Ernst Bloch

First published Wed Jan 25, 2023

Ernst Bloch (1885–1977) was a German philosopher and cultural critic who is mostly credited for renewing the interest in utopia and for mediating between the radical philosophy of emancipation, non-dogmatic religious thought, analysis of mass culture, and new aesthetic forms, notably those of Expressionism. His books, especially The Principle of Hope (1954–1959), contributed to a particular form of critical theory and, being written in a peculiar essayistic style, made him quite popular both in academic and non-academic circles. Bloch was an important voice among the intelligentsia of Weimar Germany and then, for a short period after the Second World war, the leading philosopher of the Eastern Germany. However, he quickly became a “deviator” for the Marxist ideologists. Beyond the Eastern bloc, he made a profound impact on utopian studies, theology, and aesthetics of the previous century, but also, generally, on political philosophy and critical theory. Bloch’s leftist orientation and the optimistic account of hope made him a critic of existentialist thought, despite many genealogical and stylistic affinities to it. Basing on Hegel and Marx, but also drawing on many other intellectual traditions, Bloch sought to formulate the ontology and political philosophy for uncertain and open-ended world. This was reflected in his “utopian hermeneutics” seeking to uncover the unfinishedness, the “not yet” in any phenomenon of nature or culture; in his sensitivity to the immediacy of human existence (inspired, in part, by the phenomenological movement) and to the various forms of mass culture; and in his attempts to reformulate Marxism as an utopian project of humanization of nature/naturalization of humans. The experience of utopian non-identity is elevated to the level of the ontological principle: “S is not yet P”, and the human quest for emancipation is grounded in the unfulfilled state of being itself.

1. Short biography

Ernst Bloch was born on the eighth of July 1885 in Ludwigshafen am Rhein, to a family of a railway employee, almost fully alien to academic life. But this did not upset his early interest in philosophy, supported and reinforced by his experiences in the library and the theater of the neighboring city of Mannheim, as well as by his correspondence with important thinkers of the time (Ernst Mach, Theodor Lipps, Eduard von Hartmann and Wilhelm Windelband). Between 1905 and 1908 Bloch studied philosophy (but also physics and musical theory as minors) in Munich and Würzburg, eventually defending his doctoral dissertation, later published under the title Critical Reflections on Heinrich Rickert and the Problem of the Modern Theory of Knowledge (Bloch 1909). He then moved to Berlin, where he participated in the private colloquium around Georg Simmel between 1908 and 1911, and to Heidelberg (between 1912 and 1914), where the circle around Max Weber was Bloch’s main attraction. In these years, a close friendship with Georg Lukács played a prominent role in Bloch’s intellectual development—something Lukács also acknowledged for himself while recollecting the encounter with Bloch.

During the World War I, Bloch lived in Swiss exile: he firmly opposed the war from the beginning, thus radically differing from most German intellectuals at that time. In Switzerland, he was working on his first major book, The Spirit of Utopia (1918 [2000]). Its general spiritualist sentiment was very much due to his first wife, Else Bloch-von Stritzki, a devoted Christian. This book contained, as a relatively autonomous part, Bloch’s most extensive work on the philosophy of music. Another project was a book on formal logic (Bloch 1985c: 253), which remained a manuscript and was lost in the 1930s (Zudeick 1985). Parallel to this work, Bloch was active as a politically engaged public intellectual (Bloch 1923 [1964]; 1985a), criticizing both the militarist Germany and the authoritarian bolshevist Soviet Russia (Franz 1985). In 1919, he went back to Berlin, where he lived most of the years till 1933, with long stays in Munich, Paris, and in different places in Italy and France. In these years Bloch, being both a Jew and an unorthodox thinker, had no prospects for an academic career in Germany and mostly worked as a free essayist (Bloch 2007). The major writings from that period include an historically and philosophically informed biography Thomas Müntzer as Theologian of Revolution (1921 [GA 2]); the new, 1923 edition of The Spirit of Utopia (of which the ultimate version appeared in 1964, see Bloch 1918 [2000], [GA 3]); Traces (1930 [2006], [GA 1]), the collection of essays, anecdotes and short stories, mostly dating back to the 1910s; and the book on politics and ideology Heritage of Our Times (1935 [1991], [GA 4]). In the 1930s, Bloch was also working on a long systematic manuscript on the theory and history of materialism (Theory-Praxis of Matter), parts of which were eventually published in 1972 as The Problem of Materialism, Its History and Substance (GA 7) and in 2000 as The Logos of Matter (Bloch 2000a).

In 1933, Bloch had to flee to Switzerland, and began roaming around Europe (Vienna, Paris, Prague), not least because his wife, Karola, was active as a secret agent of German and Austrian communist party. At that time, he became a resolute Marxist (Bloch 1972b) and even paid tribute to the Stalinist hysteria by supporting the show trials of 1937–1938. Still, in 1938 he emigrated not to the Soviet Union, as did Lukács, but to the United States. There, he lived (in New York; Marlborough, New Hampshire; and, in 1942–1949, in Cambridge, Massachusetts) concentrated on writing and isolated both from the American intellectual scene (he hardly spoke English) and from his fellow emigrés (his relations with Adorno’s and Horkheimer’s Institute of Social Research were strained). In 1949, Bloch moved with his family to the newly formed German Democratic Republic to teach philosophy at the University of Leipzig (Bloch 1985b). His magnum opus written mostly in the US, The Principle of Hope, was published there and in West Germany in 1954–59 (GA 5).

Though enthusiastic in the beginning, having received some academic recognition, Bloch came increasingly under pressure and, from 1957 on, when he was made emeritus, was facing a total isolation, while his philosophy was declared reactionary. The loyalty to Communist power he had been demonstrating, sometimes in quite conformist ways, since the 1930s, did not change much in the fact that his thinking was clearly at odds with the official Marxist doctrine (Caysa et al. 1992). In 1961, while being on holiday and having learned about the building of the Berlin Wall, Bloch decided to stay in West Germany and to make, as he formulated himself a bit later, the leap from the realm of necessity into the realm of freedom (interview with J. Rühle 1964, in Traub & Wieser 1975: 21). Bloch then became, not without difficulties, a guest professor at the University of Tübingen. There, he was teaching and working on the edition of his complete works (published in 1959–1978). In these years, his work became widely known, he received numerous awards and honorary degrees, was active as a public speaker (Bloch 1980) and became an icon of the German Left. In 1961, Natural Law and Human Dignity was published (GA 6), completed in the beginning of the 1940s (see Bloch 1985c: 528), followed by other key systematic and historical texts, such as Tübingen Introduction to Philosophy (1963/64, GA 13), Atheism in Christianity (1968, GA 14), and Experimentum Mundi (1975, GA 15). Bloch remained politically active throughout this last period of his life. He died on the fourth of August 1977 in Tübingen.

