Atonement is what we do to fix relationships fractured by wrongdoing. To atone is, at first pass, to do something to repair this rupture by addressing the source of the rupture, namely the wrongdoing. The end goal is to become one, to be at one, or to reconcile. “Making amends” is often used to describe what is done to repair the rupture. Atonement is a particularly prominent concept within Judaism and Christianity, which hold that humans must atone for their sins against God. The Christian doctrine of the atonement states that Christ has atoned for human sins. This entry surveys the history of discussion of (i) the nature of atonement and its relation to other connected concepts, and (ii) theories of the Christian doctrine of atonement. Recent philosophical contributions will be highlighted alongside historically prominent discussions in theology and philosophical theology.
- 1. The Concept of Atonement and Conceptual Connections
- 2. How to Atone
- 3. Human–Divine Atonement
- 4. Classical Theories of the Doctrine of Atonement
- 5. Recent Theories
- 6. Collective Atonement
- 7. Feminist and Womanist Approaches to Atonement
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
- Supplement: Atonement, God, and Morality
1. The Concept of Atonement and Conceptual Connections
1.1 The Origin of the Word “Atonement” and its Uses
The words “atone” and “atonement” are derived from the expressions “make at one”, and “at onement”. Usage of the latter phrase can be traced to as early as the 1300s in the writings of John Wycliffe (Hayes 1998). The word thus carries at its heart the notion of putting parties at one—unifying, or reconciling. The Oxford English Dictionary offers several definitions of atonement:
- “the condition of being at one with others” (def. 1),
- “the action of setting at one, or condition of being set at one, after discord or strife” (def. 2),
- “reconciliation or restoration of friendly relations between God and sinners” (def. 3), and
- “propitiation of an offended or injured person, by reparation of wrong or injury; amends, satisfaction, expiation” (def. 4).
The word applies both to relationships between non-divine people, and to relationships between God and non-divine people. Both kinds of relationships can be damaged and require atonement for repair.
The definition of atonement in terms of making amends clarifies both notions through the vivid imagery of a torn garment. As a whole garment might become torn and require mending to repair, so a whole relationship might become ruptured and require amends to repair. When a garment is mended, the torn parts are brought back together into a whole. Likewise, when proper amends are offered, the parties of the relationship are brought back together into a whole—they are made at one, or reconciled. Making amends is thus an act of atonement—something done with the aim of reconciling the estranged parties.
The image of the torn garment suggests another feature of atonement: it typically involves a community. Society is often metaphorically described as a garment, e.g., “the fabric of society”. When a garment is torn, some threads within the garment are broken, some parts of the fabric are disconnected. But the entire garment is also said to be torn. So atonement can be given not just to reconcile two individual parties, but to reconcile an individual or a collective with a collective.
Although the word derives from English in the 1300s, the concept it denotes is plainly much older. Early Greek literature contains the concept of an atoning sacrifice (Hengel 1986; Versnel 2005). The book of Leviticus in the Tanakh describes various sacrifices the Hebrew people were to offer, some—most notably the sacrifices on the Day of Atonement, or Yom Kippur—in order to atone for sin against God (Hayes 1998; Klawans 2006; Milgrom 1991). Various passages in the New Testament describe Christ as atoning for human sin (e.g., Romans 3:23–25; 1John 2:2). These passages state the famous Christian doctrine of atonement—the doctrine that through some of his deeds, including especially his crucifixion,
Jesus acts in such a way as to remove the rift or division between humans and God that is due to human sin in order to achieve reconciliation between humans and God. (Thurow 2021a: 239)
1.2 Some Definitions
The word “atonement” is defined around a paradigm series of events. First, there has been some offense or wrong that has been committed. Second, that offense is evident to the victim, who has as a result become estranged from the offender. Third, something is done—paradigmatically by the offender—to make amends for the offense with the aim of propitiating the victim and achieving reconciliation. These amends are sometimes described as a reparation, satisfaction, expiation, or sacrifice. Fourth, provided the amends are successful, the victim forgives the offender and reconciliation results. Different senses of “atonement” pick out different aspects of this series. Understanding atonement also requires us to understand the other events in the series, such as forgiveness, reconciliation, and reparation, and how they relate to atonement (see section 1.3).
There are non-paradigm cases of atonement as well—for example, cases wherein (i) the victim is unaware they have been wronged, or (ii) the victim is aware of, but unconcerned about, having been wronged, or (iii) a third party makes or assists in making atonement, or (iv) amends seem not to require reparation, satisfaction, or sacrifice. Nevertheless, the following components seem essential to atonement even in the non-paradigm cases: an offense or wrong has been committed and something is done with the aim of bringing about reconciliation. (For ease of expression, I will from now on usually just talk about wrongs being atoned for, however it should be understood that “offense” can be substituted for “wrong” in the following definitions. Although offenses have a somewhat different moral profile from wrongs, they may also be atoned for.)
We can now set out some plausible definitions.
S atones for wrong R by doing A =defn S does A in order to reconcile the author and victim of R by removing or reducing the rift between them due to R, and A is successful in doing so.
(See similar definitions in Eddy & Beilby 2006: 9; Daly 2009: 35; Forsyth 1910 [1938: 54–8]; Hodges 1955: 9–10; O’Collins 2007: 11; Paul 1960: 17–27; Rivière 1905 [1909: 2–4].)
“Atones” is defined so that the atoning act A is successful in achieving the goal of bringing about reconciliation regarding the wrong. This seems consistent with common usage. However, we also need a term for atoning that is neutral about whether success is achieved.
S makes/offers atonement for wrong R by doing A =defn S does A in order to reconcile the author and victim of R by removing or reducing the rift between them due to R.
One could offer atonement and yet fail to atone for one’s wrongdoing. These definitions also allow that there are levels of atonement: you fully atone if you erase the rift, and you partially atone if you reduce the rift to various degrees. And one could atone for one wrong, while not atoning for another wrong against the same victim. Here the offender and victim would have reconciled regarding the first wrong, but not the second. Finally, these definitions leave open the possibility that a third party could atone on behalf of the offender.
There are two other closely related notions used by scholars that draw from the semantic range of the term. Linda Radzik, in perhaps the most extensive work on atonement in analytic philosophy, defines a notion of making amends:
S makes amends for wrong R by doing A =defn by doing A S does whatever is morally required to respond to having done R. (Radzik 2009: 7)
Making amends is fundamentally a moral notion, whereas the above notions of atonement are fundamentally relational. Radzik argues, however, that they are connected: making amends, if done properly, should aim at a certain sort of reconciliation. Thus, one properly makes amends, on her view, if and only if one offers atonement. Further evidence for this view comes from the idea that atonement aims at undoing a wrong (Blocher 2004: 645; Swinburne 1989: 81–83). Making amends arguably has the same end. But even if this view of Radzik’s is incorrect, making amends may be well suited to, and often result in, making atonement.
A third connected notion is atonement as expiation, or purification or cleansing (Craig 2020). We’ll use the term “expiation” to designate this notion:
S expiates wrong R by doing A =defn A purifies or cleanses S of guilt for having done R.
Expiation is a prominent term in the ancient Jewish sacrificial system in which human sins (offenses against God) pollute the Temple, and the blood from ritually sacrificed animals is used to purify the Temple of the pollution, thus also cleansing the sinner of guilt for their sin. “Guilt” here does not refer to the mental state of feeling guilty. It also does not mean “having performed a wrong action”. It is supposed to be an objective status of some sort—a kind of mark or blot (thus the language of cleansing is particularly apt) one has in virtue of having committed a wrong, which remains until removed (Swinburne 1989: 74). Craig (2020: 232) analyzes it in retributive terms as a liability to punishment. It could also be analyzed as a certain sort of moral debt—perhaps a debt to the victim to make up for the wrong act (Radzik 2009: 29ff).
Expiation would be equivalent to making amends if the language of purification and cleansing is a metaphor aimed to pick out what one is morally required to do in response to one’s wrongdoing. At the very least, expiation is sufficient for making amends, for if you have not done what is morally required in response to having performed a given wrong action, then you still bear guilt for that action; you would still bear a liability to punishment or an unfulfilled moral debt. But expiation may not be necessary for making amends. For instance, if the language of purification and cleansing also essentially picks out certain ways of resolving guilt (say, the use of a sacrifice of some sort), then expiation would not be necessary for making amends so long as there are other ways of doing what is morally required in response to having performed a wrong action.
1.3 Conceptual Connections
Reconciliation has a tight conceptual connection to atonement: as defined above, atonement aims at reconciliation. This connection faces some questions.
First, does this connection really hold and, if so, how should reconciliation be understood? After all, there seem to be clear cases in which a person makes atonement and does not aim to reconcile the relationship that was shattered by the offense.
- One or both parties may not desire or find possible reconciliation. Suppose Jack and Jill are married and Jill has an affair. She decides to leave the marriage, but feels guilt and remorse, apologizes to Jack, and aims to be generous and fair to him in their divorce proceedings. Jill makes atonement, but she does not aim at reconciling as a married couple. And Jack may be fine with that. He may find that he is unable to love her again and relate to her in that way, but he may welcome and accept her atonement.
- There was no relationship to begin with that can be reconciled. Richards (1988) describes a case in which a stranger drives by and drenches you in mud. The stranger pulls over, gets out, apologizes, and offers to cover your dry cleaning expenses. It seems like the stranger is atoning for what he did, but you and the stranger have no relationship to reconcile.
- Reconciliation is impossible. Suppose you wronged a person who subsequently died. You may make atonement by apologizing to the deceased’s loved ones, by aiming to be a better person, and by making reparation. Reconciliation appears to be a personal relationship of some sort, but one cannot have such a relationship with a dead person (Strabbing 2020).
- There is no rift in the relationship to reconcile because the wrong never had an effect on the relationship. Radzik presents the following case: I maliciously intend to break your favorite vase and indeed attempt to do so when you are not around, so as not to be caught in the act. I throw it to the ground, but it unexpectedly bounces—it turns out to be made of rubber (Radzik 2009: 86). I may atone for this action by being remorseful, replacing the vase carefully, and firmly intending to deal with my anger issues. And yet, since you never found out about my offense, our relationship was unaffected.
Second, supposing this connection holds fast, what sort of reconciliation must one aim toward in atoning? There appear to be at least as many sorts of reconciliation as there are sorts of relationships.
We can begin to answer these questions by saying more about the nature of reconciliation. First, “reconciliation” is ambiguous. There is a sense of the word on which to reconcile is to restore a past relationship (Barth 1953 [1956: 22]). But there is another sense on which reconciliation merely removes a rift or tension that has arisen between two people; this sense does not assume that there was a substantive past relationship between the parties (O’Collins 2007: 12). Since atonement may be offered in the latter situation, atonement may aim at reconciliation in the latter sense.
Even so, both senses presume that in removing the rift between the parties due to the wrongdoing, there is some sort of relationship that is restored (or created) after atonement has been given and received. What could that relationship be given the other cases mentioned above?
Radzik argues that making amends, in her sense, also aims at reconciliation. But since one makes amends when one does what one is morally required to do in response to having wronged someone, the reconciliation that is aimed at must be something that we are morally required to have with people. Radzik calls this “moral reconciliation”, a relationship “wherein the parties regard one another and themselves as equally valuable moral persons” (2009: 81). For this relationship to exist, “the victim will have good reason to give up her resentment, fear, and distrust of the wrongdoer”, (where that good reason is not misleading, I think we should add) and “the wrongdoer will have reestablished his reputation with the victim as a member of good standing in the moral community” (2009: 82).
