To blame someone is to respond in a particular way to something of negative normative significance about him or his behavior. A paradigm case, perhaps, would be when one person wrongs another, and the latter responds with resentment and a verbal rebuke, but of course, we also blame others for their attitudes and characters (see, e.g., Smith 2005). Thus blaming scenarios typically involve a wide range of inward and outward responses to wrongful or bad actions, attitudes, or character (such responses include: beliefs, desires, expectations, emotions, sanctions, and so on). In theorizing about blame, then, philosophers have typically asked two questions:
- Which precise reactions and interactions constitute blame?
- Under what conditions is it appropriate to respond in these ways?
Many theorists approach these questions with a larger theoretical agenda in mind: for example, in an effort to understand the conditions of moral responsibility more generally and the nature of freedom (e.g., Wallace 1994), or in an effort to articulate the content of moral properties (e.g., Gibbard 1990). But the questions are interesting in their own right, especially since blame is such a common feature of our shared moral experience. This entry will critically discuss the answers that have been offered in response to the above questions concerning blame, with the aim of shedding some light on blame's nature, ethics, and significance. (A common but by no means universal assumption is that praise is the counterpart of blame; still, it is blame that is often taken to be the more significant phenomenon for moral philosophy.)
- 1. What is Blame?
- 2. When is Blame Appropriate?
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To begin, note that almost all philosophical discussions of blame ignore (or mention only to set aside) the form of blame sometimes characterized as causal or explanatory responsibility (Kenner 1967; Hart 1968; Beardsley 1969). It is this notion of blame that is at stake when we say that Hurricane Hugo is to blame for the destruction of Charleston's harbor, or that the cat is to blame for knocking over the vase. Theorists contrast this sense of “blame” with the sort of interpersonal blame that, for example, one gives up when one forgives. (As Pamela Hieronymi has pointed out (2001), forgiveness in fact requires not giving up one's judgment that the other person is explanatorily to blame.) But just what the relation is between causal blame and interpersonal blame is an important question that has not been well-explored. Nevertheless, in this entry the focus will be on blame as a response to moral agents on the basis of their wrong, bad, or otherwise objectionable actions or characters.
A taxonomy of theories of blame could be organized along a number of different dimensions, depending on one's purposes. Consider just two of these possible dimensions. First, we could categorize theories of blame according to the content of blaming attitudes. On this way of dividing up things, the view put forth by Pamela Hieronymi (2004)—which holds that the force of blame is located in judgments of ill will—would be categorized with that of R. Jay Wallace (1994, 2011)—which holds that blame is an emotional response to ill will displayed in others' action. Alternatively, we could categorize theories of blame according to those psychological states or dispositions that are identified with blame. This second way of dividing things up emphasizes an important difference between Hieronymi's and Wallace's theories: for Hieronymi, blame can be identified primarily with a judgment, but for Wallace, blame is primarily an emotion.
Of course, any scheme for categorizing theories has its advantages and disadvantages, and by selecting one of these taxonomies, one necessarily emphasizes certain aspects of blame while ignoring other aspects of blame that might be equally important. So in some sense, any preference towards one way of cutting things up over another would be arbitrary. Nevertheless, the taxonomy to follow is consonant with much of the literature in classifying theories according to the activity or mental state (or the function of the activity or mental state) that is identified with the blame. According to this way of carving things up, we get four categories: cognitive, emotional, conative, and functional accounts of blame.
Cognitive theories of blame share the idea that blame is fundamentally a judgment or evaluation that we make about an agent in light of her attitudes or her actions. One of the earliest cognitive theories of blame is due to J. J. C. Smart (1961), who develops his analysis of blame indirectly, since he begins by distinguishing between praise and dispraise (rather than with the more natural distinction between praise and blame). According to Smart, to praise or dispraise an individual is simply to grade her as a member of a particular kind. And as Smart says, this sort of grading is no different than the sort of grading involved in judging one apple to be better than the others on the grocer's stand. Crucially, Smart notes that though you might dispraise a young philosopher for his poor writing in a letter of recommendation, you are not thereby blaming him for it. Thus for Smart, blame is distinct from dispraise. Unlike dispraise, blame involves more than merely grading someone's actions or character (morally), since blame carries with it the implication that the person is responsible for her action or character. Blame, then, is a negative evaluative judgment that implies responsibility.
In a similar vein, Gary Watson (1996) has suggested that there is an evaluative form of blame connected with what he calls the “aretaic perspective”. To blame someone in this way is to judge that she has failed with respect to some standard of excellence (arête). It is also to insist that the agent is responsible for her action in the sense that the action is attributable to the agent—it represents her evaluative standpoint, her practical identity, what she “stands for” (Watson 1996). And like Smart, Watson recognizes that it is possible to make such a judgment dispassionately. Thus, on the grading and evaluative theories of blame developed by Smart and Watson, there is nothing about blame that requires a blamer to be conatively or emotionally exercised in any way. However, unlike Smart—who identifies blame with a form of grading that implies moral responsibility—Watson does not take aretaic blame to be a general analysis of blame. Rather, for Watson, aretaic blame is but one way among many that we blame others for their actions.
