Paul Feyerabend (b.1924, d.1994), having studied science at the University of Vienna, moved into philosophy for his doctoral thesis, made a name for himself both as an expositor and (later) as a critic of Karl Popper’s “critical rationalism”, and went on to become one of the twentieth century’s most famous philosophers of science. An imaginative maverick, he became a critic of philosophy of science itself, particularly of “rationalist” attempts to lay down or discover rules of scientific method.
- 1. A Brief Chronology of Feyerabend’s Life and Work
- 2. Feyerabend’s Early Life
- 3. Feyerabend’s Turn to Philosophy: The Vienna Circle, Popper, and Wittgenstein
- 4. Feyerabend’s Early Work: Liberalizing Empiricism
- 5. Feyerabend’s Later Work: Towards Relativism, but then Beyond It
- 6. Conclusion: Last Things
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. A Brief Chronology of Feyerabend’s Life and Work
|1924||Born in Vienna. Son of a civil servant and a seamstress.|
|1940||Was inducted into the Arbeitsdienst (the work service introduced by the Nazis).|
|1942||Drafted into the Pioneer Corps of the German army. After basic training, volunteered for Officers’ School.|
|1943||Learned of his mother’s suicide.|
|1944||Decorated, Iron Cross. Advanced to Lieutenant. Lectured to Officers’ School.|
|1945||Shot in the hand and in the belly during the retreat from the Russian Army. The bullet damaged his spinal nerves.|
|1946||Received a fellowship to study singing and stage-management in Weimar. Joined the “Cultural Association for the Democratic Reform of Germany”.|
|1947||Returned to Vienna to study history and sociology at the University. Soon transferred to physics. First article, on the concept of illustration in modern physics, published. Feyerabend “a raving positivist” at the time.|
|1948||First visit to the Alpbach seminar of the Austrian College Society. Became secretary of the seminars. Met Karl Popper and Walter Hollitscher. Married first wife, Edeltrud.|
|1949||Became student leader of the “Kraft Circle”, a student philosophy club centred around Viktor Kraft, Feyerabend’s dissertation supervisor and a former member of the Vienna Circle. Ludwig Wittgenstein visited the Kraft Circle to give a talk. Feyerabend also met Bertolt Brecht.|
|1951||Received doctorate in philosophy for his thesis on “basic statements”. Applied for a British Council scholarship to study under Wittgenstein at Cambridge. But Wittgenstein died before Feyerabend arrived in England, so Feyerabend chose Popper as his supervisor instead.|
|1952||Came to England, to study under Popper at the London School of Economics. Concentrated on the quantum theory and Wittgenstein. Studied the typescript of Wittgenstein’s Philosophical Investigations, and prepared a summary of the book. Befriended another of Popper’s students, Joseph Agassi.|
|1953||Feyerabend returned to Vienna. Popper applied for an extension to his scholarship, but Feyerabend decided to remain in Vienna instead. Translated Popper’s The Open Society and its Enemies into German. Declined the offer to become Popper’s research assistant. Agassi took the post. Feyerabend became research assistant to Arthur Pap in Vienna.|
|1954||First articles on quantum mechanics and on Wittgenstein published. Pap introduced Feyerabend to Herbert Feigl.|
|1955||Took up his first full-time academic appointment as lecturer in philosophy at the University of Bristol, England. His summary of Wittgenstein’s Philosophical Investigations appeared as a review of the book in The Philosophical Review.|
|1956||Married second wife, Mary O’Neill. Published an article on the “paradox of analysis”. Feyerabend got to know the quantum physicist David Bohm, whose ideas were to influence him substantially.|
|1957||Gave a paper on the quantum theory of measurement to the Colston Research Symposium at the University of Bristol.|
|1958||Took up visiting lectureship at the University of California, Berkeley. Two of his most important early papers, “An Attempt at a Realistic Interpretation of Experience”, and “Complementarity” appeared in the proceedings of the Aristotelian Society. In them, Feyerabend argued against positivism and in favour of a scientific realist account of the relation between theory and experience, largely on grounds familiar from Karl Popper’s falsificationist views.|
|1959||Accepted a permanent position at Berkeley, and applied for a Green Card to work in the US.|
|1960||As a result of earlier discussions with Herbert Feigl, Feyerabend published “Das Problem der Existenz theoretischer Entitäten”, in which he argued that there is no special “problem” of theoretical entities, and that all entities are hypothetical. Gave two lectures to Oberlin College, Ohio, in which he embroidered on Popper’s views about the pre-Socratic thinkers.|
|1962||“Explanation, Reduction, and Empiricism” appeared. Criticised existing empiricist accounts of explanation and theoretical reduction (Hempel, Nagel), and introduced the concept of incommensurability, based on the “contextual theory of meaning” which Feyerabend claimed to find in Wittgenstein’s Investigations.|
|1963||“How to be a Good Empiricist”, a position paper summing up his point of view, was published, along with his two main articles on the Mind/Body Problem in which he introduced the position now known as “eliminative materialism”.|
|1965||Publication of the first part of the essay “Problems of Empiricism”, and his “Reply to Criticism”, in which Feyerabend made his last serious attempt to construct a “tolerant”, “disinfected” empiricism. Although beginning to put some distance between himself and Popper, Feyerabend was still able to write a glowing review of Popper’s Conjectures and Refutations.|
|1967–8||Focus of his published papers had by now moved to “theoretical pluralism”, the view that in order to maximise the chances of falsifying existing theories, scientists should construct and defend as many alternative theories as possible. Feyerabend’s articles “On a Recent Critique of Complementarity” defended Niels Bohr’s views against Popper’s critique. Popper not amused.|
|1969||In a tiny article, “Science Without Experience”, Feyerabend finally gave up the attempt to be an empiricist, arguing that in principle experience is necessary at no point in the construction, comprehension or testing of empirical scientific theories.|
|1970||Publication of “Consolations for the Specialist”, in which Feyerabend attacked Popper from a Kuhnian point of view, and the essay version of “Against Method: Outline of an Anarchistic Theory of Knowledge”, in which “epistemological anarchism” was revealed for the first time. Feyerabend claimed to be applying the liberalism of John Stuart Mill’s On Liberty to scientific methodology. Published little during the next few years.|
|1974||Death of Feyerabend’s friend Imre Lakatos, putting paid to their plans to produce a dialogue volume, For and Against Method. Feyerabend, lecturing at the University of Sussex, was ill too. Published a scathing review of Popper’s Objective Knowledge.|
|1975||Appearance of Feyerabend’s first book, Against Method, setting out “epistemological anarchism”, whose main thesis was that there is no such thing as the scientific method. Great scientists are methodological opportunists who use any moves that come to hand, even if they thereby violate canons of empiricist methodology.|
|1976–7||Feyerabend replies to most of the major reviewers of Against Method. Got depressed. Published his first major article on relativism: the first time he explicitly endorsed the view.|
|1978||Science in a Free Society appears, including replies to reviewers of Against Method. Some clarification of epistemological anarchism, and very little retreat from the position set out in AM. Explored further the political implications of epistemological anarchism. The book also included one of Feyerabend’s major endorsements of relativism, one of the views for which he was becoming known. First volume of the German edition of Feyerabend’s philosophical papers appears. (Feyerabend published increasingly in German from this point onwards).|
|1981||English publication of the first two volumes of Feyerabend’s Philosophical Papers, with new material in introductory chapters.|
|1983||Met Grazia Borrini at his Berkeley lectures.|
|1984||Publishes “Science as an Art”, in which he defends an explicitly relativistic account of the history of science according to which there is change, but no “progress”. Also continues his campaign to rehabilitate Ernst Mach.|
|1987||Publication of Farewell to Reason, a volume collecting some of the papers Feyerabend had published between 1981 and 1987. Relativism again at the forefront, especially in its “Protagorean” version.|
|1988||Second, revised edition of Against Method, omitting the long chapter on the history of the visual arts, but now incorporating parts of Science in a Free Society, appeared.|
|1989||Paul and Grazia married in January. Left for Italy and Switzerland in the fall, at least partly because of the effects of the October earthquake in California.|
|1990||Officially resigned from Berkeley in March.|
|1991||Retired from Zurich. Three Dialogues on Knowledge and Beyond Reason, a festschrift edited by a former pupil, Gonzalo Munévar, published. Also lots of small publications, many of them in Common Knowledge. Signs of an increasing unhappiness with relativism in Feyerabend’s publications around this time. But still vigorously opposed to “objectivism”.|
|1993||Third edition of Against Method published. Feyerabend developed an inoperable brain tumour, and was hospitalized.|
|1994||Feyerabend died in the Genolier clinic (Genolier, Canton of Vaud, Switzerland), February 11th. Several major memorial symposia and colloquia on his work took place over the next two years.|
|1995||Killing Time: The Autobiography of Paul Feyerabend published.|
|1999||Conquest of Abundance published.|
2. Feyerabend’s Early Life
(Unless otherwise stated, page references are to Killing Time: The Autobiography of Paul Feyerabend, (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1995), henceforth referred to as “KT”).
2.1 Youth (1924 –1938)
Paul Karl Feyerabend was born into a middle-class Viennese family in 1924. Times were hard in Vienna in the nineteen-twenties: in the aftermath of the First World War there were famines, hunger riots, and runaway inflation. Feyerabend’s family had a three-room apartment on the Wolfganggasse, “a quiet street lined with oak trees” (p. 11). The first chapters of his autobiography give the impression of his being a strange child, whose activities were entirely centred around his own family, and who was cut off from neighbors, other children and the outside world because “[t]he world is a dangerous place” (p. 15). Between the ages of three and six, Feyerabend recalls, he spent most of his time in the apartment’s kitchen and bedroom. Occasional visits to the cinema and numerous stories, especially stories with a magical aura, seem to have taken the place usually filled by childhood friends. He was a sickly child, but ran away from home once, when he was five years old (p. 7). When he started school at the age of six, he “had no idea how other people lived or what to do with them” (p. 16). The world seemed to be filled with strange and inexplicable happenings. It took him some while to get used to school, which initially made him sick. But when he did so, his health problems had disappeared. When he learned to read, he found the new and magical world of books waiting for him, and indulged himself to the full (p. 25). But his sense of the world’s inexplicability took some time to dissipate—he recalls feeling that way about events during the nineteen-thirties and throughout the second world war.
Feyerabend attended a Realgymnasium (High School) at which he was taught Latin, English, and science. He was a Vorzugsschüler, that is, “a student whose grades exceeded a certain average” (p. 22), and by the time he was sixteen he had the reputation of knowing more about physics and math than his teachers. But he also got thrown out of school on one occasion.
Feyerabend “stumbled into drama” (p. 26) by accident, becoming something of a ham actor in the process. This accident then led to another, when he found himself forced to accept philosophy texts among the bundles of books he had bought for the plays and novels they contained. It was, he later claimed, “the dramatic possibilities of reasoning and… the power that arguments seem to exert over people” (p. 27) with which philosophy fascinated him. Although his reputation was as a philosopher, he preferred to be thought of as an entertainer. His interests, he said, were always somewhat unfocussed (p. 27).