Moral reconciliation helps make sense of the above cases. Regarding the first case, people may not desire a restoration of a substantive past relationship, e.g., a marriage, but people do want to be regarded as an equally valuable moral person. Jill’s atoning acts are aimed at moral reconciliation (at the least). In the second case the driver aims at moral reconciliation even though there was no substantive prior relationship to restore. The third case is a little trickier. Full moral reconciliation with the deceased seems impossible since the dead can have no reasons and have no sense of the wrongdoer’s reputation. (Assuming there is no afterlife; if there is an afterlife, then full moral reconciliation could be achieved there.) The wrongdoer can, however, still aim at reconciliation by aiming at the closest approximation he can obtain to moral reconciliation—for instance he can (i) produce what would be good reason for the victim to give up her resentment, etc. were the victim alive, and (ii) do what would reestablish his reputation with the victim if the victim were alive. Regarding the fourth case, the offense produces a moral rift even if the victim is not aware of the moral rift, for the offender has in fact wronged the victim. That rift can be repaired simply by the wrongdoer repenting of his action, sincerely recognizing the moral worth of the victim, and engaging in moral reformation. Moral reconciliation will thus occur, even though the victim may never be aware that there was a rift to reconcile.
Atonement does not always aim merely at moral reconciliation (Radzik & Murphy 2015 ; Thurow 2021b). Often, a wrongdoer aims to reconcile a more robust relationship. Unlike in the first case, Jill may instead aim to atone in a way that brings about reconciliation of her marriage with Jack. A person who has wronged his friend may aim to reconcile as friends; a worker who has wronged his employer through negligence, say, may aim to reconcile as a trusted worker.
What is done to atone for a wrongdoing will be shaped by the sort of reconciliation one aims at achieving. Restoring lost trust in a marriage will require considerably more (and things of a different nature) than restoring trust in a workplace relationship. One’s atoning acts should also be responsive to the sort of wrong that was done and how it negatively affected the victim. Restoring trust with a spouse after having an affair will be different than restoring trust with a coworker after having failed to meet at an agreed time.
A wrongdoer may need to morally reconcile not only with the primary victim of her wrongdoing, but with others in her community, such as secondary victims or interested bystanders (Radzik 2009: 135–8). Secondary victims are those who are indirectly harmed or wronged by the action—such as the spouse of someone who is unjustly fired from a job. Interested bystanders are those who learn about the wrong action and have a legitimate interest in having a positive relationship with the wrongdoer—such as a friend who has an interest in being with a morally trustworthy person. Atoning to the primary victim in a publicly visible way can help one to morally reconcile with others in one’s community. Public apologies and acts of contrition have long been used for this end. During late antiquity in Christian Europe, penance for sin routinely included a public-facing component such as penitents sitting separately in Church and engaging in a public ritual of penance. Famously, the Roman Emperor Theodosius was required by Bishop Ambrose to perform public penance for having ordered a massacre of citizens of Thessalonica. The emperor “laid down all the imperial insignia, bewailed his sin in public in the basilica and implored absolution with tears and laments” (Meens 2014: 22).
Forgiveness is intimately tied into atonement. It would appear that forgiveness is necessary for full atonement. Reconciliation of two parties seems to require that the one who is wronged forgive the wrongdoer. If the wronged does not forgive the wrongdoer, the wronged is still holding something against the wrongdoer for the wrong that was done, and thus the two are not reconciled with regard to the wrong. To fully atone would be to fully remove the rift, and thus achieve reconciliation.
This is about the only clear point about how forgiveness relates to atonement. There is a common view that forgiveness is (and only should be) granted after the wrongdoer has done something to make amends. But this common view has been contested by others who think that we may (and sometimes have good reasons to) forgive even if the offender hasn’t atoned. Which view is correct depends upon which theory of forgiveness is correct. (For an excellent survey of theories of forgiveness, see the entry on forgiveness.)
Many defend the common view, arguing that forgiveness should (or maybe even conceptually must only) be done in response to the wrongdoer’s performance of various acts that constitute at least partial atonement. Charles Griswold, developing an approach that has been inspired by Bishop Butler’s seminal discussion of forgiveness and resentment, argues that x forgives y for R iff
- x foreswears revenge against y for R, and
- x appropriately moderates x’s resentment of y due to R, and
- x “commits to work to a frame of mind in which even that resentment is let go” (Griswold 2007: 42).
Condition (iii) implies that the wrongdoer must have done something to warrant the victim’s letting go of resentment; these things will amount to offering atonement. Why?
If moderated resentment is still warranted all things considered, then forgiveness is impossible or premature. Forgiveness does not attempt to get rid of warranted resentment. Rather, it follows from the recognition that the resentment is no longer warranted. And what would provide the warrant can be nothing other than the right reasons. These specify the conditions the offending party should meet to qualify for forgiveness. (Griswold 2007: 43)
These conditions include atoning acts such as repentance, confession, offering a true narrative, and commitment to moral transformation. Swinburne (1989) and Wolterstorff (2011) offer different arguments for the same position.
Other accounts of forgiveness imply that whether a person forgives or ought to forgive is independent of whether the wrongdoer has made any atonement. For example, Garrard and McNaughton say that x forgives y for R iff x releases (or lacks) ill will towards y and x adopts an attitude of at least minimal good will towards y (2010: 90). They argue that, on this view, we can have good reason to forgive someone even if they haven’t repented or made any sort of atonement. For we have reasons of human solidarity to forgive: wrongdoers are still part of the human family and as such we have a stake in their being ushered back into the family in good standing. Forgiveness is a way of inviting them in, although Garrard and McNaughton are careful to add that forgiveness does not entail condoning, forgetting, or excusing the wrongdoer for what they did. Indeed, having good will towards the wrongdoer, on their view, requires having a clear view of what was wrong about the wrongdoer’s action, and for their degree of responsibility. A forgiver may still feel indignant and may still desire that the wrongdoer be punished. In addition, because of our solidarity, we know that we the innocent have often made, and in various circumstances would make, moral mistakes and we would desire to be forgiven. Pettigrove (2012) argues in addition that forgiving like this does not necessarily condone the wrong action, imply a lack of proper self-respect, or have generally bad consequences for the forgiver.
Stump (2018: 80–4) goes a step further, arguing that unilateral and unconditional forgiveness is morally obligatory since love is obligatory, love of x implies a desire for the good of x and a desire for union with x, and withholding forgiveness would work against the good of x and union with x. (Although see J. Rutledge 2022, Swinburne 2019, and Thurow & Strabbing 2020 for replies.) She adds that one can forgive another person without reconciling with them because of obstacles arising from the psychic condition of the wrongdoer or the effects of his wrongdoing.
Biggar (2001), after presenting an insightful survey of literature on forgiveness in the twentieth century, proposes a dual-component view that aims to incorporate aspects of the above kinds of views. One component, which he calls “forgivingness”, is a constellation of attitudes towards the wrongdoer: overcoming resentment and vindictiveness, growth of compassion, and an intention to restore some kind of friendship with the offender. Forgivingness is, or ought to be, unconditional. The other component, which he calls “forgiveness”, is an act wherein the victim declares that he will no longer view the wrongdoer in the light of his misdeed and that their relationship may proceed as before. Forgiveness is conditional upon at least the repentance of the wrongdoer.
On each of the above views, forgiveness is conceptually distinct from reconciliation. However, Strabbing has recently argued for a conceptual tie between forgiveness and reconciliation. On her view,
X’s forgiving Y for W is X’s being open to reconciliation with Y with respect to W, (2020: 533)
where to be open to reconciliation is to have
attitudes and intentions towards the offender that would reconcile them with respect to the offense, if the offender’s attitudes and intentions are what they should be for reconciliation. (2020: 535)
The notion of sacrifice is commonly associated with atonement, no doubt because of the Biblical history of both notions. The book of Leviticus, for instance, describes various ancient Israelite ritual sacrifices, some of which aimed to atone (Milgrom 1991). For instance, if someone (i) does not speak up to testify what he knows in a public case, (ii) touches anything ceremonially unclean, (iii) thoughtlessly takes an oath, or (iv) deceives or cheats his neighbor about something, that person is “guilty and will be held responsible” (Lev 5:17, NIV). Because of this,
as a penalty he must bring to the priest, that is, to the Lord, his guilt offering, a ram from the flock, one without defect and of the proper value. (Lev. 6:6, NIV)
The ram is then ritually slaughtered, its blood is wiped or sprinkled on some parts of the altar, and some of its parts are burned.
In this way the priest will make atonement for him before the Lord, and he will be forgiven for any of these things he did that made him guilty. (Lev. 6:7, NIV)
These sorts of sacrifices can be offered by people as needed throughout the year, although there was an annual ritual—the Day of Atonement, or Yom Kippur—whose purpose was to deal with all the sins of the Israelites committed throughout the year.
These symbolically rich sacrificial rituals were seen to help ancient Israelites expiate and atone for their sins (Klawans 2006). Expiation is plainly an effect of these rituals, which are designed to respond to and remove the guilty status of wrongdoers. But atonement is also plainly a goal. The Tanakh says that God will dwell among the Israelites (Exodus 29:46), but sin can drive away God’s presence and lead God to punish the nation (Lev. 26). Proper observance of the sacrifices is intended to prevent this from happening—thus, maintaining a relationship through the tension caused by sin (Klawans 2006).
Other features of these sacrificial rituals reveal an awareness of the importance of various aspects of atonement—confession, repentance, and intention to morally reform (Thurow 2021a). Some have argued that slaughter of the offering represents what was due to the offerer as a sinner—death, as a punishment for sin (Halbertal 2012). Some of the rituals require restitution to the human victim (Lev. 6:5). Thus the rituals acknowledge that sin or wrongdoing often has two victims—God, and a human—and the wrongdoer ought to atone to both. Lastly, the rituals acknowledge corporate effects of sin and a need for corporate or collective atonement. Interestingly, even though in many places sin is described as a stain on the sinner, the blood from the sacrifice is not applied as a symbolic detergent to the sinner. Rather, it is applied to the temple. The temple is polluted by human sins, and continued such pollution is disastrous for the nation as a whole—not just to the individual sinners responsible for those stains. Sin, or wrongdoing, thus has a negative effect on the community as a whole. The Day of Atonement rituals are explicitly presented as offerings for the sin of Israel as a whole (Milgrom 1991; J. Rutledge 2022; Thurow 2015).
Eventually Jews and Christians abandoned these sacrificial rituals, although both groups maintained a connection between sacrifice and atonement. For Christians, Jesus’s death by crucifixion came to be seen as the ultimate sacrifice to atone for human sin, thus rendering the system of animal sacrifices superfluous. (See Daly 2009 and Moffitt 2022 for recent accounts of Christian use of the notion of sacrifice.) For Jews, Yom Kippur is still today the highest holy day and it maintains its central focus on dealing with human sin. However, Rabbinic Judaism—working with threads from the Tanakh—came to regard various other human activities as sacrificial, expiatory, and atoning, such as prayer, confession, charity, and other kinds of voluntarily endured suffering (Halbertal 2012).
Sacrifice as described above has been seen to play a role in atoning for human sin against God. But there is a sense in which atonement between humans often involves sacrifice—not a sacrifice to the victim, but a sacrifice for the victim. “Sacrifice for” here means, approximately, a difficult or costly loss of something one cares about for the sake of another individual, collective, or cause of value (Halbertal 2012). Many of the ways humans atone to others for their wrongs involve sacrifice in this sense. Repentance can sacrifice of one’s sense of dignity; apologies, one’s reputation; reparation and restitution, one’s time or resources.
