Sin in Christian Thought

First published Thu Apr 15, 2021

While some have sought to give naturalistic accounts of sin (see Ruse 2002), this entry treats sin as a religious concept. Sin plays a central role in many of the world’s major religions (see Graham 2007), and this role is arguably its central connotation (see M. Adams 1991). A full treatment of sin as a topic in the philosophy of religion would therefore need to canvass a wide array of religious traditions, such as Judaism and Islam (Watt 2009 and McGinnis 2018). Since Christianity develops out of Judaism, a historical discussion of Christian understandings of sin would also need to pay careful attention to sin as understood in Judaism BCE (see Anderson 2009, Katz 2006, Graves 2016, and Bashevkin 2019). The present article focuses specifically on treatments of sin within the contemporary Christian analytic theological tradition.

Even limited just to the contemporary Christian tradition, “sin” denotes a broad category which can be subcategorized in a number of ways. One could, for instance, classify sins in terms of offenses against different individuals or groups, as when one distinguishes between sins against God, sins against others, and sins against oneself (see Sweeney 2018: 351; for other subcategorizations of sin in these terms, see Couenhoven 2013 and McCall 2019: chapter 5). One could also differentiate between the moral wrong that has been done by an act of sin (sometimes called “the problem of past sin”), and the moral wrong or sin that one is likely to do (sometimes called “the problem of future sin”; see Stump 1988: 64). Future sins can be further divided between moral wrongs that one is likely to do in virtue of one’s personal inclinations or dispositions, and moral wrongs that one is likely to do in virtue of possessing a fallen or sinful human nature. The present article will explore sin as an action (section 2), sin as a disposition or vice (section 3) and sin as a state or “the condition of being in sin” (section 4; see Plantinga 2000: 207).

It is important to note that commitment to one of these three categories of sin does not entail a commitment to either or both of the others; a commitment to the existence of sinful acts, for instance, does not entail a commitment to sinful dispositions or vices. There are some in the Christian tradition who think that being vicious doesn’t entail being sinful (e.g., William of Ockham; see Sweeney 2018). Furthermore, one can affirm the existence of both sinful actions and sinful dispositions without being committed to the existence of sin as a state of being, that is, without being committed to the doctrine of original sin. Immanuel Kant, for instance, affirms the two former categories while rejecting the latter (Kant Religion Within the Limits of Reason Alone [1793]; see also Quinn 1990). In addition to considering sin as action, disposition, and state, the present article also addresses the noetic effects of sin (section 5) and the idea of structural sin (section 6), according to which sin can be embedded in the structures of various social systems.

1. Approaching Sin within a Religious Tradition

1.1 Religion-Neutral Value Theory and Sin

Most contemporary philosophy of religion assumes either a framework of generic theism or the framework of Christianity. (While the present treatment largely reflects this focus from the literature on which it draws, it should be noted that this focus has been criticized on a number of fronts. (See, for instance, Knepper 2014, Draper & Nichols 2013, Schilbrack 2014, Simmons 2019a, and Timpe & Hereth 2019).) Discussions that assume the framework of generic theism often proceed along the lines of what Marilyn McCord Adams calls “a religion-neutral value theory”. Religion-neutral value theories seek both to avoid dependence on values specific to a particular religious tradition and to include only such value assumptions as would also be acceptable to an atheologian (M. Adams 1988: 127; for a criticism of such an approach, see Moser 2019). Philosophers who have adopted such theories have tended

not to speak of sin, but of moral agency and responsibility, of moral goodness or turpitude. (M. Adams 1991: 1)

McCord Adams herself thinks this assumption of neutrality is unjustified, however, citing the significant difference in ontological commitment between theists and atheologians, and the implications this difference has for their moral theorizing:

Different ontological commitments with their different stores of valuables widen or narrow the range of options for defeating evils with goods. Secular value theories can offer only packages of immanent goods; some religious theories posit an infinite transcendent goodness and invite relationship to it; while Christianity believes the infinite good to be personal, and locates the happiness of finite persons in loving personal intimacy with the divine persons. (M. Adams 1988: 129; see also Plantinga 1985: 36)

In short, the degree to which a belief system can make sense of a particular claim or theory depends on the resources within that belief system (see Hasker 2008: 17–19, 120).

A religion-value neutral approach to sin, in particular, would be constrained by the relatively small number of shared values between theists and atheologians regarding the core concepts at stake, including the nature of the harms involved and the opportunities for reparation. As suggested by Plantinga 2000, M. Adams 1988, and Stump 2010, the simple fact that different religious traditions have different constraints to work with and different resources to draw on doesn’t weigh for or against the plausibility of those traditions. In this case, contemporary Christianity sets the value system within which conceptions of sin will be examined.

1.2 Sin in Relation to Other Christian Doctrines

Within the Christian tradition, sin is typically seen as a privation, in line with the general privation view of evil (Mann 2001, Stump 2003, and Couenhoven 2013). Otherwise, sin and evil become reified. If sin were a positively existing entity in its own right, then insofar as God is the creator and sustainer of all things, God would be responsible for creating and sustaining sin. Yet as Copan notes, such a position cuts directly against the fundamental goodness of God’s creating act:

We do a disservice to the Christian doctrine of anthropology by emphasizing human wickedness to such a degree that we obscure the goodness of God’s creation…. While Christian philosophers ought not ignore the painfully obvious fact of human depravity, they must set this against the backdrop of the goodness of God’s creation. (Copan 2003: 522; see also Hasker 2008: 75; and Sweeney 2018, 366)

This example demonstrates how Christian doctrines of sin can’t be fully understood in isolation from other related theological doctrines (see Timpe forthcoming, for methodological criticisms of Christian analytic theology). Rather, conceptions of sin should be understood in the context of human life and creation as a whole,

in relation to God’s original intentions for humanity at creation and the effects of God’s mercy, cleansing and forgiveness. (Johnson & Lauber 2016b: xi)

A full exploration of the theological doctrine of sin, or hamartiology, in the Christian tradition would thus require extended engagement not only with particular biblical texts, but also with other core Christian doctrines to which the doctrine of sin is closely linked, such as creation, Christology, anthropology, atonement, the sacraments, redemption, and eschatology (Bauerschmidt 2016: 199).

The New Testament, like the Hebrew Scriptures, uses a wide range of terms for sin (the literature here is immense; See McCall 2019: chapter 1; Green 2017; and the essays in Johnson & Lauber 2016a), as well as employing a number of metaphors drawn from the earlier Jewish tradition. Most prominent among those metaphors is the idea of sin as a stain, a burden, or a debt. These metaphors help establish the contours in which a Christian hamartiology must be worked out, but none of them fully encapsulates the Scriptures’ teaching on sin (Bashevkin 2019: 6). As these metaphors differ, what appears to be the proper response to sin also differs. Stains need to be cleansed. Burdens need to be lifted. Debts need to be paid or otherwise discharged. (See Anderson’s Sin: A History for a description of the different uses of these metaphors and how the dominant metaphor shifts over the course of various Biblical texts.) Metaphors used to describe sin thus have a large impact on its philosophical treatment in the Christian tradition.

2. Sin as Action

One of the most common ways in which sinful actions have been characterized is as actions in conflict with the behaviors and patterns of life to which God calls humanity. The term “actions” should here be broadly construed to include omissions as well as commissions: we sin when we fail to love our neighbors as ourselves, for instance, even if we do not actively harm them. Sinful actions are, in short, actions that fail to live up to the will or commands of God (see Stump 2018).

Many sinful actions will be deliberately chosen or intentional. In fact, it is common in some parts of the Christian tradition to take “sin properly so called” to be a willful transgression of a known law of God. Ruth Groenhout, for instance, describes sin as

the deliberate choice of a lesser good in preference to a greater, chosen in spite of and against the loving, creative, and wholly good will of God. (Groenhout 2006: 135)

Groenhout here is drawing on a tradition that goes back at least to Augustine, according to which sin necessarily involves inordinate desire for a lesser good. Augustine held the privation view of sin, according to which—insofar as evil is the absence of good—sinful actions involve “not a desire for naturally evil things, but an abandonment of better things” (as quoted in Mann 2001: 45; see also Augustine On Free Choice of the Will).

