Reductionism in Biology

First published Tue May 27, 2008; substantive revision Mon Apr 10, 2023

Reductionism encompasses a set of ontological, epistemological, and methodological claims about the relations between different scientific domains. The basic question of reduction is whether the properties, concepts, explanations, or methods from one scientific domain (typically at higher levels of organization) can be deduced from or explained by the properties, concepts, explanations, or methods from another domain of science (typically at lower levels of organization). Reduction is germane to a variety of issues in philosophy of science, including the structure of scientific theories, the relations between scientific disciplines, the nature of explanation, the diversity of methodology, and notions of theoretical progress, as well as to numerous topics in metaphysics and philosophy of mind, such as emergence, mereology, and supervenience.

Questions about reduction in biology are pervasive throughout the history of philosophy and science. Many contemporary debates have historical analogues that reflect long-standing controversies about the legitimacy of reductionist research strategies and modes of explanation used by different life science subdisciplines. In philosophy of biology, debates about reduction in the second half of the 20th century focused traditionally on the question of whether and in what sense classical genetics can be reduced to molecular biology (although other strands of discussion were present, such as whether evolutionary theory is inherently anti-reductionist because of the principle of natural selection). Philosophical debates now address a wider array of domains beyond genetics (e.g., development, ecology, evolution, cell biology, and neuroscience), and include additional questions about the nature and status of interdisciplinarity, such as the integration of data or standards across biological fields.

Section 1 gives an overview of the idea of reduction and how it connects to biological domains and other philosophical issues. Since debates about reductionism have been going on long before recent discussions in philosophy of biology, Section 2 offers some historical background. Section 3 reviews the main philosophical accounts of reduction in light of their respective motivations and limitations. More general objections to the feasibility or scientific relevance of reduction are discussed in Section 4. Because most philosophical discussions during the past two decades have largely focused on other models of the structure of scientific knowledge than reduction (e.g., integration), Sections 5 and 6 concentrate on these recent issues and trends.

1. Introduction

Reduction (reductionism) encompasses several, related philosophical themes. At least three types can be distinguished: ontological, methodological, and epistemic (Sarkar 1992, cf. Nagel 1998). Even though arguments for and against reductionism often include a combination of positions related to all three, these distinctions are significant because no straightforward entailment relations obtain between the different types of reduction (although tacit commitments about these relations are prevalent).

(i) Ontological reduction is the idea that each particular biological system (e.g., an organism) is constituted by nothing but molecules and their interactions. In metaphysics this idea is often called physicalism (or materialism) and it assumes in a biological context that (a) biological properties supervene on physical properties (i.e., no difference in a biological property without a difference in some underlying physical property), and (b) each particular biological process (or token) is metaphysically identical to some particular physico-chemical process. This latter tenet is sometimes called token-token reduction, in contrast to the stronger tenet that each type of biological process is identical to a type of physico-chemical process. Ontological reduction in this weaker sense is a default stance nowadays among philosophers and biologists though the philosophical details remain controversial (e.g., are there genuinely emergent properties?) Different conceptions of physicalism may yield different implications for ontological reduction in biology (Dowell 2006). The denial of physicalism by vitalism, the view that biological systems are governed by forces that are not physico-chemical, is largely of historical interest. (Vitalism also admits of various conceptions, especially with respect to how non-physico-chemical forces are understood; see Section 2.) Some authors have argued vigorously for the significance of metaphysical concepts in discussions of reductionism in biology (Rosenberg 1978, 1985, 1994, 2006).

(ii) Methodological reduction is the idea that biological systems are most fruitfully investigated at the lowest possible level, and that experimental studies should be aimed at uncovering molecular and biochemical causes (Andersen 2017). A common example of this type of strategy is the decomposition of a complex system into parts (Bechtel and Richardson 1993); a biologist might investigate the cellular parts of an organism in order to comprehend its behavior, or investigate the biochemical components of a cell to understand its features. Although methodological reductionism is often motivated by a presumption of ontological reduction, this procedural recommendation does not follow directly from it. In fact, unlike token-token reduction, methodological reductionism can be quite controversial. It has been argued that exclusively reductionist research strategies exhibit systematic biases that overlook relevant biological features, and that for certain questions a more fruitful methodology consists in integrating the discovery of molecular causes with the investigation of higher level features (Wimsatt 1980, 2007).[1]

(iii) Epistemic reduction is the idea that the knowledge about one scientific domain (typically about higher level processes) can be reduced to another body of scientific knowledge (typically concerning a lower or more fundamental level). While an endorsement of some form of epistemic reduction can be motivated by ontological reduction in combination with methodological reductionism (e.g., the past success of reductionist research in biology), the possibility of epistemic reduction does not follow directly from their conjunction. Indeed, debates about reduction in the philosophy of biology have centered on this third type of reduction as the most controversial issue (see Section 4), and therefore our discussion will focus primarily on issues related to epistemic reduction. Prior to evaluating any reduction of one body of knowledge to another, a conception of those bodies of knowledge and what it would mean for them to be “reduced” must be explicated. A number of different models of reduction have been proposed. Thus, the debate about reduction in biology has not only revolved around whether epistemic reduction is possible, but also which notions of epistemic reduction are operative in actual scientific reasoning. Two basic categories can be distinguished: (a) models of theory reduction maintain that one theory can be logically deduced from another theory (Section 3.1); and, (b) models of explanatory reduction focus on whether higher level features can be explained by lower level features (Section 3.2).

The philosophical study of reduction links up with several key issues in the philosophy of science. As reduction involves relating (broadly speaking) one “body of scientific knowledge” to another, it presupposes an account of the relevant epistemic units to be related (e.g., theories, laws, models, mechanisms, concepts, or disciplines)—how should these be understood? Since the reduction of one theory to another usually presumes that somehow the reducing theory explains the principles of the reduced theory, reduction is also related to the issue of scientific explanation. For example, if a more fundamental theory fully reduces another theory or even reduces several theories, unification (of some sort) results. The situation where a historically earlier theory is reduced to a later theory is an intuitive case in which scientific progress might occur. Arguments against the existence of this type of historical reduction have maintained that terms occurring in both the precursor and descendant theory have different meanings (“incommensurability”). This indicates that questions about reduction also connect to the meaning of scientific terms and conceptual change. Therefore, accounts of reduction often involve commitments made about other notions and their adequacy depends in many cases on these related philosophical commitments. This has led some philosophers to pursue an account of reduction in biology that is as uncommitted as possible regarding the precise construal of general notions such as “law” and “explanation” (Sarkar 1998, cf. Brigandt 2013a), or to specifically highlight how a particular package of general notions travels together and skews our perspective on the shape of epistemic reduction in scientific practice (Godfrey-Smith 2008).

In philosophy of biology, reduction involves questions about how different biological disciplines and theories are related, and how biology is connected to physics and chemistry (e.g., is biology autonomous, possessing its own theoretical principles, explanations, and methods?). Over the past four decades, discussion has concentrated primarily on the question of whether classical genetics can be reduced to molecular genetics and biochemistry. This discussion was motivated by the increasing significance of molecular biology within the life sciences (Morange 2020), and revolved around specific accounts of reduction in science, such as Nagel’s (1961) model. A less central concern has been whether evolutionary biology and ecology are autonomous disciplines or reducible to molecular biology (Beatty 1990, Brandon 1996, Dupré 1993, Rosenberg 2006). For example, a notable issue in evolutionary contexts is the relationship between functional explanation (“teleology”) and causal-mechanistic explanation (Wouters 2005). The levels of selection debate includes questions about whether all evolutionary explanations can be cast in terms of genes and whether selection operates primarily or exclusively on the genetic level (Ågren 2021, Okasha 2006). The main debate about reduction in genetics has lost some intensity as many philosophers developed a skeptical consensus regarding the possibility of substantive theory reduction (but see Waters 1990). This decline has been accompanied by increasing attention to models of explanatory reduction (e.g., Kaiser 2015, Sarkar 1998, Weber 2005) across a wider variety of domains in biology (e.g., development, ecology, evolution, cell biology, and neuroscience). For example, the question of whether developmental biology can be reduced to developmental genetics and molecular biology has become salient due to recent progress in developmental genetics and growing philosophical interest in developmental biology (Love 2008b, Robert 2004, Rosenberg 1997, 2006, Weber 2022). Less attention has been given to the question of whether biology can be reduced to physics (but see Rosenberg 2006). This has been an issue of concern to many biologists (e.g., Mayr 2004), both with respect to methodology (e.g., the adequacy of analyzing a system by dissecting it into component parts) and whether modes of explanation from physical science are inherently inappropriate for biological science (Love and Hüttemann 2011).

Debates about reduction in biology have often been framed in terms of “reductionism” vs. “anti-reductionism” (or, more archaically, “mechanism” versus “organicism” or “vitalism”). However, since different models of reduction have been put forward, whether one takes a reductionist or anti-reductionist stance about a particular biological subdiscipline (e.g., classical genetics) depends on the notion of “reduction” being utilized (Wimsatt 1976b, Hull 1979). Furthermore, this framing has tended to create a false dichotomy between two extreme positions: reductionism as the idea that molecular biology can in principle fully explain all biological facts—making higher level biological theories dispensable—and anti-reductionism as the idea that higher level biological fields possess explanatory principles of their own and are fully autonomous in the sense of not benefiting from molecular biology. A variety of middle (and orthogonal) ground exists between these extremes and has motivated the efforts seen in alternative research programs in philosophy of science that address questions about the nature and status of interdisciplinarity, such as how data, standards, or explanations are integrated across biological fields (see Section 5). Given that references to “reduction” in different areas of biology pick out a variety of commitments in different contexts, which makes pronouncements of both the success and failure of “reduction” legitimate, the traditional assumption that there is a unique and global notion in need of explication is problematic (Hüttemann and Love 2011).[2]

2. Historical Background: Philosophical and Scientific

Undoubtedly, the growth and development of molecular biology over the past half century has made reductionism in biology a central issue (and DNA a household word). However, it would be wrong to assume that different aspects of reductionism only gain traction in the wake of the molecularization of biology juxtaposed with discussions of reduction from a logical empiricist perspective (see Section 3.1). Besides a perennial concern with what makes life distinctive (Riskin 2018), we can distinguish at least two reductionist themes throughout history relevant to the life sciences and its philosophy: (1) the relation among different branches or domains of knowledge and (2) the relation between parts and wholes (Grene and Depew 2004, Magner 1994). These two themes link up in a complex fashion with both epistemic and ontological reduction. (Questions about methodological reduction tend to coalesce around new technologies that open up the possibility of pursuing reductionist research methods, such as making observations at a lower level with microscopy.) Additionally, these themes arise in the context of specific domains of enduring interest: (a) the complex relations among different animals and plants in natural environments, i.e., “ecology”, (b) the integrated relations among the parts and whole of an organism, i.e., “physiology/functional anatomy”, and (c) the dynamic relations among the homogeneous components in the early stages of an embryo that eventually beget a unified whole organism containing heterogeneous parts in appropriate arrangement and connection, i.e., “development/reproduction”.