Unsurprisingly, many have resisted thinking of blame as a form of grading. For example, T. M. Scanlon (1986) objects to Smart's overly descriptive characterization of moral grading, which, by Scanlon's lights, fails to account for the characteristic force of blame. For although the force of blame is purportedly tied to the (often painful) normative burdens that one accrues when one is blamed, simply being graded poorly is not in itself such a burden. So blame as grading plus responsibility seems insufficient. Nevertheless, a number of contemporary accounts of blame retain the core idea in Smart's (and Watson's) account that blame is a kind of evaluative judgment. But what sort of evaluative judgment will do? Well, it can't just be any old judgment that describes the whole person as such (as is the case in Smart's grading theory). As a result, many theorists have identified blame with judgments that essentially implicate how our moral or practical selves were involved in the production of action. Only this, one might think, can explain the special force of blame. After all, as Scanlon puts it, “given that most people care about” their moral selves, judgments that implicate these aspects of a person are not, as Scanlon puts it, “mere descriptions” (1986: 170). Thus, for example, Michael Zimmerman (1988) and Ishtiyaque Haji (1998) have argued that to blame someone is to judge that in virtue of their attitudes, actions, or character, they have a stain on their moral self or a black mark in their moral ledger. As Zimmerman puts it, when we blame someone, we judge
that there is a “discredit” or “debit” in his ledger … that his “moral standing” has been “diminished”. (Zimmerman 1988: 38)
One need not endorse the idea of a moral ledger in order to hold a cognitive theory of blame, however. T. M. Scanlon (1986) and Pamela Hieronymi (2004) both articulate cognitive accounts of blame, where the judgment in question is a judgment that someone has shown us (or another) ill will. Since we care deeply about other people's judgments about the quality of our wills, this judgment can also carry the distinctive force of blame. (See also Kekes 2009 for a view of blame that slants toward the cognitive side of things.)
Despite a number of supporters, there are many who are less sanguine about the prospects of a purely cognitive account of blame. One potential problem for cognitive accounts is that they risk conflating blaming with judging blameworthy (Kenner 1967; Coates and Tognazzini 2012). After all, it seems quite possible to judge, for example, that another has displayed ill will in his action or that he has a mark against his moral ledger (and so, judge that he is blameworthy), without actually blaming that individual. The co-conspirator's recognition of the wrongness of his partner's criminal activity might, in fact, underlie his admiration for his partner's skillful execution of a heinous crime that most of us couldn't stomach. The fact that the same judgment could elicit such different responses (repulsion and resentment in those of us who are committed to the values of morality and admiration in those who are not) suggests that the judgment alone cannot constitute blame. More recently, Hanna Pickard (forthcoming) has argued because it is possible to blame others irrationally (i.e., to blame others even when we know that they are not really blameworthy for their actions), the judgment that another is blameworthy, or that she has shown ill will or disregard in her action is not necessary for blame. It looks, then, that judgments of the sort discussed above are neither necessary nor sufficient for blame.
A further problem for cognitive accounts is one suggested by Gary Watson (1987). According to Watson, attempts to identify or reduce blame to its cognitive components (recall that although Watson thinks that aretaic blame takes the form of judgments, it does not exhaust the phenomenon of blaming) make it seem
as though in blaming we were mainly moral clerks, recording moral faults … from a detached and austerely “objective” standpoint. (1987 as reprinted in Watson 2004: 226–27)
But surely blame issues from the perspective of a participant in human relationships, one in which we are not merely observing the moral order but are actively involved in a moral community. These sorts of considerations form the basis for emotional theories of blame.
Despite the fact that P. F. Strawson's “Freedom and Resentment” (1962) contains little sustained discussion of blame as such, many take it to be the contemporary genesis of emotional theories of blame. According to Strawson, our status as morally responsible agents is grounded in the non-detached attitudes and emotions that are (in part) constitutive of ordinary interpersonal relationships. Regarding others as morally responsible agents, for Strawson, is not a matter of judgment but of emotional response. (Of course, according to cognitivist theories of the emotions, emotional states are identified with a suite of judgments (Solomon 1993; Nussbaum 2001). Thus, if the cognitivist theory of emotions were correct, there would be no fundamental differences between cognitive and emotional theories of blame. However, cognitivist theories of the emotions are very controversial, and so we will set this important question aside in order to better understand extant emotional theories.)
R. Jay Wallace (1994) developed this idea into an account of “holding responsible” according to which we hold others morally responsible just in case we experience resentment, indignation, or (in the self-regarding case) guilt as a response to their actions, or judge that such a response would be appropriate. Thus, for Wallace, (a specific subset of) Strawson's “reactive attitudes” are essentially implicated in the stance we take up when we hold others responsible. But though it is possible to take up the stance of “holding responsible” without being emotionally exercised, Wallace stresses (and reiterates this in Wallace 2011) that to actually blame an agent, one must be exercised emotionally.
Of course, Strawson and Wallace are hardly alone in endorsing emotional theories of blame. While these “Strawsonian” accounts of blame focus on the reactive attitudes (particularly resentment, indignation, and guilt), other emotional theories of blame are more inclusive. Susan Wolf (2011), for example, defends an account of blame that emphasizes anger. Macalester Bell (2013a, b) argues for a “hostile attitudes” account of blame that includes the attitude of contempt as a blaming attitude. Consequently, what holds emotional theories of blame together is not widespread agreement over which emotions constitute blame. Rather, it is a shared commitment to thinking that to blame is to respond to others' actions with a negative emotion.
