Moral Responsibility

First published Wed Oct 16, 2019

Making judgments about whether a person is morally responsible for her behavior, and holding others and ourselves responsible for actions and the consequences of actions, is a fundamental and familiar part of our moral practices and our interpersonal relationships.

The judgment that a person is morally responsible for her behavior involves—at least to a first approximation—attributing certain powers and capacities to that person, and viewing her behavior as arising (in the right way) from the fact that the person has, and has exercised, these powers and capacities. Whatever the correct account of the powers and capacities at issue (and canvassing different accounts is the task of this entry), their possession qualifies an agent as morally responsible in a general sense: that is, as one who may be morally responsible for particular exercises of agency. Normal adult human beings may possess the powers and capacities in question, and non-human animals, very young children, and those suffering from severe developmental disabilities or dementia (to give a few examples) are generally taken to lack them.

To hold someone responsible involves—again, to a first approximation—responding to that person in ways that are made appropriate by the judgment that she is morally responsible. These responses often constitute instances of moral praise or moral blame (though there may be reason to allow for morally responsible behavior that is neither praiseworthy nor blameworthy: see McKenna 2012: 16–17 and M. Zimmerman 1988: 61–62). Blame is a response that may follow on the judgment that a person is morally responsible for behavior that is wrong or bad, and praise is a response that may follow on the judgment that a person is morally responsible for behavior that is right or good.

It should be noted at the outset that the above schema, while useful, may be misleading in certain respects. For one thing, it suggests a correspondence and symmetry between praise and blame that may not exist. The two are certainly asymmetrical insofar as the attention given to blame far exceeds that given to praise. One reason for this is that blameworthiness, unlike praiseworthiness, is often taken to involve liability to a sanction. Thus, articulating the conditions of blameworthiness may seem to theorists the more pressing matter. Perhaps for related reasons, there is a richer language for expressing blame than praise (Watson 1996 [2004: 283]), and “blame” finds its way into idioms for which there is no ready parallel employing “praise”: compare “S is to blame for x” and “S is to praise for x”. Note, as well, that “holding responsible” is itself not a neutral expression: it typically arises in blaming contexts (Watson 1996 [2004: 284]). Additionally, there may be asymmetries in the contexts in which praise and blame are appropriate: private blame is a more familiar phenomenon than private praise (Coates & Tognazzini 2013a), and while minor wrongs may reasonably earn blame, minimally decent behavior often seems insufficient for praise (see Eshleman 2014 for this and other differences between praise and blame). Finally, the widespread assumption that praiseworthiness and blameworthiness are at least symmetrical in terms of the capacities they require has also been questioned (Nelkin 2008, 2011; Wolf 1980, 1990). Like most work on moral responsibility, this entry will tend to focus on the negative side of the phenomenon; for more, see the entry on blame.

A few other general observations about the concept of moral responsibility are in order before introducing particular conceptions of it. In everyday speech, one often hears references to people’s “moral responsibility” where the point is to indicate that a person has some duty or obligation—some responsibility—to which that person is required, by some standard, to attend. In this sense, we say, for example, that a lawyer has a responsibility (to behave in certain ways, according to certain standards) to his client. This entry, however, is concerned not with accounts that specify people’s responsibilities in the sense of duties and obligations, but rather with accounts of whether a person bears the right relation to her own actions, and their consequences, so as to be properly held accountable for them. (Unfortunately, this entry does not include discussion of some important topics related to moral responsibility, such as responsibility for omissions (see Clarke 2014, Fischer & Ravizza 1998, and Nelkin & Rickless 2017a) or collective responsibility (see the entry on collective responsibility and Volumes 30 and 38 of Midwest Studies in Philosophy).

Moral responsibility should also be distinguished from causal responsibility. Causation is a complicated topic, but it is often fairly clear that a person is causally responsible for—that is, she is the (or a) salient cause of—some occurrence or outcome. However, the powers and capacities that are required for moral responsibility are not identical with an agent’s causal powers, so we cannot infer moral responsibility from an assignment of causal responsibility. Young children, for example, can cause outcomes while failing to fulfill the requirements for general moral responsibility, in which case it will not be appropriate to judge them morally responsible for, or to hold them morally responsible for, the outcomes for which they may be causally responsible. And even generally morally responsible agents may explain or defend their behavior in ways that call into question their moral responsibility for outcomes for which they are causally responsible. Suppose that S causes an explosion by flipping a switch: the fact that S had no reason to expect such a consequence from flipping the switch might call into question his moral responsibility (or at least his blameworthiness) for the explosion without altering his causal contribution to it. Having distinguished different senses of responsibility, unless otherwise indicated, “responsibility” will refer to “moral responsibility” (in the sense defined here) throughout the rest of this entry.

Until fairly recently, the bulk of philosophical work on moral responsibility was conducted in the context of debates about free will, which largely concerned the various ways that (various sorts of) determinism might threaten free will and moral responsibility. A largely unquestioned assumption was that free will is required for moral responsibility, and the central questions had to do with the ingredients of free will and with whether their possession was compatible with determinism. Recently, however, the literature on moral responsibility has addressed issues that are of interest independently of worries about determinism. Much of this entry will deal with these latter aspects of the moral responsibility debate. However, it will be useful to begin with issues at the intersection of concerns about free will and moral responsibility.

1. Freedom, Responsibility, and Determinism

How is the responsible agent related to her actions; what power does she exercise over them? One (partial) answer is that the relevant power is a form of control, and, in particular, a form of control such that the agent could have done otherwise than to perform the action in question. This captures one commonsense notion of free will, and one of the central issues in debates about free will has been about whether possession of it (free will, in the ability-to-do-otherwise sense) is compatible with causal determinism (or with, for example, divine foreknowledge—see the entry on foreknowledge and free will).

If causal determinism is true, then the occurrence of any event (including events involving human deliberation, choice, and action) that does in fact occur was made inevitable by—because it was causally necessitated by—the facts about the past (and the laws of nature) prior to the occurrence of the event. Under these conditions, the facts about the present, and about the future, are uniquely fixed by the facts about the past (and about the laws of nature): given these earlier facts, the present and the future can unfold in only one way. For more, see the entry on causal determinism.

If possession of free will requires an ability to act otherwise than one in fact does, then it is fairly easy to see why free will has often been regarded as incompatible with causal determinism. One way of getting at this incompatibilist worry is to focus on the way in which performance of a given action should be up to an agent if he has the sort of free will required for moral responsibility. As the influential Consequence Argument has it (Ginet 1966; van Inwagen 1983: 55–105; Wiggins 1973), the truth of determinism seems to entail that an agent’s actions are not up to him since they are the unavoidable consequences of things over which the agent lacks control. Here is an informal summary of this argument from Peter van Inwagen’s important book, An Essay on Free Will (1983):

If determinism is true, then our acts are the consequences of the laws of nature and events in the remote past. But it is not up to us what went on before we were born, and neither is it up to us what the laws of nature are. Therefore, the consequences of these things (including our present acts) are not up to us. (1983: 16)

For an important argument that suggests that the Consequence Argument conflates different senses in which the laws of nature are not up to us, see David Lewis (1981). For more on incompatibilism and incompatibilist arguments, see the entries on free will, arguments for incompatibilism, and incompatibilist (nondeterministic) theories of free will, as well as Randolph Clarke (2003).

Compatibilists maintain that free will (and/or moral responsibility) is possible even in a deterministic universe. Versions of compatibilism have been defended since ancient times. For example, the Stoics—Chryssipus, in particular—argued that the truth of determinism does not entail that human actions are entirely explained by factors external to agents; thus, human actions are not necessarily explained in a way that is incompatible with praise and blame (see Bobzien 1998 and Salles 2005 for Stoic views on freedom and determinism). Similarly, philosophers in the Modern period (such as Hobbes and Hume) distinguished the general way in which our actions are necessitated if determinism is true from the specific instances of necessity sometimes imposed on us by everyday constraints on our behavior (e.g., physical impediments that make it impossible to act as we choose). The difference is that the necessity involved in determinism is compatible with agents acting as they choose to act: even if S’s behavior is causally determined, it may be behavior that she chooses to perform. And perhaps the ability that matters for free will (and responsibility) is just the ability to act as one chooses, which seems to require only the absence of external constraints (and not the absence of determinism).

This compatibilist tradition was carried into the twentieth century by logical positivists such A. J. Ayer (1954) and Moritz Schlick (1930 [1966]). Here is how Schlick expressed the central compatibilist insight in 1930 (drawing, in particular, on Hume):

Freedom means the opposite of compulsion; a man is free if he does not act under compulsion, and he is compelled or unfree when he is hindered from without…when he is locked up, or chained, or when someone forces him at the point of a gun to do what otherwise he would not do. (1930 [1966: 59])

Since deterministic causal pressures do not always force one to “do what otherwise he would not do”, freedom—at least of the sort specified by Schlick—is compatible with determinism.

A closely related compatibilist strategy, influential in the early and mid-twentieth century, was to offer a conditional analysis of the ability to do otherwise (Ayer 1954, Hobart 1934, Moore 1912; for earlier expressions, see Hobbes 1654 and Hume 1748). As just noted, even if determinism is true, agents may often act as they choose, and it is equally compatible with determinism that an agent who performed act A (on the basis of his choice to do so) might have performed a different action on the condition that (contrary to what actually happened) she had chosen to perform the other action. Even if a person’s actual behavior is causally determined by the actual past, it may be that if the past had been suitably different (e.g., if the person’s desires, intentions, choices, etc. had been different), then she would have acted differently. And perhaps this is all that the ability to do otherwise comes to: one can do otherwise if it is true that if one had chosen to do otherwise, then one would have done otherwise.

