Bradley's Regress

First published Wed Nov 1, 2017

“Bradley’s Regress” is an umbrella term for a family of arguments that lie at the heart of the ontological debate concerning properties and relations. The original arguments were articulated by the British idealist philosopher F. H. Bradley, who, in his work Appearance and Reality (1893), outlined three distinct regress arguments against the relational unity of properties. Bradley argued that a particular thing (a lump of sugar) is nothing more than a bundle of qualities (whiteness, sweetness, and hardness) unified into a cohesive whole via a relation of some sort. But relations, for Bradley, were deeply problematic. Conceived as “independent” from their relata, they would themselves need further relations to relate them to the original relata, and so on ad infinitum. Conceived as “internal” to their relata, they would not relate qualities at all, and would also need further relations to relate them to qualities. From this, Bradley concluded that a relational unity of qualities is unattainable and, more generally, that relations are incoherent and should not be thought of as real.

In the decades since its original formulation by F. H. Bradley, “Bradley’s regress” has come to refer to a wider variety of arguments. This diversification has happened in two main directions: (i) with respect to the ontology that the argument targets; and (ii) with respect to the argument-type presented. (i) Bradley’s original arguments targeted a one-category ontology of qualities, where by “qualities” Bradley seemed to have in mind unrepeatable particularized properties or tropes. The same argument form, however, has been used against the one-category ontology of qualities conceived as multiply occurring universals, as well as against the two-category ontology of particulars and universals. In fact, one of the most commonly cited versions of Bradley’s regress in contemporary ontological debate challenges the possibility of appealing to relations to unify particulars (such as electrons, apples, chairs) with their respective property universals (negative charge, roundness, blackness). The argument aims to show that any appeal to a relation R (of instantiation, exemplification, etc.) to relate a particular a with its universal F will require a further relation R′ to relate the particular a, the universal F, and the relation R; and so on ad infinitum. (ii) In contemporary literature, “Bradley’s regress” has been associated with a number of arguments and problems that are not, in the way they are posed, strictly regress arguments. Some of these take the form of the general problem about unity, i.e., the question of what is the ontological ground of the unity of a bundle of tropes/state of affairs as opposed to the sum/list/set of their constituents. Others are after an explanation of how relations relate, i.e., the question of what it is about relations that makes them apt to relate distinct relata. Still others are after an explanation of the existence of specific unified complexes, i.e., the question of what makes it the case that a number of constituents of the right kinds are actually connected so as to form an existing fact/state of affairs/bundle of tropes.

In the face of these Bradleyean arguments, philosophers have had a variety of replies. Some have opted for a rejectionist route which involves questioning the very assumptions that Bradley’s arguments make and consequently refusing to reply to the arguments as stated (for instance, Russell, Blanshard, Alexander, and Grossman have argued that it is a job of relations to relate and that Bradley’s relational regresses cannot get started if relations’ relating role is taken seriously). The majority of philosophers, however, have accepted some form of the Bradleyan argument and replied in one of the following ways: 1) by appealing to a non-relational tie to relate the relata (Bergmann, Strawson, Armstrong); 2) by invoking external relations in possession of some special features which make them better apt to relate their relata (Meinertsen, Vallicella, Maurin, Weiland and Betti); 3) by describing a special sort of mutual inter-dependence of the would-be relata (Frege, Baxter, Simons, Perovic); 4) by claiming simply that the complex entities themselves (such as states of affairs or facts) act as unifiers of their own constituents (Olson, Armstrong); and 5) by arguing in favor of the benign nature of an infinite regress (Armstrong, Orilia).

This entry starts with a historical background of Bradley’s regress arguments. Section 1 opens with an outline of some of the historical precursors of Bradley’s regress arguments in ancient, medieval, and modern philosophy. It then presents in some detail the regress arguments as they were formulated by Bradley in Appearance and Reality (1893), as well as Bradley’s later concerns with complexes and relations. Section 2 discusses the two types of extensions that Bradley’s regress arguments have undergone—with respect to the ontology that they apply to, and with respect to the exact sort of problem in view. Section 3 presents six common types of replies that can be found in the literature surrounding Bradleyean problems. And Section 4 concludes by describing some of the recent applications of the regress arguments in the literature on grounding, composition of objects, and unity of the proposition.

1. Historical Background

1.1 Precursors of Bradley’s Regress

The most notable ancient regress argument that is associated with Bradley’s is found in Plato’s Parmenides 132a-b. Therein Plato presents an argument that has come to be knows as the Third Man Argument (TMA), which challenges an explanation of similarity between distinct particulars that appeals to forms. Following Vlastos (1954), the regress can be reconstructed as exhibiting the following structure:

  1. a, b and c are all large because there is a Form of largeness L that they all participate in.
  2. a, b, c and L are all large because there is a Form of largeness L1 that they all participate in.
  3. a, b, c, L and L1 are all large because all of them participate in a Form of largeness L2, and so on ad infinitum.

It is commonly assumed that at least three theses underlie this argument. The first one is “the one over many” which states that many things having L in common must be explained by the existence of the form L that all of them participate in. The second premise is implicit and it has been called the premise of “non-self explanation”; it simply assumes, that in explaining what a, b, c and L have in common one cannot appeal to the L itself, but needs to appeal to a different form of largeness, L1. The third premise which is implied in this argument is “the self-partaking” premise; it assumes that the form L is itself L, i.e., that the form of largeness is itself large.

It has been debated at great length amongst the Plato scholars whether the Third Man Argument is to be understood as a metaphysical or as an epistemic argument, an argument about the postulated entities or an argument about what is involved in our knowledge of them. (For an entry point on literature concerning the Third Man Argument, as well as the dialogue more broadly see SEP’s entry Plato’s Parmenides). Similarly, there has been much disagreement about which of the theses that underlie the TMA Plato was willing to give up in order to avoid the regress. To a modern reader the “self-partaking” premise seems like an obvious candidate, since it is quite odd to think that the form of largeness is itself large, the form of smallness itself small, etc.

Plato’s TMA featured prominently in Aristotle’s Peri Ideon, and was later picked up and discussed by medieval philosophers. For instance, Boethius in his Second Commentary on Porphyry’s Isagoge discusses a peculiar infinite regress that could be seen to echo TMA, though it is described as an infinite series of genus ascriptions. (See Spade (1994: 22) for an English translation of the text).

Henninger (1989) has individuated arguments by certain orthodox Muslim theologians, the Mutakallimun, that seem to resemble closely Bradley’s regress. Apparently they believed relations to be purely subjective, and argued that positing relations as mind-independent entities would lead to an infinite regress. According to Henninger (1989: 110), a version of this argument can also be found in Harclay, Ockham, and Aureoli.

Perhaps the closest precursor of Bradley’s regress arguments is to be found in Leibniz. Mugnai (2010) has drawn attention to and translated the following passage from a text dated “December 1676” written during Leibniz’s stay in Paris:

Suppose, for example, that there is a relation between a and b, and call it c; then, consider a new relation between a and c: call it d, and so forth to the infinite. It seems that we do not have to say that all these relations are a kind of true and real ideas. Perhaps they are only mere intelligible things, which may be produced, i.e., that are or will be produced. (Mugnai 2010: 1)

As we will see shortly, this passage very closely resembles the first of the three regresses discussed by Bradley (1893).

