environments include everything from the other allele at the locus, to whether the genotype is present in a male or female mouse, to the size and composition of the deme the mouse is in. This completes the sketch of the genic pluralist position. We now turn to its reception.

Genic pluralism’s impact has been largely philosophical rather than biological (but see Shanahan 1997 and Van der Steen & Van den Berg 1999). Within philosophy, the view has been widely disseminated and taught, and a steady stream of critical responses to the genic pluralist position has been forthcoming. These responses fall into two main categories: pragmatic and causal.

The pragmatic response to genic pluralism simply notes that in any given selective scenario the genic perspective provides no information that is not also available from the hierarchical point of view. This state of affairs is taken by critics of this type as sufficient reason to prefer whichever perspective is most useful for solving the problems facing a particular researcher (Glymour 1999; Van der Steen & Van den Berg 1999; and Shanahan 1997). The weakness of this approach as a critique of genic pluralism is that it does not so much criticize genic pluralism as simply ignore it.

The other major form of critique of genic pluralism is based on arguments concerning the causal structure of selective episodes. The idea here is that while genic pluralism gets the “genetic book-keeping” (i.e., the input/output relations) correct, it does not accurately reflect the causal processes that bring about the result in question (Wimsatt 1980a,b). Some examples of this approach used against the genic pluralists (including Sober 1990; Sober & Wilson 1994, 1998) also appeal to aspects of the manifestor-of-adaptations and beneficiary questions to establish the failure of genic pluralism to represent certain selective events correctly. Causal concerns are also raised in some other work (Shanahan 1997, Van der Steen and Van den Berg 1999, Stanford 2001, and Glennan 2002), though without the focus on other units questions. The weakness of this line of criticism is its inability to isolate a notion of cause that is both plausible and plausibly true of hierarchical but not genic level models. This feature—that the genic and hierarchical models are so similar as to be indistinguishable—which appears as an insurmountable problem in the context of debates about differing causal structure, turns out to be the locus of critical response to genic pluralism, which denies that the genic selectionists have any distinct and coherent genic level causes at all (Lloyd 2005; Lloyd et al. 2005).

Genic pluralism presents alleles as independent causal entities, with the claim that the availability of such models makes hierarchical selection models—and the ensuing debates about how to identify interactors in selection processes—moot. Or, in a less contentious version of the argument, the hierarchical and genic models are fully developed causal alternatives (Waters 1991). However, in each case of the causal allelic models, these models are directly and completely derived from precisely the hierarchical models the authors reject. Moreover, causal claims made on behalf of alleles are utterly dependent on hierarchically identified and established interactors as causes, thus undermining their claims that the units of selection (interactor) debates are mere “quibbles” and are irrelevant to the representation of selection processes. Moreover, and contrary to the claims of pluralists, cases of frequency-dependence, such as in heterosis and in game-theoretic models of selection, necessitate selection at higher than genic levels because the relevant properties of the entities at the genic level are only definable relative to higher levels of organization. Thus, they cannot be properly described as properties of alleles nor are they “even definable at the allelic level.” (Sarkar 2008: 219) In addition, when drift is taken into account, the genic accounts fail to be empirically adequate (Brandon & Nijhout 2006).

We can say that the allelic level models are completely derivative from higher level models of selection processes using the following guidelines (Lloyd 2005). Two models that are mathematically equivalent may be semantically different, that is, they have different interpretations. Such models can be independent from one another or one may be derivative of the other. In the genic selection case, the pluralists appear to be claiming that the genic level models are independent from the hierarchical models. The claim is: although the genic models are mathematically equivalent, they have different parameters, and a different interpretation, and they are completely independent from hierarchical models.

But, despite the pluralists’ repeated claims, we can see from their own calculations and examples that theirs are derivative models, and thus, that their “genic” level causes are derivative from and dependent on higher level causes. Their genic level models depend for their empirical, causal, and explanatory adequacy on entire mathematical structures taken from the hierarchical models and refashioned.