Aristotle is the foundation for both philosophical themes pertaining to reductionism. He addressed the relationship between domains of scientific knowledge in his concepts of superordinate and subordinate sciences (Posterior Analytics I). Each science has a distinctive subject genus, first principles, and a set of predicates that are commensurable with the subject genus (McKirahan 1978, 1992, ch. 4–5). Though the relations among sciences are systematic, they are not necessarily reductive because there is no most fundamental science. These connections are relevant to relations between parts and wholes because Aristotle utilized his science of elements and their potentials (e.g., as seen in On Generation and Corruption and Meteorology) to inform his description and analysis of organism components in the History of Animals and Parts of Animals. He treated three compositional “levels”: elements and their potentials; uniform parts such as blood and bone; and, non-uniform parts that include multiple uniform parts, such as the face or hands. The primary domain here is physiology/functional anatomy but development/reproduction is always in view and addressed directly in the Generation of Animals. Claims about “potentials” are buttressed by an account of their contributions to material properties composing uniform parts (Meteorology IV; see Lennox 2001, ch. 8, Popa 2005). Complex dispositions (e.g., the fleshy, sinuous elasticity of the esophagus) are postulated from these material substrates that have relevance to, but do not determine the nature of, these organismal parts because functional strictures ultimately govern them (the fleshy, sinuous elasticity of the esophagus is for the sake of repeated dilation during food ingestion).

The teleological orientation of Aristotle’s biology means that he is often characterized as an ontological anti-reductionist (e.g., the elemental potentials of lower levels of organization are for the sake of but do not determine the uniform parts at higher levels of organization). This blends with epistemic issues related to particular domains, such as his rejection of Presocratic materialist (i.e., purely “mechanistic”) explanations for the origin of animal morphology during development. (Empedocles apparently claimed that vertebrae arise during ontogeny solely as a consequence of a unified cylindrical column physically breaking into the observable iterated units of the backbone; see Parts of Animals I.1 [640a].) Yet Aristotle was attentive to issues of material composition and constraints arising from the nature of properties exhibited by animal parts, which often mark commitments to types of ontological and epistemic reduction. His concept of hypothetical necessity (Physics II; see Cooper 1987) permitted the use of one kind of material in many different organismal parts. Galen, among many others subsequent to Aristotle, also explored these issues, whether from the perspective of how material complexes generate higher level properties (Mixtures) or the relations among parts and wholes in the context of development (The Construction of the Embryo).

In the early modern period, William Harvey adopted an Aristotelian stance in the context of both physiology and development (Lennox 2006, 2017). The relation between parts and wholes in ontogeny, including relevant material properties, is constantly in view (Harvey 1981 [1651]). Although Harvey used “mechanistic” analogies, referring to the motion of the heart in terms of interlocking gears or to the heart itself as a pump (Distelzweig 2016), René Descartes famously disputed Harvey’s claims from the perspective of the “mechanical philosophy”. Descartes sought to explain the movement of the heart not in terms of function but rather by appeal only to the matter in motion composing the circulating blood that is heated and thus expands akin to fermentation (Description of the Human Body). He also attempted to explain embryology in terms of matter and motion alone; e.g., tissue and organ origination is accounted for via matter slowing down and aggregating in different regions of the embryo (Des Chene 2001, ch. 2, Smith 2006, Part II). Robert Boyle defended teleological explanations in anatomy and physiology (specifically, the integrated relations among the parts and whole of an organism) by laying out how they were compatible with and supported by mechanistic explanations (Lennox 1983). Thus, he offered a version of epistemic reduction in line with his conception of mechanical philosophy, which included a heterogeneous methodology (reductionist and non-reductionist) and concomitant reservations about ontological reduction. Baruch Spinoza famously used the image of a worm in a bloodstream to engage the theme of part-whole relations and their complexity in a 1665 letter to Henry Oldenburg.[3] More broadly, the emergence of distinctive scientific approaches to living phenomena in the 18th century involved constant debate over whether organisms were composed of “active” matter or energized by an animating element, distinct from non-living entities, such that their resistance to decay could be accounted for by a “vital materialism” (Zammito 2018).

Immanuel Kant explicitly articulated a dialectic between a teleological outlook on organismal functioning (including ecological relationships, physiology, and development specifically) and a mechanistic understanding of causation modeled on Newtonian mechanics (Critique of Judgment, Part II; see Mensch 2013, Zuckert 2010). Kant’s maintenance of this tension between the reciprocal causal relations of parts in an organism (“teleology”) and the linear-mechanical causality justified within his critical philosophy was a way of splitting apart epistemological and metaphysical issues. It has elements of epistemic anti-reductionism (organismal processes must be understood in terms of their reciprocal contribution to a systemic goal—an epistemological subordination of mechanism to teleology) and ontological reductionism (all causation is ultimately linear-mechanical). But Kant also understood linear-mechanical causation as a category by which the mind frames experiences of the world. Thus, his understanding of metaphysics differs from the realist one underlying most contemporary accounts of ontological reduction. In addition to the theme of reductive relations between parts and wholes, Kant also addressed relations among different scientific domains in his discussion of sciences having their own distinct concepts and subject matter (Critique of Judgment, §68, 79).

Kant’s work was influential among those studying biological phenomena, even if misinterpreted in various ways, and helped frame the question of teleology versus mechanism in the early 19th century (Lenoir 1982, Zammito 2012). His discussion stressed the significance of methodological conclusions—it is necessary (a maxim or regulative principle) to take organisms as natural purposes if we are to investigate them scientifically. This encouraged speculations about new forces, akin to those found in Newtonian mechanics, which would explain biological phenomena “mechanistically” (e.g., the formative force explaining embryonic development; see Look 2006, Richards 2000). The Newtonian inspiration survived, with or without Kantian traces, well into the 19th century and beyond. Comparative anatomy (conceptualized broadly to include functional anatomy and embryology) exploited methodological suggestions from successful physical science. For example, Geoffroy St. Hilaire appealed to Newton’s musings that animals are governed by similar principles or laws as those found in mechanics (Le Guyader 2004). More typical is Richard Owen’s discussion of matter and its properties within living organisms, where he exhibits a clear anti-reductionist stance and postulates something akin to emergent properties.[4] This perspective was shared by many comparative anatomists who used an “analysis:synthesis” style of reasoning (Elwick 2007). A related strand regarding reductionism winds its way through physiological investigations of the 19th century. Here the Cartesian mechanical-reductionist program is rejoined with an emphasis on the animal machine (Canguilhem in Delaporte 1994, ch. 5, 8, 10, 12, Coleman 1977, ch. 6). Despite clear metaphysical commitments to a form of ontological reduction, methodological types of reductionism were qualified because of their impact on experimental design (e.g., Bernard 1957 [1865]). Overall, there was a diversity of mechanist (“reductionist”) and organicist (“non-reductionist”) positions corresponding to ontological, epistemic, and methodological types of reduction in the 19th century, similar to the philosophical diversity observable today (see Sections 3 and 5 below).

In the late 19th and early 20th century, the topic of development returned with a vengeance in the controversy over vitalism (sometimes termed “organicism”) (Normandin and Wolfe 2013). A general movement towards more mechanistic or materialistic interpretations of living systems was emerging at this time (e.g., Loeb 1912, cf. Allen 1975) and disagreements about explaining development loomed large (Maienschein 1991). However, the famous example of vitalism in Hans Driesch’s interpretation of development and the autonomy of the organism should be seen as an issue of epistemology as much as metaphysics (Maienschein 2000). Instead of materialism versus vitalism (i.e., ontological reduction questions), the explanatory conflict involved the nature of differentiation in early ontogeny and to what degree it is prespecified. The theme of order and organization in living systems pervades many writings about methodological, epistemological, and ontological types of reductionism at this time (emphasizing both relations between physics and biology and between parts and wholes) (Esposito 2014, Peterson 2016). Examples include Joseph Needham’s Order and Life (1936), Kurt Goldstein’s The Organism (1934/1963), E.S. Russell’s The Interpretation of Development and Heredity (1930), D’Arcy Thompson’s On Growth and Form (1917), Ludwig von Bertalanffy’s Modern Theories of Development (1933), and J.H. Woodger’s Biological Principles (1929). Philosophers of science who have had less influence on contemporary Anglo-American philosophy were keenly aware of these discussions. For example, Ernst Cassirer (1950, Part II) explored reductionist themes related to causal explanations of development, including the debates about mechanism and vitalism surrounding Driesch, as well as the relations between physical science and biology. These topics also appeared in the pages of Philosophy of Science (e.g., Lillie 1934, 1942, 1948, Singer 1934, 1946), although not necessarily utilizing the specific terminology of reduction (Byron 2007).

Ernest Nagel’s general treatment of reductionism in chapters 11 and 12 of The Structure of Science (1961) canvassed many different aspects of these perennial debates (Sarkar 2015). Whereas the sections concerning theory reduction have usually been in view (connecting with the reductionist theme of relating domains of knowledge), Nagel also interacted with biological literature addressing claims about parts, wholes, and emergence, thereby addressing the second reductionist theme that has been prominent since Aristotle (see Nagel 1961, 366ff). He highlighted the polysemy of “wholes”, “parts”, and “sums” inherent in claims about success or failure in showing that the whole is just the sum of its parts (pp. 380ff). Additionally Nagel treats the question of evolutionary emergence, i.e., whether genuinely new entities arise in the history of our universe and life on Earth (see Goudge 1961). He dealt with the aforementioned theoretical biologists (e.g., Bertalanffy, Russell, and Woodger) on the topic of hierarchical organization and reduction in living systems, especially as seen in ontogeny (Nagel 1961, pp. 432ff). Nagel’s contemporaries likewise treated reductionist themes, though their work has largely been overlooked (e.g., Morton Beckner’s discussion of “organization” and “levels of analysis” as methodological and explanatory aspects of reduction; Beckner 1959, ch. 9).

Despite Nagel’s wide-ranging analysis, most subsequent philosophical discussion has concentrated on his formal account of theory reduction (see Section 3.1), and whether it serves as an adequate general characterization of reductionism for all areas of scientific inquiry.[5] The biological case that has received the most scrutiny is the relationship between classical and molecular genetics, in part because the molecularization of genetics was palpable in this historical period (Schaffner 1969). The manifold difficulties encountered in applying Nagelian theory reduction to genetics (see Section 4) encouraged the growth of philosophy of biology as an independent disciplinary specialty, in part because these difficulties seemed to fit a recurring pattern—misconstruing biological reasoning with philosophical accounts of science forged on physical science examples (Love and Hüttemann 2011). Philosophical issues in biology seemed to require distinct analyses that are more sensitive to empirical research in biology (Brigandt 2011). Additionally, the rise of sociobiology and gene-centered evolutionary explanations provoked anti-reductionist stances among biologists on the basis of social and political commitments (e.g., Levins and Lewontin 1985).

More recent attention to reductionism in situ within different life science contexts has led many philosophers to revisit the perennial aspects of reductionism, many of which were simply tangential to controversies over theory reduction. A number of current debates are unconscious returns to neglected issues, albeit in different ways and in different contexts. That developmental biology has returned to the center of discussions is not surprising because of its enduring status as a biological topic inviting reflection on reductionist themes. The same can be said for ecology and functional anatomy, although they remain more peripheral for many philosophers. Socially and politically tinged aspects of reductionist research in biology, such as racial categorizations based on genetic profiles, also continue to provoke philosophical analyses (see Section 5).

3. Models of (Epistemic) Reduction

Most discussion in contemporary philosophy of science has centered on the issue of epistemic reduction (rather than ontological or methodological reduction; see Hoyningen-Huene 1989). The basic idea that the knowledge (or other epistemic units) pertaining to one scientific domain can be reduced to another body of knowledge (or its epistemic units) has been spelled out in different ways. It is useful to group different approaches to reduction into two basic categories: (1) models of theory reduction, which maintain that a higher level theory can be logically deduced from a lower level theory, and, (2) models of explanatory reduction, which focus on whether representations of higher level features can be explained by representations of lower level features, typically by decomposing a higher level system into parts (Sarkar 1992). Models of theory reduction were of primary interest in post-positivist philosophy of science that emerged in the 1960s and have received the most sustained attention (Schaffner 1993). More recently, accounts of explanatory reduction have been developed to remedy the inadequacies of theory focused accounts, so that theory reduction has been displaced as the central issue by competing accounts of explanatory reduction (but see Dizadji-Bahmani et al. 2010 and Sarkar 2015).