However, Feyerabend’s school physics teacher Oswald Thomas inspired in him an interest in physics and astronomy. The first lecture he gave (at school) seems to have been on these subjects (p. 28). Together with his father, he built a telescope and “became a regular observer for the Swiss Institute of Solar Research” (p. 29). He describes his scientific interests as follows:
I was interested in both the technical and the more general aspects of physics and astronomy, but I drew no distinction between them. For me, Eddington, Mach (his Mechanics and Theory of Heat), and Hugo Dingler (Foundations of Geometry) were scientists who moved freely from one end of their subject to the other. I read Mach very carefully and made many notes. (p. 30).
Feyerabend does not tell us how he became acquainted with another one of his main preoccupations—singing. He was proud of his voice, becoming a member of a choir, and took singing lessons for years, later claiming to have remained in California in order not to have to give up his singing teacher. In his autobiography he talks of the pleasure, greater than any intellectual pleasure, derived from having and using a well-trained singing voice (p. 83). During his time in Vienna in the second world war, his interest led him to attend the opera (first the Volksoper, and then the Staatsoper) together with his mother. A former opera singer, Johann Langer, gave him singing lessons and encouraged him to go to an academy. After passing the entrance examination, Feyerabend did so, becoming a pupil of Adolf Vogel. At this point in his life, he later recalled:
The course of my life was… clear: theoretical astronomy during the day, preferably in the domain of perturbation theory; then rehearsals, coaching, vocal exercises, opera in the evening…; and astronomical observation at night… The only remaining obstacle was the war. (p. 35).
2.2 The Anschluss (1938)
Feyerabend tells how, without falling for Adolf Hitler’s charisma, he appreciated Hitler’s oratorial style. Austria was re-unified with Germany in 1938. Jewish schoolmates were treated differently, and Jewish neighbours and acquaintances started disappearing. But, as usual, Feyerabend had no clear view of the situation:
Much of what happened I learned only after the war, from articles, books, and television, and the events I did notice either made no impression at all or affected me in a random way. I remember them and I can describe them, but there was no context to give them meaning and no aim to judge them by. (pp. 37–8).
For me the German occupation and the war that followed were an inconvenience, not a moral problem, and my reactions came from accidental moods and circumstances, not from a well-defined outlook. (p. 38).
The general impression given by his autobiography is of an imaginative but fairly solitary person with no stable or well-defined personality. Rather, his decisions and courses of action seem to have been the result of a struggle between his tendency to conform and his contrariness. Just as when he was a child, events happening around him seemed strange, distant, and out of context. It is very difficult to see him identifying with any group, and he must have made an unlikely soldier.
2.3 The War (1939–1945)
As far as his army record goes, Feyerabend claims in his autobiography that his mind is a blank. But in fact this is one of the periods he tells us most about. Having passed his final high school exams in March 1942, he was drafted into the Arbeitsdienst (the work service introduced by the Nazis), and sent for basic training in Pirmasens, Germany. Feyerabend opted to stay in Germany to keep out of the way of the fighting, but subsequently asked to be sent to where the fighting was, having become bored with cleaning the barracks! He even considered joining the SS, for aesthetic reasons. His unit was then posted at Quelerne en Bas, near Brest, in Brittany. Still, the events of the war did not register. In November 1942, he returned home to Vienna, but left before Christmas to join the Wehrmacht’s Pioneer Corps.
Their training took place in Krems, near Vienna. Feyerabend soon volunteered for officers’ school, not because of an urge for leadership, but out of a wish to survive, his intention being to use officers’ school as a way to avoid front-line fighting. The trainees were sent to Yugoslavia. In Vukovar, during July 1943, he learnt of his mother’s suicide, but was absolutely unmoved, and obviously shocked his fellow officers by displaying no feeling. In December that same year, Feyerabend’s unit was sent into battle on the northern part of the Russian front, but although they blew up buildings, they never encountered any Russian soldiers.
Despite the fact that Feyerabend reports of himself that he was foolhardy during battle, treating it as a theatrical event, he received the Iron Cross (second class) early in March 1944, for leading his men into a village under enemy fire, and occupying it. He was advanced from private soldier to lance corporal, to sergeant, and then, at the end of 1944, to lieutenant. At the end of November that year, he gave a series of lectures to the officers’ school at Dessau Rosslau, near Leipzig. Their theme was the (“historicist”) one that “historical periods such as the Baroque, the Rococo, the Gothic Age are unified by a concealed essence that only a lonely outsider can understand” (p. 49). His description of these lectures, and of his notebook entries at the time, reveals the influence of Friedrich Nietzsche in their fascination with this “lonely outsider”, “the solitary thinker” (p. 48).
Having returned home for Christmas 1944, Feyerabend again boarded the train for the front, this time for Poland, in January 1945. There he was put in charge of a bicycle company. Although he claims to have relished the role of army officer no more than he later did that of university professor, he must have been at least a competent soldier, since in the field he came to take the place of a sequence of injured officers: first a lieutenant, then a captain, and then a major, before he was shot during another heroic act of carelessness performed in the 1945 retreat westwards from the Russian army. The bullet lodged in his spine left him temporarily paralysed from the waist down, meaning that he spent time in a wheelchair, then on crutches, and thereafter walked with the aid of a stick. The war ended as he was recovering from his injury, in a hospital in Apolda, a little town near Weimar, while fervently hoping not to recover before the war was over. Germany’s surrender came as a relief, but also as a disappointment relative to past hopes and aspirations. He later said of his stint in the army that it was “an interruption, a nuisance; I forgot about it the moment it was over” (p. 111).
2.4 Post-War Activities (1945–1947)
However, the war took its toll even on Feyerabend. The bullet in his spine left him impotent for the rest of his life. (His descriptions of subsequent sexual encounters are one of the more amusing parts of his autobiography). Although he started off completely ignorant of women, he married four times, and had, by his own account, plenty of affairs. But he seems to have been distant not just in his relationship with his parents, but in some of his marriages too. He hated the slavery love seemed to imply, but hated equally the freedom achieved by taking evasive action. He got bogged down in cycles of dependence, isolation, and renewed dependence, which only dissolved into a more balanced pattern after many years.
At the end of the war, Feyerabend went to the mayor of Apolda and asked for a job. He was assigned to the education section, given an office and a secretary and, fittingly, put in charge of entertainment.
In 1946, having recovered from paralysis, he received a state fellowship to return to study singing and stage-management for a year at the Musikhochschule in Weimar. He moved from Apolda to Weimar after about three months. At the Weimar Institut zur Methodologischen Erneuerung des Deutschen Theaters he studied theatre, and at the Weimar academy he took classes in Italian, harmony, piano, singing and enunciation. Singing remained one of his life’s major interests. He attended performances (drama, opera, ballet, concerts) at Weimar’s Nationaltheater, and later reminisced about opera stars of the time, recalling debates and arguments about theatre (e.g. the stereotyping of roles and plays) with Maxim Vallentin, Hans Eisler, etc. He also played a small part in one of the films of G.W.Pabst, a notable German film-director. Although, by his own account, he led a full life, he became restless and decided to move.
3. Feyerabend’s Turn to Philosophy: The Vienna Circle, Popper, and Wittgenstein
3.1 Return to Vienna: University Life, Alpbach, and Popper (1947–1948)
Feyerabend therefore returned, still on crutches, to his parents“ apartment house in Vienna’s 15th district. Although he planned to study physics, maths and astronomy, he chose instead to read history and sociology at the University of Vienna’s Institut für Osterreichische Geschichtsforschung, thinking that history, unlike physics, is concerned with real life. But he became dissatisfied with history, and returned to theoretical physics. Together with a group of science students, who all regarded themselves as far superior to students of other subjects, Feyerabend invaded philosophy lectures and seminars. Although this was not his first contact with philosophy, it seems to have been the period which cemented his interest. He recalls that in all interventions he took the radical positivist line that science is the basis of knowledge; that it is empirical; and that nonempirical enterprises are either logic or nonsense (p. 68). These views would have been familiar from the climate of Logical Positivism which found its main root in the Vienna Circle, a group of scientifically-minded philosophers who, in the nineteen-twenties and ”thirties sought to deploy the newly-revitalised formal logic of Gottlob Frege and Russell and Whitehead’s Principia Mathematica to represent the structure of human knowledge. As we shall see, Feyerabend’s youthful positivist scientism makes quite a contrast with his later conclusions.
In August 1948, at the first meeting of the international summer seminar of the Austrian College Society in Alpbach which he attended, Feyerabend met the philosopher of science Karl Popper, who had already made a name for himself as the Vienna Circle’s “official opposition”. (The Austrian College Society had been founded in 1945 by Austrian resistance fighters, “to provide a forum for the exchange of scholars and ideas and so to prepare the political unification of Europe” (Science in a Free Society, p. 109)). In his 1934 book Logik der Forschung Popper had elaborated the straightforward and appealing falsificationist view that great science could be characterised as a process in which thinkers put forward bold conjectures and then do their best to improve them by trying to refute them. Instead of trying to develop an inductive logic, Popper argued for the (deductivist) view that scientific method could be characterised in terms of logically valid deductive inferences.
Popper’s own autobiography, unfortunately, tells us nothing about their meeting or their relationship, despite the fact that he was to be the largest single influence (first positive, then negative) on Feyerabend’s work. For those hoping that Feyerabend might use the occasion of his autobiography to settle accounts with his erstwhile philosophical conscience, it is disappointing that the book tells us so little about his acquaintance with Popper. Elsewhere Feyerabend tells us that he
admired [Popper’s] freedom of manners, his cheek, his disrespectful attitude towards the German philosophers who gave the proceedings weight in more senses than one, his sense of humour… [and] his ability to restate ponderous problems in simple and journalistic language. Here was a free mind, joyfully putting forth his ideas, unconcerned about the reaction of the “professionals”. (SFS, p. 115).
But Popper’s ideas themselves, Feyerabend alleges, were not new to him, deductivism having been defended as early as 1925 by Viktor Kraft, and falsificationism being “taken for granted” at Alpbach. Popper’s ideas, he remarks, were also similar to those of another Viennese philosopher, Ludwig Wittgenstein (!), although “more abstract and anaemic” (SFS, p. 116). Over the following years, Feyerabend attended the Alpbach symposium about fifteen times, first as a student, then as a lecturer and seminar chair. He was offered, and accepted, the post of “scientific secretary” to the society, and this he calls “the most decisive step of my life” (p. 70). In fact, it is this decision which answers his self-addressed questions about the origin of his career, his reputation, and his situation at the time of writing his autobiography, since he traces his situation back to it.