However, this compatibilist picture is open to serious objections. First, it might be granted that an ability to act as one sees fit is valuable, and perhaps related to the type of freedom at issue in the free will debate, but it does not follow that this is all that possession of free will comes to. A person who has certain desires as a result of indoctrination, brainwashing, or psychopathology may act as he chooses, but his free will and moral responsibility may still be called into question. (For more on the relevance of such factors, see §3.2 and §3.3.3.) More specifically, the conditional analysis is open to the following sort of counterexample. It might be true that an agent who performs act A would have omitted A if she had so chosen, but it might also be true that the agent in question suffers from an overwhelming compulsion to perform act A. The conditional analysis suggests that the agent in question retains the ability to do otherwise than A, but, given her compulsion, it seems clear that she lacks this ability (Broad 1934, Chisholm 1964, Lehrer 1968, van Inwagen 1983). More generally, incompatibilists are likely to be dissatisfied with the conditional analysis since it fails to give an account of an ability that agents can have, right here and right now, to either perform or omit an action while holding everything about the here and now, and about the past, fixed.

Despite the above objections, the compatibilist project described so far has had significant lasting influence. As will be seen below, the fact that determined agents can act as they see fit is still an important inspiration for compatibilists, as is the fact that determined agents may have acted differently in counterfactual circumstances. For more, see the entry on compatibilism. For recent accounts related to (and improving upon) early compatibilist approaches, see Michael Fara (2008), Michael Smith (2003), and Kadri Vihvelin (2004), and for criticism of these accounts, see Randolph Clarke (2009).

Another influential trend in compatibilism has been to argue that moral responsibility does not require an ability to do otherwise. If this is right, then determinism would not threaten responsibility by ruling out access to behavioral alternatives (though determinism might threaten responsibility in other ways: see van Inwagen 1983: 182–88 and Fischer & Ravizza 1998: 151–168). In a very influential 1969 paper, Harry Frankfurt offers examples meant to show that an agent can be morally responsible for an action even if he could not have done otherwise. Versions of these examples are often called Frankfurt cases or Frankfurt examples. In the basic form of the example, an agent, Jones, considers a certain action. Another agent, Black, would like to see Jones perform this action and, if necessary, Black can make Jones perform it through some type of intervention in Jones’s deliberative process. However, as things transpire, Black does not intervene in Jones’s decision making since he can see that Jones will perform the action on his own and for his own reasons. Black does not intervene to ensure Jones’s action, but he could have, and he would have, had Jones showed some sign that he would not perform the action on his own. Therefore, Jones could not have done otherwise, yet he seems responsible for his behavior. After all, given Black’s non-intervention, Jones’s action is a perfectly ordinary bit of voluntary behavior.

There are questions about whether Frankfurt’s example really shows that Jones is morally responsible even though he couldn’t have done otherwise. For one thing, it may not be clear that Jones really couldn’t have done otherwise: while he performed the action on his own, there was the alternative that he perform the action due to some intervention on Black’s part, and not on his own. Furthermore, though he did not do so, Jones might have given Black some indication that he would not perform the action in question. Alternatively, an objection might be framed by asking how Black could be certain that Jones would or would not perform the action on his own. There seems to be a dilemma here. Perhaps determinism obtains in the universe of the example, and Black sees some sign that indicates the presence of factors that causally ensure that Jones will behave in a particular way. But in this case, incompatibilists are unlikely to grant that Jones is morally responsible if they think that moral responsibility is incompatible with determinism. On the other hand, perhaps determinism is not true in the universe of the example, but then it is not clear that the example excludes alternatives for Jones: if Jones’s behavior isn’t causally determined, then perhaps he can do otherwise. For objections to Frankfurt’s original example along these lines, see Carl Ginet (1996) and David Widerker (1995); for defenses of Frankfurt, see John M. Fischer (1994: 131–159; 2002; 2010); and for refined versions of Frankfurt’s example, meant to clearly deny Jones access to alternatives, see Alfred Mele and David Robb (1998), David Hunt (2000), and Derk Pereboom (2000; 2001: 18–28).

In response to criticisms such as the above, Frankfurt has said that his example was intended mainly to draw attention to the fact “that making an action unavoidable is not the same thing as bringing it about that the action is performed” (2006: 340; emphasis in original). In particular, while determinism may make an agent’s action unavoidable, it does not follow that the agent acts as he does only because determinism is true: it may also be true that he acts as he does because he wants to and because he sees reasons in favor of so acting. The point of his original example, Frankfurt suggests, was to draw attention to the significance that the actual causes of an agent’s behavior (such as her reasons and desires) can have independently of whether the agent might have done something else. Frankfurt concludes that “[w]hen a person acts for reasons of his own…the question of whether he could have done something else instead is quite irrelevant” for the purposes of assessing responsibility (2006: 340). A focus on the actual causes that lead to behavior, as well as investigation into when an agent can be said to act on her own reasons, has characterized a great deal of work on responsibility since Frankfurt’s essay (see §2.3 and §3.3.3).

2. Some Approaches to Moral Responsibility

This section discusses three important approaches to responsibility. Additional perspectives (attributionism, conversational theories, mesh or structural accounts, skeptical accounts, etc.) are introduced in more or less detail in the discussions of contemporary debates below.

2.1 Forward-Looking Accounts

Forward-looking approaches to moral responsibility justify responsibility practices by focusing on the beneficial consequences that can be obtained by engaging in these practices. This approach was influential in the earlier parts of the twentieth century (as well as before), had fallen out of favor by the closing decades of that century, and has recently been the subject of renewed interest.

Forward-looking perspectives tend to emphasize one of the central points discussed in the previous section: an agent’s being subject to determinism does not entail that he is subject to constraints that force him to act independently of his choices. If this is true, then, regardless of the truth of determinism, it may be useful to offer certain incentives to agents—to praise and blame them and generally to treat them as responsible—in order to encourage them to make certain choices and thus to secure positive behavioral outcomes.

According to some articulations of the forward-looking approach, to be a responsible agent is simply to be an agent whose motives, choices, and behavior can be shaped in this way. Thus, Moritz Schlick argued that

The question of who is responsible is the question concerning the correct point of application of the motive…. in this its meaning is completely exhausted; behind it lurks no mysterious connection between transgression and requital…. It is a matter only of knowing who is to be punished or rewarded, in order that punishment and reward function as such—be able to achieve their goal. (1930 [1966: 61]; emphasis in original)

And, according to Schlick, the goals of punishment and reward have nothing to do with the past: the idea that punishment “is a natural retaliation for past wrong, ought no longer to be defended in cultivated society” (1930 [1966: 60]; emphasis in original). Instead, punishment ought to be

concerned only with the institution of causes, of motives of conduct…. Analogously, in the case of reward we are concerned with an incentive. (1930 [1966: 60]; emphasis in original)

J. J. C. Smart (1961) also defended a well-known, forward-looking approach to moral responsibility in the mid-twentieth century. Smart claimed that to blame someone for a piece of behavior is simply to assess the behavior negatively (to “dispraise” it, in Smart’s terminology) while simultaneously ascribing responsibility for the behavior to the agent. And, for Smart, an ascription of responsibility merely involves taking an agent to be such that he would have omitted the behavior if he had been provided with a motive to do so. Whatever sanctions may follow on an ascription of responsibility are administered with eye to giving an agent motives to refrain from such behavior in the future.

Smart’s general approach has its contemporary defenders (Arneson 2003), but many have found it lacking in important ways. For one thing, as R. Jay Wallace notes, an approach like Smart’s “leaves out the underlying attitudinal aspect of moral blame” (Wallace 1996: 56, emphasis in original; see the next subsection for more on blaming attitudes). According to Wallace, the attitudes involved in blame are “backward-looking and focused on the individual agent who has done something morally wrong” (Wallace 1996: 56). But a forward-looking approach, with its focus on bringing about desirable outcomes

is not directed exclusively toward the individual agent who has done something morally wrong, but takes account of anyone else who is susceptible to being influenced by our responses. (Wallace 1996: 56; emphasis added)

In exceptional cases, a focus on beneficial outcomes may provide grounds for treating as blameworthy those who are known to be innocent (Smart 1973). This last feature of (some) forward-looking approaches has led to particularly strong criticism.

Recent efforts have been made to develop partially forward-looking accounts of responsibility that evade some of the criticisms mentioned above. These (somewhat revisionary) accounts justify our responsibility practices by appeal to their suitability for fostering moral agency and the acquisition of capacities required for such agency. Most notable in this regard is Manuel Vargas’s “agency cultivation model” of responsibility (2013; also see Jefferson 2019 and McGeer 2015). Recent conversational accounts of responsibility (§3.2.2) also have an important forward-looking component insofar as they regard those with whom one might have fruitful moral interactions as candidates for responsibility. Some responsibility skeptics have also emphasized the forward-looking benefits of certain responsibility practices. For example, Derk Pereboom—who rejects desert-based blame—has argued that some conventional blaming practices can be maintained (even after ordinary notions of blameworthiness have been left behind) insofar as these practices are grounded in “non-desert invoking moral desiderata” such as “protection of potential victims, reconciliation to relationships both personal and with the moral community more generally, and moral formation” (2014: 134; also see Caruso 2016, Levy 2012, and Milam 2016). In contrast to some of the forward-looking approaches described above, Pereboom (2017) proposes that only those agents who have in fact acted immorally should be open to forward-aiming blaming practices. (For more on skepticism about responsibility, see §3.3 and the entry on skepticism about moral responsibility.)

