Notes to Atonement

1. “Since all have sinned and fall short of the glory of God; they are now justified by his grace as a gift, through the redemption that is in Christ Jesus, whom God put forward as a sacrifice of atonement by his blood” (Romans 3: 23-25, NRSV), and “but if anyone does sin, we have an advocate with the Father, Jesus Christ the righteous; and he is the atoning sacrifice for our sins, and not for ours only but also for the sins of the whole world” (1John 2:2, NRSV).

2. Chisholm (1963) characterizes offenses as “permissible ill-doing”: acts or omissions that are morally bad, but permissible. Treating a loved one in a less-than-loving way—for instance, by half-listening while they tell you a complicated story about tedious drama at their workplace—seems to count as an offense in this sense. And we do seem to atone for these offenses when they cause rifts, as anyone can attest whose partner has stopped halfway through their story and said “are you even listening to me?” Other examples come in some cases where circumstances dictate you cannot fulfill two duties. Suppose you miss a coffee date with someone because of an urgent family emergency. You were justified in attending to the emergency, and so it was not wrong, nor were you blameworthy for, missing the coffee date. And yet it feels like there is something to atone for: you promised your friend you’d be at the date and it’s bad to break a promise and disappoint your friend. You might atone by offering something like an apology (with an exculpatory excuse and explanation of what happened) and reparation by rescheduling the date and offering to cover their coffee purchase. (Thanks to an anonymous referee for a comment that led to this discussion of offenses.)

3. There is a rift in the relationship due to the wrong. The rift can be healed by undoing the wrong: doing something to, as best you can, make the world as if the wrong had never happened (without removing the good things that may have resulted from the wrong). When one wrongs someone, one does something one shouldn’t have done. Arguably, it follows that one’s obligation in response to having done the wrong thing is to make the world, as far as you can, as if the wrong hadn’t happened (with the above proviso). You should undo what you shouldn’t have done. Thus, one makes proper amends if and only if one atones.

4. We may have prima facie moral obligations to aim to reconcile certain sorts of relationships. Arguably, a marriage vow entails a commitment to aim to reconcile the marriage when one wrongs one’s partner. Thus, if one wrongs one’s partner one has an obligation to at least try hard to reconcile one’s marriage with one’s partner. But vows aren’t necessary for grounding these sorts of obligations. Arguably, good friends also have an obligation to at least try hard to reconcile their friendship if one wrongs the other. If I wrong my close friend—say, by lying to him about a matter of mutual significance—and if I atone by sincerely apologizing and firmly intending not to lie to my friend again and I aim to fulfill that intention by ending our friendship, I am doing something indecent. I am not treating our relationship with the seriousness and value that close friends should. These obligations are prima facie as they may be overridden by other considerations: I may have done my best but my spouse or friend has not and foreseeably will not restore trust in me to the degree needed to maintain the marriage or friendship, perhaps there are too many offenses to adequately atone for in a way that will reconcile the relationship in a human lifetime, and one party may acquire other reasons not to restore the relationship.

5. Here’s a more careful defense of this argument: According to the definition in section 1.2, to atone for R is to succeed in reducing or removing the rift between two parties due to R. One could reduce the rift, while some rift remains (perhaps because the wronged will not forgive the wrongdoer). However, if one fully atones—that is, fully reduces the rift—then reconciliation has been achieved, and thus the wrongdoer has been forgiven. (It goes without saying that one can offer atonement or make amends for R without being forgiven; it is unclear whether expiating R requires forgiveness as it is unclear whether cleansing of guilt requires the wronged to forgive.)

6. Swinburne says that forgiveness is a performative act in which the forgiver communicates that they will undertake in the future not to treat the offender “as the originator of the act by which” the offender wronged the forgiver (Swinburne 1989: 85). Swinburne grants that it may be possible to make this performative act if the offender has not offered atonement, but he thinks in that case we should not call the act an act of forgiveness. He thinks this because he says forgiveness is a good thing and making this performative act without atonement on the part of the offender isn’t good (Swinburne 1989: 86f).