Though it's very plausible that we blame others by responding to their actions with anger, resentment, indignation, or even contempt, there are a number of objections to emotional theories of blame. George Sher (2006) argues that emotional responses are unnecessary for blame. For example, Sher argues that we can blame a loved one without feeling negative emotional reactions. So too, we can blame villains from whom we are temporally distant without any emotional response. The thought here is simply that it is possible to blame Nero for the burning of Rome, even though we do not feel any resentment or indignation towards Nero for his cruelty. In response, defenders of emotional theories might simply argue that despite appearances, without the emotions, one is simply not blaming Nero but instead merely judging blameworthy (see Wallace 1994, 2011). Alternatively, a defender of emotional theories could argue (plausibly, but by no means uncontroversially) that one can be in an emotional state even if one does not experience any felt affect. On this latter point, Elisa A. Hurley and Coleen Macnamara (2010) have argued that on the correct theory of reactive emotions, it is possible to resent or be indignant without experiencing the affective components paradigmatically associated with these emotions.
A second objection to emotional theories of blame might be called the “force objection”. Pamela Hieronymi develops this objection by noting that
an affective accompaniment of a judgment would be a certain unpleasant emotional disturbance … but, the force of blame seems deeper, more serious or weightier. (Hieronymi 2004: 121)
Thus, the normative force of blame must be grounded in the cognitive elements of blaming emotions, since it is these elements that are responsive to and reflect our concern for morality. But if the force of blame is grounded in the cognitive elements of the emotion, then why wouldn't a judgment with the same content constitute an instance of blame? It seems that while emotions might be concomitant with blame, it is the cognitive element—one that can be present even if the blamer is not emotionally exercised—and not the emotion itself that constitutes one's blame.
In response to this sort of objection, Wallace (2011) argues that the reactive emotions are not superfluous add-ons to the judgment, but instead they serve to change the meaning of the judgment, imbuing the judgment with the sort of expressive significance that is characteristic of blame and that would otherwise be lacking from a mere judgment.
Conative theories of blame emphasize motivational elements, like desires and intentions, as essential to blame. Two of the most developed extant theories of blame—those due to George Sher (2006) and T. M. Scanlon (2008, 2013)—fall in this category. And though we will focus on these two theories, other conative theories are possible.
As already mentioned above, George Sher (2006) is skeptical of emotional theories of blame. However, he is also skeptical about accounts of blame that are merely cognitive. There is more to blame than a mere judgment that an agent has acted wrongly, but one need not be emotionally exercised in order to blame. Sher, thus, is looking for a happy medium between these two widely accepted alternatives.
According to Sher, what must be added to judgments of wrongness is a backwards-looking desire “that the person in question not have performed his past bad act” (2006: 112). But it's not enough that the blamer simply wish that the bad action not have happened; the desire must be one that issues from the blamer's general commitment to morality, since what we really want is that the wrongdoer not have “exercised his own decision-making capacities in a certain way”, and that “he have responded, or that he be disposed to respond, to what we consider a compelling moral reason” (2006: 105). Thus, on the resultant view, when the cognitive component of judging blameworthy is accompanied by this desire, which reflects our general commitment to morality, then we are said to be blaming. (See also Arpaly 2006 and Arpaly & Schroeder 2014 for a similar view, according to which blame requires having a conative orientation “against the wrong or bad” (Arpaly & Schroeder 2014: 161).) Moreover, Sher argues that the belief-desire pair in question is itself the basis of those affective and behavioral dispositions that are commonly associated with blame. For example, a blamer's disposition to feel hostile attitudes like anger towards the agent and to also reprimand, rebuke, and seek apology are to be explained by the presence of the belief-desire pair.
Despite the elegance of Sher's view, it has generated a number of critical replies. Pamela Hieronymi (2008) objects to the link between the belief-desire pair and attendant affective and behavioral dispositions. To her mind, the link is too weak; though she accepts Sher's claim that the belief-desire pair is essentially implicated in one's general commitment to morality, she does not think he has adequately shown that the characteristic dispositions are implicated in the same way. After all, “surely our commitment to morality could be affirmed or clarified in ways that do not involve hostile behavior or reproach” (2008: 25). But if this is correct, then it looks like blame's characteristic dispositions need not be present—even in those who are genuinely and sincerely committed to moral norms. As a result, Hieronymi concludes that Sher has failed to show that blame—which must involve such dispositions—is essentially tied to a more general commitment to morality.
A second objection to Sher's view is due to Angela Smith (2008). Smith rejects Sher's claim that only by adding a desire component to the belief that someone has acted wrongly or badly, can we be said to blame someone. To defend this, she invites us to consider an ordinary case of blame, say the blame we feel for a politician who leads us into a disastrous war. While we no doubt desire that the politician hadn't led us into the war because we are generally committed to morality (and we therefore don't enjoy the suffering of innocents), it is not clear how this desire is itself part of our blame. By Smith's lights, the desire component of the belief-desire pair, like the attendant affective and behavioral dispositions, seems to be something that is above and beyond blame itself. In more recent work, Smith has also argued that in some cases, say in “the reactions of a mother whose son is blameworthy for [a] crime” (2013: 35), the relevant belief-desire pair might be present without blame. Other challenges to Sher's theory include the worry that it is too “sanitized” because it compromises psychological realism by “stripping away [blame's] unsavory features” (McGeer 2013: 166).