2.2 The Reactive Attitudes Approach

2.2.1 “Freedom and Resentment”

P. F. Strawson’s 1962 paper, “Freedom and Resentment”, is a touchstone for much of the work on moral responsibility that followed it, especially the work of compatibilists. Strawson’s aim was to chart a course between incompatibilist accounts committed to a free will requirement on responsibility, and forward-looking compatibilist accounts that did not, in Strawson’s view, appropriately acknowledge and account for the interpersonal significance of the affective component of our responsibility practices. In contrast with forward-looking accounts such as J. J. C. Smart’s and Moritz Schlick’s (§2.1), Strawson focuses directly on the emotions—the reactive attitudes—that play a fundamental role in our practices of holding one another responsible. Strawson’s suggestion is that attending to the logic of these emotional responses yields an account of what it is to be open to praise and blame that need not invoke the incompatibilist’s conception of free will. Indeed, Strawson’s view has been interpreted as suggesting that no metaphysical facts beyond our praising and blaming practices are needed to ground these practices.

Part of the novelty of Strawson’s approach is its emphasis on the “importance that we attach to the attitudes and intentions towards us of other human beings” (1962 [1993: 48]) and on

how much it matters to us, whether the actions of other people…reflect attitudes towards us of goodwill, affection, or esteem on the one hand or contempt, indifference, or malevolence on the other. (1962 [1993: 49])

For Strawson, our practices of holding others responsible are largely responses to these things: that is, “to the quality of others’ wills towards us” (1962 [1993: 56]).

To get a sense of the importance of quality of will for our interpersonal relations, note the difference in your response to one who injures you accidentally as compared to how you respond to one who does you the same injury out of “contemptuous disregard” or “a malevolent wish to injure [you]” (P. Strawson 1962 [1993: 49]). The second case is likely to arouse a type and intensity of resentment that would not be (appropriately) felt in the first case. Corresponding points may be made about positive responses such as gratitude: you would likely not have the same feelings of gratitude toward a person who benefits you accidentally as you would toward one who does so out of concern for your welfare. The focus here is on personal reactive attitudes directed toward another on one’s own behalf, but Strawson also discusses “sympathetic or vicarious” attitudes felt on behalf of others, and “self-reactive attitudes” that an agent may direct toward herself (1962 [1993: 56–7]).

On Strawson’s view, the tendency to respond with relevant reactive attitudes to displays of good or ill will implicates a demand for moral respect and due regard. Indeed, for Strawson, “[t]he making of the demand is the proneness to such attitudes”, and the attitudes themselves are the “correlates of the moral demand in the case where the demand is felt to be disregarded” (1962 [1993: 63]; emphasis in original). Thus, among the circumstances that mollify a person’s (negative) reactive attitudes, are those which show that—despite initial appearances—the demand for due regard has not been ignored or flouted. When someone explains that the injury she caused you was entirely unforeseen and accidental, she indicates that her regard for your welfare was not insufficient and that she is therefore not an appropriate target for the negative attitudes involved in moral blame.

Note that the agent who excuses herself from blame in the above way is not calling into question her status as a generally responsible agent: she is still open to the demand for due regard and liable, in principle, to reactive responses. Other agents, however, may be inapt targets for blame and the reactive emotions precisely because they are not legitimate targets of a demand for regard. In these cases, an agent is not excused from blame, he is exempted from it: it is not that his behavior is discovered to have been non-malicious, but rather that he is seen to be one of whom better behavior cannot reasonably be demanded. (The widely-used terminology in which the above contrast is drawn—“excuses” versus “exemptions”—is due to Watson 1987 [2004]).

For Strawson, the most important group of exempt agents includes those who are, at least for a time, significantly impaired for normal interpersonal relationships. These agents may be children, or psychologically impaired like the “schizophrenic”; they may exhibit “purely compulsive behaviour”, or their minds may have “been systematically perverted” (P. Strawson 1962 [1993: 51]). Alternatively, exempt agents may simply be “wholly lacking…in moral sense” (P. Strawson 1962 [1993: 58]), perhaps because they suffered from “peculiarly unfortunate…formative circumstances” (P. Strawson 1962 [1993: 52]). These agents are not candidates for the range of emotional responses involved in our personal relationships because they do not participate in these relationships in the right way for such responses to be sensibly applied to them. Rather than taking up interpersonally-engaged attitudes (that presuppose a demand for respect) toward exempt agents, we instead take an objective attitude toward them. The exempt agent is not regarded “as a morally responsible agent…as a member of the moral community” (P. Strawson 1962 [1993: 59]); though he may be regarded as “an object of social policy” and as something “to be managed or handled or cured or trained” (P. Strawson 1962 [1993: 52]).

Strawson’s perspective has an important compatibilist upshot. We may be able, in limited circumstances, to take up a detached, objective perspective on the behavior of normal (that is, non-exempt) agents. But Strawson argues that we cannot take up with this perspective permanently, and certainly not on the basis of discovering that determinism is true:

The human commitment to participation in ordinary interpersonal relationships is, I think, too thoroughgoing and deeply rooted for us to take seriously the thought that a general theoretical conviction [e.g., about the truth of determinism] might so change our world that, in it, there were no longer any such things as interpersonal relationships as we normally understand them; and being involved in inter-personal relationships…precisely is being exposed to the range of reactive attitudes and feelings that is in question. (1962 [1993: 54])

More specifically, the truth of determinism would not show that human beings generally occupy excusing or exempting conditions that would make the attitudes involved in holding one another responsible inappropriate. It would not follow from the truth of determinism, for example, “that anyone who caused an injury either was quite simply ignorant of causing it or had acceptably overriding reasons for” doing so (P. Strawson 1962 [1993: 53]; emphasis in original); nor would it follow (from the truth of determinism)

that nobody knows what he’s doing or that everybody’s behaviour is unintelligible in terms of conscious purposes or that everybody lives in a world of delusion or that nobody has a moral sense. (P. Strawson 1962 [1993: 59])

2.2.2 Criticisms of Strawson’s Approach

Various objections have been raised regarding P. F. Strawson’s general theoretical approach to moral responsibility, his assumptions about human psychology and sociality, and his arguments for the compatibility of determinism and responsibility.

As noted in the previous subsection, Strawson argues that learning that determinism is true would not raise general concerns about our responsibility practices. This is because the truth of determinism would not show that human beings are generally abnormal in a way that would call into question their openness to the reactive attitudes: “it cannot be a consequence of any thesis which is not itself self-contradictory that abnormality is the universal condition” (P. Strawson 1962 [1993: 54]). In reply, it has been noted that while the truth of determinism might not suggest universal abnormality, it might well show that normal human beings are morally incapacitated in a way that is relevant to our responsibility practices (Russell 1992: 298–301). Strawson’s assumptions that we are too deeply and naturally committed to our reactive-attitude-involving practices to give them up, and that doing so would irreparably distort our moral lives, have also been criticized (Nelkin 2011: 42–45; G. Strawson 1986: 84–120; Watson 1987 [2004: 255–258]).

A different sort of objection emphasizes the response-dependence of Strawson’s account: that is, the way it explains an agent’s responsibility in terms of the moral responses that characterize a given community’s responsibility practices, rather than in terms of independent facts about whether the agent is responsible. This feature of Strawson’s approach invites a reading that may seem paradoxical:

In Strawson’s view, there is no such independent notion of responsibility that explains the propriety of the reactive attitudes. The explanatory priority is the other way around: It is not that we hold people responsible because they are responsible; rather, the idea (our idea) that we are responsible is to be understood by the practice, which itself is not a matter of holding some propositions to be true, but of expressing our concerns and demands about our treatment of one another. (Watson 1987 [2004: 222]; emphasis in original; see Bennett 1980 for a related, non-cognitivist interpretation of Strawson’s approach)

Strawson’s approach would be particularly problematic if, as the above reading might suggest, it entails that a group’s responsibility practices are—as they stand and however they stand—beyond criticism simply because they are that group’s practices (Fischer & Ravizza 1993a: 18).

But there is something to be said from the other side of the debate. It may seem obvious that people are appropriately held responsible only if there are independent facts about their responsibility. But on reflection—and following R. Jay Wallace’s (1996) influential Strawsonian approach—it may be difficult “to make sense of the idea of a prior and thoroughly independent realm of moral responsibility facts” that is separate from our practices and yet to which our practices must answer (1996: 88). For Wallace, giving up on practice-independent responsibility facts doesn’t mean giving up on facts about responsibility; rather, “we must interpret the relevant facts [about responsibility] as somehow dependent on our practices of holding people responsible” (1996: 89). Such an interpretation requires an investigation into our practices, and what emerges most conspicuously, for Wallace, from this investigation is the degree to which our responsibility practices are organized around a fundamental commitment to fairness (1996: 101). Wallace develops this commitment to fairness, and to norms of fairness, into an account of the conditions under which people are appropriately held morally responsible for their behavior (1996: 103–109). (For a more recent defense of the response-dependent approach to responsibility, see Shoemaker 2017b; for criticism of such approaches, see Todd 2016.)

2.3 Reasons-Responsiveness Views

As noted in §1, one of the lasting influences of Harry Frankfurt’s defense of compatibilism was to draw attention to the actual causes of agents’ behavior, and particularly to whether an agent—even a causally determined agent—acted for her own reasons. Reasons-responsiveness approaches to responsibility have been particularly attentive to these issues. These approaches ground responsibility by reference to agents’ capacities for being appropriately sensitive to the rational considerations that bear on their actions. Interpreted broadly, reasons-responsiveness approaches include a diverse collection of views, such as David Brink and Dana Nelkin (2013), John M. Fischer and Mark Ravizza (1998), Ishtiyaque Haji (1998), Michael McKenna (2013), Dana Nelkin (2011), Carolina Sartorio (2016), R. Jay Wallace (1996), and Susan Wolf (1990). Fischer and Ravizza’s Responsibility and Control (1998), which builds on Fischer (1994), offers the most influential articulation of the reasons-responsiveness approach.