Wolterstorff defends a similar position. He says that

forgiveness is the enacted resolution of the victim no longer to hold against the wrongdoer what he did to one. (Wolterstorff 2011: 169)

One “no longer holds against the wrongdoer what he did to one” when one treats him as if his wrong action was not part of his moral history, his moral history being

the ensemble of things he did that contribute to determining his moral condition, things he did that contribute to determining in which respects and to what degree he is a morally good person and in which respects and to what degree he is morally bad. (2011: 170)

On this view, forgiveness should come after atonement.

7. Rutledge (2022) argues also that there can be reasons not to forgive—even if the offender has atoned to some degree—if forgiving would be bad for the victim or offender.

8. Forgiveness, on Strabbing’s view, doesn’t imply reconciliation, but it does imply an openness to reconciliation. Also, one can forgive without having been offered atonement. This view also explains why reconciliation requires forgiveness, but also why atoning for a wrong will require more than the victim’s forgiveness of that wrong: the wrongdoer will also need to become open to reconciliation, which will require atoning acts such as remorse and repentance (at the least), and atoning acts may be needed to move the victim to become open to reconciliation.

9. There is a vast literature on sacrifice, both in the Judeo-Christian tradition and in religious and other cultural traditions more broadly. Sacrifice has been approached from many angles in the academic literature. Some—especially many writing from the 1800s to the mid 1900s—try to reconstruct a history of sacrifice (and here scholars tend to focus on animal sacrifices) and then try to find the essence of sacrifice in its prehistorical origins. More recent scholars have been skeptical of this project (both of its historical reconstructions and of its inference to claims about essence). Recent scholarship has been more pluralistic, allowing that different traditions may use sacrifice for and understand its significance in different ways. The most important and influential figures in the history of scholarship on sacrifice include Robertson Smith, Durkheim, Hubert and Mauss, Burkert, Vernant and Detienne, Girard, and Milgrom. Carter 2003 is a valuable anthology of classic and contemporary work. Gane 2022 is an excellent up to date survey. Klawans 2006 and Naiden 2013 both contain valuable surveys and evaluations of the literature on sacrifice and, themselves, constitute state-of-the-art accounts of sacrifice in the Jewish and Greek traditions, respectively.

10. The ritual for the Day of Atonement involves several sacrificial offerings—one the high priest offers for himself and his family, then another for the Israelites. The high priest then confesses the sins of the Israelites over the head of another goat—the scapegoat—which is then driven out into the wilderness (Leviticus 16).

11. Girard (1986) views sacrifice as a tool human communities use to address escalating internal conflicts: they agree to punish a scapegoat. Although controversial as an historical understanding of sacrifice (see Klawans 2006 for critique), Heim (2006) has used Girard’s views to develop an account of the sacrifice of Christ as a scapegoat that is intended to unmask and defeat the violent scapegoating tool.

12. The Hebrew scriptures sometimes depict God as angry with humans in response to sin or disobedience (e.g., Exodus 4:14; 32:10; Ezra 8:22; Psalm 60:1; Isaiah 5:25), as does the New Testament (e.g., Romans 2:5-8). His wrath/anger towards sin will result in punishment of the sinner, unless something is done to atone for sin, expiate guilt, and propitiate God. Many regard attributions of anger and wrath to God as non-literal either because lacking a body God cannot feel passions, or because these sorts of emotions are unfitting of a good God (see, e.g., Aquinas Summa Contra Gentiles I.89, 96). If God literally lacks negative emotions, such as anger, towards a sinner, then God isn’t literally propitiated. “Propitiation”, if it were applied at all in this context, then would mean either one of the other senses mentioned above, or it would mean “to remove an obstacle to reconciliation”.

