Michel Foucault

First published Wed Apr 2, 2003; substantive revision Tue May 22, 2018

Michel Foucault (1926–1984) was a French historian and philosopher, associated with the structuralist and post-structuralist movements. He has had strong influence not only (or even primarily) in philosophy but also in a wide range of humanistic and social scientific disciplines.

1. Biographical Sketch

Foucault was born in Poitiers, France, on October 15, 1926. As a student he was brilliant but psychologically tormented. He became academically established during the 1960s, holding a series of positions at French universities, before his election in 1969 to the ultra-prestigious Collège de France, where he was Professor of the History of Systems of Thought until his death. From the 1970s on, Foucault was very active politically. He was a founder of the Groupe d’information sur les prisons and often protested on behalf of marginalized groups. He frequently lectured outside France, particularly in the United States, and in 1983 had agreed to teach annually at the University of California at Berkeley. An early victim of AIDS, Foucault died in Paris on June 25, 1984. In addition to works published during his lifetime, his lectures at the Collège de France, published posthumously, contain important elucidations and extensions of his ideas.

One might question whether Foucault is in fact a philosopher. His academic formation was in psychology and its history as well as in philosophy, his books were mostly histories of medical and social sciences, his passions were literary and political. Nonetheless, almost all of Foucault’s works can be fruitfully read as philosophical in either or both of two ways: as carrying out philosophy’s traditional critical project in a new (historical) manner; and as a critical engagement with the thought of traditional philosophers. This article will present him as a philosopher in these two dimensions.

2. Intellectual Background

We begin, however, with a sketch of the philosophical environment in which Foucault was educated. He entered the École Normale Supérieure (the standard launching pad for major French philosophers) in 1946, during the heyday of existential phenomenology. Merleau-Ponty, whose lectures he attended, and Heidegger were particularly important. Hegel and Marx were also major interests, Hegel through the interpretation of his work offered by Jean Hyppolite and Marx through the structuralist reading of Louis Althusser—both teachers who had a strong impact on Foucault at the École Normale. It is not surprising that Foucault’s earliest works (his long “Introduction” to Jacqueline Verdeaux’ French translation of Traum und Existenz by Ludwig Binswanger, a Heideggerian psychiatrist, and Maladie mentale et personnalité, a short book on mental illness) were written in the grip of, respectively, existentialism and Marxism. But he soon turned away from both.

Jean-Paul Sartre, working outside the University system, had no personal influence on Foucault. But, as the French master-thinker of the previous generation, he is always in the background. Like Sartre, Foucault began from a relentless hatred of bourgeois society and culture and with a spontaneous sympathy for marginal groups such as the mad, homosexuals, and prisoners. They both also had strong interests in literature and psychology as well as philosophy, and both, after an early relative lack of political interest, became committed activists. But in the end, Foucault seemed to insist on defining himself in contradiction to Sartre. Philosophically, he rejected what he saw as Sartre’s privileging of the subject (which he mocked as “transcendental narcissism”). Personally and politically, he rejected Sartre’s role as what Foucault called a “universal intellectual”, judging society by appeals to universal moral principles, such as the inviolability of individual freedom. There is, however, more than a hint of protesting too much in Foucault’s rejection of Sartre, and the question of the relation of their work remains a fertile one.

Three other factors were of much more positive significance for the young Foucault. First, there was the French tradition of history and philosophy of science, particularly as represented by Georges Canguilhem, a powerful figure in the French University establishment, whose work in the history and philosophy of biology provided a model for much of Foucault’s work in the history of the human sciences. Canguilhem sponsored Foucault’s doctoral thesis on the history of madness and, throughout Foucault’s career, remained one of his most important and effective supporters. Canguilhem’s approach to the history of science (an approach developed from the work of Gaston Bachelard), provided Foucault with a strong sense (in some ways Kuhnian avant la lettre, see entry on scientific revolutions, section 5.3) of the discontinuities in scientific history, along with a “rationalist” understanding of the historical role of concepts that made them independent of the phenomenologists’ transcendental consciousness. Foucault found this understanding reinforced in the structuralist linguistics and psychology developed, respectively, by Ferdinand de Saussure and Jacques Lacan, as well as in Georges Dumézil’s proto-structuralist work on comparative religion. These anti-subjective standpoints provide the context for Foucault’s marginalization of the subject in his “structuralist histories”, The Birth of the Clinic (on the origins of modern medicine) and The Order of Things (on the origins of the modern human sciences).

In a quite different vein, Foucault was enthralled by French avant-garde literature, especially the writings of Georges Bataille and Maurice Blanchot, where he found the experiential concreteness of existential phenomenology without what he came to see as dubious philosophical assumptions about subjectivity. Of particular interest was this literature’s evocation of “limit-experiences”, which push us to extremes where conventional categories of intelligibility begin to break down.

This philosophical milieu provided materials for the critique of subjectivity and the corresponding “archaeological” and “genealogical” methods of writing history that inform Foucault’s projects of historical critique, to which we now turn.

3. Major Works

Since its beginnings with Socrates, philosophy has typically involved the project of questioning the accepted knowledge of the day. Later, Locke, Hume, and especially, Kant developed a distinctively modern idea of philosophy as the critique of knowledge. Kant’s great epistemological innovation was to maintain that the same critique that revealed the limits of our knowing powers could also reveal necessary conditions for their exercise. What might have seemed just contingent features of human cognition (for example, the spatial and temporal character of its perceptual objects) turn out to be necessary truths. Foucault, however, suggests the need to invert this Kantian move. Rather than asking what, in the apparently contingent, is actually necessary, he suggests asking what, in the apparently necessary, might be contingent. The focus of his questioning is the modern human sciences (biological, psychological, social). These purport to offer universal scientific truths about human nature that are, in fact, often mere expressions of ethical and political commitments of a particular society. Foucault’s “critical philosophy” undermines such claims by exhibiting how they are the outcome of contingent historical forces, not scientifically grounded truths. Each of his major books is a critique of historical reason.