“To propitiate” can sometimes mean simply “to expiate” or “to atone”, but often the word implies “to appease” or “to conciliate”. In this latter sense, to propitiate someone for the wrong you have done them is to do something to appease them, to change their attitude towards you in a more positive direction. Propitiation isn’t always required for atonement because, as in the fourth example in section 1.3.1, you can wrong someone without them knowing it. They have no attitudes about your wrong action to change. But of course in many cases a victim will be aware of having been wronged and will thus be angry, upset, and ill at ease with the wrongdoer. In these cases, if one is to atone—to remove the rift that has arisen with a person due to one’s having wronged them, in order to achieve reconciliation—one will have to propitiate one’s victim to at least some degree. For if the victim is in the same negative state towards the wrongdoer in virtue of the wrong action, then the rift remains and the two haven’t been reconciled.
There is a fierce debate in Christian theology and Biblical interpretation regarding whether Jesus’s sacrifice and the Jewish animal sacrifices should be considered propitiations of God’s wrath (Morris 1983; F. Rutledge 2015). However, clearly in a human relationship damaged by wrongdoing, the victim may feel towards the wrongdoer not only anger, but other negative emotions such as resentment, condemnation, revulsion, and hardening of the heart. Propitiation aims to reduce or eliminate these sorts of emotions and replace them with other positive attitudes such as good will, compassion, love, trust, reapproval, benevolence, affection, or esteem.
Since propitiation is an appeal to the victim to change her attitude in a more positive direction, the wrongdoer must acknowledge that the success of his attempt at propitiation and the fate of the relationship is in the hands of the victim. The victim determines when to offer forgiveness and when to reduce her negative attitudes and replace them with positive attitudes. (Of course, one cannot do these things entirely at will.)
This feature of propitiation seems also to be a feature of atonement. Whether an act of atonement is adequate depends at least in part on the victim’s will and desires. Swinburne states,
One consequence of my harming you is just that it is in part up to you whether my guilt is remitted…. The victim has the right, within limits, to judge when the wrongdoer’s atonement suffices. (1989: 87–8)
He argues that this is true because if instead one could remit one’s guilt simply by meeting some objective standard of atonement, then one could wrong another and remove one’s guilt at will.
That would not take seriously the fact that the act is an act by which you are wronged, and in the wiping out of which you ought therefore to have a say. (1989: 87)
Radzik agrees and adds that given in atonement we aim to show and restore proper respect to the victim,
an important way for the atoning wrongdoer to reestablish respect for the victim … is to give the victim a say in what comes next. (2009: 123)
Both agree, however, that there are moral limits to what a victim can demand for atonement.
To offer satisfaction, in the sense that has been connected to atonement since at least the time of the writing of the later books in the Hebrew scriptures, is to pay a debt (Anderson 2009: 44ff). Economic metaphors for atoning and making amends have flourished ever since; evidence of them is seen in various second Temple Jewish texts and early Christian texts, up through the medieval discussions of satisfaction (Anderson 2009; Burns 1975). Forgiveness is also sometimes understood in terms of canceling a debt (Pettigrove 2012: 21ff). How seriously to take the economic metaphor is debated, but broad notions of satisfaction and moral debt can be outlined that stay neutral about the aptness of economic metaphors.
When a person wrongs another person, the wrongdoer incurs a moral debt that is owed to the victim. So long as the moral debt remains unfulfilled, the wrongdoer remains in a state of guilt. This moral debt is distinct from others, such as a debt of gratitude. There’s nothing intrinsically bad about having the latter debt, but there is with the former, which are sometimes said to carry with them a sort of moral mark or stain (Swinburne 1989).
What sort of debt is accrued through wrongdoing? There are various ways of describing this debt, which may produce different concrete views about what one can or should do to pay the debt. Here are two: an obligation to make up for the wrong act (Radzik 2009: 29ff) by erasing as far as possible the wrong and its effects; an obligation to counter the disrespect shown to the victim. However the debt is characterized, it has been thought to entail at least the following: withdrawing the insult to the victim and repairing the injury done to the victim and the community (Burns 1975; J. Murphy 2012a).
One way of defining “satisfaction” is as follows: to offer satisfaction for wrong W is to fulfill one’s moral debt of wrongdoing for W. On this definition, satisfaction is equivalent to making amends since by fulfilling one’s moral debt for W, one does whatever is morally required to respond to having done W. Although this definition certainly falls within the lexical range of the term, the term is often used to indicate a narrower range of things one might due to make amends or atone for wrongdoing, such as reparation, restitution, compensation, or penance. The primary aim of satisfaction, on this narrower definition, is to repair the injury and its harmful effects, although of course by doing so one may also contribute towards withdrawing the insult of the wrong.
2. How to Atone
We have some fairly strong intuitions about what kinds of actions can atone and many of our stories about atonement illustrate the means which will be described in this section (McEwan 2001; Stevenson 2015). But with the definitions above we can go a step further than mere intuition, for we can explain why these various activities atone: they contribute to reconciliation and help fulfill our moral debts by making amends—including the debts to withdraw insult to the victim, and to repair insofar as possible the harms of the wrong to the victim and to society.
Stump (1988) notes that when we atone we aim to deal with two problems: the problem of past sin and the problem of future sin. The former just is the moral wrong that was done, its harmful effects and the relational rifts due to these. The latter is the problem of the future wrong that the wrongdoer remains likely to do. The latter is key to atoning because reconciliation is difficult if the victim fears that the wrongdoer will wrong her again in the same sort of way as before. Furthermore, if part of a wrongdoer’s moral duty is to repair the harms due to the wrong, then the wrongdoer may be required to assuage fear and trepidation about potential future violations.
Although there is some dispute concerning how best to define the notion of apology (N. Smith 2008), many apologies plainly help atone for wrongdoing. Smith presents the notion of a categorical apology, which he takes to be a regulative ideal (N. Smith 2008; 2014). Categorical apologies involve some thirteen features such as accepting blame, recognizing the victim as a moral interlocutor, and reforming one’s behavior. All thirteen features of categorical apology plainly can atone, as they each can help bridge the rift preventing reconciliation, as well as help fulfill moral debts of wrongdoing. Indeed, categorical apology is defined to include almost everything that could go into atoning for a wrong—for Smith, repentance, reparation, accepting punishment, and moral reformation all count as part of apology. But Smith acknowledges that most of our apologies do not include all thirteen features.
How we define apology ultimately is of little significance to the issue of how we can atone. Actions can be carved and catalogued as one pleases, so long as the actions of atoning significance are included somewhere in the catalogue. In this section I will work with the narrower notion of a genuine apology: one genuinely apologizes for an action when one accepts blame for the action, has the standing to accept blame for it, feels sorrow and guilt, regards the victim as a moral interlocutor, communicates the apology to the victim, and intends to reform and offer redress. This narrower notion is fairly well expressed, surprisingly enough, on a sign often found in Jimmy John’s sandwich shops: “proper apologies have three parts: 1. What I did was wrong. 2. I feel badly that I hurt you. 3. How can I make this better?”
By apologizing, the wrongdoer withdraws the insult made to the victim. Their intention to refrain from the wrong action in the future gives the victim at least some reason to trust them. Both aspects of apology can thus reduce the rift that divides the wrongdoer from the victim and bring about reconciliation—at least, moral reconciliation. In addition, the wrongdoer’s feeling of guilt and fear of rejection can be a source of relational rift with the victim. The wrongdoer can’t bring themselves to face the victim. By apologizing the wrongdoer breaks down this barrier to reconciliation as well (Griffiths 2021: 103).
Although apologies may sometimes in themselves suffice to atone and bring about reconciliation—when the offense is small, or when the victim already has good reason to think that the wrongdoer is repentant and that the wrongdoer wants what is best for the victim—often more is required to atone. Apologies can be easy to fake, and there are a variety of locutions that sound like apologies but in fact are not—e.g., expressions of sympathy, and ambiguous apologies (N. Smith 2008: 145–8). Victims will thus reasonably be expected to accept an apology only where there are clear signs that the apology is genuine, such as if the apology is costly (Ohtsubo & Watanabe 2009). This is especially so if the wrongdoer aims to reconcile a thicker relationship with the victim, such as a close friendship or a marriage.
Apology isn’t always necessary for atonement, such as in Radzik’s rubber vase case and Bovens’s case of a doctor who secretly gives his patient a treatment intending to kill the patient, but by chance the treatment instead cures the patient’s disease (Bovens 2008). If the victim is unaware of the wrongdoing and apologizing would only bring grief to the victim and a rupture in the relationship between the offender and victim, and no other benefits, then even if there is a pro tanto moral reason to apologize, that reason is overridden by a moral reason not to inflict harm when there are no benefits to doing so. One can atone in other ways in these circumstances.
One repents of a wrong action when one
- admits that one performed the action in question,
- admits that the action was wrong,
- admits that one bears at least some blame for having performed the action, and
- resolves to amend one’s ways (Swinburne 1989: 82).
The resolution to amend one’s ways includes a resolution to make amends to the victim, and a resolution to not perform similar actions in the future. The latter resolution may require one to repudiate and seek to change aspects of one’s character (J. Murphy 2003). The Greek word that translates as “repentance” is “metanoia”, which means to make a fundamental change of one’s mind or outlook. A repentant person changes her outlook about her past actions for the right reason; you’re not repentant if you decide to amend your ways not because you care at all about being blameworthy for having done something wrong, but because you don’t want to be caught, or you don’t want to be thought of poorly. One repents when one resolves to amend one’s ways because of how one has blameworthily wronged another person.
There is also an emotional component to repentance. Someone who is repentant has remorse and guilt about her wrong action (J. Murphy 2012b). She also experiences sympathy towards her victim (Bovens 2008), sadness at having acted wrongly, and contrition.
Repentance contributes to atonement in various ways. It is a necessary ingredient of a genuine apology. Repentance is a prerequisite for moral and thicker sorts of reconciliation. Moral reconciliation involves entering into a relationship of mutual moral respect and it seems that a wrongdoer does not respect a victim by refraining from repenting. The wrongdoer has an obligation to fix what can be fixed about the wrong action and its effects; one thing that can be fixed is the insult to the victim. By repenting, the wrongdoer begins to withdraw the insult.
Many theological approaches to repentance share the above features, but regard repentance as a more general rejection of sin and embrace of God’s goodness. For example, repentance in both Roman Catholic Christianity and Sufi Islam requires (i)—(iv) above together with emotions of contrition, regret, and sadness towards sin. Both, however, also regard repentance as interior conversion: rejecting living in sin and embracing a new way of life following God (Catechism of the Catholic Church 1431 [126.96.36.199.IV, Other Internet Resources]; Khalil 2018).
2.3 Giving a True Account
To give a true account of a wrong is to accurately describe what happened and to explain the motivations, intents, desires, passions, and thinking behind the wrong action. Ideally, the wrongdoer would come to understand a true and relatively complete account of their wrongdoing and communicate that understanding to the victim, who would then incorporate it into their own understanding of the event. In this ideal situation, the understanding and exchange of a true account of the wrongdoing helps bring about reconciliation. First, for the offender to repent and genuinely apologize, he needs to be aware of the extent of his culpability for the wrong action and this awareness requires something approaching a true account of his action. For similar reasons, an offender’s awareness of a true account of their wrongdoing assists in personal moral reformation and transformation, which can also atone.
