Philosophy of Biomedicine

First published Thu Apr 9, 2020

Despite the simple name, biomedicine is not simply the area of overlap between biology and medicine. It is a framework, a set of philosophical commitments, a global institution woven into Western culture and its power dynamics, and more. Biomedicine is the umbrella theoretical framework for most health science and health technology work done in academic and government settings. Western medical practices and the surrounding healthcare infrastructure are principally biomedical. Health-related corporations are predominantly biomedical in orientation (with the exception of a few homeopathic producers and other scattered outliers). International medical aid mainly offers biomedical resources. Biomedicine, in other words, is the name for how most powerful global institutions envision the relations between biological sciences and medicine.

The biomedical model is in fact so commonplace that it is easy to overlook how philosophically weighty (and contentious) its core commitments are: that health phenomena must be understood in terms of physical/biochemical entities and processes, that experimental techniques are the preferred means of acquiring and assessing health-related knowledge, and that human bodies are best understood as composed of a collection of subsidiary parts and processes (Krieger 2011: 130). In addition to critiquing those core commitments, philosophers have also disputed connected issues regarding the meanings of health and disease, the nature of biomedical knowledge and expertise, the value of reductionist thinking, the value of biomedicine’s global institutions, etc. Some philosophers have also proposed alternative frameworks for understanding the relations between biology and medicine. Though, relatively little literature is directed at biomedicine per se.

The fact that the philosophical literature is so critical is in part because

  1. biomedicine is so expansive that there is no shortage of flaws to identify, and
  2. biomedicine is deeply embedded in the current global order, and hence is tied directly or indirectly to all of the goods and ills of that order.

This entry will, as much as possible, avoid duplicating the work done in the thorough Philosophy of Medicine entry. That entry focuses on elucidating the work done by that branch of philosophy, which according to entry, has

dedicated journals and professional organizations, a relatively well-established canon of scholarly literature, and distinctive questions and problems. (Reiss & Ankeny 2016)

Most of the “medicine” examined in “philosophy of biomedicine” is medicine pursued within a biomedicine framework, so there is much overlap. Yet, this entry will accomplish something other than what that entry does. This entry will review the philosophical literature (and some literature in allied fields, such as history of medicine) that scrutinizes the biomedical framework itself, in whole or in part.

1. Biomedicine as a Framework for Medicine + Biology

Consult with a primary care physician when feeling ill. Perhaps they send you to a medical lab that will take a blood sample to run a biochemical analysis. After the results arrive, consult with a physician specialist whose expertise is the particular bodily organ or system where the ailment is localized. The specialist prescribes a drug that has been mass-produced in a factory, after a biology laboratory extracted the active ingredient from a natural source, or perhaps synthesized it from scratch. The drug’s efficacy has been proven by testing the drug experimentally on two groups with the relevant disease, randomly sorted into an experimental group and a control group so that the drug’s measurable bodily effects could be scrutinized and counted. This is biomedicine. It has quickly grown to be so pervasive around the globe that it is difficult to characterize biomedicine.

1.1 What is biomedicine?

As explored in this entry, and outlined in how the sections are divided in the entry, biomedicine has many facets. It is a very large and complex thing. It is a morphing historical product of the post-World War Two West. It is a contemporary global social institution. It is an epistemology of medical research and practice (albeit with factions). It is a set of ontological and metaphysical commitments. And more.

The US National Cancer Institute defines biomedicine as synonymous with “allopathic medicine, conventional medicine, mainstream medicine, orthodox medicine, and Western medicine” (NCI Other Internet Resources, accessed 12 March 2020). By contrast, A. E. Clarke, Mamo, Fishman, Shim, and Fosket (2003) takes an expansive view of the nature of biomedicine, contending that it is an evolving entity, a cohesive and developing whole that consists of elements ranging from the assertion that good health is a personal moral obligation to the increasing reliance on “computerization and data banking” (A. E. Clarke et al. 2003: 173).

Krieger offers a detailed examination of the history and philosophy of the “biomedicine approach,” and extracts three key tenets of the view.

Among the many features of a biomedical perspective, three stand out as fundamental regarding its approach to investigating disease (Lock & Gordon 1988; Fee & Krieger 1994; Krieger 1994; Lawrence & Weisz 1998; Cambrosio & Keating 2001; Bynum 2008). They are:

  • First, specific to biomedicine: the domain of disease and its causes is restricted to solely biological, chemical, and physical phenomena;
  • Second, shared with many natural sciences: an emphasis on laboratory research and technology and, as translated to health research, a discounting of research questions that cannot be studied by randomized clinical trials (or their analogs, e.g., “natural experiments”); and
  • Third: an embrace of “reductionism,” a philosophical and methodological stance (discussed more fully below) that holds that phenomena are best explained by the properties of their parts. (Krieger 2011: 130)

Krieger’s account of biomedicine offers a compelling distillation of the philosophical commitments of biomedical science. Though since this is an entry on philosophy of biomedicine, the entry will be organized around philosophical dimensions and debates, rather than being organized directly around these core theoretical tenets (e.g., the upcoming section is on ontological and metaphysical commitments). Additionally, this entry will supplement the tenets identified by Krieger with discussion of connected issues, such as philosophical critiques of biomedicine as a social institution (Section 4).

The terms “framework” and “approach” are used here to describe biomedicine, in an attempt to avoid narrowly overcommitting to any particular philosophical system. Biomedicine may or may not qualify as one of Thomas Kuhn’s “paradigms”, in the way that the heliocentric model of the solar system is a paradigm—a complex worldview in which the viewpoints cannot be straightforwardly translated back-and-forth with an alternative paradigm (i.e., if we try to translate the concepts of biomedicine to the pre-biomedical concepts of humoral theory, discussed in Section 1.2 (Kuhn 1962). Alternatively, biomedicine seems to qualify as one of Imre Lakatos’ Research Programmes, a different way of conceiving of the way that research communities intellectually cohere (Lakatos 1968). It’s a question of how biomedicine serves as a means of organizing and guiding research.