3.1 Histories of Madness and Medicine

Foucault’s History of Madness in the Classical Age (1961) originated in his academic study of psychology (a licence de psychologie in 1949 and a diplome de psycho-pathologie in 1952), his work in a Parisian mental hospital, and his own personal psychological problems. It was mainly written during his post-graduate Wanderjahren (1955–59) through a succession of diplomatic/educational posts in Sweden, Germany, and Poland. A study of the emergence of the modern concept of “mental illness” in Europe, History of Madness is formed from both Foucault’s extensive archival work and his intense anger at what he saw as the moral hypocrisy of modern psychiatry. Standard histories saw the nineteenth-century medical treatment of madness (developed from the reforms of Pinel in France and the Tuke brothers in England) as an enlightened liberation of the mad from the ignorance and brutality of preceding ages. But, according to Foucault, the new idea that the mad were merely sick (“mentally” ill) and in need of medical treatment was not at all a clear improvement on earlier conceptions (e.g., the Renaissance idea that the mad were in contact with the mysterious forces of cosmic tragedy or the seventeenth-eighteenth-century view of madness as a renouncing of reason). Moreover, he argued that the alleged scientific neutrality of modern medical treatments of insanity are in fact covers for controlling challenges to conventional bourgeois morality. In short, Foucault argued that what was presented as an objective, incontrovertible scientific discovery (that madness is mental illness) was in fact the product of eminently questionable social and ethical commitments.

Foucault’s next history, The Birth of the Clinic (1963) also presents a critique of modern clinical medicine. But the socio-ethical critique is muted (except for a few vehement passages), presumably because there is a substantial core of objective truth in medicine (as opposed to psychiatry) and so less basis for criticism. As a result The Birth of the Clinic is much closer to a standard history of science, in the tradition of Canguilhem’s history of concepts.

3.2 The Order of Things

The book that made Foucault famous, Les mots et les choses (translated into English under the title The Order of Things), is in many ways an odd interpolation into the development of his thought. Its subtitle, “An Archaeology of the Human Sciences”, suggests an expansion of the earlier critical histories of psychiatry and clinical medicine into other modern disciplines such as economics, biology, and philology. And indeed there is an extensive account of the various “empirical disciplines” of the Renaissance and the Classical Age that precede these modern human sciences. But there is little or nothing of the implicit social critique found in the History of Madness or even The Birth of the Clinic. Instead, Foucault offers an analysis of what knowledge meant—and how this meaning changed—in Western thought from the Renaissance to the present. At the heart of his account is the notion of representation. Here we focus on his treatment of representation in philosophical thought, where we find Foucault’s most direct engagement with traditional philosophical questions.

3.2.1 Classical Representation

Foucault argues that from Descartes up to Kant (during what he calls the Classical Age) representation was simply assimilated to thought: to think just was to employ ideas to represent the object of thought. But, he says, we need to be clear about what it meant for an idea to represent an object. This was not, first of all, any sort of relation of resemblance: there were no features (properties) of the idea that themselves constituted the representation of the object. (Saying this, however, does not require that the idea itself have no properties or even that these properties are not relevant to the idea’s representation of the object.) By contrast, during the Renaissance, knowledge was understood as a matter of resemblance between things.

The map is a useful model of Classical representation. It consists, for example, of a set of lines of varying widths, lengths, and colors, and thereby represents the roads in and around a city. This is not because the roads have the properties of the map (the widths, lengths, and colors of the lines) but because the abstract structure given in the map (the relations among the lines) duplicates the abstract structure of the roads. At the heart of Classical thought is the principle that we know in virtue of having ideas that, in this sense, represent what we know. Of course, in contrast to the map, we do not need to know what the actual features of our ideas are in virtue of which they are able to represent. (In Descartes’ scholastic terminology, we do not need to know their “formal reality”.) We need to know only the abstract structure that they share with the things they represent (the structure of what Descartes calls their “objective reality”). We do, however, have direct (introspective) access to the abstract structures of our ideas: we can “see” what representational structure they have. Further, we can alter an idea’s structure to make it a better representation of an object, as we can alter a map to improve it.

How, on the Classical view, do we know that an idea is a representation of an object—and an adequate representation? Not, Foucault argues, by comparing the idea with the object as it is apart from its representation. This is impossible, since it would require knowing the object without a representation (when, for Classical thought, to know is to represent). The only possibility is that the idea itself must make it apparent that it is a representation. The idea represents the very fact that it is a representation. As to the question of whether an idea is a representation, this “self-referential” feature is all there is to it. As to adequacy, it must be that some subset of ideas likewise bear witness to their own adequacy—as, for example, Descartes’ “clear and distinct perceptions” or Hume’s simple impressions. In this sense, early modern philosophy is based on “intuition” (intellectual or sensory). Note, however, that an “intuition” of an idea’s adequacy does not, of itself, establish the independent existence of the object represented by the idea. As far as the early modern view is concerned, there may be no such objects; or, if there are, this needs to be established by some other means (e.g., an argument or some other sort of intuition).

We see, then, that for Foucault the key to Classical knowing is the idea, that is, mental representation. Classical thinkers might disagree about the actual ontological status of ideas (their formal reality); but they all agreed that as representations (epistemically, if not ontologically) they were “non-physical” and “non-historical”; that is, precisely as representing their objects, they could not be conceived as having any role in the causal networks of the natural or the human worlds. From this it further followed that language—precisely as a physical and/or historical reality—could have no fundamental role in knowledge. Language could be nothing more than a higher-order instrument of thought: a physical representation of ideas, having no meaning except in relation to them.

3.2.2 Kant’s Critique of Classical Representation

Foucault maintains that the great “turn” in modern philosophy occurs with Kant (though presumably he is merely an example of something much broader and deeper). Kant raises the question of whether ideas do in fact represent their objects and, if so, how (in virtue of what) they do so. In other words, ideas are no longer taken as the unproblematic vehicles of knowledge; it is now possible to think that knowledge might be (or have roots in) something other than representation. This did not mean that representation had nothing at all to do with knowledge. Perhaps some (or even all) knowledge still essentially involved ideas’ representing objects. But, Foucault insists, the thought that was only now (with Kant) possible was that representation itself (and the ideas that represented) could have an origin in something other than representation.