Second, victims can experience a variety of negative consequences that result due in part to a lack of awareness of a true account of the wrongdoing (Volf 2006). Victims are often confused about why someone would wrong them in the way they did. This confusion can be intrinsically painful. Worse, victims often feel that they are in some way to blame for the event, or feel shame at having been victimized. Lacking a true account of what happened, victims can also feel greater fear of being victimized again without any good idea of how to prevent it from happening. Receiving a true account of the wrong action from the offender can help heal these negative consequences. “It takes knowing the truth to be set free from the psychic injury caused by wrongdoing” (Volf 2006: 75).
Third, it is difficult enough to know why we ourselves do what we do, but even more difficult to know why someone else does what they do. And when we have been victimized, it can be immensely tempting to reconstruct an account of what happened that demonizes the offender. We can hold offenders more culpable than they deserve. We can fail to sympathize with their personal weaknesses and circumstances which have led them to form poor adaptational strategies (M. Adams 1991), and with common human frailties we share (Garrard & McNaughton 2010). Victims can thus, understandably and often nonculpably, form views of the offender that erect a barrier to reconciliation. By giving a true account, wrongdoers can help break down this barrier to reconciliation, thus atoning for their wrongdoing.
2.4 Moral Reformation and Transformation
As noted above, repentance entails a resolution to amend one’s ways regarding the wrong action in view. This implies more than just resolving to never again do that kind of wrong action to that person in those kinds of circumstances. One must resolve against performing wrong actions of a more general sort. My resolving not to lie to you about using our money to make spontaneous personal purchases is not enough. I must resolve not to lie about how I use money more generally, and I must resolve not to lie to anyone (or maybe anyone who has a significant interest in knowing about my money usage). To carry out this resolution, I must also examine why I am inclined to lie about how I use money and then begin to transform my motivations and how I respond to them. And I must do all of this not just because I do not want to be caught, or to get you off my case, but because I see how lying about how I use money wrongs you and others. In short, repentance requires that I resolve to be morally reformed or transformed.
Since a resolution to reform (as I shall here abbreviate it) is a part of repentance and repentance atones, resolutions to reform contribute to atonement. But both the resolution to reform and the reform itself also atone separate from being a necessary ingredient of repentance. Reform regarding the wrong action in view constitutes moral respect for the victim. It demonstrates that the wrongdoer has taken seriously his wronging of the victim and repudiates that wronging by transforming his life so that he will not (or he is less likely to) wrong the victim or others in this sort of way again. Reform also, for similar reasons, can serve to withdraw the insult of the victim. Reform also enables reconciliation. Part of what blocks reconciliation is the victim’s fear of being wronged again. Since reform atones in these ways, and resolving to reform puts one on the path to reform (and can itself partially withdraw insult and reduce fear of future wrong), resolving to reform also atones.
Experience shows that moral reformation and transformation often requires struggle and time, and we often fall short of the change we desire. Perhaps in part for this reason, in many cases we seem not to require moral transformation in order to reconcile with someone who has wronged us. When the harm isn’t very great, when the threat of future harm from the wrongdoer isn’t very great (or when we can easily be more vigilant to prevent or avoid the harm), and when we know that ordinary human limitations and temptations explain the wrong, in practice we seem content to reconcile even if the wrongdoer hasn’t morally reformed and even may be unlikely to reform. Genuine repentance displayed to us is often sufficient. Coming to repent can itself be a difficult journey for many people; sometimes it may be the best we can hope for from a wrongdoer, and sufficient to reconcile some sort of relationship.
As noted in section 1.3.5, wrongdoers accrue a moral debt to their victim to, at the least, withdraw the insult conveyed by, and repair the harmful effects of, their wrong. Sometimes the harm is so minor—such as the harm resulting from forgetting to keep one’s promise to one’s spouse to pick up milk at the store—that no reparation is required beyond repentance and an apology. But, often and tragically, wrong actions result in substantial harms. In those cases, it seems that atonement and making amends require that wrongdoers fulfill their moral debts to repair the harm.
The terms “reparation”, “restitution”, “recompense”, and “satisfaction” all have slightly different shades of meaning (Spelman 2002). Satisfaction, as defined above, is the most general term; “reparation” in everyday speech is quite close in meaning. Recompense and restitution are more specific ways of repairing through monetary compensation or an exchange of equivalent value to the harm.
Although there are different shades of meaning to the four notions, they are unified by sharing a goal that each aims to achieve: undoing the harmful effects of the wrong (Zolkos 2020). Harms cannot literally be completely undone, even in cases of minor wrongs and harms. I may replace your window I have carelessly broken with a new window, but there still was a time when your window was broken during which you were angry and resentful. Those latter events cannot be undone. Reparation, restitution, etc. aim at approximating an undoing of the harmful effects.
The word “penance” is most familiar today from the Roman Catholic sacrament of penance. Used to refer to the sacrament in its entirety, it refers to a process involving contrition for sin, confession, satisfaction, and absolution. The word is often used more narrowly to describe the third step of that process, satisfaction (Barton 1961). However, although penance in this narrower sense may sometimes include the sorts of things that are described in section 2.5, those things are done with a different purpose qua penance.
In Roman Catholicism, penance—the sacrament—is a sort of medicine for the soul (John Paul II 1984: 31). Each part of the sacrament is medicinal, including satisfaction—or penance, narrowly construed (Aquinas ST supp 12.3). Penance, in the narrow sense, in part can involve reparation since making reparation is part of how we make amends and atone, and thus remove guilt for our sin. But penance is also medicinal in another way: it is supposed to express a desire for and help bring about moral and spiritual transformation. Consequently, many penances –such as saying certain prayers, or reading certain spiritual texts, or giving alms—do not offer reparation to the human victim of one’s sin (they may amount to reparation to God). Penance, in the narrower sense, thus denotes a certain class of acts that express a desire for and aid in bringing about what was discussed in section 2.4—moral transformation—as well as spiritual transformation.
Penance, in the narrower sense, can thus also have a secular meaning if the notion is narrowed even further: x does penance for wrong R if and only if x does something to express a desire for and to help produce moral transformation in response to having done R. Criminals may in this sense do penance for their crimes by, say, doing community service or by committing themselves to helping other people to avoid committing similar sorts of crimes.
Richard Swinburne proposes a different secular notion of penance: penance is something a wrongdoer provides to his victim that (i) is offered in addition to reparation or compensation, and (ii) is offered as a way of disowning the wrong action by indicating his appreciation for the victim, his awareness of the seriousness of the wrong, and his sorrow at having wronged the victim (Swinburne 1989: 83–84). Penance, in this sense, is significant as a performative act of disowning. Apologies can be insincere or routine, and reparation can be done without a spirit of contrition and sorrow. Penance, in Swinburne’s sense, helps the wrongdoer to adequately communicate to his victim contrition, sorrow, and appreciation.
The relationship between punishment and atonement has been highly disputed. Part of the dispute results from divergent understandings of punishment. For instance, Anselm says that justice requires that humans who sin against God must either repay the honor they have taken from God (i.e., offer satisfaction), or suffer punishment (Anselm Cur Deus Homo, CDH hereafter, 13). But punishment, in this case, would result in eternal damnation and God doesn’t want that end for his creatures. Satisfaction thus provides a way for atonement, but punishment does not. Aquinas, however, seems to think that sin must be atoned through penal compensation and acts of penance and reparation count as penal because they are imposed for sin and are involuntary in themselves, although people voluntarily accept them in the circumstances when they desire to atone (see ST I-II.87.6). Satisfactions are thus punishments, on this view, and thus at least some punishments atone.
According to contemporary western views of punishment, for an act to count as punishment it must
- impose some cost or hardship (which could amount to the loss of an opportunity or privilege),
- be done intentionally by the punisher,
- be imposed in response to what is believed to be a wrong act,
- be imposed as a way of expressing condemnation or censure of the act, and
- be performed by a recognized authority (see the entry on punishment).
In this sense, most acts of penance and reparation—unless imposed by a recognized authority—will not amount to punishment. Typical punishments, on this notion, include: fines, prison sentences, the death penalty, court ordered community service, and time-outs declared by parents.
Can punishments, understood in this sense, atone? Once again, punishments that are impositions of reparation, penance, and apology can atone, for all the same reasons that they can atone when done on their own, independently of being imposed as punishment. However, these actions appear to have less value as acts of atonement when undertaken merely as punishment than when undertaken voluntarily from the heart. When an action is undertaken merely as punishment, it does not (or does not clearly convey) any repentance, contrition, or remorse—unlike (typically) when it is undertaken voluntarily independent of an imposition of punishment. Thus, an essential ingredient of atonement for moral reconciliation is absent in the former case. Even worse, acts undertaken merely as punishment can hinder atonement by producing resentment, anger, and other attitudes that hinder reconciliation.
What about punishments such as jail time, the death penalty, and other forms of enforced suffering such as lashings—can these punishments atone? Rashdall (1907; 1920) and others have argued that these practices, typically justified on retributive grounds, do not atone as they do no good to the wrongdoer or the victim (aside from protection from future harm), and do nothing to bring about any sort of reconciliation between the wrongdoer and victim. Indeed, for the reasons mentioned above, punishment can hinder reconciliation.
Defenders of certain retributivist theories of punishment, such as what Craig (2020: 178) calls positive retributivism, can resist Rashdall’s argument as follows: wrongdoers morally should be punished, and so to make amends they must be punished, and since atoning requires making amends, being punished atones. This view faces a challenge: how can punishment be a way of atoning if punishment doesn’t even aim at reconciliation? How does the wrongdoer being imprisoned (for example) aim for any sort of reconciliation between the wrongdoer and the victim?
Garvey (1999), drawing on expressivist theories of punishment, offers one answer to this question. A wrong action both harms and wrongs the victim.
The harm of a crime is the material loss it causes…the wrong of a crime is the message of disrespect or dishonor it conveys. (Garvey 1999: 1821)
Punishment is our conventional means to, as a society, counter this message. The counter-message of punishment can thus bring about moral reconciliation by removing or repudiating the insult delivered by the wrong action. Moral reconciliation between the victim and wrongdoer requires more than that society send a counter-message; it requires that the wrongdoer send the counter-message. By voluntarily submitting to just punishment, the wrongdoer makes the public message sent by punishment his own.
This defense of the atoning value of punishment, however, seems to imply that punishment is not absolutely necessary for making atonement since there are many other ways a wrongdoer could clearly communicate a repudiation of the insult delivered by their wrong action. Indeed, apology, reparation, and acts of moral improvement can—perhaps even more clearly—communicate a repudiation of the insult (Radzik 2009: 44). However, in some cases it may be conditionally necessary to be punished in order to atone—for instance, if there is a clearly established set of punishments that are taken to be the way people should express repudiation of their wrong actions. In these cases, refraining from accepting a just punishment due to you would communicate a lack of repudiation.
2.8 Third Party Assistance
The wrongdoer will have to do at least some of the atoning work. Atonement aims at moral reconciliation at the very least, which requires a renewed respect for the victim from the wrongdoer. This renewed respect requires at least repentance and perhaps make some efforts at moral transformation. However, it seems that people other than the wrongdoer can assist with atonement. Indeed, according to Christianity, Christ has made atonement for all human sin even though Christ himself is completely innocent of sin.