Without getting too lost in the technical criteria, biomedicine shares the Kuhnian paradigm quality of being incommensurable (or at least more or less so) with other conceptions of biology and health. Scholars of complementary medicine have spent enormous effort searching for ways that traditional medical practices—e.g., herbal treatments handed down over generations—can get a foothold in a medical world dominated by biomedicine. It is telling that there is no question that ‘proof’ of a treatment’s efficacy requires starting from scratch, by examining the herb’s chemical makeup, isolating and analyzing which chemical components are the active ingredients, and then testing safety and efficacy, all entirely within biomedicine’s rules. Whatever explanations might have been offered by herbalists (e.g., ‘it calms turmoil in the stomach’) are irrelevant untranslatable knowledge. Biomedicine also shares the Lakatosian Research Programme quality of (largely implicitly) dictating what sorts of internal dispute about biomedicine is permissible. Within the biomedical Research Programme, one is invited to question whether a particular experimental design is suitable; one is not permitted to reject experimentation entirely.

1.2 The history of biomedicine

Biomedicine as a global institution coevolved with its characteristic philosophical positions. While key elements, such as laboratory biology, were present in the nineteenth century and even before, “World War II is usually presented as a turning point in the ‘biomedicalization’ process” (Löwy 2011: 117). The term “biomedicine” was first used between the two world wars as a shorthand for some of the medical and scientific work being done on radioactive materials (Keating & Cambrosio 2003; Löwy 2011: 49–55). But biomedicine only came into its own during the period of economic and social transformation in industrialized Western countries that followed World War Two:

In industrialized countries, the post-World War II era was also characterized by important increases in public funding for medical research, the extension of health insurance to large parts of the population (a process that, in nearly all the Western countries, the United States excepted, was also supported by the state), and the rapid growth of the pharmaceutical industry. (Löwy 2011: 117)

If biomedicine is a recent historical development, then what exactly came before it? Many different frameworks for health existed before the rise of biomedicine, though many such frameworks exist now despite the dominance of biomedicine. Some have been distinctly influenced by or merged with biomedicine. For instance, osteopathic medicine has gradually gone from a full alternative system of medicine (focusing on manipulation of body via pressure, stretching and other means of readjustment of bodily structure in order to rebalance internal processes), to an alternative track of medical education/practice that has in large part converged with the biomedical/allopathic medicine track (McClain 2017; Stark 2013).

Insofar as biomedicine formed in the West, it is helpful to see it in contrast to the medical and philosophical traditions that preceded it. The most influential Western tradition prior to biomedicine is the Hippocratic tradition—the views attributed to Hippocrates and over two millennia of re-interpretations, riffs, amendments, and other alterations. At the core of Hippocratic medicine were two views. First, it made a commitment to methodological naturalism—a refusal to attribute disease processes to the work of gods and other supernatural beings (Conrad, Neve, Nutton, Porter, & Wear 1995). Though, it is worth noting that for much of that history, elements of astrology, talismans, and some forms of magic were understood as essentially natural phenomena (e.g., the sun obviously affects health via sunburns and such, so it is not absurd to have inferred that planets could have their own subtle effects on bodies too). Second, it understood health as a matter of balance—and disease as a matter of imbalance—of the humors. Humoral theory was interpreted in many different ways, but centered on the idea that heath and disease are attributable to the interactions of anatomical humors (blood, phlegm, yellow bile, and black bile), which were in turn directly tied to a much larger cosmology of the elements (e.g., blood is linked to air, the springtime, a combination of heat and moisture, the heart, and the astrological influence of the planet Jupiter) (see additional internet resources below) (Conrad et al., 1995).

There is long-standing debate in health policy over exactly how successful the biomedical model has been over its relatively short historical trajectory. The growth of the biomedical model in Western countries occurred at the same time as other social and economic transformations (industrialization, urbanization, globalization, etc.) and at the same time as improvements in life expectancy and a large number of disease outcomes. The ‘received view’ of these historical relations is that social and economic changes allowed the growth of biomedicine, which in turn created new institutions, professional health care practices, and technologies that, in turn, caused vast improvements in health outcomes for the populations served by biomedical institutions. Penicillin is the go-to example for illustrating the positive health impacts of biomedicine (Löwy 2011). It is a medicine extracted from nature (mold), made into a widely available ‘magic bullet’ thanks to biomedical techniques of identifying its active components, and manufacturing controlled doses of it at reasonable cost at massive scale. Suffering and death from bacterial infections was rapidly alleviated; once hopeless diseases were suddenly curable with a few (usually) benign pills.

Thomas McKeown was an influential critic of the biomedical institution (including the work done during its early twentieth century prehistory), having authored the blockbuster volume The Role of Medicine: Dream, Mirage, or Nemesis (1976). McKeown reevaluated the historical record and available evidence to instead hypothesize that the social and economic changes in the West were more responsible for the health improvements than biomedicine’s growth. Put bluntly, he argued that twentieth century modernity (economic development, improved nutrition, etc.) caused populations in the West to get healthier over time, then modernity went on to also cause the growth of contemporary medicine/biomedicine, but the medical advances themselves played a generally secondary role in supporting the health improvements. His works has inspired decades worth of debates over the validity of his bold claims, which have been largely overturned or largely vindicated, depending on whom one asks (Link & Phelan 2002).

Health theorist Nancy Krieger shows how the activity of finding ratios of how much biomedical healthcare vs. socioeconomic environment contributed to health improvements since the twentieth century is the sort of debate that easily falls victim to the “fallacy of treating causes of population health as if they sum to 100%” (Krieger 2017). Causes overlap and interact in complex ways; e.g., individual diet, exercise, medications, and changing exposures to smoking, etc. have all been contributing to changes in heart disease rates. How much of the credit goes to biomedicine for studying the effects of exercise on heart attack risk, for helping make the case for the heart risks of smoking, and so on? Extracting and assessing the contributions of biomedicine, an enterprise fully embedded in Western countries’ social systems and economies, is not possible; biomedicine is firmly embedded. That is not to deny it is impossible to attribute health effects in particular populations to particular causes in general—there are methods allowing such calculations—just that causes’ interactions need to be taken into consideration (Krieger 2017).