2. Bloch’s Ontology of the Unfinished

2.1 The Core Ideas of Utopian Philosophy

Bloch’s philosophy is guided by the interest in the ontologically grounded incompleteness of the world and the associated drive towards the future. Genuine future, for Bloch, is radically uncertain: it is something that has never been before (GA 13: 228; Bloch 1954–59 [1986a: 1375f.]). One could think about this perspective as an attempt to formulate the specific relation of being and time, in which the future becomes constitutive modus of being (and of the present). The main philosophical question to be answered would then be: how can the future, or utopia, be present—as objective possibility—and recognized—as anticipation (Holz 1975)? Philosophy’s major task, for Bloch, becomes the exploration of the possibilities inherent in our world, and the ontological formula proper to it is “S is not yet P,” meaning that reality (or matter) is in the process of predication, and the world itself is on the move searching for its essence. This short formula captures both the transitory, processual character of being, and the negativity associated with this process.[1]

As an open-ended process, a Not-Yet in the presence, reality must be grasped both as unfinished and in its entirety. Even when a wish is fulfilled, when the dream comes true, there is an irreducible remainder to it that does not let one completely satisfied. The major problem for Bloch’s philosophy is thus to find the ways the future, that becomes the key dimension of time,[2] could still be discovered, recognized, and explored as part of the present. This dynamic moment is also referred to as an “utopian function”. The notion of utopia is so central in Bloch precisely because it captures this anticipatory drive of realizing something qualitatively new (novum), but doing it not in an “abstract” way, as merely an invocation of a general normative ideal, but rather in a form of immanent critique and thus of a dialectical mediation, something Bloch calls “concrete utopia”. The object of anticipation, or what Bloch later described as “Ultimum”, is a reality of non-alienated, non-exploitative relations of humans among each other and with the nature. Bloch’s philosophy is loaded with this normative meaning of the directedness towards the unity of the ideal and the real.

Bloch thus conceives of the world as a utopian whole. In this ontological conception, logic also plays its role—not as the beginning of knowledge, for Bloch insists on wonder and amazement as its beginning (see below),—but in its heuristic function formalizing and structuring the categories needed to grasp a complex changing reality (Bloch 2000a). Bloch’s “speculative materialism” understands matter as “real possibility” (Bloch 1954–59 [1986a: 235f.]), natura naturans, which does not require an external formal determination, but rather bears its future within itself. Matter is thus historicized. “Speculative” implies that matter, the source of radical novelty, is the concept that relates to the totality of the world, and not just to its single aspect (Moir 2019b). It is this ontological reference that defines Bloch’s key insight: utopia is not a “mere” phantasy, since it is the whole world, which is dreaming, or “venturing beyond”.

However, early Bloch tries to grasp this dimension of the future mostly by referring to the subjectivity (“soul”, as he calls it in The Spirit of Utopia or “revolutionary magic of the subject”, as in Thomas Müntzer) and community of those who should fulfill the utopian promise the world gives to itself. In his first books Bloch speaks a spiritualist, prophetic, performative language and draws heavily on the wealth of mystical—in particular, gnostic—traditions, in a paradoxical attempt to synthesize them with Marxist materialism (Christen 1979). This focus on subjective anticipation led Adorno to remark that Bloch’s key argument is akin to an ontological proof: the very presence and persistence of utopian anticipation, the very desire to transcend the status quo supports the idea that the world is pregnant with unrealized possibilities (Bloch 1988: 16).

The important starting point for Bloch’s philosophy is, in various forms, the subjective experience of non-identity and fragility that goes under the names of “darkness of the lived moment” or “the shape of inconstruable question” (denoting the impossibility of formulating the ultimate metaphysical problem without relying on a pre-given solution) (Czajka 2006). Bloch emphasizes the non-availability of the very core of our existence and the associated feeling of lack. Human consciousness can never fully experience itself and cannot immediately grasp the full meaning of its momentary state (1969 [GA 10: 74, 145f.]). The darkness of the future serves as the objective counterpart of this experience.

Dealing with the phenomena of temporality—along with the episodes of amazement (Staunen) or estrangement (Verfremdung)—should demonstrate how the perceived reality, as well as the traditional epistemology that assumes it fixed and given, can be destabilized and open to intentional anticipatory praxis. Bloch considers temporality in its qualitative, intensive dimension, it is attached to—and is, in its very definition, dependent on—what is happening existentially and historically (GA 13: 129, 138; see also Holz 1975; Hartmann 2012). For Bloch, unlike in the philosophies of durée, the discontinuity of time and its social conditionality are decisive (Levinas 1976). While estrangement demonstrates the falsity of the given context, the amazement, that is as ineffable and as transient as the darkness of the lived moment (Bloch 1918 [2000: 199f.]), reveals the final identity of subject and object.

Later, Bloch formulated the notion of “front” as the most actual moment of the process that often requires our ability to grasp new opportunities (Siebers 2012). For Bloch’s idea of temporality, the concept of fulfilled moment is also important, for this is the moment that is being anticipated in many utopian projections. The intensity of Bloch’s early thinking rests on the unresolved contradiction between the insistence on full immediate presence of the utopian (primarily of ethical nature, such as the self-evidence of the good), and the impossibility to fully grasp, articulate, and appropriate it.