There is a difference between helping another person to atone, and atoning for another person. The former is plainly possible. A wrongdoer’s friend could help them to atone by, for example, encouraging them to repent, helping them construct a true account of the wrong action, discussing with them ways to apologize, driving them to a meeting with the victim so that the wrongdoer can apologize. The latter also seems possible. Indeed, an entire religious tradition—Christianity—is predicated on its possibility. Aquinas, following similar statements by Anselm, writes,
since those who differ as to the debt of punishment may be one in will by the union of love, it happens that one who has not sinned bears willingly the punishment for another, just as even in human affairs we see men take the debts of another upon themselves. (ST I-II.87.7)
The sort of punishment that others can bear for us is what he calls “satisfactory punishment”, which amounts to what we above called reparation imposed as punishment. Thus, a wrongdoer’s friend could pay a fine, or replace a damaged or lost item, or perform some other act of service that is owed to the victim.
Can third parties atone for a wrongdoer by acting as a substitute for punishment in the narrower sense described in section 2.7? D. Lewis (1997) argues that we are of two minds about penal substitution. He observes, following a long line of thinkers stretching back at least to Socinus in the sixteenth century CE, that we do not allow penal substitution amongst humans for punishments such as imprisonment, the death penalty, and lashings. If someone were to offer themselves in place of their brother, say, on the electric chair, “the offer would strike the authorities as senseless, and they would decline it out of hand” (D. Lewis 1997: 129). However, Lewis also observes that we are of two minds because we also seem to have no problem with third parties paying penal fines on behalf of wrongdoers.
M. Murphy (2009) and Quinn (2004) observe that we are sometimes uncomfortable with penal fines being paid by a third party. Murphy argues, further—assuming an expressivist view of punishment—that penal substitution is incoherent because the putative punishment undergone by the third party does not express any condemnation of the third party. However, he thinks that vicarious punishment is possible and can be justly performed. Vicarious punishment occurs when
A deserves to be punished; B undergoes hard treatment, which hard treatment constitutes A’s being punished; and so A no longer deserves to be punished. (M. Murphy 2009: 260)
Hill and Jedwab (2015) object that Murphy begs the question by assuming that the recipient of punishment must be the object of condemnation. They suggest there are cases where this seems false, such as when a teacher punishes everyone in a class for the actions of a few students, or when a sergeant imposes suffering on all the soldiers in a squad because of the actions of just a few members. Thurow (2015) agrees that these can be cases of penal substitution, but he explains how penal substitution is conceptually and morally possible by understanding the third party as acting for a collective entity of which they are a member, where the collective is guilty of wrongdoing.
Craig (2020) rejects Murphy’s argument on the grounds that there are cases of punishment that do not express condemnation, e.g., punishment for crimes of strict liability such as marijuana possession. (See section 4.3 for further discussion of penal substitution.)
3. Human–Divine Atonement
Atonement is deeply important for religions such as Judaism and, especially, Christianity. (See Cornille 2021 for a comparison of these with other religious approaches to atonement.) In this and the following sections we will focus on the Christian notion of God and what atonement might look like in a Christian context.
Just as humans can wrong each other, so can they wrong God. Atoning to God can differ from atoning to a fellow human because the victim, the nature of the wrongdoing, and the kind of relationship that one aims to or should aim to reconcile all differ. First, God’s nature may affect the seriousness of wrongs against him. Anselm and many others in the medieval Christian theological tradition, for instance, hold that sinning against God is infinitely worse than wronging a fellow human being because God is perfectly, infinitely good whereas fellow humans are not (CDH II.14; see also Aquinas ST I-II.87.3–4).
Second, how God is wronged differs in some ways from how humans are wronged. Wronging God disrespects and insults him and wronging someone is always “in itself objectively harmful” (Cross 2001: 401). However, God is harmed by sin differently than humans are harmed by wrongdoing. God’s safety or existence is never threatened. God cannot be physically or emotionally injured in his divine nature. But God can be harmed in other ways: his desire that humans love and obey him can be frustrated, his plans for humanity can be frustrated (Anselm CDH I.23), and he is indirectly harmed by the harm done to other things he loves (Hick 1993 [2005: 123]). The latter harm implies that atoning to God will require atoning to the human victims of one’s wrongdoing (Thurow 2017a).
Third, the shape of atonement to God for human sin depends on the kind of reconciled relationship humans want or should want to have with God, or that God wants to have with them—especially important if, as Christians believe, God plays a crucial role in helping humans atone (Thurow 2021b). This relationship has been depicted many different ways: as a certain sort of union of love (John 17:20ff; Stump 2018), a familial relationship—being brothers and sisters of Christ, with God as father (Hebrews 2:10ff), friendship with God (John 15:12ff; Aquinas ST II-II.23.1), fellowship with God (1Cor. 1:9; Taylor 1941), covenantal love (Deut. 7:9–10; Levenson 2016), all followers of God being unified in one body, with Christ as the head (Ephesians 4:1ff; De Lubac 1947 ), and deification/theosis/renewing the image of God in humanity (2Cor. 3:18; Athanasius On the Incarnation). These are each more robust relationships than merely moral reconciliation.
Unsurprisingly, there are several different accounts of how humans can and should atone to God for human sin. In the next two sections we will survey several different theories of the Christian doctrine of atonement. Each theory tends to emphasize one or more of the ways of atonement described in section 2 in their accounts of how Christ atones for human sin. Thus the theories implicitly grant that atoning to God resembles to some degree atoning to humans—although the nature of God, the severity of human sin, the weakness of humans, and other contextual factors are taken to imply that atoning to God will in practice and detail look different than atoning to humans (Thurow 2021a).
For a summary of work on the issue of how the Christian doctrine of atonement might help make sense of moral phenomena, see the appendix, Atonement, God, and Morality (LINK).
4. Classical Theories of the Doctrine of Atonement
Although the doctrine of the atonement is central to Christianity, there has been no widely accepted account of how Christ atones for human sin. The Nicene Creed—an ecumenical creed declared at the Council of Nicea in 325 CE—asserts that
Jesus Christ…for our salvation came down and became flesh, and was made man, suffered, and rose again on the third day. (Denzinger 2012: 51)
This brief statement asserts that Christ atones for human sin, but neither Nicea nor any other ecumenical creed has given an account of how Christ atones for human sin.
Every Christian wants their view of atonement to do justice to the Christian scriptures, but doing so is challenging. The New Testament uses a diverse array of language to describe Christ’s atonement; weaving this language into a coherent account presents one challenge (Letham 1993; Grensted 1920; O’Collins 2007). Another challenge comes from the Jewish background. The New Testament says that Christ both fulfills God’s law in the Old Testament and is a sacrifice that deals once and for all with the problem of human sin. But there is dispute over how to understand both these Old Testament notions and how the New Testament is using them (Finlan 2020 [Other Internet Resources]).
Philosophical assumptions present another challenge to developing an account of the doctrine of atonement. The notions of God’s love, justice, and forgiveness play a key role in understanding atonement. Although scriptural interpretation helps to interpret those notions, theologians also bring their own philosophical assumptions about these notions to their accounts. Intuitions about love and justice, for example, have both motivated some theories, and provided material for challenging other theories.
In this section we briefly survey some of the most prominent historical accounts of the doctrine of the atonement. Various schemes have been used to categorize accounts. Aulén (1930 ) famously divides them into three categories: Christus Victor, forensic, and subjective or exemplarist. Others distinguish between objective and subjective theories, or God-ward and man-ward theories (MacKinnon 1966; Grensted 1920; Fiddes 1989; Thurow 2021a). Another way to categorize accounts would be according to which of the ways of atoning (see section 2 above) are emphasized in the explanation of what Christ does to atone for human sin.
These theories share some common assumptions. First, without Christ’s atoning work, humans could not be saved from their state of sin (1Cor. 15: 3–4, 17). Second, there is an anti-Pelagian assumption: humans can do nothing of their own power to merit salvation, and thus they can do nothing of their own power to atone for sin (O’Collins 2007: 64ff). Third, although Christ atones for human sin, to take advantage of Christ’s atoning work, humans must themselves repent of their sins (1John 1:7–2:2). Thus, humans contribute something to atonement for their sins, although even here God’s grace is needed for humans to fully repent. Fourth, atonement for human sin must either involve or entail, in normal circumstances, that humans who have accepted the atoning work of Christ will be morally transformed. As Turner puts it,
even the most rigidly objective doctrine of the Cross must leave room for the Imitatio Christi [i.e., that humans should imitate Christ] at least as a corollary or a consequent. (1952 [2004: 117])
Fifth, although aspects of many different parts of Christ’s life may atone, his death on the cross plays an important and distinctive role in atonement (Pelikan 1978: 131ff; Thurow 2021a). Some of these assumptions function more like norms or desiderata; indeed, some accounts are criticized on the ground that they do not adequately respect these norms.
For other useful recent surveys of accounts of the Christian doctrine of atonement, see Beilby & Eddy 2006; Crisp 2020a; J. Johnson 2016; Pugh 2014; Schmiechen 2005. Grensted 1920 is a classic history of the doctrine—readable and still useful. F. Rutledge 2015 contains a deep, but accessible discussion of many of the elements of accounts of atonement. These surveys touch on classic theories we are unable to discuss here such as Grotius’s governmental theory and Campbell’s vicarious penitence theory.
4.1 The Ransom Theory
The ransom theory was widespread in the first few centuries of Christianity. Versions of it can be found in the Latin (Augustine, On the Trinity, books IV and XIII), Greek (Gregory of Nyssa, An Address on Religious Instruction), and Syriac (Narsai, “Homily for the Great Sunday of the Resurrection”) Church fathers. It is an instance of a broader family of views: Christus Victor. Gregory Boyd, a defender of a Christus Victor account, says that the “essence” of the view is that God breaks
into human history to destroy the power of sin and rescu[e] us from the cosmic powers that keep us in bondage to sin. (2006: 29)
Views differ over how to depict the cosmic powers, the nature of human bondage to them, and the mechanism by which God frees humans from bondage through the work of Christ. The ransom account fills in these details in a distinctive and memorable way, although today it is rarely defended (for a notable exception, see Lombardo 2013).
The ransom view is built on a drama between God, Satan and humans. Humans sin, and as a result fall under the power of Satan, who in his role as accuser rightly subjects humans to death. God, in his love, does not desire humans to endure eternal death, but it would be unjust for God to simply remove us from Satan’s power as he rightly condemns us to death. To solve this problem, God sends Christ—the son of God, the second person of the Trinity—who has both a human and divine nature. Christ is not guilty of sin, but Satan brings about his death anyway, which then functions as a ransom: Satan owes God for this injustice and God, in return, frees humans from Satan’s power.
Stated as baldly as this, the ransom theory faces several objections. First, Anselm objects that God has the right and power to simply remove humans from Satan’s power; it would be better to do that than to send God the Son to die unjustly (CDH I.6). Second, Anselm argues that Satan has no right to treat humans as he does. All are subject to God’s authority and Satan would not be wronged if God removed humans from his influence (CDH I.7). However, it should be noted that there are ransom accounts that do not assume that Satan has rights over humans—for instance, Irenaeus holds that God submits to what Satan desires not because Satan has a right to a ransom, but because it is more fitting for God to act through persuasion than force (AH V.1.1).
Third, the ransom theory treats humans like mostly innocent and hapless beings who have been tricked and enslaved by a foreign power (Ray 1998). Although this idea is present in the New Testament, it isn’t clearly connected to atonement, which concerns a torn relationship due to sin.