Fischer and Ravizza begin with a distinction between regulative control and guidance control. Regulative control involves the possession of a dual power: “the power freely to do some act A, and the power freely to do something else instead” (1998: 31). Guidance control, on the other hand, does not require access to alternatives: it is manifested when an agent guides her behavior in a particular direction (and regardless of whether it was open to her to guide her behavior in a different direction). Since Fischer and Ravizza take Frankfurt cases (§1) to show that access to behavioral alternatives is not necessary for moral responsibility, they conclude that “the sort of control necessarily associated with moral responsibility for action is guidance control” and not regulative control (1998: 33; emphasis in original).

A number of factors can undermine guidance control. If a person’s behavior is brought about by hypnosis, brainwashing, or genuinely irresistible urges, then that person may not be morally responsible for her behavior since she does not reflectively guide it in the way required for responsibility (Fischer & Ravizza 1998: 35). More specifically, an agent in the above circumstances is not likely to be responsible because he “is not responsive to reasons—his behavior would be the same, no matter what reasons there were” (1998: 37). Thus, Fischer and Ravizza characterize possession of guidance control as (partially) dependent on responsiveness to reasons. In particular, guidance control depends on whether the psychological mechanism that issues in an agent’s behavior is responsive to reasons. (Guidance control also requires that an agent owns the mechanism on which she acts. According to Fischer and Ravizza, this requires placing historical conditions on responsibility; see §3.3.3.)

Fischer and Ravizza’s focus on mechanisms is motivated by the following reasoning. In a Frankfurt case, an agent is responsible for an action even though his so acting is ensured by external factors. But the presence of these external factors means that the agent in a Frankfurt case would have acted the same no matter what reasons he was confronted with, which suggests that the responsible agent in a Frankfurt scenario is not responsive to reasons. This is a problem for Fischer and Ravizza’s claim that guidance control, and thus reasons-responsiveness, is necessary for responsibility. Fischer and Ravizza’s solution is to argue that while the agent in a Frankfurt case may not be responsive to reasons, the agent’s mechanism—“the process that leads to the relevant upshot [i.e., the agent’s action]”—may well be responsive to reasons (1998: 38). In other words, the agent’s generally-specified psychological mechanism might have responded (under counterfactual conditions) to considerations in favor of omitting the action that the agent actually performed (and that he was guaranteed to perform, regardless of reasons, since he was in a Frankfurt-type scenario).

Fischer and Ravizza thus arrive at the following provisional conclusion: “relatively clear cases of moral responsibility”—that is, those in which an agent is not hypnotized, etc.—are distinguished by the fact that “an agent exhibits guidance control of an action insofar as the mechanism that actually issues in the action is his own, reasons-responsive mechanism” (1998: 39). But how responsive to reasons does an agent’s mechanism need to be for that agent to have the type of control over his behavior associated with moral responsibility? A strongly reasons-responsive mechanism would both recognize and respond to any sufficient reason to act otherwise (1998: 41). (In Fischer and Ravizza’s terminology, such a mechanism is strongly “receptive” and “reactive” to reasons). But strong reasons-responsiveness cannot be required for guidance control since many intuitively responsible agents—i.e., many garden variety wrongdoers—fail to attend to sufficient reasons to do otherwise. On the other hand, weak reasons-responsiveness is not enough for guidance control. An agent with a weakly reasons-responsive mechanism will respond appropriately to some sufficient reason to do otherwise, but the pattern of responsiveness revealed in the agent’s behavior might be too arbitrary for the agent to be credited with the kind of control required for responsibility. A person’s pattern of responsiveness to reasons would likely seem erratic in the relevant way if, for example, she would forego purchasing a ticket to a basketball game if it cost one thousand dollars, but not if it cost two thousand dollars (Fischer & Ravizza 1998: 66).

Fischer and Ravizza settle on moderate reasons responsiveness as the sort that is most germane to guidance control (1998: 69–85). A psychological mechanism that is moderately responsive to reasons exhibits regularity with respect to its receptivity to reasons: that is, it exhibits “an understandable pattern of (actual and hypothetical) reasons-receptivity” (Fischer & Ravizza 1998: 71; emphasis in original). Such a pattern will indicate that an agent understands “how reasons fit together” and that, for example, “acceptance of one reason as sufficient implies that a stronger reason must also be sufficient” (Fischer & Ravizza 1998: 71). (In addition, a pattern of regular receptivity to reasons will include receptivity to a range of moral considerations (Fischer & Ravizza 1998: 77). This will rule out attributing moral responsibility to non-moral agents; see Todd and Tognazzini 2008 for criticism of Fischer and Ravizza’s articulation of this condition.) However, a moderately responsive mechanism may be only weakly reactive to reasons since, as Fischer and Ravizza put it (somewhat mysteriously), “reactivity is all of piece” such

that if an agent’s mechanism reacts to some incentive to…[do otherwise], this shows that the mechanism can react to any incentive to do otherwise. (1998: 73; emphasis in original)

Fischer and Ravizza’s account has generated a great deal of attention and criticism. Some critics focus on the contrast (just noted) between the conditions they impose on receptivity to reasons and those they impose on reactivity to reasons (McKenna 2005, Mele 2006a, Watson 2001). Additionally, many are dissatisfied with Fischer and Ravizza’s presentation of their account in terms of the powers of mechanisms as opposed to agents. This has led some authors to develop agent-based reasons-responsiveness accounts that address the concerns that led Fischer and Ravizza to their mechanism-based approach (Brink & Nelkin 2013, McKenna 2013, Sartorio 2016).

3. Contemporary Debates

3.1 The “Faces” of Responsibility

3.1.1 Attributability versus Accountability

Do our responsibility practices accommodate distinct forms of moral responsibility? Are there different senses in which people may be morally responsible for their behavior? Contemporary interest in these possibilities has its roots in a debate between Susan Wolf and Gary Watson. Among other things, Wolf’s important 1990 book, Freedom Within Reason, offers a critical discussion of “Real Self” theories of responsibility. According to these views, a person is responsible for behavior that is attributable to her real self, and

an agent’s behavior is attributable to the agent’s real self…if she is at liberty (or able) both to govern her behavior on the basis of her will and to govern her will on the basis of her valuational system. (Wolf 1990: 33)

The basic idea is that a responsible agent is not simply moved by her strongest desires, but also, in some way, approves of, or stands behind, the desires that move her because they are governed by her values or because they are endorsed by higher-order desires. Wolf’s central example of a Real Self view is Watson’s (1975). In an important and closely related earlier paper, Wolf (1987) characterizes Watson (1975), Harry Frankfurt (1971), and Charles Taylor (1976) as offering “deep self views”. For more on real-self/deep-self views, see §3.3.3; for a recent presentation of a real-self view, see Chandra Sripada (2016).

According to Wolf, one point in favor of Real Self views is that they explain why people acting under the influence of hypnosis or compulsive desires are often not responsible (1990: 33). Since these agents are typically unable, under these conditions, to govern their behavior on the basis of their valuational systems, they are alienated from their actions in a way that undermines responsibility. But, for Wolf, it is a mark against Real Self views that they tend to be silent on the topic of how agents come to have the selves that they do. An agent’s real self might, for example, be the product of a traumatic upbringing, and Wolf argues that this would give us reason to question the “agent’s responsibility for her real self” and thus her responsibility for the present behavior that issues from that self (1990: 37; emphasis in original). For an important account of an agent with such an upbringing, see Wolf’s (1987) fictional example of JoJo (and see Watson 1987 [2004] for a related discussion of the convicted murderer Robert Alton Harris). For discussion of JoJo in this entry, see §3.2.1, and for general discussion of the relevance of personal history for present responsibility see §3.3.3.

Wolf suggests that when a person’s real self is the product of serious childhood trauma (or related factors), then that person is potentially responsible for her behavior only in a superficial sense that merely attributes bad actions to the agent’s real self (1990: 37–40). However, Wolf argues that ascriptions of moral responsibility go deeper than such attributions can reach:

When…we consider an individual worthy of blame or of praise, we are not merely judging the moral quality of the event with which the individual is so intimately associated; we are judging the moral quality of the individual herself in some more focused, noninstrumental, and seemingly more serious way. (1990: 41)

This deeper form of assessment—assessment in terms of “deep responsibility” (Wolf 1990: 41)—requires more than that an agent is “able to form her actions on the basis of her values”, it also requires that “she is able to form her values on the basis of what is True and Good” (Wolf 1990: 75). This latter ability will be impaired or absent in an agent whose real self is the product of pressures (such as a traumatic childhood) that have distorted her moral vision. (For the relevance of moral vision, or “moral competence”, for responsibility, see §3.2.)

In “Two Faces of Responsibility” (1996 [2004]), Gary Watson responds to Wolf. Watson agrees with Wolf that some approaches to responsibility—i.e., self-disclosure views (a phrase Watson borrows from Benson 1987)—focus narrowly on whether behavior is attributable to an agent. But Watson denies that these attributions constitute a merely superficial form of responsibility assessment. After all, behavior that is attributable to an agent—in the sense, for example, of issuing from her valuational system—often discloses something interpersonally and morally significant about the agent’s “fundamental evaluative orientation” (Watson 1996 [2004: 271]). Thus, ascriptions of responsibility in this responsibility-as-attributability sense are “central to ethical life and ethical appraisal” (Watson 1996 [2004: 263]).