2. Ontological and Metaphysical Commitments in Biomedicine

Biomedicine is built around a conception of disease as a disfunction of particular physical parts (organs, tissues, cells) of the body. Despite being hegemonic in the global research community, biomedicine’s ontological and metaphysical commitments are not self-evident, historically long-lived, nor universally embraced. In contrasting Classical Chinese Medicine with biomedicine, Lee explains that biomedicine is set apart by

the metaphysical thesis that only what is ascertainable by means of the five senses and by extension the use of instrumentation is real and exists

and a connected epistemic claim that legitimate health knowledge must come to us via those means (Lee 2017: 2).

2.1 Ontology of the body and life in biomedicine

What makes patients and their bodies special? Some philosophers of biomedicine have attempted to make headway in this question by provocatively asking what it means for biomedical sciences to be ‘chauvinist’ and whether this is proper. Biomedical discussions are in large part defined by what they exclude from discussion. Curiously, there are two sides to the coin of biological chauvinism: one that directly supports the biomedical framework and one that challenges it. Both help shed light on the relationship between biology and medicine.

Broadbent (2009) uses the helpful term, “biological chauvinism” to describe the way that biomedicine actively excludes consideration of entities and processes that don’t fit into its worldview: “a refusal to countenance causes of ill health that are not biological” (Broadbent 2009: 305). Biological chauvinists might appeal to ontological or epistemic commitments, e.g., the assumption that knowledge of the body is nothing but knowledge of organic chemical processes, and any processes not clearly reducible to such terms are not yet worthy of being given full consideration. But the strongest case for this chauvinism rests more on pragmatic grounds than on such philosophical assumptions. Biomedicine has built itself into a massive global institution and research enterprise while operating under that assumption (to repeat Krieger’s phrasing from Section 1.1, the assumption is that “the domain of disease and its causes is restricted to solely biological, chemical, and physical phenomena” (Krieger 2011: 130)). This is a powerful argument, though it cuts both ways; Section 5 discusses critiques attempting to undercut the value of what biomedicine has indeed built while operating under that approach.

On the other side of the coin, “biochauvinism” is the term applied to the view that there is something philosophically unique about biological organisms—due to their basic nature and/or the limitations of human knowledge’s access to them—that makes them the biological world fundamentally unlike the rest of the world (Wolfe 2015). Vitalism—the view that life has some animating entity (along the lines of spirit) that animates matter into a living being—is one form of such biochauvinism (Wolfe 2015). Another form of biochauvinism is the use of phenomenology to assert that human lived experience partly operates within a space-time context that is different from that of a rock (Wolfe 2015). Wolfe finds that sort of view inside the influential phenomenological work of Maurice Merleau-Ponty (Wolfe 2015) (See Section 5 on phenomenology). Thus there are two rather opposite senses in which we can chauvinistically hold that the biological world is special:

  1. a specialness through what life excludes (medicine is nothing but applied biology) or
  2. a specialness through what life includes (an intangible vital spirit; a unique frame of time and space).

Version (1) of biomedicine is consistent with biomedicine and version (2) generally is not. The fact that the valorizing of biology can cut both ways helps to show, though, that biomedicine has staked out a sort of middle ground by insisting that understanding health and medicine is accomplished through understanding the innumerable subtleties of biological processes and substances, but that those biological processes and substances must not be so subtle or mysterious as to become untethered from properties and processes condoned by physics and chemistry.

Put another way, the biomedical framework of the body can be understood by considering what it excludes: spirit, vitality, and any other entity or property unknown to mainstream physicists or chemists. The concept Physicalism is closely related, but the term is perhaps not a perfect fit since it has taken on conceptual connotations and baggage through its use by analytic philosophers of metaphysics. The connection is that in the psychological biosciences, the “hard problem of consciousness” looms over everything:

It is widely agreed that experience arises from a physical basis, but we have no good explanation of why and how it so arises. Why should physical processing give rise to a rich inner life at all? It seems objectively unreasonable that it should, and yet it does. (Chalmers 1995)

While the human mind and consciousness attract a special sense of awe, the hard problem of consciousness is not all that different from the problems facing attempts to make sense of the patient as a whole. Patients live; their bodies function every second of the day, via an astounding series of interconnected processes. It stretches the imagination to think that a vital spirit or such is giving unity to each life (human or non-); it stretches the imagination in another way to think that we humans are simply skin bags of chemical reactions.

2.2 Biomedical conceptions of health and disease

The preceding section on purpose in biomedicine leads directly to the related issue of how health and disease are conceptualized in biomedicine. This is something that will only be dealt with very briefly here, in part to avoid duplicating the content in the entry on Concepts of Health and Disease. Debates over the meaning of health and disease—including how the two are connected—are central to philosophy of medicine. This entry will not attempt to summarize that complex literature, and rather focus on how conceptions of health and disease relate to biomedicine, including related disputes over how disease relates to disability justice matters, and ways in which purportedly objective biomedical conceptions of disease can be co-opted for dubious purposes.

Of the different philosophical accounts of health and disease, Christopher Boorse’s naturalistic Biostatistical Theory (BST) of disease gives the account that is perhaps most tightly linked with the philosophical commitments of biomedicine. Boorse’s revised account of the BST states:

  1. The reference class is a natural class of organisms of uniform functional design; specifically, an age group of a sex of a species.
  2. A normal function of a part or process within members of the reference class is a statistically typical contribution by it to their individual survival [or] reproduction.
  3. Health in a member of the reference class is normal functional ability: the readiness of each internal part to perform all its normal functions on typical occasions with at least typical efficiency.
  4. A disease [later, pathological condition] is a type of internal state which impairs health, i.e., reduces one or more functional abilities below typical efficiency (Boorse 2014: 684, amending Boorse 1977: 562).