This thought, according to Foucault, led to some important and distinctively modern possibilities. The first was developed by Kant himself, who thought that representations (thoughts or ideas) were themselves the product of (“constituted” by) the mind. Not, however, produced by the mind as a natural or historical reality, but as belonging to a special epistemic realm: transcendental subjectivity. Kant thus maintained the Classical view that knowledge cannot be understood as a physical or historical reality, but he located the grounds of knowledge in a domain (the transcendental) more fundamental than the ideas it subtended. We must add, of course, that Kant also did not think of this domain as possessing a reality beyond the historical and the physical; it was not metaphysical. But this metaphysical alternative was explored by the idealistic metaphysics that followed Kant. Another—and in some ways more typically modern—view was that ideas were themselves historical realities. This could be most plausibly developed, as Herder did, by tying ideas essentially to language, now regarded as the primary (and historicized) vehicle of knowledge. But such an approach was not viable in its pure form, since to make knowledge entirely historical would deprive it of any normative character and so destroy its character as knowledge. In other words, even when modern thought made knowledge essentially historical, it had to retain some functional equivalent of Kant’s transcendental realm to guarantee the normative validity of knowledge.

3.2.3 Language and “Man”

At this point, The Order of Things introduces the two central features of thought after Kant: the return of language and the “birth of man”. Our discussion above readily explains why Foucault talks of a return of language: it now has an independent and essential role that it did not have in the Classical view. But the return is not a monolithic phenomenon. Language is related to knowledge in diverse ways, each of which corresponds a distinctive sort of “return”. So, for example, the history of natural languages has introduced confusions and distortions that we can try to eliminate through techniques of formalization. On the other hand, this same history may have deposited fundamental truths in our languages that we can unearth only by the methods of hermeneutic interpretation. (So these two apparently opposed approaches—underlying the division of analytic and continental philosophy—are in fact, according to Foucault, complementary projects of modern thought.) But there is yet another possibility: freed from its subordination to ideas, language can function (as in the Renaissance) as an autonomous reality—indeed as even more deeply autonomous than Renaissance language, since there is no system of resemblances binding it to the world. Even more, Foucault suggests, language is a truth unto itself, speaking nothing other than its own meaning. This is the realm of “pure literature”, evoked by Mallarmé when he answered Nietzsche’s (genealogical) question, “Who is speaking?” with, “Language itself”. In contrast to the Renaissance, however, there is no divine Word underlying and giving unique truth to the words of language. Literature is literally nothing but language—or rather many languages, speaking for and of themselves.

Even more important than language is the figure of man. The most important point about “man” is that it is an epistemological concept. Man, Foucault says, did not exist during the Classical age (or before). This is not because there was no idea of human beings as a species or of human nature as a psychological, moral, or political reality. Rather, “there was no epistemological consciousness of man as such” (The Order of Things, [1973: 309]). But even “epistemological” needs construal. There is no doubt that even in the Classical age human beings were conceived as the locus of knowledge (since humans possess the ideas that represent the world). The notion of man, on the other hand, is epistemological in the Kantian sense of a transcendental subject that is also an empirical object. For the Classical age, human beings are the locus of representations but not, as for Kant, their source. There is, in Classical thought, no room for the modern notion of “constitution”.

Foucault illustrates his point through a striking discussion of Descartes’ cogito, showing why it is an indubitable certitude within the classical episteme, but not within the modern episteme. There are two ways of questioning the force of the cogito. One is to suggest that the subject (the thinking self, the I) that Descartes concludes necessarily exists in the act of thinking is something more than just the act of representing objects; so we can’t go from representation to a thinker. But for the Classical Age this makes no sense, since thinking is representation. A second criticism would be that the self as representer may not be “really real” but merely the “product of” (constituted by) a mind that is real in a fuller sense. But this objection has weight only if we can think of this “more real” mind as having the self as an object in some sense other than representing it. (Otherwise, there is no basis for saying that the self as representer is “less real”.) But, once again, this is precisely what cannot be thought in Classical terms.

3.2.4 The Analytic of Finitude

At the very heart of man is his finitude: the fact that, as described by the modern empirical sciences, he is limited by the various historical forces (organic, economic, linguistic) operating on him. This finitude is a philosophical problem because man as a historically limited empirical being must somehow also be the source of the representations whereby we know the empirical world, including ourselves as empirical beings. I (my consciousness) must, as Kant put it, be both an empirical object of representation and the transcendental source of representations. How is this possible? Foucault’s view is that, in the end, it isn’t—and that the impossibility (historically realized) means the collapse of the modern episteme. What Foucault calls the “analytic of finitude” sketches the historical case for this conclusion, examining the major efforts (together making up the heart of modern philosophy) to understand man as “empirico-transcendental”.

The question—and the basic strategy for answering it—go back, of course, to Kant, who put forward the following crucial idea: that the very factors that make us finite (our subjection to space, time, causality, etc.) are also conditions necessary for the possibility of empirical knowledge. Our finitude is, therefore, simultaneously founded and founding (positive and fundamental, as Foucault puts it). The project of modern (Kantian and post-Kantian) philosophy—the analytic of finitude—is to show how this is possible.

Some modern philosophy tries to resolve the problem of man by, in effect, reducing the transcendental to the empirical. For example, naturalism attempts to explain knowledge in terms of natural science (physics, biology), while Marxism appeals to historical social sciences. (The difference is that the first grounds knowledge in the past—e.g., an evolutionary history—whereas the second grounds it in a revolutionary future that will transcend the limitations of ideology.) Either approach simply ignores the terms of the problem: that man must be regarded as irreducibly both empirical and transcendental.