However, Watson agrees with Wolf that the above story of responsibility is incomplete: there is more to responsibility than attributing actions to agents. In addition, we hold agents responsible for their behavior, which “is not just a matter of the relation of an individual to her behavior” (Watson 1996 [2004: 262]). When we hold responsible, we also “demand (require) certain conduct from one another and respond adversely to one another’s failures to comply with these demands” (Watson 1996 [2004: 262]). The moral demands, and potential for adverse treatment, associated with holding others responsible are part of our accountability (as opposed to attributability) practices, and these features of accountability raise issues of fairness that do not arise in the context of determining whether behavior is attributable to an agent (Watson 1996 [2004: 273]). Therefore, conditions may apply to accountability that do not apply to attributability: for example, perhaps “accountability blame” should be—as Wolf suggested—moderated in the case of an agent whose “squalid circumstances made it overwhelmingly difficult to develop a respect for the standards to which we would hold him accountable” (Watson 1996 [2004: 281]).

There are, then, two forms, or “faces”, of responsibility on Watson’s account. There is responsibility-as-attributability, and when an agent satisfies the conditions on this form of responsibility, behavior is properly attributed to her as reflecting morally important features of her self—her virtues and vices, for example. But there is also responsibility-as-accountability, and when an agent satisfies the conditions on this form of responsibility, which requires more than the correct attribution of behavior, she is open to being held accountable for that behavior in the ways that predominantly characterize moral blame.

3.1.2 Attributionism

It has become common for the views of several authors to be described (with varying degrees of accuracy) as instances of “attributionism”; see Neil Levy (2005) for the first use of this term. These authors include Robert Adams (1985), Nomy Arpaly (2003), Pamela Hieronymi (2004), T. M. Scanlon (1998, 2008), George Sher (2006a, 2006b, 2009), Angela Smith (2005, 2008), and Matthew Talbert (2012, 2013). Attributionists take moral responsibility assessments to be mainly concerned with whether an action (or omission, character trait, or belief) is attributable to an agent for the purposes of moral assessment, where this usually means that the action (or omission, etc.) reflects the agent’s “judgment sensitive attitudes” (Scanlon 1998), “evaluative judgments” (A. Smith 2005), or, more generally, her “moral personality” (Hieronymi 2008).

Attributionism resembles the self-disclosure views mentioned by Watson (see the previous subsection) insofar as both focus on the way that a responsible agent’s behavior discloses interpersonally and morally significant features of the agent’s self. However, it would be a mistake to conclude that contemporary attributionist views are interested only in specifying the conditions for what Watson calls responsibility-as-attributability. In fact, attributionists typically take themselves to be giving conditions for holding agents responsible in Watson’s accountability sense. (See the previous subsection for the distinction between accountability and attributability.)

According to attributionism, fulfillment of attributability conditions is sufficient for holding agents accountable for their behavior. This means that attributionism rejects conditions on moral responsibility that would excuse agents if their characters were shaped under adverse conditions (Scanlon 1998: 278–85), or if the thing for which the agent is blamed was not under her control (Sher 2006b and 2009, A. Smith 2005), or if the agent can’t be expected to recognize the moral status of her behavior (Scanlon 1998: 287–290; Talbert 2012). Attributionists reject these conditions on responsibility because morally and interpersonally significant behavior is attributable to agents that do not fulfill them, and such attributions are taken to be sufficient for an agent to be open to the responses involved in holding agents accountable for their behavior. Attributionists have also argued that blame may profitably be understood as a form of moral protest (Hieronymi 2001, A. Smith 2013, Talbert 2012); part of the appeal of this move is that moral protests may be legitimate in cases in which the above conditions are not met.

Several objections have been posed to attributionism. Some argue that attributionists are wrong to reject the conditions on responsibility mentioned in the last paragraph (Levy 2005, 2011; Shoemaker 2011, 2015a; Watson 2011). It has also been argued that the attributionist account of blame is too close to mere negative appraisal (Levy 2005; Wallace 1996: 80–1; Watson 2002). In addition, Scanlon (2008) has been criticized for failing to take negative emotions such as resentment to be central to the phenomenon of blame (Wallace 2011, Wolf 2011; a similar criticism would apply to Sher 2006a).

3.1.3 Answerability

Building on the distinction between attributability and accountability (§3.1.1), David Shoemaker (2011 and 2015a) has introduced a third form of responsibility: answerability. On Shoemaker’s view, attributability-responsibility assessments respond to facts about an agent’s character, accountability-responsibility responds to an agent’s degree of regard for others, and answerability-responsibility responds to an agent’s evaluative judgments. However, A. Smith (2015) and Hieronymi (2008 and 2014) use “answerability” to refer to a view more like the attributionist perspective described in the previous subsection, and Pereboom (2014) has used the term to indicate a form of responsibility more congenial to responsibility skeptics.

3.2 Moral Competence

3.2.1 The Moral Competence Condition on Responsibility

The possibility that moral competence—the ability to recognize and respond to moral considerations—is a condition on moral responsibility has been suggested at several points above (§2.2.1, §2.2.2, §2.3, §3.1.1, §3.1.2). Susan Wolf’s (1987) fictional story of “JoJo” is one of the best-known illustrations of this proposal. JoJo was raised by an evil dictator, and as a result he became the same sort of sadistic tyrant that his father was. As an adult, JoJo is happy to be the sort of person that he is, and he is moved by precisely the desires (e.g., to imprison, torture, and execute his subjects) that he wants to be moved by. Thus, JoJo fulfills important conditions on responsibility (§3.1.1, §3.3.3), however, Wolf argues that it may be unfair to hold him responsible for his bad behavior.

JoJo’s upbringing plays an important role in Wolf’s argument, but only because it left JoJo unable to fully appreciate the wrongfulness of his behavior. Thus, it is JoJo’s impaired moral competence that does the real excusing work, and similar conclusions of non-responsibility should be drawn about all those whom we think “could not help but be mistaken about their [bad] values”, if possession of these values impairs their ability to tell right from wrong (Wolf 1987: 57).

Many others join Wolf in arguing that impaired moral competence (perhaps on account of one’s upbringing or other environmental factors) undermines one’s moral responsibility (Benson 2001, Doris & Murphy 2007, Fischer & Ravizza 1998, Fricker 2010, Levy 2003, Russell 1995 and 2004, Wallace 1996, Watson 1987 [2004]). Part of what motivates this conclusion is the thought that it can be unreasonable to expect morally-impaired agents to avoid wrongful behavior, and that it is therefore unfair to expose these agents to the harm of moral blame on account of their wrongdoing. For detailed development of the moral competence requirement on responsibility in terms of considerations of fairness, see R. Jay Wallace (1996); also see Erin Kelly (2013), Neil Levy (2009), and Gary Watson (1987 [2004]). For rejection of the claim that blame is unfair in the case of the morally-impaired agent, see several of the defenders of attributionism mentioned in §3.1.2 (particularly Hieronymi 2004, Scanlon 1998, and Talbert 2012)

The moral competence condition on responsibility can also be motivated by the suggestion that impaired agents are not able to commit wrongs that have the sort of moral significance to which blame would be an appropriate response. The basic idea here is that, while morally-impaired agents can fail to show appropriate respect for others, these failures do not necessarily constitute the kind of flouting of moral norms that grounds blame (Watson 1987 [2004: 234]). In other words, a failure to respect others, is not always an instance of blame-grounding disrespect for others, since the latter (but not the former) requires the ability to comprehend the norms that one violates (Levy 2007, Shoemaker 2011).

3.2.2 Conversational Approaches to Responsibility

Considerations about moral competence play an important role in the recent trend of conversational theories of responsibility, which construe elements of our responsibility practices as morally-expressive moves in an ongoing moral conversation. The thought here is that to fruitfully (and fully) participate in such a conversation, one must have some degree of competence in the (moral) language of that conversation.

Several prominent versions of the conversational approach develop P. F. Strawson’s suggestion (§2.2.1) that the negative reactive attitudes involved in blame are expressions of a demand for moral regard from other agents. Gary Watson argues that a demand “presumes”, as a condition on the intelligibility of expressing it, “understanding on the part of the object of the demand” (1987 [2004: 230]). Therefore, since, “[t]he reactive attitudes are incipiently forms of communication”, they are intelligibly expressed “only on the assumption that the other can comprehend the message”, and since the message is a moral one, “blaming and praising those with diminished moral understanding loses its ‘point,’” at least in a certain sense (Watson 1987 [2004: 230]; see Watson 2011 for a modification of this proposal). R. Jay Wallace argues, similarly, that since responsibility practices are internal to moral relationships that are

defined by the successful exchange of moral criticism and justification…. it will be reasonable to hold accountable only someone who is at least a candidate for this kind of exchange of criticism and justification. (1996: 164)

Michael McKenna’s Conversation and Responsibility (2012) offers the most developed conversational analysis of responsibility. For McKenna, the “moral responsibility exchange” occurs in stages: an initial “moral contribution” of morally salient behavior; the “moral address” of, e.g., blame that responds to the moral contribution; the “moral account” in which the first contributor responds to moral address with, e.g., apology; and so on (2012: 89). Like Wallace and Watson, McKenna notes the way in which a morally impaired agent will find it difficult “to appreciate the challenges put to her by those who hold [her] morally responsible”, but he also argues that a suitably impaired agent cannot even make the first move in a moral conversation (2012: 78). Thus, the morally impaired agent’s responsibility is called into question not only because she is unable to respond appropriately to moral demands, but also because “she is incapable of acting from a will with a moral quality that could be a candidate for assessment from the standpoint of holding responsible” (McKenna 2012: 78). This point is related to Neil Levy’s and David Shoemaker’s contention, noted in the previous subsection, that impairments of moral competence can leave an agent unable to harbor and express the type of ill will or lack of regard to which blame responds. By contrast, Watson (2011), seems to allow that significant moral impairment is compatible with the ability to perform blame-relevant wrongdoing, even if such impairment undermines the wrongdoer’s moral accountability for her actions.