The idea is that we can wield insights of biochemistry, pathology, and evolutionary biology to together yield an objective means of ‘reading’ nature to tell us which states are pathological or diseased states, without the interference of messy and culturally rooted/biased evaluations. One line of rebuttal is that there is no principled way of objectively choosing a reference class against which to judge that a given part or process is falling short (my blood sugar levels are objectively too high compared to…what exactly?) (Kingma 2014). Even if that problem is resolvable, Krueger argues that an objective set of criteria for defining states as pathological or not would be a very limited accomplishment. Knowing that my blood sugar levels are objectively pathological does not really tell me much about what, if anything, I or my physician ought to do about that (Krueger 2015).

Fraught as it is to approach health via the functioning of components in the body, it is also quite conceptually difficult to measure health in a broader sense. Biomedical science practitioners tend to get twisted into conceptual and epistemic knots when attempting to measure general/overall health or well-being in a population (Hausman 2015). One key philosophical dispute among health scientists engaged in patient health measurement activities is over what sorts/amounts of knowledge patients have about their own health states, and how this knowledge ought to be accessed (McClimans forthcoming). How much can we glean about a patient’s physical comfort by asking them to rate their level of pain on a scale of 1–10? How do we solicit such information without repeating unethical patterns of trust or mistrust, rooted in racist/sexist/etc. stereotypes about patients (Buchman, Ho, & Goldberg 2017)?

The notion of disease is biological malfunction is also tied to a pair of critiques of the “medical model” of disability and of “medical model” of mental health. Both models are criticized for reducing the complexities of disability or psychological welfare to only the individual-level signs, symptoms, and variables recognized by biomedicine (see: Disability: Definitions, Models, Experience). As traced in Hogan’s history of the concept, the medical model is either critiqued as insufficiently attentive to other dimensions (especially the social dynamics that drastically shape the relevant health experiences) or oppressive (since the model empowers biomedical experts to unilaterally dictate the disability/psychiatric categories, relevant evidence, diagnoses, treatments, etc.) (Hogan 2019). This is in part a dispute over functioning since debates over normality, difference, and pathology depend on whether/how we commit to the notion that bodies or parts thereof have functions at all. If one’s legs do not perform the function of walking, are the legs pathological? Is the person with those legs inherently diseased? Disabled? Worse off than if they had legs that could walk? One solution is to simply throw out the notion of normal functioning (Amundson 2000). Another related option is to embrace pluralism in the sense of accepting that the relationship between disability and well-being or health is complex, variable, and dependent on individual and social contingencies (Campbell & Stramondo 2017).

One philosophical complication is that a naturalistic concept of disease, like Boorse’s, does not prevent social processes from altering the standards and practices of how the boundaries of these natural categories are drawn in practice. Chronic diseases such as cardiovascular diseases and type 2 diabetes have been targeted by drug companies to not only create new treatments but to redraw the boundaries between healthy vs. pathological, including boundary zones such as “prediabetes” (Greene 2006). These efforts are in part accomplished via the design of clinical trials, which have the dangerous distinction of having very high epistemic value in the biomedical community, while remaining highly susceptible to manipulations to the experimental setup that push the evidence one direction or another (González-Moreno, Saborido, & Teira 2015).

While a naturalistic concept of disease is the most consistent with the ontological assumptions and methodological practices of biomedicine, that has not prevented biomedicine from accommodating a certain type of dissent from the biomedical tenet that biomedicine ought to focus on diseases and (only) the biological, chemical, and physical aspects thereof (Krieger 2011: 130). The World Health Organization (WHO)—founded in the same post-World War Two period as biomedicine—adopted a holistic positive concept of health at its founding. i.e., it said that health is the presence of complete well-being (including mental and social well-being) rather than just the absence of disease. This created a direct tension with the core tenets of biomedicine, especially the reduction of disease to a set of concrete observable and measurable physical bases (Valles 2018). Historically, the tension was resolved in the case of the WHO by the organization, shortly after its founding, effectively self-suppressing the use of its own definition of health in favor of pursuing a narrower set of initiatives to combat particular diseases (e.g., the celebrated Smallpox Eradication Program) (Irwin & Scali 2007). This seems to have been in part because cold war politics made it pragmatic to not antagonize the United States with pushing a health concept concerned with “social” well-being, sounding a bit reminiscent of socialism (Irwin & Scali 2007). While a WHO-type understanding of health is in genuine tension with the philosophical tenets of biomedicine, the tension is manageable in this case by simply pursuing areas of overlap between the different conceptions of disease (e.g., investing in infectious disease-control strategies for a population) while ignoring any purported aspects of health beyond the absence of pathologies (e.g., declining to invest in assessing how human-environment relations contribute to a population’s happiness or misery).

3. Epistemology of Biomedicine

There are philosophical disputes happening at the heart of the biomedical enterprise and those disputes offer a means of understanding the epistemological dimensions of biomedicine: the nature of evidence and knowledge in the framework. The most contentious of those internal biomedicine disputes center on what the epistemology of biomedicine ought to be, with the rise of “evidence-based medicine” (EBM) being the event that provoked the largest segment of these disputes. By examining the disputes surrounding EBM, we can gain a better understanding of the epistemology of biomedicine, as illustrated in work such as Solomon’s Making Medical Knowledge (2015).

Evidence-based medicine is a tricky concept, since its name misleadingly raises the question of who is practicing medicine that is not based on evidence (Goldenberg 2006). Instead, the dispute is over which evidence is best and how it ought to be used. For instance, physicians will often advise patients on which home treatments to use for minor lower back pain, with individual physicians varying in which treatments they recommend, even aside from differences in the advice based on differing patient characteristics. Ibuprofen? Acetaminophen? Heat and/or cold compresses? Exercise? The standard twentieth-century medical response would be to let physician groups (including consensus groups convened for this purpose) lay out the options and perhaps use their collective expertise to make a recommendation, but giving great leeway to individual physicians to use their individual accumulated expertise to choose another of the available options seen as viable options by their peers. EBM instead treats this as a matter to be largely decided by empirical research. I.e., we ought to run randomized control trial experiments that compare the efficacy of alternative options by randomly assigning patients with lower back pain into Treatment A or Treatment B—controlling for the single variable—and measure the effects on patients using predetermined metrics (change in reported pain severity, incidence of major side effects, etc.). After doing multiple experiments we can then do a “systematic review and meta-analysis” that compiles the data trends across parallel research studies and helps us build an evidence base for creating guidelines for which treatment clinicians ought to use. Those guidelines dictate the proper default practices, which individual clinicians can contravene if specific individual patient needs are in conflict (e.g., a patient history of not responding well to a certain medication).