As reviewed above, one example from their own writing comes from the treatment of the t-allele case, a universally recognized case of three levels of selection operating simultaneously on a single allele. Right before the t-allele case, a suggestion is offered that a Williams’s type analysis could be based on an application of Lloyd’s additivity criterion for identifying interactors, which is strictly hierarchical (Waters 1991: 563; Lloyd [1988] 1994: Ch. 5). Thus, the pluralist suggestion is to borrow a method for identifying potential higher-level interactors in order to determine the genic environments and thus to have more adequate genic level models. Similarly, other pluralists resort to a traditional approach to identifying interactors in order to make their genic models work. It had earlier been proposed that the statistical idea of screening off be used to identify which levels of entities are causally effective in the selection process; i.e., it is a method used to isolate interactors (Brandon 1982). But some pluralists propose using screening off to identify layers of allelic environments, and also show how Sober’s probabilistic causal account could be used for a genic account (Sterelny & Kitcher 1988: 354).

Hence, the pluralists all use the same methods for isolating relevant genic-level environments as others do for the traditional isolating of interactors. What, we may ask, is the real difference? Both can be seen as attempting to get the causal influences on selection right, because they are using the same methods. What is different is that the genic selectionists want to tell the causal story in terms of genes and not in terms of interactors and genes. Moreover, they propose doing away with interactors altogether, by renaming them the genic-level environments. Are we to think that renaming changes the metaphysics of the situation?

It seems that levels of interaction important to the outcome of the selection process are being discovered in the usual ways, i.e., by using approaches to interactors and their environments, and that that exact same information is being translated into talk of the differentiated and layered environments of the genes.

The issue concerning renaming model structures is especially confusing in the genic pluralists presentations, because they repeatedly rely on an assumption or intuition that, given an allelic state space, we are dealing with allelic causes. This last assumption is easily traced back to the original genic selectionist views that alleles are the ultimate beneficiaries of any long term selection process (Williams 1966; Dawkins 1982a,b); thus, the genic pluralist argument rests substantially on a view regarding the superior importance of the beneficiary question, which has been clearly delineated from the interactor question, above.

Let us summarize the consequences of derivativeness in terms of the science and metaphysics of the processes discussed. First, the genic pluralists end up offering not, as they claim, a variety of genuinely diverse causal versions of the selection process at different levels. This is because the causes of the hierarchical models, however determined, are simply transformed and renamed in the lower level models, but remain fully intact as relevant causes at the full range of higher and lower levels. More importantly, no new allelic causes are introduced. Second, while genic models may be derived from hierarchical models, they fail to sustain the necessary supporting methodology. Third, the lack of genuine alternative causal accounts destroys the claims of pluralism or, at least, of any interesting philosophical variety, since there are no genuine alternatives being presented, unless you count renaming model structures as metaphysically significant (see also Okasha 2011).[18] Thus, the picture of proposing an alternative “interactor” at the genic level is not fulfilled (vs. Sterelny & Kitcher 1988). Perhaps the best way to save the pluralist vision is to appeal to the work on neighbor selection (Godfrey-Smith 2008), which can be cast within a pluralist program. This effort is to revive and discuss an alternative fashion of modeling altruism or group benefit, within the terms of a lower, individual level (see the discussion in section 3.1, Genic Selection: The Originators).

There is a further complication with respect to the nature of the genic selection models put forward by genic pluralists. These models function under the presupposition that they are at least mathematically equivalent to hierarchical models. This claim has largely depended on the work of Dugatkin and Reeve in establishing this equivalence (Dugatkin & Reeve 1994, Sterelny 1996b, Sober & Wilson 1998, Sterelny & Griffiths 1999, Kerr & Godfrey-Smith 2002a, Waters 2005). However, foundational work has indicated that this equivalence does not in fact hold. In Dugatkin and Reeve and the rest of this literature, comparison of population genetic models was largely based on predictions of allele frequency changes; in other words, if two models made the same predictions as to the changes of allelic frequencies in a given situation, then the models are equivalent. However, this is an overly simplistic method for testing model equivalence which pays little mind to the details of the models themselves. When the notion of representational adequacy of the models is taken into account, specifically through the inclusion of parametric and dynamical sufficiency as important points of comparison, this equivalence between genic and hierarchical models disappears (Lloyd, Lewontin, & Feldman 2008; Lewontin 1974; see also group selection for more on formal equivalence).