At Alpbach he was also approached by communists, including the Marxist intellectual Walter Hollitscher, who became his teacher and friend. Feyerabend resisted Hollitscher’s political arguments on the basis of his own “youthful elitism” and “an almost instinctive aversion to group thinking” (p. 73). But although Feyerabend later described himself as having been “a raving positivist” at the time, it was Hollitscher, he says, who persuaded him of the cogency of realism about the “external world” (Popper’s important arguments for realism came somewhat later). The considerations Hollitscher deployed were, first, that scientific research was conducted on the assumption of realism, and could not be otherwise conducted, and, second, that realism is fruitful and productive of scientific progress, whereas positivism was simply a commentary on scientific results, barren in itself.
Hollitscher never presented an argument that would lead, step by step, from positivism to realism and he would have regarded the attempt to produce such an argument as philosophical folly. He rather developed the realist position itself, illustrated it by examples from science and commonsense, showed how closely it was connected with scientific research and everyday action and so revealed its strength. (SFS, p. 113).
Feyerabend eventually developed these thoughts in a fascinating series of papers beginning in 1957, arguing that science needs realism in order to progress, and that positivism would stultify such progress. The argument was entirely in line with Popper’s approach, as well as with his conclusions.
3.2 Early Contact with Wittgenstein (1948–1952)
Feyerabend’s principal intellectual engagement in the late 1940s and early 1950s was in his capacity as student leader of the “Kraft Circle”. Viktor Kraft was a former member of the Vienna Circle, and became Feyerabend’s dissertation supervisor. The Kraft Circle was a philosophy club centred around Kraft, which constituted another part of the Austrian College Society. Bela Juhos, Walter Hollitscher, Georg Henrik von Wright, Elizabeth Anscombe and Wittgenstein were all visiting speakers. Feyerabend reports that the Circle held meetings from 1949 to 1952 or 1953 (SFS, p. 109), that they set themselves the task of “considering philosophical problems in a nonmetaphysical manner and with special reference to the findings of the sciences” (“Herbert Feigl: A Biographical Sketch”, in P. K.Feyerabend & G.Maxwell (eds.), Mind, Matter, and Method: Essays in Philosophy and Science in Honor of Herbert Feigl, (Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1966), pp. 1–2) and that their main topics of discussion were the questions of the reality of theoretical entities and of the “external world”. About Wittgenstein’s lecture, Feyerabend recalls the following:
Not even a brief and quite interesting visit by Wittgenstein himself (in 1952) could advance our discussion. Wittgenstein was very impressive in his way of presenting concrete cases, such as amoebas under a microscope… but when he left we still did not know whether or not there was an external world, or, if there was one, what the arguments were in favour of it. (Feyerabend & Maxwell ibid., p. 4. Note that Feyerabend must have got the date wrong, since Wittgenstein died in April 1951).
Wittgenstein, who took a long time to make up his mind and then appeared over an hour late gave a spirited performance and seemed to prefer our disrespectful attitude to the fawning admiration he encountered elsewhere. (SFS, p. 109).
In 1949, Feyerabend was introduced to Bertolt Brecht, and Hollitscher offered him the opportunity to become one of Brecht’s production assistants, but he turned it down, later describing this as one of the biggest mistakes of his life (SFS, p. 114). In the autobiography, however, he retracts this statement, saying that he would not have enjoyed being part of the closely knit group that surrounded Brecht. (The reasons for his later defection from the Popperian camp seem to have been similar).
The University of Vienna’s physicists were Hans Thirring, Karl Przibram, and Felix Ehrenhaft. Feyerabend admired Thirring and Ehrenhaft, and was influenced by Ehrenhaft, who had lectured on physics there from 1947. Ehrenhaft was known as a fierce and independent critic of all kinds of orthodoxy in physics, but was sometimes thought of as a charlatan. Feyerabend reports that he and his fellow science students looked forward to exposing him as a fraud, but in fact were treated, at the 1949 Alpbach seminar, to a battle between Ehrenhaft and the orthodox in which the former presented his experiments but the latter defended their position by using strategies which Galileo’s opponents would have been proud of, ridiculing Ehrenhaft’s phenomena as mere Dreckeffects. Feyerabend commented that “Only much later did Ehrenhaft’s lesson sink in and our attitude at the time as well as the attitude of the entire profession provided me then with an excellent illustration of the nature of scientific rationality” (SFS, p. 111). Ehrenhaft did not convince the theoreticians, who protected themselves with an iron curtain of dogmatic belief of exactly the same kind as that deployed by Galileo’s opponents. His audience remained staunch empiricists, never doubting that science had to be adapted to facts. Feyerabend commented that the day-to-day business of science, what Thomas Kuhn called “normal science”, cannot exist without this kind of “split consciousness”.
At the University of Vienna, although he had originally planned to submit a thesis on physics, Feyerabend swapped to philosophy when he got nowhere with the electrodynamics problem he was calculating (the philosopher of science as failed scientist?). He completed his doctoral thesis, “Zur Theorie der Basissätze” in 1951 under Kraft’s supervision. The subject of the thesis was “basic sentences”, or “protocol sentences”, i.e. the kind of sentences that, the Logical Positivists had theorised, comprise the foundations of scientific knowledge. He later reported that in his philosophical work he had “started from and returned to the discussion of protocol statements in the Vienna Circle” (“Concluding Unphilosophical Conversation”, in Munévar (1991), p. 526). This is unsurprising, given that Kraft was then the Vienna Circle’s only survivor in Vienna. However, Kraft’s influence on Feyerabend has only recently been emphasised. Much of the material from Feyerabend’s thesis was presented at (or gleaned from) meetings of the Kraft Circle, and also appears in his early articles, such as “An Attempt at a Realistic Interpretation of Experience” (1958). The thesis itself was “a condensed version of the discussions in the Kraft Circle” (p. 115).
In the early 1950’s, Feyerabend published several German papers on Wittgenstein, written as a result of having read the proofs of the Philosophical Investigations, lent to him by Elizabeth Anscombe. Feyerabend first met Anscombe when lecturing on Descartes to the Austrian College Society. Anscombe had come to Vienna to perfect her German in order to translate Wittgenstein’s works.
She gave me manuscripts of Wittgenstein’s later writings and discussed them with me. The discussions extended over months and occasionally proceeded from morning over lunch until late into the evening. They had a profound influence upon me though it is not at all easy to specify particulars. (SFS, p. 114).
Feyerabend planned to study with Wittgenstein in Cambridge, and Wittgenstein was prepared to take him on as a student, but he died before Feyerabend arrived in England. Karl Popper became his supervisor instead.
3.3 Life at the London School of Economics (1952–1953)
In Feyerabend’s autobiography, we are told a little about Popper’s lectures and his famous LSE seminar. The lectures began with the claim that there is no method in science, but that there are some simple and helpful rules of thumb. Popper tried to show “how simple ideas that were derived from equally simple requirements brought order into the complex world of research” (pp. 88–9). Having being convinced by Popper’s and Pierre Duhem’s critiques of inductivism (the view that science proceeds through generalisation from facts recorded in experience), Feyerabend considered falsificationism a real option, and, he says, “fell for it” (p. 89), applying falsificationism in his papers and lectures. This is not his first admission that he was a falsificationist, but it is notable that he did not see it as entailing his having been a Popperian. Feyerabend was (usually) a fairly liberal falsificationist, always emphasising the tenacity with which scientists should defend their theories, and allowing that scientific theories can start by being untestable. Faithful Popperians like John Watkins and Joseph Agassi, he emphasises, continually ticked him off for being unorthodox (he was later accused, by Agassi, of plagiarising from Popper). Instead he later saw this interlude as an example of the dangers of abstract reasoning. Rationalism is already dangerous, since it “paralyses our judgment” (p. 89) and is invested with “an almost superhuman authority” (p. 90). But Popper added a further dangerous element: simplicity. Such a philosophy, complains Feyerabend, “may be out of touch with reality… [that is], with scientific practice” (p. 90).
Feyerabend is here referring to Popper’s approach to the epistemology of science, which he himself followed and furthered for quite a while. In chapter II of The Logic of Scientific Discovery (1934), Popper had distinguished between scientific practice and scientific standards, principles, or methodology. Arguing against a “naturalistic” theory of method which makes standards depend on practice, Popper opted instead for a strongly normative epistemology, a discipline which lays down optimum rules of method for scientists to follow. This is one of the most important aspects of the Popperian perspective which Feyerabend originally took on board.
Such an epistemology, Feyerabend now complains, makes the false assumption that “rational” standards can lead to a practice that is as mobile, rich and effective as the science we already have. Falsificationism would destroy science as we know it. Science did not develop in accordance with Popper’s model. It is not “irrational”, but it contains no overarching pattern. Popper’s rules could produce a science, but not the science we now have. (Feyerabend remarks that the Logical Positivist Otto Neurath had already put this criticism of Popper some time before (p. 91)).
In 1952, Feyerabend presented his ideas on scientific change to Popper’s LSE seminar and to a gathering of illustrious Wittgensteinians (Elizabeth Anscombe, Peter Geach, H.L.A.Hart and Georg Henrik von Wright) in Anscombe’s Oxford flat. This meeting seems to have been the first airing of the important concept of incommensurability (although not the term itself, which crept into publications only a decade later):
On one occasion which I remember vividly Anscombe, by a series of skilful questions, made me see how our conception (and even our perceptions) of well-defined and apparently self-contained facts may depend on circumstances not apparent in them. There are entities such as physical objects which obey a “conservation principle” in the sense that they retain their identity through a variety of manifestations and even when they are not present at all while other entities such as pains and after-images are “annihilated” with their disappearance. The conservation principles may change from one developmental stage of the human organism to another and they may be different for different languages (cf. Whorf’s “covert classifications”… ). I conjectured that such principles would play an important role in science, that they might change during revolutions and that deductive relations between pre-revolutionary and post-revolutionary theories might be broken off as a result. (SFS, p. 115).
Major discoveries, I said, are not like the discovery of America, where the general nature of the discovered object is already known. Rather, they are like recognizing that one has been dreaming. (KT, p. 92).
These thoughts received an unenthusiastic reception from Hart, von Wright and Popper.
Feyerabend’s articles on Wittgenstein culminated in his review of the Philosophical Investigations, the text of which he studied in detail while he was in London. (“Being of a pedantic turn of mind”, he says, “I rewrote the book so that it looked more like a treatise with a continuous argument”. (SFS, p. 116)). Anscombe translated Feyerabend’s summary into English and sent it to The Philosophical Review. It was accepted by the editor, Norman Malcolm (having been turned down by Gilbert Ryle, editor of Mind—see KT, p. 93). This review was Feyerabend’s first English-language publication; he called it his “Wittgensteinian monster” (p. 115). He later commented:
I knew that Wittgenstein did not want to present a theory (of knowledge, or language), and I did not expressly formulate a theory myself. But my arrangements made the text speak like a theory and falsified Wittgenstein’s intentions. (KT, p. 93).