13. Notice that at least part of what a propitiator hopes to change in the victim is what the victim aims to do through forgiveness: release negative emotions towards the wrongdoer and replace them with attitudes of positive regard. A propitiator aims to achieve these ends in a certain way. I don’t propitiate you if I trick you into having brain surgery that removes your negative attitudes towards me. And I don’t propitiate you if I gaslight you, or successfully trick you into believing that someone else wronged you, not I. To propitiate you, I need to acknowledge the truth about my wrongdoing, and I aim to give you a good reason to change your attitude towards me, such as by atoning and appealing to your gracious nature. I want you, of your own free will, to overcome your negative attitudes towards me and to come to have positive attitudes towards me grounded in some value for me as me (rather than simply in what I can do for you).

14. A victim could refuse to reconcile, remain angry, and refuse to accept the wrongdoer’s atoning acts even though the wrongdoer has sufficiently atoned. The wrongdoer in this sort of situation has no right that the victim accept his atoning acts, even if the victim morally ought to (or it would be morally indecent not to) accept those acts. In this situation, the wrongdoer would have offered adequate atonement, although atonement in the fullest sense hasn’t occurred (since that sense implies that the goal of reconciliation has been achieved), and the victim has not been propitiated.

15. A categorical apology includes:

  1. a corroboration of the factual record of the events relevant to the wrong in question,
  2. acceptance of blame (as opposed to merely expressing sympathy for the harm done, or describing the action as accidental),
  3. possession of appropriate standing to accept blame for the wrongdoing,
  4. identification of each harm,
  5. identification of the moral principles underlying each harm, thus indicating an awareness of the values that were at stake with the wrong,
  6. commitment to moral principles underlying each harm,
  7. recognition of the victim as a moral interlocutor—as someone to be morally respected who is worthy of engaging in moral discourse,
  8. categorical regret—believing the action was a mistake and wishing that one hadn’t done it,
  9. performance of the apology—expressing the apology to the victim,
  10. reform—committing to not reoffend and demonstrating this commitment,
  11. redress—taking practical responsibility for the harms caused and offering appropriate remedies and redress, and accepting appropriate legal sanctions for the wrong,
  12. intentions for apologizing—the primary aim of apologizing is to advance the victim’s well-being and right the wrong, and
  13. emotions—feeling an appropriate range of sorrow and guilt for the wrongdoing and sympathy and empathy towards the victim.

16. Costly apologies may involve a thoughtful or costly gift, or may be offered in a way that is inconvenient or embarrassing for the wrongdoer. Even costly apologies may not suffice to atone when the wrongdoing is severe and has resulted in considerable harm to the victim. In those cases, the wrongdoer seems to owe more to the victim than just apology—reparation or restitution is also required. The victim may be unable to reconcile with the wrongdoer until reparation or restitution has been provided (or has begun to be provided).

17. Some have argued that there is a deeper sense of remorse that involves a feeling of hopelessness (J. Murphy 2012b): one’s wrongdoing is deep and cureless and recognition of this produces agony (Griffiths 2021). This deeper sort of remorse isn’t necessary for, although it may be concomitant with, repentance.

18. A person who rightly sees that his action was wrong, but incorrectly thinks both that he bears little culpability and that the victim was not seriously harmed, may repent and apologize for what he views himself culpable for. However, his repentance and apology will be defective because they will not constitute adequate respect for the victim. He will not make proper amends and, as a result, a relational rift preventing at least moral reconciliation remains.

19. X is recompense for loss L when X is given in compensation for L and X and L have like value. Recompense is most appropriate when the loss is something of material or monetary value. But, of course, not all harms amount entirely (or even partially) to this sort of loss. X is restitution for harm H when X is given to restore the victim to her state before the harm. Compensation can thus count as one sort of restitution, but there are other sorts of restitution. For instance, someone who has defaced another person’s property might offer restitution by stripping and repainting the property to restore it to its previous appearance. But there are many cases where restitution cannot be given, such as when a lie is told about a person that spreads throughout a community. The state before when the lie was told cannot be restored, as not all traces of the lie and its effects can be eliminated. X is reparation for a harm when X is given to repair the harm in a way that neutralizes it. Sometimes one cannot compensate for a harm, or restore the person to the state before the harm, but one can repair the harmful effects so as to neutralize them. In the just mentioned case of the lie, the wrongdoer can repair the harm by confessing the lie to other people in the community who have heard it and perhaps taken it seriously.