We sin, then, if we knowingly do that which we know we ought not, and if we knowingly do not do that which we know we ought. According to many views, we also sin when we internally endorse a sinful action, whether or not we carry through with that endorsement and perform the action. These views often appeal to the following passage from the Sermon on the Mount:

You have heard that it was said to those of ancient times, “You shall not murder”; and “whoever murders shall be liable to judgment”. But I say to you that if you are angry with a brother or sister, you will be liable to judgment.…You have heard that it was said, “You shall not commit adultery”. But I say to you that everyone who looks at a woman with lust has already committed adultery with her in his heart. (Matthew 5:21–22 and 27–28, New Revised Standard Version)

On some views, Christianity also countenances involuntary or unintentional sins, holding that some emotions and desires can be sinful even if they’re not directly under our voluntary control. According to Robert Adams, for instance, failing to take responsibility for our emotions and motives is both self-alienating and blameworthy even when those emotions and motives are involuntary, although the appropriate response to involuntary sins differs from that for voluntary sins and voluntariness can affect the degree of wrongness (R. Adams 1985). William Wainwright also defends the view that we can sometimes be blameworthy for involuntary actions, broadly construed to include desires and beliefs (see Wainwright 1988: 40).

Furthermore, some philosophers think that there are sinful actions that don’t violate any normative restrictions. Here, Richard Swinburne’s distinction between “objective” and “subjective” sins can be helpful. Objective sins occur when a person does what is objectively wrong, whether they realize that it’s wrong or not. Subjective sins occur when a person does what they believe to be wrong, acting against their conception of the good (Swinburne 1989: 124). On this differentiation, it’s possible for an action to be both objectively and subjectively sinful, objectively but not subjectively sinful (as in the case of people who sin believing they are acting in the right), and subjectively but not objectively sinful (as in the case of a person who acts against an erring conscience). According to Philip Quinn,

Theists who believe that erring conscience binds will want to allow for cases in which, on account of a mistaken belief about the moral wrongness of an action, a person does what is subjectively but not objectively wrong and so sins subjectively but not objectively. (Quinn 1986: 542; see also Stump 2003: 90)

However, one could also think that what is sinful about “subjective sins” is that one is acting against one’s conscience, and thus “objectively” sinning insofar as one is not following one’s conscience, even when one’s conscience is in error. Even on this interpretation, however, the class of sins is broader than “willful transgressions of a known law of God”.

Much of the philosophical work engaging sinful actions in contemporary philosophy of religion has been in connection with the problem of evil, understood as a family of related arguments that take among their premises facts about evil and seek to conclude either that God (understood as having a particular nature) does not exist or that it is irrational to believe that such a being exists. Sinful acts and moral evil are often taken to be either co-extensive or nearly so (see Hasker 2008: 160), and so versions of the problem of evil that focus on the problem of moral evil also often talk about sin. The main thrust of most of the versions is that an all-powerful, all-knowing, all-good God would not allow human beings to perpetuate or suffer horrendous evils. Because human beings do both perpetuate and suffer horrendous evils, either God must not be all-powerful, all-knowing, and/or all-good, or God must not exist. The question of sin is not, however, limited to discussions of the logical problem of moral evil; it also comes up in discussions of evidential versions of the problem of evil and even the problem of natural evils (see, for instance, Swinburne 2009 and 1978); van Inwagen 2006: lecture 7; and O’Connor 1991).

One of the most famous responses to this version of the problem of evil is what Alvin Plantinga has termed “The Free Will Defense”. According to this response, God’s creating human beings with free will (and refraining from tampering with the freedom of that will) makes the existence of moral evils/sinful actions at least possible – and perhaps even likely:

For any free creature God creates, this falling into sin is clearly a possibility; God can’t create significantly free creatures [i.e., a person who is free with respect to a morally significant action it would be morally wrong for them to perform and morally right to refrain from, or vice versa] who cannot fall into sin. And perhaps a high probability of such a fall attaches to free creatures (creatures with an area of autonomy) who are created in the image of God. God sets out to create beings in his own image: they resemble him in having will and intellect, and they recognize the lustrous beauty, glory, and desirability of God’s position. God is himself the center of the universe; his creatures see the splendor and wonderful desirability of that condition. Perhaps, insofar as one is free, and sees both the glory of this position and its enormous desirability, there is a powerful tendency to desire it for oneself. Perhaps there is a high probability that beings created in the image of God will also wind up resembling him in this: that they want to see and do see themselves as the center of the universe. Perhaps a substantial probability of falling into this condition is built into the very nature of free creatures who have knowledge of God’s glorious status and do see it as indeed glorious and desirable. (Plantinga 2000: 212f; see also Plantinga 1974, Plantinga 1977, and M. Adams 1999)

As this argument makes clear, one’s view about the nature of sinful act will be closely related to one’s view about the nature of human freedom (see McFadyen 2016, Timpe 2014a, and Couenhoven 2013). Plantinga here assumes a libertarian, and hence incompatibilist, understanding of free will. While all Christian views have to explain how God is not complicit in sin given the doctrines of conservation and concurrence (Kvanvig 2009; Vander Laan 2017; and McCall 2019: chapter 7), the question of God’s relation to sinful human acts is especially pressing for compatibilist views, which hold that God could have caused human agents to never freely sin, and theological determinist views, which hold that God causes all events (see McCall 2019: chapter 3; Bignon 2018: part 2; White 2016; Bruce 2016; McCall 2016; Rogers 2008; McCann 2005; and Crisp 2005, particularly chapter 3).

Account of the nature of sinful acts are closely related to accounts of the theological need for forgiveness, redemption, and atonement. While some philosophers claim that the correct understanding of these doctrines comes as a package (see Copan 2003: 525f), there is significant disagreement about how best to understand them, both individually and in relation to each other. (There is, for instance, a wide range of views about how best to understand the atonement; see, among others, Stump 2018, S. Porter 2004, Swinburne 1989 and 1988, Lewis 1997, and Quinn 1986. For a discussion directly of how sin relates to atonement, see Crisp 2009.)

2.1 Primal Sin

Among individual acts of sin, special importance attaches to the temporally first sin, which is referred to as the “primal sin”. (Most take this to be the temporally first sin regardless of whether it was committed by an angelic or human being, although some take it to be the first human sin committed.) Scott MacDonald describes the primal sin as follows:

The fall of the angels constitutes the paradigm case [of evil-originating free choice] since, unlike Adam’s and Eve’s sin in the garden, the first angelic sin is entirely unprecedented. We can think of that first evil free choice as constituting primal sin. The first sin deserves to be called primal, however, not just because it is temporally first but also because it is something radically new in creation: the first evil appears against a backdrop of utter goodness. All things created by God, including the rational creatures whose free choices are the original evils, are wholly good and without flaw.…There can be no context of defect or corruption into which the first sin fits. Good creatures with good wills voluntarily introduce evil into a world where there was none before. Primal sin is not only unprecedented but also seemingly unprepared for and unprompted. (MacDonald 1998: 110–1; see also Rogers 2008 and Couenhoven 2013: chapter 1)

The very notion of a primal sin implies that there was a time when creation was without sin. While a temporally first sin would seem to be required by a finite past, discussions of the primal sin often presuppose that there was a time of perfect creation prior to a fall, which is more contentious. As Craig A. Boyd argues, given that it conflicts with contemporary science,

the claim that creation was originally perfect in every respect—the idea that an idyllic paradise existed without death, disease, poison or weeds before the first human [or angelic] sin—is especially problematic. (Boyd 2009: 111)

But one need not take the story of the fall literally to think that there was a primal sin. (For a discussion of the historicity of the fall as it relates to sin, see McLeod-Harrison 2019; Smith 2017; and McCall 2019, appendix.) Even if one rejects the notion of a historical fall, Christianity nevertheless traditionally holds that all that God creates is good. But if both humans and angels are created good, how is it that at least some of them do evil? (This is what John Hick refers to as the problem of the “origin of evil ex nihilo”; see Hick 1968: 595.) The answer to this question, of course, is that an agent does evil because it wills to do evil. But this answer immediately raises another question: where does will for evil originate in free agents? This question is especially pressing given that many Christian traditions have held that free agents were created able both to sin and to refrain from sinning, a state sometimes called the status integritatis. While a creature’s having free will in the status integritatis might account for the possibility of evil, it isn’t sufficient to explain why that possibility was actualized by an otherwise morally untarnished creature. The primal sin can thus be seen as a specific instance of what Peter Kivy calls “the secular problem of evil”: “cases of evil [action] in which the perpetrator appears to pursue no real or apparent good” (Kivy 1980). One might say that the initial choice to sin involved a perceived good, perhaps the assertion of one’s own independence from God in an act of pride, self-love, or envy. What is perplexing is how that sin could come about in a non-sinful being—why is it that a non-sinful agent would wrongly but culpably conceive of such as act as good? How could a non-sinful agent be drawn to a sinful action in the first place?