It might seem that Husserl’s phenomenology has carried out the Kantian project of synthesizing man as object and man as subject by radicalizing the Cartesian project; that is, by grounding our knowledge of empirical truths in the transcendental subject. The problem, however, is that, as Foucault sees it, the modern notion of man excludes Descartes’ idea of the cogito as a “sovereign transparency” of pure consciousness. Thought is no longer pure representation and therefore cannot be separated from an “unthought” (i.e., the given empirical and historical truths about who we are). I can no longer go from “I think” to “I am” because the content of my reality (what I am) is always more than the content of any merely thinking self (I am, e.g., living, working, and speaking—and all these take me beyond the realm of mere thought). Or, conversely, if we use “I” to denote me simply as a conscious being, then I “am not” much of what I (as a self in the world) am. As a result, to the extent that Husserl has grounded everything in the transcendental subject, this is not the subject (cogito) of Descartes but the modern cogito, which includes the (empirical) unthought. Phenomenology, like all modern thought, must accept the unthought as the ineliminable “other” of man. Nor are the existential phenomenologists (Sartre and Merleau-Ponty) able to solve the problem. Unlike Husserl, they avoid positing a transcendental ego and instead focus on the concrete reality of man-in-the world. But this, Foucault claims, is just a more subtle way of reducing the transcendental to the empirical.

Finally, some philosophers (Hegel and Marx in one way, Nietzsche and Heidegger in another) have tried to resolve the problem of man’s dual status by treating him as a historical reality. But this move encounters the difficulty that man has to be both a product of historical processes and the origin of history. If we treat man as a product, we find ourselves reducing his reality to something non-human (this is what Foucault calls the “retreat” from man’s origin). But if we insist on a “return” to man as his own proper origin, then we can no longer make sense of his place in the empirical world. This paradox may explain the endless modern obsession with origins, but there is never any way out of the contradiction between man as originator and man as originated. Nonetheless, Foucault thinks that the modern pursuit of the question of origins has provided us with a deeper sense of the ontological significance of time, particularly in the thought of Nietzsche and Heidegger, who reject Hegel’s and Marx’s view of the return to our origin as a redemptive fullness of being, and instead see it as a confrontation with the nothingness of our existence.

3.3 From Archaeology to Genealogy

Foucault explicitly presents The Order of Things as an “archaeological” approach to the history of thought. Three years later, in 1969, he published The Archaeology of Knowledge, a methodological treatise that explicitly formulates what he took to be the archaeological method that he used not only in The Order of Things but also (at least implicitly) in History of Madness and The Birth of the Clinic. The key idea of the archaeological method is that systems of thought and knowledge (epistemes or discursive formations, in Foucault’s terminology) are governed by rules, beyond those of grammar and logic, that operate beneath the consciousness of individual subjects and define a system of conceptual possibilities that determines the boundaries of thought in a given domain and period. So, for example, History of Madness should, Foucault maintained, be read as an intellectual excavation of the radically different discursive formations that governed talk and thought about madness from the seventeenth through the nineteenth centuries.

Archaeology was an essential method for Foucault because it supported a historiography that did not rest on the primacy of the consciousness of individual subjects; it allowed the historian of thought to operate at an unconscious level that displaced the primacy of the subject found in both phenomenology and in traditional historiography. However, archaeology’s critical force was restricted to the comparison of the discursive formations of different periods. Such comparisons could suggest the contingency of a given way of thinking by showing that the people living in previous ages had thought very differently (and, apparently, just as effectively). But mere archaeological analysis could say nothing about the causes of the transition from one way of thinking to another and so had to ignore perhaps the most forceful case for the contingency of entrenched contemporary positions. Genealogy, the new method first deployed in Discipline and Punish, was intended to remedy this deficiency.

Foucault intended the term “genealogy” to evoke Nietzsche’s genealogy of morals, particularly with its suggestion of complex, mundane, inglorious origins—in no way part of any grand scheme of progressive history. The point of a genealogical analysis is to show that a given system of thought (itself uncovered in its essential structures by archaeology, which therefore remains part of Foucault’s historiography) was the result of contingent turns of history, not the outcome of rationally inevitable trends.

3.4 History of the Prison

Discipline and Punish, published in 1975, is a genealogical study of the development of the “gentler” modern way of imprisoning criminals rather than torturing or killing them. While recognizing the element of genuinely enlightened reform, Foucault particularly emphasizes how such reform also becomes a vehicle of more effective control: “to punish less, perhaps; but certainly to punish better”. He further argues that the new mode of punishment becomes the model for control of an entire society, with factories, hospitals, and schools modeled on the modern prison. We should not, however, think that the deployment of this model was due to the explicit decisions of some central controlling agency. Foucault’s analysis shows how techniques and institutions, developed for different and often quite innocuous purposes, converged to create the modern system of disciplinary power.

At the core of Foucault’s picture of modern disciplinary society are three primary techniques of control: hierarchical observation, normalizing judgment, and the examination. To a great extent, control over people (power) can be achieved merely by observing them. So, for example, the tiered rows of seats in a stadium not only makes it easy for spectators to see but also for guards or security cameras to scan the audience. A perfect system of observation would allow one “guard” to see everything (a situation approximated, as we shall see, in Jeremy Bentham’s Panopticon). But since this is not usually possible, there is a need for “relays” of observers, hierarchically ordered, through whom observed data passes from lower to higher levels.

A distinctive feature of modern power (disciplinary control) is its concern with what people have not done (nonobservence), with, that is, a person’s failure to reach required standards. This concern illustrates the primary function of modern disciplinary systems: to correct deviant behavior. The main goal is not revenge (as in the case of the tortures of premodern punishment) but reform, where reform means primarily coming to live by society’s standards or norms. Discipline through imposing precise and detailed norms (“normalization”) is quite different from the older system of judicial punishment, which merely judges each action as allowed by the law or not allowed by the law and does not say that those judged are “normal” or “abnormal”. This idea of normalization is pervasive in our society: e.g., national standards for educational programs, for medical practice, for industrial processes and products.

The examination (for example, of students in schools, of patients in hospitals) is a method of control that combines hierarchical observation with normalizing judgment. It is a prime example of what Foucault calls power/knowledge, since it combines into a unified whole “the deployment of force and the establishment of truth” (1975 [1977: 184]). It both elicits the truth about those who undergo the examination (tells what they know or what is the state of their health) and controls their behavior (by forcing them to study or directing them to a course of treatment).

On Foucault’s account, the relation of power and knowledge is far closer than in the familiar Baconian engineering model, for which “knowledge is power” means that knowledge is an instrument of power, although the two exist quite independently. Foucault’s point is rather that, at least for the study of human beings, the goals of power and the goals of knowledge cannot be separated: in knowing we control and in controlling we know.