For another important account of responsibility in broadly conversational terms, see Shoemaker’s discussion of the sort of moral anger involved in holding others accountable for their behavior (2015a: 87–117). For additional defenses and articulations of the conversational approach to responsibility, see Stephen Darwall (2006), Miranda Fricker (2016), and Colleen Macnamara (2015).

3.2.3 Psychopathy

Impairments of moral competence come in degrees. Susan Wolf’s JoJo (§3.2.1) has localized impairments of the capacity to recognize and respond to moral considerations, but it is not clear that he is entirely immune to moral considerations. However, at the far end of the spectrum, we encounter more globally and thoroughly impaired figures such as the psychopath. In philosophical treatments, the psychopath is typically presented as an agent who, while retaining other psychological capacities, is entirely—or as nearly so as possible—incapable of responding appropriately to moral considerations. (This is something of a philosophical construct since real-life psychopathy admits of varying degrees of impairment, corresponding to higher or lower scores on diagnostic measures.)

One interesting question is whether the psychopath’s inability—or at least consistent failure—to respond appropriately to moral incentives is primarily the result of a motivational rather than cognitive failure: does the psychopath in some way know what morality requires and simply not care? If a positive answer is given to this last question (Fischer & Ravizza 1998: 76–81; Nichols 2002), then it seems likely that the psychopath could be responsible for at least some of his bad behavior. And some have argued that even if psychopathy is primarily a cognitive impairment, it may still be the case that psychopaths possess a sufficient capacity for distinguishing right and wrong—or that they possess sufficient related capacities—to be held responsible, at least to some extent and in certain ways (Glannon 1997, Greenspan 2003, Maibom 2008, Shoemaker 2014, Vargas & Nichols 2007). On the other hand, many believe that the psychopath’s capacity for grasping moral considerations is too superficial to sustain responsibility (Kennett 2019; Levy 2007; Nelkin 2015; Wallace 1996: 177–78; Watson 2011; see Mason 2017 for the claim that the relevant deficiency is one of moral knowledge rather than moral capacity). And still others have argued that even those who are fully impaired for moral understanding are open to blame as long as they possess broader rational competencies (Scanlon 1998: 287–290; Talbert 2014). However, the psychopath’s possession of these broader competencies has been called into question (Fine & Kennett 2004, Greenspan 2003, Litton 2010).

3.3 Skepticism and Related Topics

This section introduces contemporary skepticism about moral responsibility by way of discussions of several topics that have broad relevance for thinking about responsibility.

If moral responsibility requires free will, and free will involves access to alternatives in a way that is not compatible with determinism, then it would follow from the truth of determinism that no one is ever morally responsible. The above reasoning, and the skeptical conclusion it reaches, is endorsed by the hard determinist perspective on free will and responsibility, which was defended historically by Spinoza and d’Holbach (among others) and, more recently, by Ted Honderich (2002). But given that determinism may well be false, contemporary skeptics about moral responsibility more often pursue a hard incompatibilist line of argument according to which the kind of free will required for desert-based (as opposed to forward-looking, see §2.1) moral responsibility is incompatible with the truth or falsity of determinism (Pereboom 2001, 2014). The skeptical positions discussed below are generally of this sort: the skeptical conclusions they advocate do not depend on the truth of determinism.

3.3.1 Moral Luck

According to Thomas Nagel, a person is subject to moral luck if factors that are not under that person’s control affect the moral assessments to which he is open (Nagel 1976 [1979]; also see Williams 1976 [1981] and the entry on moral luck.)

Is there such a thing as moral luck? More specifically, can luck affect a person’s moral responsibility? Consider a would-be assassin who shoots at her target, aiming to kill, but fails to do so only because her bullet is deflected by a passing bird. It seems that such a would-be assassin has good moral outcome luck (that is, good moral luck in the outcome of her behavior). Because of factors beyond her control, the would-be assassin’s moral record is better than it would have been: in particular, she is not a killer and is not morally responsible for causing anyone’s death. One might think, in addition, that the would-be assassin is less blameworthy than a successful assassin with whom she is otherwise identical, and that the reason for this is just that the successful assassin intentionally killed someone while the unsuccessful assassin (as a result of good moral luck) did not. (For important recent defenses of moral luck, see Hanna 2014 and Hartman 2017.)

On the other hand, one might think that if the two assassins just mentioned are identical in terms of their values, goals, intentions, and motivations, then the addition of a bit of luck to the unsuccessful assassin’s story cannot ground a deep contrast between these two agents in terms of their moral responsibility. One way to sustain this position is to argue that moral responsibility is a function solely of internal features of agents, such as their motives and intentions (Khoury 2018; also see Enoch & Marmor 2007 for some of the main arguments against moral luck). Of course, the successful assassin is responsible for something (killing a person) for which the unsuccessful assassin is not, but it might be possible to argue that both are morally responsible—and presumably blameworthy—to the same degree insofar as it was true of both of them that they aimed to kill, and that they did so for the same reasons and with the same degree of commitment toward bringing about that outcome (see M. Zimmerman 2002 and 2015 for this influential perspective).

But now consider a different would-be assassin who does not even try to kill anyone, but only because his circumstances did not favor this option. This would-be assassin is willing to kill under favorable circumstances (and so he may seem to have had good circumstantial moral luck since he was not in those circumstances). Perhaps the degree of responsibility attributed to the successful and unsuccessful assassins described above depends not so much on the fact that they both tried to kill as on the fact that they were both willing to kill; in this case, the would-be assassin just introduced may share their degree of responsibility since he shares their willingness to kill. But an account that focuses on how agents would be willing to act under counterfactual circumstances is likely to generate unintuitive conclusions about responsibility since many agents who are typically judged blameless might willingly perform terrible actions under the right circumstances. (M. Zimmerman 2002 and 2015 does not shy away from this consequence, but criticisms of his efforts to reject moral luck—Hanna 2014, Hartman 2017—have made much of it; see Peels 2015 for a position that is related to Zimmerman’s but that may avoid the unintuitive consequence just mentioned.)

Another approach to luck holds that it is inimical to moral responsibility in a way that generally undermines responsibility ascriptions. To see the motivation for this skeptical position, consider constitutive moral luck: that is, luck in how one is constituted in terms of the “inclinations, capacities, and temperament” one finds within oneself (Nagel 1976 [1979: 28]). Facts about a person’s inclinations, capacities, and temperament explain much—if not all—of that person’s behavior, and if the facts that explain why a person acts as she does are a result of good or bad luck, then perhaps it is unfair to hold her responsible for that behavior. As Nagel notes, once the full sweep of the various kinds of luck comes into view, “[t]he area of genuine agency” may seem to shrink to nothing since our actions and their consequences “result from the combined influence of factors, antecedent and posterior to action, that are not within the agent’s control” (1976 [1979: 35]). If this is right, then perhaps,

nothing remains which can be ascribed to the responsible self, and we are left with nothing but a…sequence of events, which can be deplored or celebrated, but not blamed or praised. (Nagel 1976 [1979: 37])

The above quotations notwithstanding, Nagel himself doesn’t fully embrace a skeptical conclusion about responsibility on grounds of moral luck, but others have done so, most notably, Neil Levy (2011). According to Levy’s “hard luck view”, the encompassing nature of moral luck means “that there are no desert-entailing differences between moral agents” (2011: 10). Of course, there are differences between agents in terms of their characters and the good or bad actions and outcomes that they produce, but Levy’s point is that, given the influence of luck in generating these differences, they don’t provide a sound basis for differential treatment of people in terms of moral praise and blame. (See Russell 2017 for a compatibilist account that is led to a variety of pessimism, though not skepticism, on the basis of the concerns about moral luck just described.)

3.3.2 Ultimate Responsibility

Another important skeptical argument—related to the observations about constitutive moral luck in the previous subsection—is Galen Strawson’s Basic Argument, which concludes that “we cannot be truly or ultimately morally responsible for our actions” (1994: 5). (Since the argument targets “ultimate” moral responsibility, it does not necessarily exclude other forms, such as forward-looking responsibility (§2.1) and, on some understandings, responsibility-as-attributability (§3.1.1).) The argument begins by noting that an agent makes the choices she does because of certain facts about the way she is: for example, the facts about what seems choiceworthy to her. But if this is true, then, in order to be responsible for her subsequent choices, perhaps an agent also needs to be responsible for the facts about what seems choiceworthy to her. But how can one be responsible for these prior facts about herself? Wouldn’t this require a prior choice on the part of the agent, one that resulted in her present dispositions to see certain ends and means as choiceworthy? But this prior choice would itself be something for which the agent is responsible only if the agent is also responsible for the fact that that prior choice seemed choiceworthy to her. And now we must explain how the agent can be responsible for this additional prior fact about herself, which will require positing another choice by the agent, and the responsibility for that choice will also have to be secured, which will require explaining why it seemed choiceworthy to her, and so on. A regress looms here, and Strawson claims that it cannot be stopped except by positing an initial act of self-creation on the responsible agent’s part (1994: 5, 15). Only self-creating agents could be fully responsible for their own tendencies to exercise their powers of choice as they do, but self-creation is impossible, so no one is every truly or ultimately morally responsible for their behavior.