T. M. Scanlon (2008) has recently developed an account of blame that represents something of a shift from his earlier, more cognitive, account (see Scanlon 1986). In developing this new account, Scanlon's initial motivation is similar to that of Sher, since Scanlon thinks that an adequate account of blame must fit somewhere between a mere judgment that another has acted in some objectionable way and a sanction (of which expressed reactive emotions are but one paradigm case). But unlike Sher, Scanlon does not think that we can avoid these (putatively) unattractive alternatives simply by supplementing the belief that another has acted wrongly or badly with a desire that they did not so act. Indeed, for Scanlon, the belief that another has acted wrongly is not part of blame at all. Instead, the cognitive component of blame is provided by a judgment that another has acted in a way that impairs meaningful interpersonal relations; this is a judgment of blameworthiness. (For Scanlon, blame is a response to the meaning of someone's actions, rather than the permissibility of those actions. For more on this distinction, see the first three chapters of Scanlon 2008.) But this judgment itself is insufficient for blame (for largely the reasons that Sher takes the belief that another has acted wrongly or badly to be insufficient for blame), so in addition to judging that the agent is blameworthy, blame requires you “to take your relationship with him or her to be modified in a way that [a judgment of blameworthiness] holds to be appropriate” (2008: 128–29). In other words, blaming someone involves not just the belief that he has acted in a way that impairs your relationship with him, but also, that you take yourself to have reasons to revise your intentions and attitudes towards him, and accordingly that you revise these intentions and attitudes on the basis of such reasons.
Like Sher, then, Scanlon has provided an initially plausible account of what it is to blame. But also like Sher, his account has been widely criticized. The most common line of criticism is best summed up by R. Jay Wallace's (2011) slogan that Scanlon's account “leaves the blame out of blame”. More precisely, Wallace argues that
blame has a quality of opprobrium that is not captured by the considerations about the normative significance of impaired relationships that are at the center of Scanlon's approach. (2011: 349; see also Mason 2011)
Susan Wolf (2011) has also argued that in some cases, such as the case of a hot-headed but ultimately loving family, it seems that you can blame another without taking yourself to have impairments in your relationship or attendant reasons to revise your intentions or attitudes towards that person. The characteristic features of Scanlon's interpretation of blame, then, seem to be unnecessary. More recently, Sher (2013) has argued that Scanlon's emphasis on relationships is problematic. After all, many cases of wrongdoing involve strangers—e.g., in most car thefts, the victim does not know the criminal. Nevertheless, it still seems that it is possible to blame those with whom we have no standing relationship. So blame cannot essentially implicate interpersonal relationships. Scanlon, in response (2008, 2013), insists that all rational agents stand in the “moral relationship” to one another. However, whether this kind of relationship is sufficient to explain the blame of strangers is unclear. And indeed, as Sher points out, even if there is some relationship between a victim and the stranger who victimizes her, it's not clear that this relationship plays any role at all in grounding her blame.
Functional accounts of blame are analogous to functionalist theories of mental states or properties. Instead of identifying blame with any particular attitude (like a judgment or emotion) or combination of attitudes (like a belief-desire pair), functional accounts of blame identify blame by its functional role. This way of proceeding leaves open the particular attitude or combination of attitudes that constitute blame. In this way, functional accounts can be more flexible.
According to one functional account of blame, the function of blame is protest. In other words, what we're doing when we blame others is protesting their actions or character. But this, of course, means that perhaps any number of attitudes or combination of attitudes could be present in blame. Pamela Hieronymi (2001), Matthew Talbert (2012), and Victoria McGeer (2013) argue that reactive attitudes like resentment (and the expressions of these attitudes) serve as powerful forms of protest. Angela Smith (2013), on the other hand, argues that when we modify our attitudes and intentions as Scanlon envisions, but do so as a form of protest, then we are actually blaming. In other words, for Smith, it's not enough that we modify our attitudes and intentions; the modification in question must serve a particular function, namely that of protest, to count as an instance of blame. And in order to count as a protest, it need not involve any particular emotional state. (See Franklin 2013 and Houston 1992 for more on the way in which blame allows us to stand up for our values.)
Of course, there might be other functions of blame: to express or communicate condemnation or disapproval, for example. Michael McKenna (2012, 2013) has argued for such an account. In fact, he has claimed that blame is conversational, and thus functions to continue a conversation started by the blamee's wrongful action. In particular, McKenna claims that the reactive attitudes and their expressions serve this function. Antony Duff has proposed a similar understanding of the aim of blame, according to which it is
an attempt to communicate to the wrong-doer a moral understanding of his wrong-doing; to bring him to recognise his guilt and repent what he has done. (1986: 70)
(See also Macnamara 2011 on the communicative nature of holding responsible more generally.) In a similar vein, Christopher Bennett (2013) has argued that blame functions symbolically to express our disapproval. Like Smith, he develops this account by supplementing Scanlon's theory of blame, but it seems that one could adapt Bennett's expressive apparatus even outside of a Scanlonian framework.
Because of their relative newness to the scene, there is not much criticism of these views. But there are at least two sources of concern for those theories that take protest to be the function of blame. First, it's not clear that protest is independent of blame, such that one could specify what it is to protest without appealing to blaming attitudes. But if this is so, it's not clear that appealing to the notion of protest will help us clarify the nature of blame. Second, protest seems paradigmatically expressed. Indeed, it's hard to make sense of unexpressed protest. Do workers protest unfair labor conditions simply through their beliefs or attitudes? Or must they make such beliefs and attitudes known? And if it is the latter, then it's not clear that protest could be the function of blame. After all, not all blame is expressed.
How this question gets answered will depend on four variables: (i) the person who is being blamed, (ii) the person who is blaming, (iii) the nature of the blaming interaction, and (iv) the precise sense of “appropriate” at issue. A better way to put the question, then, is perhaps to ask when it is appropriate for X to blame Y, keeping in mind that emphasizing different aspects of this relationship will produce a different contrast, and hence a different question. (Also keep in mind, of course, that X and Y might be one and the same person.) Moreover, it's important to recognize the connections between the questions of what blame is and when blame is appropriate, since the propriety conditions of a judgment are plausibly thought to be distinct from the propriety conditions of overt forms of blame like rebuke. Consequently, because we are not here endorsing a particular theory of blame, our characterization of the norms in question will operate at a level of abstraction that floats free of substantive commitments concerning the nature of blame.