1.2 Bradley’s Regress Arguments in Appearance and Reality (1893)

Bradley’s original formulation of the regress arguments can be found in chapters II and III of his Appearance and Reality (1893). Bradley starts the discussion in chapter II on “Substantive and Adjective”, by taking as an example a lump of sugar. He notes that there appears to be such a thing as a lump of sugar and this thing appears to have qualities such as whiteness, sweetness, and hardness. But—asks Bradley - what is this “thing” that bears properties? On the one hand, he thinks it is odd to assume that there is something to the lump of sugar beside its several qualities, thus implying that postulating a property-less bearer of properties is incoherent. On the other hand, he notes that the lump cannot merely be its qualities either, since the latter must somehow be united. For Bradley, unity or “coexistence” of qualities presupposes relations, which is why he next turns to examine different conceptions of relations.

One at a time, Bradley examines relations conceived as attributes of a single thing; relations conceived as attributes of two or more terms; and relations conceived as entirely “independent” of their relata.

The trouble with the conception of relations as attributes of a single thing or attributes of two or more things comes down, for Bradley, to the more general problem of predication. The problem, according to him, is expressed by the following question: “what is it that we do when we predicate a property of a thing?” Bradley argues that

if you predicate what is different, you ascribe to the subject what it is not; and if you predicate what is not different, you say nothing at all. (Bradley 1893:17)

To understand what Bradley means by this, we need to keep in mind that he is here presupposing a bundle view of particulars and that he is using “is” to indicate the identity of the subject with the bundle of qualities (see Wollheim (1959), Bonino (2012) and Baxter (1996) for an interpretation that reads his “is” as an “is” of identity in this context). His concern is thus with the relationship between the whole, conceived as a bundle of qualities, and the qualities themselves. He is worried that if a given quality, say blackness, is different from the whole, and separate from it (i.e., it is not in the bundle of qualities that constitutes the lump of sugar), then it is wrong to attribute it to the whole. But if the quality, say whiteness, is not distinct from the whole, but just a part of the bundle, then the attribution does not add anything new at all, it trivially states what is already the case.

Equally troubling, for Bradley, is the conception of relations as “independent” from their terms. Indeed, it leads to the first of the infinite regresses that Bradley discusses in these pages. He writes:

Let us abstain from making the relation an attribute of the related, and let us make it more or less independent. ‘There is a relation C, in which A and B stand; and it appears with both of them.’ But here again we have made no progress. The relation C has been admitted different from A and B, and no longer is predicated of them. Something, however, seems to be said of this relation C, and said again, of A and B. And this something is not to be the ascription of one to the other. If so, it would appear to be another relation D, in which C, on one side, and, on the other side, A and B stand. But such a makeshift leads at once to the infinite process. (Bradley 1893: 18)

In this famous passage, Bradley does not make it sufficiently clear what exactly generates the infinite regress. He also shifts between the linguistic worry about “something being said” of relation C and relata A and B, and the more substantial ontological worry about the unity of qualities A, B, and the relation C conceived as “independent” from relata. Despite this, it seems clear that for Bradley it is the assumed independence of the relation C that generates the problem. An independent relation is, according to him, incapable of relating A and B, and no amount of further independent relations can do the job either, thus generating the regress that has the following structure.

Regress 1against “independent” relations as unifiers of qualities

  1. Suppose that there is an independent relation C, in which qualities A and B stand.
  2. Independent relations are different from their relata and as such cannot relate.

  3. Therefore, an independent relation C cannot relate A and B.
  4. New relation D is needed to relate C, A, and B.
  5. D is an independent relation.

  6. From 2, 4 and 5, it follows that D cannot relate C, A, and B.
  7. A new relation E is needed to relate A, B, C, and D. And so on ad infinitum.

For this argument to have some force, Bradley needs to argue in support of his conception of “independent” relations as relations that cannot relate. Although he offers no such argument, he does give us a clue as to what “real” relations ought to be like:

If it [relation] is to be real [i.e., actually relating], it must be somehow at the expense of the terms, or, at least, must be something which appears in them or to which they belong. A relation between A and B implies really a substantial foundation within them. (Bradley 1893: 18)

This suggests that for Bradley, “real” relations have to be in some way ontologically grounded in their relata. Since his “independent” relations are not conceived as grounded in their relata in such a way, they cannot relate.

Bradley’s “real” relations might sound like internal relations to a contemporary ear. Internal relations, following Armstrong (1989: 43) and Lewis (1986: 62), are often characterized as relations that supervene on the intrinsic properties of their relata and that present no ontological addition. Common examples of such relations are taller than, being the same shade of blue, having the same mass. In contrast, external relations are frequently understood as relations the holding of which does not depend on the intrinsic features of particulars that they relate; they present a genuine ontological addition (for different ways of understanding the internal/external discussion see section 1 of SEP entry on Relations). Frequently cited examples of external relations are spatio-temporal relations such as being 2 feet apart, etc. Thus, in the contemporary debate, the question concerning whether or not relations exist turns on the question of whether or not external relations exist (internal ones are considered an “ontological free lunch”). But for Bradley, it is the other way around: according to him, the only relations that stand a chance at being “real” are the ones that are ontologically founded in the terms, the internal ones. The peculiar way that such relations are founded in their terms for Bradley, becomes central for the second regress, which we find in chapter III of Appearance and Reality.

Chapter III focuses on the relationship between qualities and relations. The conclusion of the overarching argument in that chapter is that the entire relational way of thought is unintelligible and flawed. Bradley arrives at this conclusion by arguing first that qualities need relations; he then tries to prove that qualities are unintelligible with relations; and finally, he argues the same for relations—i.e., that relations need qualities but are unintelligible with them.

Bradley’s starting thesis in this chapter is that qualities need relations. He assumes that without relations qualities would just collapse into an indistinguishable blob; thus qualities, in order to exist, need relations to somehow separate them out from that blob, i.e., to act as difference-makers. In addition, qualities need relations to unify them. Thus, the demand on relations is to act as both distinction-makers and as unifiers of qualities. Qualities, on their part, also have a “a double character as both supporting and as being made by the relation” (Bradley 1893:26). Qualities are made by relations through relations’ difference-making role, but qualities also need to be related into a unified whole.

For Bradley, as we saw above, only internal relations stand a chance of being “real”[1] and, subsequently, of doing the double duty just described. At the same time, Bradley’s internal relations (from now on, internalB relations) are meant to be grounded in the proper parts of qualities (see more below on this peculiar understanding of relations). But if different proper parts of a quality are to be truly different, they must be made different by some additional internal relations. The latter, in their turn, must be grounded in further different proper parts of parts of qualities. This “process of fission”, as Bradley calls it, continues ad infinitum, thus generating the second infinite regress of relations in these pages, and providing Bradley with the alleged “proof” that qualities standing in relations are unintelligible.