EBM began as a self-described Kuhnian scientific revolution of biomedicine—a fundamental change of worldview that is incommensurable with the previous one; a paradigm shift (Evidence-Based Medicine Working Group 1992). The most fundamental dispute between advocates of the EBM movement and skeptics within the biomedical community is, in one sense, over the epistemic and power relationships between the two halves of biomedicine: biology and medicine. In biology, experimental methodologies and attempts to find generalizable population trends are valued highly; in clinical medicine, the single patient and the clinician’s accumulated (and ineffable) expert evaluation of them has long been valued very highly—much attention is paid to that individual patient’s contingencies (the particulars of their body and symptoms), with the clinician’s accumulated knowledge and know how being relied on when determining how to proceed. Evidence-based medicine is not a simplistic adoption of biology principles and their application to medicine; it is not the triumph of biology over medicine in biomedicine. Instead, EBM has helped to draw out deeper disagreements about what it means to do and use biomedical science well.

There is a large philosophical literature on evidence-based medicine, with the first monograph appearing in 2002 (Goodman 2002). Most of the literature takes at least a partially skeptical stance on EBM practitioners’ various hardline stances on evidentiary matters: the suitability of clinicians relying primarily on brief synopses that attempt to synthesize massive bodies of evidence (Borgerson 2009); the room for hidden biases in the process of evaluating medical data (Stegenga 2011), and more. EBM has also inspired passionate disputes among clinicians over how to apply its principles (Berwick 2005; Greenhalgh, Snow, Ryan, Rees, & Salisbury 2015). One line of criticism is that its aims are noble, but have been hijacked by bad actors, namely corporations that learned to that by getting involved in the production of randomized control trial evidence they could sway the evidence for the apparent safety and efficacy of their own products (Ioannidis 2016). Philosophy of EBM is given extensive discussion in the entry on Philosophy of Medicine, and as with the rest of this entry, this entry will avoid needless repetition and keep the focus on biomedicine per se.

3.1 Epistemology of expertise and experimental clinical data in biomedicine

Biomedicine is in a state of tension, between

  1. a history of resolving evidentiary disputes using mechanistic reasoning, consensus, and authority (see, e.g., Solomon [2015] on the roles played by ‘consensus conferences’) vs.
  2. a recent practice of creating predetermined evidentiary ranking/​evaluating procedures designed to minimize the ability of biased or erratic human judgments to unduly influence the resolution of evidentiary disputes.

Clinical guidelines were once routinely created by what is pejoratively called GOBSAT: Good Old Boys Sat Around A Table (and reached a consensus by talking amongst themselves as leading experts in the subject matter). As Greenhalgh puts it, “it is a major achievement of the EBM movement that almost no guideline these days is produced by GOBSAT!” (Greenhalgh 2014: 7). It remains a point of philosophical contention just how epistemically different it is to generate clinical practice guidelines using a consensus-based model vs. an evidence-based model, in large part since, no matter what evidence is prioritized, a group of experts will ultimately need to interpret the data and make judgment calls on how to generate practical guidelines based on the compiled evidence (Djulbegovic & Guyatt 2019). Though even the meaning of clinical expertise is itself not clearly defined and agreed upon, a matter further complicated by the way that the meaning of expertise is tangled up with views about what roles expertise ought to be playing in clinical practice (Wieten 2018).

Evidence-based medicine prizes certain types of biomedical evidence—highly controlled and systematic evidence—more highly than others. But that preference is a matter of much contention. As noted above, experimental evidence from a randomized experiment testing a treatment (a “randomized control trial”) is held as the best sort of evidence: the gold standard. The one exception is that “meta-analyses” of multiple experimental studies are perhaps a platinum standard better than gold (Stegenga 2011), i.e., the thinking goes that the only evidence that might be better than such experimental data is a rigorous quantitative study rigorously looking for patterns and lessons by analyzing the results many rigorous experimental studies. While the rigidity of EBM thinking gets a great deal of criticism, there are elements of the EBM’s philosophy that implement the sort of pragmatism that many critics desire, such as an epistemic openness in the community to engage in “open-ended critical inquiry” (Goldenberg 2009).

3.2 Epistemology of basic and applied science in biomedicine

The status of laboratory evidence is a major point of contention in philosophy of biomedicine disputes. “Bench science” is often used as a catchall term in EBM for a wide variety of laboratory evidence (biochemistry, pathology, digital models of drug metabolism, animal studies of a treatment, etc.), and that evidence is pushed to the very bottom of the evidence hierarchy (B. Clarke, Gillies, Illari, Russo, & Williamson 2014). For example, green tea contains epigallocatechin gallate (EGCG), which seems to be effective at killing cancer cells in petri dishes and in mice (Eisenstein 2019). EBM supporters would be inclined to look down on inferences that green tea is therefore a wise anti-cancer home health behavior, until there is at least epidemiological evidence that green tea drinkers genuinely do have better cancer outcomes. Even then, EBM supporters would want to know if the anti-cancer effects are due to EGCG, some combination of multiple components of green tea, or perhaps just the relaxing social act of having a hot beverage. Biomedicine has always valued the sort of research that investigates EGCG in petri dishes, in mice, or other models used on the laboratory bench, but the dispute is over how reliable one takes that research to be for guiding real medical decisions (ought physicians tell patients to drink green tea?).