Wittgenstein’s emphasis on the need for concrete research and his objections to abstract reasoning (“Look, don’t think!”) somewhat clashed with my own inclinations and the papers in which his influence is noticeable are therefore mixtures of concrete examples and sweeping principles. (SFS, p. 115).
In his review of the Philosophical Investigations, he summarised the book in a very effective way, drawing particular attention to Wittgenstein’s critique of a family of “realist” or “essentialist” theories of meaning according to which the meaning of a word is the object designated or referred to by that word. Feyerabend argued that Wittgenstein was attempting a reductio ad absurdum of realist theories, showing that they had the untenable implication that we could not be said to know the meaning of words which we nevertheless constantly use in totally unproblematic ways.
Unfortunately, as argued in Preston 1997 (ch.2), Feyerabend completely failed to follow up this insight by endorsing Wittgenstein’s non-representationalist conception of meaning, according to which the meaning of a term is determined by its use. Instead, wrongly associating the idea that meaning is use with positivism, Feyerabend proferred what he called a “contextual” theory of meaning, which identified the meaning of a term or statement with whatever role it plays in theoretical contexts. But he over-extended the idea of the theoretical to cover any context whatever, thus completely depriving it of content. For Feyerabend, the theoretical contrasts with nothing at all.
The book review was also critical of Wittgenstein, though. Notably, it railed against Wittgenstein’s conception of philosophy (as “philosophical analysis”). In a short article published the next year (1956), Feyerabend expanded on his critique, arguing that consideration of G.E.Moore’s famous “paradox of analysis” showed that “philosophy cannot be analytic and scientific, i.e., interesting, progressive, about a certain subject matter, informative at the same time” (“A Note on the Paradox of Analysis”, p. 95). Feyerabend thenceforth plumped for (what he conceived of as) scientific philosophy. Like Popper, he had very little time for the kind of “analytic” philosophy or “linguistic” philosophy which followed in Wittgenstein’s wake, and with which Oxford University dominated the philosophical scene in the 1950s and early 1960s.
One of the things that comes across most clearly from his autobiography is the consistently malleable nature of Feyerabend’s views. He records that his friend Agassi caused him completely to change his mind about a book he considered translating. When Agassi urged Feyerabend to become a faithful Popperian, Feyerabend’s resistance seems to have been based mainly on his aversion to groups.
3.4 Return to Vienna (1953–1955)
By the summer of 1953, when Popper had to apply for extra funds to allow Feyerabend to work as his assistant, Feyerabend had decided to leave the Popperian church and return to Vienna. Although the assistantship was soon approved, Feyerabend “felt quite uncomfortable. I couldn’t put my finger on it; I only knew that I wanted to remain in Vienna” (p. 99).
During this period Feyerabend, having nothing to do and needing the money, translated Popper’s “war effort”, The Open Society and its Enemies into German, wrote articles on “Methodology” and “Philosophy of Nature” for a French encyclopaedia, produced a report on post-war developments in the Humanities in Austria for the U.S. Library of Congress, and made a mess of his first professional opportunity as a singer (p. 98). But he also felt that he did not know what to do in the long run, so he applied for jobs in various universities.
He then met Arthur Pap, “who had come to Vienna to lecture on analytic philosophy and who hoped, perhaps somewhat unrealistically, that he would be able to revive what was left from the great years of the Vienna Circle and the analytic tradition there” (“Herbert Feigl: A Biographical Sketch”, p. 3). Feyerabend became Pap’s assistant. Pap arranged for him to meet Herbert Feigl in Vienna in 1954, and together they studied Feigl’s papers. Feigl had been a member of the Vienna Circle until his emigration to the USA in 1930, but he had never given up the “realist” view that there is a knowable external world. He convinced Feyerabend that the positivism of Kraft and Pap had not solved the traditional problems of philosophy. His paper “Existential Hypotheses” (1950), together with Kraft’s contributions and certain ideas Popper had put forward at Alpbach in 1948 and 1949, greatly diminished Feyerabend’s doubts about realism (ibid., p. 4). Here is how Feyerabend recounts Feigl’s influence:
It was … quite a shock to hear Feigl expound fundamental difficulties and to hear him explain in perfectly simple language without any recourse to formalism why the problem of application [of the probability-calculus] was still without a solution. Formalization, then, was not the last word in philosophical matters. There was still room for fundamental discussion-for speculation (dreaded word!); there was still a possibility of overthrowing highly formalized systems with the help of a little common sense! (ibid., p. 5).
1954 saw the publication of the first of Feyerabend’s many articles on the philosophy of quantum mechanics, the first fruits of the time he spent studying with Popper. In these publications, he generally took the line that the dominance achieved by the “Copenhagen Interpretation” of the quantum theory was undeserved. Feyerabend was particularly keen to argue that it had not and could not be shown that this interpretation of the theory was a general panacea for the problems of microphysics, or that its defenders could justifiably believe it to be unassailable. He came to defend the right of “hidden-variables” theorists such as Louis de Broglie, David Bohm, and Jean-Pierre Vigier to hypothesise the existence of an unobserved deterministic substructure underpinning the apparently indeterministic cavortings of objects on the quantum-mechanical level.
However, Feyerabend also came to think that Popper’s earlier critique of the Copenhagen orthodoxy had been somewhat limited and superficial. According to Popper, the Copenhagen Interpretation was simply the result of some bad positivistic philosophising. Niels Bohr and Werner Heisenberg, on this view, had been seduced by positivist philosophers (like Ernst Mach and his ostensible followers, the Vienna Circle) into thinking that their theory was not conjectural but was merely a compendious, economical but non-hypothetical description of experience. Feyerabend argued that, on the contrary, the Copenhagen theorists had some perfectly good “physical”, “scientific”, or “factual” arguments for thinking that their view alone was currently compatible with the observed results of experiments. He therefore put forward a defence of their instrumentalist interpretation of the quantum theory. But the defence was only tactical, since he ultimately argued that the observed results of experiments themselves needed to be challenged by a point of view which would reveal their truth or falsity. So Feyerabend used the quantum case to push for a reconsideration of the methodological rules to which scientists subscribe. This is the genesis of his idea of a “pluralistic” test model, in which theories are compared with one another, as well as against “experience”. (Note, however, that this idea can already be found in Popper, and that Feyerabend did initially acknowledge this fact). According to Feyerabend, only by endorsing scientific realism can the scientist cleave to a methodology which would consistently bring out the (conceptually) revolutionary potential of scientific theories, rekindling the kind of fire Galileo had lit under the Aristotelian world-view. Such a realism interprets theories not as summaries of experience, but as genuine conjectures about a mind-independent reality. It also puts the observation-language of science in the same epistemological boat as its theoretical terms: observations, he urged, are just as “theoretical” (that is, hypothetical) as theories: “Logically speaking, all terms are ”theoretical“” (Philosophical Papers, Volume 1, p. 32 note).
4. Feyerabend’s Early Work: Liberalizing Empiricism
4.1 First Academic Appointment: the University of Bristol (1955–1958)
In 1955, with the help of references from Popper and Erwin Schrödinger, as well as his own big mouth (SFS, p. 116, KT, p. 102), Feyerabend secured his first academic post lecturing in philosophy of science at the University of Bristol, England. In his autobiography (pp. 103–4) he describes how Agassi had to help him prepare for these lectures, since they covered a subject Feyerabend had never studied (see also SFS, p. 116). He also describes how for some time he felt directionless and unsettled: he was “killing time”.
In the summer of that year, he again visited Alpbach, where he met the philosopher of science Philipp Frank (another former Logical Positivist), who exerted on him a (somewhat delayed) influence:
Frank argued that the Aristotelian objections against Copernicus agreed with empiricism, while Galileo’s law of inertia did not. As in other cases, this remark lay dormant in my mind for years; then it started festering. The Galileo chapters of Against Method are a late result. (KT, p. 103. See also SFS, p. 112).
Around the same time, Feyerabend met David Bohm, who was lecturing in physics at the University of Bristol. Bohm had been the favoured protegé of Niels Bohr, and his first book, Quantum Theory (Englewood Cliffs, NJ: Prentice-Hall, 1951), was a lengthy defence of the Copenhagen Interpretation of the quantum theory. But in the early 1950s Bohm rejected his former view, and became one of the leading defenders of the then-unpopular “hidden-variables” theory. He was to be a significant influence on Feyerabend, weaning him away from Popper with his somewhat Hegelian account of the structure of reality. Feyerabend produced a critical study of Bohm’s 1957 book Causality and Chance in Modern Physics in 1960, when he was still very much under Popper’s influence. In their later work, though, Bohm and Feyerabend moved in parallel directions, towards an interest in “fringe” science. And Bohm’s ideas sunk in gradually, having visible effects on Feyerabend’s published productions from the mid–1960s onwards (see Van Strien 2020). Feyerabend increasingly flirted with the vaguely Hegelian metaphysic that he had discerned and critiqued in Bohm’s book.
In 1956, Feyerabend got married for the second time, this time to one of his former students, Mary O’Neill. But this relationship seems to have been very short-lived, for he reports that his wife spent Christmas 1957 away from him with her parents, that she subsequently had an affair, and that the last time he saw her was 1958.
Feyerabend remembers his Bristol lecture course on quantum mechanics as being a disaster. However, in the summer of 1956, along with Alfred Landé, he chaired a successful seminar on philosophical issues in quantum mechanics at Alpbach. A related success was his contribution to the 1957 Colston Research Symposium, where he gave a paper “On the Quantum Theory of Measurement”. Here Feyerabend introduced what was to become a long-running theme in his work: that there is no separate and neutral “observation-language” or “everyday language” against which the theoretical statements of science are tested, but that “the everyday level is part of the theoretical rather then something self-contained and independent” (Philosophical Papers, Volume I, p. 217, emphasis added). This was his principal contribution to his central subject, the relation between theory and experience. It constituted not only a decisive break with the positivist conception of theories, but also something of a step beyond Popper’s conception.
4.2 The University of California at Berkeley: Early Years (1958–1964)
In the summer of 1957, Feyerabend accepted an invitation from Michael Scriven to visit the Minnesota Center for the Philosophy of Science in Minneapolis. The Center was, as Feyerabend later said, “one of the foremost institutions in the field” (p. 115). There he met Feigl, Carl Hempel, Ernest Nagel, Hilary Putnam, Adolf Grünbaum, Grover Maxwell, E.L.Hill, Paul Meehl, and others. He returned to the Center in 1958, having accepted another invitation to work there, backed by an NSF grant. He often went back there in subsequent years.
Around this time, many of Feyerabend’s most important early papers were published. In them, under the influence of both Popper and Wittgenstein, Feyerabend initiated a vigourous critique of the then-orthodox philosophies of science provided by descendants of the Vienna Circle, “Logical Empiricist” thinkers such as Rudolph Carnap, Feigl, Nagel, and Hempel. This critique was conducted through a study of the relationship between observation and theory.