Regress 2against internalB relations as unifiers of qualities

  1. Relating relations are internalB in the sense that they are grounded in parts of qualities that they relate.
  2. Qualities need relations to differentiate them from other qualities.
  3. Qualities need relations to unite them with other qualities.

  4. From (1) and (2), it follows that a given quality A must have a part a, which is part of the ontological ground for the difference-making relation Rd, i.e., it is a part on which the distinctness of A from other qualities is based.
  5. From (1) and (3), it follows that quality A must have a part α, which is part of the ontological ground for the unifying relation Ru, i.e., it is a part on which the unity with other qualities is based.
  6. Parts a and α of quality A are different.
  7. Difference within parts of a quality requires internalB relations.
  8. Each of the original parts of A, namely a and α, must have a part that grounds the distinction of a from α, say a′ and α′, respectively, as well as a part that grounds the unity of a with α, say a″ and α″, respectively.
  9. But the parts a′ and a″ are distinct and yet unified; and so are α′ and α″. Thus, each of these parts must have further parts that ground such distinctness and unity. And so on ad infinitum.

The main work in this regress is being done by premises (1), (2), and (3). It is thus quite unfortunate that Bradley does not spend time substantiating them. This is especially needed when it comes to his peculiar interpretation of internality of a relation as being grounded in proper parts of qualities. For why not claim that the quality in its entirety can act as part of the ground (the other part being the other quality or qualities) for different internal relations? This would certainly be more in keeping with the contemporary understanding of internality of a relation and it could stop the regress. To this suggestion, Bradley would probably respond by reiterating the unintelligibility of the idea that the very same quality can serve as part of an ontological ground for distinctness from other qualities as well as part of an ontological ground for the unity with other qualities. In response to this, one could challenge Bradley’s reliance on the assumption that relations need to account for difference between qualities, as well as for their unity. In fact, it would be much simpler to claim that, say, whiteness and sweetness are different not because there is a difference-making part in them, but simply because they are, in their entirety, intrinsically different. Intrinsic difference of qualities could be Bradley’s bottom line, a primitive of the theory and it would eliminate the need for relations as difference-makers, thus rejecting premise (2) above.

One possible interpretation (see Perovic 2014: 381) of why Bradley does not wish to take distinctness of qualities as ontologically primitive is that he might already be presupposing a primitive which is contrary to it—a monistic undifferentiated whole. From such monistic perspective, it would then seem that differentiation of qualities would need an explanation and an ontological ground, whereas the lack of differentiation would appear to be an ontological default, requiring no explanation at all. However, although this interpretation would help us understand better why Bradley might have assumed that relations need to act as difference-makers for qualities, it is certainly not terribly charitable to Bradley; that is, it would assume that Bradley had already question-beggingly presupposed monism as the default ontological position in his arguments against relations.

Finally, let’s consider the third and final regress brought forward by Bradley in chapter III. After claiming that relations are unintelligible without qualities, he wants to show that the way relations stand to qualities is equally unintelligible. He writes:

If it [relation] is nothing to the qualities, then they are not related at all; and, if so, as we saw, they have ceased to be qualities, and their relation is a nonentity. But if it is to be something to them, then clearly we now shall require a new connecting relation. For the relation hardly can be the mere adjective of one or both of its terms; or, at least, as such it seems indefensible. And, being something itself, if it does not itself bear a relation to the terms, in what intelligible way will it succeed in being anything to them? But here again we are hurried off into the eddy of a hopeless process, since we are forced to go on finding new relations without end. The links are united by a link, and this bond of union is a link which also has two ends; and these require each a fresh link to connect them with the old. (Bradley 1893: 27–28)

The regress presented here is somewhat similar to the one expressed in Regress 1 above. In both cases relations are assumed to be incapable of relating. In Regress 1, however, Bradley explicitly targeted only the “independent” relations. Here, Bradley is assuming the results of his previous arguments, and attacking all relations, i.e., relations as such.

Regress 3against relations as such as unifiers of qualities

  1. Suppose that there is a relation R uniting qualities A and B.
  2. If R is nothing to A and B, they are not related.
  3. If R is something to A and B, then R itself is something.
  4. If R is something itself then it cannot relate and needs further relations, such as R′ to relate it to A and B.
  5. The same process is then repeated with R′ and further relations, ad infinitum.

In this regress, Bradley is employing the phrases “being nothing to the qualities” and “being something to the qualities,” but he doesn’t explain what he means by these phrases. If, however, Bradley is to be consistent with his previous claims, relations that are “nothing to the qualities” have to be his internalB relations which he dismissed with Regress 2, and relations that are “something to the qualities” have to be his “independent” relations which he dismissed with Regress 1. We should thus read premise (2) in Regress 3 as follows: if R is an internalB relation, A and B will end up not just not related, but will instead end up in the infinite process of division, as seen in Regress 2. If, on the other hand, R is something to A and B, as in premise (3) in Regress 3, it itself has to be something—that is, it is, in Bradley’s terminology a non-internal, “independent” relation. And “independent” relations, as we have seen in Regress 1, cannot relate and no amount of further independent relations can relate either.

After presenting Regress 3, Bradley believes that he has succeeded in showing that the entire relational way of thought is flawed and that relations as such should be relegated to the sphere of appearance, rather than to reality. Central to arriving at such a conclusion has been his assumption that what he calls “independent” relations cannot relate. It seems as if Bradley simply did not know how to think of such entities and often resorts to metaphors and talks about links needing further links at their ends and insists on our inability to show how “solid things” can be joined to other “solids” (cf. Bradley 1893: 28). As these metaphors indicate, Bradley’s worry seems to be that if relations are conceived of as independent from the terms that they relate, they themselves will become just like the terms that need relating and this way they will lose their relating power.

1.3 The Bradley-Russell Debate About Relations and Complexes in 1910/1911

Bradley’s arguments against relations gained a different dimension during his debate with Russell in the journal Mind, during 1910–1911. At this point, Bradley is no longer concerned just with arguments against the relational unity of qualities; rather, he is concerned with the possibility of there being compex unities that cannot be analyzed.

By the end of his paper “On Appearance, Error, and Contradiction” (1910), Bradley challenges Russell to explain how he can reconcile his pluralism of terms and external relations with his commitment to complex unanalyzable entities which have terms and external relations as constituents. He writes as follows:

I encounter at the outset a great difficulty. Mr. Russell’s position has remained to myself incomprehensible. On the one side I am led to think that he defends a strict pluralism, for which nothing is admissible beyond simple terms and external relations. On the other side Mr. Russell seems to assert emphatically, and to use throughout, ideas which such a pluralism surely must repudiate. He throughout stands upon unities which are complex and which cannot be analysed into terms and relations. These two positions to my mind are irreconcilable, since the second, as I understand it, contradicts the first flatly. If there are such unities, and still more, if such unities are fundamental, then pluralism surely is in principle abandoned as false. (Bradley 1910: 179)

Bradley thinks that a pluralist who postulates two fundamental simple entities cannot also admit a third fundamental entity which is complex, i.e., constituted out of the simple entities. There is a tension which must be resolved by either letting go of the fundamentality of the simples (the view that Bradley would have opted for); or by letting go of the fundamentality of complexes (the view that Bradley thinks a consistent pluralist should embrace). But there is a further way that the tension might be resolved, and this is by arguing that simples and complexes are fundamental in different senses of the term “fundamental”. (For different senses of fundamentality in this context see Perovic (2016) who distinguishes between constitutive, explanatory, and existential fundamentality.)