In general, two different approaches to explaining the primal sin have been offered. Because the philosophical work on the primal sin is conducted largely in dialogue with medieval figures, drawing on a complex moral psychology in which the faculties of the intellect and will play an essential role, I also discuss these two approaches in those terms. Put simply, there can be no sin without the involvement of the intellect and will (see McCluskey 2017: 21 and 100); the difference between the two approaches is whether they locate that sin primarily in the will or in the intellect. Voluntarists, on the one hand, hold that human beings act freely primarily in virtue of the faculty of the will, and thus explain the primal sin primarily in the misuse of that faculty. (Robert Brown notes that in the history of Christian theology, voluntarism is the dominant view; see Brown 1978). Intellectualism, on the other hand, holds that human beings act freely primarily in virtue of the role of the intellect, and thus that the primal sin must be explained primarily in intellectual terms.

In what follows, I focus on two of the most developed extant accounts of primal sin in the contemporary literature: Katherin Rogers’s account of Anselm’s voluntarist view and Scott MacDonald’s account of Augustine’s intellectualism. Leaving aside the question of whether Rogers’s and MacDonald’s interpretations of their historical subjects are accurate, both of these interpretations present libertarian accounts insofar as they presuppose that the truth of theological determinism would render the devil unfree, and thus not responsible, in his fall. (It is worth noting that while Anselm is widely regarded as a libertarian [see Visser & Williams 2008 and Rogers 2008], there is disagreement about how best to interpret Augustine’s view of free will [compare Stump 2001 and Couenhoven 2017].)

On Rogers’s account, Anselm holds that a free will involves two inclinations (or affectiones): the desire for benefit and the desire for justice. The desire for benefit is the desire for things the possession of which one thinks will lead to their happiness. The desire for justice, in contrast, is

a desire for “rightness of will preserved for its own sake”. It is therefore a second order desire that one’s first order desires should be properly ordered, should be as they ought to be. (Rogers 2008: 67)

Anselm doesn’t think anyone wills injustice, or any other sin, for its own sake; rather, they will it under the description of something beneficial. Why would one choose the lower good of benefit over the higher good of justice? Anselm’s answer cannot be “ignorance” but simply “because that is how the agent formed their volition”. Is such a choice explicable? According to Rogers, in one sense it isn’t:

“But why did he will what he ought not?” asks the student. “No cause preceded this will, unless it was that he was able to will”. But this ability per se is not really the cause, since the good angels were equally able to desert justice. “Why then did he will?” ’The teacher responds, “Only because he willed. For this choice had no other cause by which it was by any means impelled or drawn, but it was its own efficient cause, and effect, if such a thing can be said”. Here we have libertarianism of the self-causation variety stated with brutal clarity and with no attempt to downplay its core problem.… Anselm does not go on and try to mitigate the problem of intelligibility. (Rogers 2008: 97)

On this sort of view, any attempt to fully understand the primal sin falls short and must ultimately remain

mysterious and irrational. Those who were made to love God should not have found the prospect of defying God attractive, and pride should not have come naturally to them. (Couenhoven 2016: 189)

On MacDonald’s interpretation of Augustine, by contrast, the primal sin involves the agent’s will, but that act of will is preceded by an act of the intellect. As MacDonald describes the situation:

What could primal sinners have done to guard against sinning? I think the answer must be that they failed to pay attention to the reason they had for loving God above all things, namely, their knowledge that God is the highest good.… Had they attended to the reasons they possessed, they would have seen that rationality required them to love God above all things.… Primal sinners, then, must have made their evil choices in some sense without thinking, without deliberating sufficiently, without taking account of relevant information that was nevertheless in their possession. (MacDonald 1998: 120–1)

In other words, the intellect’s failing to properly grasp or weigh the normative reasons in the first place is the primary cause of the primal sin. The will’s volition in the primal sin thus isn’t a will to act contrary to what the agent knows ought not be done, but results rather from ignorance or failure to give the right reasons the right weight (for more, see Timpe 2014a: chapter 3).

Aquinas’s intellectualism builds on but differs from Augustine’s (see Stump 2001). Jonathan Edwards appears to have a different sort of intellectualist account. On Edwards’s view, the will must follow its strongest motivation (Crisp 2005: 41), which is an output of the intellect. And more recently, Alvin Plantinga also endorses an intellectualist account. He suggests that while primal sin involves both affective and intellectual elements, it must originate with “an intellectual defect; it must be by way of somehow acquiring a false belief” (Plantinga 2000: 211). In other words, there must be a “prior intellectual fault” (Plantinga 2000: 212) before any affective failure.

2.2 Sin as Action, the Problem of Evil, and O Felix Culpa

As mentioned above, acts of sin relate closely to those versions of the problem of evil that focus on moral evils, where one tries to explain free creatures doing what is wrong. It is common in these discussions to differentiate a defense from a theodicy. Alvin Plantinga describes a theodicy as “the attempt to specify God’s reason for permitting evil”, while a defense is the attempt to specify not what God’s reason is but what it “might possibly be” (Plantinga 1977: 27f; see also van Inwagen 2006). Versions of free will theodicy argue that the existence of free will is the good that justifies God’s permitting evil, while free will defenses argue that the existence of free will might be such a reason. Both free will theodicies and defenses typically presuppose libertarian understandings of free will, and thus the possibility of moral evil, although they need not (see, for instance, Almeida 2016 and Turner 2013). Given the focus here on sin, one particular response to the problem of moral evil is worth extended attention: a response known as “O Felix Culpa”, according to which God not only allows but even desires evil insofar as it furthers his plans.

While John Hick (1966) and Paul Helm (1994) both discuss O Felix Culpa theodicies, Alvin Plantinga’s work has been especially influential in contemporary philosophical discussions, and so I will focus on Plantinga. In earlier work (see Plantinga 1977 and 1985), Plantinga was interested in only giving a defense, explicitly rejecting theodicies. In fact, at one point he claimed that

most attempts to explain why God permits evil—theodicies, as we may call them—strike me as tepid, shallow, and ultimately frivolous. (Plantinga 1985: 35)

His later 2000 Warrant and Christian Belief is an extended response to defeaters to Christian belief, but it also contains the elements of his later O Felix Culpa theodicy. As Kevin Diller comments,

this argument is a new species from Plantinga in the genus of responses to the problem of evil. This is a theodicy, not merely a defense, not merely a defeater defeater, but an explanation for why God allows evil—a reason for evil, that does not remove all the perplexity, but at a general level gives us an understanding for why it exists. (Diller 2008: 90)

He continues:

Unlike a free will theodicy, in a [O] Felix Culpa theodicy God desires evil [perhaps not for its own sake but] as a means to his good purposes. This move has a dangerously distorting moral and theological impact. We can no longer condemn evil and injustice as wholly antithetical to what is good. Evil is ultimately the will of God…. In a free will theodicy it is the permission of evil that is essential to the greater good that God intends, in the Felix Culpa theodicy it is the evil itself that is essential to the greater good. Evil is made reasonable as a functional good. (Diller 2008: 96)

On this view,

there is also a contingent good-making characteristic of our world—one that isn’t present in all worlds—that towers enormously above all the rest of the contingent states of affairs included in our world: the unthinkably great good of divine incarnation and atonement. (Plantinga 2004: 7)

Given his other commitments, including what Marilyn McCord Adams calls the “swamping effect” of God’s goodness (M. Adams 2008: 126), Plantinga thinks that every possible world is a very good world. God’s existence is not only necessary but also infinitely good, God’s existence outweighs any evil, and every possible world is thus one that is infinitely good. But not all infinities are equal. In some worlds, there are additional goods that outweigh the evil of sin, namely the goods of incarnation and atonement. Since the incarnation and atonement, on Plantinga’s view, follow only after sin, which is contingent, the (infinite) good of the incarnation and atonement is also contingent. God’s willing the incarnation and atonement is logically prior to God’s decisions to permit sin, and thus sin becomes the means to that justifying good. Such a position is called “supralapsarianism”. The way Plantinga understands the supralapsarianism,

the [divine] decree to save [at least] some of the fallen [via the incarnation and atonement] precedes the decree to permit sin. (Plantinga 2004: 1)

(Diller objects to Plantinga characterizing the supralapsarian/infralapsarian debate in this way; see Diller 2008: 94).