Parametric sufficiency concerns what state space and variables are sufficient to capture the relevant properties of a given system, while dynamical sufficiency

concerns what state space and variables are sufficient to describe the evolution of a system given the parameters being used in the specific system. (Lloyd, Lewontin, & Feldman 2008: 146; Lewontin 1974)

Utilizing these concepts allows for a more detailed and meaningful evaluation of a given mathematical model. And under such an analysis, the claims regarding the equivalency of genic and hierarchical models cannot be sustained. Since allelic parameters and the changes in allelic frequencies depend on genotypic fitnesses, the genic models claimed to be equivalent to the hierarchical models are neither parametrically nor dynamically sufficient.[19]

3.5 Units of Evolutionary Transition

In our preceding discussions of units of selection, we have restricted ourselves to situations in which the various units were pre-established entities. Our approach has been synchronic, one in which the relevant units, be they genes, organisms, or populations, are the same both before and after a given evolutionary process. However, not all evolutionary processes may be able to be captured under such a perspective. In particular, recent discussions regarding so-called “evolutionary transitions” present a unique complication to the debates over units and levels of selection.

Evolutionary transition is “the process that creates new levels of biological organization” (Griesemer 2000c: 69), such as the origins of chromosomes, multicellularity, eukaryotes, and social groups (Maynard-Smith and Szathmáry 1995: 6–7). These transitions all share a common feature, namely that “entities that were capable of independent replication before the transition can replicate only as part of a larger whole after it” (Maynard-Smith and Szathmáry 1995: 6).

Evolutionary transitions create new potential levels and units of selection by creating new kinds of entities that can have variances in fitness. Thus, it is the “project of a theory of evolutionary transition to explain the evolutionary origin of entities with such capacities” (Griesemer 2000c: 70). However, since such cases involve the evolutionary origin of a given level of selection, traditional synchronic approaches to units and levels of selection, which assume the pre-existence of a “hierarchy of entities that are potential candidates for units of selection”, may be insufficient, since it is the evolution of those very properties that allow entities to serve as, for example, interactors or replicators that is being addressed (Griesemer 2000c: 70). Such a task requires a diachronic perspective, one under which the properties of our currently extant units of selection cannot be presupposed.

…[A]s long as evolutionary theory concerns the function of contemporary units at fixed levels of the biological hierarchy…, the functionalist approach may be adequate to its intended task. However, if a philosophy of units is to address problems going beyond this scope—for example to problems of evolutionary transition,… then a different approach is needed. (Griesemer 2003: 174)

The “reproducer” concept (discussed in section 2.2), which incorporates the notion of development into the treatment of units and levels of selection, is a step toward meeting the goal of addressing such evolutionary transitions, and

the dependency of formerly independent replicators on the “replication” of the wholes—the basis for the definition of evolutionary transition … is a developmental dependency that should be incorporated into the analysis of units. (2000c: 75)

Those adopting the reproducer concept argue that thinking in broader terms of reproducers avoids the presupposition of evolved coding mechanisms implicit to the concept of replicators. In the case of evolutionary transitions, this allows us to separate the basic development involved in the origin of a new biological level from the later evolution of sophisticated developmental mechanisms for the “stabilization and maintenance of a new level of reproduction” (Griesemer 2000c: 77).

Explaining evolutionary transitions in Darwinian terms poses a particular challenge: “Why was it advantageous for the lower-level units to sacrifice their individuality and form themselves into a corporate body?” (Okasha 2006: 218). On one analysis, three stages of such a transition, each defined in terms of the connection between fitness at the level of the collective and the individual fitness of its component particles, are identified (Okasha 2006: 238). Initially, collective fitness is simply defined as average particle fitness. As fitness at the two levels begins to be decoupled, collective fitness remains proportional to average particle fitness, but is not defined by it; at such a stage, “the emerging collective lacks ‘individuality’, and has no collective-level functions of its own” (Okasha 2006: 237). Finally, collective fitness “starts to depend on the functionality of the collective itself” (Okasha 2006: 237–8; see Okasha 2015 for a representation of this in terms of causal graphs).

On this analysis, the different stages of an evolutionary transition involve different conceptions of multi-level selection (Okasha 2006, 2015). Using the distinction defended by Lorraine Heisler and John Damuth (Heisler & Damuth 1987; Damuth & Heisler 1988) in their “contextual analysis” of units of selection, this analysis claims that early on in the process of an evolutionary transition, multi-level selection 1 (MLS1), in which the particles themselves are the “‘focal’ units” upon which selection directly acts, applies. However, by the end of the transition, both the collectives and the particles are focal units of selection processes, with independent fitnesses, a case of Damuth and Heisler’s multi-level selection 2 (MLS2) (Okasha 2006: 4). An easy way to capture this distinction is that, under MLS1, the lower level particles are the interactors as well as the replicators, while in MLS2, both the upper level collectives as well as the particles are interactors. Thus, the issues surrounding evolutionary transitions involve both the interactor question and the replicator question. Understanding evolutionary transitions hence provides additional significance to Damuth and Heisler’s distinction:

Rather than simply describing selection processes of different sorts, which should be kept separate in the interests of conceptual clarity, MLS1 and MLS2 represent different temporal stages of an evolutionary transition. (Okasha 2006: 239)

On a different approach, evolutionary transitions are seen as the appearance of a “new kind of Darwinian population”, of “new entities that can enter into Darwinian processes in their own right” (Godfrey-Smith 2009: 122). These transitions involve a “de-Darwinizing” of the lower-level entities such that

an initial collective has come to engage in definite high-level reproduction, and this has involved the curtailing of independent evolution at the lower level. (Godfrey-Smith 2009: 124)

This can be accomplished in a variety of ways, such as through the bottleneck caused by the production of new collectives from single individuals, coupled with germ-line segregation (as in the transitions to multicellularity), or by a single member of the collective preventing all other members from reproducing (for example, among eusocial insects), or by single member having primary but not total control over the other constituents (as in the evolution of eukaryotes) (Godfrey-Smith 2009: 123–124).

These processes all involve restrictions on the ability of the lower-level entities to function as interactors and replicators, and the emergence of upper-level collectives as both interactors and replicators. The degree to which lower-level entities are thus restricted can vary. For example, somatic cells are still capable of bearing individual fitness, of outcompeting neighboring cells, and of producing more progeny. Thus, they are not yet “post-populational”; they “retain crucial Darwinian features in their own right” (Godfrey-Smith 2009: 126). However, they are dependent on the germ-line cells for the propagation of new collectives, and thus their ability to act as replicators is necessarily curtailed. Thus, in order to prevent subversion and encourage cooperation, such a transition requires both the “generation of benefit” and the “alignment of reproductive interests” (Godfrey-Smith 2009: 124, with terminology from Calcott 2008; see Booth’s 2014 analysis of heterokaryotic Fungi using Godfrey-Smith’s approach). For example, in the case of multicellularity, the latter can be accomplished by “close kinship within the collective” (Godfrey-Smith 2009: 124).

In a useful analysis of the volvocine algae, other hierarchical selectionists use optimality modeling at the group level to search for a group level adaptation, in aid of modeling evolutionary transitions (Shelton & Michod 2014b). They look for selection and adaptation at the higher level in their model of transition, which contrasts other views that look only for selection at the higher level, but not for engineering adaptations. The emphasis is on the distinction between fortuitous group benefit and real group adaptation. In places, however, they seem to embrace the product-of-selection definition of group adaptation, even though they are committed to denying its applicability (2014b: 454). Their point is to decompose levels of selection and adaptation using a model organism to get evolutionary emergence of levels, i.e., evolutionary transition.

Thus, there are a variety of philosophical approaches to analyzing evolutionary transition on offer, whether in terms of reproducers, multilevel selection, or Darwinian populations. The essential diachronic nature of the problem poses a unique challenge, and involves not just the interactor and replicator (or reproducer) questions, but also the questions of who is the beneficiary of the selection process, and how that new level emerges.

4. Conclusion

It makes no sense to treat different answers as competitors if they are answering different questions. We have reviewed a framework of four questions with which the debates appearing under the rubric of “units of selection” can be classified and clarified. The original discussants of the units of selection problem separated the classic question about the level of selection or interaction (the interactor question) from the issue of how large a chunk of the genome functions as a replicating unit (the replicator question). The interactor question should also be separated from the question of which entity should be seen as acquiring adaptations as a result of the selection process (the manifestor-of-adaptation question). In addition, there is a crucial ambiguity in the meaning of adaptation that is routinely ignored in these debates: adaptation as a selection product and adaptation as an engineering design. Finally, we can distinguish the issue of the entity that ultimately benefits from the selection process (the beneficiary question) from the other three questions.

This set of distinctions has been used to analyze leading points of view about the units of selection and to clarify precisely the question or combination of questions with which each of the protagonists is concerned. There are many points in the debates in which misunderstandings may be avoided by a precise characterization of which of the units of selection questions is being addressed.


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Other Internet Resources

  • KLI Theory Lab, searchable, bibliographic database maintained by the Konrad Lorenz Institute

The editors would like to thank Sally Ferguson for noticing and reporting a number of typographical and other infelicitous errors in this error.

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Elisabeth Lloyd <ealloyd@indiana.edu>

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