Begin by considering potentially relevant facts about the person who is being blamed. A natural answer to the question of when blame is appropriate is to say that blame is only appropriate when the person blamed is in fact blameworthy. This may sound at first like an unhelpful tautology—after all, what could it mean to be worthy of blame if not simply that you can be appropriately blamed?—but the emphasis on worthiness is meant to draw attention to the fact that it's only appropriate to blame a person when she has earned it or deserves it. That is, only when certain facts about her are in place. Which facts? What does one have to do to earn blame?
Being to blame (i.e., causally responsible; see Beardsley 1969 and Kenner 1967) is not sufficient for being blameworthy because often, the best or most salient casual explanation doesn't even involve a moral agent at all. Earthquakes and mosquitoes can be to blame for various negative outcomes, but neither can be blameworthy because neither can, as Gary Watson puts it, “act effectively and competently in moral matters” (2013a: 3322). Only certain creatures are even candidates for blame in the first place, and though it is a matter of some controversy which precise capacities are required, the list certainly includes the capacities for reflection, deliberation, decision-making, and self-determination. But earthquakes and mosquitoes are the easy cases; the harder cases are children and psychopaths, individuals who haven't (or haven't yet) developed an understanding of or an appreciation for moral norms. These individuals, it seems, can still act in morally significant ways—indeed, in ways we would naturally describe as cruel and even evil—but whether they can earn moral blame (as opposed merely to giving us good reason to protect ourselves from them) is a vexed question (see Watson 2011 for insightful discussion). But regardless of how one answers that question, it is widely accepted that potentially blameworthy agents must be capable of reflecting upon, reasoning about, and executing a decision about how to behave. If someone lacks these capacities, he is exempted from blame.
In addition to having the general capacity for practical reasoning, however, it is often thought that an individual is appropriately blamed only if he has (and, on the occasion, exercises) free will. The excuse “I couldn't help it” or “I was forced to do it” is often enough to render blame inappropriate, so it's a natural thought that someone can only be blamed for those things that he could have helped, or wasn't forced into—in other words, for those things that he chose of his own free will. (Of course, this is primarily a condition applied to actions for which one is thought to be blameworthy. Taking seriously the possibility that we can be blameworthy for our attitudes as well might naturally lead one to downplay the importance of free will. See, for example, Smith 2005.) Typically, free will is thought of as a sort of control: as the ability to control (by selecting) which of two possible futures obtains, for example, or as the ability to control (by guiding) one's actions in light of one's considered judgments about what one ought to do. (See van Inwagen 1983; Fischer 1994; Watson 2003.) And of course it's a difficult question whether control of the right sort is compatible with determinism; hence it's a difficult question whether blame would ever be appropriate in a deterministic world. There are less sweeping threats to freedom, however. We are all vulnerable to coercion, manipulation, situational pressures, and varying degrees of temptation or compulsion, and the extent to which these factors rob us of our freedom is the extent to which we may be excused (though not exempted) from blame.
If you add the capacity for practical reasoning to the right sort of capacities for control (which will likely include not just volitional capacities but cognitive capacities, too), you end up with a morally responsible agent—that is to say, an individual who has the capacities that render her a sensible target of blame (see Fischer & Ravizza 1998). If she exercises those capacities in order to bring about some negative outcome, then she is morally responsible for that action—that is to say, she is a sensible target of blame for that action (she is neither exempted nor excused from our blaming practices).
There are further subtleties here, but they are inessential to the main point, which is simply that most theorists think that it is appropriate for X to blame Y only if Y has certain capacities for control, practical reasoning, moral understanding, etc., and exercised them on the occasion in question. (One of the subtleties is that even if an agent satisfies all the relevant control conditions, she may still fail to be responsible if she fails to meet an independent epistemic condition. Non-culpable ignorance of the consequences of one's actions seems to excuse as much as lack of control. See Ginet 2000 and Mele 2011.) Likewise, most theorists think that if Y has and exercises these capacities, then Y is blameworthy—that is, Y has earned blame. But this is all compatible with saying that blame is nevertheless all-things-considered inappropriate. To see why, let's turn now to facts about the person who is blaming.
Even if some agent is blameworthy, it's not the case (or, at least, not always the case) that everyone can blame him. As Roger Wertheimer notes,
some matters—like other folks' intimate intrafamilial relations—may be none of your business, not your affair, no (proper) concern of yours, so, whatever your evidence and emotions, it is not your place to bear ill will. (1998: 499)
G. A. Cohen (2006: 118) echoes the sentiment from a different perspective:
[Moral] admonition may be sound, and in place, but some may be poorly placed to offer it. When a person replies to a critic by saying: “Where do you get off criticizing me for that?”, she is not denying (or, of course, affirming) the inherent soundness of the critic's criticism. She is denying her critic's right to make that criticism, in a posture of judgment.
The general idea here is that there may be facts about the person who is blaming that undermine her standing to blame. It's not her place, she isn't well positioned, she doesn't have the authority, and so on. (Marilyn Friedman (2013: 272) puts the point nicely by saying that not everyone is blamerworthy.) But there are several different ways in which one's standing might be undermined.