3.1 Theory Reduction

According to theory reduction, theory \(T_A\) reduces \(T_B\) (e.g., \(A\)tomic physics reduces \(B\)iology) if \(T_A\) logically entails \(T_B\). Assuming a deductive-nomological account of explanation (Hempel and Oppenheim 1965 [1948]), theory reduction as deduction from theoretical principles is an instance of explanation. In particular, \(T_A\) logically entails and explains the laws of \(T_B\). Compare this with the logically weaker notion of reduction put forward by Kemeny and Oppenheim (1956), which includes instances of theory replacement. The Kemeny-Oppenheim model concerns the situation where the observable predictions made by \(T_A\) include (at least) all observable predictions of \(T_B\). In this case \(T_A\) can explain everything that \(T_B\) explains, but \(T_A\) need not encompass the theoretical principles of \(T_B\) (as in genuine theory reduction), which allows for the possibility that \(T_B\) contains inadequate theoretical notions and is replaced by \(T_A\).

Many models of theory reduction derive from the account of reduction due to Ernest Nagel (1949, 1961). Working within the philosophical framework of logical empiricism, Nagel construed reduction as a logical relation between theories, where a theory is understood as a system of statements, containing laws, formulated in a first-order formal language (Sarkar 2015). The reducing theory \(T_A\) reduces the reduced theory \(T_B\) if the laws of \(T_B\) can be logically derived from \(T_A\), which Nagel called the “condition of derivability”. However, if \(T_B\) contains scientific terms that do not occur in the language of the reducing theory \(T_A\) (“organismal reproduction” is not an expression of biochemistry), then derivability presupposes that the primitive expressions of \(T_B\) (in particular, its predicates) can be logically related to the language of \(T_A\). Nagel made this explicit by a “condition of connectability”: reduction presupposes that there are statements (e.g., conditionals) that contain expressions both from \(T_A\) and \(T_B\), such that \(T_A\) together with these statements entail the laws of \(T_B\). These connectability statements are often called bridge principles (or correspondence rules, or reduction functions), and have been interpreted diversely. Nagel rejected the idea that bridge principles are analytic statements, but did not take a stand as to whether they are factual or conventional. Some philosophers have required that bridge principles are laws (rather than accidental generalizations), whereas others have maintained that they should express metaphysical identities between entities, properties, and processes (e.g., identifying cells with collections of molecules, in line with ontological reduction). Nagel himself construed reduction as an epistemic notion without ontological commitment; nor did he require that bridge statements be biconditionals—mere conditionals when conjoined with \(T_A\) sometimes logically entail \(T_B\). (The Kemeny-Oppenheim notion of reduction / theory replacement is weaker than Nagelian reduction as it does not require such bridge principles connecting \(T_A\) and \(T_B\).)

This account covers interlevel theory reduction. For instance, Oppenheim and Putnam (1958) argued for a hierarchical or layered model of scientific disciplines that assumes each layer or level corresponds to a theory. Each discipline is reducible to the theory on the next lower level, e.g., sociology to organismal biology, organismal biology to molecular biology, molecular biology to chemistry, and chemistry to microphysics (see also Brooks et al. 2021, Walter and Eronen 2011). Another way to apply Nagel’s general model is successional theory reduction, where a historically earlier theory is reduced to a later, more mature theory, so that reduction can be an instance of theoretical progress (Nickles 1973). In both cases, Nagel held that theories needed to be indexed to a particular time: “The question whether a given science is reducible to another cannot in the abstract be usefully raised without reference to some particular stage of development of the two disciplines” (1961, 361). Paul Feyerabend (1962, 1965a, 1965b) and Thomas Kuhn (1962) criticized successional theory reduction and especially Nagel’s connectability condition. Feyerabend argued that an earlier and later theory might use the same theoretical term with a different meaning (e.g., “mass” in classical and relativistic mechanics). This incommensurability of meaning makes the connectability of these theories’ expressions, and thus the logical derivation of one theory from another, impossible. Whether or not genuine incommensurability obtains is controversial (see, e.g., Sankey 1994).

Nagel’s model was revised and applied in a specifically biological context—the reduction of classical genetics to biochemistry—by Kenneth Schaffner (1967, 1969, 1976; see Schaffner 1993 for his mature account). Schaffner’s “General Reduction Model” addresses a key drawback of Nagel’s account, first noted by Feyerabend: even though the theory to be reduced may be approximately true, it might contain empirically false statements, especially if it is a historical precursor of the more mature reducing theory (e.g., the inheritance “laws” of classical genetics have exceptions). If the theory to be reduced \((T_B)\) contains false statements, then it cannot possibly be deduced from \(T_A\). For this reason, Schaffner considers instead \(T_{B^*}\), which is a corrected version of the theory to be reduced in that \(T_{B^*}\) makes more adequate predictions than \(T_B\). On this model, reduction occurs if \(T_A\) and \(T_{B^*}\) can be related by reduction functions (bridge principles) and \(T_{B^*}\) follows logically from \(T_A\) enriched by the reduction functions. (Whereas Nagel focused on the laws of \(T_B\) being deducible from \(T_A\), Schaffner requires that all statements of \(T_B /T_{B^*}\) be deducible from \(T_A\).) Schaffner’s central tenet about reduction in biology is that the success of molecular biology shows that classical genetics and traditional fields of experimental biology are in the process of being reduced to biochemistry. Although this reduction has not been completed yet, a logical derivation of traditional experimental biology from a (completed) theory of biochemistry is in principle possible and will be achieved eventually. Schaffner’s account has an ontological aspect in that he interprets the reduction functions as synthetic statements expressing identities between the entities and processes of the two domains related (in line with Sklar 1967 and Causey 1972a, 1972b), though he does not argue that these identities are metaphysical necessities. The Nagel-Schaffner approach to theory reduction assumes a syntactic account of theory structure such that they are axiomatized systems formalizable in first order predicate calculus. A variety of other models of theory reduction exist, some of which use a semantic (i.e., theories as families of models) rather than a syntactic account of scientific theories (see Balzer and Dawe 1986a,b, Hooker 1981, Suppes 1957, Woodger 1952).

Schaffner’s account provided the motivation and point of departure for much of the reduction debate in philosophy of biology, which was conducted primarily in the 1970s and 80s and revolved around the issue of whether (and in which sense) classical genetics can be reduced to molecular genetics or biochemistry. Three criticisms pertaining specifically to the Nagel-Schaffner model bear mentioning. (Section 4 reviews the main objections to different models of reduction more generally.)

(a) Michael Ruse (1971) and David Hull (1974) argued that the relation between classical and molecular genetics is one of theory replacement, not reduction in Schaffner’s sense. Although Schaffner’s account permits a correction of the theory to be reduced \((T_{B^*}\) instead of \(T_B)\), it is not clear when a modified version \(T_{B^*}\) (corrected “classical genetics”) still counts as being largely similar to \(T_B\) (classical genetics). This leaves an ambiguity of whether one should conclude that \(T_B\) was reduced because \(T_{B^*}\) is similar enough or that \(T_B\) has been replaced by another theory because the two are so dissimilar (Hull 1976, Ruse 1976). Schaffner only requires that \(T_B\) and \(T_{B^*}\) are “strongly analogous” (1993, 429), without offering a specification of how much similarity is required for reduction rather than replacement (Winther 2009). William Wimsatt (1976b) emphasizes that while interlevel, compositional reductions are transitive, successional reductions through history are intransitive, so that a continuum between genuine successional reduction and replacement obtains. Any sequence of successive reductions can be expected to evolve into an instance of replacement given enough time.

(b) Nagel and Schaffner relied on a syntactic construal of theories, which assumes that a theory is a set of statements in a formal language, including laws (Kitcher 1984). Yet it has been argued that molecular biology as the reducing theory does not consist of a small body of laws, so that a covering-law model of explanation and reduction is not applicable (Culp and Kitcher 1989, Kitcher 1984, Sarkar 1998). If molecular biology or other biological fields are inadequately represented as consisting of a clearly delineated theory, reconstructed as a set of statements in a formal language, then an account of reduction that presupposes this construal of scientific theories is problematic.

(c) Hull (1976), Wimsatt (1976a, 1976b), and Sahotra Sarkar (1992, 1998) have objected that Schaffner focuses too much on formal considerations about reduction, rather than substantive issues. His account construes reduction as a logical relation that is “in principle” possible even though it is not occurring in practice. If reduction in this sense is not occurring in biology, then there are significant questions about whether it best fits biological knowledge and practice. Nagel claimed that premature attempts at reduction could retard scientific progress, thus implicitly decoupling methodological demands from epistemological ones (Nagel 1961, 362–3). Schaffner (1974, 1993) acknowledges that reductionism in his sense has been peripheral to the practice of molecular biology, but maintains that his formal model of reduction captures the reduction relation between theories. Wimsatt (1979) suggests that Nagel’s and Schaffner’s focus on in-principle considerations and the context of justification, to the exclusion of in-practice considerations and the context of discovery, leads to misunderstandings about the nature of reductionism debates, including historical and current controversy among scientists (see Section 2). Reduction may obtain between classical and molecular genetics, but not in the sense of Nagel’s or Schaffner’s logical empiricist approach (Hull 1974).

3.2 Explanatory Reduction

A variety of explanatory reasoning patterns used by life scientists are now under scrutiny in philosophy of biology and theory reduction is no longer the primary focus. Various models of explanatory reduction focus on reductive explanation and differ from theory reduction (which is also a kind of explanation on the deductive-nomological notion of explanation) in two important ways:

(a) Whereas theory reduction assumes that reduction is a relation between theories, models of explanatory reduction permit other features as the relata of a reductive explanation, such as fragments of a theory, generalizations of varying scope, mechanisms, and even individual facts. One approach pursued along these lines is due to Kenneth Waters (1990, 1994, 2000). Instead of construing theory relations in terms of the Nagel-Schaffner model, he identifies a key principle of inference operating in classical genetics and molecular genetics: the “difference making principle” (gene differences cause differences in phenotypes). This principle can be ascribed to genes in both classical and molecular genetics. An explanatory reduction is achieved between them because their causal roles correspond. Waters (2008) extends this account by emphasizing how the investigative practices of classical genetics were “retooled” by developments in molecular genetics, which accounts for the success of the corresponding explanations.

Another example of explanatory reduction is due to Marcel Weber (2005). In line with models of theory reduction, Weber maintains that biochemical (“physico-chemical”) laws carry the explanatory force, but that a fact or basic generality about biological mechanisms (rather than a genuine law or a whole theory), such as the mechanism of action potentials in neurotransmission, is what is explained. By permitting reference to higher level structures in the explanans, such as axons, he does not require that a reductive explanation contain exclusively biochemical expressions.