The ransom theory isn’t typically stated so baldly, however. Other motifs are used in concert with the notion of ransom, and some of these motifs can help address some of the above objections (although the motifs each raise their own problems as well). In the next section we survey some of these motifs, as they are in principle separable from the ransom theory, and have been used as elements of other accounts of atonement.
4.2 Three Motifs
4.2.1 The Recapitulation Motif
Irenaeus, an early Church father, is famous for saying that Christ’s entire life and death recapitulate what Adam has done to spread sin in humanity. Adam is not just an individual, but a representative for humanity who has set humanity on the course of sin. Christ is viewed as the new Adam, who reverses what Adam did for humanity. Recapitulation aims at restoring humanity to how it was meant to be. It does this by summing up in Christ’s life the sort of obstacles humans have faced, but reversing what humanity, following Adam, has done in the face of those obstacles (Turner 1952). Where humanity sinned and was disobedient, Christ was sinless and obedient. Irenaeus uses this theme to explain in granular detail some of the specific events of Christ’s life. For instance, because Adam committed the first sin in regard to a tree, Christ needs to finally defeat sin in obedience in regard to a tree—i.e., by hanging on the cross (AH V.16.2).
Recapitulation, if seen as a requirement for how sin must be defeated, provides an additional tool to use to explain why Christ’s life took the particular shape it did. Of course, the main question it faces is this: why should recapitulation provide strictures as to how sin is defeated? (Rashdall 1920: 233ff) One answer is that there is a certain sort of beauty to the structure (McNall 2019: 34). Another is that if Christ is to operate as a representative for humanity in combatting evil, he should in his actions sum up the full range of humanity’s experience with evil and counteract it (McNall 2019: 40).
4.2.2 The Divinization/Healing Motif
Many of the early Greek Church fathers—including Gregory of Nazianzus, Gregory of Nyssa, and Athanasius—emphasize this motif (although it is also found in the Latin tradition). Athanasius states it simply: “He [i.e., Christ, the word of God]…assumed humanity that we might become God” (On the Incarnation [1993: 93]). God the Son assumes a human nature to divinize it—to restore the image of God in humanity that has been tarnished by sin and to heal our nature that had become sick and subject to corruption. Humans cannot cure themselves of the problem with their nature, and so the cure must come from a divine source that unites with their human nature, “for a sick man cannot be healed unless the ailing part of him in particular receives the cure” (Gregory of Nyssa An Address [1954: 305]). The cure includes saving humans from death, which Christ accomplishes through his own death (Myers 2015).
This motif is used to explain why God became incarnate, and it implies that all of Christ’s life plays some role in healing human nature. And since healing human nature is needed for reconciliation with God, and thus for atonement, mere repentance is not sufficient (Athanasius On the Incarnation [1993: 33]) for atonement.
The main question for this motif is: how does the incarnation of the Son of God bring about divinization/healing of humans? The usual answer appeals to the solidarity of humankind together with the Son of God’s ability, like Adam, to affect all of humanity through his actions (De Lubac 1947 ; Mersch 1933/1938 ). All of humanity exists in a union of sorts, constituting “a single living organism” (Gregory of Nyssa An Address [1954: 310]). By uniting himself with this organism, God the Son—who becomes the Head of humanity—can convey his renewed human nature to other humans in the organism, thus healing them.
4.2.3 Vicarious Substitute/Representative Motif
This motif, rooted in the Christian scriptures, is common throughout the history of Christian thought (Gathercole 2015; Bynum 2004). This motif is often combined with seeing Christ’s atoning work—especially his death—as a sacrifice. Sometimes Christ’s atoning work is understood as substitutionary: he does it instead of those who ought to have done it (or something equivalent), releasing them of any obligation to do it. Athanasius, for example, says that humans have a debt that needs to be paid due to sin—a debt of death—and Christ becomes “in dying a sufficient exchange for all” (On the Incarnation [1993: 35]). Christ’s atoning work is also sometimes regarded as representative: he represents humans, and so what he does to atone counts as what we humans need to do to atone. The divinization/healing motif is often coupled with seeing Christ as a representative.
The main challenge for this motif is to explain how Christ is a substitute or a representative and, as such, how his atoning work can remove the need or duty for non-divine humans to atone for their sin. Each theory that incorporates this motif—and most theories do, one way or another—replies to this challenge differently.
4.3 Anselm’s Satisfaction Theory
Anselm’s satisfaction theory in Curs Deus Homo (abbr. CDH as noted above) is the most influential account of the Christian doctrine of atonement. Nearly everything written since defines itself as a defense, development, or rejection of (and alternative to) Anselm’s theory.
Anselm’s argument in CDH moves through four steps (Thurow 2017b: 433).
- Step 1:
- In order to be saved, humans must offer satisfaction to God for what they have taken from God in sinning against him.
- Step 2:
- Only God incarnated as a human descendant of Adam will be able to offer adequate satisfaction for human sin.
- Step 3:
- At least some humans will be saved.
- Step 4:
- By dying in service of God, God incarnate provides an adequate and most fitting satisfaction for human sin.
Steps 1, 2, and 4 give us the heart of Anselm’s theory of atonement.
Step 1 is supported as follows (see CDH I.10–14,19,22,24). Humans have sinned and sin dishonors God. A just God cannot tolerate the injustice of dishonor, and so sinners must either offer satisfaction that adequately compensates for the dishonor done to God, or suffer punishment. But the punishment due for sin against God is eternal death. Thus, if humans are to be saved from eternal death, they must instead offer adequate satisfaction.
In support of step 2, Anselm argues (in short) that humans are so mired in sin, and the disvalue of sin is so great because of God’s nature, that no non-divine human can offer adequate satisfaction. However, it is “necessary that the person paying recompense should be identical with the sinner, or a member of the same race” (CDH II.8 [1998: 321]). God—being divine, morally perfect, and having no debt of sin—could offer adequate satisfaction. Thus, adequate satisfaction can only be offered by a human descendant of Adam who is also God—i.e., God incarnate.
For step 4, Anselm argues that whatever God incarnate does to satisfy for human sin must be supererogatory. Living a perfect life is required of all, including Christ. But dying in service of God is supererogatory and, because of the value of God himself, has far greater value than does the debt of human sin (CDH II.10–11, 14–15). Furthermore, this satisfaction is fitting in other ways: it involves pain (CDH II.11), which counters the pleasure of sin, it decisively conquers Satan (CDH I.22–23), and it is a better example of service to God than one that does not involve his death (CDH II.18). Anselm here weaves in elements of recapitulation, ransom, and moral influence views. Since God incarnate performed a great act of supererogation for God the Father, he is owed compensation. God incarnate desires the merit of his supererogatory act be used as satisfaction for human sin.
Anselm’s satisfaction theory has been criticized on several grounds. Some criticisms conflate the satisfaction theory with penal substitution and reject both for problems leveled chiefly at penal substitution (Gorringe 1996, for example). However, Anselm’s theory is notable for saying that God precisely does not punish humans for their sin. Rather, punishment is avoided by Christ’s satisfaction for human sin.
Many object that Anselm’s notion of honor is at heart a feudal notion, both foreign to the Biblical context and not one that we should attribute to God (see Whidden 2011 for examples). Others have contested this charge, arguing that Anselm’s notion of satisfaction has far older roots not connected with feudalism (Anderson 2009; Crisp 2020a: 71; Mansini 1987; Whidden 2011) and that it fits into his broader metaphysical notion of rectitude—things being as they should, as rightly ordered, or as morally ordered by God (R. Campbell 1998; McGrath 1981).
The theologian Faustus Socinus is famous for leveling a series of objections against objective theories of the atonement (Grensted 1920). Two of those objections target satisfaction views specifically. First, if satisfaction is made for sin, then God does not pardon or forgive. But scripture plainly asserts that God forgives humans for sin, thus the satisfaction view must be false. This objection, however, depends upon the debt-canceling view of forgiveness, which has been contested (Pettigrove 2012) and conflicts with other views of forgiveness described in section 1.3.2. Second, Socinus argues that Anselm’s allowance of someone of the same race to make satisfaction for human sin is unmotivated and contrary to our moral standards—the sinner and the sinner alone should pay the price. However, given that for Anselm the “price” seems to be reparative, people other than the sinner can help atone by helping repair its harmful effects (Purtill 1990).
Scotus objects to Anselm’s calculation of the infinite debt resulting from sin against God. He argues that sin produces a finite debt arising from loving or pursuing a finite thing improperly. Humans can perform supererogatory acts, which they can use as satisfaction to pay this finite debt (see Burns 1975).
Cross (2001) argues that sin against God, when it does not have other harmful consequences, is a deprivation of service and one only need genuinely apologize and repent to atone in such cases. One must repair harmful consequences to humans, but beyond that no further reparation is owed to God.
Stump (2018) objects that Anselm (and many other views) regards God’s forgiveness as conditional upon and responsive to Christ’s satisfaction for human sin. This, she claims, is contrary to God’s love, which entails unconditional and unilateral forgiveness. Some have objected to Stump’s view of God’s love and forgiveness (Craig 2019; J. Rutledge 2022; Swinburne 2019; Thurow & Strabbing 2020; Warmke 2019). Thurow and Strabbing (2020) argue that Anselm’s notion of forgiveness is different from Stump’s and, in any case, Anselm is more concerned to argue that reconciliation is conditional upon satisfaction.
Lombardo (2013) objects that Anselm is committed to saying that God wills Christ’s death and the moral evil that causes his death, neither of which a good God would do. Anselm tries to dodge this concern in CDH, however Lombardo argues that his attempts all fail; they either render his view unable to explain why God became human or result in a tension within the Trinity.
Lastly, many have criticized Anselm’s view for not accounting for how humans are to respond to and adopt Christ’s atoning work for themselves (e.g., Grensted 1920; Crisp 2020a). However, this lacuna may be due to the narrow goal of the CDH; Anselm elsewhere shows deep sensitivity to the importance of human repentance and faith in becoming reconciled to God (Thurow & Strabbing 2020).
Contemporary defenses of Anselm’s view, or modified satisfactions views, can be found in Anderson 2009; Aspenson 1990; Farris & Hamilton 2018; Rogers 2001; Shannon 2009; Sonderegger 2017 and perhaps most prominently in the work of Richard Swinburne, which will be discussed in section 5.2.
4.4 Penal Substitution
Penal substitution has been defended by many in the Reformed and more broadly evangelical tradition. It has strong roots in Luther and Calvin; there has been considerable debate about whether there are earlier precursors. On this view Christ, instead of paying satisfaction for human sin, suffers punishment on behalf of humans for human sin. God’s justice is thus satisfied, enabling God and humans to be reconciled (Schreiner 2006a).
William Lane Craig, however, defines the view more broadly
as the doctrine that God inflicted upon Christ the suffering that we deserved as the punishment for our sins, as a result of which we no longer deserve punishment. (2020: 147)
On this definition one could hold that Christ was not punished; he merely experienced sufferings that would have constituted punishment if we mere humans had endured them. Somehow, though, in virtue of his enduring these sufferings, “we no longer deserve punishment”. How could that be? One option is to say that we mere humans are punished through Christ enduring these sufferings. M. Murphy (2009) calls this a “vicarious punishment” view, which he distinguishes from penal substitution. A second option is to say that the debt of punishment is a collective debt humanity owes to God and that Christ, through his death, pays it on behalf of the human community. Humanity is punished, but Christ is not, on this view (Thurow 2015). A third option is to say that nobody is punished. Hard treatment can be endured by an innocent third party—and this isn’t regarded as punishment of the third party or anyone else—in virtue of which the guilty party’s debt of punishment is canceled (Quinn 1994: 298). We can call this the “penal cancellation” view.