Plantinga gives three different versions of the argument, each based on a different assumption about value. Since Plantinga endorses the strongest of these, which Hud Hudson calls “the Strong Value Assumption” (Hudson 2019: 269), I’ll focus on this version. (It’s worth noting that Plantinga thinks that only the weakest of the three value assumptions is needed for the O Felix Culpa theodicy, although Hudson 2019 argues otherwise.) The Strong Value Assumption is as follows:

Any world with incarnation and atonement is a better world than any without it—or at any rate better than any world in which God does nothing comparable to incarnation and atonement. (Plantinga 2004: 1)

More fully:

No matter how much sin and suffering and evil [world] W contains, it is vastly outweighed by the goodness of God, so that W is a good world, and indeed a very good world. It follows, once more, that every possible world is a very good world. But that doesn’t mean that none are more valuable than others. The fact is: some possible worlds are much better than others. For there is a feature to be found only in some and not all possible worlds. This is the towering and magnificent good of divine incarnation and atonement.…No matter how much evil, how much sin and suffering a world contains, the aggregated badness would be outweighed by the goodness of incarnation and atonement, outweighed in such a way that the world in question is very good. In this sense, therefore, any world with incarnation and atonement is of infinite value by virtue of containing two goods of infinite value: the existence of God, and incarnation and atonement. (Plantinga 2004: 9f)

Plantinga thinks that since all possible worlds containing the goods of incarnation and atonement also contain moral evil, the introduction of sin into the world is justified by those goods. (For concerns about how Plantinga’s O Felix Culpa theodicy might conflict with his defense to the logical problem of evil, see Davis & Franks 2018 and M. Adams 2008.)

There are a number of objections to Plantinga’s O Felix Culpa theodicy. The first involves Plantinga’s treating the incarnation and atonement together as a package contained in all the best worlds. While he considers the possibility that there may be other worlds not involving incarnation and atonement that are equally good, he says that it’s hard to imagine those worlds and suggests we ignore them. But there are reasons to think that the set of worlds containing the incarnation and the set of worlds containing the atonement are not identical. Marilyn McCord Adams, for instance, writes,

In fact, as the great medieval theologians recognized, Incarnation and atonement are logically independent: all agreed, it would have been metaphysically or logically possible for God to become Incarnate, even if creatures had never sinned; and Incarnation without atonement would still have been cosmic excellence enhancing. (M. Adams 2008: 131)

Anselm seems to have thought that God couldn’t have reconciled with us in any other way, thereby making the incarnation not only fitting (Cur Deus Homo I.1, in Anselm BW; see also the discussions in Flint 2009 and M. Adams 2004) but also conditionally necessary on human sinfulness (Cur Deus Homo II.6–7, in Anselm BW; see also Williams forthcoming). But numerous other theologians after him in the medieval period thought he was just wrong about this, including Alexander of Hale, Bonaventure, and Aquinas. Bonaventure, for instance, believes that the ability of God to bring about the atonement without becoming incarnate follows from divine power. And according to Thomas Williams, the non-necessity of the incarnation for atonement was “the dominant medieval view” (Williams forthcoming).

The incarnation and the atonement can come apart in the other direction as well: God could have become incarnate even in the absence of sin. Scholastic philosopher and theologian Robert Grosseteste lists no fewer than nineteen reasons why God might have become incarnate even without sin (see M. Adams 2004: 143). Aquinas held (Summa theologiae III.1.3) that while God could have become incarnate even had there been no sin, God would not have chosen to do so. (It’s worth noting that other notable theologians, such as Augustine and Pope Leo, disagreed; see M. Adams 2004: 147). Duns Scotus also thought sin wasn’t required for God’s decision to become incarnate.

As Kevin Diller understands Plantinga’s O Felix Culpa theodicy, the incarnation and atonement play different roles:

Suffering is not just a necessary byproduct of the plan to effectuate incarnation and atonement, but it also allows us to have a kind of intimacy and solidarity with Christ that would not otherwise have been possible. (Diller 2008: 90)

Diller argues that intimacy and solidarity are made possible by the incarnation. But these goods could be achieved even without sin and the need for atonement:

the incarnation alone does not require suffering and evil, so neither then is evil required for enhancing the intimacy of human relationship with God. If it is not an enhancement in our relationship with God that necessitates evil, then Plantinga’s argument stands solely on the first claim: that the value of the atonement, which outweighs the required evil and suffering, is its being an, otherwise impossible, towering display of God’s love. (Diller 2008: 96)

For his theodicy to work, Plantinga would need to argue that it is the good of the atonement in particular that assures the relevant goodness, thereby revising the Strong Value Assumption to something like

any world with atonement is a better world than any without it—or at any rate better than any world in which God does nothing comparable to atonement

(see also Hudson 2019: 282).

Furthermore, regarding the value of the atonement, Diller suggests that it is not the actual atonement that is required for the good, but rather God’s disposition or willingness to engage in the atonement:

Even in worlds without sin—if such worlds are indeed possible—the counterfactuals of God’s love are the same. Perhaps Plantinga’s view is not that there would be anything lacking in God’s love for us without atonement, but that there would be something lacking in our perception of that love. It is reasonable to think that it is part of God’s loving purposes that the beloved would understand how loved they are. The argument, in this case, would be that the enactment of God’s love in redemption gives us a view of the nature of that love which we would not otherwise have had. But how could we know what God’s limitations are with respect to communicating to us a knowledge of the depth of his love? The weight of the theodicy rests on this assumption, but we are not given a good reason to accept it. (Diller 2008: 92; citations omitted)

Marilyn McCord Adams rejects the entire framework of the instrumental value of evils that the O Felix Culpa theodicy assumes. For her, “horrors” are defined as

evils the participation in (the doing or suffering of) which constitutes prima facie reason to doubt whether the participant’s life could (given their inclusion in it) have positive meaning for him/her on the whole. (M. Adams 2006: 32)

She elaborates elsewhere:

My own conclusion is that means/end connections between greater goods and the worst evils (the ones I have identified as horrors) do not help the project of Christian theodicy. There need to be meaningful connections of another kind. Where horrors are concerned, it won’t be enough to suggest—as Plantinga does—that the greater good outweighs the evil either. For precisely because horrors threaten to take away the possibility of positive personal meaning, they require recontextualizing to confer some positive meaning upon them. (M. Adams 2008: 137)

Horrors, in Adams’ view, need to be defeated rather than simply balanced out or outweighed. And defeat must happen in the life of the person who has suffered or perpetrated the horror, not someone else; that is, we must restrict defeat to the agent involved in the horror. Without this agent-centered restriction, it isn’t possible for Plantinga to argue that

not only are perfect love and mercy compatible with requiring the suffering of a person for ends that are unconnected to her own good but that these traits are also compatible with that suffering extended to being wrecked and ruined, damnable and (maybe in some cases) damned. (Hudson 2019: 283)

Diller picks up the same thread:

For Plantinga’s theodicy to be successful, he must hold that a world including all of the same people would be better off with a fall than without a fall, even though it could not be better for those who suffer eternally broken relationship with God. The good of having participated in making the world a better place would not individually offset the quite personal cost of entering hell or even being annihilated. Barring a commitment to universalism, it seems once again, from this angle, that on the Felix Culpa view the value of the extravagance of God’s sacrifice is made to be more valuable than the right relationship with God that the sacrifice is meant to restore. (Diller 2008: 94)

McCord Adams argues that it is actually worse than Diller thinks. Plantinga doesn’t clearly endorse the double predestination that is sometimes paired with supralapsarianism. But, given his rejection of universalism, God does knowingly choose to create some free creatures who will be damned:

Plantinga’s “Felix Culpa” Supralapsarianism has God decide on what careers incompatibilist free creatures will have prior in the order of explanation to their existence. Once again, for Plantinga, incompatibilist free creatures, considered as merely possible, are not “truth-makers” for the counterfactuals of freedom about them. (M. Adams 2008: 134)

The culprit here is actually Plantinga’s Molinism, however, not necessarily the O Felix Culpa. (For concerns about Molinism on this point, see Perszyk 2011a: 8f; Wierenga 2011: 131–135; and Timpe 2018. For a rejection of this concern, see Merricks 2011: 66).