(b) A characteristic difference between theory reduction and explanatory reduction stems from the fact that the former—focusing on the epistemic notion of logical deduction—does not incorporate the historically ubiquitous ontological idea that a reduction explains the whole in terms of its parts (see, e.g., Winther 2011). Models of explanatory reduction typically assume that reductive explanation is causal explanation, where a higher level feature is explained by the interaction of constituent parts. Stuart Kauffman (1971) gave an early expression of the idea that the search for explanations in experimental biology proceeds by decomposing an overall system into interacting parts. Wimsatt (1976b) also recognized that this mapped more naturally onto the language of biologists, especially the practice of discovering and elucidating mechanisms (see also Bechtel and Richardson 1993). Mechanism approaches have now developed into a robust alternative to theory reduction (see Section 5). Since many philosophers of biology and neuroscience conceive of explanation as the description of mechanisms, accounts of explanatory reduction can rely on the notion of a mechanistic explanation (e.g., Delehanty 2005).

Models of explanatory reduction avoid several problems facing theory reduction (see Section 3.1). Since explanatory reduction is not committed to the relata of an explanation being theories involving laws, it can defend the possibility of reduction without formally reconstructing a clearly delineated theory of molecular biology or classical genetics. Its focus on reduction as explanation of a whole in terms of its parts captures a feature of actual molecular explanations. Whereas accounts of theory reduction have to acknowledge that reduction (in this sense) has not yet been achieved and must appeal to its “in principle” possibility, accounts of explanatory reduction comport well with the piecemeal nature of actual scientific research. Experimental and molecular biology can offer reductive explanations even if many facts remain unexplained and existing explanations still require more details to be filled in. Current biology effectively explains individual facts and generalities of smaller scope, and the explanans can be a mere fragment of a theory (see, e.g., Schaffner 2006 on “patchy and fragmentary” reductions). Finally, given that mechanistic explanations in experimental biology are preceded by and closely tied to the discovery of mechanisms (Craver and Darden 2013), explanatory reduction provides an account of reduction that can be related to scientific discovery, while approaches of theory reduction have to separate the context of justification (reduction and explanation) from the context of discovery.

An early model of explanatory reduction due to William Wimsatt (1976b) assumes that reduction is the causal explanation of an individual event (rather than a generality), involving a “compositional redescription” of a higher level state of affairs into some of its component features. This model is related to Wesley Salmon’s (1971) account of statistical explanation, which uses the notion of screening off to explicate the idea of one property being statistically more relevant (and thus more explanatory) than another one. Wimsatt replaces Salmon’s statistical relevance with the idea of causal relevance (as explanatory reduction in biology involves the search for causally relevant factors), and he develops the notion of “effective screening off”. Compositional redescription and explanation in terms of lower level properties can have a greater “cost” of explanation (e.g., by being more complicated) than the description in terms of the higher level property that is effectively screened off. A consequence of the epistemic “cost” requirement is that an explanatory reduction that effectively screens off a described higher level feature does not make it irrelevant and thus eliminable (as in Salmon’s account) because it can be retained for pragmatic purposes.

Sahotra Sarkar’s (1998) detailed discussion of reductionism and genetics offers several relevant conceptual clarifications. Focusing on substantive issues about reduction in genetics (especially representation, see Section 4.3), rather than formal considerations in a theory of reduction, Sarkar develops a view of explanatory reduction that is not committed to a particular account of explanation. Two such basic types of reduction are “abstract hierarchical reduction” and “strong reduction” (or spatial hierarchical reduction), where the latter—unlike abstract hierarchical reduction—requires that entities of a lower hierarchical level are physical parts of higher level entities. (Each type of reduction can come in stronger and weaker forms as different kinds of approximations are involved in different explanations.) Sarkar argues that explanations in classical genetics, which explain phenotypic patterns in terms of classical genes, are abstract hierarchical reductions. The entities involved in this case are alleles, loci, linkage groups, genotypes, and phenotypes, which stand in hierarchical relations (e.g., alleles \(A\) and \(a\) form genotype \(Aa)\), with individual alleles occupying the lowest level. However, this is an abstract rather than a spatial hierarchy; the assumption that \(A\) and \(a\) map to \(Aa\) at the next higher level does not require \(Aa\) to be a physical entity that has \(A\) and \(a\) as its spatial parts. Furthermore, the genotypic entities in this hierarchy are governed by various transformations and regularities (principles of inheritance), such as segregation, linkage, and mutation, which help to explain phenotypic patterns of inheritance. Although this abstract hierarchy can be interpreted as a spatial hierarchy by viewing classical genes as being parts of chromosomes, Sarkar’s point is that the various practices in classical genetics, such as segregation and linkage analysis, did not require a physical interpretation of genetic maps, and that explanations in terms of an abstract hierarchy can be genuine reductions since they invoke a lower and thus more fundamental hierarchical level.

Regarding spatial hierarchical reduction, Sarkar argues that this regularly occurs in molecular biology, where certain cellular features are explained by macromolecular physics. The various components of cells form nested part-whole relations, resulting in a spatial hierarchy. Many mechanisms of classical genetics can be reductively explained by the physical principles governing the behavior of macromolecules (though approximations are still necessary). Explanatorily relevant principles for the physics of macromolecules include weak interactions, hydrogen bonding, hydrophobic bonding, allosteric transformations, lock-key fit, and the idea that structure determines function. Sarkar’s central tenet is that the elucidation of the molecular mechanisms of replication, recombination, and cell division provide reductive explanations of the principles of classical genetics. Even though classical genetics offered an account of gene transmission and could rely on cytological explanations, these accounts did not yield a complete explanation of how and why recombination occurs. Molecular biology filled in this gap and corrected classical genetics.

Other models of explanatory reduction have been put forward by philosophers, many with an explicit eye to capturing how reduction occurs in scientific practice (e.g., Bickle 2003, 2006, 2008). In some ways the most unique defense of explanatory reduction is found in the work of Alex Rosenberg (2006), which departs from his earlier critical focus on theory reduction (1978, 1985, 1994). First, according to his position, strict laws (universal, exceptionless, spatio-temporally unrestricted) are required for explanation and the only candidate law in biology is the principle of natural selection (PNS). Second, why-necessary explanations are better than how-possible explanations in historical sciences such as biology, but why-necessary explanations are only available at the molecular level because structure becomes decoupled from function above this level. Therefore, all how-possible explanations in “functional biology” (i.e., non-molecular biology), even those invoking the PNS, and any descriptions from functional biology involving higher levels of organization get explained (why-necessarily) by the PNS operating on the molecular level (often occurring at some relatively distant point in evolutionary history).[6]

Marie Kaiser (2011, 2015) has offered a thorough analysis of reductive explanation, including a systematic treatment of metaphilosophical issues that underlie different approaches (see 2015, Chapter 2). Instead of arguing for or against reduction, she both articulates the advantages of an explanation being reductive and indicates that many biological phenomena cannot be explained in this way. On Kaiser’s account, an explanation is reductive if it has three characteristics: (1) lower-level, (2) internal, and (3) parts-in-isolation. “Lower-level” means that the explanation relies only on features that are at a lower level than the phenomenon being explained. Similar to Sarkar’s hierarchical account, a reduction does not have to be a molecular or lowest-level explanation because Kaiser wants to capture reductive explanations throughout biology, including ecology. Explanations with this characteristic provide an epistemically important unidirectional “flow” of explanation from the lower to the higher level, even if some of the relevant lower-level entities are not spatial parts of the explanandum phenomenon. However, Kaiser also requires that reductive explanations appeal only to physical parts (“internal”) of the explanandum phenomenon or system. Additionally, to fully qualify as reductive, an explanation must represent each part it invokes in isolation—not in isolation from any context, but rather in isolation from a part’s original complex context. This “parts-in-isolation” characteristic is associated with a system being near-decomposable; upon decomposition, the actual functioning of a part can be understood in isolation. The whole system’s operation then can be recomposed from the parts interacting in a largely sequential and linear fashion (Bechtel and Richardson 1993, Bechtel and Abrahamsen 2009). Using these three characteristics, one can classify different explanations and distinguish a reductive explanation from a mechanistic explanation or from a part-whole explanation (Kaiser 2015, ch. 6).

4. Problems with Reductionism

Different accounts of theory reduction and explanatory reduction face several potential problems. Some critiques of (epistemic) reductionism emphasize that the effects of molecular processes strongly depend on the context in which they occur, so that one molecular kind can correspond to many higher level kinds (Section 4.1). Another significant challenge to reductionism stems from the fact that higher level biological structures and processes can be (and typically are) realized by different kinds of molecular processes, so that many molecular kinds can correspond to one higher level kind (Section 4.2). Finally, because biological processes must be represented before they can be explained (Sarkar 1998), two further features become salient as issues for explanatory reduction: temporality and intrinsicality (Section 4.3).

4.1 Context-Dependence of Molecular Features (one-many)

One key challenge for reduction stems from the fact that the effect of a molecular entity or mechanism may depend strongly on the context in which it occurs (Hull 1972, 1974, 1976; see also Wimsatt 1979, Gilbert and Sarkar 2000, Laubichler and Wagner 2001). Classical geneticists were fully aware of the fact that a phenotype is brought about by the interaction of several (many) classical genes—the same allele may lead to two different phenotypes if occurring in two individuals with a different overall genotype (Waters 2004). Although one-many phenomena have been known for some time, it is now a robust empirical generalization that a molecular pathway may have different effects in different cellular contexts; the same pathway can be involved in different functions in different species or in different parts of an individual (Gilbert and Sarkar 2000, Laubichler and Wagner 2001, Burian 2004).[7] These different contexts include developmental and physiological history, which condition the behavior of molecular pathways (Brigandt 2006, Kirschner 2005). Even the amino acid sequence produced by a molecular gene may depend on both DNA elements outside of the gene and non-genetic factors, which means the same gene can code for distinct products in different cells or different states of a cell (Griffiths and Stotz 2013, Stotz 2006a,b). Thus, there are one-many relations between molecular kinds and higher level kinds: a molecular mechanism can causally lead to or be part of different higher level states depending on the context.[8]

A common conclusion drawn from these one-many relations is that the parts and molecular components of an organism have to be understood in terms of the organized whole in which they occur (recall Kant’s regulative principle; Section 2). Although biologists view the decomposition of a system into lower-level parts as reductionist (an instance of methodological reduction, see Section 1), they often construe the attempt to understand how the parts are organized to bring about the system-level properties as a synthetic, non-reductionist endeavor (Bechtel 2010, 2013). Paying attention to context and organismal organization is a valid methodological recommendation; however, it is less clear why this is an argument against epistemic reduction. For example, proponents of theory reduction, such as Nagel (1961) and Schaffner (1976), have replied that a molecular reduction can take the relations of parts and the context of molecular processes into account. For example, one can specify the relevant context as initial conditions in the molecular premises from which the higher level state is to be deduced (Frost-Arnold 2004).

Context-dependence is primarily a problem for models of theory reduction; some models of explanatory reduction take the organismal context for granted without being committed to reducing it molecularly (as seen in explanations offered in developmental biology). Sciences can avail themselves of causes as difference makers relative to a given causal context (Waters 2007, Woodward 2003). Both experimental investigation and explanation can focus on one among many causes, relegating everything else to the context or background (which is often held fixed in experimental studies). For example, if the loss in function of a particular gene leads to an abnormal phenotype in a knock-out experiment, this gene is one causal factor implicated in the development of the normal phenotype. Explanations appealing to this gene—as a salient causal factor relative to a context—are genuinely explanatory even if other genes involved in the phenotype are unknown and the cellular context for the gene is not yet understood (Waters 1994, 2007). If molecular biologists discover that the same mechanism produces different effects in distinct contexts and only one of these effects is the target of inquiry, a part of the mechanism’s context becomes epistemically relevant and can be included in the explanation (Delehanty 2005).