Advocates of penal substitution tend to defend it on three grounds. First, they argue that a proper interpretation of scripture demands a penal substitutionary view (see, e.g., Craig 2020; S. Jeffrey et al. (2007); Schreiner 2006a; Stott 1986). This claim has been widely contested (see, e.g., Belousek-Snyder 2011; Eberhart 2011). Second, they accept something like what Purtill (1990) calls “strict retributionism”—the demands of justice require that proper punishment be delivered—alongside the idea that if mere humans received this justice they would be separated from God forever in eternal damnation. Strict retributionism has also been widely contested (see, e.g., Purtill 1990). Third, some (Porter 2002; 2004) reject strict retributionism in favor of what we might call “penal goodness”—it is good for sinners to be punished, even if they have repented, apologized, and made reparation, as it sends a message about the seriousness of sin. Although God’s justice does not require that he punish sinners, because of this good aspect of punishment, he does punish.
Penal substitution faces a host of objections. Some of the objections to satisfaction theory also target penal substitution. Others specifically target penal substitution; three have been particularly influential.
One objection is that penal substitution is incoherent because punishment necessarily expresses condemnation of the person punished, but Christ surely is not condemned when he suffers and dies on the cross. Section 2.8 above discusses this objection and some replies. Here one further reply should be mentioned. Some defenders of penal substitution, such as the Reformed theologian Turretin, believe that human sins are imputed to Christ—that is, Christ is treated legally as if he had sinned, or human guilt for sin is transferred or replicated in Christ. If sins are imputed to Christ, then Christ may well be condemned for sin since he then would at least bear guilt for human sin (Craig 2020: 161). Imputation has been objected to on the grounds that there is no area of morality where imputation seems possible (M. Murphy 2009; Crisp 2020a. Craig replies that God, as the ultimate lawgiver, has sole authority to impute sins and so it isn’t surprising we don’t accept it in other areas of morality or law. He also finds analogies to imputation in our law from legal fictions (e.g., treating a ship as a person) and vicarious liability (e.g., holding employers liable for acts done by employees in their role as employees).
A second objection is that, on the penal substitution view, justice isn’t done because the full punishment isn’t paid by the substitute. The full punishment due for sin, according to penal substitution, is eternal separation from God. However, Christ plainly does not suffer eternal separation from God.
One reply is that during and while dead, Christ endures enough suffering to match the suffering of those eternally separated from God (Craig 2020: 209). However, the punishment for sin isn’t just the suffering—it’s the eternal separation. No amount of suffering matches eternal separation (Stump 2018: 78). A second reply is that God, in his divine authority, may accept a lesser punishment in place of full punishment (Turretin 1978).
The third objection is perhaps the most influential: penal substitution of the sort supposedly involved in the atonement is immoral. Perhaps an innocent person paying a guilty person’s penal fine is morally acceptable, but punishment that involves hard treatment such as the death penalty, imprisonment, and lashings cannot be justly leveled upon an innocent, even willing, third party. We do not have the hint of an intuition that it would be just, say, for an innocent mother to willingly take on the death penalty due her son for murder.
One reply is that God in his authority—in virtue of divine command theory—can accept what he will to fulfill justice. If he chooses to accept a substitute, then that is just (Craig 2020: 177). The second reply is that, although penal substitution is rarely justified, there are plausible conditions in which it would be justified and in the case of human sin and Christ being God incarnate, those conditions are met (Strabbing 2016).
4.5 Moral Influence
Moral influence views say that Christ atones for human sin by influencing humans to live a morally good life. In effect, these views emphasize the moral transformation aspect of atonement. This view is often attributed to the twelfth century theologian Abelard. Contemporary scholarship has tended to see Abelard’s view as more sophisticated (Quinn 1993; Weingart 1970), although some still argue that Abelard is best understood as embracing a moral influence theory (Pugh 2014). Many theologians of the German Aufklärung endorsed moral influence views (McGrath 1985), as did Socinus (1668), Kant (1793 ), Rashdall (1920) and, more recently, Hick (1993 ).
Moral influence views differ regarding the mechanism by which humans are influenced to live morally. The moral exemplar view says that Christ is an example of a morally excellent life. The mechanism of influence is inspiration—Christ’s example inspires us to greater moral heights. This view has been repeatedly criticized for (i) downplaying the fact that humans have sinned and thus need to be reconciled to God, not just inspired to live better (McGrath 1985), and (ii) offering too thin a mechanism (Crisp 2020b). To be a model for inspiration does not make us righteous and does not overcome the forces preventing us from being righteous. To put it another way, on the moral exemplar view Christ does not atone for humans, but at most he motivates humans to atone.
More sophisticated moral influence views work around the above objections. They can say that Christ’s death shows the depth of human depravity, inspiring humans not just to want to be better people, but also to see more clearly their own sins and to repent for those sins. Furthermore, the Holy Spirit—the third person of the Trinity—works to bring about transformation within a person who is open to receiving it (Moberly 1924). The Holy Spirit can transform people and undo obstacles to transformation that would be difficult or impossible to manage without God’s help.
However, even these more sophisticated views face a host of objections:
- they do not adequately account for the Biblical ideas that Christ’s atoning work is substitutionary, representative, and expiatory (Crisp 2020b),
- they cannot explain why Christ’s death is crucial for atonement (Pugh 2014: 132), and
- they cannot account for the Biblical language of sacrifice.
5. Recent Theories
5.1 Christus Victor Theories
Aulén’s (1930 ) study of patristic views of atonement led to a flourishing of that approach in theological literature into the twenty-first century. Christus Victor views highlight the ransom motif from scripture: humans are in some way enslaved to the power of sin and their only escape from its power can come from a rescuer, Jesus Christ, who will free humans from its power. However, contemporary views rarely espouse the ransom theory described above.
Some, such as Gregory Boyd (2006), take seriously Satan’s existence and the reality of demonic activity, and argue that Christ’s atoning work is aimed at undermining their influence over humans. Christ does this through his teaching, healing, and exorcism ministry. But his death and resurrection constitute his ultimate defeat of Satan, as he allows Satan to influence humans to kill him, only to show that Satan cannot win. Christ’s resurrection is central to atonement, on this view, as it is a demonstration of defeat over Satan’s worst.
Others, such as Darby Kathleen Ray (1998), J. Denny Weaver (2001), and Walter Wink (1992), demythologize the Christus Victor view. What humans need to be freed from is not literal demons, but a sort of depersonalized power of evil that humans have allowed to infect their institutions, organizations, and cultures. Christ combats the power of evil nonviolently. In doing so, particularly through his death, he unmasks evil by showing it at its worst. When humans see evil unmasked, and then see that Christ defeats its worst by being resurrected, humans are drawn instead to God’s way of life and his response to evil.
Christus Victor theories have been criticized on various grounds (some are only relevant to certain specific theories). First, they do not account for the importance of Christ’s crucifixion for atonement (Thurow 2021a). The victory over the powers could have been obtained in so many ways (and indeed is obtained in ways other than his death) not involving the death of the innocent son of God. Second, they downplay individual responsibility for sin (Schreiner 2006b). This can make it seem like the Christus Victor accounts don’t offer a theory of atonement since they do not explain how the wrong done to God by human sin is resolved (Crisp 2020a: 55). Lastly, if the primary mechanism of atonement is to free humans from the power of sin, empirical evidence indicates that this hasn’t been achieved (Reichenbach 2006). And yet, Christ is said to have already atoned for human sin.
5.2 Another Satisfaction Theory
Swinburne’s theory of atonement is Anselmian, although it dispenses with Anselm’s calculus about how valuable the satisfaction must be in order to atone. According to Swinburne (1989), atonement has four components: repentance, apology, reparation, and penance (see section 2.6 for a description of Swinburne’s notion of penance). For less severe wrongs, repentance and apology may suffice to atone, but for more serious wrongs—especially those that cause harm aside from the offense itself—reparation and penance are required. Since human sin is immense and immensely harmful, humans must make reparation and penance for sin—and not only for their own personal sin, but also for the sins of their forebears, to whom they owe a debt of helping to repair their moral debts. However, the victim may determine what counts as adequate satisfaction for wrongdoing. Christ’s entire life lived in obedience and service to God, which caused his death at the hands of his enemies, was offered by Christ as a reparation and penance for human sin. Humans can adopt it as their own reparation and penance by adding to it their personal repentance and apology.
Swinburne’s theory evades many of the objections to Anselm’s satisfaction theory presented in section 4.3 (although Hick 1994 argues that some of the classic objections apply). He has responded to Stump’s objection that his view makes forgiveness contingent by arguing that Stump’s view of forgiveness is not well reflected in Christ’s view of forgiveness, whereas his is (Swinburne 2019). Cross’s and Lombardo’s objections have yet to be rebutted.
Porter (2004), among others (Quinn 1994; Stump 2018; Thurow 2021a), objects that Swinburne’s theory does not explain why Christ’s death is distinctly important for atonement. His perfect life is what appears to do the reparative work; his death appears to be simply a causal consequence of that work, but not something in virtue of which reparation is made. Hick (1994) adds that since Swinburne thinks God could have accepted a supererogatory act from a mere human or angel as satisfaction, it is hard to see why God would instead use the horrific death of the Son of God as satisfaction. McNaughton (1992) and Aspenson (1996) present other critiques.
5.3 Marian/Thomistic Theory
Building upon her earlier interpretations and developments of Aquinas’s views on atonement (Stump 1988; 2003), Eleonore Stump (2018) defends what she calls a Marian theory of atonement (named after the many Marys in the New Testament). According to this theory, Christ’s atonement is aimed at bringing humans into union with God in love. To be united in love, both parties must share attention with each other and desire the other wholeheartedly. Guilt and shame due to human sin, and its resultant stain on the soul, prevent humans from embracing union with God. God is fully ready to reconcile; the only thing preventing reconciliation is human resistance to God. Christ’s atoning work enables, in several ways, a bond of love between humans and God. First, Christ experiences on the cross what it is like to commit every single human sin in history, and thus God is attentive in a second-person way to humans. Second, Christ’s death on the cross is the best way for God to melt the hearts of humans, who resist accepting God’s love. Those who thus surrender to God receive the gift of the Holy Spirit, which gives them a second-person awareness of God, and gives them a desire to desire God, which in time sanctifies humans to bring their first-order desires in line with this second-order desire. Through this process all of the obstacles to reconciliation from guilt, shame, and stain on the soul, are dealt with.
Stump justifies her view in part by repudiating Anselmian views and insisting that God’s forgiveness and readiness for reconciliation is universal and unconditional. As noted in section 4.3, several have questioned her views about love and forgiveness. Thurow and Strabbing (2020) argue that the core of Anselm’s view—that human sin is so bad that repentant sinners ought to and will want to offer satisfaction to God—is plausible and can be incorporated into Stump’s account of atonement. They also question her account of surrendering to God. Others have questioned how Stump’s view would account for restoring damage to nature from human sin (Pawl 2021) and for atoning for social sin (Pogin 2021). Dougherty (2019), A. Jeffrey (2021), and Rea (2019) critique other details. Stump (2019; 2021) responds to some of these concerns.