The problem of how highly to value bench science is distinct from the general objection to hierarchies of evidence (Bluhm 2005). Even if evidence isn’t treated as inherently rankable in value, one key philosophical objection is that much of the biomedical research world is treated by EBM as less important than clinical patient experiments, or meta-analyses of such experimental data. Solomon explains that this position is in tension with a simultaneous trend in biomedicine, an increased concern with translational medicine (an effort to improve the process of moving candidate treatments from (the laboratory) bench to (the patient’s) bedside (Solomon 2011). This effort to better manage the biomedical research enterprise has brought with it,

a restoration of the recognition that clinical research requires an engagement with basic theory (e.g., physiological, genetic, biochemical) and a range of empirical techniques such as bedside observation, laboratory and animal studies. (Solomon 2011: 451)

In an openly conciliatory move, the “EBM+” group of philosophers and clinicians (see Other Internet Sources), offers a defense of the view that mainstream EBM has erred by essentially relegating mechanistic evidence, such as EGCG having anti-cancer chemical properties, to a subsidiary role (B. Clarke et al. 2014).

3.3 Epistemology of measurement in biomedicine

While epidemiology-focused EBM is partly in tension with most of the rest of laboratory-focused biomedicine—needing it but seeing it as in service to randomized control trials on patients—both EBM and other branches of biomedicine are united by a valuing of precise measurement. While precise measurement is achievable in the biochemistry lab, the practical and philosophical challenges are thornier when doing measurement at the level of the whole person or the population. What is well-being (Alexandrova 2017)? By what standards can we call a population healthy (Hausman 2015)? What sorts of social structures, policies, and interventions are effective for promoting health (Valles 2018)? How do we identify which subgroups are left out of the benefits and prevent injustices being done to them (Maglo 2010, 2012)? What sorts of values are at stake when we debate biomedical evidence surrounding culturally issues such as birthing practices (McClimans 2017)? A common theme shared by these critiques is a concern about the fickleness and contingency of measurement leaving much room for practitioners’ values and motivations to shape the results of the measurement process, for good or for ill.

The biomedical quest for precise and objective measurements leaves some unsatisfied with the little room left for patient input in clinical care decision-making. What roles are there for patient input in the process of deciding the best course of treatment (Chin-Yee & Upshur, 2018)? According to critiques, by trying to sideline subjective factors in medical care and replace them with increasingly objective factors, EBM especially (even among than other biomedical perspectives), risks losing the humanistic aspects of medicine, an ethical loss and an epistemic loss. By treating patients’ desires, goals, and values as largely irrelevant or a source of interference with an objective process, EBM loses sight of medicine as a means of helping real humans’ real problems. Relatedly, by shutting the patient out of the process, the notion of the best or right treatment becomes hollowed out (McClimans forthcoming).

In the background is the important—and meta-epistemic—problem that physicians are not educated to be comfortable with uncertainty, and what to do in an objective measurement-focused field when one finds oneself lacking the desired evidence: inconclusive tests, treatments designed for patients unlike the one being treated, etc. The very topic of uncertainty is conspicuously absent from medical education (Tonelli & Upshur 2019).

3.4 Reductionism in epistemology of biomedicine

In biomedicine, it appears much of medicine is reduced to applied biology—patients are just biochemical substances processes and medical knowledge is just a complicated form of biological knowledge. Keating and Cambrosio see the relationship between this reductionism in biomedicine (the reducing of medicine to biology) as more a matter of the two being aligned for complex historical and philosophical reasons, instead of that reductionism being philosophically central to biomedicine (Keating & Cambrosio 2003). According to them, after World War Two, the fields of biology and pathology negotiated the creation of “the institutional and epistemic hybrid we call biomedicine,” and neither component of this hybrid rules the other (Keating & Cambrosio 2003, p. 368). They see this as undermining claims of biomedicine being reductionist because such assertions implicitly or explicitly mean that (micro)biology gets epistemic priority because it is the true and stable foundation.

Part of the challenge is that there are multiple varieties of Reductionism in Biology. And there are a number of different reductionism disputes in biology, and the overlaps with biomedicine vary—e.g., Rosenberg’s defense of reductionism in genetics overlaps with biomedicine in the area of medical genetics (Rosenberg 2006). As discussed in Section 1, it is very difficult to tell the difference between the core components of biomedicine and the bits of philosophy/technology/sociology that aren’t inherently part of biomedicine, but have gotten tangled up in it. The rationale for reductionism in biomedicine is explained with great care by Andersen:

Being able to successfully take a disease as complex as sickle cell anemia or Parkinson’s and reduce it to a single genetic error that cascades through various systems, even if that reduction holds for only a proper subset of cases, illustrates that reduction can be a powerful tool for research and explanation in medicine. It cannot be the only tool in the toolkit, since some diseases or dysfunctions may be only partially reducible, or for which only some cases are reducible. But it is a good working assumption, as Oppenheim and Putnam put it, in tackling a problem with an unknown etiology, to look for ways to reduce it to a few or even a single causal driver at a molecular level (Andersen 2016: 86).

In other words, the potential for success and record of prior successes is an argument for at least operating under the assumption that biomedical scholars ought to continue treating biomedical mysteries as biochemical puzzles for which the relevant pieces have not yet been identified or assembled.

Reductionism in biomedicine has been targeted by some committed critics. For instance, Marcum explains that the process of reducing the body to such component parts yields a vision of the body as machine, a radically dehumanizing move.

From the biomechanical point of view, the patient’s body is often perceived as a material object that can be reduced to a system of physical parts. That body is viewed as a machine composed of individual body parts, which can be fixed or exchanged with new parts, when broken. By reducing the patient’s body to an assemblage of body parts, the patient qua person vanishes (Marcum 2005: 318).

While the critique stands on its own, it remains an open question what other view ought to be adopted if not a reductionist biomechanical one. Marcum contrasts the view most directly to phenomenological views—which will be discussed in Section 5—arguing that a phenomenological approach is better suited to advancing medicine, which he presents as being in a state of crisis.

EBM’s reliance on randomized control trials as a cornerstone of health data collection doubles down on the general reductionism of biomedicine. Randomized control trials assume that health variables can be observed, manipulated and controlled as largely independent units. Yet, is a well-established problem that we simply don’t know all of the variables that might confound a clinical experiment (Worrall 2007), so randomization can at most hope that the ‘confounders’ (e.g., unknown dietary factors that affect metabolization of a drug) are randomly distributed between the different treatment populations in an experiment. Taking the reductionism a step further, the goal of exactly measuring the differences between Treatment A and Treatment B requires EBM to only look for effects that are precisely measurable in the first place. This limitation is a deeply-rooted problem since even the official list of clinical signs and symptoms of a given disease can diverge from accumulated patient observations, and in cases such as some psychiatric conditions, the symptoms—or lack thereof—are overtly difficult to measure or factor into an assessment of treatment efficacy (e.g., one’s sense of self and/or emotional life) (Kendler 2016).