In perhaps the most important of these early publications, “An Attempt at a Realistic Interpretation of Experience” (1958), Feyerabend argued against positivism and in favour of a scientific realist account of the relation between theory and experience, largely on grounds familiar from Karl Popper’s falsificationist views. Positivist theories of meaning, he complained, have consequences which are “at variance with scientific method and reasonable philosophy” (Philosophical Papers, Volume 1, p. 17). In particular, they imply what Feyerabend dubbed the “stability thesis”, that even major changes in theory will not affect the meanings of terms in the scientific observation-language. Against this supposition, Feyerabend defended what he called “Thesis I”, the idea that
the interpretation of an observation-language is determined by the theories which we use to explain what we observe, and it changes as soon as those theories change. (ibid., p. 31).
Thesis I reversed the direction of interpretation which the positivists had presupposed. Instead of meaning seeping upwards from the level of experience (or the observation-language), Feyerabend had it trickling down from theory to experience. For him, theory is meaningful independently of experience, rather than vice-versa. The roots of this view clearly lie in his contextual theory of meaning, according to which meaning is conferred on terms by virtue of their participation in theoretical contexts. It seems to imply that there is no principled semantic distinction between theoretical terms and observation terms. And Feyerabend soon followed up this implication with his “Pragmatic Theory of Observation”, according to which what is important about observation-sentences is not their having a special core of empirical meaning, but their causal role in the production and refutation of theories.
In 1958, Feyerabend had been invited to spend one year at the University of California at Berkeley, and accepted. When this visiting appointment ended, the University administration decided to hire him on the basis of his publications and, of course, his big mouth (p. 115). But because of his grant to work at Minneapolis, he only started lecturing full-time at Berkeley in 1960. There he encountered Thomas Kuhn, and read Kuhn’s forthcoming book The Structure of Scientific Revolutions in draft form. He then wrote to Kuhn about the book (these letters have recently been published in Studies in the History and Philosophy of Science, 26, 1995). But he was not quite ready to take on Kuhn’s descriptive-historical approach to the philosophy of science. Although more and more historical examples peppered his published work, he was still using them to support fairly orthodox falsificationist conclusions.
In his meta-methodology, Feyerabend applied to the dispute over the interpretation of scientific theories a strong measure of Popperian methodological conventionalism, arguing that the dispute between realists and instrumentalists is not a factual issue but a matter of choice. We can choose to see theories either as descriptions of reality (scientific realism) or as instruments of prediction (instrumentalism), depending on what ideals of scientific knowledge we aspire to. Adherence to these competing ideals (roughly: high informative content on the one hand, and sense-certainty on the other) is to be judged by their respective consequences. Stressing that philosophical theories have not merely reflected science but have changed it, Feyerabend argued further that the form of our knowledge can be altered to fit our ideals. So we can have certainty, and theories that merely summarise experience, if we wish. But, mobilising the usual equation between empirical content and testability (common to Carnap, Popper and Feyerabend), he urged that we should decisively reject the ideal of certainty and opt instead for theories which go beyond experience and say something informative about reality itself. In this respect, he clearly followed Popper’s lead, reconstruing empiricism as a doctrine about the most desirable form for our theories, rather than as a view about the sources of knowledge.
Feyerabend argued that the idea, common to positivists, that the interpretation of observation terms doesn’t depend upon the status of our theoretical knowledge, has consequences undesirable to positivists. One of these is that “every positivistic observation language is based upon a metaphysical ontology” (Philosophical Papers, Volume 1, p. 21). Another follows from the thesis, which he relishes, that the theories we hold influence our language, and maybe even our perceptions. This implies that as long as we use only one empirically adequate theory, we will be unable to imagine alternative accounts of reality. If we also accept the positivist view that our theories are summaries of experience, those theories will be void of empirical content and untestable, and hence there will be a diminution in the critical, argumentative function of our language. Just as purely transcendent metaphysical theories are unfalsifiable, so too what began as an all-embracing scientific theory offering certainty will, under these circumstances, have become an irrefutable dogma, a myth. It is argued in Preston 1997 (chapter 5) that his antipathy toward this “myth predicament” was one the main driving-forces behind Feyerabend’s views at the time.
Feyerabend defended a realism according to which “the interpretation of a scientific theory depends upon nothing but the state of affairs it describes” (Philosophical Papers, Volume 1, p. 42). At the same time he claimed to find in Wittgenstein’s Philosophical Investigations a contextual theory of meaning according to which the meaning of terms is determined not by their use, nor by their connection with experience, but by the role they play in the wider context of a theory or explanation. Thesis I, the key proposition of Feyerabend’s early work, is supposed to encapsulate both the contextual theory of meaning and scientific realism. Only realism, by insisting on interpreting theories in their most vulnerable form as universally-quantified statements which strive for truth, leads to scientific progress instead of stagnation, he argued. Only realism allows us to live up to the highest intellectual ideals of critical attitude, honesty, and testability.
Unlike positivism, which conflicts with science by taking experiences as unanalysable building-blocks, realism treats experiences as analysable, explaining them as the result of processes not immediately accessible to observation. Experiences and observation-statements are thus revealed as more complex and structured than positivism had realised. Feyerabend over-extended the contextual theory of meaning to apply not only to theoretical terms but to observation terms too, arguing that there is no special “problem” of theoretical entities, and that the distinction between observation terms and theoretical terms is a purely pragmatic one. If, as the contextual theory also implies, observation-statements depend on theoretical principles, any inadequacy in these principles will be transmitted to the observation-statements they subtend, whence our beliefs about what is observed may be in error, and even our experiences themselves can be criticised for giving only an approximate account of what is going on in reality. All our statements, beliefs and experiences are “hypothetical”. Observations and experiments always need interpretation, and different interpretations are supplied by different theories. If existing meanings embody theoretical principles, then instead of passively accepting observation-statements, we should attempt to find and test the theoretical principles implicit in them, which may require us to change those meanings.
Feyerabend therefore idolised semantic instability, arguing that the semantic stability presupposed by positivist accounts of reduction, explanation and confirmation, has been and should be violated if we want progress in science. If meaning is determined by theory, terms in very different theories simply cannot share the same meaning: they will be “incommensurable”. Any attempt to derive the principles of an old theory from those of a new one must either be unsuccessful or must effect a change in the meaning of the old theory’s terms. The “theoretical reduction” beloved of Logical Empiricists is therefore actually more like replacement of one theory and its ontology by another. At the end of his well-known 1962 paper “Explanation, Reduction, and Empiricism”, in which he introduced the concept of incommensurability, Feyerabend concluded that this concept precluded any formal account of explanation, reduction or confirmation. (Kuhn’s book The Structure of Scientific Revolutions, in which the same term was used to characterize a related concept, was published in the same year).
In his first major published excursion from the philosophy of science, Feyerabend applied these ideas to the mind/body problem. In two papers published in 1963, he sought to defend materialism (roughly, the view that everything which exists is physical) against the supposition that the mind cannot be a physical thing. Although these papers exhibit a rather unclear mixture of views, they are now remembered primarily for having ushered in the position known as “eliminative materialism”, according to which our way of conceiving the mind and mental phenomena amounts to a seriously inadequate theory which is in conflict with a (materialistic) scientific account of those same things. Feyerabend suggested that the two theories in question were incommensurable, but that nevertheless we ought to prefer the materialistic one on general methodological grounds. This radical view of the mind/body problem has been one of Feyerabend’s most important legacies. Even though Feyerabend himself seems to have given it up in the late 1970s, it was taken up by Richard Rorty and, more recently, by Paul and Patricia Churchland.
In Feyerabend’s version of the incommensurability thesis, the semantic principles of construction underpinning a theory (in its realist interpretation) can be violated or “suspended” by another theory. As a result, theories cannot always be compared with respect to their content, as “rationalists” would like. It took Feyerabend a while to see it, for he did not officially subscribe to this view until the late 1960s, but this opens the door to relativism, the view that there is no objective way of choosing between theories or traditions. This is perhaps the most notorious and widely-reviled consequence of the contextual theory of meaning.
In the ground-breaking central papers from this period of Feyerabend’s oeuvre such as “How to be a Good Empiricist” (1963), “Realism and Instrumentalism” (1964), “Problems of Empiricism” and “Reply to Criticism” (1965), his most important argument for scientific realism was methodological: realism is desirable because it demands the proliferation of new and incompatible theories. This leads to scientific progress because it results in each theory having more empirical content that it otherwise would, since a theory’s testability is proportional to the number of potential falsifiers it has, and the production of alternative theories is the only reliable way to ensure the existence of potential falsifiers. So scientific progress comes through “theoretical pluralism”, allowing a plurality of incompatible theories, each of which will contribute by competition to maintaining and enhancing the testability, and thus the empirical content, of the others. According to Feyerabend’s pluralistic test model, theories are tested against one another. He thus idealised what Kuhn called “pre-paradigm” periods and “scientific revolutions”, occasions when there are many incompatible theories, all forced to develop through their competition with each other. But he downplayed the idea that theories are still compared with one another primarily for their ability to account for the results of observation and experiment. For Feyerabend, this idea was an empiricist myth which disguised the role of aesthetic and social factors in theory-choice.
Thus far, the argument for theoretical pluralism largely follows that of John Stuart Mill’s On Liberty (1859), to which Feyerabend often paid homage. But Feyerabend went on to try to demonstrate a mechanism whereby theories can augment their empirical content. According to this part of the argument, theories may face difficulties which can only be discovered with the help of alternative theories. A theory can be incorrect without our being able to discover this in a direct way: sometimes the construction of new experimental methods and instruments which would reveal the incorrectness is excluded by laws of nature, sometimes the discrepancy (were it to be discovered) might be regarded as an oddity, and might never be given its correct interpretation. Circumstances can thus conspire to hide from us the infirmities of our theory. The methodological “principle of testability” demands that we develop alternative theories incompatible with the existing theory, and develop them in their strongest form, as descriptions of reality, not mere instruments of prediction. Instead of waiting until the current theory gets into difficulties, and only then starting to look for alternatives, we ought vigorously to proliferate theories and tenaciously defend them in the hope that they may afford us an indirect refutation of our existing theory. Only theories which are empirically adequate will thus contribute to raising the empirical content of their fellows. But Feyerabend insists that any theory, no matter how weak, may become empirically adequate, and so may contribute to this process. To be a realist, he therefore suggests, involves demanding support for any theory, including implausible conjectures having no independent empirical support, conjectures which are inconsistent with data and well-confirmed laws. We should retain theories that are in trouble, and invent and develop theories that contradict the observed phenomena, just because in doing so we will be respecting the intellectual ideal of testability.