The examination also situates individuals in a “field of documentation”. The results of exams are recorded in documents that provide detailed information about the individuals examined and allow power systems to control them (e.g., absentee records for schools, patients’ charts in hospitals). On the basis of these records, those in control can formulate categories, averages, and norms that are in turn a basis for knowledge. The examination turns the individual into a “case”—in both senses of the term: a scientific example and an object of care. Caring is always also an opportunity for control.

Bentham’s Panopticon is, for Foucault, a paradigmatic architectural model of modern disciplinary power. It is a design for a prison, built so that each inmate is separated from and invisible to all the others (in separate “cells”) and each inmate is always visible to a monitor situated in a central tower. Monitors do not in fact always see each inmate; the point is that they could at any time. Since inmates never know whether they are being observed, they must behave as if they are always seen and observed. As a result, control is achieved more by the possibility of internal monitoring of those controlled than by actual supervision or heavy physical constraints.

The principle of the Panopticon can be applied not only to prisons but also to any system of disciplinary power (a factory, a hospital, a school). And, in fact, although Bentham himself was never able to build it, its principle has come to pervade aspects of modern society. It is the instrument through which modern discipline has been able to replace pre-modern sovereignty (kings, judges) as the fundamental power relation.

Foucault’s genealogy follows Nietzsche as well as existential phenomenology in that it aims to bring the body into the focus of history. Rather than histories of mentalities or ideas, genealogies are “histories of the body”. They examine the historical practices through which the body becomes an object of techniques and deployments of power. In Discipline and Punish, Foucault shows how disciplinary techniques produce “docile bodies”: bodies of prisoners, soldiers, workers and schoolchildren were subjected to disciplinary power in order to make them more useful and at the same time easier to control. The human body became a machine the functioning of which could be optimized, calculated, and improved. Its functions, movements and capabilities were broken down into narrow segments, analyzed in detail and recomposed in a maximally effective way.

By historicizing the body, Foucault’s genealogies also have distinctive philosophical implications. They question the naturalistic explanatory framework that understands human nature—uncovered by science—as the basis for such complex areas of behavior as sexuality, insanity or criminality. A key idea in Foucault’s historical analysis of the modern penal institutions is that they operate with markedly different rationality than those that are aimed solely at retribution through pain. He effectively reveals the double role of the present system: it aims at both punishing and correcting, and therefore it mixes juridical and scientific practices. Foucault argued that the intervention of criminal psychiatry in the field of law that occurred at the beginning of the nineteenth century, for example, was part of the gradual shift in penal practice from a focus on the crime to a focus on the criminal, from the action to agency and personality. The new idea of the “dangerous individual” referred to the danger potentially inherent in the criminal person. The new rationality could not function in an effective way in the existing system without the emergence of new forms of scientific knowledge such as criminal psychiatry that enabled the characterization of criminals in themselves, beneath their acts. Foucault suggests that this shift resulted in the emergence of new, insidious forms of domination and violence. The critical impact of Discipline and Punish thus lies in its ability to reveal the processes of subject formation that operate in modern penal institutions. The modern prison does not just punish by depriving its inmates of liberty, it categorizes them as delinquent subjects, types of people with a dangerous, criminal nature.

3.5 History of Modern Sexuality

Foucault’s history of sexuality was originally projected as a fairly straightforward extension of the genealogical approach of Discipline and Punish to the topic of sexuality. Foucault’s idea is that the various modern fields of knowledge about sexuality (various “sciences of sexuality”, including psychoanalysis) have an intimate association with the power structures of modern society and so are prime candidates for genealogical analysis. The first volume of this project, published in 1976, was intended as the introduction to a series of studies on particular aspects of modern sexuality (children, women, “perverts”, population, etc.). It outlined the project of the overall history, explaining the basic viewpoint and the methods to be used.

On Foucault’s account, modern control of sexuality parallels modern control of criminality by making sex (like crime) an object of allegedly scientific disciplines, which simultaneously offer knowledge and domination of their objects. However, it becomes apparent that there is a further dimension in the power associated with the sciences of sexuality. Not only is there control exercised via other people’s knowledge of individuals such as doctors’ knowledge, for example; there is also control via individuals’ knowledge of themselves. Individuals internalize the norms laid down by the sciences of sexuality and monitor themselves in an effort to conform to these norms. Thus, they are controlled not only as objects of disciplines but also as self-scrutinizing and self-forming subjects.

Foucault shows how sexuality becomes an essential construct in determining not only moral worth, but also health, desire, and identity. Subjects are further obligated to tell the truth about themselves by confessing the details of their sexuality. Foucault argued that modern sexuality was characterized by the secularization of religious techniques of confession: one no longer confesses the details of one’s sexual desire to a priest; one goes to a doctor, a therapist, a psychologist, or a psychiatrist.

The book begins with a repudiation of the “repressive hypothesis”, the idea that sexuality in the Victorian era was repressed and discourse on it silenced. Foucault claims that it was not repression that characterized the primary attitude of modern society towards sex; rather, sexuality became the object of new kinds of discourse—medical, juridical and psychological ­– and that discourse on it actually increased. Sexuality was inextricably linked to truth: these new discourses were able to tell us the scientific truth about ourselves through our sexuality.

Although the book is a historical study of the emergence of modern sexuality in the nineteenth century, Foucault’s targets were also contemporary ideas and practices. The prevalent views on sexuality in the 1960s and 1970s held that there was a natural and healthy sexuality that all human beings shared simply in virtue of being human, and this sexuality was presently repressed by cultural prohibitions and conventions such as bourgeois morality and capitalist socio-economic structures. Repressed sexuality was the cause of various neuroses and it was important to have an active and free sexuality. The popular discourse on sexuality thus fervently argued for sexual liberation: we had to liberate our true sexuality from the repressive mechanisms of power.