20. We can state this a little more carefully. Sometimes we offer restitution for bad things we are causally, but not morally responsible for. In these cases, we haven’t wronged the person, but we have harmed them, and we offer restitution with the aim of undoing the harm. However, in a context where one has wronged another—and these are the contexts that matter for atonement—restitution, recompense, and reparation are aimed at undoing the wrong.

21. Although in this latter case, some say that a person engages in self-punishment (e.g., Radzik 2009: 32). If that is so, the distinction drawn here would need to be drawn between merely other-imposed punishment and self-imposed punishment. An act could be both other- and self-imposed; in that case it would not be merely other-imposed.

22. Imposed losses or hard treatment are often met with resentment and anger. Wrongdoers often feel that the punishments are unjust or extreme (especially when issued by mere humans without full understanding of the situation, and given that punishing authorities may be motivated by vengeance as much as justice). Even when the punishment is just, and regarded as such by the wrongdoer, he may still reluctantly accept the punishment and be resentful of it as he will have had little ability to choose the manner of his punishment. The lack of agency itself can induce anger, but especially when one is deprived of the ability to accept a punishment in a way that will enable them to better express contrition. And because punishment is presented as a price one has to pay for wrongdoing, it can lead to the wrongdoer having the mindset that they have “done their time” and “paid the price,” which treats atonement simply as a matter of paying a sort of economic debt. In some cases, then, it seems that an act undertaken as punishment atones in one way (by offering reparation or penance), but fails or even works against atonement in another way (by hindering repentance or introducing a new gulf of resentment and anger on the part of the wrongdoer towards the victim or to society). See Zaibert 2018 for more on the harms of punishment.

23. Both Garvey and Radzik (2009: 101f) argue that the same goes for self-punishment, which they describe as a sort of penance.

24. God is a person or God is personal, according to these traditions (although how to understand these claims, and which is to be preferred, is disputed; see, e.g., Swinburne 1977 [2016]; Thatcher 1985; Davies 2020). God can be wronged. According to Anselm, “to sin is nothing other than not to give God what is owed to him” (CDH I.11, Davies & Evans 1998) and many monotheists in the Judeo-Christian tradition would say that humans owe God obedience and love (see the SEP entry on sin in christian thought). To sin, then, is to wrong God. Wronging God results in a ruptured relationship with God and a need for humans to atone for, make amends for, and expiate their sin.

25. According to the Christian doctrine of incarnation, God the Son can be physically and emotionally harmed and threatened in his human nature.

26. There is a deep puzzle here, though: how can an omniscient and omnipotent being’s desires and plans be frustrated? If he is in addition provident—everything is under his control and nothing escapes his influence—is not whatever happens his will? The puzzle seems even deeper for those who, like Leibniz, think that God has created the best possible world. He created it because it was the best, so isn’t everything that happens within it in his will? One traditional way to respond to this puzzle is to distinguish God’s antecedent and consequent will (see, e.g., Aquinas ST I.19.6; Leibniz 1710; Stump 2018: 176ff). God’s consequent will is what he wills regarding an event given all the circumstances in the universe and consequences of the event. God’s antecedent will is what he wills regarding an event in itself, abstracted away from all the circumstances and consequences. Every event that occurs is in God’s consequent will, but many events—acts of theft and murder and omissions of one’s duty to God and neighbor—will not be in God’s antecedent will.

27. Various other factors influence the nature and extent of human wrongs against God. First, Christians hold that humans have a duty to obey God’s will and his will is that humans love him with their whole heart, mind, and strength and love their neighbors (i.e., fellow humans) as themselves (see Matthew 22:34ff). Every act or omission that constitutes a failure to adequately love God or another human thus counts as a sin and, as such, wrongs God. Given familiar human frailties, the average human will have sinned many times, in many ways throughout their life. Second, one common way of wronging God is wronging a fellow human. Loving a human one has wronged surely entails at least attempting to atone to that human. Thus, atoning to God for these wrongs will include making atonement to fellow humans (Thurow 2017a). Third, atoning for sin is, on the Christian view, made even more difficult by original sin—a state all humans are in which involves at least a weakness and corruption of natural human powers that results in an inclination to sin, but which may also involve guilt passed on from the first human sin.

