Binarium Famosissimum

First published Mon Jul 14, 2003; substantive revision Mon Jun 16, 2008

Binarium famosissimum’ (= “most famous pair”) is the name given by some twentieth-century historians of medieval philosophy to what was regarded as a characteristic pair of doctrines—universal hylomorphism and plurality of forms—often maintained together by members of the “Augustinian” school of scholastics in the thirteenth century. The doctrines were opposed by “Aristotelians” such as Thomas Aquinas. The linking of the two theories under this name appears to be a purely recent development, although there are conceptual connections between the theories.

1. The “most famous pair”

Some historians of medieval philosophy describe what they see as an Augustinian “doctrinal complex” that emerged in the late twelfth and early thirteenth centuries and that was the “common teaching” among scholastics after the 1220s.[1] Weisheipl [1980], pp. 242–43, lists five ingredients of this “Augustinian” synthesis:[2]

  1. voluntarism (an emphasis on the role of the will as distinct from the intellect)
  2. universal hylomorphism
  3. plurality of forms
  4. divine illumination, interpreted through the influence of Avicenna
  5. the real identity of the soul with its powers or faculties.

The second and third items on this list together make up what is sometimes called the “binarium famosissimum,” the “most famous pair.”

1.1 Universal hylomorphism

Paul Woodruff has defined hylomorphism as “the doctrine, first taught by Aristotle, that concrete substance consists of forms in matter (hyle)” (Audi [1999], p. 408). One might therefore expect universal hylomorphism to be the doctrine that all substances consist of forms in matter. But in fact the medieval theory of universal hylomorphism maintained something slightly weaker than that; it held that all substances except God were composed of matter and form, whereas God is entirely immaterial.

This view seems to be the result of two more basic theses:

  • the explicit claim that only God is metaphysically simple in all respects, so that all creatures are metaphysically composite;
  • the view, not always explicitly spelled out, that all composition is in some way a composition of matter and form, an indeterminate factor and a determining element.

The reasoning behind the second thesis is murky. On the other hand, it is easy to find medieval authors who argue in detail for the first claim.[3] Still, it is surprisingly hard to find any medieval author who gives a good motivation for it. That is, why should it be important to maintain that God and only God is metaphysically simple? What rests on the claim?

It it tempting, and plausible, to suppose that the implicit reasoning goes something like this: “Composite” (com + positus = “put together”) things don't just happen to be composite; something put them together. In short, composition requires an efficient cause. It follows therefore that God, as first cause, cannot be composite. Conversely, anything that is caused is in some sense composite. Hence, since everything besides God is created and therefore caused, everything other than God is composite. In short, the unique simplicity of God is important to maintain because it is required by the doctrine of creation. Nevertheless, while this line of reasoning is plausible, it is not found clearly stated in any medieval author I know of.[4]

The notion that all creatures are composites of matter and form requires that something be said about what we might otherwise call “immaterial” substances—angels, Aristotelian “separated substances,” the human soul after death. For universal hylomorphism, such entities cannot be truly immaterial, and yet they are obviously quite unlike familiar physical objects. As a result, universal hylomorphists distinguished between “corporeal” matter, i.e., the matter of physical, sensible objects, and another kind of matter sometimes called “spiritual matter.”[5]

1.2 Plurality of forms

The theory known as “plurality of forms” is not just the theory that there are typically many forms in a material substance. That would have been an innocuous claim; everyone agreed that material substances routinely have many accidental forms. The theory of plurality of forms is instead the theory that there is a plurality of substantial forms in a given material substance. Details of the theory varied widely from author to author.[6] There was some disagreement over how many substantial forms were involved. Most people who held a version of this theory agreed that at least a “form of corporeity” was required in all physical substances, but they disagreed over how many additional substantial forms were required for a given kind of body. Particular attention was given to the case of the human body.