William Hasker thinks that the most serious objection to Plantinga’s O Felix Culpa theodicy is that

God in this theodicy is using his creatures, treating them as means and not as ends in themselves, by placing them in great peril in order to get the glory of saving them. (Hasker 2008: 168f)

But that glory might not even be for saving those individuals that sin, since Plantinga thinks that not all who sin are saved. This benefit of the atonement might extend only to some of those who suffer, again raising Adam’s agent-centered constraint. As Hasker notes, God’s using or instrumentalizing people in this way for the sake of some other good seems to run afoul of Romans 3:8, which explicitly rejects the thinking that we should do evil “that good may come”.

Finally, Hud Hudson raises another objection to Plantinga’s theodicy that he thinks is decisive as an objection to theodicy in general. Plantinga writes that

any world with incarnation and atonement is better than any world with it—or at any rate better than any world in which God does nothing comparable to incarnation and atonement. It is hard to imagine what God could do that is in fact comparable to incarnation and atonement; but perhaps this is just a limitation of our imagination. But since this is so hard to imagine, I propose that we ignore those possible worlds, if there are any, in which God does not arrange for incarnation and atonement, but does something else of comparable excellence. (Plantinga 2004: 10)

Hudson thinks this line of argument fails because it’s a “simple and straightforward noseeum inference” where absence of evidence doesn’t amount to evidence of absence (Hudson 2019: 285). And Hudson thinks we have no reason to endorse such an inference in this case. (For another criticism of Plantinga on this point, see also Hasker 2008.)

3. Sin as Disposition

In addition to being a category of action, sin can also be understood as an inclination or disposition to engage in sinful action. As Plantinga puts in,

sin is also and perhaps primarily an affective disorder or malfunction. Our affections are skewed, directed to the wrong objects; we love and hate the wrong things. Instead of seeking first the kingdom of God, I am inclined to seek first my own personal glorification and aggrandizement, bending all of my efforts toward making myself look good. Instead of loving God above all and my neighbor as myself, I am inclined to love myself above all and, indeed, to hate God and my neighbor. (Plantinga 2000: 208)

The relation between sinful acts and sinful dispositions is complex. Having a sinful disposition can certainly make it easier to commit a particular kind of sin (e.g., being gluttonous makes it easier for me to drink another coffee beyond what I should), but a sinful disposition is neither necessary nor sufficient for committing a sinful act. It can’t be necessary, given that the primal sin isn’t explained by the presence of a sinful disposition. And it can’t be sufficient, since we don’t do all the sinful actions that a vice disposes us towards.

As is also the case for examining individual acts of sin, a full account of sinful dispositions will depend on one’s larger normative framework. Sinful dispositions understood as inclinations towards certain kinds of sinful acts can be understood as disordered dispositions to not follow the natural law or divine comments, or within the framework of a Kantian-inspired deontological account. It is, however, perhaps most natural to think of such dispositions within the general normative framework of virtue ethics as vices (J. Porter 1997: 466; McCluskey 2017: 7). The vices, on this approach, are habits of the soul that are contrary to individuals’ flourishing and are opposed to, or involve the privation of, a particular virtue. According to Colleen McCluskey (2017), Thomas Aquinas holds that only actions can be sinful, strictly speaking, while vices are bad habits without those dispositions being themselves sinful. There is long tradition within Christianity, however, of treating sin in terms of dispositions as well as actions. Today, in part because of the influence of ethicists such as Anscombe, Foot, Murdoch and MacIntyre, many contemporary Christian philosophers and theologians draw on the medieval virtue ethics tradition and its portrayal of vices as sinful dispositions.

Much of the relevant work on sinful dispositions focuses either on particular categories of vice (e.g., vices opposed to the cardinal virtues, or the seven capital vices) or on individual vices. (For examples, see DeYoung 2020, Sweeney 2018, and McCluskey 2017.) As Rebecca DeYoung notes, a common Christian response to vice is to concentrate on sanctification, which is the change or transformation of character required to remove sinful dispositions (DeYoung 2020: viii; for different models of the nature of sanctification, see Alston 1988, S. Porter & Rickabaugh 2018, and Yeo 2014.) Sanctification importantly includes spiritual disciplines in the process of virtue formation (see DeYoung 2020 and Smith 2016).

4. Sin as State

4.1 Sin as Uncleanness

In addition to thinking of sin in terms of action and/or dispositions, parts of the Christian tradition also think of sin as in terms of an ontological state. Marilyn McCord Adams, for instance, thinks of sin, at its most basic level, as ontological “uncleanness”. On this view, sin is fundamentally an

impropriety in the relation between God and created person.… Sin is uncleanness arising from the incommensuration of Divine and created natures, in the incapacity of any finite being to do or to be anything, naturally or intrinsically, worthy of God. (M. Adams 1991: 20f)

This incommensuration is

a metaphysically necessary consequence of what God and creatures are, not the outcome of the free and contingent exercise of anyone’s agency. (M. Adams 1991: 21)

Elsewhere, McCord Adams describes it as an outgrowth of “the metaphysical gap” between humans and God, in virtue of differences in their natures:

We have no more rightful place in God’s household than worms and maggots do in our ours (Job 24:4–6); nothing we could naturally be or do would make us suitable for Divine company. Because Divine and created natures are incommensurate, God will be unclassifiable relative to any merely human order (social, political, international) or to any human perception of natural order. Since we are unable to fit Him into any of our categories, we experience God as … wholly other, and therefore as utterly unpredictable. (M. Adams 1999: 94)

This state of uncleanness, on her view, isn’t a result of sinful actions but is instead simply a function of the radical limitation and finitude of created natures in comparison with God.

Because of the size gap nothing we could be or do could count—simply by virtue of what it is—as an appropriate move in relation to God. (M. Adams 1999: 95)

Because sin is primarily a function of our created state rather than a result of human actions, this view doesn’t portray human freedom or forgiveness as playing a key role overcoming the state of sin. Rather, the gap is straddled by covenant and, ultimately, incarnation.

4.2 Original Sin

The Christian doctrine of original sin can also be understood as a kind of state or “condition” (see Mann 2001: 47). While, as discussed in section 2.1, primal sin refers to the temporally first sin, original sin is original in the sense that “it is an evil at the origins of human agency, and from which human agency flows” (Couenhoven 2016: 193). Original sin is sometimes referred to as human beings possessing a “sinful nature”. This view leads to certain Christological worries, however: if the Second Person of the Trinity becomes incarnate and assumes a human nature, then if human nature is somehow itself sinful, Christ would also be sinful. But all Christian theories hold that the Incarnate Christ is fully human as well as fully divine, and yet without original sin. (For discussions of the relationship between Christ’s divine nature and the human nature assumed in the Incarnation, see Pawl 2019 and 2016). Some Christian traditions also hold that Mary the mother of Jesus also was free from sin via the immaculate conception. Because such language about human nature itself becoming sinful can be misleading (see Copan 2003: 523) and also potentially in conflict with the conviction that all things created by God are good, original sin is perhaps better described in terms of human nature’s being distorted. In virtue of its distorting effects, original sin thus “becomes the origin of actual sins” (Blocher 1997: 19), and perhaps even a condition that almost inevitably leads to sinful actions (see Franks 2012: 3).