Russell’s own reply to Bradley focused on clarifying the sense in which he claimed that complex unities cannot be analyzed. He wrote back the following:

It would seem that everything here turns upon the sense in which such unities cannot be analysed. I do not admit that, in any strict sense, unities are incapable of analysis; on the contrary, I hold that they are the only objects that can be analysed. What I admit is that no enumeration of their constituents will reconstitute them, since any such enumeration gives us a plurality, not a unity. But I do not admit that they are not composed of their constituents; and what is more to the purpose, I do not admit that their constituents cannot be considered truly unless we remember that they are their constituents. (Russell 1910: 373)

In this reply to Bradley, Russell is taking care to point out that he is using the term “analysis” to designate a process performed by us of “discovery of the constituents of the complex” (Russell 1910: 374). This signifies a departure from his claims in the Principles of Mathematics, where he argued that propositional unities could not be analyzed because analysis would destroy the unity of the proposition (Russell 1903: 50–51). This shift in the understanding of the notion of “analysis” from ontological breaking down of unities to something that we perform when we are discovering constituents of complex entities, allows Russell to say that complexes are the only objects that can in fact be analyzed.

In addition, Russell pinpoints his disagreement with Bradley when it comes to relations. Russell explicitly rejects the view which favors internal relations, that is, which holds “that the fact that an object x has a certain relation R to an object y implies complexity in x and y, i.e., it implies something in the “natures” of x and y in virtue of which they are related by the relation R” (Russell 1910: 373–374). Instead, Russell states his support of external relations, the holding of which cannot be derived from the terms that such relations relate or their intrinsic complexity. Instead, when we have x and y standing in an external relation R, we then have a complex or a unity xRy. What distinguishes such a complex from a “mere aggregate”, according to Russell, is that a relation in a unified complex relates whereas in an aggregate it does not relate and is just a member of an aggregate.

Russell’s reply was unsatisfying to Bradley, who followed up with his “Reply to Mr Russell’s Explanations” in 1911, reiterating some of the same concerns. Namely, Bradley repeatedly returns to the worry about external relations—he finds them to be unobservable and unthinkable without the terms; a relation apart from its terms is indeed for Bradley an “indefensible abstraction”. In addition, he asks Russell to elaborate further on the presumed difference between an aggregate of entities and a unity of those entities. Bradley says that an appeal to relating relations is unsatisfying and further asks Russell to explain wherein the difference between relating relations and non-relating relations lies for him. But for Russell there was no further story to be told; the difference between relating and non-relating relations is a primitive on which he did not feel the need to offer any further details.

1.4 Bradley’s Remarks on Relations in his Posthumous “Relations” (1926)

Between 1923 and the first part of 1924, Bradley returned to the topic of relations. He was working on an article that he intended to publish in Mind, the first part of which was posthumously made available in his Collected Essays vol.2, under the simple title “Relations”. This manuscript is significant because Bradley is, on the one hand, restating in a slightly different way what he takes to be the most salient arguments from his previous works and, on the other hand, expanding his attack on relations.

Thus, we find again his regress argument against external relations, motivated by his assumption that such relations cannot relate; external relations are, he writes, no more than “mere abstractions” from relational facts and as such hold no relating power (Bradley 1926: 643). Internal relations are no improvement, and Bradley rejects as untrue any suggestions that he might have wanted to accept them (642). The true problem seems to be that “an actual relation […] must possess at once both the characters of a ‘together’ and a ‘between’, and, failing either of these, is a relation no longer” Bradley 1926: 644, 634). Thus, just as in his Appearance and Reality (1893), Bradley is demanding of relations that they fulfill both an “in-between role” (what I have called above a difference-making role) as well as the “together” role (what I have called the unifying role). Failing either of these roles amounts to not being a true relation, which in turn makes the presumed relational experience contradictory, for Bradley:

Relational experience must hence in its very essence be self-contradictory. Contradiction everywhere is the attempt to take what is plural and diverse as being one and the same, and to take it so (we must add) simply or apart from any “how”. And we have seen that without both diversity and unity the relational experience is lost, while to combine these two aspects it has left to it no possible “how” or way, except one which seems either certainly less or certainly more than what is relational. (Bradley 1926: 635)

As this often quoted passage illustrates, Bradley’s skepticism about relations takes the form of the “how” question. Bradley’s “how” question is often read as “How do relations relate?”. But taking into account the wider context, his question is actually “How might relations at the same time relate and diversify their relata?”. Failing to see how relations might do both, Bradley concludes that relational experience is marred by contradiction.

Finally, by the end of “Relations”, Bradley wishes to make it clear that what is fatal to his monism is not just a specific type of relations (such as asymmetric relations), but an ultimate reality of any kind of relation: “For not one kind of relation, but every and any relation, if taken as an ultimate reality, would (on any view such as mine) be fatal to Monism” (Bradley 1926: 649). This is an important reminder of Bradley’s own motivation for his repeated arguments against relations.[2]

2. Extensions of Bradley’s Regress Arguments

In the decades since Bradley’s original discussion in AR, “Bradley’s regress” has come to refer to a wider variety of arguments. This widening of scope has happened in two main directions: (i) with respect to the ontology that the arguments target; and (ii) with respect to the type of the argument presented. In this section we will take a closer look at both of these extensions.

2.1 Bradley’s Regress vs. One and Two Category Ontologies

As we have seen in section 1.2 above, Bradley’s original regress arguments targeted a one-category ontology of qualities, where by “qualities” Bradley seemed to have in mind unrepeatable particularized properties, i.e., tropes. But the same argument form has been used against the one-category ontology of qualities conceived as multiply occurring universals, as well as against the two-category ontologies of particulars and universals, as well as particulars and tropes.

Bradley’s regress arguments apply easily to the one-category ontology of universals. The same problem that Bradley articulated for trope-like qualities can be articulated for universals: namely, what is it that unites universals of whiteness, sweetness, and hardness into the particular lump of sugar? If ordinary particulars such as lumps of sugar are nothing but bundles of universal qualities, it seems important to provide an account of unity of such bundles. The challenge is particularly difficult in the case of universals because, unlike tropes, they are concieved as multiply occurring entities that are wholly present in each of their instances. Thus, the problem of uniting a bundle of universals such as whiteness, sweetness, and hardness will go hand in hand with the problem of individuation of bundles of universals, i.e., the problem of distinguishing between this particular bundle of whiteness, sweetness, and hardness and another exact duplicate bundle of whiteness, sweetness, and hardness.