28. See Barth Church Dogmatics IV; Martin 1981 [1997]; Taylor 1941 for influential Biblical and theological discussions of reconciliation.

29. Some Christian ecclesiastical bodies have issued more detailed statements about Jesus’s atonement, some even going so far as to endorse certain accounts. For an example of the former, see the Wesleyan Church’s articles of religion, article 10; for the latter see the Southern Baptist Convention’s 2017 resolution on the necessity of penal substitutionary atonement (although this resolution does not amount to a binding doctrinal statement made by the Convention). See Other Internet Resources for links.

30. For discussion of the Grotian view and others related to it (such as Jonathan Edwards and other American theologians), see the survey texts listed above as well as Crisp 2008, 2012; Todd 2019.

John McLeod Campbell (1856), a Scottish Presbyterian minister writing in the nineteenth century, developed the vicarious penitence view of atonement, according to which Christ atones for human sin by vicariously repenting of human sin on behalf of humanity. Crisp (2007) describes this as a “non-penal substitution” view, as Christ substitutes his work for other humans in order to atone, but he does not take punishment; rather he offers a perfect penitence that humans should offer. Campbell emphasizes that the entirety of Christ’s life contributes to his penitence for human sin, and that Christ’s penitence both removes the offense of past sin, and sets humans on a better path through Christ’s teaching, example, and his sending of the Holy Spirit. Campbell thus ties human moral transformation to Christ’s work of vicarious penitence.

The theory faces several objections. First, repentance appears to be something that only a guilty person can do (Crisp 2020a: 126). One cannot repent for an action one did not perform, and Christ performed no wrong actions according to Christian doctrine. Christ can, of course, express great sorrow for human sin, but repentance involves more than sorrow—it also involves an admission of guilt. Second, Christ’s death appears not to play an important role on this view, for repentance of sin doesn’t require that one die (Crisp 2020a: 127). One could, in response, fold the recapitulation motif into vicarious penitence and argue that genuine, full, open-eyed repentance would need to be offered while experiencing the consequences of sin (if not sin itself), and death is one of those consequences. Third, an Anselmian would say that repentance is at most necessary, but insufficient for atonement. For the great offense of human sin, either satisfaction must be offered as well, or humans must experience punishment. Fourth, Campbell has been criticized for not explaining how a response of faith is important for humans to appropriate Christ’s atoning work (Pugh 2014: 91).

31. Aulén (1930 [1931]) claimed that the Christus Victor account was the earliest Christian account of atonement. However, many scholars have contested his claim (Crisp 2015, 2020a; Turner 1952).

32. Gregory of Nyssa illustrates this part of the view with his famous fishhook metaphor:

Hence it was that God, in order to make himself easily accessible to [Satan], veiled himself in our nature. In that way, as it is with greedy fish, he might swallow the Godhead like a fishhook along with the flesh, which was the bait. Thus, when life came to dwell with death and light shone upon darkness, their contraries might vanish away. (Gregory of Nyssa Logos katechetikos, section 24 [1954: 301])

33. If humans have been tricked and enslaved then, even if they have come to enjoy and endorse their lives under Satan as if they have Stockholm Syndrome, their culpability for their wrongdoing against God is seriously reduced. Atonement, then, is barely in need and what is offered through ransom isn’t atonement for whatever culpability remains; rather the ransom is a means of obtaining freedom from a powerful force. Here’s another way to illustrate the problem. Which of the ways of atonement (see section 2) are provided, on the ransom view? Not apology, repentance, truth telling, reparation, or punishment. Truth telling may be incidentally involved, but the truth that is told has less to do with the wrongdoing of humans than with the power of Satan. Maybe moral transformation of a sort is provided, but the theory doesn’t focus on the people themselves changing, but on them being freed from the power of something else that constrains them. This reduces culpability, thus reducing if not eliminating the need for atonement. Plus, it doesn’t address the core issue that atonement is supposed to address: the rupture in a relationship with God due to human sin.