While reductionist and antireductionist approaches are in direct opposition, it is possible to take a pluralistic stance toward them: both can be welcomed into health science. For instance, this is the position taken by Campaner (2010). Though, as discussed in the next section, the power of the biomedical institution makes it such that biomechanical reductionist approaches can easily overwhelm alternative views.

4. Biomedicine as an Institution

The disputes over biomedicine’s virtues and flaws are tied to the other aspects of Western cultural-political-economic influence that coevolved with it, and travelled with it around the globe. The dynamics between the institution of biomedicine—rooted in wealthy Western countries—and low/middle-income countries is in part a manifestation of the philosophical complexities of the international political scene. See, for instance, the literature on International Distributive Justice.

As discussed in Section 1.2, biomedicine co-evolved with the West’s social and economic institutions in the aftermath of World War Two. Of particular importance, the individualism of Western capitalism has meshed with biomedicine’s ontological view of the body as effectively separable from its social context. Briggs and Hallin describe the how contemporary media and biomedicine work to coproduce public knowledge about health and disease, a process they dub biomediatization (Briggs & Hallin 2016).

Metzl and Kirkland’s influential edited volume Against Health: How Health Became the New Morality lays out a related case for how biomedicine exercised undue influence over culture, including casting health ills as personal failings deserving of public shaming and stigmatization (Metzl & Kirkland 2010). As an illustration of the sort of stigmatizing strategies that they condemn as unacceptable, bioethicist Daniel Callahan ethically endorsed the social practice of ‘fat shaming’ as a means of promoting public health (Callahan 2016). Empirical arguments on the harms of stigmatization (Hatzenbuehler, Phelan, & Link 2013), and contrary ethical arguments (Dean 2018), both rebut stigma as an ethically viable health-promoting intervention.

Health/body stigma, public rhetoric over health, and moralism about health behaviors are all subjected to scrutiny in critiques of ‘self-care’ strategies, e.g., telling ‘overweight’/overtired/overworked employees feeling stressed by their jobs that they should take better care of themselves by doing yoga, more closely monitoring their eating at work, etc. The critique is that the biomedical model can recast social problems (including outright abuses—usually capitalist ones) as individual responsibilities. Self-care can go well when it empowers, such as the Women’s Health Movement of the 1960s and 1970s that fought against sexism by calling upon women to know their own bodies and value that knowledge (Bueter 2017). Or self-care can become regressive when it becomes

inner-directed, authoritarian, victim-blaming, manipulated by dominant forces, or diversionary from struggles for radical change in both medicine and the broader society. (Sidel & Sidel 1981: 656)

In recent discourse, in which the problem of stress has garnered increased attention,

controlling the health problems associated with living in stressful situations therefore becomes the responsibility of the individuals—all too often, the responsibility of individuals who are already disadvantaged by their economic status, their race, or their social position more generally. (Kaplan 2019: 116)

Biomedicine has been used as one prong of colonial power dynamics between Western institutions and non-Western peoples (including indigenous peoples) (see Millum & Emanuel 2012). Colonial governments and cultural imperialism have long undermined or directly attacked local/indigenous medical frameworks and institutions. And since biomedical education and practice are based on technologies and education from the West, low- and middle-income countries are left dependent on wealthy Western countries (Nunn 2009). As a result, local would-be biomedical practitioners often travel to the West for biomedical education and then have little incentive to return to their home countries to practice techniques for which they will have relatively few biomedical tools, lower pay, etc. This raises further ethical questions related to which entities have which individual/collective responsibilities to address this so-called ‘brain drain’ trend (Yuksekdag forthcoming). Meanwhile, non-governmental organizations such as the Red Cross offer medical aid, but generally in the form of sending temporary trained personnel from the West, rather than building local capacity for medical training and practice. And well-meaning Western biomedical students travel to the same low- and middle-income countries, with limited biomedical skills and little or no knowledge of the populations or health needs, seeking to help populations assumed to be incapable of helping themselves (Pinto & Upshur 2009).

5. Alternative Frameworks

As noted at the beginning of this entry, critiques of biomedicine tend to focus on elements of biomedicine rather than the whole. There are exceptions to this. This section will review some of the frameworks that have been offered in place of biomedicine, though they vary in how similar they remain to the biomedical framework. Before delving into the alternative frameworks, it is important to discuss two prominent critiques of biomedicine that are influential primarily as holistic criticisms and not so much as sources of alternative visions of what ought to be offered in place of biomedicine.

Michel Foucault’s work, and use of the concepts biopower and biopolitics, remain touchstones for much of the critical discourse surrounding biomedicine. Foucault’s critique of modern medicine is part of a career critiquing other aspects of modernity, including the related topic of psychiatry. His famous work The Birth of the Clinic is written as a history, though in the process it highlighted aspects of biomedicine that other scholars went on to critique as well, either based on his critique or in parallel to it: dehumanization, reductionism, measurement and observation methods of dubious value, and the problem of the biomedicine’s institutional power (Foucault 1963 [2002]).

Ivan Illich’s Medical Nemesis is perhaps the most influential critique of biomedicine (Illich 1976). It combines critiques of (bio)medicine for failing at its own goals (iatrogenic disease—harms caused by medical treatment—are a large component) and for having the wrong goals in the first place (he valorizes death, disease, and pain as proper components of the human experience rather than enemies to be automatically and constantly opposed).