In contrast, theory reduction (such as the Nagel-Schaffner approach) is committed to deducing a description of the higher level phenomenon from purely molecular premises. In order to deduce even a single higher level statement (a fortiori a total higher level theory on Schaffner’s account), the premises must contain (in addition to the lower level laws) a specification of the total lower level context—every feature that has some causal impact. This includes features internal to an organism and some parts of its environment. While explanatory reduction can appeal to particular causes relative to a background that is not molecularly specified, a logical deduction (as required by theory reduction) can go through only if the total causal context is contained in the premises.[9] A molecular characterization of the total context is in principle possible due to ontological reduction: for any higher level state there is always a total molecular configuration that determines this higher level phenomenon. However, this entails a retreat to the “in principle” possibility of a molecular derivation; not only is a molecular specification of the total context currently unavailable but it may not be forthcoming in the future (Hull 1972, 1974, 1976).[10] In this respect, accounts of explanatory reduction have a clear advantage over models of theory reduction because the former are committed neither to formal derivation nor the assumption that the explanans of the reductive explanation involves only molecularly characterized notions.

Although context-dependence is not a problem for many models of explanatory reduction, issues can arise for some models of mechanistic explanation. A mechanistic approach decomposes a system into components and scrutinizes the functioning of each component in isolation (where possible). However, a mechanistic explanation must also epistemically “recompose” the mechanism behavior (the explanandum) from these component functions (Bechtel 2010, Bechtel and Abrahamsen 2009). There are molecular systems consisting of highly interconnected and functionally integrated networks whose complex organization does not permit a recomposition of the system behavior from the component functions studied in isolation (Green et al. 2018, Kaiser 2015). The functioning of individual components is transformed by the many influences of the other components. This empirical situation also is important because it stands behind many instances where molecular biologists claim a limit of “reduction”—these complex system interactions lead to emergence (in some sense). This highlights that biologists frequently attempt to account for mechanism functioning or system dynamics and not just mereological or structural constitution (e.g., reducing the Mendelian kind “gene” to biochemical kinds).

Jason Robert’s (2004) treatment of explanation and methodology in developmental biology describes what is probably the main valid point stemming from the context-dependence of molecular features. While acknowledging the legitimacy of reductionist research strategies that isolate molecular causes relative to a background held fixed for experimental purposes, Robert emphasizes that this methodology does not license an inference to an exclusively reductionist position where all explanatorily relevant causes are molecular. That developmental genetics uncovers various differences between individuals that are due to differences in gene expression does not entail that genes are the only factors relevant in ontogeny. Since genetic research holds other cellular and organismal factors fixed, the causal influence of these non-genetic resources is simply not assessed by this research method. It begs the question against those who maintain that some explanations of development must invoke higher level features to assert that the organismal context can always be described molecularly. For example, an appeal to developmental genetics research success alone is inadequate for reducing cellular context to molecular causes because the discovery of genetic causes occurs against a fixed organismal background (Robert 2004). The dependence of molecular features on cellular and organismal contexts poses problems for theory reduction approaches maintaining that higher level phenomena can be deduced from purely molecular premises. (It is also a problem for claims that the embryo can be computed from a purely molecular specification of the fertilized egg, as endorsed by Rosenberg 1997; see Keller 2002, ch. 9.) Thus, there are limitations on the kinds of inferences that can be drawn from reductionist research strategies. What remains missing from many philosophical discussions critical of reduction is an explicit account of methodological strategies and epistemological frameworks that both capture actual scientific reasoning and offer an alternative to reductionism (Love 2008a; see Section 5).

4.2 Multiple Realization of Higher Level Features (Many-One)

In addition to the one-many relation between molecular and higher level kinds, Hull (1972, 1974, 1976) also pointed to the existence of many-one relations as a challenge for reductionism. The same higher level phenomenon (e.g., a Mendelian trait such as coat color) can be produced by several different molecular mechanisms or a higher level phenomenon is realized by different kinds of molecular configurations (multiple realization). This is a potential problem for both theory reduction and explanatory reduction (though to differing degrees). In defense of his model of theory reduction, Schaffner (1976) replies that it is sufficient to specify one such molecular situation. Then the higher level situation, which is determined by the molecular constellation, can be derived logically from this molecular specification of the higher level situation. However, one has to be clear about the nature of the explanandum in a reductive explanation (i.e., what is the consequent of a reductive deduction). Is it a type of higher level phenomenon (described by higher level predicates) or merely a token phenomenon (an instance of a higher level phenomenon)? Theory reduction is the idea that a whole theory (such as classical genetics) can be reduced, or at least that its laws can be reduced. For example, the Mendelian principle of segregation is a law describing a phenomenon occurring in all sexually reproducing organisms, not just a token phenomenon, so this general principle—covering various lower level realizations—would have to be explained/deduced molecularly.

Consider the example that Schaffner (1993) offers in support of the possibility of reduction: the Mendelian concept of “dominance”. On his account, given classical genes \(a\) and \(b\), the property “allele \(a\) is dominant (relative to allele \(b)\)” can be expressed in molecular terms as follows. Assume that genotype \(aa\) yields phenotype \(A\) and genotype \(bb\) corresponds to phenotype \(B\), while \(ab\) yields \(A\) (because of dominance). We ascertain that gene \(a\) consists of DNA sequence \(\alpha\) and gene \(b\) consists of DNA sequence \(\beta\), and that phenotype \(A\) is brought about by protein א while phenotype \(B\) is brought about by protein ב. This yields the following supposed reduction:

Allele \(a\) is dominant (relative to \(b)\) iff the presence of two copies of DNA sequence \(\alpha\) molecularly produces protein א [thus phenotype \(A\)], the presence of two copies of sequence \(\beta\) produces protein ב [phenotype \(B\)], and the presence of one copy of \(\alpha\) and one copy of \(\beta\) produces א [phenotype \(A\)]. (Schaffner 1993, 442)

Although Schaffner explicitly claims to have shown that the predicate (or concept of) “dominance” can be reduced to the language of biochemistry, his evidence actually shows how a single instance of dominance (allele \(a\) is dominant to allele \(b)\) could be brought about by states on the molecular level. But epistemic reduction requires reducing higher level concepts and, since Mendelian dominance can be brought about by different kinds of molecular situations, this higher level predicate corresponds to many molecular predicates, which makes any reductive translation of higher level concepts very complex. (In addition to translating such concepts into molecular terms, theory reduction also requires deducing higher level generalizations involving such concepts.) A similar issue can apply to explanatory reduction. Biology attempts to explain kinds of phenomena occurring in different contexts and organisms: reductive explanations must molecularly explain kinds of phenomena in addition to single instances.

Subsequent discussion based on ideas in metaphysics and philosophy of mind has clarified how one conception of the many-one relation between molecular and higher level kinds can bear on epistemic reduction. In his general treatment of reduction in psychology and social science, Jerry Fodor (1974, 1975, 1997) distinguishes between token-token reduction and type-type reduction (or between token physicalism and type physicalism). Token-token reduction is the idea that each token higher level property or process is metaphysically identical to a token physico-chemical property or process (the weak sense of ontological reduction that is uncontroversial: see Section 1). The dispute centers on how much more than token-token reduction is possible. A substantially stronger idea is that each type of higher level phenomenon corresponds to one type of lower level phenomenon. Type-type reduction yields a bold version of epistemic reductionism where higher level concepts and knowledge about higher level phenomena could be immediately reduced to molecular notions. Yet Fodor argues that type-type reduction (regarding mental and social kinds in particular) is empirically false. Consider a simple law or causal principle of a higher-level science relating two kinds, \(S\) and \(T\), such that \(\forall x(Sx \rightarrow Tx)\), which can be read as “all \(S\)s are \(T\)s” or “all events of type \(S\) bring about events of type \(T\)”. (Some laws or principles might be of a more complex logical form.) As a matter of fact, a higher level kind is often realized by several different kinds on the physical level; different instances of the higher level kind are of a different type on the molecular level. If kind \(S\) is realized by the lower level kinds \(M_1, M_2 , \ldots ,M_i\), the bridge principle (reduction function) is of a disjunctive form:

\[ \forall x (Sx \leftrightarrow (M_1 x \vee M_2 x \vee \ldots \vee M_i x)) \]

\(T\) is likewise multiply realized, say by the molecular kinds \(N_1, N_2 , \ldots ,N_j\). Fodor’s point is that the lower level basis of the higher level law \(\forall x(Sx \rightarrow Tx)\) consists in several laws that reduce different higher level instances, such as:

\[ \forall x(M_1 x \rightarrow N_3 x), \forall x(M_2 x \rightarrow N_1 x), \forall x(( M_3 x \vee M_4 x) \rightarrow N_2 x),\ldots \]

Thus, while on the higher level there is one unified law \(\forall x (Sx \rightarrow Tx)\), its translation into molecular terms is a disjunctive statement:

\[ \forall x ((M_1 x \vee M_2 x \vee \ldots \vee M_i x) \rightarrow (N_1 x \vee N_2 x \vee \ldots \vee N_j x)) \]

This disjunctive statement has the appearance of being a gerrymandered combination rather than a genuine law. Therefore, the higher level law cannot be reduced to a unified lower level law. Token-token reduction obtains, but since the natural kinds (to which laws apply) of the higher level science cross-cut the kinds of the lower level science, type-type reduction fails and the law-based explanation from the higher level cannot be replaced by a unified law-based explanation on the lower level. Steven Kimbrough (1978) argues that this situation also applies to the relation between classical and molecular genetics: ontological (token-token) reduction is possible, but not epistemic (type-type) reduction.[11]

The multiple realizability of higher level kinds is typically viewed as an obstacle to reduction (e.g., Kincaid 1997), and many have interpreted the many-one relation between molecular and higher level phenomena in a similar way. Rosenberg’s earlier discussions that criticized theory reduction in light of multiple realization (1978, 1985, 1994) used the notion of supervenience, which is another way to spell out an idea of ontological without epistemic reduction (non-reductive physicalism).[12] Higher level facts supervene on physical facts if any difference between two higher level situations implies a difference in the physical basis. Yet this is consistent with two distinct physical situations corresponding to the same higher level state (many-one). Since biological properties such as fitness supervene on physical properties, fitness can be nothing more than a combination of physical properties, even though no such property complex is necessary for having a particular fitness value. Higher level theories abstract away from irrelevant variation in lower level features and thereby arrive at generalizations that are explanatory precisely because they do not include features irrelevant to explaining the phenomenon (Putnam 1975, Strevens 2008). From this perspective, theory reduction of classical to molecular genetics is impossible as the many–many relations between classical and molecular kinds make any reductive account radically disjunctive. At the same time, the notion of supervenience implies that classical and molecular genetics are not incommensurable, and that molecular genetics can shed light on the exceptions of classical genetics.

A related critique of reductionism in genetics is due to Philip Kitcher (1984). It is not that the complexities of any reduction due to many-one relations between molecular and higher level kinds exceed our cognitive capacities. Rather, the reductive, molecular account does not adequately explain because it does not involve the natural kinds that underlie the appropriate causal relations. Principles of classical genetics (e.g., segregation) are explained by cellular processes (e.g., the behavior of chromosomes in meiosis) because the higher level kinds picked out by cytology are causally relevant. Rephrasing these cellular processes in molecular terms leads to an account that mentions various disjunctive combinations of molecular kinds, while failing to exhibit the unified kinds that are the causes of the cellular process. A key aspect of Kitcher’s argument is that an epistemic account of reduction fails for ontological reasons: it does not capture the natural kind structure of chromosomal phenomena studied by classical genetics.