The arguments in support of this theory were quite diverse, and come from a variety of directions. William of Ockham, for instance, held that if the form of corporeity were not distinct from the intellective soul and were not essentially present in the human being both during his life and after the intellective soul departs at death, then once a saint had died it would be false to say that the body that remains is the body that saint ever had. Hence the cult of venerating the bodies of the saints would make no sense. (Quodlibet II, q. 11.[7])

Again, Thomas Aquinas, although he rejects plurality or forms, nevertheless records several arguments given on its behalf. Among them[8]

Furthermore, before the coming of the rational soul the body in the womb of the mother has some form. Now when the rational soul comes, it cannot be said that this form disappears, because it does not lapse into nothingness, nor would it be possible to specify anything into which it might return. Therefore, some form exists in the matter previous to the rational soul …

Furthermore, in VII Metaphysica [11, 1036a 26] it is said that every definition has parts, and that the parts of a definition are forms. In anything that is defined, therefore, there must be several forms. Since, therefore, man is a kind of defined thing, it is necessary to posit in him several forms; and so some form exists before the rational soul.

2. Proponents and opponents

The theories of universal hylomorphism and plurality of forms are found together in many authors from the twelfth and thirteenth century. They are both held, for instance, by the author known to the scholastics as “Avicebron” (or Avicebrol, Avencebrol, etc.), who is to be identified with the Spanish Jewish philosopher and poet Solomon Ibn Gabirol (c. 1022–c. 1052/c. 1070), and whose Mekor Hayyim (= Fons vitae, “Fountain of Life”) was translated into Latin in the late-twelfth century.[9] Indeed, medieval as well as modern scholars have sometimes looked to Ibn Gabirol as the main source for the two doctrines in the thirteenth century.[10] Other authors who held both theories included the translator of the Fons vitae, one Dominic Gundisalvi (Gundissalinus)[11] as well as people as diverse as Thomas of York,[12] St. Bonaventure,[13] the anonymous thirteenth-century Summa philosophiae once ascribed to Robert Grosseteste,[14] John Pecham, Richard of Mediavilla,[15] and many others.[16]

But other authors rejected these two views. The best known is no doubt Thomas Aquinas. Aquinas held that the uniqueness of God's absolute simplicity does not require positing a kind of matter in all creatures. Rather all creatures, including incorporeal substances such as angels or human souls, are composite insofar as they have a composition of essence and esse (“to be,” the act of existing), whether or not they have an additional composition or matter and form.[17] Again, he argues that if any substance has a plurality of forms, only the first form that comes to it can be a substantial form; all the others must be accidental forms.[18] Godfrey of Fontaines likewise rejected both theories. John Duns Scotus accepted plurality of forms, but denied universal hylomorphism.[19]

3. The expression “binarium famosissimum”

The expression “binarium famosissimum” is not a medieval label for this pairing of doctrines; its use in this sense appears to be purely a twentieth-century development. Oddly enough, only a single occurrence of the expression has been found in a medieval text, the anonymous Summa philosophiae cited above.[20] But it clear that this author uses the expression to refer not to a pair of doctrines, whether to universal hylomorphism and plurality of forms or to any other pair, but to the division of substance into corporeal and incorporeal[21]:

Now the first contrariety in the categorial line of substance, from the nature of genus, partly by reason of the matter related to both sides [i.e., to corporeal and incorporeal], partly from the nature of the most common form tending to particularity by degrees according to the proportion of the matter's receptivity, contains the binarium famosissimum, that is, corporeal and incorporeal.

On the other hand, as early as 1943 Daniel Callus writes of a certain John Blund, an early-thirteenth century Englishman who rejected both universal hylomorphism and plurality of forms. Callus says [1943], p. 252:

More than Gundissalinus, we see delineated in Blund the great questions which in the second half of that century were to divide the different schools into two opposing armies, the outlining of the conflict between philosophers and theologians, Aristotelians and the so-called Augustinians. In Blund we meet with the earliest, clear, and unmistakable account of the binarium famosissimum of the Augustinians, Plurality of Forms and hylomorphic composition of spiritual substances, the angels and the human soul.