5.1 Traditional healing practices

“Complementary, alternative, or integrative medicine” is biomedicine’s ‘big tent’ category for non-biomedical systems of health care (see NCCIH in Other Internet Resources). Philosophers have pointed out that biomedicine, specifically evidence-based medicine, puts advocates of such non-biomedical systems into a no-win position. One such philosophical challenge is that some of the claims made by non-biomedical systems are claimed to be non-measurable experiences, e.g., the experience of Qi life force in traditional Chinese Medicine (Tonelli & Callahan 2001). This means that advocates have to either submit to the epistemological framework of biomedicine (which may be incapable of assessing some of the effects claimed to exist), or refusing to play by medicine’s rules and hence being dismissed by as quackery by biomedicine. Epistemically, it seems like the latter option is the better option, but it would require advocates to “work to develop new research designs and new standards of evidence that reflect their approach to medical care” (Borgerson 2005: 502).

Classical Chinese Medicine (CCM) remains practiced in communities around the world, and Lee draws out two core philosophical differences between CCM and biomedicine. First, CCM has

a process ontology—it considers causal relationships between events and processes to be foundational, rather than things. Furthermore, it implies complex causal relationships between events and processes which may be said to be multi-factorial and non-linear. (Lee 2017: 2)

Second, it is holistic

the universe and everything in it, including human beings, constitute wholes which are different from the sum of their parts, and which in turn are related and as well as inter-related with other wholes. (Lee 2017: 2)

It is within this philosophical system that treatments such as acupuncture and herbal/dietary remedies are used. While the gulf between biomedicine and CCM is wide, it is not entirely dissimilar from some Western scientific practices: CCM’s approach to health and the human body bear some resemblances to the ways that epidemiologists approach populations’ health and how ecologists approach ecosystems. Among other similarities, in both fields there is great respect for balance and dynamic interconnected processes (Lee forthcoming).

Ayurvedic medicine takes a somewhat similarly holistic and balance-oriented approach to the person and their health (Rastogi, 2014) (note also that holistic bodily balance is central to the Hippocractic medicine described in Section 1.2). One way that manifests in Ayurvedic practice—in contrast with biomedicine—is that the biological characteristics of two individuals might be similar but their recommended treatments might be quite different. For instance, while biomedicine routinely hands out standardized advice on what sorts of foods are best for someone of a given age and sex, Ayurvedic medicine rejects the assumption that such standardization within a single age-sex grouping is even a good default. Other factors play larger roles than in biomedicine, including bodily changes over the course of the day and one’s (internal) body type (affecting how one metabolizes specific foods, etc.). Complicating matters is that Ayurvedic medicine grew as a part of Hinduism in South Asia, and Hinduism itself is a substantially heterogeneous family of beliefs/practices that vary between communities (Desai 1988).

5.2 Narrative and phenomenological approaches

Among the numerous humanistic critiques of biomedicine, coming from the broad field of medical humanities (for an overview, see Marcum 2008), philosophers have paid particular attention to narrative and phenomenology (Ferry-Danini 2018).

Narrative medicine offers a revision to the biomedical model alternative based around the centrality of the story or narrative in human life (Charon 2006). This notion that narrative is central to human experience offers a variety of potential operationalizations in clinical biomedical practice. For instance, it places additional value on the patient consultation and asks for improved active listening skills among clinicians, who must learn to elicit, receive, and understand patients’ stories about their health conditions. Such listening has many potential benefits, including the potential to understand the meaning(s) of what human dignity means for a given patient, an important benefit given that biomedical settings are known for being “dehumanizing” (Parsons & Hooker 2010). Though, the proposition that humans are indeed narrative beings has itself been disputed (Woods 2011).

As shown by Carel, phenomenology’s value to medicine comes from its insistence on taking illness seriously (Carel 2016).

…we must enlist philosophical analysis in order to fully appreciate the existential transformation illness brings about. This transformation cannot be accounted for as merely physical or mental (in the case of psychiatric disorder) dysfunction. Rather, there is a need for a view of personhood as embodied, situated, and enactive, in order to explain how local changes to the ill person’s body and capacities modify her existence globally (Carel 2016: 14).

Biomedicine takes illness seriously, but the philosophical framework of biomedicine leaves no space for the notions of existential transformation as part of illness—disease is reduced to the state of a system in which there are malfunctioning parts (pathologies in body parts). See also the discussion of phenomenology in Section 3.4.

5.3 Gentle medicine and population health framework approaches

Stegenga has argued in favor of “gentle medicine,” a conservative treatment mindset that stands in contrast to the biomedical pursuit of ever-more interventions (Stegenga 2018)—a pill for each ailment. This is in one sense a challenge to biomedicine more in quantity than in quality; he does not advocate for switching from pills to naturopathic diet-based treatments. He recommends this (purportedly gentler) conservatism as a response to an epistemic devaluing of biomedicine knowledge which he calls: “medical nihilism…the view that we should have little confidence in the effectiveness of medical interventions” (Stegenga 2018: 1). This follows in the loose tradition of other writings, such as the text by Illich discussed at the start of Section 5 (Illich 1976). But Stegenga’s critique and replacement remains a radical challenge to biomedicine in the sense that it undercuts the epistemic practices of biomedicine and pushes back on the institutional practices (and the related infrastructure, including massive pharmaceutical companies) by arguing that (bio)medical treatments ought to be applied sparingly.

Valles offers an alternative—the population health framework—that partly meshes with Stegenga’s concluding suggestion that “gentle medicine” ought to be accompanied by interventions that refocus health promotion efforts on social determinants of health, including “clean drinking water, better nutrition, and greater socio-economic equality” (Stegenga 2018: 198). Valles expounds and defends the merits of the population health framework, a view developed in response to frustrations with biomedicine that coalesced in the 1990s in Canada as an alternative theoretical framework, before expanding internationally (Evans, Barer, & Marmor 1994; Valles 2018). The population health framework is not nihilistic about medical care, but rather seeks to decenter medicine and healthcare in the overall pursuit of health; most of the problems and most promising solutions to ill health lay outside the scope of biomedicine (safer workplaces, an end to racist housing discrimination, neighborhoods where people can safely walk, socialize and play, etc.) (Valles 2018).


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Other Internet Resources


I am indebted to Robyn Bluhm and Maya Goldenberg for their helpful comments on a draft of this work.

Copyright © 2020 by
Sean Valles <>

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