Foucault challenged this view by showing how our conceptions and experiences of sexuality are in fact always the result of specific cultural conventions and mechanisms of power and could not exist independently of them. The mission to liberate our repressed sexuality was thus fundamentally misguided because there was no authentic or natural sexuality to liberate. To free oneself from one set of norms only meant adopting different norms in their stead, and that could turn out to be just as controlling and normalizing. He wrote mockingly that the irony of our endless preoccupation with sexuality was that we believed that it had something to do with our liberation.

In order to challenge the dominant view of the relationship between sexuality and repressive power, Foucault had to re-conceive the nature of power. His major claim is that power is not essentially repressive but productive. It does not operate by repressing and prohibiting the true and authentic expressions of a natural sexuality. Instead it produces, through cultural normative practices and scientific discourses, the ways in which we experience and conceive of our sexuality. Power relations are “the internal conditions” of our sexual identities.

Foucault outlined what became one of the most influential contemporary understandings of power in a series of short propositions over three pages of The History of Sexuality, Volume 1. He elucidated and developed this understanding of power in a number of essays, lectures and interviews throughout the rest of his life, but the basic idea was already present in these pages. We should not try to look for the center of power, or for the individuals, institutions or classes that rule, but should rather construct a “microphysics of power” that focuses on the multitude of loci of power spread throughout a society: families, workplaces, everyday practices, and marginal institutions. One has to analyze power relations from the bottom up and not from the top down, and to study the myriad ways in which the subjects themselves are constituted in these diverse but intersecting networks.

Although dispersed among various interlacing networks throughout society, power nevertheless has a rationality, a series of aims and objectives, and the means of attaining them. This does not imply that any individual has consciously formulated them. As the example of the Panopticon shows, power often functions according to a clear rationality irrespective of the intentions and motives of the individual who guards the prison from the tower. Despite the centrality of the Panopticon as a model for power, Foucault does not hold that power forms a deterministic system of overbearing constraints. Power should rather be understood and analyzed as an unstable network of practices implying that where there is power, there is always resistance too. Just as there is no center of power, there is no center of resistance somewhere outside of it. Resistance is rather inherent in power relations and their dynamics, it is “the odd term in the relations of power” (1976 [1978: 96]). While power relations permeate the whole body of society, they may be denser in some regions and less dense in others.

Foucault’s short but influential discussion of biopower also first appears at the end of The History of Sexuality, Vol. 1. Foucault contrasts it to what he calls sovereign power: a form of power that was historically founded on violence—the right to kill. It was exercised mainly by “deduction” (taking something away): it consisted of the right to appropriate a portion of the nation’s wealth, for example by imposing a tax on products, goods and services, or by demanding a portion of the subjects’ time, strength, and ultimately life itself. The obligation to wage war on behalf of the sovereign and the imposition of death penalty for going against his will were the clearest forms of such power. But Foucault claims that the West has undergone a profound transformation in its mechanisms of power since the seventeenth century. Deductive and violent sovereign power has been gradually complemented and partly replaced by biopower, a form of power that exerts a positive influence on life, “that endeavors to administer, optimize, and multiply it, subjecting it to precise controls and comprehensive regulations” (1976 [1978: 137]). This era of biopower is marked by the explosion of numerous and diverse techniques for achieving the control of populations: techniques that, for example, coordinate medical care, normalize behavior, rationalize mechanisms of insurance, and rethink urban planning. The aim is the effective administration of bodies and the calculated management of life through means that are scientific and continuous. Mechanisms of power and knowledge have assumed responsibility for the life process in order to optimize, control, and modify it. The exercise of power over living beings no longer carries the threat of death, but instead takes charge of their lives.

The rationality of biopower is markedly different from that of sovereign power in terms not just of its objectives, but also of its instruments. A major consequence of its development is the growing importance of norms at the expense of the juridical system of the law. Foucault claims that the dominance of biopower as the paradigmatic form of power means that we live in a society in which the power of the law has subsided in favor of regulative and corrective mechanisms based on scientific knowledge. Biopower penetrates traditional forms of political power, but it is essentially the power of experts and administrators.

The genealogical attempt to historicize the body is prominent also in The History of Sexuality, Vol. 1, but now Foucault’s target is the naturalist explanations of sex and sexuality. At the end of the book Foucault takes up the question of whether we can find a scientific truth about sex. He makes clear that his genealogical investigation of sexuality implies a challenge to a certain kind of explanatory framework of sexuality and gender: the idea of sex as a natural foundation or an unobserved cause, which supports the visible effects of gender and sexuality. He critically appraises the idea of a natural, scientifically defined true sex by revealing the historical development of this form of thought. He does not claim that sex, understood as the categories of maleness and femaleness, was invented in a particular historical period. He rather analyses the ways in which these categories were founded and explained in discourses claiming the status of scientific truth, and how this allegedly “pure” explanation in fact constituted these categories so that they were understood as “natural”. This idea has had enormous influence on feminist philosophers and queer theorists. Judith Butler has appropriated this idea in her influential book Gender Trouble to argue that allegedly scientific ideas of sex as a natural and necessary ground for sexual and gendered identities in fact have a normative function: they constitute our conceptions of “normal” men and women and their “natural” sexual desire for each other.

3.6 Sex in the Ancient World

Foucault’s final engagement with traditional philosophy arises from the turn toward the ancient world he took in the last few years of his life. The History of Sexuality had been planned as a multi-volume work on various themes in a study of modern sexuality. The first volume, discussed above, was a general introduction. Foucault wrote a second volume (Les aveux de la chair) that dealt with the origins of the modern notion of the subject in the practices of Christian confession, but he never published it. (It was published posthumously in 2018.) His concern was that a proper understanding of the Christian development required a comparison with ancient conceptions of the ethical self, something he undertook in his last two books (1984) on Greek and Roman sexuality: The Use of Pleasure and The Care of the Self.

These treatments of ancient sexuality moved Foucault into ethical issues that had been implicit but seldom explicitly thematized in his earlier writings. What emerges out of his historical studies of ancient sexuality is a particular conception of ethics that he traces to antiquity. In the ancient conception, ethics referred to the practice through which one forms oneself as an ethical subject following the prescriptive elements of morality. It concerns the way in which moral rules can be adopted and problematized by the subjects themselves.