While the doctrine of original sin isn’t explicitly taught in the Christian scriptures, it “was developed from scriptural warrants” (Green 2017: 115). It also is a distinctively Christian doctrine (Quinn 1997: 541), rejected by both Judaism and Islam. Augustine played a central role in the historical development of the doctrine of original sin. In contrast to Pelagius and Caelestius who denied that humans inherit original sin via the fall (see Timpe 2014a: chapter 4 and Couenhoven 2013), Augustine maintained that through Adam’s sin, the whole human race is now

bound by the chain of death and justly condemned, …lead by a succession of miseries from its depraved origin, as from a corrupt root. (Augustine City of God, XIII.14)

Augustine’s view in this debate was codified by the Councils of Carthage (418) and Orange (529), with Pelagius’ view being declared heresy in the West, and thus the components of this view deserves a closer look. (For a discussion of the history of the doctrine, see Vanneste 1971.)

In what follows, I will follow Jesse Couenhoven, who argues that Augustine’s doctrine of original sin has five parts and distinguishes between them as follows:

  1. the primal sin;
  2. the participation of the rest of the human race (except Jesus and, in some traditions, Mary) in that sin because of their solidarity with those who committed the first human sin;
  3. involuntary and inherited common guilt that all humans (again except Jesus and, in some traditions, Mary) are subject to because of that solidarity;
  4. penalty to human nature because of the primal sin; and
  5. the transmission of inherited sin and its penalty. (Couenhoven 2013: 46; for slightly different categorizations, see Blocher 1997 and Crisp 2019: chapter 7)

Of these, (1) has already been dealt with above in section 2.1. (2) is a claim about the scope of those who are affected by original sin, and in what follows I will assume the restriction that excludes Jesus and, in Catholicism and parts of the Orthodox tradition, his mother Mary. I address claims (3) and (4) respectively in section 4.3 and section 4.4. Other than noting that there are a range of options regarding how original sin (which is sometimes referred to as hereditary sin, or erbsünde in Germanic languages) is transmitted, ranging from Augustine’s view that this transmission occurs via semen as part of sexual intercourse to its occurring through participation in sinful human community (see Couenhoven 2013: chapter 7), I will not focus on claim (5) either in what follows.

4.3 Constitutional Fault and Original Guilt

Couenhoven describes the third component of the doctrine of original sin as its conceptual center, with the other parts of the doctrine providing “a background that assists us in understanding the center of the doctrine” (Couenhoven 2013: 47). This third component is itself the conjunction of two claims: the first being about constitutional fault, which Couenhoven also sometimes calls “original sin itself” (Couenhoven 2013: 23), and the second being that one is morally blameworthy or suffers from original guilt in virtue of that constitutional fault. While Couenhoven may be correct that much of the historical reflection on original sin involves both of these elements, the second of these claims is controversial in contemporary philosophical work on original sin.

Couenhoven describes constitutional fault as a kind of moral “improper functioning qua human being” (Couenhoven 2013: 12) that involves “an inherited state of disordered desire and ignorance” (Couenhoven 2013: 30). This element has also been described as a disordering of human desires such that they “are now congenitally turned away from God” and in bondage to sin (McFarland 2016: 308). There are two main ways of understanding the distortion or corruption involved in constitutional fault. The first is as a loss of original righteousness or “a deprivation of original holiness and justice” (Catechism of the Catholic Church 2003, part I, section 2, paragraph 7, 405). The second is as an actual perversion of the moral nature of humanity (see McCall 2019: 159).

Original guilt, on the other hand, is defended by very few philosophers, although William Wainwright suggests that original guilt is essential to the doctrine of original sin (Wainright 1988: 31). Thomas McCall refers to those views that reject original guilt as “corruption-only doctrines” (McCall 2019: 156). The denial of original guilt is found in the Catholic tradition (see Catechism of the Catholic Church 2003, part I, section 2, paragraph 7, 405) and many of the Orthodox traditions (see Louth 2020). Among contemporary philosophers, corruption-only views are endorsed by Crisp 2020a, McFarland 2016, McFadyen 2016, Hudson 2014, Wyma 2004, Plantinga 2000, Quinn 1997, Morris 1992, and Swinburne 1989.

According to Michael C. Rea (2007), much of the opposition to the idea of original guilt comes from its prima facie conflict with the following “principle of possible prevention”:

A person P is morally responsible for the obtaining of a state of affairs S only if S obtains (or obtained) and P could have prevented S from obtaining.

Rea argues that no part of the doctrine of original sin, including original guilt, contradicts (MR). Rather, one gets a contradiction when the doctrine of original sin is conjoined with the following plausible assumption:

No human being born after Adam’s first sin could have done anything to prevent Adam’s first sin; and no human who is born corrupt could have done anything to prevent her own corruption.

Rea then develops two different theories of original guilt that are inconsistent with (A1), one drawing on realism and perdurantism (roughly, the view that ordinary objects like humans persist through time in virtue of having temporal parts) and the other drawing on Molinist assumptions. (For criticisms of Rea’s proposals, see Hudson 2014: chapter 4.)

4.4 Just Penalty

Closely connected with the concept of constitutional fault is the idea of just punishment for that fault. According to those views which reject original guilt, we are justly punished only for our actual sinful actions and dispositions. For those views which affirm original guilt, a question arises concerning where this guilt comes from, given that it doesn’t seem that the post-Adam person in question committed the sin to which the original guilt attaches. There are two main families of views that seek to address this issue: federalism and realism. According to federalism, which is sometimes also referred to as representationalism, we are held to be guilty for original sin and for our constitutional fault in virtue of Adam (or Adam and Eve) being our “federal” or “representative” head. In short,

we are condemned because Adam stood in for us as the representative of the whole human race; due to his relationship to us as our “federal head” or “legally appointed representative”, his guilt thus counts as our guilt. (McCall 2019: 162)

Federalism involves a “treating as if”, or a “legal fiction”, where guilt is imputed via taking Adam to be a representative of the human race (see Madueme 2020; for a criticism of such imputation, see Crisp 2009).

In contrast, realism holds that there is a real unity between all who are justly punished for original guilt and Adam (or, again, Adam and Eve). As Augustine puts it,

The first human beings … having become the first sinners, were then punished by death in such a way that whatsoever sprang from their stock should also be subject to the same penalty. For nothing could be born of them which was not what they themselves had been …so that what arose as a punishment in the first human beings who sinned also follows as a natural consequence in the rest who are born of them. (Augustine City of God, XIII.iii)

Because of our common human nature, all humans have an organic unity in virtue of which the punishment for original sin is just (for a discussion and criticism, see Crisp 2020b). However, Augustine “never really explains how all did exist and act in Adam, leaving the matter rather mysterious” (Couenhoven 2013: 27).

The realist view perhaps best known is that of Jonathan Edwards, who held that all humans are one simply because as God declares us to be:

there is no identity or oneness [that does not] depend on the arbitrary constitution of the Creator.… Divine constitution [God’s treating all humans as one entity] is the thing which makes truth. (Edwards 1758: part 4, ch. III [1970: 404])

Influenced by Jonathan Edwards, a number of philosophers have suggested that the theory of perdurantism might provide a basis for realism. (See the discussions in Wainwright 1988, Wyma 2004, Crisp 2005 and 2009, Rea 2007, and Hudson 2014.)

4.5 Inevitability of Sinful Actions

Even the rejection of original guilt doesn’t solve all the concerns related to the third component of the doctrine of original sin: constitutional fault also faces philosophical and theological challenges. While some argue that constitutional fault merely inclines one to commit sinful acts (see Swinburne 1989: 138), most have held that acts of sin are inevitable given the state of original sin (Crisp 2019: 150). As Paul Copan puts it,

though we do not sin necessarily (that is, it is not assured that we must commit this or that particular sin), we sin inevitably (that is, in addition to our propensity to sin, given the vast array of opportunities to sin, we eventually do sin at some point. (Copan 2003: 531)

Paul Franks raises the following problem for views like Copan’s (and Plantinga’s and Wyma’s), which affirm the inevitability of sin without original guilt. On these views, the following claim is true:

Necessarily in a world tainted by original sin, (a) every human subsequent to Adam and Eve [where those names are understood to refer to whoever the first sinners happen to be in whatever world is tainted by sin] is born in a condition such that it is inevitable that she sin (given that she performs at least one morally significant action), but (b) it is not inevitable that she sin on any given occasion. (Franks 2012, 6f; citations omitted)

(This claim would seem to entail that every world tainted by original sin includes sinners who give birth to other creatures capable of sinning. That looks to be false if there’s a world where the first sinners are annihilated immediately afterwards and new human beings are created, but Franks doesn’t consider this possibility.) Now consider a possible world in which a human performs only one morally significant action in their lifetime. This would mean that:

Possibly, some human performs only one morally significant action in her lifetime. (Franks 2012: 7)

Franks thinks that the truth of (2) “seems assured” and finds “no reason one could give for thinking it to be false” (Franks 2012: 7 and 11). However, according to (1a) above, it is true of the human in question that they inevitably sin in that particular action. That is, it follows from (1a) and (2) that

If some human performs only one morally significant action in [their] lifetime, then that action is inevitably sinful. (Franks 2012: 7)

However, from (1b) it follows that:

If some human performs only one morally significant action in [their] lifetime, then that action is not inevitably sinful. (Franks 2012: 7)

(3) and (4) together entail a contradiction.