In thus appealing to the “principle of testability” as the supreme methodological maxim, Feyerabend forgets that testability must be traded-off against other theoretical virtues. Only his pathological fear of theories losing their empirical content and becoming myths leads him to want to maximise testability and embrace an absolutely unrestricted principle of proliferation. He also disregards historical evidence that anti-realist approaches can be just as pluralistic as realism.
At Alpbach in 1964, Feyerabend and Feigl jointly directed a seminar on the recent development of analytic philosophy. There Feyerabend re-encountered the leading light of the Logical Positivist movement, Rudolph Carnap (whom he had already met at UCLA). Carnap tried to convince Feyerabend of the virtues of clarity, but failed. Feyerabend was still attached to “scientific” philosophy, and considered philosophy worthless unless it made a positive and quantifiable contribution to the growth of knowledge (which, of course, meant science).
But a seminar in Hamburg in 1965, at which Feyerabend discussed the foundations of quantum theory with the physicist C.F. von Weizsäcker, did have a lasting, if somewhat delayed, impact:
Von Weizsäcker showed how quantum mechanics arose from concrete research while I complained, on general methodological grounds, that important alternatives had been omitted. The arguments supporting my complaint were quite good… but it was suddenly clear to me that imposed without regard to circumstances they were a hindrance rather than a help: a person trying to solve a problem whether in science or elsewhere must be given complete freedom and cannot be restricted by any demands, norms, however plausible they may seem to the logician or the philosopher who has thought them out in the privacy of his study. Norms and demands must be checked by research, not by appeal to theories of rationality. In a lengthy article I explained how Bohr had used this philosophy and how it differs from more abstract procedures. Thus Professor von Weizsäcker has prime responsibility for my change to “anarchism”—though he was not at all pleased when I told him so in 1977. (SFS, p. 117).
4.3 The Impact of the “Student Revolution”
The mid-to-late 1960s was a time of ferment in Western culture, and Feyerabend was in the thick of it. In Berkeley, naturally, he ran into the Free Speech Movement, and he encountered the “student revolution” there too, as well as in London and Berlin. This obviously fired his interest in political philosophy, more especially in political questions about science. Of his post at Berkeley, he later said:
My function was to carry out the educational policies of the State of California which means I had to teach people what a small group of white intellectuals had decided was knowledge. (SFS, p. 118).
However, Feyerabend’s experience under these educational policies was undoubtedly one of the defining periods of his intellectual life, a time in which he became deeply suspicious of these intellectuals and “Western rationalism” as a whole:
In the years 1964ff. Mexicans, Blacks, Indians entered the university as a result of new educational policies. There they sat, partly curious, partly disdainful, partly simply confused hoping to get an “education”. What an opportunity for a prophet in search of a following! What an opportunity, my rationalist friends told me, to contribute to the spreading of reason and the improvement of mankind! I felt very differently. For it dawned on me that the intricate arguments and the wonderful stories I had so far told to my more or less sophisticated audience might just be dreams, reflections of the conceit of a small group who had succeeded in enslaving everyone else with their ideas. Who was I to tell these people what and how to think? (ibid. See also KT, p. 123).
At this time, Feyerabend gave two lectures, one on general philosophy, and one on philosophy of science. He seems to have got into some trouble at Berkeley by running his seminar on unacceptably loose lines, regularly cancelling lectures, and failing to prepare for the lectures he did give:
I often told the students to go home—the official notes would contain everything they needed. As a result an audience of 300, 500, even 1,200 shrank to 50 or 30. I wasn’t happy about that; I would have preferred a larger audience, and yet I repeated my advice until the administration intervened. Why did I do it? Was it because I disliked the examination system, which blurred the line between thought and routine? Was it because I despised the idea that knowledge was a skill that had to be acquired and stabilized by rigorous training? Or was it because I didn’t think much of my own performance? All these factors may have played a role. (p. 122).
But although he sympathised with the original aims of the student movement, Feyerabend was unimpressed by their leaders, feeling that their ideas were as authoritarian as those they were trying to replace. He reports having cut fewer lectures during the student strike than either before or afterwards! Nevertheless, by holding his lectures off-campus during this campus war, Feyerabend antagonised the administration that had hired him. Tales of him giving “A” grades to every student in his class, regardless of their production (or lack of it), abound. He had the impression that some of his colleagues, especially John Searle, wanted to have him fired, and that they only gave up when they realised how much paperwork would be involved (p. 126).
4.4 The Late Sixties
During the summer of 1966, Feyerabend lectured on church dogma at Berkeley. (“Why church dogma? Because the development of church dogma shares many features with the development of scientific thought” (pp. 137–8)). He eventually turned these thoughts into a paper on “Classical Empiricism”, published in 1970, in which he argued that empiricism shared certain problematic features with protestantism. He had already come some way from his 1965 defence of a “disinfected”, “tolerant” form of Empiricism. The publication, in 1969, of the four-page article, “Science Without Experience”, which argued that in principle experience is necessary at no point in the construction, comprehension or testing of empirical scientific theories finally gave notice that Feyerabend was no longer concerned to present himself as any kind of empiricist.
Despite taking his academic duties and responsibilities decreasingly seriously, and coming into conflict with his own university’s administration as a result, Feyerabend had not yet fouled his substantial reputation as a serious philosopher of science. He reports that he received job offers from London, Berlin, Yale, and Auckland, that he was invited to become a fellow of All Souls College, Oxford, and that he corresponded with Friedrich von Hayek (whom he already knew from the Alpbach seminars) about a job in Freiburg (p. 127). He accepted the posts in London, Berlin, and Yale. In 1968, he resigned from UC Berkeley and left for Minneapolis, but grew homesick, got re-appointed, and returned to Berkeley almost immediately.
In London, lecturing to University College and the LSE, he met Imre Lakatos. The two became great friends, corresponding with one another regularly and voluminously until Lakatos’ death. Feyerabend recalls that Lakatos, whose office was across the corridor from the LSE lecture hall, used to intervene in his lectures when Feyerabend made a point he disagreed with (SFS, p. 13, KT, p. 128).
5. Feyerabend’s Later Work: Towards Relativism, but then Beyond It
5.1 Against Method (1970–75)
After stints in London, Berlin, and Yale (all of them running alongside his post at UC Berkeley), Feyerabend took up a visiting professorship at the University of Auckland, New Zealand, and lectured there in 1972 and 1974 (pp. 134–5). He even considered settling down in New Zealand around that time (p. 153), although this hardly seems compatible with his jet-setting lifestyle.
By the early 1970s Feyerabend had flown the falsificationist coop and was ready to expound his own perspective on scientific method. In 1970, he published a long article entitled “Against Method” in which he attacked several prominent accounts of scientific methodology. In their correspondence, he and Lakatos subsequently planned the construction of a debate volume, to be entitled For and Against Method, in which Lakatos would put forward the “rationalist” case that there was an identifiable set of rules of scientific method which make all good science science, and Feyerabend would attack it. Lakatos’ unexpected death in February 1974, which seems to have shocked Feyerabend deeply, meant that the rationalist part of the joint work was never completed.
Later that year, Feyerabend found himself lecturing at the University of Sussex:
I have no idea why and how I went to the University of Sussex at Brighton… what I do remember is that I taught two terms (1974/1975) and then resigned; twelve hours a week (one lecture course, the rest tutorials) was too much. (p. 153).
A member of Feyerabend’s audience recalls things in rather more detail:
Sussex University: the start of the Autumn Term, 1974. There was not a seat to be had in the biggest Arts lecture theatre on campus. Taut with anticipation, we waited expectantly and impatiently for the advertized event to begin. He was not on time—as usual. In fact rumour had it that he would not be appearing at all that illness (or was it just ennui? or perhaps a mistress?) had confined him to bed. But just as we began sadly to reconcile ourselves to the idea that there would be no performance that day at all, Paul Feyerabend burst through the door at the front of the packed hall. Rather pale, and supporting himself on a short metal crutch, he walked with a limp across to the blackboard. Removing his sweater he picked up the chalk and wrote down three questions one beneath the other: What’s so great about knowledge? What’s so great about science? What’s so great about truth? We were not going to be disappointed after all!
During the following weeks of that term, and for the rest of his year as a visiting lecturer, Feyerabend demolished virtually every traditional academic boundary. He held no idea and no person sacred. With unprecedented energy and enthusiasm he discussed anything from Aristotle to the Azande. How does science differ from witchcraft? Does it provide the only rational way of cognitively organizing our experience? What should we do if the pursuit of truth cripples our intellects and stunts our individuality? Suddenly epistemology became an exhilarating area of investigation.
Feyerabend created spaces in which people could breathe again. He demanded of philosophers that they be receptive to ideas from the most disparate and apparently far-flung domains, and insisted that only in this way could they understand the processes whereby knowledge grows. His listeners were enthralled, and he held his huge audiences until, too ill and too exhausted to continue, he simply began repeating himself. But not before he had brought the house down by writing “Aristotle” in three-foot high letters on the blackboard and then writing “Popper” in tiny, virtually illegible letters beneath it! (Krige 1980, pp. 106–7).
Because his health was poor, Feyerabend started seeing a healer who had been recommended to him. The treatment was successful, and thenceforth Feyerabend used to refer to his own case as an example of both the failures of orthodox medicine and the largely unexplored possibilities of “alternative” or traditional remedies.
Instead of the volume written jointly with Lakatos, Feyerabend put together his tour de force, the book version of Against Method (London: New Left Books, 1975), which he sometimes conceived of as a letter to Lakatos (to whom the book is dedicated). A more accurate description, however, is the one given in his autobiography:
AM is not a book, it is a collage. It contains descriptions, analyses, arguments that I had published, in almost the same words, ten, fifteen, even twenty years earlier… I arranged them in a suitable order, added transitions, replaced moderate passages with more outrageous ones, and called the result “anarchism”. I loved to shock people… (pp. 139, 142).
The book contained many of the themes mentioned so far in this essay, sprinkled into a case study of the transition from geocentric to heliocentric astronomy. But whereas he had previously been arguing in favour of methodology (a “pluralistic” methodology, that is), he had now become dissatisfied with any methodology. He emphasised that older scientific theories, like Aristotle’s theory of motion, had powerful empirical and argumentative support, and stressed, correlatively, that the heroes of the scientific revolution, such as Galileo, were not as scrupulous as they were sometimes represented to be. He portrayed Galileo as making full use of rhetoric, propaganda, and various epistemological tricks in order to support the heliocentric position. The Galileo case is crucial for Feyerabend, since the “scientific revolution” is his paradigm of scientific progress and of radical conceptual change, and Galileo is his hero of the scientific revolution. He also sought further to downgrade the importance of empirical arguments by suggesting that aesthetic criteria, personal whims and social factors have a far more decisive role in the history of science than rationalist or empiricist historiography would indicate.