In the later work, Bloch is more systematic in putting together his philosophical intuitions, and less radical in staging the epiphanies of the world’s utopian goal. For example, he tries to codify different levels of a “possibility” (Bloch 1954–59 [1986a: Ch. 18]). But even later, in the Tübingen Introduction to Philosophy, the starting point of his reflection is an existential human drive (hunger). Bloch then describes this process of realization in a more abstract form as a way from the That (Daß), an active potency, to its product, the What (Was). The structures of objective world come to themselves via the “subjective factor”. It is this critical subjectivity that helps escape the reification of various structures of reality and allows to study it in its processual complexity (Bloch 2000a), and it is this subjective intervention that is called for in the open-ended process, because its outcome is uncertain and dependent on this human praxis (Gekle 1986). Bloch envisions a mutual dialectical mediation of the subjective and the objective (“naturalization of human and humanization of nature”, see Raulet 1982) and maintains that the matter moves on a higher level when comprehended and mediated by human practical consciousness that emerges within it, the laboring individual as its potentiality (Bloch 1954–59 [1986a: 261]). As Bloch puts it, the human is the answer to the world-as-question, whereby this question itself is understood in all its existential intensity. This emergence of consciousness and freedom (Moir 2019b) itself reflects the inherent disposition within matter as an open process, its autonomous activity, something Bloch gladly inherits from the “apocryphal” traditions of materialism—“left” Aristotelianism (Bloch 1952 [2018]) and Renaissance thinkers, notably Giordano Bruno, but also Schelling (Habermas 1969/1970). As Bloch reads this tradition, the creation of the world is not a wholly external act, but a “self-movement, self-fertilization of the matter of God” (Bloch 1954–59 [1986a: 236]). The utopian process for Bloch is also a realization of the “realizing element” (cf. Bloch 1954–59 [1986a: ch. 20]; GA 15, ch. 49), a fulfillment of an active subjectivity. In Bloch’s ontology—that can always be also read as an anthropology (Siebers 2013)—the redemption of nature and of the human being are thus presupposing each other.

Following various strands of philosophy, Bloch thus develops a qualitative vision of nature, he conceives nature as a creative drive towards the realization of the possible (or latency), a drive that can be understood with the concept of nature-subject (Natursubjekt), something that could be reproached as anthropomorphism (Habermas 1969/1970). A nature-subject itself remains an internal impulse, an “immanent agency” (Moir 2013: 128f.) within the material world (Bloch 1954–59 [1986a: 673]). To put it in aesthetic terminology, Bloch reminds us that the landscape—a human creation—is a potentiality of nature. The chance for a better outcome in the history of nature is not only dependent on the human activity but is—qua this activity—the potentiality of nature itself.

The concept of hope captures the universal anticipatory drive in human and non-human world—as permeated by futurity. For Bloch, hope is self-consciousness of human praxis (Holz 1975) that needs an ontological foundation. Many hopes can turn out to be illusions, but even illusory hopes can give indications to some very real human wishes and drives. Hope aims at something uncertain and often beyond the control of the actor (Tegtmeyer 2012), and thus can always be disappointed. It is this uncertainty that made Riedel (1994) interpret Bloch’s early philosophy as a form of a postmodern “weak thought” in the spirit of Vattimo (1985 [1988]), a thought that refuses to seek prior transcendent foundations for itself.

The inherent openness of the object of hope is—unlike the existential fear, which, Bloch remarks, can also anticipate,—enabling, rather than limiting the human capacities, because this is the uncertainty of potentialities, that, despite being often disappointed, never cease to exist (Vidal 2012). Bloch distinguishes hope from quietism and thinks of it as a practical, transformative attitude to the world. As such, it cannot be blind and “abstract”, but should be grounded in objective real tendencies, something that also precludes Bloch from embracing an absolute contingency of the future.

An important anthropological dimension of Bloch’s ontology is the idea of the “Not-Yet-Conscious”, which Bloch would then oppose to the Freudian emphasis on the unconscious as something “no longer conscious”, or repressed. In this critique, Bloch assumes that the unconscious is merely quantitatively different from the conscious, complementing it—and not a completely, qualitatively different domain that limits the conscious, as Freud believed (Gekle 1986). Unlike Freud, Bloch is more interested in the ways human desires and drives contribute to the political emancipatory praxis. He accuses Freud of a tautological closedness associated with his understanding of the unconscious: for Bloch, Freud’s psychoanalysis aims at merely reconstructing what has already been, or recollecting, instead of venturing towards the radical and unsettling novelty of the Not-Yet. Similar critique is voiced against Plato or Bergson (Bloch 1954–59 [1986a]), but most significantly, in Subjekt-Objekt, against Hegel’s dialectics as “anamnesis” (1951 [GA 8]). The general pattern of this critique is the distrust toward the arguments that explain phenomena by grounding them in a deeper essential principle, whereby the principle itself, as eternal truth, remains posited and unchanged. Even in Hegel Bloch finds a fetishization of the logical idea and the tendency to closure, reducing the ontological process to the static construction of the idealistic absolute.

2.2 Some of Bloch’s intellectual origins and affinities

Bloch’s philosophy is shaped by many previous traditions: he inherits his account of matter from Aristotle and “Left Aristotelianism”; his notions of tendencies and drives are inspired by Leibniz’ idea of appetitus that denotes the mode of the future’s existence within the present; Bloch’s insistence on immanent objectivity has Spinoza as one of its origins; the primacy of practical reason, given the fundamental non-transparency of the world, and the appreciation of the non-empirical, non-deterministic reality of normativity are for Bloch associated with Kant; his critical perspective on reality as consisting of self-transcending social entities and practices is prompted by Hegel and Marx; his appreciation of a primordial intensity and contingency, a pre-logical being that precedes and goes beyond the logic or reason, as an irreducible remainder, is following Schelling; his process thinking, the urgency to engage with the irrational, or the Dionysian, the belief in the expressive powers of language, as well as Bloch’s optimism were reflecting his early fascination with Nietzsche; his attention to everyday experiences and mundane cultural forms, as well as to the importance of an “individual law”, was shaped by Simmel.[3]

Hegel’s perspective is also crucial for Bloch’s epistemology. The process of knowing is essentially reconsidered as a process of self-understanding, or self-articulation, of the open world (Cunico 2000). The epistemic categories are thus the forms of existence, but instead of spirit Bloch deals with matter. Since this material world is unfinished, his epistemology also implies the active involvement in the world, a network of concepts referring to each other (Holz 1975), without stable definitions, but rather as being the outcomes of dialectical processes. It is also by recourse to dialectics that Bloch is trying to resolve the difficulty of grasping radical novelty, while maintaining that it has not been revealed. Bloch often uses the dialectical figures of mediation in, e.g., willing to synthesize Kant and Hegel in The Spirit of Utopia (Bloch 1918 [2000: 185f.]), or utopias of freedom (as advanced by Thomas More) and order (envisioned by Tommaso Campanella) in The Principle of Hope (Bloch 1954–59 [1986a: 528f.]). But Bloch eventually wants to go beyond Hegel because he lacks there the true novelty, the openness, and sees in it the reduction of the existential experience to the movement of the totality (something Bloch also bemoans in the most advanced piece of Hegelian Marxism he was exposed to, namely, Lukács’ History and Class Consciousness) (Hudson 1982).