A number of replies to this argument (and the argument from constitutive moral luck) are possible. One might simply deny that how a person came to be the way she is matters for present responsibility: perhaps all we need to know in order to judge a person’s present responsibility are facts about her present constitution and about how that constitution is related to the person’s present behavior. (For views like this, see the discussion of attributionism (§3.1.2) and the discussion of non-historical accounts of responsibility in the next subsection). Alternatively, one might think that while personal history matters for moral responsibility, Strawson’s argument sets the bar too high, requiring too much historical control over one’s constitution (see Fischer 2006; for a reply, see Levy 2011: 5). Perhaps what is needed is not literal self-creation, but simply an ability to enact changes in oneself so as to acquire responsibility for the self that results from these changes (Clarke 2005). A picture along these lines can be found in Aristotle’s suggestion that one can be responsible for being a careless person if one’s present state of carelessness is the result of earlier choices that one made (Aristotle, Nicomachean Ethics; see also Michele Moody-Adams 1990).

Roughly in this Aristotelian vein, Robert Kane offers a detailed incompatibilist account of how we can secure ultimate responsibility for our actions (1996 and 2007). On Kane’s view, for an agent

to be ultimately responsible for [a] choice, the agent must be at least in part responsible by virtue of choices or actions voluntarily performed in the past for having the character and motives he or she now has. (2007: 14; emphasis in original)

This position may appear to be open to the regress concerns presented in Galen Strawson’s argument above. But Kane thinks a regress is avoided in cases in which a person’s character-forming choices are undetermined. Since these undetermined choices will have no sufficient causes, there is no relevant prior cause for which the agent must be responsible, so there is no regress problem (Kane 2007: 15–16; see Pereboom 2001: 47–50 for criticism of Kane on this point.)

Of particular interest to Kane are potential character-forming choices that occur “when we are torn between competing visions of what we should do or become” (2007: 26). In such cases, if a person sees reasons in favor of either choice that he might make, and the choice that he makes is undetermined, then whichever choice he makes will have been chosen for his own reasons. According to Kane, when an agent makes this kind of choice, he shapes his character, and since his choice is not determined by prior causal factors, he is responsible for it and for the character it shapes and for the character-determined choices that he makes in the future.

Kane’s approach is an important instance of those incompatibilist theories that attempt to explain how free will, while requiring indeterminism, could clearly be at home in the natural world as we know it (also see Balaguer 2010, Ekstrom 2000, and Franklin 2018). (This is as opposed to agent-causal accounts of free will—Chisholm 1964, O’Connor 2000—that invoke a type of causal power that is less easily naturalized). However, many have argued that any account like Kane’s, which inserts an indeterministic link in the causal chain leading to action, actually reduces an agent’s control over an action or at least leaves it unclear why such an insertion would increase agential control over actions as compared to a deterministic story of action (Hobart 1934; Levy 2011: 41–83; Pereboom 2014: 31–49; van Inwagen 1983: 126–52; Watson 1999).

3.3.3 Personal History and Manipulation

Accounts such as Neil Levy’s (2011) and Galen Strawson’s (1994), described in the two preceding subsections, assume that the facts about the way a person came to be the way she is are relevant for determining her present responsibility. But non-historical views, such as attributionism (§3.1.2) and the views that Susan Wolf calls “Real Self” theories (§3.1.1), reject this contention. Real Self accounts are sometimes referred to as “structural” or “hierarchical” theories, and John M. Fischer and Mark Ravizza (1998: 184–187) have called them “mesh” theories. By whatever name, the basic idea is that an agent is morally responsible insofar as her will has the right sort of structure: in particular, there needs to be a mesh or fit between the desires that actually move the agent and her values, or between the desires that move her and her higher-order desires, the latter of which are the agent’s reflective preferences about which desires should move her. (For approaches along these lines, see Dworkin 1970; Frankfurt 1971, 1987; Neely 1974; and Watson 1975.)

Harry Frankfurt’s comparison between a willing drug addict and an unwilling addict illustrates important features of his version of the structural approach to responsibility. Both of Frankfurt’s addicts have desires to take the drug to which they are addicted, and the nature of their addictions is such that both addicts will ultimately act to fulfill their first-order addictive desire. But suppose that both addicts are capable of taking higher-order perspectives on their first-order desires, and suppose that they take different higher-order perspectives. The willing addict endorses and identifies with his addictive desire. The unwilling addict, on the other hand, repudiates his addictive desire to such an extent that, when it ends up being effective, Frankfurt says that this addict is “helplessly violated by his own desires” (1971: 12). The willing addict has a kind of freedom that the unwilling addict lacks: they may both be bound to take the drug to which they are addicted, but insofar as the willing addict is moved by a desire that he endorses, he acts freely in a way that the unwilling addict does not (Frankfurt 1971: 19). A related conclusion about responsibility may be drawn: perhaps the unwilling addict’s desire is alien to him in such a way that his responsibility for acting on it is called into question (for a recent defense of this conclusion, see Sripada 2017).

One objection to Frankfurt’s view goes like this. His account seems to assume that the addicts’ higher-order desires have the authority to speak for them—they reveal (or constitute) the agent’s “real self”, to use Wolf’s language (1990). But if higher-order desires are invoked out of a concern that an agent’s first-order desires may not stem from his real self, why won’t the same worry recur with respect to higher-order desires as well? In other words, when ascending through the orders of desires, why stop at any particular point, why not think that appeal to a still higher order is always necessary to reveal where an agent stands? (See Watson (1975) for an objection along these lines, which partly motivates Watson—in his articulation of a structural approach—to focus on whether an agent’s desires conform with her values, rather than with her higher-order desires).

And even if one agrees with Frankfurt (or Watson) about the structural elements required for responsibility, one might wonder how an agent’s will came to have its particular structure. Thus, an important type of objection to Frankfurt’s view notes that the relevant structure might have been put in place by factors that intuitively undermine responsibility, in which case the presence of the relevant structure is not itself sufficient for responsibility (Fischer & Ravizza 1998: 196–201; Locke 1975; Slote 1980). Fischer and Ravizza argue that

[i]f the mesh [between higher- and lower-order desires] were produced by…brainwashing or subliminal advertising…we would not hold the agent morally responsible for his behavior

because the psychological mechanism that produced the behavior would not be, “in an important intuitive sense, the agent’s own” (1998: 197; emphasis in original). In response to this type of worry, Fischer and Ravizza argue that responsibility has an important historical component, which they attempt to capture with their account of how agents can “take responsibility” for the psychological mechanisms that produces their behavior (1998: 207–239). (For criticism of Fischer and Ravizza’s account of taking responsibility, see Levy 2011: 103–106 and Pereboom 2001: 120–22; for quite different accounts of taking responsibility, see Enoch 2012; Mason 2019: 179–207; and Wolf 2001. For work on the general significance of personal histories for responsibility, see Christman 1991, Vargas 2006, and D. Zimmerman 2003.)

Part of Fischer and Ravizza’s motivation for developing their account of “taking responsibility” was to ensure that agents who have been manipulated in certain ways do not turn out to be responsible on their view. Several examples and arguments featuring the sort of manipulation that worried Fischer and Ravizza have played important roles in the recent literature on responsibility. One of these is Alfred Mele’s Beth/Ann example (1995, 2006b), which emphasizes the difficulties faced by accounts of responsibility that eschew historical conditions. In the example, Ann has acquired her preferences and values in the normal way, but Beth is manipulated by a team of neuroscientists so that she now has preferences and values that are identical to Ann’s. After the manipulation, Beth is capable of reflecting on her new values, and when she does so, she endorses them enthusiastically. But whereas we might normally take such an endorsement to be a sign of the sort of self-governance associated with responsibility, Mele suggests that Beth, unlike Ann, exhibits merely “ersatz self-government” since Beth’s new values where imposed on her (1995: 155). And if certain kinds of personal histories similarly undermine an agent’s ability to genuinely or authentically govern her behavior, then agents with these histories will not be morally responsible. (For replies to Mele and general insights into manipulation cases, see Arpaly 2003, King 2013, McKenna 2004, and Todd 2011; for discussion of issues about personal identity that arise in manipulation cases, see Khoury 2013, Matheson 2014, Shoemaker 2012)

Now one can take a hard line in Beth’s case (McKenna 2004). Such a stance might involve noting that while Beth acquired her new values in a strange way (and in a way that involved moral wrongs done to her), everyone acquires their values in ways that are not fully under their control. Indeed, following Galen Strawson’s line of argument (1994), described in §3.3.2, it might be noted that no one has ultimate control over their values, and even if normal agents have some capacity to address and alter their values, the dispositional factors that govern how this capacity is used are ultimately the result of factors beyond agents’ control. So perhaps it is not as clear as it might first appear that Beth is distinguished from normal agents in terms of her powers of self-governance and her moral responsibility for her behavior. But this reasoning can cut both ways: instead of showing that Beth is assimilated into the class of normal, responsible agents, it might show that normal agents are assimilated into the class of non-responsible agents like Beth. Derk Pereboom’s four-case argument employs a maneuver along these lines (1995, 2001, 2007, 2014).

Pereboom’s argument presents Professor Plum in four different scenarios. In each scenario, Plum kills Ms. White while satisfying the conditions on desert-involving moral responsibility most often proposed by compatibilists (and described in earlier sections of this entry): Plum kills White because he wants to, and while this desire is in keeping with Plum’s character, it is not irresistible; Plum also endorses his desire to kill White from a higher-order volitional perspective; finally, Plum is generally morally competent, and the process of deliberation that leads to his decision to kill White is appropriately responsive to reasons.