One way to reject (1b) is to accept a compatibilist view on which at least some human free actions, namely those in which one sins, are determined by God. But those with libertarian commitments seem to be committed to (1b). Since Franks is a libertarian, he rejects that the constitutional fault of original sin necessitates sinful actions: “we are influenced by a fallen world to sin, but are free at any point to refrain from sinning” (Franks 2012: 370). As mentioned above, Swinburne also rejects the inevitability of sin on the basis of original sin:

Adam’s responsibility for our sinfulness is confined to a responsibility for beginning the social transmission of morality (as such a good thing) which made sin possible, but a morality which, as a result of his own sinful example and perhaps false moral beliefs, was no doubt a corrupt morality and so made it easier for our genetically inherited proneness to sin to work in Adam’s successors. (Swinburne 1989: 143)

According to Swinburne, sinful acts are “almost unavoidable” but not inevitable. Those incompatibilists who want to hold that committing at least one sinful action is inevitable while avoiding the inevitability (and thus non-responsibility) of each particular sinful action need to provide an account of what ensures sinful action.

5. Noetic Effects of Sin

The depravity brought about by sin is held to affect all parts of human nature. In addition to sin as act, disposition, and fallen state, Christian philosophers have also done significant work on the noetic effects of sin, including but not limited specifically to its epistemic effects. The Reformed tradition in particular emphasizes the effects of sin not just on the will but on the human intellect. Alvin Plantinga, for instance, states that “Original sin involves both intellect and will; it is both cognitive and affective” (Plantinga 2000: 207). On Plantinga’s view, the affective dimension of sin—particularly the skewing of affections toward the sin of pride—is perhaps “the deepest root of the condition of sin”, but a full accounting of sin must also include its impact on our epistemic faculties:

One the one hand, [sin] carries with it a sort of blindness, a sort of imperceptiveness, dullness, stupidity. This is a cognitive limitation that first of all prevents its victim from proper knowledge of God and his beauty, glory, and love; it also prevents him from seeing what is worth loving and what worth hating, what should be sought and what eschewed. It therefore comprises both knowledge of fact and knowledge of value. (Plantinga 2000: 207)

Plantinga develops an influential view of warrant which he calls the extended Aquinas/Calvin (A/C) model. Though an account of warrant in general, it was developed specifically to show how religious beliefs could be justified (both internally and externally); rational; and, if these beliefs are true, could have warrant.

The central feature of this model is the stipulation that God has created us human beings with a belief-producing process or source of belief, the sensus divinitatis; this source works under various conditions to produce beliefs about God, including, of course, beliefs that immediately entail his existence. (Plantinga 2000: 199)

For Plantinga, religious belief can be immediate and basic; a religious belief can be warranted even if it is not held on the basis of argument, so long as it is reliably produced by the sensus divinitatis. The A/C model is explicitly constructed to be able to account for the noetic effects of sin:

Our fall into sin has had cataclysmic consequences, both affective and cognitive. As to affective consequences, our affections are skewed and our hearts now harbor deep and radical evil: we love ourselves above all, rather than God. There were also ruinous cognitive consequences. Our original knowledge of God and of his marvelous beauty, glory, and loveliness has been severely compromised; in this way the narrow image of God in us was destroyed and the broad image damaged, distorted. In particular, the sensus divinitatis has been damaged and deformed; because of the fall, we no longer know God in the same natural and unproblematic way in which we know each other and the world around us. Still further, sin induces in us a resistance to the deliverances of the sensus divinitatis, muted as they are by the first factor; we don’t want to pay attention to its deliverances. We are unable by our own efforts to extricate ourselves from this quagmire. (Plantinga 2000: 205)

Plantinga thinks that “the most serious noetic effects of sin” (Plantinga 2000: 214) are the deleterious effects sin has on our knowledge of God:

Our original knowledge of God and his glory is muffled and impaired; it has been replaced (by virtue of sin) by stupidity, dullness, blindness, inability to perceive God or to perceive him in his handiwork. Our knowledge of his character and his love toward us can be smothered: it can even be transformed into a resentful thought that God is to be feared and mistrusted; we may see him as indifferent or even malignant.… The most important cognitive consequence of sin, therefore, is failure to know God. And this failure can have further cognitive consequences…. If we don’t know there is such a person as God, we don’t know the first thing (the most important thing) about ourselves, each other, and the world. (Plantinga 2000: 215 and 217)

The noetic effects of sin aren’t limited simply to knowledge of God, however. They extend to our knowledge of the moral demands on our lives given our relationship with God, our emotions, imagination and even non-epistemic mental functions (see McMartin 2016).

Despite sin’s epistemic effects, Plantinga thinks that knowledge of God is still possible in two ways. First, knowledge of God is possible via natural theology (see Walls & Dougherty 2018). Second, knowledge of God is possible despite the noetic effects of sin given the role of the Holy Spirit in bringing about faith. Faith, for Plantinga, has both affective and cognitive elements. Central to the cognitive dimension of faith is “a firm and certain knowledge of God” (Plantinga 2000: 206; see also Diller 2014) and knowledge of other central aspects of Christian belief. The sensus divinitatis is repaired by the working of the Holy Spirit. “Without some special activity on the part of the Lord, we wouldn’t believe” (Plantinga 2000: 269). While sin has damaged the sensus divinitatis, the Holy Spirit can regenerates it, allowing it to again function properly and remove defeaters from warranted religion belief.

Merold Westphal is another contemporary Christian philosopher who explores sin’s noetic effects. Westphal claims that to take St. Paul seriously is to take seriously the universality of sin (Westphal 1990; see also Westphal 1993), including sin’s effects on how we think about God. Westphal worries that much philosophical theology is too optimistic about human reason, ignoring the impact of sin on our epistemic capacities and functioning. By “sin”, Westphal has in mind both sinful acts and the general disposition to commit sinful acts, and he maintains that both acts and dispositions can be individual and communal. Following Augustine, Westphal also sees sin as best described in terms of pride,

the self-assertion which usurps a role in life not proper to me, depriving God and neighbor of their rightful places as, respectively, my absolute superior and my equal. (Westphal 1990: 200)

Ultimately, sin isn’t weakness but rather idolatry. Westphal’s “Law of Inverse Rationality” holds that

the ability of human thought to be undistorted by sinful desire is inversely proportional to the existential import of the subject matter. (Westphal 1990: 205; see also Timpe 2014b)

This worry about the noetic effects of sin is one of the major motivations for Westphal’s criticism of Reformed epistemology, for we can’t be sure that our epistemic faculties, including the sensus divinitatis, are functioning properly if they’re distorted by sin.

William Abraham suggest that Westphal’s approach insufficiently appreciates the role grace places as a remedy to sin:

If the sensus divinitatis is damaged all the way down without repair, it is hard to see how we would even know anything that really counted about God or about ourselves. Merold Westphal runs this risk is his very insightful essay. We need to remember that epistemically as well as spiritually, where sin abounds, grace amounts all the more. (Abraham 2006: 111 n. 17)

Abraham suggests a

more robust vision of [human] cognitive capacities and practices, like intuition, percept, reason, memory, testimony, and the like

on the basis of the recognition that these capacities and practices, even while affected by sin, are “underwritten by the power and goodness of God” (Abraham 2006: 121).