Bloch’s attention to existential experiences and his tendency, in his aesthetic essays, to reflect on specific, rich thingness (like that of an old pitcher in The Spirit of Utopia) prompt parallels to Heidegger—to the point that Bloch was sometimes even referred to as a left-­wing Heidegger. Moreover, the political proclivities of Heidegger are paralleled in Bloch’s Stalinist posture of the 1930s (Münster 1987; Zipes 2019). Indeed, Bloch poses the question of being as early as 1918 and tries to answer it with the focus on human existence (Riedel 1994), while Heidegger’s gives priority to the future in his analysis of temporality (Levinas 1976). But for Heidegger, the feeling of thrownness and the existential fear (Angst) are central affects pertaining to the future, which is obviously opposed to Bloch’s idea of futurity. Bloch’s Heimat, unlike Heidegger’s, is something to be anticipated, as a horizon of the utopian movement, and not something that precedes our experience as its lost foundation (Habermas 1969/1970; Korstvedt 2010), it is, moreover, something one needs to actively precipitate and not passively expect.

2.3 Preliminary outlook

Bloch’s writing style is unorthodox: he prefers to begin with laconic phrases, resembling/striving to become aphorisms, and indulges in metaphors while often avoiding precise definitions. The ultimate aim of this philosophy cast in “open-ended essays” (Holz 1975) is to decipher the not-yet-uncovered utopian elements of the world by showing—somewhat performatively (Siebers 2013) and privileging style over (not fully available) content (Edwards 2013)—how various concepts work as applied to particular cultural domains, rather than by building a logically coherent theoretical system.[4] Indeed, such a system’s closedness would contradict Bloch’s main ontological stance that implies spelling out the tensions, rather than resolving them (Adorno 1980).

Utopian anticipation plays an ambiguous role in Bloch’s philosophy. On the one hand, it attaches special meanings to different elements of material and social reality, to various fragments of nature and history and thus serves, teleologically, as a unifying normative force (1951 [GA 8: 487]), sometimes creating the impression that Bloch overemphasizes the unity of futurity for its own sake (Eagleton 2015). On the other hand, it suspends any given form or entity as experimental and preliminary, emphasizes the risk of fetishizing the utopian goal, the teleology of the pre-given plan, and insists on the impossibility to fully construe the new from the old, on radical incompleteness of any achieved state or any present process (Lyotard 1976). The problem of the absolute is re-stated by Bloch as the non-availability of the future and even of the tools to fully grasp it. Crucially, this incompleteness also entails a permanent risk of failure, which again, dialectically, is just an opposite side of a fundamental instability and mutability of our world (Bloch characteristically calls things Auszugsgestalten ihrer selbst, “forms of departure from themselves” [Bloch 1954–59 [1986a: 1345]]). In this sense, the question: where does utopia go? Or What is the eschatological aim of the utopian process?—is both necessary and unanswerable. It should be asked for defining the normative orientation of hope and for establishing a proper critical function of “concrete utopia”. But its answer is never perfect, either. In the state of absolute fulfillment, there is no place for utopian philosophy. This philosophy is subject to its own critical scrutiny, its aims are only formulated in the process, and its business itself is never complete. That is why the original title of The Principle of Hope was Dreams of a Better Life, not of a best life. This negative dialectical vision makes Bloch not a Hegelian of a system (indeed, he attacked “the system” when it was associated with East European “socialist” unfreedom), but a Hegelian of a promise.

3. Ethics, political philosophy, and philosophy of religion

3.1 General ideas in practical philosophy

In view of Bloch’s ontology, the central aim of his practical philosophy is to free the world to its radically, qualitatively new possibilities. In this, the critical and normative function of utopia plays a major role (Levitas 1990; Moir 2019b): humans are defined as inherently utopian beings (GA 13: 239); the world is amenable to change through human praxis; and the subjective utopian drive paired with objective tendencies condition this processual vision. In fact, Bloch’s whole philosophy is the investigation into various forms of practical intentionality—or, as Habermas (1969/1970) puts it, the way to redress Schellingian idea of potencies in a Marxist interpretation: in Bloch, a working socialized human being realizing these potencies comes central stage. Bloch’s ontological emphasis on natura naturans is paralleled by the centrality of the productive force in the ontology of society (Bloch 2000a). It is this historical intersubjective dimension, always accompanying existential experience and prompting it to active transformation of its world, that, Bloch believes, makes his philosophy so different from Heidegger’s. Even his early spiritualist attempts focusing on subjectivity are always accompanied by the dialectical complement of worldly realization. Bloch’s mysticism—as well as his ontology—was thus always political, it is used to stage the existential presence of the forthcoming freedom.

The world Bloch wants to liberate is the world of capitalist estrangement, which, in his Marxist phase, is also described as a meaningless “hollow space”. In it, the conflicts are due to the inherently unjust, class based social structure and private property. In the classless kingdom of the future, based on “morals without property” (GA 15: 188), neither nature nor technology will be alienated from or alienating for humans (Bloch also explores an emancipatory potential in technological utopias). The prevailing attitude would then be that of affectedness (Betroffenheit) (GA 9: 56).

Bloch’s commitment to Marxism is visible already in his early work (it is present in The Spirit of Utopia), but was never orthodox. The urge to emancipation, the critical perspective on the human social praxis, and the focus on the laboring individual as the major motor of history were the elements of Marxist doctrine Bloch was mostly keen to adopt. Indeed, only after Marx, Bloch believed, utopia became “concrete”. Bloch’s major theoretical proposal was to complement what he termed “cold stream” in Marxism (analysis of objective social conditions) with the “warm stream” of utopian “surplus”. Bloch was thus criticizing the lack of a normative and imaginative dimension in Marxist philosophy. His ultimate aim was not to find its way into Marxism, but rather to locate, in an Hegelian fashion, Marxist ideas in a broader realm of utopian thought.