The importance of a study of ethics becomes apparent when we try to make visible the difference between the morality of antiquity and that of Christianity. Foucault’s specific goal was to compare ancient pagan and Christian ethics through the test-case of sexuality and to trace the development of Christian ideas about sex from the very different ideas of the ancients. He argues that, contrary to what is often believed, on the level of moral codes of behavior, there are in fact striking similarities between antiquity and Christianity. Both shared, for example, a concern that sexual expenditure could harm an individual’s health, and they both valued conjugal fidelity and sexual abstinence. But there was a strong contrast in the ways these two cultures understood and practiced these ideals and demands.

In the Christian view sexual acts were, on the whole, evil in themselves and most forms of sexual activity were simply forbidden. A main emphasis in Christian morality is therefore on the moral code, its systematicity, its richness, and its capacity to adjust to every possible case and to embrace every area of behavior. The rules in Christian monasteries, for example, were not only very severe, but also extremely detailed. The morality of antiquity, on the other hand, is one in which the code and rules of behavior are rudimentary. The ancient Greeks’ view was that sexual acts were natural and necessary, but subject to abuse. They emphasized the proper use (chresis) of pleasures, where this involved engaging in a range of sexual activities (heterosexual, homosexual, in marriage, out of marriage), but with proper moderation. Their texts discussing morality therefore lay down very few explicit rules or guidelines on the kinds of sexual acts that one should engage in. More important than the moral rules was the relationship that one had with oneself, the choice of the “style of existence” made by the individual. Sexual austerity, for example, was not practiced as a result of prohibitions, but because of a personal choice to live a beautiful life and to leave to others memories of a beautiful existence. Sex for the Greeks was a major part of what Foucault called an “aesthetics of existence”: the self’s creation of a beautiful and enjoyable existence.

Foucault’s last two books are an attempt to make a contribution to the task of rethinking ethics, but they are also a continuation of his attempt to rethink the subject. Now the focus is on the forms of understanding that subjects create about themselves and the practices by which they transform their mode of being. In his study of ancient Greek ethics, Foucault continued to pursue his idea that there was no true self that could be deciphered and emancipated, but that the self was something that had been—and must be—created. There is, however, a whole new axis of analysis present in his late studies of the subject. While his earlier genealogical studies investigated the ways in which power/knowledge networks constituted the subject, his late work emphasizes the subject’s own role in this process. It therefore offers a more complex understanding of the subject. Subjects are not simply constructed by power; they themselves partake in that construction and modify themselves through practices of the self. They are not just docile bodies, but actively refuse, adopt and alter forms of being a subject. One way of contesting normalizing power is by shaping oneself and one’s lifestyle creatively: by exploring opportunities for new ways of being, new fields of experience, pleasures, relationships, modes of living and thinking.

4. Foucault after Foucault

Foucault left instructions that there should be no posthumous publication of his writings that he had not published in his lifetime. But Foucault had allowed taping of his lectures, and his estate decided that this amounted to permission to publish edited versions of his public lectures based on his notes and tape recordings. This decision has allowed print editions of the annual courses of lectures that he delivered at the Collège de France from 1970–71 through 1983–84 (except for a sabbatical year in 1976–77) as well as other lectures he gave in different universities around the world. This has made an enormous body of important material available. Some of it covers work later published, but some presents ideas that appear nowhere else.

The lecture series Security, Territory, Population (1977–1978) and The Birth of Biopolitics (1978–1979) have been especially influential and introduce Foucault’s ideas on government and governmentality. “Government” becomes Foucault’s preferred term for power, while “governmentality” functions as his main theoretical tool for analyzing its rationality, techniques, and procedures in the modern world.

Foucault shows that while government historically referred to a wide range of practices, from religious guidance of the soul to ruling over a territory and its inhabitants, in the context of the modern state it has come to mean governing a population. Population as the object of modern forms of government both required and encouraged the development of specific forms of knowledge such as statistical analysis as well as macro-economic and bio-scientific knowledge. The modern state had to take care of the life and the wellbeing of its population, and Foucault therefore calls the politics of the modern state biopolitics.

In Foucault’s original formulation, the term “governmentality” referred to the specific historical development of the essentially modern, complex techniques of power that focused on the population. Later Foucault also gave the term a more general meaning as “the way in which one conducts the conduct of men”. His key claim was that to understand the practice of government in this broad sense of controlling people’s conduct, one had to study the specific technologies of power, but also the rationality underpinning them. The practices and institutions of government are always enabled, regulated, and justified by a specific form of reasoning or rationality that defines their ends and the suitable means of achieving them. To understand power as a set of relations, as Foucault repeatedly suggested, means understanding how such relations are rationalized. It means examining how forms of rationality inscribe themselves in practices and systems of practices, and what role they play within them.

The exposition and analysis of the historically changing governmental rationalities was a pivotal goal of Foucault’s lectures. His analysis makes clear that modern governmental rationality has two major features. On the one hand, the development of the modern state is characterized by the centralization of political power: a centralized state with highly organized administration and bureaucracy has emerged. While this feature is commonly analyzed and also criticized in political thought, Foucault also identifies the evolution of a second feature that appears to be antagonistic to this development. He claims that the modern state is also characterized by individualizing power—or “pastoral power” as he also calls it. This is power that relies on individualizing knowledge about a person’ life. The modern state required the development of power technologies oriented towards individuals in an attempt to govern their conduct in a continuous and permanent way. The result is the intervention of the state in the everyday life of individuals for example, their diet, mental health, and sexual practices.

The analysis of governmentality does not replace Foucault’s earlier understanding of power. His method of analysis is similar to the one he used to study the techniques and practices of power in the context of particular, local institutions such as the prison. What had to be analyzed, but also questioned, were the historically specific rationalities intrinsic to practices. At the same time, Foucault’s analysis of governmentality adds new and important dimensions to his understanding of power. While his studies of disciplinary power were restricted to specialized institutional contexts, with the notion of government he was able to study larger, strategic developments beyond the scope of his “microphysics of power”. He was able to transfer his understanding of power to domains such as the state that were traditionally regarded as objects of political theory. With the idea of power as government, Foucault was also able to clarify his understanding of resistance. Because government refers to strategic, regulated and rationalized modes of power that have to be legitimized through forms of knowledge, the idea of critique as a form of resistance now becomes crucial. To govern is not to physically determine the conduct of passive objects. Government involves offering reasons why those governed should do what they are told, and this implies that they can also question these reasons. Foucault claims that this is why governmentality has historically developed in tandem with the practice of political critique. The practice of critique must question the reasons for governing like that: the legitimate principles, procedures and means of governing.