Bradley’s regress arguments have been most widely discussed within the context of the realists’ two-category ontology of particulars and universals. The challenge in this context is to provide an ontological ground of unity of particulars and universals, and the worry is that any appeal to a relation R (of instantiation, exemplification, etc.) to unify a particular a with its respective property universal F sets off an infinite regress of relations, similar to the regresses described by Bradley. In the light of this problem, some realists such as Olson (1987), and Armstrong (1997) have argued that it is a third entity - the fact or state of affairs of a being F that provides the ontological ground of unity of a and Fness as well as the truthmaker for the truth that “a is F”. According to critics (see, for instance, Vallicella 2000 and 2002), this approach instead of solving the problem of unity of particulars and universals, merely reframes it as the one threatening the very possibility of there being such entities as facts or states of affairs. Similar worries have arisen for trope theorists that embrace a two-category ontology of particulars and tropes. Philosophers such as C.B. Martin (1980) and Daly (1997) have worried that an appeal to a relation of inherence in the context of unfying a substratum and its property trope would lead to an infinite regress of inherence relataions.

Finally, D.M. Armstrong (1979) has stated a regress argument similar to Bradley’s, as a threat to class nominalists. The thought is that since class nominalists analyze particulars’ having of properties in terms of particulars’ membership in a class of things that all have those properties, they would incur a regress when trying to define a membership relation. However, class nominalists like Lewis (2002), have been adamant about not being committed to a membership relation of any sort; indeed, Lewis has argued that all we have is a “singular-to-plural copula: ‘is one of’ as in ‘this is one of those’.” (Lewis 2002: 10, italics mine).

2.2 The Regress and Associated Problems

There are a number of problems that tend to be brought up in the context of discussing Bradley’s regress but that do not take the form of a regress argument. The three that stand out are: (1) the problem of explaining what differentiates a unified complex entity from a mere aggregate of its constituents; (2) the problem of explaining how exactly it is that relations relate; and (3) the problem of explaining how the specific complex comes into existence.

2.2.1 The problem of explaining what differentiates a unified complex entity from a mere aggregate of its constituents

For a proponent of particulars, universals, and states of affairs, this problem takes the form of the following questions: what is the ontological ground of the difference between the sum a+F and the unified state of affairs Fa? It could be the case that both a and F exist at a world, and thus that the sum a+F exists at such a world, without it being the case that Fa obtains (but, say, a being G and b being F obtain). What then is the ground of such a difference? Similarly, what provides an ontological ground of the difference between the sum a+R+b and the unified state of affairs aRb? It might be the case that all three a, R, and b exist at a world, and hence that their sum is given, without it being the case that aRb obtains (instead, say, aRc and bRd obtain). The same sort of question can be posed, of course, for other ontologies. For instance, for a bundle trope theorist the question will be: what is the ontological ground of the difference between the sum F1+G1+H1 of property tropes and a unified trope bundle constituted out of them? (See Armstrong 1989, 1997; Vallicella 2000, 2002; Maurin 2010; and Meinertsen 2008, amongst others for such a formulation of the problem.)

It must be noted that this problem takes it for granted: (i) that mereological sums are unproblematic and a metaphysical default, whereas complexes are problematic and in need of an explanation; and (ii) that all kinds of entities (particulars, universal properties and relations, tropes, etc.) can indeed be summed regardless of whether such entities can exist independently of others. Similar assumptions are made in formulations that make no reference to mereological sums but rather contrast lists, groupings, or sets of entities with the unified complexes such as states of affairs or bundles of tropes.

Philosophers who pose the problem in these terms, will often move on to generate a regress argument for any attempt to explain the difference between a sum/list/set of entities and a unified complex that appeals to relations. The next question becomes: what will account for the difference between a sum/list/set of entities a, F, and a relation R (of instantiation or exemplification) on the one hand, and a unified state of affairs of a being F, on the other? The implication is that any addition of further relations will set off Bradley’s regress of relations, with no explanation in sight (see in particular Vallicella (2000)).

2.2.2 The problem of explaining how relations relate

The question “How do relations relate?” can be traced back to Bradley (1926: 635), and it fuels much of the recent discussion surrounding Bradley’s regress (see Simons 1994, Maurin 2010, Meinertsen 2008, Wieland and Betti 2008). But, as we saw in section 1.4 above, Bradley’s “how” question was motivated by his puzzlement over the dual role that he thought relations had to fill; he saw them as having to distinguish between different relata and having to unify them. Thus his question was not so much “how do relations relate?” but rather “how do relations relate as well as differentiate their relata?”

In contrast, contemporary philosophers’ puzzlement over “how relations relate” stems from a different place. The assumption in this case seems to be that unless some account of the nature of relations adequately explains what makes them apt to unite distinct relata, an appeal to relations as relating entities is illicit. The type of explanation that philosophers are after in this context often remains unspecified, though it is clear that what is expected is not a causal explanation, but a metaphysical explanation of some kind. It is assumed that an adequate explanation will refer to some special feature of relations that makes it possible for them to relate; absent such feature, relations are usually considered to be relationally inert and Bradley’s regress of relations is re-introduced.

2.2.3 The problem of explaining the existence of a specific complex

This problem is usually brought out by contrasting it with the general problem of existence of complexes. The question is not “what is it that unifies states of affairs/bundles of tropes?” but rather “what is it that unifies this particular bundle of whiteness, hardness, and sweetness into a lump of sugar?” and “what is that unifies this particular chair and the universal blackness?” Vallicella puts the question, as it applies to facts, in the following way:

What makes it the case that a number of constituents of the right kinds—constituents which are connectable so as to form a fact but need not be connected to exist—are actually connected so as to form an actual or existing fact? (Vallicella 2000: 242)

(Note that a similar formulation of this problem can be found in Maurin 2010).

Vallicella and others who pose the question in these terms make it clear that they are not after a causal story about how a particular lump of sugar or a particular black chair was made. Instead, what drives the problem as posed is the assumed contingent nature of the connection between constituents of states of affairs. This chair is black but it might have been some other color; and this blackness, for realists, need not be instantiated here, it might (and in fact is) present in many other states of affairs. So what is it that “makes it so” that this particular blackness and this particular chair are actually united? There is nothing in the natures of constituents of states of affairs to require that they come together, so—the thought is - something else must bring those constituents together.

3. Replies to Bradleyean Arguments

In this section, we will take a closer look at different strategies philosophers have employed in engaging with Bradley’s regress arguments and the associated problems discussed above (I will be using the locution “Bradleyean arguments” to refer indifferently to both of these cateogires). The first fork in the road for philosophers has been to either reject the argument by questioning one or more of the assumptions that the argument makes, or to accept and respond to the argument on its own terms. Those that have chosen the rejectionist approach have mostly done so by challenging Bradley’s skepticism about relations’ ability to relate their relata. Russell, Broad, Blanshard, Alexander, and Grossman have argued that it is a job of relations to relate and that Bradley’s relational regresses cannot get started if relations’ relating role is taken seriously. Many more philosophers, however, have found Bradleyean argument compelling and have responded in one of the following ways. They have appealed to: 1) some sort of non-relational tie or nexus to relate the relata (Bergmann, Strawson); 2) external relations equipped with special features (Meinertsen’s self-relating relations, Vallicella’s external relations with the power of self-determination, Maurin’s and Weiland and Betti’s relata-specific relations); 3) the mutual inter-dependence of the would-be relata (Frege, Baxter, Simons); 4) complexes as brute unifiers of their constituents (Olson, Armstrong); and 5) the benign nature of the regress in question (Armstrong, Orilia).