At least sometimes, we blame others with the aim of getting them to see the error of their ways and change their behavior in the future. One sure way to fail at this is to be guilty of the very same (or a relevantly similar) transgression as the one you are condemning. The hypocritical blamer is perhaps the paradigm example of someone who lacks the moral standing to blame. And it's not just that hypocritical blame won't be effective—though that's also true (see Dworkin 2000)—it's that it seems positively inappropriate (and would remain so even if it were effective). Even the genuinely blameworthy agent, it seems, can respond to the hypocritical blamer by saying, “Look who's talking”, and this retort has a “silencing” effect (see Cohen 2012).
But what precisely is the problem with hypocritical blame? The answer to this question will likely depend on the nature of blame. R. Jay Wallace, for example, who advocates a Strawsonian account of blame, explains the problem with hypocrisy by an appeal to the underlying commitments of the reactive attitudes. For Wallace (2011: 326), “blame carries with it a kind of practical commitment to critical self-scrutiny”, a commitment that the hypocritical blamer fails to live up to. Given that “we all have an interest in being protected from the kind of social disapproval and opprobrium that are involved in blame”, the hypocritical blamer—as long as he isn't also blaming himself, in which case he might not count as hypocritical—treats his own interest in avoiding blame as more important than the interest of the target of his blame. As Wallace puts it (2011: 328): “This offends against a presumption in favor of the equal standing of persons that I take to be fundamental to moral thought”. Thus, for Wallace, the problem with hypocritical blame is that it is morally wrong (and thus inappropriate even if the target is blameworthy).
For T. M. Scanlon, on the other hand, who takes blame to be an adjustment of attitudes in response to an impaired relationship, the problem with hypocritical blame is that it distorts the facts. The adjustment of attitudes and expectations that constitutes blame purports to be a response to some way in which the person blamed has impaired his or her relationship with the blamer. But, as Scanlon says (2008: 177),
There is something false in [the hypocritical blamer's] suggesting that it is [the blamee's] unwillingness to act in ways that indicate untrustworthiness that impairs [their] moral relationship.
Rather, according to Scanlon, the past attitudes and actions of the hypocritical blamer already impaired the relevant relationship. Thus, for Scanlon, we might say that the problem with hypocritical blame is that it is unfitting (or untrue to the facts).
Other accounts of the way in which hypocritical blame is inappropriate are, of course, possible. G. A. Cohen (2006), for example, seems to favor an account that considers blame as a speech-act, and hypocrisy is then one way in which the illocutionary force of the speech-act can be compromised. One might also take a page from Stephen Darwall (2006), and maintain that in blaming, we are attempting to give the blamee a distinctively second-personal reason to apologize and/or change her behavior, and that hypocritical blame fails to communicate this distinctive reason. (See also Radzik 2011.)
Work on this topic is still very much in its infancy, and there are many more questions in need of exploration. (See Szabados and Soifer 2004 for a book length treatment of the ethics of hypocrisy.) For example, need someone be guilty of the very same transgression in order to be a hypocrite in the relevant sense? And how can an erstwhile hypocrite regain his lost standing? Is it sufficient that the blamer who is guilty of a similar transgression feels guilty about his own transgression and resolve to do better in the future? But even in that case, isn't there still something inappropriate or otherwise untoward about the blame?
To charge someone with blaming hypocritically is to allege that he is blaming (or, at least, pretending to blame) in response to transgressions similar to those (or perhaps type-identical to those) that he himself has committed in the past. A somewhat related charge, but worth distinguishing, is the claim that the blamer is somehow objectionably involved in the very act that he is, at this very moment, condemning. This is to charge the blamer with complicity, and such a charge might take many forms. G. A. Cohen (2006: 126) gives a nice sample: “you ordered me to do it, you asked me to do it, you forced me to do it, you left me with no reasonable alternative, you gave me the means to do it”. The superior officer who orders a subordinate to do something morally reprehensible is not in a position to blame the subordinate for carrying out the order, even if civilians are. And this is not necessarily because the superior officer has himself done similar things in the past (perhaps he hasn't), but instead because he is too closely involved in the very act he purports to condemn.
Of course, there are complications here, as well. For example, we can distinguish between permissible involvement in someone else's transgression and impermissible involvement in someone else's transgression, and we can ask whether both or only one of these ways of being involved undermines one's standing to blame. Patrick Todd (2012) argues that only impermissible involvement undermines one's standing to blame, and to illustrate his point he imagines two Nazi commanders, one of whom is committed to the Nazi cause and the other of whom is using his position of power as an attempt to undermine the regime. If, in order to keep up appearances, the latter commander issues an order for a subordinate to perform an action that is morally impermissible, does he lose his standing to blame the subordinate? Todd claims that he doesn't, and thus that there is an important distinction between complicity that undermines standing and complicity that doesn't.
Even if a blamer isn't a hypocrite and isn't involved in the action she is condemning, her blame can nevertheless be inappropriate if the wrong in question is just none of her business. Linda Radzik (2011: 582) gives a nice description of our common moral attitudes toward these situations:
For example, a group of co-workers will often insist that the romantic infidelity of one of their members is none of their business (and then feel a bit ashamed when they continue to gossip about it). Neighbors and teachers hesitate to interfere with a parent's treatment of her child although they judge the treatment to be wrongful, unless the wrong reaches a certain level of severity. Even within close relationships, we are sometimes uncertain whether we should express our negative moral judgment of a friend's behavior. True, the hesitancy to sanction in these cases is sometimes based on laziness, self-interest, cowardice or uncertainty about the moral judgments at issue, none of which contradict the claim that we have the standing to sanction. But, at other times, our hesitancy seems to be based on the sense that it would be wrong to sanction. We say, “It isn't my place to interfere even though I can see what she is doing is wrong”. We do not feel entitled to sanction every wrongdoer for every wrong.