Schaffner’s reply to the multiple realization objection (1993, 463–6) emphasizes that the same DNA sequence can be present in many individuals, which means that molecular biology studies more than token phenomena; molecular generalizations apply to restricted types. This is true but fails to address the core issue. Critics of reductionism do not argue that each higher level type corresponds to several lower level tokens (which is trivially true) or that molecular biology can study token phenomena only. Rather, the point is that a higher level type corresponds to several lower level types, and for each of these lower level kinds a distinct molecular account obtains. Thus, a unified (as opposed to disjunctive) causal explanation of the higher level phenomenon appears impossible.

Waters (1990) challenges the commitment to unification that implies there is explanatory loss in appealing to the multiply realized “gory details” of molecular biology. In some cases, disjunctive explanations at a lower level seem to explain better than unified explanations at higher levels. Elliott Sober (1999) extends this line of argument: an explanation in terms of higher level kinds can be more unified or general by encompassing heterogeneous lower level kinds, but this same heterogeneity exhibits important differences in scientifically interesting properties. Only the lower level science can account for such differences and therefore, in this sense, offers a deeper explanation than the higher level science. Explanations are not better or worse along a one-dimensional scale. There are several epistemic virtues an explanation can possess, such as generality, depth, or specificity. Sometimes a lower level explanation is better relative to one epistemic virtue, while a higher level explanation is preferable relative to another, such as unification. And unification itself can be explicated differently in terms of functional or structural features of biological systems (see, e.g., Weiskopf 2011).[13]

Many contemporary accounts of explanatory reduction focus on mechanisms and the study of model organisms. One reply to the multiple realization objection from this perspective argues explicitly for token-token reduction, discussing how the causal description of a token mechanism explains (Delehanty 2005). Weber (2005) acknowledges that higher level features are multiply realizable but notes that this does not hamper the reducibility of token systems or individual organisms: “the fact that chemotactic behavior is multiply realizable does not affect the reductionistic explanation of this organism’s behavioral biology” (48). However, this stratagem ignores the key point of contention because token-token reduction is uncontroversial. The focus on token phenomena or individual organisms fails to address an important epistemological feature of scientific knowledge: explanations often cover types of phenomena. In many biological contexts, such as developmental biology, the intellectual aim is to explain phenomena instantiated in many organisms and the use of model organisms is predicated on this aim.[14] Any version of epistemic reductionism has to address this feature of scientific explanation to be adequate. Explaining development—as understood by many developmental biologists—means to have an account of ontogeny exhibited by individual organisms belonging to a larger group (e.g., understanding the developmental principles that govern vertebrate or amphibian development). As the same morphological structure may develop in different species by means of different processes and based on the action of different genes, multiple realization obtains and is relevant for such explanations (Laubichler and Wagner 2001).

Moreover, even if the aim is to explain a feature of a single organism, it does not follow that an explanation should appeal exclusively to factors on the lowest level. An explanation should only include factors that are explanatorily relevant; an irrelevant factor is one whose omission from (or modification in) the explanation does not prevent the explanandum from following (Strevens 2008). This also holds for mechanistic explanation, which should cite those features as components of a mechanism whose modification would make a causal difference to the explanandum phenomenon (Craver 2007). For instance, chromosomes are relevant parts of the mechanisms (“working entities”) needed to explain Mendelian patterns of inheritance (Darden 2005), but this particular explanation will apply regardless of the lower level, molecular composition of the chromosomes (e.g., whether or not the various genes have similar or very different DNA sequences).

In the context of developmental biology, even during the development of a single organism, a structure may be present across time and have a stable developmental-functional role, but its underlying molecular and cellular basis may change (Brigandt 2006, Kirschner 2005). Entities above the molecular level can be more robust so that when some molecular processes change or break down these higher level entities are not modified or removed. Knocking out a gene need not have any impact on ontogeny due to genetic redundancy, while eliminating a particular cell or group of cells may dramatically interfere with normal development (Brigandt 2013a, 2015, Mitchell 2009). A higher level causal connection can be more salient in that the regular operation of the mechanism strongly depends on the presence of this kind of causal relation. Such a higher level causal relation is realized by molecular entities and their interactions (i.e., supervenience obtains), but if relevant higher level processes are less sensitive to disturbance or intervention than certain molecular causes, the more powerful mechanistic explanation can be the one that appeals to more robust, higher level causal connections. This is one reason why some biological sciences preferentially invoke higher level entities and processes in the face of multiple realization, explaining in terms of higher level natural kinds and causes.

In summary, the level(s) of organization a successful explanation addresses often depends on the particular explanandum. If the aim is to explain a type of phenomenon, multiple realization issues (many-one relations) are likely pertinent. In the explanation of a token phenomenon, the explanation should include lower level factors only to the extent that they are explanatorily relevant for that particular explanandum.

4.3 Representation, Temporality, and Intrinsicality

Sarkar’s (1998) account of explanatory reduction draws attention to the requirement of representation: natural phenomena must be symbolized, embodied, pictured, or designated through media such as equations, scale miniatures, or abstract diagrams (Abrahamsen et al. 2018, Bechtel et al. 2018, Potochnik 2017, Sheredos and Bechtel 2020). Every reductive explanation in science involves representations of the systems or features to be related by reduction. (Note that this is not the question of how theory structure is represented; see, e.g., Schaffner 1996.) Almost all of the discussion surrounding one-many (Section 4.1) and many-one problems (Section 4.2) for theory and explanatory reduction assume or presume particular representations that directly impact the arguments offered (e.g., they involve approximations of different kinds). Sarkar distinguishes three representational criteria for a reductive explanation: (i) fundamentalism: the explanation of the phenomenon relies entirely on features that pertain to a more fundamental realm; (ii) abstract hierarchy: the system is represented as a hierarchy, where the lower levels are regarded as more fundamental; and, (iii) spatial hierarchy: the abstract hierarchy is rendered physical by the requirement that the entities on the lower level are (spatial) parts of the entities at higher levels (see Section 3.2). Whether or not there are one-many or many-one relations between different hierarchical levels turns on the nature of the hierarchy invoked and how it is characterized. The decomposition of a system is not a univocal enterprise and, depending on the principles utilized, can generate both competing and complementary sets of part representations from the same system (Craver 2009, Kauffman 1971, Wimsatt 1974, Winther 2011). Certain governing principles are often visible, such as functional versus structural decompositions (Bechtel and Richardson 1993, Winther 2006). Therefore, prior to determinations of whether reductive explanations succeed or fail, questions of representational choice and adequacy need to be addressed explicitly.

These representational issues are not idle with respect to differing explanations, both past and present, because the same line of argument about the non-independence of organismal parts constituted reasons for treating the organism from a non-reductionist standpoint (Aristotle, Parts of Animals II.3, Owen, Hunterian Lectures [1837] in Sloan 1992, 213–4). Individuation of parts and their explanatory relationship to wholes is critically dependent on the principles utilized in representing them (Love 2012). Wimsatt (1974, 1986, 1997, 2007) has claimed that reduction and emergence are compatible within the context of explaining organizational complexity in living systems, going so far as to argue that reductionist methodology can identify emergence when specific conditions of aggregativity are delineated. Different failures of aggregativity result when different conditions are not met, which yields a subtle taxonomy of compositional relations, as well as highlighting that different decompositions produce distinct fulfillments and/or violations of those conditions that can be methodologically exploited by scientists for the purpose of causal discovery.

In addition to individuation, two other issues related to representation are germane: temporality and intrinsicality (Hüttemann and Love 2011). In most discussions of epistemic reduction, both theoretical and explanatory, no explicit distinction has been drawn between constitutional or spatial relations (arrangements) and causal or temporal relations (dynamics; but see Mitchell 2009, 2012). One source of the focus on spatial relations is the objection to reductionism from structural organization (Polanyi 1968, cf. Delehanty 2005, Frost-Arnold 2004, Schaffner 1993, ch. 9.2), which is related to the “context” objection (Section 4.1). Moreover, physical science models that serve as templates for thinking about reduction emphasize spatial composition questions rather than causal relations (Love and Hüttemann 2011). As Schaffner has remarked: “Biological theories are usually given in the form of a series of temporal (and frequently causal) models. In physics, time is usually eliminated by making it implicit in differential equations, whereas in biology a temporal process … is the rule” (1993, 83–4, cf. Kellert 1993, 93). Nagel presciently recognized differences between spatial and temporal organization in his discussion of teleological explanation (in part because he was reading the literature on explaining ontogeny by theoretical biologists; see Section 2).

The contrast between structure and function is evidently a contrast between the spatial organization of anatomically distinguishable parts of an organ and the temporal (or spatiotemporal) organization of changes in those parts. What is investigated under each term of the contrasting pair is a mode of organization or a type of order. In the one case the organization is primarily if not exclusively a spatial one, and the object of the investigation is to ascertain the spatial distribution of organic parts and the modes of their linkage. In the other case the organization has a temporal dimension, and the aim of the inquiry is to discover sequential and simultaneous orders of change in the spatially ordered and linked parts of organic bodies. (Nagel 1961, 426)

Kitcher also glimpsed the potential significance of temporality for reductive explanation in the context of embryology: “Because developmental processes are complex and because changes in the timing of embryological events may produce a cascade of effects at several different levels, one sometimes uses descriptions at higher levels to explain what goes on [later] at a more fundamental level” (1984, 371).

A very different distinction utilizing time, which is agreed upon by diverse participants, distinguishes between the historical succession of theories via reduction (“diachronic reduction”) and current attempts to relate parts to wholes, such as in explanatory reduction or interlevel theory reduction (“synchronic reduction”; see Section 3.1).

Synchronic reduction is mereological explanation, in which the behavior of more composite items described in reduced theories is explained by derivation from the behavior of their components by the reducing theory. Thus, reduction is a form of explanation. Diachronic reduction usually involves the succession of more general theories which reduce less general ones, by showing them to be special cases which neglect some variables, fail to measure coefficients, or set parameters at restricted values. As the history of science proceeds from the less general theory to the more general, the mechanism of progress is the reduction of theories. (Rosenberg 2006, 28)
The first distinction to note is that between synchronic and diachronic conceptions of reductionism. The term reduction is often used to refer to the relation between a theory and its historical successor. … This is … what I mean by diachronic reductionism. My concern, on the other hand, is solely with synchronic reductionism, that is to say, with the relations between coexisting theories addressed to different levels of organization. (Dupré 1993, 94–5)

What this distinction misses is the possibility of diachronic aspects of part-whole or interlevel relations. Scientific explanations commonly invoke dynamic (causal) processes involving entities on several levels of organization (Craver and Bechtel 2007). This is one of the core reasons why development is a persisting biological topic for reductionism. During ontogeny there are causal interactions over time among parts and activities (both homogeneous and heterogeneous) to bring about new parts and activities (both homogeneous and heterogeneous), eventually generating an integrated adult (whole) organism.

Temporality can be added as a fourth criterion on representations for reductive explanations: (iv) temporal hierarchy: for an abstract hierarchy embedded in an explanation, the entities and their behaviors on the lower level are temporally prior to the entities and their behaviors at the higher levels (Hüttemann and Love 2011). Although temporal or process hierarchies have not received the same attention as spatial hierarchies (such as in Wimsatt’s aggregativity criteria), their importance is seen in explanations that invoke higher level features (e.g., tissue interactions during ontogeny) at an earlier time to causally explain lower level features at a later time (e.g., gene expression patterns). For example, a study of the developmental origin of aortic arch asymmetry involves a mixture of reductionist and non-reductionist representations according to the criterion of temporality (Yashiro et al. 2007; see also Love 2017). The explanation depicts several events in a sequential process. First, fundamental level properties (gene expression) change non-fundamental level properties (arterial structure), which alters blood flow dynamics (thereby fulfilling the temporality condition). These new dynamics induce a subsequent change in gene expression (thereby violating the temporality condition). This altered gene expression then produces the non-fundamental property of interest, aortic arch asymmetry (thereby fulfilling the temporality condition). Thus, depending on how time is represented and which temporal partitions are utilized, an explanation may be reductive, non-reductive, or both. This is a good example of how ontological and epistemic reduction can yield strikingly different answers. A biologist using a higher level feature at an earlier time to explain a lower level feature at a later time (a non-reductionist explanation by the criterion of temporality) is not denying that this higher level feature is composed of lower level features (e.g., cells and molecules), nor the possibility that the higher level feature was caused by a different set of lower level features at some more distal point in time.