3.1 Rejectionism

Rejectionists about Bradleyean arguments tend to question one or more of the assumptions on which the argument rests. With respect to the regresses, rejectionists have mainly questioned the grounds of Bradley’s skepticism about relations and their relating role. As we have seen in section 1.3 above, Russell employed this strategy when debating Bradley in the journal Mind, in 1910. On that occasion, Russell argued in favor of external relations and their relating role within complexes of the form aRb.[3]

C. D. Broad (1933) also objected to Bradley for his treatment of relations; he thought that the main problem had to do with Bradley’s treatment of relations as if they were particulars in need of being related themselves. He wrote, rather harshly:

It is plain that Bradley thinks of A and B as being like two objects fastened together with a bit of string, and he thinks of R as being like the bit of string. He then remembers that the objects must be glued or sealed to both ends of the the bit of string if the latter is to fasten them together. And then, I suppose, another kind of glue is needed to fasten the second drop of glue to the object B on the one side and the string on the other. And so on without end. Charity bids us avert our eyes from the pitiable spectacle of a great philosopher using an argument which would disgrace a child or a savage. (Broad 1933: 85)

We find a very similar take on Bradley’s regress in Blanshard (1986). He argued contra Bradley that “R is not the same sort of being as its terms. It is neither a thing nor a quality. It is a relation, and the business of a relation is to relate” (Blanshard 1986: 215).

More of the same can also be found in Alexander (1920 [1966], vol. 1, 249, 256) and Grossmann (1992: 55–56). Though they are less harsh than Broad and Blanshard in their assessment of Bradley’s regress arguments, they are unambiguous in their diagnosis of the problem as one involving the wrong conception of relations. According to Grossmann, for instance, the correct conclusion to draw from Bradley’s regress argument is that “it is really an argument not against relations, but against the assumption that relations need to be related to what they relate” (Grossmann 1992: 55).

In recent debate, replies to Bradley’s regress that bluntly insist on relations’ relating role have been unpopular. This is because the debate has shifted to include the associated questions outlined in 2.2. above, including the question: “How do relations relate?”. Thus, if one is after the answer to the “how” question, simply saying that it is the job of relations to relate is deemed unsatisfactory.

One sort of rejectionist reply to Bradleyean arguments can be found in Perovic (2014). Perovic (2014) argues that Bradley’s original regress arguments in AR rest on unsubstantiated assumptions and thus cannot be considered as successful reductio arguments against relations. For example, the first regress takes for granted that as long as unifying relations are conceived as “independent” from their relata, they cannot relate. The second regress assumes that unifying of qualities cannot be achieved with “internal” relations either; for the latter are understood as being grounded in proper parts of qualities, which leads, according to Bradley, to an infinite regress. She points out that it is not clear why Bradley understands internal relations as grounded in proper parts of qualities that they relate, nor is it clear why Bradley believes that relations, if they are to have any standing, ought to fill a dual role of unifying their relata as well as providing the ground of their distinctness. Perovic (2014) concludes that without further support, Bradley’s original arguments against relations as unifiers of qualities do not establish the unreality of relations; an appeal to external relations as unifiers of their relata is still a perfectly acceptable option for both realists and trope theorists.

3.2 Non-Relational Ties

A great number of philosophers have found Bradley’s regress arguments to be compelling as stated. Some, in fact, have taken the regress arguments to be so threatening, that they have concluded that only non-relational ties might be able to unify qualities. Strawson (1959: 167–170), for instance, has appealed to non-relational ties such as instantial tie and characterizing tie to unify a particular with a sortal (such as dog) and characterizing universal (such as wisdom) respectively. He thought of these ties as being more intimate relators than ordinary relations as well as allowing for greater heterogeneity between the terms they bind. Bergmann (1967: 9) famously appealed to a non-relational tie he called “nexus” and which he introduced to tie the qualities directly, without mediation. Armstrong (1978: 110, 1989: 109) too embraced something he called a “non-relational fundamental tie” of instantiation.

Two objections are frequently brought against non-relational ties: (1) they are found to be more obscure than full-blooded relations; and (2) they are accused of not being able to stop the regress any more than ordinary relations do. Philosophers that find relations to be suspicious entities, tend to find non-relational ties even more suspicious and obscure. They ask: How are non-relational ties different from relations? If they are meant to relate or “tie” their relata, are they not sufficiently like relations? And if there was a problem with Bradley’s regress of relations in the first place, don’t we have the same problem with non-relational ties? (Lewis (2002) has made similar remarks against non-relational ties in the context of discussing the problem of termporary intrinsics and the adverbialist reply to the problem.) Vallicella (2000: 241) has attacked non-relational ties by arguing that even if the nexus manages to save Bergmann from the regress, the unity problem remains. The problem, as Vallicella sees it, then becomes that nexus is sufficiently like a universal that it remains unclear what it is that unites a, Fness, and nexus into a state of affairs as opposed to having a mere sum of a+Fness+nexus.

3.3 External Relations with Special Features

Philosophers impressed by Bradleyean arguments, but with the desire to preserve relations as unifiers of complex entities such as states of affairs or bundles of tropes, have been drawn towards postulating relations with certain special features. Convinced that relations ordinarily concieved would lead to a dangerous regress, these philosophers have tried to equip their relations with characteristics that would enable them to relate their relata and answer the “how do relations relate?” question.

For instance, Vallicella has argued in favor of an external unifying operator that connects a fact’s constituents and brings facts into existence. This external unifier U is described as a “metaphysical agent” that acts as an “existence maker” for facts (Vallicella 2000: 250); it does so due to “the power of contingent self-determination”, i.e., it has “the power to contingently determine itself as operating upon its operand” (Vallicella 2000: 256). In characterizing U in this way, Vallicella is trying to ensure both that the connection between U and what it unifies remains contingent, and that such unity is grounded in U itself (out of worry about the infinite regress). The only way that he can see U fulfill both these roles is by construing it “along the lines of God or a transcendental consciousness” (Vallicella 2000: 256). The trouble with this reply to Bradleyean arguments is, of course, that the god-like creating role of the external unifier U remains quite murky and it seems to bring in consciousness into both the operator itself as well as the creation of states of affairs.