3.2 Ethics

Early Bloch re-interprets Kantian postulates—immortality, freedom, and existence of God—as utopias (GA Erg. Bd.: 318; Bloch 1918 [2000: 179]) and thus gives ethics an ontological meaning, stresses the normativity of being, which itself becomes a promise of utopia (see Schiller 1982, Tegtmeyer 2012). The very idea of the utopian is, for the early Bloch, immediately apparent (Riedel 1994: 139 calls his position ethical intuitionism) and normative at the same time, while Kantian “thing in itself” is reinterpreted as “objective phantasy”, that is, creative anticipation (1969 [GA 10: 133]; Bloch 1918 [2000: 201]). Kant’s imperative is important for Bloch insofar as “the moral As If really appears” there “as a theological Not Yet” (Bloch 1918 [2000: 177]).

Bloch rethinks the idea of revolutionary violence and, in his early work, suggests that in a state of exception, that is, in fighting the injustice of authority, the non-action can represent a bigger evil than a violent resistance. He thus offers another attempt—a parallel to the one suggested by Lukács—of moral legitimization of revolutionary violence and of a politicization of ethics, calling it “a categorical imperative with revolver in hand” (Bloch 1918 [2000: 242]). The community perspective is important here: for Bloch, in certain historical periods, non-resistance to evil can be contagious and debilitating, and Bloch’s Müntzer condemns the passivity precisely because of the present lack of universal emancipation (1921 [GA 2: 174]). In The Principle of Hope, Bloch develops this idea in a questionable hierarchization of ideals and suggests that “lower” ideas could be temporarily sacrificed in view of the highest one, the classless society (Bloch 1954–59 [1986a: 173]). However, elsewhere Bloch retreats from this radicalism and, in criticizing Pashukanis’ Marxist theory of law claims that

it is not a matter of finding a substitute for morals, such as turning the struggle for a better society itself into a morality and saying that morality is only a tautology for this struggle, or that this struggle is the only authentic one. (Bloch 1961 [1986b: 241]; see Riedel 1994)

Generally, Bloch’s critical utopian posture, his belief that the foundations of morality cannot be fully evident and fully sublated by the overarching totalizing political goal (as early Lukács believed), something that Bloch thematizes as a fundamental obscurity of the human soul, functioned as a counterweight to moral absolutism in his ethical thinking.

3.3 Theory of History and Non-Contemporaneity

Applied to the social and political realm, the dynamic ontological vision of Bloch’s philosophy makes it particularly focused on temporality and non-identity: in the world of the Not-Yet, what matters is the still unfulfilled promises (heritage) of the past, and the unrealized possibilities awaiting the society in the future. Bloch’s vision of history is built on the idea of its open-ended processuality and heterogeneity of historical time—something that brings Bloch quite close to Walter Benjamin.[5] Indeed, Bloch criticized a linear model of historical progress as early as his dissertation (Mendes-Flohr 1983; Pelletier 2019).

This view is most pronounced in Heritage of Our Times, the book, in which Bloch developed a theory of non-contemporaneity (or non-synchronicity, Ungleichzeitigkeit) claiming that various temporalities can co-exist within one historical period[6] and that past consciousness and being can still be present in the present (Rabinbach 1977; Dietschy 2012). This theory captures the heterogeneity of historical time and emphasizes the unsettled elements of the past as promises of yet unrealized possibilities—something Bloch also paradigmatically develops in his book on Thomas Müntzer. There, he develops the idea of actualization—another name of “self-encounter” or affectedness— whereby the concepts and the figures of history re-emerge on the scene to fulfill the revolutionary promise.

The synchronicity of the non-synchronous is opposed to the linear developmental vision of history that took shape in the Enlightenment. Bloch’s idea helps relativize this vision of progress. The heterogeneity of historical time gives voices to the plurality of historical temporalities, including non-Western societies. It is connected to the fundamental non-identity of individual experience: an individual is never contemporaneous to herself. Various social formations—such as nations, geographical regions, classes, or institutional logics—could be non-contemporaneous as such—and to each other. Various non-contemporaneous elements could both block the work of emancipation and help revitalize it after its alleged defeat. Non-contemporaneity is the proper concept for the utopian vision of society, permeated by revolutionary discontinuities.

Bloch’s theory of modernity developed in Heritage of our Times aims to explain the success of Nazi ideology by demonstrating how it could incorporate the suppressed non-contemporaneous elements (the ideas of a nation or kingdom [Reich]). By suggesting, in his review of Lukács’ History and Class Consciousness, to move, in Marxist dialectics, from the concept of totality to the concepts of a sphere (GA 10), Bloch in fact tries to rethink the social analysis as a conglomerate of heterogenous temporalities that, however, interact with, oppose, and constitute each other. At times, he appears to wish to overcome the non-contemporaneity in the vision of a true presence, which should be utopian and dialectically mediated by the future:

[C]ontemporaneity is not such if it is not also super-contemporaneous; it is not the capitalist of the uncontrolled, changeable Today who stands at par with the real present but only the knower and controller of the Tomorrow in the Today together, in short, the active Marxist. (Bloch 1935 [1991: 195f.])

Bloch’s ideal of super-contemporaneity thus means embracing the intensity of the future in the present.

In the fight against the new conservatism, the non-contemporaneous social groups—urban bourgeoisie, white-collar workers, peasants, youth—should play a specific role, often overlooked by textbook versions of historical materialism that only focused on the conflict between capitalists and industrial workers. Bloch criticizes the narrow economistic version of historical materialism already in the book on Müntzer, by making recourse to Max Weber. In Heritage of Our Times, he argues that German fascists could exploit the anti-capitalist utopian tendencies in these social strata and re-function them in their conservative political propaganda, thus mobilizing the energy of the non-contemporaneity, which should be regained by the more inclusive left.[7]

Bloch thus criticized overly positivist tendencies in Marxism (what Lenin dubbed “stupid materialism”, see on that Levitas 2012) that tended to dismiss all kinds of “irrational” elements precisely at the point where and when it was critical to engage with them. The same happens in capitalist society, where these elements tend to be repressed by the capitalist “contemporaneity”. In co-opting them, Bloch follows the basic dialectical strategy, forging a new synthesis with the other—with something heterogeneous to capitalist or Marxist rationality. The promises and claims from the past serve both as explanatory elements and as normative justifications for the new practical engagement with the “heritage” Bloch finds so crucial.