In the lecture series The Birth of Biopolitics, Foucault also engages in a lengthy examination of neoliberal governmentality. This analysis has become seminal for contemporary political theory. Many political commentators now see the year 1979, when Foucault delivered his lectures, as the inauguration of the dominance of neoliberal economic policy in Europe and the United States. Almost forty years after its expanding application, Foucault’s topic and his insights appear farsighted. His analysis of neoliberalism is distinctive in at least two significant ways. First, he analyzes neoliberalism as a historically novel form of governmentality—a rationality of governing connected with specific technologies of power. On Foucault’s account neoliberalism is not understood just as an economic doctrine, but as a governmental form that is directed toward specific objectives, regulates itself through continuous reflection, and, essentially, aims to ensure that capitalism works. It comprises a coherent political ontology, a set of philosophical background beliefs about the nature of society, markets, and human beings. However, it is not an ideology in the sense of consisting only of ideas or false beliefs. Its political ontology necessitates and rationalizes a specific technology of power—specific practices of governing, as well as a particular way of reflecting on and problematizing these practices.

Foucault also emphasizes that neoliberal governmentality should be viewed as a particular way of producing subjects: it produces an economic subject structured by specific tendencies, preferences, and motivations. It aims to create social conditions that not only encourage and necessitate competitiveness and self-interest, but also produce them. Foucault discusses the work of the American neoliberal economists, in particular Gary Becker and his theory of human capital, in order show how neoliberal subjects are understood as navigating the social realm by constantly making rational choices based on economic knowledge and the strict calculation of the necessary costs and desired benefits. Such subjects must make long-term and short-term investments in different aspects of their lives and acquire sufficient economic knowledge to be able to calculate costs, risks, and possible returns on the capital invested.

Foucault never published any of the material developed in these two lecture series, and in the lectures in the 1980s he turned to examine texts from ancient philosophy. Many of the ideas developed there were later published as The Use of Pleasure and Care of the Self. His studies of ancient sexuality, and, particularly, the idea of an aesthetics of existence also led him to the ancient idea of philosophy as a way of life rather than a search for theoretical truth. Although The Use of Pleasure has some discussion of Plato’s conception of philosophy, Foucault’s treatments of the topic are primarily in lectures that he had no time to develop for publication. Some of these lectures discuss Socrates (in the Apology and in Alcibiades I) as both a model and an exponent of a philosophical life focused on “care of the self” and follow the subsequent ancient discussions of this topic in, for example, Epictetus, Seneca, and Plutarch. Other lectures deal with the ancient ideal of “truthful speaking” (parrhesia), regarded as a central political and moral virtue. Here Foucault discusses earlier formulations of the notion, in Euripides and Socrates, as well as its later transformations by the Epicureans, Stoics, and Cynics. This research project might have been the most fruitful of all Foucault’s engagements with traditional philosophy. But his early death in 1984 prevented him from completing it.

Bibliography

Primary Sources

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  • Dits et écrits vol I–IV, 1980–1988, Paris: Gallimard, 1994, édités par D. Defert & F. Ewald. These include virtually all Foucault’s previously published shorter writings and interviews. Some of the more important items are translated in Essential Works of Foucault, 1954–1984, 3 volumes, edited by Paul Rabinow, New York: The New Press, 1997–1999.
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  • 2013, La grande étrangère: A propos de littérature, Philippe Artières, Jean-François Bert, Mathieu Potte-Bonneville and Judith Revel (eds), Paris: EHESS.
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  • 2015, «Qu’est-ce que la critique?» suivi de «La culture de soi», Henri-Paul Fruchaud and Daniele Lorenzini (eds), Paris: Vrin. English translation forthcoming, The University of Chicago Press.
  • 2016, «Discours et vérité» précédé de «La parrêsia», Henri-Paul Fruchaud and Daniele Lorenzini (eds), Paris: Vrin. English translation forthcoming, The University of Chicago Press.
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Secondary Sources

  • Bernauer, James William, 1990, Michel Foucault’s Force of Flight: Toward An Ethics for Thought, (Contemporary studies in philosophy and the human sciences), Atlantic Highlands, NJ: Humanities Press.
  • Barry, Andrew, Thomas Osborne, and Nikolas Rose (eds.), 1996, Foucault and Political Reason. Liberalism, Neo-Liberalism and Rationalities of Government, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Butler, Judith P., 1990, Gender Trouble: Feminism and the Subversion of Identity, London and New York: Routledge.
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  • Gutting, Gary, 1989, Michel Foucault’s Archaeology of Scientific Reason, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9781139172141
  • ––– (ed.), 2005, The Cambridge Companion to Foucault, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, second edition.
  • Han, Béatrice, 2002, Foucault’s Critical Project, Stanford: Stanford University Press.
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  • Hoy, David (ed.), 1986, Foucault: a Critical Reader, Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Koopman, Colin, 2013, Genealogy as Critique: Foucault and the Problems of Modernity, Stanford: Stanford University Press.
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  • Oksala, Johanna, 2005, Foucault on Freedom, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511597923
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Other Internet Resources

  • Foucault News, a good information source on Foucault’s life and works, recent publications and current events on Foucault.
  • The Foucault Circle, a worldwide network of scholars and educators who share the interest in the thought of Foucault.
  • The Foucault Society, an interdisciplinary society for scholars, students, activists and artists who are interested in studying and applying Foucault’s ideas within contemporary context.
  • Michel Foucault, Info, provides access to a large selection of Foucault’s texts.

Copyright © 2018 by
Gary Gutting <gutting.1@nd.edu>
Johanna Oksala <Johanna.Oksala@helsinki.fi>

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