Another novel relation has been proposed by Meinertsen (2008). He has argued for a self-relating relation to do the uniting of particulars and universals into states of affairs. According to this proposal, what makes R related to the pair (a, b) is a unifying self-relating relation U* which unites itself to R, a, and b. Thus, a state of affairs R (a, b) turns out to be identical to the state of affairs U* (U*, R, a, b) and a state of affairs Fa is just a short for U*(U*, F, a) (cf. Meinertsen 2008: 12). The self-relating relation U* occurs twice in the states of affairs it unites: the first time, outside the brackets, U* occurs in its “active” relating role; the second time, inside the brackets, U* occurs in its “passive” role as one of the constituents being related (cf. Meinertsen 2008: 15).

All this evokes Russell’s talk of relations having dual nature, i.e., being able to occur as terms of relations as well as relating relations. The trouble with such dual roles, is to explain, as Bradley asked Russell: “What is the difference between a relation which relates in fact and one which does not so relate?” (Bradley 1911: 74). Or for Meinertsen: What is the difference between a relation occurring in its passive role and it occurring in its active role? If we are willing to accept as a primitive that there is such a difference and that it is thanks to U*’s dual role as a self-relating relation that it is able to unify constituents of a complex a, b, and R, then why exactly is such a view an improvement upon a view that takes it that a relating relation R simply relates its relata?

Weiland and Betti (2008) on the one hand, and Maurin (2010) on the other, have argued for relata-specific relations as unifiers of tropes in trope bundles (Weiland and Betti hint at a possible extension of this idea to relations unifying particulars and universals in states of affairs). They have argued that the relational trope of compresence construed as asymmetrically dependent on specific relata is the way to solve the Bradleyean unity problem. It is part of the very nature of the relation of compresence to relate specific relata; thus, there would be a different compresence trope for each specific bundle of tropes. As Weiland and Betti put it:

If a relation is relata-specific, it necessarily relates its relata, but only if it exists. To put it in possible-worlds terminology: if R holds between a and b in the actual world, it holds between a and b in all possible worlds in which R exists (and not in any possible world in which a and b exist, or in any possible world whatsoever). (Weiland and Betti 2008: 519)

3.4 Mutual Interdependence of Constituents

In “Function and Concept” (1891), Frege famously described a concept-object distinction as a special case of the function-argument distinction. Concepts, according to Frege, were unsaturated and incomplete entities, in need of completion by objects. Because of such natures of concepts and objects, the two would presumably “fit” together without any intermediaries.

Taking a cue from Frege, some philosophers have argued in favor of a two-sided dependence of constituents of states of affairs (and a many-sided dependence of property tropes in trope bundles) as a non-relational way of accounting for the unity of such complexes. Baxter (2001), for instance, has proposed that the unity of particular and universal should be analyzed as partial identity. For Baxter, both particulars and universals have “aspects”. Different instances of one and the same universal are different aspects of a universal; spatial parts of particulars are their different aspects. Particulars and universals can be partially identical by overlapping in their aspects. Baxter writes:

Suppose Hume is a particular, Benevolence is a universal, and Hume is benevolent. Then Hume has as an aspect, Hume insofar as he is benevolent. Also Benevolence has as an aspect, Benevolence insofar as Hume has it. These are the same aspect—Hume’s benevolence. (Baxter 2001: 454)

Hume’s benevolence in Baxter’s example is what Armstrong calls a state of affairs. In fact, Armstrong was temporarily swayed by Baxter’s partial identity view of states of affairs, but then went on to object to the view on the grounds that partial identity cannot be merely contingent. Thus, for later Armstrong, “once one has identity, even if only partial identity, there will be found necessity” (Armstrong 2005: 317). A particular, thus, necessarily has all the properties that it in fact has, and the universal necessarily has the instances that it has. This outcome secures the unity of particulars and universals but at a cost of embracing a strong version of necessitarianism.

Inspired by earlier Armstrong, Perovic (2016) has proposed a non-necessitarian dependence model for particulars and universals in states of affairs. On this model, the constituents of most states of affairs such as this chalk being white exhibit mutual generic existential dependence. This simply captures the idea that a particular piece of chalk presumably cannot exist without having some color or other, it is generically existentially dependent upon some color universal. Similarly, the universal whiteness is generically existentially dependent on some concrete particular, for it cannot exist without inhering in some concrete particular or other, but it need not be the particular piece of chalk a. However, the state of affairs this particular chalk being white exhibits the strongest kind of dependence on its constitutive particular and universal—namely, it seems to exhibit one-sided specific existential dependence on its constituents. The reason why specific states of affairs seem to exhibit such strong existential dependence, is because of the simple fact that any change in a particular or in a universal would bring about a different state of affairs.

Simons (1994) put forward a similar proposal within the framework of his “nuclear theory” of tropes. He thinks of bundles of tropes as having different levels of unity. Property tropes that are essential to a particular are tightly woven through mutual dependence on one another, whereas property tropes that are accidental are more loosely dependent upon the tight bundle tropes in the nucleus.

One might find these sorts of proposals wanting since they only characterize the types of dependence that hold between constituents of unified wholes (whether they are states of affairs or nuclear bundles of tropes). But, the objection goes, they do not account for the difference between constituents considered outside of such unities and constituents in a unified whole. Here, Perovic (2016) is happy to admit that she is not trying to provide such an account in the first place. Following Armstrong, she takes the world to be exhausted by states of affairs and takes particulars and universals to exist only in states of affairs.

3.5 The Brute Fact Approach

The term “brute fact approach” is slightly ambiguous. It can be identified with the rejectionist view sketched along the lines of 3.1 above, where to say that relations’ job is to relate is to take that fact about relations as primitive or “brute”. However, the expression, as it is used here, is intended to refer to the view that takes complexes such as states of affairs or facts as unifiers of their own constituents. This view was defended by Olson (1987) and Armstrong (1989, 1997), and challenged by Vallicella (2000).

Olson finds that the upshot of Bradley’s arguments was not so much a reductio of relations, but to show that facts should be taken as irreducible entities. The word “relation”, for Olson, is ambiguous between two senses: the first one is to designate an entity that can be multiply instantiated by various pairs of relata, whereas the second sense is to designate the fact of relatedness. In place of “relation”, Olson prefers the word “connection”, since it “can only mean being connected. There is not the same temptation to think of it as an additional thing that does the connecting. The connection is not a constituent of the fact; it is the fact itself” (Olson 1987: 61). Armstrong seems to have something similar to this in mind when he says that states of affairs “come first”. But then he also adds that they “hold their constituents together in a non-mereological form of composition, a form of composition that even allows the possibility of having different states of affairs with identical constituents” (Armstrong 1997: 118, italics added).

Vallicella (2002) has objected to this sort of brute fact approach that it is mysterious and incoherent. He even accuses the proponents of the brute fact approach as being committed to the following contradiction:

It is self-evident that a fact, being a complex, is composed of its constituents and is thus nothing more than them. But it is also self-evident that a fact, being the unity of its constituents, is more than its constituents. Faced with this contradiction, we must either deny the existence of facts altogether […] or look beyond facts to something that can remove the contradiction. (Vallicella 2002: 20–21)

This objection, of course, presupposes that the only non-controversial form of composition is the mereological kind and that facts are “nothing more than their constituents”. Armstrong’s and Olson’s facts openly go against these assumptions: they are unities that are more than just the sum of their constituents. But failing to provide further ground for the difference between the sum and the fact makes such facts brute and unacceptable to Vallicella.