3.4 Bloch on Natural Law

One particularly important case in this work of actualization is Bloch’s analysis of natural law, a legal dimension of utopian practical philosophy (Wagner 1995). The tradition of natural law as something more fundamental than statist legal structures, is going back to antiquity, but also to such scholars as Christian Thomasius and, for Bloch, to the values of the French revolution. What mostly interests Bloch is the political dimension of the natural law doctrine, its role for the critique of the positive law, its grassroots nature, its focus on individual freedom, dignity, and rights of a citizen (in contrast to the pursuit of happiness characteristic for social utopias), as something to be fought for and defended.

Within Marxism, Bloch reinstates the importance of human rights that are not inborn, but are something to fight for and uphold. He makes them as necessary for the left political cause as the end of exploitation (Bloch 1961 [1986b: xxix]). Following his ontological beliefs, Bloch does not wish to inherit the ahistorical ideas of human nature or some fixed universal principles. What remains an historical invariant of the natural law tradition, for Bloch, is a drive towards freedom (Gramm 1990). The essence of natural law is the idea of human dignity, captured in a metaphor of “upright walk”. The content or the foundation of dignity is the openness and the ability to transcend the frames of one’s class or any other fixed position in the social world. In the class society, positive law and state are, for Bloch, instruments of domination.

Bloch’s utopian ideal is thus natural law, but not positive law, that would necessarily be misused by the ruling class; and it is an utopian humanistic community of dignity and love, existing beyond the state. Note that Bloch’s humanism is not built on the idea of an immutable and immediately and intuitively given human nature. On the contrary, he emphasizes that the true meaning of the human can only be anticipated and posited as an aim of history (Bloch 1961 [1986b: 192]). Liberty, equality and fraternity are the utopian ideals of human individual and communitarian praxis that is in the process of seeking its most adequate realization.[8]

3.5 Utopian Philosophy of Religion

Perhaps the most poignant formula characterizing Bloch’s general attitude toward religion is “transcending without any heavenly transcendence” (Bloch 1954–59 [1986a: 1288])—or “transcending into the this-worldly” (Transzendieren ins Diesseits, see Traub & Wieser 1975: 234). This “horizontal” transcending (Agar 2014) is predicated upon the utopian anticipation, the premonition of the ideal state, of the full adequacy of the subject and the object. God is thus expected as a future utopian human kingdom, while religion is a necessary bearer of emancipatory utopian drive.

The openness to the future is something associated with the messianic moment of Bloch’s philosophy. The coming of the radically new must meet the humans who prepare it and practically work towards its realization. The general sentiment visible in the prophetic style of Bloch’s first writings is that of a tense anticipation of a radical revolutionary upheaval and of “communist-apostolic kingdom of Christ” (1921 [GA 2: 53]) coming. In fact, in Bloch’s early thinking, shaped by the feelings of deep social and cultural crisis, eschatology is a binding force of the whole human history.

Since the state as an hierarchical and violent institution, new forms of community, or “fraternal inwardness” (Bloch 1918 [2000: 161]), are called for. The Spirit of Utopia ends with the invocation of the utopian community (indeed, the “inconstruable question” is a question on “us”)—the community, on which God’s own realization in history is dependent, while Tübingen Introduction to Philosophy begins with the formula that stages the becoming of community out of mere individual being and the feeling of subjective lack.[9] Note that Bloch was skeptical towards the aesthetization of the political and the synthesis of an ethical and aesthetic genius in a single political figure of violence and domination. The function of the spiritual leaders, the agents of creativity, is not to impose their genius on others, but to open up an anticipatory space of redemption (die Sache selbst, GA 10: 209) and share with the utopian community the practices and possibilities of this incompleteness, a yet “hidden human face” (GA 10: 210) of an individual.

The political media of utopia for Bloch were the anarchist religious movements that tried to emancipate themselves from the authorities of the state and the church, to revolutionize existing institutions, and to establish new forms of democratic solidarity. This refusal to take the world as it is, the political energy of utopia, is opposed not only to conformist tendencies in Catholicism, but also to Calvinism helping establish “capitalism as religion” (1921 [GA 2: 123]) and to Luther’s Protestantism that repressed any social engagement and, in the irrationalism and quietism of its pure passive inwardness, fetishized the given political order. The mystical hiatus between action and redemption, between human creatures and transcendent grace, and the projection of all the real agency on God stifled the work of emancipation.

In Atheism in Christianity, Bloch (1968 [2009]) consistently demonstrates the entanglement of the political dominance of the ruling class and intellectual dominance of religious doctrines. He thus follows Nietzsche in exposing the political dimension of theocracy. However, his key argument remains that all the religions contain an utopian heretic core—something Bloch calls Exodus—that reveals the true meaning of religion: the emancipatory drive to throw down the political and intellectual hegemony of the ruling class. Bloch’s key insight is to demonstrate that this drive is essential for the philosophy that emphasizes anticipation of the future and hope and for that, a non-dogmatic religious myth is a legitimate ally. The revolutionary figure of Jesus is treated in view of its human dimension: Christ is a prophet of this world, “messianic kingdom of God—without God” (Bloch 1954–59 [1986a: 1200]). Just as the Marxist orthodoxy could not see any potential in romanticism and avant-garde, and thus failed politically, Enlightenment, with its sweeping critique of religion, went too far and discarded its own emancipatory core with the bath water. Bloch, inspired by Feuerbach, but also by the gnostic sentiment of his earlier work, focuses on the not-yet-revealed Judeo-Christian God of Exodus as a liberating figure and on the heroes of the Scripture (such as Job), who discover “the processual God” (Bielik-Robson 2019).