And the thought, of course, is that we do not feel entitled to sanction every wrongdoer for every wrong because we aren't so entitled. Radzik describes three situations in which only a limited group of individuals have the standing to blame: (1) cases where an agent wrongs herself, (2) cases where the wrong is “committed within special relationships, such as romantic partnerships, familial bonds, and friendships” (2011: 593), and (3) cases where third-party blame “would interfere with the victim's ability to find vindication in the aftermath of wrongdoing” (2011: 597).
It's a good question exactly why the standing to blame would be restricted only to certain individuals in these sorts of case. Perhaps there are norms of privacy at play (Smith 2007; Nagel 1998), or perhaps there's an illuminating analogy to be made here with the notion of standing in the law (Sabini and Silver 1982), or perhaps if we see blame as a response which presupposes that the person blamed is in some way accountable to the members of her moral community, then we can distinguish between several (overlapping) moral communities, only some of which any one person belongs to, and thus only some of which underwrite one's standing to blame (Duff 2010: 126). If we adopt Scanlon's recent account of blame (2008), then perhaps we can say that some wrongs are none of our business because they don't impair any of our relationships, and hence don't render appropriate any blame-constituting modifications in those relationships.
Moral luck (in all its forms) provides another perspective from which to see how the standing to blame might be undermined. Consider Gary Watson's (1987) influential discussion of Robert Harris, who is at once an unequivocally cruel murderer and also, in a real sense, a victim of his tragic formative circumstances. It's a legitimate question, given his history, whether Harris is even the sort of creature who is a sensible target of blame—that is, whether Harris is even a morally responsible agent in the first place—but even if we grant that he is, there's another potential obstacle to blame at work here. Watson expresses it like this (2004: 245):
The fact that Harris's cruelty is an intelligible response to his circumstances gives a foothold not only for sympathy, but for the thought that if I had been subjected to such circumstances, I might well have become as vile. What is unsettling is the thought that one's moral self is such a fragile thing. One tends to think of one's moral sensibilities as going deeper than that (though it is not clear what this means). This thought induces not only an ontological shudder, but a sense of equality with the other: I too am a potential sinner.
The obstacle to blame that Watson is describing here is not the thought that Harris might not be blameworthy (though he might not be), but rather the thought expressed well by the common thought that “There but for the grace of God go I”. It's a humbling perspective to take on one's agency, and one that may “taint one's own view of one's moral self as an achievement” (2004: 246), and make one feel that “indignation on one's part would be self-righteous and indulgent” (2004: 254). For want of a better term, we might say that this is a worry about subjunctive hypocrisy, since it certainly has a similar flavor to the hypocrisy worry discussed above. The thought is something like this: “If I were as bad as him, I'd have no standing to blame him. But the difference between us is simply a matter of luck, and surely my good moral luck can't serve as the basis for my moral standing to blame. So I lack the standing to blame even though I've never done the terrible things in question.”
When X has the moral standing to blame Y, we might say that Y is within X's blaming jurisdiction (Coates & Tognazzini 2012). But even if Y is within X's jurisdiction, it may still be inappropriate for X to blame Y due to a number of other factors specific to the way in which X goes about blaming Y. If we think of blame as a “move” made through moral space, or as a contribution to a moral conversation (see McKenna 2012), then questions of standing address whether X is even playing the right game, or whether X even has a voice with which to speak. But there are still norms governing which moves X can make or what X can say. Call these procedural norms.
Analogous to the common thought that the punishment must fit the crime, it seems plausible to suppose that the blame must, in some sense, fit the transgression. Perhaps it's legitimate to be annoyed at your friend for forgetting your birthday one year, but you can't (at least in the absence of some special context) vow never to speak to him again as a result of that one lapse. What will count as an appropriately proportional blaming response to a transgression will no doubt vary with different relationships and different transgressions, but there will likely always be some responses that take the transgression too seriously, and some that don't take it seriously enough.
What counts as a proportional blaming response won't depend just on the nature of the transgression, though; it will likely also depend on the way the wrongdoer has responded to his own transgression. As Angela Smith (2007: 482) puts it:
If someone has an objectionable attitude toward me, for example, but is already reproaching herself for it and making efforts to change, then I may judge that I have no reason to adopt or express any blaming attitudes toward her at all. Her own self-reproach shows me that she already recognizes that I have moral standing and deserve better treatment, and therefore I may no longer see her attitude as posing a challenge to me or my status. In cases of this sort, the faulty attitude is still attributable to the agent and she is open to legitimate moral criticism for it; but the agent is already responding appropriately to this fact and therefore there may be no grounds for further criticism on the part of others.
A judgment about what counts as a proportional blaming response must also be tempered by facts about what temptations or circumstances we can reasonably expect human beings to resist. (The “expect” here is normative rather than predictive; see Wallace 1994). Erin Kelly makes this point well (2013: 258):
Our sense that a particular person is unfairly burdened by contingencies the rest of us rarely encounter triggers a judgment that compassion is appropriate and that the circumstances that call for our compassion temper a person's worthiness of blame.
Kelly puts the point in terms of blameworthiness, but in our terminology she is saying that even if a person has exercised his or her capacities of moral reasoning to do something wrong (and thus even if the person is blameworthy, in our sense), it may nevertheless be inappropriate to blame them if the transgression in question was a natural consequence of circumstances that would push anyone to the breaking point. Perhaps this last point is similar to the worry about subjunctive hypocrisy (see section 2.2.4). If it is, then it serves as a nice reminder that any proposed taxonomy is going to involve categories that blur and overlap, at least to some degree.