Another example is found in protein folding within molecular biology (Hüttemann and Love 2011). Functional proteins are folded structures composed of amino acid components linked together into a linear chain. If we ask whether the folded protein is mereologically composed of its amino acid parts given current representations in molecular biology, then the affirmative answer seems to favor explanatory reduction with respect to the spatial hierarchy. But if we ask whether the linear amino acid chain folds into a functional protein (a causal process with a temporal dimension) purely as a consequence of its linked amino acid parts, then the answer is less clear. Empirical studies have discerned a necessary role for other folded proteins to assist in the proper folding of newly generated linear amino acid chains (Frydman 2001). That the linked amino acid components alone are insufficient causally, even if they are sufficient constitutionally, allows for a more explicit appreciation of the significance of temporality and dynamics (Mitchell 2009), especially because the relations of interest concern only molecular biological phenomena (as opposed to higher levels of organization, such as cells or anatomy).

A final representational feature is intrinsicality, whereby what is “internal” and “external” are explicitly or implicitly distinguished in reductive explanations. Wimsatt (1980) drew attention to the fact that every investigation must divide a system from its environment and that methodological reductionism favors attributions of causal responsibility to internal parts of a system rather than those deemed external (see also Wilson 2004). In the protein folding case, it appears that the failure of temporally indexed explanatory reduction involves the causal powers of something extrinsic to (an instance of) the process under scrutiny (i.e., the folding of a single amino acid chain). The presumption of atemporal, compositional relationships has encouraged a neglect of this distinction because nested part-whole relations are predicated on a prior individuation of a system from its environment (Hüttemann and Love 2011). Kaiser’s (2015) idea that a reductive explanation must (among other things) represent each lower-level part of the explanation “in isolation” from other parts is one explicit attempt to engage representational questions related to intrinsicality (Section 3.2). Overall, this line of thought relates to the context-dependency objection (Section 4.1), but emphasizes the importance of functional dependency relations uncovered by attending to temporality in addition to structural organization.

Recognizing temporal aspects of reductive explanations found in biology alongside other representational issues like intrinsicality, both of which are not captured by a focus on mereology alone, strengthens the argument in favor of talking about different kinds of reductionism rather a unified account of reduction or overarching dichotomies of “reductionism” versus “anti-reductionism” (or “holism”). Once we incorporate distinctions about different types of reduction (ontological, epistemic, and methodological), the different interpretations of these types (e.g., theoretical versus explanatory epistemic reductions), the different representational features involved (spatial, temporal, etc.), and the distinct biological topics to which philosophers have applied them (e.g., development or functional anatomy), then any single conception of reduction appears inadequate to do justice to the diversity of phenomena and reasoning practices in the life sciences. The multiplicity and heterogeneity of biological subdisciplines only reinforce this argument and suggest to some that we should move beyond reductionism entirely.

5. “Alternatives” to Reductionism: Moving Beyond Dichotomies

Much of the past discussion about reduction presupposes a unitary view of the scientific enterprise that involves a close relation between natural kinds, laws, counterfactual dependence, explanation, and confirmation (Godfrey-Smith 2008). One of the ubiquitous features of modern biology that is prima facie incompatible with many methodological and epistemological reductionist theses is the proliferation and flourishing of diverse biological subdisciplines, molecular and otherwise. Despite the purported “hegemony of molecular biology” (Kitcher 1999a), biological subdisciplines focused on higher levels of organization have not disappeared: “Special sciences: still autonomous after all these years” (Fodor 1997). For some time this feature of biological research, along with many of the problems associated with theoretical reduction (especially its inapplicability to scientific practice, but also the difficulties in identifying clear-cut and distinct “levels” to relate reductively; Brooks 2014, 2021, Brooks et al. 2021, McGill and Potochnik 2012, Potochnik 2021), has prompted philosophers to reject “reduction” as the appropriate (or only) relation among concepts and explanations from different domains.[15] Instead, relations of coordination driven by a commitment to unifying, integrating, or synthesizing aspects of scientific knowledge have been offered (Bechtel and Hamilton 2007, Brigandt 2013b, Love 2017, Potochnik 2011).

Lindley Darden and Nancy Maull were at the forefront of this discussion with the concept of an inter-field theory (Darden and Maull 1977, Maull 1977). For example, the advent of the chromosome theory of inheritance in the 1910s bridged the previously unrelated fields of Mendelian genetics (which studied phenotypic patterns of inheritance across generations) and cytology (which dealt with the material contents of cells). This interfield theory effected a kind of unification, but Mendelian genetics and cytology were not reduced to each other, nor did the interfield theory reduce both fields. More recent work has articulated interfield relations without relying on the notion of a theory (Ankeny and Leonelli 2016, Bechtel 1986, Burian 1993, Grantham 2004a, 2004b, Leonelli 2013, Mitchell 2002). This parallels the trend in models of explanatory reduction of moving away from theories as the only epistemic units of interest (Section 3.2), but the emphasis is on such relations as coordination, integration, synthesis, or reciprocal interaction (Bechtel 2013, Green 2013, Hochstein 2016, Love 2017, Nathan 2017, Plutynski 2013). A rationale for these complex relations emerges from the demand for multidisciplinary research (O’Rourke et al. 2016); the explanatory task involves coordinating diverse epistemic resources (Ankeny and Leonelli 2016), which amounts to an implicit rejection of the “fundamentality” of one particular discipline producing the most empirically adequate explanations.

In this context, Alan Love (2008a, 2014) uses the notion of a problem agenda to argue that some scientific problems not only motivate interdisciplinary research but also provide structure for the requisite intellectual coordination (see also Brigandt 2010, 2012, Brigandt and Love 2012, Villegas et al. 2023). Problem agendas consist of numerous component questions that stand in systematic relations and are tied to associated standards of explanatory adequacy. These standards imply what epistemic resources and different disciplines are needed to address the problem. The relations among component questions of the problem agenda (i.e., its internal structure) foreshadow how various contributions can be coordinated to generate an adequate explanatory framework. Building on this perspective, Ingo Brigandt (2010) suggests that there is no single, linear hierarchy among scientific fields (e.g., Oppenheim and Putnam 1958), but that the relationships among theories and disciplinary approaches are determined by and vary with the scientific problem being addressed. These philosophical accounts align with general research on interdisciplinarity, which has identified the presence and articulation of a complex question as a prerequisite (Repko 2008, Szostak 2002, 2009). Thus, instead of unification being a regulative ideal with biologists seeking as much unity as possible in their explanations of the complex natural world (e.g., Kitcher 1999b), an erotetic perspective suggests that particular problems determine the need for and degree of any integration (Brigandt 2010). William Bechtel’s (1993, 2006) studies of cell biology document how the formation of new subdisciplines generates both integration among approaches and some disintegration due to new specializations. Bechtel’s attention to the institutional underpinnings of biology also meshes with sociological analyses of disciplinary organization (Gerson 1998, 2013).

Recently, accounts of explanation revolving around “mechanisms” have been widely discussed (e.g., Baetu 2015, Bechtel 2006, 2008, Bechtel and Abrahamsen 2005, Craver 2006, 2007, Darden 2006, Glennan 1996, 2017, Machamer et al. 2000). Many philosophers view experimental biology as fundamentally concerned with the discovery of mechanisms (Craver and Darden 2013, Darden and Craver 2002, Tabery 2004), where mechanisms are understood as akin (though not equivalent) to machines with interconnected, organized parts operating to produce regular or expected outcomes. Conceiving of biological explanation in terms of mechanisms provides a philosophical framework that closely tracks biological practice and does not rely on the notion of a theory. Besides providing new models for explanatory reduction (Section 3.2), mechanisms also have been used to demonstrate integration among different fields. Darden (2005) argues that both reduction and replacement fail to capture the relations between classical and molecular genetics. Both fields deal with different mechanisms that occur at different periods of the cell cycle and involve different working entities: classical genetics focuses on meiosis and involves chromosomal behavior; molecular genetics focuses on gene expression and involves various molecular entities such as nucleotide sequences. Relations between the two fields are manifested as differential attention to distinct aspects of a larger, temporally extended mechanism.

The mechanisms framework has proved particularly fruitful in capturing explanations that appeal to entities at several levels of organization (Darden 2016, Tabery 2014). An instructive example is Carl Craver’s (2005, 2007) discussion of multilevel and multifield explanation in the context of neuroscientific studies of learning. While the cellular-molecular process of long-term potentiation is critical for memory formation, it is not merely a molecular counterpart of memory. Long-term potentiation is a lower-level component of an overall, multilevel mechanism. Reductionist accounts have neglected the phenomenon of disciplinary integration at the same level of structural organization and invested too heavily in finished reductive explanations, ignoring the dynamic changes in research strategy that precede them (Craver 2005). In addition to searching for molecular correlates of higher-level phenomena (“downward-looking” episodes), there also have been attempts to understand the role of molecular mechanisms in complex higher-level phenomena (“upward-looking” periods of research). Sometimes progress has been achieved independently of or by abandoning reduction as an explanatory goal. This need to change strategies depending on the research context is ubiquitous in mechanistic research (Bechtel 2010), which serves as another reminder for philosophers to attend to actual scientific practice. Even though a mechanism is temporally extended, philosophical analyses of mechanisms may not capture all aspects of temporality (see Section 4.3). While discussions have focused on the representation of time relative to a mechanism (e.g., Bechtel 2006, Machamer et al. 2000), not all aspects of the dynamics of biological systems are well represented as mechanisms involving entities and activities. Some might be better modeled using equations (Bechtel 2012, Bechtel and Abrahamsen 2010, 2011, Brigandt 2015, Weber 2008), and in other cases time might be represented independently of the mechanisms being investigated.[16]

Complexity also has been a source for articulating non-reductionist epistemological accounts of biological reasoning (Wimsatt 1974, Hooker 2011). Sandra Mitchell (2003, 2009) has argued that different forms of biological complexity block standard reductionist perspectives. Multiple (idealized) causal models must be integrated from different disciplinary approaches to adequately represent this complexity, including our uncertainty in predicting its behavior, which has implications for any social policy derived from these models (see also Mitchell 2008, 2020, Mitchell and Gronenborn 2017). She specifically draws attention to the phenomenon of self-organization, which refers to how system behaviors or patterns emerge from non-specific interactions among lower-level components (Camazine et al. 2001, Kauffman 1993), such as the collective behavior of social insects. (Self-organizing phenomena are also relevant to reductionism in physical science; see, e.g., Goldenfeld and Kadanoff 1999, Whitesides and Ismagilov 1999.) Although decomposing a system into parts is important for claims about self-organization, there is no localization of causal responsibility to individual components (Bechtel and Richardson 1993, ch. 9). Instead, the system behavior is a function of generic patterns of component interaction, which foregrounds how complexity emerges from dynamics rather than constitution (see Section 4.3). For example, gene networks and human social networks may exhibit isomorphic patterns of self-organization due to their interactive structure, which is unrelated to whether genes or humans are the components. Thus, self-organizing phenomena occupy an odd place in the reductionism discussion because even though components are used to explain the behavior of the system, it is the nature of their interactions (not their specific characteristics) that generate patterns of behavior. These patterns are often referred to as emergent properties of the system (see also Bishop et al. 2022, Grantham 2007, Mitchell 2012).