Again, in a paper delivered in 1946, Callus [1955], p. 4, mentions the “binarium famosissimum, the twofold pillar on which the whole structure of the Augustinian school was supposed to stand.” Although he does not there say what this “twofold pillar” is, a few pages later (p. 9) he cites “the famosissimum binarium Augustinianum, namely, the hylomorphic composition of all created beings, not only corporeal but also spiritual substances, the angels and the human soul; and plurality of forms in one and the same individual.”

A few years later Étienne Gilson [1955], p. 377, in the discussion of Thomas Aquinas in his monumental History of Christian Philosophy in the Middle Ages, says:

The radical elimination of the binarium famosissimum, i.e., hylomorphism and the plurality of forms, was not due to a more correct understanding of the metaphysics of Aristotle but to the introduction, by Thomas Aquinas, of a new metaphysical notion of being.

Again, Weisheipl [1980], p. 250, writing about Albert the Great, says (the emphasis is Weisheipl's):

Thus Albert is quick to point out that Avicebron in the Fons vitae is “the only [philosopher] who says that from one simple principle two [things] must immediately proceed in the order of nature, since the number ‘two’ follows upon unity.” And Saint Thomas notes: “Some say that the soul and absolutely every substance besides God is composed of matter and form; indeed the first author to hold this position is Avicebron, the author of Liber fons vitae.” This is the origin of the later binarium famosissimum: after One must come Two.

In this passage, Weisheipl uses the phrase “binarium famosissimum” in a sense perhaps loosely related to that used by the author of the Summa philosophiae. But he also links it, via the quotation from Aquinas, to the doctrine of universal hylomorphism.[22]

A few years later, Weisheipl ([1984], p. 451), speaking about Robert Grosseteste, remarks that he:

saw no problem whatever in accepting universal hylomorphism or a plurality of forms in a single material composite. Not only were these two tenets, known as the binarium famosissimum, common in the 1220s and 1230s, they were accepted as 'traditional' teaching by Franciscans at Oxford and Paris throughout the thirteenth century. John Peckham, Matthew of Aquasparta, Richard of Mediavilla, Roger Bacon, the pseudo-Grosseteste and even John Duns Scotus took the binarium famosissimum as orthodox Augustinian doctrine against the 'novelties' of Albert the Great and Thomas Aquinas.[23]

Again, E. A. Synan [1993], p. 236, refers to Aquinas's denial that there can be a plurality of substantial forms in any given substance, and calls it a “rejection of one half of the binarium famosissimum.

4. Conceptual issues

Thus, although Gilson and some other twentieth-century scholars have paired the theories of universal hylomorphism and plurality of forms under the title “binarium famosissimum,” and although it is certainly true that many medieval authors held both theories, there is no evidence that in medieval times they were ever thought of as a “pair” in this way.

Why then have some recent scholars linked the two theories so closely? They certainly have done so. Weisheipl ([1980], p. 243), for example, describes the plurality of forms as “simply a logical consequence of” universal hylomorphism. And Zavalloni ([1951], p. 437, n. 61) likewise claims that universal hylomorphism necessarily implies plurality of forms, although he says the latter does not imply the former.[24]

What may be going on is this. The theory of universal hylomorphism closely fits the view that the structure of what we truly say about things mirrors the structure of the things themselves. Thus, if I truly say ‘The cat is black’, then there is a cat that corresponds to the subject term, and that cat is qualified by the quality blackness corresponding to the predicate term. Without the blackness, the cat is to that extent indeterminate. It is the addition of blackness that determines the cat to the particular color it has. In general then, the relation of subject to predicate in a true affirmative judgment is the relation of what is at least relatively indeterminate to what at least partially determines it. Now the relation of something indeterminate to what determines it is a relation of “matter” to “form.”[25] Hence everything we can truly say about a subject reflects the fact that the thing is composed of an indeterminate side and a determining element—of matter and form. In short, hylomorphic composition is involved in anything we can make true affirmations about—thus, universal hylomorphism.[26]