Imaginary philosophical examples are always told by an omniscient narrator, but of course real-life cases of blame are never like that, and we have to rely on our fallible judgments about the obscure motivations of other human beings. Sometimes we are confident that someone has done wrong; other times we let our anger hamper our imagination and our generosity in searching for possible excuses for apparent wrongdoing. Having too quick a temper is itself something for which one can be open to criticism, and what makes a temper count as too quick is often that it outstrips the evidence for wrongdoing. The realm of interpersonal blame is not perfectly analogous to the realm of legal responsibility, of course, so “beyond a reasonable doubt” may be too demanding a requirement, but nevertheless there is some epistemic standard that must be met before blame is appropriate, even if the potential target of blame is in fact blameworthy and inside of the potential blamer's jurisdiction.
In fact, Gideon Rosen (2004) has used epistemic considerations to argue for a general sort of skepticism about moral responsibility:
What must you think in order to judge that Bill, for example, is responsible for lying to his wife? You must think that at the time of action, either he knew that he had decisive reason not to lie, or if he did not know this, that his ignorance was the upshot of some prior bad action done in full knowledge of every pertinent fact or norm. You must think, in other words, that his bad action either is, or derives from, an episode of genuine, full-strength akrasia.
I suggest that given the opacity of the mind—of other minds and even of one's own mind—it is almost always unreasonable to place significant confidence in such a judgment.
Rosen's skepticism here relies on arguments presented earlier in the article for the conclusion that the epistemic requirements on moral responsibility are quite stringent (in order for ignorance to be culpable, it must eventually trace back to clear-eyed akratic action; see also Levy 2011), but for our purposes the important point is simply that “the opacity of mind”, as Rosen puts it, can make it hard to tell when someone is genuinely blameworthy, and thus can render unjustified the judgment of wrongdoing on which appropriate blame rests. Of course, one need not accept Rosen's skeptical conclusion to agree that blamers must not jump to conclusions about wrongdoing.
The ambiguity of the word “appropriate” is useful if one is simply trying to enumerate all the possible ways that blaming can go wrong, but a full understanding of the ethics of blame will require more precision. Moreover, digging into the normative details will help to ensure that theorists aren't talking past each other when they discuss the “appropriateness”, “legitimacy”, “justice”, “fittingness”, or “rationality” of blame.
Take the case of hypocritical blame, for example: there is widespread agreement that hypocritical blame is inappropriate (though see Bell 2013a for a dissenting view). R. Jay Wallace (2011) takes this to mean that hypocritical blame is morally objectionable, and thus his investigation leads him to identify the moral principle that the hypocritical blamer flouts. But it is clear that G. A. Cohen, on the other hand, is interested in a different sense of appropriateness altogether (2006: 119–120, n. 10):
My topic is not when it's morally permissible or obligatory to condemn, and it is not part of my view that it is always bad or wrong for someone who is not in a position to condemn to condemn…I think one can say: “He has no right to condemn, but let us hope he does condemn”, and maybe even “but he ought to do so …”.
Cohen frames his investigation more in terms of when someone has the “right” to blame, and he thinks that someone might lack that right even while that person is morally obligated to act as though he does.
T. M. Scanlon, too, seems to be interested in a non-moral sense of appropriateness. As described above, his way of explaining how hypocrisy undermines standing is to say that hypocritical blame is unfitting, not true to the facts as blame represents them. It may be that unfitting blame is also morally inappropriate, of course, but if so that would require an argument. (On the distance between fitting and appropriate, see D'Arms & Jacobson 2000.)
There are many other senses in which an instance of blame might be inappropriate: perhaps it fails to motivate its target, or perhaps it fails to communicate a second-personal reason, or perhaps it displays a vice. Gary Watson (2013b), for example, has offered an analysis of the vice of judgmentalism, which he understands as either of two related faults: (1) lacking interpretive generosity or (2) being too unaccepting of the faults of others. Of course, it's controversial whether blame is (merely) a judgment, but in any case it is clear that certain responses to wrongdoing (perhaps blame is among them) can be vicious even if they don't violate the principles of interpersonal morality. (Pettigrove 2012 contains a similar discussion, but about the alleged virtue of meekness.)
Because the nature of blame is controversial, we have tended in this section simply to use the word “blame”, but it's important to remember that one's views about the ethics of blame will very much depend on what one takes blame to be. For instance, although hypocritical moral address (to use Wallace's term) seems clearly to undermine standing, it is less clear whether merely harboring a hypocritical blaming judgment is likewise inappropriate, or inappropriate in quite the same way. In general, the difference between expressed and unexpressed blame seems likely to be an important distinction to keep in mind when theorizing about the ways in which blame can go wrong.
Moreover, blame seems to be just one among many ways that we respond to wrongdoing, and it's still an open question just how blame relates to activities like holding responsible, demanding answers, punishing, and so on. (For some attempted taxonomies, see Macnamara 2011; Shoemaker 2011; Smith 2012; Tognazzini forthcoming.) So, answers to the above questions about the ethics of blame will not automatically double as answers to analogous questions about the ethics of these other ways of interacting.
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Our sincere thanks to John Martin Fischer, Coleen Macnamara, Angela Smith, and Gary Watson for all of their help thinking about moral responsibility and blame over the past several years, and to the American Council of Learned Societies and The College of William & Mary for financial assistance during the research for this entry.