34. According to Gregory of Nyssa, this happens most fully after a human dies, but begins during life through the sacraments such as baptism and the eucharist (Gregory of Nyssa Logos katechetikos, sections 16, 25, 32, 35, and 37).

35. Steps 1 and 2 together imply that in order for humans to be saved, God incarnate must offer satisfaction for human sin. Step 3 adds that some humans will be saved; combined with steps 1 and 2, it follows that God will become incarnate and offer adequate satisfaction. Step 4 explains how God incarnate offers adequate satisfaction.

36. To unpack his reasons a bit further: anything humans might offer in satisfaction they already owed to God—e.g., praise, obedience, desire to love God more deeply (CDH I.20). Furthermore, the severity of the wrong, and thus the depth of the debt owed, is proportional to the value of the being wronged, and so sinning against God, the greatest good, is very deeply wrong (CDH I.21, II.6, II.11). And adequate satisfaction requires that humanity give back to God what they took from him—a return of humans that were conquered by Satan, but sinful humans are unable to provide this (CDH I.22).

37. To be given proper honor, in this feudal sense, is, roughly, to be given what is owed to one by one’s vassals, be it service or goods. Should a vassal fail, they must either pay an equivalent to restore proper honor and soothe the felt indignity of the lord, of suffer punishment. However, it is far from clear that Anselm relies on this feudal notion. The notion of satisfaction has far older roots in patristic theology of penitence (Crisp 2020a: 71). Anderson (2009) argues that the roots go even farther back to the New Testament and other second-Temple Jewish literature. CDH uses almost none of the terms typically associated with feudalism (Whidden 2011). Anselm was a Benedictine monk and the Rule of Benedict contains a notion of satisfaction that matches well with Anselm’s notion (Mansini 1987).

38. Human sinners could, in principle—especially if given afterlife opportunities—offer adequate reparation to the human victims of their actions.

39. Aside from Boso’s exclamations of wonder, praise, and thanksgiving, and Anselm’s argument that it is fitting that Christ offer satisfaction as he did because of its great example for humans, Anselm says nothing about what humans must do to gain the benefits of Christ’s work. However, this lack in CDH may be due more to the goals of that work than to Anselm’s views. Its goal is to explain why God became human. Its goal is not to offer a systematic theology of atonement. The issue of what humans should do to adopt Christ’s atoning work is thus irrelevant to the main goal of CDH.

40. See Ensor 2011; Flood 2010; Hill & Jedwab 2015; S. Jeffrey et al. 2007; and G. Williams 2011 for discussion of evidence of penal substitution in the Church fathers. See also Myers 2015 for an alternative general account of the patristic view.

41. Hugo Grotius’s governmental view of atonement also embraces penal goodness, although he gives a somewhat different mechanism for atonement. Crisp (2008) calls his a “penal non-substitution” view.

42. For example, Socinus’s objection that if justice is served through punishment then there is no forgiveness, Stump’s objection that this view makes forgiveness conditional, and Lombardo’s objection that this view entails that God wills Christ’s death and the moral evil that causes it.

43. However, this concession threatens to undermine the motivation for the penal substitution theory, for if God may accept a lesser punishment, why not simply accept the natural death of humans as sufficient, or simply an apology, or satisfaction? There are other means of atonement aside from being punished that can bring about reconciliation.

44. This reply depends on divine command theory, which has been heavily contested. It also threatens to undermine the motivation for penal substitution theory, as with the second reply to the second objection—see footnote 43.

45. Beginning with his contemporary Bernard of Clairvaux, who wrote a scathing refutation of what he took to be Abelard’s errors

46. See part II of N. Smith (2008) for an extensive discussion of examples of and difficulties regarding collective apology.

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