Despite his atheism, something he espoused from the very beginning,[10] Bloch stated explicitly the link between hope and religion (GA Erg. Bd.: 347), and some theologians saw in his philosophy of hope a commitment to liberated version of Christianity that would accept the God as an immanent eschatological force (see especially Moltmann 1964 [1967], who puts eschatology at the center of theological discourse and defines its major object in essentially Blochian terms: to capture the future within the present) (see also Moylan 1997).

4. Aesthetics

Works of art, in Bloch’s interpretation, are perfect examples of utopian objects, in that they always transcend their immediate meanings and contexts and serve as non-contemporaneous indications of unrealized possibilities (Korstvedt 2010). They are the perfect embodiments of the highest happiness and intensive openness to the new (Holz 1975), and an artistic genius is the most proper medium of the not-yet-conscious (Bloch 1954–59 [1986a: 122f.]). Works of art thus both embody the incompleteness of the world and mediate an aesthetic experience that is, in its epistemic role, a primary vehicle of grasping the utopian, the radically new, by the human mind (Vidal 1994). The term Bloch mostly used for characterizing art is Vor-Schein (pre-appearance, sometimes also translated as anticipatory illumination), drawing on the classic idea of aesthetic appearance (Schein), which has the meaning of illusion or fiction. So art is not “mere” illusion, but an utopian anticipation. Thus, a perfect work of art is always imperfect, is completeness is complete because it is incomplete, that is, because it contains within itself the fullness of the Not Yet.

Art is—like the world itself—a laboratory, in which the inner and the outer interact and exchange identities (Hudson 1982) thus overcoming the narrowness of private experience and the estrangement of objectified cultural forms. It is inherently utopian precisely because it sublimates the sensuous by staying sensuous, because it elevates the empirical reality by making the ideal happen in a sensuous form, and because it is an important medium of imagination. The productivity of an artist, their creative drive, is for Bloch connected to the experience of lack in the actual present (“something’s missing”), and is directed towards the future absolute, the full adequacy of subject and object.

Tropes as media of reference are for Bloch instruments for comprehending the unsettled reality and indicating its future possibilities, the mirrors of not-yet-become (GA 9: 293)—be it in putting various phenomena together in view of a common telos (as in the case of symbols) or in creating an irreducible multiplicity of references (as in the case of allegories). In producing the new by combining heterogenous elements, these techniques are

a form of materialist cognition … designed to reveal traces of world contents not given in the abstract appearance of capitalist society. (Hudson 1982: 2)

Bloch’s philosophy of nature leads him to re-evaluate the concept of the beauty in nature. Since the nature itself is utopian, it does its own creative work and is permeated by “real” tropes pertaining to its future potentialities.

Music, for Bloch, provides us with “the utopian sound of […] existence” (Bloch 1985d: 212) in the most immediately graspable way. Music is both dynamic and material, following Bloch’s vision of nature. It creates the way to comprehend an essential reality, a fulfilled moment, the absolute, to externalize the pure inwardness, what in The Spirit of Utopia coincides with “self-encounter” (which Bloch also conjures by referring to Expressionist art) and is later extended to the whole of humanity encountering itself. Music is paradigmatically incomplete, non-discursive, ineffable, and is the source of inexhaustible novelty and variability, a realm, in which the utopian, the future in the past, should be heard. Importantly, music is created and perceived in the darkness of the lived moment and affects the subjectivity in the most direct and profound way, by dynamizing it, bringing it into motion.

Music begins as “singing-to-oneself”, which is conceived as an analogy to the darkness of the lived moment that should be overcome in the further dialectical progression of musical formations, or categories. The general pattern of this progression is gradual emancipation from immediate practical entanglements of the “tone”, the dialectics playing out between human expression and objective form, between the material/emotional, and the technical (Korstvedt 2010). This interplay was first conceived by Bloch in his analysis of the ornament in The Spirit of Utopia while juxtaposing the Egyptian art as a dead, merely external form and a Gothic art, in which the human dimension becomes prominent. In The Principle of Hope, Bloch further emphasizes the social conditioning and direct social influence of music, its powers to transgress the context, to which it most immediately relates (Levitas 2013). The dialectic of the material and the ideal in tone,[11] unlike in Hegel’s philosophy of music Bloch largely follows, is not fully resolved in the overarching subjectivity of spirit but keeps reproducing a tension and a productive utopian indeterminacy (Gallope 2017).

An important feature of Bloch’s aesthetics is the focus on the small, seemingly insignificant, and on the mundane (Jameson 1971): in The Spirit of Utopia, he praises applied art and crafts; later, while working a lot as a cultural critic, he turns to popular culture, in particular, fairy tales, adventure stories and detective novels. The Principle of Hope, besides being a work in philosophy, is also an encyclopedia of utopian motives in visual art, architecture, but also in all genres of literature, popular culture, mythology, and everyday life. Bloch was practicing utopian hermeneutics in discovering the potentialities in various aesthetic forms and exploring the aspects of poetic non-contemporaneity in certain works of art that get re-actualized in different historical contexts, and in literary characters (such as Don Quixote), who exemplify the utopian transgression.

In the detective novel, the small details are crucial, as well as the darkness of the lived moment (GA 9: 247, 260, see Bloch 1965 [1998]), a fundamental obscurity of the crime that is driving the investigation. It is crucial for Bloch that this obscurity is not merely something that should be elucidated epistemically. It is rather still unclear to itself, like in the story of Oedipus (Bloch also conceded to psychoanalysis its role as hermeneutics of suspicion). The whole world is thus becoming this investigation into its own obscure origins, while the detective hermeneutics—including the one practiced by Benjamin—becomes the major epistemological strategy.

Fairy tale is for Bloch a genre that represents a victory over the stiflingly static mythical powers, its imagination is emancipatory and is directed at the future happiness (GA 9: 131), its general optimist hopeful attitude is recognized as that of an rational Enlightenment autonomy (Weissberg 1992). Popular literature of the “colportage”[12] (particularly Karl May) was important for Bloch because of its democratic tendency, its grassroots nature, and its genuine wish for the new, its dream for revolution (Edwards 2013). Romanticism was also re-functioned in view of its anti-bourgeois pathos. Following Bloch’s political philosophy, the elements of the conservative German culture—from Hebel (Siebers 2011) to Wagner (Korstvedt 2010)—should also be saved.