In Case 1, Plum is “created by neuroscientists, who…manipulate him directly through the use of radio-like technology” (Pereboom 2001: 112). These scientists cause Plum’s reasoning to take a certain (reasons-responsive) path that culminates in Plum concluding that the self-serving reasons in favor of killing White outweigh the reasons in favor of not doing so. Pereboom believes that in such a case Plum is clearly not responsible for killing White since his behavior was determined by the actions of the neuroscientists. In Cases 2 and 3, Plum is causally determined to undertake the same reasoning process as in Case 1, but in Case 2 Plum is merely programmed to do so by neuroscientists (rather than having been created by them), and in Case 3 Plum’s reasoning is the result of socio-cultural influences that determine his character. In Case 4, Plum is just a normal human being in a causally deterministic universe, and he decides to kill White in the same way as in the previous cases.

Pereboom claims that there is no relevant difference between Cases 1, 2, and 3 such that our judgments about Plum’s responsibility should be different in these three cases. Furthermore, the reason that Plum is not responsible in these cases seems to be that, in each case, his behavior is causally determined by forces beyond his control (Pereboom 2001: 116). But then we should conclude that Plum is not responsible in Case 4 (since causal determinism is the defining feature of that case). And since, in Case 4, Plum is just a normal human being in a causally deterministic universe, the conclusion we draw about him should extend to all other normal persons in causally deterministic universes. (For an important, related manipulation argument, see Mele’s “zygote argument” in Mele 1995, 2006b, and 2008.)

Pereboom’s argument has inspired a number of objections. For example, it could be argued that in Case 1, the manipulation to which Plum is subject undermines his responsibility for some reason besides the fact that the manipulation causally determines his behavior, which would stop the generalization from Case 1 to the subsequent cases (Fischer 2004, Mele 2005, Demetriou 2010; for a response to this line of argument, see Matheson 2016; Pereboom addresses this concern in his 2014 presentation of the argument; also see Shabo 2010). Alternatively, it might be argued, on compatibilist grounds, that Plum is responsible in Case 4, and this conclusion might be extended to the earlier cases since Plum fulfills the same compatibilist-friendly conditions on responsibility in those cases (McKenna 2008).

The four-case argument attempts to show that if determinism is true, then we cannot be the sources of our actions in the way required for moral responsibility. It is, therefore, an argument for incompatibilism rather than for skepticism about moral responsibility. But, in combination with Pereboom’s argument that we lack the sort of free will required for responsibility even if determinism is false (2001: 38–88; 2014: 30–70), the four-case argument has emerged as an important part of a detailed and influential skeptical perspective. For other skeptical accounts, see Caruso (2016), Smilansky (2000), Waller (2011); also see the entry on skepticism about moral responsibility.

3.3.4 The Epistemic Condition on Responsibility

There has been a recent surge in interest in the epistemic, or knowledge, condition on responsibility (as opposed to the freedom or control condition that is at the center of the free will debate). In this context, the following epistemic argument for skepticism about responsibility has been developed. (In certain structural respects, the argument resembles Galen Strawson’s skeptical argument discussed in §3.3.2.)

Sometimes agents act in ignorance of the likely bad consequences of their actions, and sometimes their ignorance excuses them from blame for so acting. But in other cases, an agent’s ignorance might not excuse him. How can we distinguish the cases where ignorance excuses from those in which it does not? One proposal is that ignorance fails to excuse when the ignorance is itself something for which an agent might be blamed. And one proposal for when ignorance is blameworthy is that it issues from a blameworthy benighting act in which an agent culpably impairs, or fails to improve, his own epistemic position (H. Smith 1983). In such a case, the agent’s ignorance seems to be his own fault, so it cannot be appealed to in order to excuse the agent.

But when is a benighting act blameworthy? Several philosophers have suggested that we are culpable for benighting acts only when we engage in them knowing that we are doing so and knowing that we should not do so (Levy 2011, Rosen 2004, M. Zimmerman 1997). Ultimately, the suggestion is that ignorance for which one is blameworthy, and that leads to blameworthy unwitting wrongdoing, has its source in knowing wrongful behavior. Thus, if someone unwittingly does something wrong, then that person will be blameworthy only if we can explain his lack of knowledge (his “unwittingness”) by reference to something else that he knowingly did wrong.

Consider an example from Gideon Rosen (2004) in which a surgeon orders her patient to be transfused with the wrong type of blood, and suppose that the surgeon was unaware that she was making this mistake. According to Rosen, the surgeon will be blameworthy for harming her patient only if she is blameworthy for being ignorant about the patient’s blood type when she requests the transfusion, and she will be blameworthy for this only if her ignorance stems from some instance in which the surgeon knowingly failed to do something that she ought to have done to avoid her later ignorance. It won’t, for example, be enough that the surgeon’s ignorance is explained by her failure to doublecheck the patient’s medical records. In order to ground blame, this omission on the surgeon’s part must itself have been culpable, which requires that the surgeon knew that this omission was wrong. And if the surgeon wasn’t aware that she was committing a wrongful omission (when she failed to doublecheck her patient’s medical records), then this failure of knowledge on the surgeon’s part must be explained by some prior culpable—that is, knowing—act or omission. In the end, for Rosen,

the only possible locus of original responsibility [for a later unwitting act] is an akratic act…. a knowing sin. (2004: 307; emphasis in original)

Similarly, Michael Zimmerman argues that

all culpability can be traced to culpability that involves lack of ignorance, that is, that involves a belief on the agent’s part that he or she is doing something morally wrong. (1997: 418)

The above reasoning may apply not just to cases in which a person is unaware of the consequences of her action, but also to cases in which a person is unaware of the moral status of her behavior. A slaveowner, for example, might think that slaveholding is permissible, and so, on the account considered here, he will be blameworthy only if he is culpable for his ignorance about the moral status of slavery, which will require, for example, that he ignored evidence about its moral status while knowing that this is something he should not do (Rosen 2003 and 2004).

These reflections can give rise to a couple forms of skepticism about moral responsibility (and particularly about blameworthiness). First, we might come to endorse a form of epistemic skepticism on the grounds that we rarely have insight into whether a wrongdoer was akratic—that is, was a knowing wrongdoer—at some suitable point in the etiology of a given action (Rosen 2004). Alternatively, or in addition, one might endorse a more substantive form of skepticism on the grounds that a great many normal wrongdoers don’t exhibit the sort of knowing wrongdoing supposedly required for responsibility. In other words, perhaps very many wrongdoers don’t know that they are wrongdoers and their ignorance on this score is not their fault since it doesn’t arise from an appropriate earlier instance of knowing wrongdoing. In this case, very many ordinary wrongdoers may fail to be morally responsible for their behavior. (For skeptical suggestions along these lines, see M. Zimmerman 1997 and Levy 2011.)

There is more to the epistemic dimension of responsibility than what is contained in the above skeptical argument, but the argument does bring out a lot of what is of interest in this domain. For one thing, it prominently relies on a tracing strategy. This strategy is used, for example, in accounts that feature a person who does not, at the time of action, fulfill control or knowledge conditions on responsibility, but who nonetheless seems morally responsible for her behavior. In such a case, the agent’s responsibility may be grounded in the fact that her failure to fulfill certain conditions on responsibility is traceable to earlier actions undertaken by the agent when she did fulfill these conditions. For example, a person may be so intoxicated that she lacks control over, or awareness of, her behavior, and yet it may still be appropriate to hold her responsible for her intoxicated behavior insofar as she freely took steps to intoxicate herself. The tracing strategy plays an important role in many accounts of responsibility (see, e.g., Fischer & Ravizza 1998: 49–51), but it has also been subjected to important criticisms (see Vargas 2005; for a reply see Fischer and Tognazzini 2009; for more on tracing, see Khoury 2012, King 2014, Shabo 2015, and Timpe 2011).

Various strategies for rejecting the above skeptical argument also illustrate stances one can take on the relevance of knowledge for responsibility. These strategies typically involve rejecting the claim that knowing wrongdoing is fundamental to blameworthiness. For example, it might be argued that it is often morally reckless to perform actions when one is merely uncertain whether they are wrong, and that this recklessness is sufficient for blameworthiness (see Guerrero 2007; also see Nelkin & Rickless 2017b and Robichaud 2014). Another strategy would be to argue that blameworthiness can be grounded in cases of morally ignorant wrongdoing if it is reasonable to expect the wrongdoer to have avoided her moral ignorance, and particularly if her ignorance is itself caused by the agent’s own epistemic and moral vices (FitzPatrick 2008 and 2017). Relatedly, it might be argued that one who is unaware that he does wrong is blameworthy if he possessed relevant capacities for avoiding his failure of awareness; this approach may be particularly promising in cases in which an agent’s lack of moral awareness stems from a failure to remember her moral duties (Clarke 2014, 2017 and Sher 2006b, 2009; also see Rudy-Hiller 2017). Finally, it might simply be claimed that morally ignorant wrongdoers can harbor, and express through their behavior, objectionable attitudes or qualities of will that suffice for blameworthiness (Arpaly 2003, Björnsson 2017, Harman 2011, Mason 2015, Talbert 2013). This approach may be most promising in cases in which a wrongdoer is aware of the material outcomes of her conduct but unaware of the fact that she does wrong in bringing about those outcomes.

For more, see the entry on the epistemic condition for moral responsibility.


The special issues of Midwest Studies in Philosophy cited in the Introduction are Volume 30 (2006) and Volume 38 (2014), Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press.

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I would like to thank Derk Pereboom for his helpful comments on drafts of this entry.

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