Discussions of the noetic effects of sin aren’t limited to the ones mentioned here, nor to these topics. For a discussion of the compatibility of the noetic effects of sin with evolutionary epistemology, for instance, particularly with an eye toward the cognitive science of religion, see De Cruz and Smedt 2013 and Barrett 2009. Peter Harrison also argues that sin’s noetic effects helped shape the experimental method in science (Harrison 2007).

6. Structural Sin

The discussions of sin in the previous sections all have social implications insofar as sin qua action, disposition, state, and epistemic factor can all harm human community. A sinful action can not only harm others but also spark retaliatory sinful actions by the one originally sinned against. The noetic effects of sin impact social learning and instruction, with those effects being passed from individuals and groups to others. The doctrine of original sin also clearly has social implications: if all human beings suffer from original sin, then their social interactions will be impacted by it. Even Swinburne, who rejects that humans suffer from original sin in a way that makes sin inevitable to us, holds that we contribute to the proneness of our communities to sin such that we are involved in the sins of our communities (Swinburne 1989: 145). These forms of sin affect our relationships, not just between individuals and other individuals, but between individuals and groups and between groups and other groups. In short, sin corrupts the moral imaginations of not just individuals, but of entire communities.

We can also think of sin, however, not just in terms of individual acts and attitudes, but in terms of social structures. In this case, there is a further “sociability” of sin that’s not captured by the previous discussions. The sixth century Byzantine monk and theologian Maximus the Confessor, for instance, held that sin leads to a breakdown in community, leading to individualism and social fragmentation. He went so far as to compare this state to a kind of bestiality (Deane-Drummond 2017: 38). Henri de Lubac interprets Maximus as understanding

original sin as a separation, an individualization it might be called in the depreciatory sense of the word. (de Lubac 1988: 33)

If this is correct, then thinking of sin solely in individual terms is itself a result of sin.

It has seemed plausible to many others as well that sin can be embedded within social structures such that it is committed by groups and not just individuals. Writing within the Reformed tradition, Ruth Groenhout suggests we can think of “total depravity” as the conviction that

the corruption of sin is not limited to smallish pockets of existence but instead runs through every aspect of creation that we encounter as a fracture that affects every part of our human reality. (Groenhout 2006: 134)

Sin thus impacts not just individuals or groups, but the very nature of our social systems themselves:

When sins such as pride, greed, and covetousness infect those who legislate for society, as they almost always do, the legislation and resulting social structures are themselves corrupt, and will produce often predictable pathologies in society: poverty, racial segregation, destruction of lives and relationships in the name of profit. (Groenhout 2006: 138)

On this view, human structures and systems as well as human nature are marred or distorted by sin. Parallel to structural accounts of injustices, structural approaches to sin hold that it “creates and exists within structures that shape the material reality of our planet and all life on it” (Ray 2016: 417). This approach to sin is often found in liberation theologies (see McCall 2019: 259ff).

Consider, for instance, racism. McCluskey 2017, chapter 6 contains a discussion of racism as involving not only bad actions but also bad habits:

A common habit among whites is to check that their car doors are locked whenever they see an African-American walking on the street while they are driving. Seeing a white person walking does not trigger the same response. Underlying this habit is the unacknowledged judgement by the privileged (white) group prevalent in a racist society that blacks, especially young black men, are criminals and therefore to be feared. Racial profiling by the police leads to stopping persons of color on a habitual basis simply because of their skin color and is also grounded in the explicit or implicit belief that members of these groups are more likely to commit crimes. (McCluskey 2017: 176; citations omitted)

Those instances of racism that are caused by willful ignorance or resistance to self-scrutiny will also reflect the epistemic dimension of sin. But beyond this, it may be that racism is an example of an irreducibly structural sin, as Stephen Ray argues. Racism, like race itself, on his view, is socially constructed. If racism isn’t just habits of individuals (made more likely, surely, by the habits and actions prevalent in their community or society) but something structural itself, it may also be helpful to think of some sin as structural along similar lines. This holds for two important reasons, one of which regards the existence of oppressive structures and the second about how their existence is masked:

First, … is the realization that sin becomes apparent in structures through the material consequence of their operation.… The second reason is that, because the evidence of sin’s presence is usually undeniable, it effectively shields itself from scrutiny and intervention by constructing ideological formations that take the presence of ill-being and death as simply the natural order of things. (Ray 2016: 424)

This latter is what he means by saying that structural sin is “mundane”.

Katie Walker Grimes argues that a response to racism framed primarily in terms of “white privilege” rather than white supremacy or antiblackness is insufficient because such an approach is overly individualistic and doesn’t take the social nature of sin sufficiently seriously (see Grimes 2016: xxi). Grimes develops an account of anti-blackness built on “corporate virtue theory”, which focuses on the relationship between habits and character of social bodies rather than individuals. The forces that result in antiblackness are inherently social (e.g., economics, segregated space), and so antiblack racism should be seen as inherently social as well. A number of theologians also explore victim-oriented soteriologies that focus primarily on the plight of individuals who are victims of institutional oppression and injustice, trying to articulate what reconciliation looks like in those settings (see Hunsinger 2016 and Hieb 2013).

A number of feminist scholars have also argued that sexism can be understood along the lines of structural sin. Elisabeth Schüseller Fiorenza, for instance, characterizes sexism as

the dehumanizing trends, injustices, and discrimination of institutions, the theology and symbol system that legitimate these institutions, and the collective and personal “false consciousness” created by sexist institutions and ideologies and internalized in socialization and education. This “false consciousness” permits oppressed people and groups to accept their oppression and to internalize the values of the oppressor. This understanding of patriarchal sexism as structural sin and evil power institutionalized in society and ecclesial oppressive structures is akin to [Saint] Paul’s understanding of sin as transpersonal, destructive power whose ultimate expression is the life-destroying power of death. (Schüseller Fiorenza 1993: 140)

Many of these scholars see traditional approaches to sin as individualistic action or disposition to be problematic and harmful to women (see, for instance, the work of Saiving 1992, Plaskow 1980, and Dunfee 1982 for historically influential examples). Rachel Sophia Baard’s work is one example of this line of criticism. Baard argues that sin-talk contributes to communal praxis, shaping where and how our practices reproduce themselves. As she puts it, our language and understanding of sin creates a script that people perform; for instance, if sin is simply understood as individual actions, then it would encourage us not to see the social structures involved in patriarchy as sinful, thereby making it more likely that those structures continue rather than addressing them as problematic. Traditional understandings of sin rooted in pride, she continues, which lie at the heart of many Christian institutions, and cultural beliefs and practices,

create a social climate in which gender violence is not only imaginable but tolerated or accepted as “normal”, indeed, as simply part of the human condition. (Baard 2019: 49; see also Jones 2000)

If all sin is ultimately rooted in pride and self-exertion, the proper response to sin is found in humility and self-sacrifice. But in situations of oppression and gender-based violence, such a response encourages further harm and a denial of proper agency:

by and large, female pathology is typically not rooted in the elevation of the self but in the negation of the self—hence, calling for the shattering of the self or the humility that “regards others as better than ourselves” will end up aggravating, rather than addressing, women’s sin. (Baard 2019: 61)

This can be seen historically in how women have been blamed for sin, and that blame then used to deny opportunities for or justify violence against women. Baard argues that a shift to a rhetoric of the systemic nature of oppression rather than pride is often called for, shifting focus away from the purported moral failing of the individual to the androcentric rhetoric and practices that perpetuates structures that oppress.

In addition to racism and sexism, other social forms of oppression can also be understood as examples of structural sins. Leigh Vicens suggests that we can understand implicit bias as a kind of socially based structural sin (Vicens 2018; for a recent discussion of the state of research on implicit bias, see Brownstein, Madva, and Gawronski 2020). Marjorie Suchocki argues that sin is

participation through intent or action in unnecessary violence that contributes to the ill-being of any aspect of earth or its inhabitants. (Suchocki 1994: 12)

where that participation is part of our inheritance thorough social solidarity with other sinful humans. Sin is “individual only insofar as we participate in the whole society” (Suchocki 1994: 157). She uses this account to illuminate oppression, economic systems, and homophobia. Patriarchy can perhaps be understood in a similar way (see Baard 2019 and Ruether 1993). And Ruth Groenhout explores the relationship between systemic sin and contemporary healthcare systems (Grouenhout 2006).


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