Bloch’s intellectual strategy became especially salient in the debates on expressionism, an important aesthetic discussion of the 1930s. Bloch argued, against Lukács, that in the hollow world of the contemporaneous capitalism, the avant-garde is the genuine aesthetic achievement (Schmitt 1973; Ujma 1995). He insisted on the openness and discontinuity of the true works of art, which he defended speculatively already in The Spirit of Utopia (Riedel 1994), and focused on a fragment as a technique that conveys an inherently utopian potential. The aesthetic attitude propagated by Bloch, the discontinuous, shocking, estranging intervention in reality—such as the technique of montage, or anacoluthon, a sudden interruption in the flow of narrative—is for him a true realism, a mimesis faithful to a ubiquitous utopian surplus of the world, performatively activating this surplus.



Bloch’s most extensive and comprehensive biography to date is

  • Zudeick, Peter, 1985, Der Hintern des Teufels: Ernst Bloch, Leben und Werk, Baden-Baden, Moos: Elster.

The two books of interviews also cover many biographical details:

  • Traub, Rainer and Harald Wiesner (eds.), 1975, Gespräche mit Ernst Bloch, Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp.
  • Münster, Arno (ed.), 1977, Tagträume vom aufrechten Gang: sechs Interviews mit Ernst Bloch, Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp.

A more recent, psychoanalytically informed perspective on Bloch’s life and thought is developed in:

  • Gekle, Hanna, 2019, Der Fall des Philosophen: eine Archäologie des Denkens am Beispiel von Ernst Bloch, Frankfurt am Main: Vittorio Klostermann GmbH.

Primary Sources

The standard edition of Bloch’s work in German is:

  • [GA] Bloch, Ernst, 1959–1978, Gesamtausgabe in 16 Bänden + 1 Ergänzungsband, Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp (cited as GA).

English translations and other primary sources cited in the text (here listed by year of publication):

  • 1905/1906 [1992], “Gedanken über religiöse Dinge”, Das Freie Wort, 5: 690–694; reprinted, 1992, Bloch-Almanach, 12: 9–13.
  • 1909, Kritische Erörterungen über Rickert und das Problem der modernen Erkenntnistheorie, Ludwigshafen am Rhein: Baur.
  • 1918 [2000], Geist der Utopie, München: Duncker & Humblot [GA 16]; 2nd revised edition, 1923; 3rd edition, 1964 [GA 3]; translated as The Spirit of Utopia, Anthony A. Nassar (trans.), Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press, 2000.
  • 1921, Thomas Münzer als Theologe der Revolution, München: Wolff; revised edition published as GA 2.
  • 1923 [1964], Durch die Wüste. Frühe kritische Aufsätze, Berlin: P. Cassirer; new edition Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp, 1964.
  • 1930 [2006], Spuren, Berlin: Cassirer; expanded in GA 1; translated as Traces, Anthony A. Nassar (trans.), Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press.
  • 1935 [1991], Erbschaft dieser Zeit, Zurich: Oprecht & Helbling [GA 4]; translated as Heritage of Our Times, Neville Plaice and Stephen Plaice (trans.), Cambridge: Polity Press, 1991.
  • 1951, Subjekt-Objekt: Erläuterungen zu Hegel, Berlin: Aufbau-Verlag [GA 8].
  • 1952 [2018], Avicenna und die Aristotelische Linke, Berlin: Rütten & Loenin (a shorter form first appeared in Sind und Form, 4(3)); slightly revised and included as an appendix in GA 7; translated as Avicenna and the Aristotelian Left, Loren Goldman and Peter Thompson (trans.), New York: Columbia University Press, 2018.
  • 1954–59 [1986a], Das Prinzip Hoffnung, Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp [GA 5]; translated as The Principle of Hope. Vol. I–III, Neville Plaice, Stephen Plaice, and Paul Knight (trans.), Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, 1986.
  • 1961 [1986b], Naturrecht und menschliche Würde, Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp [GA 6]; translated as Natural Law and Human Dignity, Dennis J. Schmidt (trans.) Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, 1986.
  • 1963/64, Tübinger Einleitung in die Philosophie, 2 volumes, Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp [GA 13].
  • 1965 [1998], Literarische Aufsä̈tze, Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp [GA 9]; translated as Literary Essays, Andrew Joron, Jack Zipes, Frank Mecklenburg, and H. Wild (trans.), Stanford: Stanford University Press, 1998.
  • 1968 [2009], Atheismus im Christentum: Zur Religion des Exodus und des Reichs, Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp [GA 14]; translated as Atheism in Christianity. The Religion of the Exodus and the Kingdom, J.T. Swann (trans.), New York: Herder and Herder, 1972; translation reprinted London: Verso, 2009.
  • 1969, Philosophische Aufsätze zur objektiven Phantasie, Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp [GA 10].
  • 1972a, Das Materialismusproblem, seine Geschichte und Substanz (The Problem of Materialism, Its History and Substance), Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp [GA 7].
  • 1972b, Vom Hasard zur Katastrophe. Politische Aufsätze 1934–1939, Volker Michels (ed.), Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp.
  • 1975, Experimentum Mundi, Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp [GA 15].
  • 1980, Abschied von der Utopie? Vorträge, Hanna Gekle (ed.), Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp.
  • 1985a, Kampf, nicht Krieg. Politische Schriften 1917–1919, Martin Korol (ed.), Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp.
  • 1985b, Leipziger Vorlesungen zur Geschichte der Philosophie 1950–1956, Bd. I–IV, Ruth Römer and Burghart Schmidt (eds.), Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp.
  • 1985c, Briefe 1903–1975, K. Bloch, J. R. Bloch, A. Frommann, H. Gekle, I. Jens, M. Korol, I. Mülder, A. Münster, U. Opolka, and B. Schmidt (eds.), Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp.
  • 1985d, Essays on the Philosophy of Music, Peter Palmer (trans.), Cambridge/New York: Cambridge University Press.
  • 1988, The Utopian Function of Art and Literature: Selected Essays, Jack Zipes and Frank Mecklenburg (trans.), Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • 2000, Logos der Materie. Eine Logik im Werden. Aus dem Nachlaß 1923–1949, Gerardo Cunico (ed.), Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp.
  • 2007, Der unbemerkte Augenblick: Feuilletons für die »Frankfurter Zeitung« 1916–1934, Ralf Becker (ed.), Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp.

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