Of course, we can truly say many things about a given subject. (E.g., ‘The cat is black’, ‘The cat is fat’, ‘The cat is asleep’, etc.) The predicates of all these true statements correspond to forms really inhering in the relatively indeterminate subject. Hence we can speak of a “plurality of forms.” But the “plurality of forms,” in the sense in which our authors speak of it, refers to something more restricted, to the fact that we can predicate predicates of a given subject in a certain “nested” order. We can, for example, while taking about the very same cat, say “This is a body” (i.e., it is corporeal), “This body is alive” (i.e., it is an organism), “This organism is sensate” (i.e., it has sensation, it is an animal), “This animal is a cat,” “This cat is black,” etc. Each such predication attributes a form to the underlying, “material,” indeterminate subject, and each such subject is in turn a composite of a form and a deeper, underlying material subject. The picture we get then is the picture of some kind of primordial matter, corresponding to the bare ‘this' of the first predication (“This is a body”), to which is added a series of forms one on top of the other in a certain order, each one limiting and narrowing down the preceding ones. The structure that results is a kind of laminated structure, a metaphysical “onion” with several layers. On this picture, of course, substantial and accidental forms are both “layers of the onion” in exactly the same sense. The distinction between essential and accidental features of a thing would therefore have to be drawn in some other way.

If this reconstruction is more or less correct, then it is clear why universal hylomorphism and plurality of forms can be viewed as conceptually linked. Both fit nicely with the view that the structure of reality is accurately mirrored in true predication. Ibn Gabirol, who held both theories, seems to have been thinking along approximately these lines. But some of the arguments cited above in favor of plurality of forms show that at least that half of the “pair” was sometimes held for entirely different reasons.

By contrast with the above reasoning, there is another view of predication, an “Aristotelian” (and later, Thomistic) view that rejects this picture. On this view, true predication in language is not a reliable guide to the metaphysical structure of what makes it true. One can truly describe a given subject in narrower and narrower terms without there being any corresponding distinction of real metaphysical components in what we are describing. We can, for example, describe our cat as a body, as an organism, as an animal, and as in particular a cat, all the while referring to a single metaphysical configuration, a particular combination (in this case) of matter and a feline form. Calling it a body, an organism, an animal, before calling it a cat in no way reflects any sequence of metaphysical distinctions in the entity itself. It is only when we call it “black” that we introduce a new entity into the structure, an accident. In short, on this alternative view, the structure of reality is not accurately mirrored in true predication, at least not in any straightforward way. This view is not committed to any “plurality” of substantial forms, and is not committed to universal hylomorphism either.[27]

5. Conclusion

The issues here are complex and the historical facts are not yet well sorted out. But it appears that twentieth-century scholars who saw a close conceptual link between universal hylomorphism and the plurality of forms were perhaps thinking of the two theories as motivated by a common commitment to the first theory of predication described in § 4 above. In some cases (for example the Fons vitae), they probably were so motivated. Still, the fact that the two theories are regarded as a “pair” is a recent phenomenon, not a medieval one. It seems to have arisen first in the writings of Daniel Callus.[28]


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  • –––. 1968. On Being and Essence. 2nd rev. ed. Armand Maurer, trans. Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Mediaeval Studies. (Original edition 1949.)
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  • –––. 1955. “The Condemnation of St Thomas at Oxford.” 2nd ed. (“The Aquinas Society of London: Aquinas Paper,” No. 5.) London: Blackfriars. (“A paper read to the Aquinas Society of London on 24th April, 1946.” First published 1946.)
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Copyright © 2008 by
Paul Vincent Spade

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