The philosophical import of biological complexity is underscored by recent trends in systems biology (Boogerd et al. 2007, Green 2015, 2017, Green et al. 2015, Mazzocchi 2012, Noble 2006, O’Malley and Soyer 2012). In addition to the mathematical modeling of system-wide behavior, systems biology has a wealth of data about various molecular components of cells stemming from functional genomics, transcriptomics, proteomics, and metabolomics methods. Downward looking strategies in systems biology attempt to analyze systemic dynamics into different components, whereas upward looking strategies aim to synthesize how the quantitative interactions among individual molecules result in higher-level behavior (Green et al. 2018, Krohs and Callebaut 2007). Despite the focus on molecular components and their interactions, non-reductionist themes tied to complexity are motivated by non-linear interactions and feedback loops that generate emergent behaviors, distributed control, and system robustness (Brigandt 2015, Bruggeman et al. 2002, Westerhoff and Kell 2007).

Another distinct strand of discussion about reductionism is found in critical analyses of methodology and explanation from the perspective of feminist philosophy of science and studies of the social aspects of science (e.g., Fehr 2004, Longino 1990, 1996). Feminist philosophy of biology has related reductionism and pluralism to other philosophical, scientific, and social issues. One core idea in these discussions is that forms of reductionism are involved in mutually reinforcing feedback loops with other factors, such as socioeconomic status or expectations about gender (Keller and Longino 1996, Levins and Lewontin 1985). Thus, reductionism, whether ontological, epistemic, or methodological, can be understood as the manifestation of more diverse commitments (e.g., political ideology) than much of the philosophy of biology literature on reductionism would suggest—the history of biology points in this direction as well (see, e.g., Allchin 2008). This line of criticism also suggests that the interrelations between reductionism in biology and the social sciences should be treated more explicitly. Elisabeth Lloyd (2002) has argued that medical research should not be restricted simply to molecular biological investigation because higher levels of social organization that are culturally sanctioned have unrecognized causal effects on health. As the social sciences and medicine attempt to apply different life science reasoning strategies, similar philosophical issues predictably transfer, but with the potential for more socially damaging consequences (see, e.g., Richardson 2013, 2021).

A shared feature of many alternatives to reductionism is an emphasis on pluralist dimensions of epistemology in biology that situate methodological or explanatory reduction as only one among many components (Dupré 1993, Kellert et al. 2006, Longino 2000, 2002, 2013, Mitchell 2003, Muszynski and Malaterre 2021, O’Malley 2013). In different ways, these positions stress how the scientific investigation of biological phenomena demands diverse epistemic tools without a requirement to tie it all together into fundamental physics, macromolecular chemistry, or even molecular biology. Thus, ontological reduction becomes more or less unhinged from epistemological reduction because there is no need to demonstrate how each and every domain of scientific inquiry is anchored in physical stuff. Scientists are epistemologically profligate, even if they are largely metaphysically frugal (see Dupré 1993 and van Fraassen 2002 for differing perspectives on science and metaphysics). The plurality of biological research motivates a philosophical pluralism about biology, both in terms of the many meanings available for different methodological and epistemological types of reduction, and the need to have multiple dimensions of reductionism in order to secure empirical adequacy with respect to modeling biological phenomena (Grantham 1999, Kellert et al. 2006, Looren de Jong 2006, Morange 2006, Sullivan 2009, van der Steen 1999, Wylie 1999).

It is clear that these different kinds of “alternatives” to reductionism successfully capture a number of features left untreated or ignored by theory reduction. However, it is an open question whether they supplant discussions of reduction or bear some complex relation to them (Craver 2005). Reasons in favor of the latter position include the continued use of “reductionist” language (for and against) in biological research, as well as the fact that a near universal reason for rejecting reduction and choosing an alternative is the problematic nature of theory reduction, which only represents a small space of the philosophical possibilities. One interpretation of some alternatives to reduction is that they are responding to the complexity of reduction that has become more apparent over the past two decades (e.g., seeing explanations as inherently interlevel), and the fact that biologists’ use of the term “reductionism” refers to different specific commitments in different cases and research contexts. Thus, for example, mechanisms approaches are another way to treat the heterogeneity of explanation (including reductive and non-reductive aspects), which was largely ignored in the literature on theory reduction, which assumed that a few select examples from biological research were representative. This heterogeneity is a pervasive feature of the history of biology; philosophical alternatives to reduction are responding in part to long-standing controversies among life science investigators about the legitimacy of reductionist research strategies and modes of explanation (see Section 2). The compatibility or conflict among these various alternatives and different accounts of explanation in biology is still being probed (e.g., Bechtel 2006, 40–44), but the traditional philosophical project of articulating a single notion of reduction to capture most essential aspects of theory structure and explanation across biology is unlikely to succeed.

6. Future Prospects

Arguably, discussions of reductionism in biology are becoming more rather than less philosophically interesting. This is a consequence of recognizing the diverse conceptual landscape carved out over past decades, one that is much larger than that conceived of when only Nagelian theory reduction was in view. Biological science is now more specialized than ever, but disciplinary proliferation brings with it issues relevant to any analysis of reduction: using the same terms differently, disparate methodologies, distinct explanatory norms, and divergent interests in “levels” of biological organization (Brooks 2021, Potochnik 2021). It also includes an acknowledgment that certain enduring biological topics like development still engender difficult questions about reductionism and new fields of inquiry reinvigorate these discussions (e.g., synthetic biology’s appeal to molecular components as Lego-like building blocks in the Registry of Standard Biological Parts). Philosophers need to recognize that a criterion of adequacy on accounts of reductionism in biology involves interpreting why scientists make pronouncements about the failure of reductionism in different areas of life science (see, e.g., De Backer et al. 2010).[17]

There also is increasing contact between neuroscience and psychologically oriented investigations (Barwich 2020, Bechtel 2008, Boogerd et al. 2002, Craver 2007, Sullivan 2016, 2017, Tabb 2019). A potential prospect related to the contact between molecular neurobiology and psychology is the injection of epistemic considerations into philosophy of mind discussions (Godfrey-Smith 2008). More attention to issues of representation, decomposition, and temporality could alter the nature of these debates. At the same time, a more explicit evaluation of metaphysical components imported from philosophy of mind into philosophy of biology is warranted. Discussions of the status of downward causation and realization in biological systems are relevant for a better understanding of the intersection between epistemological and metaphysical components of reduction (Craver and Bechtel 2007, Green 2021, Love 2012, Robinson 2005, Wilson and Craver 2007, Woodward 2021). For example, an interest in the context sensitivity of realization in philosophy of mind (Wilson 2004, ch. 6) invokes issues pertaining to the context objection, individuation, temporality (especially causation versus constitution), and intrinsicality. These analyses can then be imported into biological contexts to argue for or against particular aspects of reductionism (see, e.g., Wilson 2005).

More work is needed in how to relate different kinds of hierarchies to questions of reductionism. Biological hierarchies are diverse (Grene 1987, Korn 2002, 2005) and subject to evolutionary change (Baedke 2021, DiFrisco, 2021, Tëmkin 2021), and some areas of biological research, such as paleontology and systematics (Valentine and May 1996; see also Grantham 1999, 2004a, 2004b, 2007), have been ignored when reductionism comes into view. Paying attention to temporality encourages the exploration of functional or control hierarchies in more detail (Love 2021, Salthe 1985, 1993, Wimsatt 2002). The limitations of representing biological systems in terms of hierarchies should be explored in more depth as well (Bechtel 2022, Brooks 2014, O’Malley et al. 2014, Potochnik 2021, Potochnik and McGill 2012).

All of these possibilities suggest more scrutiny of disciplinary heterogeneity in biological investigation relevant to reductionism. Although ecology has received some treatment (Dupré 1993, ch. 5, Mikkelson 2004), issues of decomposition and representation have not yet received wide attention. Other topics connected to explanatory reduction and mechanisms in experimental research are cancer (Bertolaso 2013, 2016, Bizzarri et al. 2008, Green 2021, Moss 2002, Plutynski 2013, Soto and Sonnenschein 2005, 2006) and stem cells (Fagan 2013, Laplane 2016, Laplane and Solary 2019). Because of the diversity of explanations found in these different disciplines, the nature of scientific explanation returns with a vengeance (Schaffner 2006). Although only a few reductionists demand that explanation be strictly nomological (Rosenberg 2006, Weber 2005), the subtle interplay between explanation and reduction must be treated when ranging over diverse biological subdisciplines. Additionally, as more attention is given to the diversity of investigative reasoning (or “scientific practice”) in and among these disciplinary contexts, the interplay between different aspects of methodological and epistemic reduction will become more salient. To achieve an understanding of the intricacy and diversity of scientific practice, it has become more common for philosophers of science to interact or collaborate with scientists from various fields (“engaged philosophy of science”), where some of the engagement with practicing scientists and stakeholders affected by science and technology also aims at influencing the methodological approaches adopted in such research (Brister and Frodeman 2020, Kaiser and Meunier 2014, Plaisance and Elliott 2021, Tuana 2010, 2013).

A final prospect concerns whether discussions of reduction in different sciences will interact fruitfully. Although questions about reduction in philosophy of physics have largely diverged from those in philosophy of biology, some connections have been drawn (Batterman 2021, Green and Batterman 2017). For example, Sarkar has approached quantum mechanics using his account of reductionism that was forged in a biological context (Jaeger and Sarkar 2003). A potential intersection between these discussions arises around the relations between parts and wholes or temporality, which have come under scrutiny from philosophers focused on the physical sciences (Hüttemann 2004, Love and Hüttemann 2011, Rueger 2000, Rueger and McGivern 2010). Another area worthy of more attention is reductive explanation in chemistry, which has been ignored in large part by philosophers of biology (see, e.g., Bishop 2010, LePoidevin 2005, Ramsey 1997, Scerri 1994, 2000).

In all these cases it seems clear that debates about reductionism in biology have not reached a denouement but rather portend vigorous philosophical discussion as the heterogeneity of issues related to its ontological, epistemological, and methodological types are brought to bear on perennial biological topics. The task of philosophers focused on reductionism in biology will be to analyze these promiscuities of reasoning and seek to develop different accounts of reduction that capture what scientists actually do and contribute to more general perspectives on biological knowledge and scientific inquiry.


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Tom Doyle, Andreas Hüttemann, Ken Waters, Rob Wilson, and two anonymous referees provided useful suggestions on earlier versions of this entry. We appreciate the many further colleagues who gave us valuable feedback. Ingo Brigandt’s work on this essay was funded with an Izaak Walton Killam Memorial Postdoctoral Fellowship by the Killam Trusts of Canada and with Standard Research Grant 410-2008-0400 and Insight Grant 435-2016-0500 by the Social Sciences and Humanities Research Council of Canada. Alan Love’s work on revisions of this essay was supported in part by grants from the John Templeton Foundation (“Complexity, emergence and reductionism: toward a multilevel integrative analysis of the brain and cognition,” ID 24426; “Integrating generic and genetic explanations of biological phenomena,” ID 46919) and funding from the Winton Chair in the Liberal Arts (University of Minnesota).

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