3.6 Benign Infinitism

In the context of discussion of states of affairs as unifiers of their constituents, Armstrong anticipated Vallicella’s objection just described. His reply was to claim that even if he had to concede that it was necessary to introduce a relation or a “fundamental tie” to account for the peculiar unity present in states of affairs, the resulting regress would not be vicious. In fact, such a regress would be closer to the benign truth regress—many truths, but only one truthmaker, just like with “p”, and “it is true that p”, and “it is true that it is true that p”, etc. Treating the instantiation regress in the same way, we would have the first instantiation relation uniting the constituents of the state of affairs, but all further relations would supervene and not present any further ontological addition.

Orilia (2006, 2007) develops this sort of response a bit further. He agrees with Armstrong (1997) that Bradley’s regress is an explanatory regress that is, in fact, benign. What makes it benign for Orilia is that at each step of an explanation the added fact explains the previous one via an additional external relation. He argues that despite it being the case “that at any given stage we can continue the explanatory task”, it “does not show that no knowledge or no understanding is provided at any stage”. According to Orilia, this “merely shows that at no stage we know/understand everything that there is to know/understand about the explicandum that gives rise to the expalantory chain. And noting that the explicandum in question gives rise to such an infinite chain may be considered part of our understanding of it” (Orilia 2007: 160).

Even if one were to grant Orilia that there can be infinite dependence chains of facts, for Maurin (2015) a crucial problem remains unresolved. According to her, Orilia’s account does nothing to answer what she calls the “how” question, i.e., the question “how can there be a situation in which the state of affairs that a is F exists?”. She argues that the infinitist’s reply already presupposes that there is unity of states of affairs before explaining what its existence depends upon—that is, a further state of affairs, etc. But the all important “how” question, according to Maurin, remains unanswered.

4. Further Applications of Bradley’s Regress

Grounding. The metaphysical debate about the nature of grounding and metaphysical explanation has taken an interest in Bradley’s regress from a different perspective. Here, the main Bradley-inspired issue has been whether or not it should be one of the requirements for a metaphysical explanation that it “must ground out”. The problem with Bradley’s regress in this context is that it appears to be committed to an infinite chain of facts, each one ontologically dependent on the subsequent one for its explanation. This is the situation described positively by Orilia (2006, 2007) above. The unity of a state of affairs Fa is explained by appeal to another higher-order fact R<Fa>, and this one in turn is explained by appeal to a further fact R′<R, <Fa>>, and so on ad infinitum. However, Cameron (2008) has found such a dependence chain to be very problematic. He believes that there is a strong intuition in favor of there being “a metaphysical ground, a realm of ontologically independent objects which provide the ultimate ontological basis for all the ontologically dependent entities, and a realm of basic facts which provide the ultimate metaphysical ground for all the derivative facts” (Cameron 2008: 8).

Cameron admits that it is hard to argue for this intuition by appeal to a further, more basic metaphysical principle. Instead, he suggests, it can be supported by appeal to theoretical utility; a unified explanation of the same sort of phenomenon seems preferable to an infinite descending chains of separate explanations. In response to Cameron, Orilia (2009) has pointed out weaknesses in Cameron’s appeal to a unified explanation as a way of supporting the thesis of well-foundeness of all chains of ontological dependence (WF); thus, Orialia has concluded that WF cannot yet have a claim of being a contingent truth.

Another interesting question inspired by Bradley’s regress arguments, has been posed by Bennett (2011). Her question is: is grounding itself fundamental? Prima facie, it seems that it can neither be fundamental, nor grounded. But if it is neither, then the grounding would have to be rejected, which is an unattractive outcome that Bennett does not want to embrace. Inspired by Armstrong’s (1989) discussion of the Bradley problem and relations of instantiation as internal and supervenient upon their relata, she then explores whether the grounding relation itself could be treated in a similar fashion. There is one important difference: rather than have grounding supervene on two or more relata, Bennett proposes that it be treated as a relation that supervenes upon only one of its relata. Such a relation she calls “superinternal”.

Debate concerning the nature of mataphysical explanation and the concept of grounding is quite prolific and ongoing. (For a detailed discussion see the SEP entry on Grounding.) What one must keep in mind when it comes to Bradleyean problems and grounding is that the former debate is itself quite varied and without a consensus on either the nature of the problem or the desiderata for the satisfactory solution. Thus, caution should be advised when importing conclusions from one contentious problem into the area of another even more abstract and contentious one.

Composition. Grounding considerations and Bradley’s regress have found their application in the discussion of the problem of composition of objects. Brzozowski (2008) has recently posed the following question concerning the location of composite objects: does the location of a composite object derive from the location of its proper parts, or not? (Brzozowski 2008: 193). Either way, Brzozowski takes it that we get unappealing consequences. The first horn of the dilemma is that if indeed the location of composite objects is derived from their proper parts, the possibility of spatio-temporal gunk objects (composite objects whose parts are themselves composite objects) would have to be denied. If, on the other hand, the location of composite objects is not derived from their proper parts, then brute metaphysical necessities connecting the location of composite objects with the locations of their proper parts must be posited. Brzozowski argues in favor of the first horn of the dilemma, and part of his argument relies on applying a Bradley-type argument to the location of gunk objects. His main thought is that there would be a serious problem of location of gunk objects since “even though at each level of the series of decomposition we can explain the location of a composite object by appealing to the location of a proper part, it is left unexplained how any object in the series is located in space-time. Given the piecemeal story, there is no way for the totality of location relations to be grounded…” (Brzozowski 2008: 201). As we can see, Brzozowski here relies on some version of Cameron’s WF principle described above.

Philosophy of Language. Outside of the strictly metaphysical debates, Bradleyean arguments are often brought up when discussing the problem of the unity of the proposition. This problem in philosophy of language is usually put as follows: what is the difference between a mere list of words such as "wise, Alice, is" and a meaningful sentence such as "Alice is wise"? The latter seems to possess a unity of some sort, but what is the exact nature of such unity and how does it come about? In analogy with the ontological version of Bradley’s regress, philosophers then worry that an appeal to a copula does not explain what it is that is special about the unity present in “Alice is wise” and absent in a mere list. And no appeal to further copulas will help the matters either.

There has been a tendency recently to view the problem of the unity of the proposition as a useful heuristic in interpreting views of Frege, Russell, and Wittgenstein. We can see this in Davidson’s (2005) posthumous work on truth and predication, where he often runs together the ontological and the semantic versions of what he refers to as “the problem of predication”. More careful work on this issue has been recently done by Gaskin (1995, 2008) and Collins (2011). The particularly obscure nature of the debate between Russell and Wittgenstein over Russell’s theory of judgment has lent itself to being interpreted as concerning the problem of the unity of the proposition. For such an interpretation see in particular Hanks (2007).


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