Against Method explicitly drew the “epistemological anarchist” conclusion that there are no useful and exceptionless methodological rules governing the progress of science or the growth of knowledge. The history of science is so complex that if we insist on a general methodology which will not inhibit progress the only “rule” it will contain will be the useless suggestion: “anything goes”. In particular, logical empiricist methodologies and Popper’s Critical Rationalism would inhibit scientific progress by enforcing restrictive conditions on new theories. The more sophisticated “methodology of scientific research programmes” developed by Lakatos either contains ungrounded value-judgements about what constitutes good science, or is reasonable only because it is epistemological anarchism in disguise. The phenomenon of incommensurability renders the standards which these “rationalists” use for comparing theories inapplicable. The book thus (understandably) had Feyerabend branded an “irrationalist”. At a time when Kuhn was downplaying the “irrationalist” implications of his own book, Feyerabend was perceived to be casting himself in the role others already saw as his for the taking. (He did not, however, commit himself to political anarchism. His political philosophy was a mixture of liberalism and social democracy).
He later said:
One of my motives for writing Against Method was to free people from the tyranny of philosophical obfuscators and abstract concepts such as “truth”, “reality”, or “objectivity”, which narrow people’s vision and ways of being in the world. Formulating what I thought were my own attitude and convictions, I unfortunately ended up by introducing concepts of similar rigidity, such as “democracy”, “tradition”, or “relative truth”. Now that I am aware of it, I wonder how it happened. The urge to explain one’s own ideas, not simply, not in a story, but by means of a “systematic account”, is powerful indeed. (pp. 179–80).
5.2 The Political Consequences of Epistemological Anarchism: Science in a Free Society (1978)
The critical reaction to Against Method seems to have taken Feyerabend by surprise. He was shocked to be accused of being aggressive and nasty, so he replied by accusing his accusers of the very same thing. He felt it necessary to respond to most of the book’s major reviews in print, and later assembled these replies into a section of his next book, Science in a Free Society, entitled “Conversations with Illiterates”. Here he berated the unfortunate reviewers for having misread Against Method, as well as for being constitutionally incapable of distinguishing between irony, playfulness, argument by reductio ad absurdum, and the (apparently rather few) things he had really committed himself to in AM. The spectacle of Feyerabend levelling these accusations at others is not itself without irony. (His widow reports that in his later years, SFS was the book he would most like to have distanced himself from). In the commotion surrounding AM, Feyerabend succumbed to depression:
… now I was alone, sick with some unknown affliction; my private life was in a mess, and I was without a defense. I often wished I had never written that fucking book. (KT, p. 147).
Feyerabend saw himself as having undermined the arguments for science’s privileged position within culture, and much of his later work was a critique of the position of science within Western societies. Because there is no scientific method, we can’t justify science as the best way of acquiring knowledge. And the results of science don’t prove its excellence, since these results have often depended on the presence of non-scientific elements, science prevails only because “the show has been rigged in its favour” (SFS, p. 102), and other traditions, despite their achievements, have never been given a chance. The truth, he suggests, is that
science is much closer to myth than a scientific philosophy is prepared to admit. It is one of the many forms of thought that have been developed by man, and not necessarily the best. It is conspicuous, noisy, and impudent, but it is inherently superior only for those who have already decided in favour of a certain ideology, or who have accepted it without ever having examined its advantages and its limits (AM, p. 295).
The separation of church and state should therefore be supplemented by the separation of science and state, in order for us to achieve the humanity we are capable of. Setting up the ideal of a free society as “a society in which all traditions have equal rights and equal access to the centres of power” (SFS, p. 9), Feyerabend argues that science is a threat to democracy. To defend society against science we should place science under democratic control and be intensely sceptical about scientific “experts”, consulting them only if they are controlled democratically by juries of laypeople.
5.3 Ten Wonderful Years: The Eighties in Berkeley and Zurich
Out of all Feyerabend’s many academic positions, perhaps the one he enjoyed most was his tenure throughout the 1980s at the Eidgenössische Technische Hochschule, Zurich. Feyerabend applied for the post after his friend Eric Jantsch had told him that the Polytechnic was looking for a philosopher of science. The selection process was, by Feyerabend’s account, very long and somewhat involved (pp. 154ff.). Having recently left another post in Kassel, he apparently gave up hopes of being hired by the Swiss, and “decided to remain in Berkeley and stop moving about” (p. 158). But, after several stages in the decision-making procedure, he was finally given the job, and “ten wonderful years of half-Berkeley, half-Switzerland” (p. 158) turned out to be exactly what he had been looking for. At Zurich he lectured on Plato’s Theaetetus and Timaeus, and then on Aristotle’s Physics. The two-hour seminars, many of which were organised by Christian Thomas (with whom Feyerabend was to edit anthologies) were run on the same lines as Berkeley: no set topic, but presentations by the participants (p. 160). Feyerabend later considered this to be the period in which he “got his intellectual act together” (p. 162), meaning that he recovered from the critical reactions to Against Method and was finally freed from the necessity of defending it against all criticism. However, this didn’t seem to have affected his attitude towards work: in Zurich he refused offers of an office, because no office meant no office hours, and therefore no waste of time (pp. 131, 158)!
Many of the more important papers Feyerabend published during the mid-1980s were collected together in Farewell to Reason (London: Verso, 1987). The major message of this book is that relativism is the solution to the problems of conflicting beliefs and of conflicting ways of life. Feyerabend starts by suggesting that the contemporary intellectual scene in Western culture is by no means as fragmented and cacophonous as many intellectuals would have us believe. The surface diversity belies a deeper uniformity, a monotony generated and sustained by the cultural and ideological imperialism which the West uses to beat its opponents into submission. Such uniformity, however, can be shown to be harmful even when judged by the standards of those who impose it. Cultural diversity, which already exists in some societies, is a good thing not least because it affords the best defence against totalitarian domination.
Feyerabend proposes to support the idea of cultural diversity both positively, by producing considerations in its favour, and negatively “by criticising philosophies that oppose it” (FTR, p. 5). Contemporary philosophies of the latter type are said to rest on the notions of Objectivity and Reason. He seeks to undermine the former notion by pointing out that confrontations between cultures with strongly held opinions which are each believed by members of the cultures in question to be objectively true can turn out in different ways. The result of such confrontation may be the persistence of the old views, fruitful and mutual interaction, relativism, or argumentative evaluation. “Relativism” here means the decision to treat the other people’s form of life and the beliefs it embodies as “true-for-them”, while treating our own views as “true-for-us”. Feyerabend feels that this is an appropriate way to resolve such confrontation.
Admittedly, these outcomes are indeed possible. But this does not establish any form of relativism. Indeed, we might as well turn the argument around, and say that the possibility of the dispute being resolved by one participant freely coming around to the other’s point of view shows the untenability of relativism.
Feyerabend complains that the ideas of reason and rationality are “ambiguous and never clearly explained” (FTR, p. 10); they are deified hangovers from autocratic times which no longer have any content but whose “halo of excellence” (ibid.) clings to them and lends them spurious respectability:
[R]ationalism has no identifiable content and reason no recognisable agenda over and above the principles of the party that happens to have appropriated its name. All it does now is to lend class to the general drive towards monotony. It is time to disengage Reason from this drive and, as it has been thoroughly compromised by the association, to bid it farewell. (FTR, p. 13).
Relativism is the tool with which Feyerabend hopes to “undermine the very basis of Reason” (ibid.). But is it Reason with a capital “R”, the philosophers’ abstraction alone, that is to be renounced, or reason itself too? Feyerabend is on weak ground when he claims that “Reason” is a philosophers’ notion which has no content, for it is precisely the philosopher who is willing to attach a specific content to the formal notion of rationality (unlike the layperson, whose notion of reason is closer to what Feyerabend calls the “material” conception, where to be rational is “to avoid certain views and to accept others” (ibid., p. 10)).
Relativism is a result of cultural confrontation, an “attempt to make sense of the phenomenon of cultural variety” (FTR, p. 19). Feyerabend is well aware that the term “relativism” itself is understood in many different ways. But his attempt to occupy a substantial yet defensible relativist position is a failure. At some points he merely endorses views which no-one would deny, but which do not deserve to be called relativist (such as the idea that people may profit from studying other points of view, no matter how strongly they hold their own view (FTR, p. 20)). At others he does manage to subscribe to a genuinely relativist view, but fails to show why it must be accepted.
It was only in 1988, on the 50th anniversary of Austria’s unification with Germany, that Feyerabend became interested in his past (p. 1). The Feyerabends left California for life in Switzerland and Italy in the fall of 1989 (p. 2). It was during this move that Feyerabend re-discovered his mother’s suicide note (p. 9), which may have been one of the factors that spurred him to write his autobiography. Feyerabend looked forward to his retirement, and he and Grazia decided to try to have children. He claimed to have forgotten the thirty-five years of his academic career almost as quickly as he had earlier forgotten his military service (p. 168).
5.4 Feyerabend in the Nineties
In the early 1990s, Feyerabend worked up a course of lectures he had previously given in Berkeley into a series of five lectures entitled ‘What is knowledge? What is science?’. These were originally delivered to a general audience, but later edited and published by Eric Oberheim as a book entitled The Tyranny of Science [Feyerabend 2011].
The main themes of the book are as follows. Scientists and philosophers sometimes present science as a unified worldview, a monolith (or a monster, depending on one’s preferences). It is not. Science is both incomplete and quite strongly disunified. It does not speak with a single voice, therefore appeals to the abstraction ‘Science’ are out of place. The ideology known as objectivism, or scientific materialism, which takes science to be our ultimate measure of what exists, is therefore ungrounded. Its defenders, who portray themselves as the defenders of Reason, are often the kind of intellectual imperialists whose attitudes and advice in the past led, or would have led, to the destruction of first-nation communities.
Other equally popular philosophical claims about science are also flawed. The idea that science is successful needs interrogation. Science does have some successes, but these can be detached from the ideology that seems to support them. The idea that science starts from facts, and eschews theories until the facts are gathered, is a myth. The same can be said of the idea that science is value-free, and also of the idea that scientific results are relevant to urgent social problems.
One aspect of the disunity of science is that ‘scientists’ should not mean merely theoreticians: science also (and essentially) features experimentalists. In their work the importance of hands-on experience, and of what Michael Polanyi called ‘tacit knowledge’, is most obvious. But in fact these sorts of experience and knowledge play an important role throughout the sciences, even in their most obviously theoretical parts. The Platonic-rationalist picture of science as pure thinking about the nature of reality is a distortion.