5.4 Participation Theories
Participation theories take as their starting point various statements of the apostle Paul:
- “I have been crucified with Christ and I no longer live, but Christ lives in me” (Galatians 2:19–20),
- “we were therefore buried with him through baptism into death in order that, just as Christ was raised from the dead through the glory of the Father, we too may live a new life” (Romans 6:4),
- “we were baptized by one Spirit into one body” (1Cor. 12:13) and
- Christ is the head of the body (Colossians 1:18).
Participation theories take these statements to indicate that atonement works by humans being in some way united with Christ, so that what he does is done also for them, which also effects healing in human hearts and minds. These theories thus emphasize the divinization/healing motif, where this healing is brought about through participation in a union with Christ.
Bayne and Restall (2009) argue that participation theories do a better job than other theories of explaining why the incarnation is important for atonement, and that they rightly view sin as a pollution that produces a relational problem (rather than as a deontic matter of failing in a duty). Crisp (2016; 2020a) advocates for a theory that employs a robust notion of union. All fallen humans are part of a four-dimensional entity, fallen humanity. Christ becomes human and creates a new four-dimensional entity, redeemed humanity, of those who join themselves to him in faith and love. The Holy Spirit brings about transformation in the merely human members of redeemed humanity—using Christ’s atoning work to bring about transformation. Gorman’s (2014) new-covenant model understands union to result from a covenant, and what Christ’s atonement does is form a new covenant through which various benefits flow to its members.
5.5 Mashup Theories
Many people want to combine elements of different theories into one larger theory. Sometimes this is done by centering one theory while building elements of other theories around it (e.g., Packer 1974, who centers penal substitution). But one could also attempt to bring several theories together without centering any one. Crisp (2020a) calls these “mashup theories”. Examples include Boersma (2004; 2006), who uses Irenaeus’s notion of recapitulation to tie together Christus Victor, penal substitution, and moral influence, and McNall (2019), who tries to integrate the same theories together using the metaphor of a mosaic in which each theory depicts part of a mosaic of Christ. Some have objected to mashup theories on the grounds that each theory has a different internal logic—a different “target” of atonement—and purports to present a central mechanism for how Christ atones (Weaver 2006). Baker and Green endorse a kaleidoscope approach to theories of atonement which, although superficially similar to mashup theories, regards all theories as culturally conditioned and limited, although valuable, ways to understand Christ’s atonement (Baker & Green 2011; Green 2006). Others have defended the mashup approach. Gunton (1989) construes the classic atonement theories as built around different guiding metaphors that can and should be combined to provide a fuller understanding of Christ’s atonement. Thurow (2021b) argues that since atonement aims at reconciliation, and there are various dimensions to reconciling, a theory of atonement could view different classic theories as articulating different dimensions of atonement corresponding to unique dimensions of reconciliation.
6. Collective Atonement
In everyday speech we sometimes talk of collectives (or groups) offering atonement or being the recipients of atonement. For example, people discuss whether Germany has sufficiently atoned for its Nazi past (M. Smith 2019 [Other Internet Resources]) and how the Canadian government has atoned for its mistreatment of indigenous populations (Skylstad 2021 [Other Internet Resources]), and Roman Catholic popes have apologized for the role of the Church in the sexual abuse scandal and in harm to native people during the conquest of the Americas (Cunningham 2022). There is considerable dispute about how to understand these attributions of responsibility to collectives and the moral action of the collectives (see the entry on collective responsibility for details). Some take them at face value and accept a realm of collective responsibility that is distinct from the individual responsibility born by members of the collective (e.g., Isaacs 2011). Others object that only individuals can be responsible for actions and that groups can be regarded as responsible in only a metaphorical sense (e.g., H. D. Lewis 1948; Narveson 2002).
Both approaches have a range of important moral phenomena to explain. These include: apology for a collective and how in some cases victims feel that an apology from a group is more needed than an apology from individual members of the group; collective responsibility for historical injustices when no currently existing member of the group committed or aided anyone in committing any of the injustices; the sense of guilt or shame at being a member of a collective that has wronged people; morally acceptable collective punishment; that individuals in a guilty group can have varying degrees of responsibility connected to the action for which the group is guilty. (See French & Wettstein 2006, 2014; Isaacs & Vernon 2011; and May & Hoffman 1991 for important collections of essays on these and other related issues.)
Collective atonement is one of these phenomena. Insofar as groups can be responsible for actions or states of affairs in the world, they can also be responsible for atoning for the same. Since atonement aims at reconciliation, collective atonement would aim at reconciling one group with another individual or group. Roy Brooks, for example, argues that “racial reconciliation should be the primary purpose of racial redress” (2004: 141). He thus presents what he calls an atonement model for black reparations, according to which reconciliation is the goal, which is to be achieved through government apology and reparation. Reparations are needed not only because of the extent of the harm done but because they are “essential to atonement”, as they “make apologies believable” (2004: 142). Even if there are no agents literally collectively responsible for anything, there are bad social facts and relations that can cause and result from wrongdoing—these are sometimes called social evils or social sins (John Paul II 1984). Sometimes adequate atonement will require making reparations for social evils.
Some reflections on the Christian doctrine of atonement make use of notions of collectivity. The version of the divinization/healing motif that highlights Christ’s role as a second Adam and as the Head of humanity (or the Church) posits that Christ’s acting as a representative for a collective entity is part of how he atones for human sin. The Hebrew scriptures contain a clear notion of collective responsibility, illustrated most clearly in the Day of Atonement rituals (Milgrom 1991) and this notion may influence the New Testament conception of Christ as a priest offering the sacrifice of himself. Some argue that Anselm regards, or is committed to regarding, Christ as atoning for collective sin (D. Brown 2004; Thurow 2017b; for a different reading see Rogers 2012). Drawing on these sources, Thurow 2015 develops a theory of atonement on which Christ atones primarily for the collective sins of humanity and secondarily for the sins of individual humans who join themselves to Christ in faith and repentance.
7. Feminist and Womanist Approaches to Atonement
Feminist and womanist scholars have argued that our understanding of atonement needs to be transformed by an awareness that (i) women throughout history in many cultures have suffered many wrongs while their culture ignored or belittled their need for atonement/amends, while at the same time (ii) in many cultures women have born the burden of repairing moral fragmentation that happens in households (Spelman 2002: 26ff). As a result, women have faced a sort of oppression in relation to atonement: they are held responsible for helping make amends for other peoples’ (often men’s) wrongs, while their own need for atonement is sidelined. Many feminist and womanist theologians and philosophers have argued that these facts, and others grounded in women’s experiences, are grounds for critique of traditional theories of the Christian doctrine of atonement.
Tanner (2010: 249f) observes that several feminist criticisms are in line with other standard criticisms in the history of theological argument. Some question the character of God as depicted in the classic atonement theories. J. Brown and Parker (1989) argue the classic theories endorse divine child abuse, as Christ, the son of God, suffers terribly at the Father’s will for the sake of others and their actions. Others question the mechanism of atonement—for instance, D. Williams (1991) argues that black women in America have historically had terrible experiences of coerced and voluntary surrogacy, acting as surrogate parents and household managers for white folks, performing field work, and providing sexual pleasure to male slaveholders. Many traditional theories treat Christ as a substitute, or surrogate, who atones for human sin. The experience of black women shows that even voluntary surrogacy is not necessarily a great good.
However, feminist and womanist critiques extend beyond the classic critiques. One of their core claims is that
theologies of the cross are seen to be complicit in the oppression, victimization and disempowerment of women. (Keshgegian 2000: 476; see also Buck 2020)
D. Williams suggests that
the image of the surrogate-God…supports and reinforces the exploitation that has accompanied [black women’s] experience with surrogacy. (1991: 9)
Brock and Parker (2001) present many stories of women who have suffered from abuse and neglect at the hands of a partner and were told by church members to endure the suffering—even rejoice in it—as it brings them closer to Christ who suffered on the cross.
If one extols the silent and freely-chosen suffering of Christ, who was “obedient unto death” (Philippians 2:8), as an example to be imitated by all those victimized by patriarchal oppression…one not only legitimates but also enables acts of violence against women and children. (Fiorenza 1994: 106)
This can in turn lead to a sort of hermeneutical injustice wherein women and other oppressed people are hindered from seeing that resisting injustice and standing up for one’s own well-being are permissible and noble (Pogin 2020).
In response to these critiques, some endorse forms of the Christus Victor theory that treat Christ’s death as a tragedy, not as an intrinsically redemptive act (Ray 1998; Weaver 2001), while others endorse a version of participation theory (Tanner 2010) on which Christ’s divine life-giving power deeply manifest on the cross and humans can receive a share of that power through union with Christ. Some have defended Anselm’s theory against the critiques (Keshgegian 2000). Some argue that a full appreciation of the doctrine of the Trinity can help evade some of the critiques (Crisp 2020).
Guðmundsdóttir (2010; 2017) argues that some of the critiques do not adequately distinguish between theology being abused and theology being essentially abusive. She thinks when a theology of the cross glorifies suffering per se, theology is being abused. However, a theology of the cross—and an account of atonement—need not be essentially abusive if it embraces the idea that suffering and death can be transformed into joy and life and offers hope of a better life to those who suffer unjustly.
One thing the feminist and womanist critiques show is that there is need for further reflection on how the Christian doctrine of the atonement ought to integrate with and impact human practices of atonement. (See McKnight 2007 and Swamy 2018 for recent excurses in this issue.)
- AH = Irenaeus’s Against Heresies, cited by book and chapter
- CDH = Anselm’s Cur Deus Homo (Why God Became Man), cited by book and chapter, translated in Anselm 
- NIV = New International Version of the Bible
- NRSV = New Revised Standard Version of the Bible
- ST = Aquinas’s Summa Theologica
- Biblical books
- 1Cor. = First Epistle to the Corinthians
- 2Cor. = Second Epistle to the Corinthians
- 1John. = First Epistle of John
- Deut. = Deuteronomy
- Lev. = Leviticus
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- [CDH] Anselm, c. 1098 , Cur Deus Homo. Translated as “Why God Became Man”, in Davies and Evans 1998: 260–356.
- [ST] Aquinas, Thomas, 1267–73, Summa theologica. See the entry on Aquinas especially the bibliography.
- Aspenson, Steven S., 1990, “In Defense of Anselm”, History of Philosophy Quarterly, 7(1): 33–45.
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- Athanasius, c. 318 CE , De Incarnatione, originally in Greek. Translated as On the Incarnation, John Behr (tr.), Centenary Press, 1944. Reprinted Crestwood, NY: St Vladimir Seminary Press, 1993.
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- ––– (eds.), 2014, Forward-Looking Collective Responsibility, (Midwest Studies in Philosophy 38), Boston, MA: Wiley.
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- Girard, René, 1986, The Scapegoat, Baltimore, MD: Johns Hopkins University Press.
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Other Internet Resources
- Finlan, Stephen, 2020, “Atonement”, Oxford Bibliographies. doi:10.1093/OBO/9780195393361-0128
- Skylstad, Rose, 2021, “Reckoning and Reparation: Canada Navigates Past Mistreatment of Indigenous Populations”, Canada Institute at the Wilson Center, Washington, DC, 18 November 2021.
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- Christian ecclesiastical bodies statements about Jesus’s
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- Resolution on the Necessity of Penal Substitutionary Atonement, Southern Baptisti Convention, 1 June 2017, 2017 Annual Meeting, Phoenix, Arizona.
- Catechism of the Catholic Church, Vatican City: Libreria Editrice Vaticana, 1993
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