Perhaps the book’s central complaint is that a particular abstract, theoretical, ‘objectivist’ kind of science, together with an associated kind of thinking about science, now dominate our thinking, excluding more human modes of thought. Scientism, the belief that science has the answer to all meaningful questions, is also a target. Feyerabend’s typical strategy is to take some hallowed idea (e.g., that the success of science is due to observation and experiment), and ask: how did it arise? Tracing its ancestry back to ancient Greek thinkers (usually Plato, Parmenides, or Xenophanes), he assesses their arguments for it, and finds them eminently resistible. His complaint is not that their arguments are invalid, though—that would be already to take on a quasi-scientific mode of assessment. Instead, Feyerabend makes it clear that he prefers ‘stories’ (or even ‘fairytales’) to arguments, and that rival stories are to be assessed in terms of how interesting, appealing, or revealing they are. The sorts of stories the ancient Greek tragedians told, being more obviously human, fare better on such measures than those of the ancient Greek philosophers, so we should not assume that philosophers are our best guides in such matters.
Feyerabend also published a surprisingly large number of papers in the 1990s (although many of them were short ones with overlapping content). Several appeared in a new journal, Common Knowledge, in whose inauguration he had a hand, and which set out to integrate insights from all parts of the intellectual landscape.
Although these papers were on scattered subjects, there are some strong themes running through them, several of which bear comparison with what gets called “post-modernism” (see Preston 1998). Here I shall sketch only the main ones.
One of the projects which Feyerabend worked on for a long time, but never really brought to completion, went under the name “The Rise of Western Rationalism”. Under this umbrella he hoped to show that Reason (with a capital “R”) and Science had displaced the binding principles of previous world-views not as the result of having won an argument, but as the result of power-play. While the first philosophers (the pre-Socratic thinkers) had interesting views, their attempt to replace, streamline or rationalise the folk-wisdom which surrounded them was eminently resistible. Their introduction of the appearance/reality dichotomy made nonsense of many of the things people had previously known. Even nowadays, indigenous cultures and counter-cultural practices provide alternatives to Reason and that nasty Western science.
However, Feyerabend sometimes also recognised that this is to present science as too much of a monolith. In most of his work after Against Method, he emphasises what has come to be known as the “disunity of science”. Science, he insists, is a collage, not a system or a unified project. Not only does it include plenty of components derived from distinctly “non-scientific” disciplines, but these components are often vital parts of the “progress” science has made (using whatever criterion of progress you prefer). Science is a collection of theories, practices, research traditions and world-views whose range of application is not well-determined and whose merits vary to a great extent. All this can be summed up in his slogan: “Science is not one thing, it is many.”
Likewise, the supposed ontological correlate of science, “the world”, consists not only of one kind of thing but of countless kinds of things, things which cannot be “reduced” to one another. In fact, there is no good reason to suppose that the world has a single, determinate nature. Rather we inquirers construct the world in the course of our inquiries, and the plurality of our inquiries ensures that the world itself has a deeply plural quality: the Homeric gods and the microphysicist’s subatomic particles are simply different ways in which “Being” responds to (different kinds of) inquiry. How the world is “in-itself” is for ever unknowable. In this respect, Feyerabend’s last work can be thought of as aligned with “social constructivism”.
6. Conclusion: Last Things
Feyerabend’s autobiography occupied him right up until his death on February 11th, 1994, at the Genolier Clinic, overlooking Lake Geneva. At the end of the book, he expressed the wish that what should remain of him would be “not papers, not final declarations, but love” (p. 181).
His autobiography was published in 1995, a third volume of his Philosophical Papers appeared in 1999, and his last book The Conquest of Abundance, edited by Bert Terpstra, appeared in the same year. A volume of his papers on the philosophy of quantum mechanics is currently being prepared, under the editorship of Stefano Gattei and Joseph Agassi.
Although the focus of philosophy of science has moved away from interest in scientific methodology in recent years, this is not due in any great measure to acceptance of Feyerabend’s anti-methodological argument. His critique of science (which gave him the reputation for being an “anti-science philosopher”, “the worst enemy of science”, etc.) is patchy. Some of its flaws stem directly from his scientific realism. It sets up a straight confrontation between science and other belief-systems as if they are all aiming to do the same thing (give us “knowledge of the world”) and must be compared for how well they deliver the goods. A better approach would be, in Gilbert Ryle’s words, “to draw uncompromising contrasts” between the businesses of science and those of other belief-systems. Such an approach fits far better with the theme Feyerabend approached later in his life: that of the disunity of science.
Feyerabend came to be seen as a leading cultural relativist, not just because he stressed that some theories are incommensurable, but also because he defended relativism in politics as well as in epistemology. His denunciations of aggressive Western imperialism, his critique of science itself, his conclusion that “objectively” there may be nothing to choose between the claims of science and those of astrology, voodoo, and alternative medicine, as well as his concern for environmental issues ensured that he was a hero of the anti-technological counter-culture.
Different components and phases of Feyerabend’s work have influenced very different groups of thinkers. His early scientific realism, contextual theory of meaning, and the way he proposed to defend materialism were taken up by Paul and Patricia Churchland. Richard Rorty, for a time, also endorsed eliminative materialism. Feyerabend’s critique of reductionism has influenced philosophers of science such as Cliff Hooker, Bas van Fraassen, and John Dupré, and his general point of view influenced books such as Alan Chalmers’ well-known introduction to philosophy of science What Is This Thing Called Science? (1978).
Feyerabend has also had considerable influence within the social studies. He directly inspired books like D.L. Phillips’ Abandoning Method (1973), in which the attempt was made to transcend methodology. Less directly, he has exerted enormous influence on a generation of sociologists of science through his relativism, social constructivism, and apparent irrationalism. It is still far too early to say whether, and in what way, his philosophy will be remembered.
Feyerabend’s Major Writings
- “Problems of Empiricism”, Beyond the Edge of Certainty: Essays in Contemporary Science and Philosophy, R.G. Colodny (ed.), New Jersey: Prentice-Hall, 1965, pp. 145–260.
- Against Method, London: Verso, 1975.
- Science in a Free Society, London: New Left Books, 1978.
- Der wissenschaftstheoretische Realismus und die Autorität der Wissenschaften, Braunschweig: Vieweg, 1978.
- Erkenntnis für freie Menschen, Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp Verlag, 1980.
- Realism, Rationalism, and Scientific Method (Philosophical Papers, Volume 1), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1981.
- Problems of Empiricism (Philosophical Papers, Volume 2), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1981.
- Wissenschaft als Kunst, Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp Verlag, 1984.
- Farewell to Reason, London: Verso/New Left Books, 1987.
- Against Method, London: 1975; Revised edition, London: Verso, 1988.
- Three Dialogues on Knowledge, Oxford: Basil Blackwell, 1991.
- Killing Time: The Autobiography of Paul Feyerabend, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1995.
- Conquest of Abundance: A Tale of Abstraction Versus the Richness of Being, B. Terpstra (ed.), Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1999.
- Knowledge, Science and Relativism (Philosophical Papers, Volume 3), J. Preston (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999.
- Naturphilosophie, eds. H. Heit & E. Oberheim, Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp Verlag, 2009.
- The Tyranny of Science, E. Oberheim (ed.), Cambridge: Polity Press, 2011.
- Physics and Philosophy (Philosophical Papers, Volume 4), S. Gattei & J. Agassi (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2016.
- Philosophy of Nature, New Jersey: Wiley-Blackwell, 2016.
- Paul Feyerabend: Wissenschaftstheoretische Plaudiereien (Originaltonaufnahmen 1971-1992), Klaus Sander (ed.), Köln: Supposé, 2000.
- Paul Feyerabend: Stories from Paulino’s Tapes (Private Recordings 1984-1993), Grazia Borrini-Feyerabend & Klaus Sander (eds.), Köln: Supposé, 2001.
- Achinstein, P., 1964, “On the Meaning of Scientific Terms”, Journal of Philosophy, 61: 497–509.
- –––, 1968, Concepts of Science, Baltimore: Johns Hopkins University Press.
- Agassi, J., 1976, Review of Against Method, Philosophia, 6: 165–177.
- –––, 2002, “A Touch of Malice” (Review of Feyerabend & Lakatos 1999),Philosophy of the Social Sciences, 32: 107–119.
- Alford, C.F., 1985, “Yates on Feyerabend’s Democratic Relativism”, Inquiry, 28: 113–118.
- Andersson, G., 1994, Criticism and the History of Science: Kuhn’s, Lakatos’s and Feyerabend’s Criticisms of Critical Rationalism, Leiden: Brill.
- Athanasopoulos, C., 1994, “Pyrrhonism and Paul Feyerabend: A Study of Ancient and Modern Scepticism”, in Hellenistic Philosophy (Volume 2), K. Boudouris (ed.), Athens: International Center for Greek Philosophy and Culture, pp. 11–29.
- Baertschi, B., 1986, “Le Réalisme Scientifique de Feyerabend”, Dialogue, 25: 267–289.
- Bearn, G.C.F., 1986, “Nietzsche, Feyerabend, and the Voices of Relativism”, Metaphilosophy, 17: 135–152.
- Ben-Israel, I., 1986, “Philosophy and Methodology of Military Intelligence: Correspondence with Paul Feyerabend”, Philosophia, 28: 71–101.
- Bernstein, R.J., 1983, Beyond Objectivism and Relativism, Oxford: Basil Blackwell.
- Bhaskar, R., 1975, “Feyerabend and Bachelard: Two Philosophies of Science”, New Left Review, 94: 31–55.
- Brown, H.I., 1976, “Reduction and Scientific Revolutions”, Erkenntnis, 10: 81–385.
- –––, 1983, “Incommensurability”, Inquiry, 26: 3–29.
- Brown, M.J., 2009, “Models and Perspectives on Stage: Remarks on Giere’s Scientific Perspectivism”, Studies in History and Philosophy of Science, Part A, 40: 213–220.
- –––, 2016, “The Abundant World: Paul Feyerabend’s Metaphysics of Science”, Studies in History and Philosophy of Science (Part A), 57: 142–154.
- Brown, M.J. & Kidd, I.J., 2016, “Introduction: Reappraising Paul Feyerabend”, Studies in History and Philosophy of Science (Part A), 57: 1–8.
- Bschir, K., 2015, “Feyerabend and Popper on Proliferation and Anomaly Import: On the Compatibility of Theoretical Pluralism and Critical Rationalism”, HOPOS – The Journal of the International Society for the History of Philosophy of Science, 5: 24–55.
- Burian, R.M., 1984, “Scientific Realism and Incommensurability: Some Criticisms of Kuhn and Feyerabend”, in Methodology, Metaphysics and the History of Science, R.S.Cohen and M.W.Wartofsky (eds.), Dordrecht: D.Reidel, pp. 1–31.
- Butts, R.E., 1966, “Feyerabend and the Pragmatic Theory of Observation”, Philosophy of Science, 33: 383–93.
- Casamonti, M., 2002, “Mach e Feyerabend”, Rivista di Estetica, 42: 86–117.
- Chalmers, A., 1986, “The Galileo that Feyerabend Missed: An Improved Case Against Method”, in J.A.Schuster & R.R.Yeo (eds.), The Politics and Rhetoric of Scientific Method, Dordrecht: D. Reidel, pp. 1–31.
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