First published Thu Sep 23, 1999; substantive revision Wed Nov 25, 2020

Properties are those entities that can be predicated of things or, in other words, attributed to them. Thus, properties are often called predicables. Other terms for them are “attributes”, “qualities”, “features”, “characteristics”, “types”. Properties are also ways things are, entities that things exemplify or instantiate. For example, if we say that this is a leaf and is green, we are attributing the properties leaf and green to it, and, if the predication is veridical, the thing in question exemplifies these properties. Hence, properties can also be characterized as exemplifiables, with the controversial exception of those that cannot be instantiated, e.g., some would say, round and square. It is typically assumed that no other entities can be predicated and exemplified (Aristotle, Categories, 2a). For example, ordinary objects like apples and chairs cannot be predicated of, and are not exemplified by, anything.

The nature and existence of properties have always been central and controversial issues in philosophy since its origin, and interest in them keeps flourishing, as Allen’s (2016) recent introductory text well testifies (see also surveys or anthologies such as Loux 1972; Oliver 1996; Mellor and Oliver 1997; Koons and Pickavance 2017; Marmodoro and Mayr 2019). At least since Plato, who called them “ideas” or “forms”, properties are viewed as universals, i.e., as capable, (in typical cases) of being instantiated by different objects, “shared” by them, as it were; consequently, in contrast with particulars, or individuals, of being somehow at once in different places.[1] For example, if there are two potatoes each of which weighs 300 grams, the property weighing 300 grams is instantiated by two particulars and is therefore multi-located. According to a different conception, however, properties are themselves particulars, though abstract ones. As so conceived, properties are nowadays commonly called tropes, and are the subject of another entry. Here we shall focus on properties as universals. Relations, e.g., loving and between, can also be considered properties: they are predicable, exemplifiable, and viewable as universals. Accordingly, we use “property” as a generic term that also covers them, unless the context suggests otherwise. However, we shall consider their peculiarity only to a minimum extent, since they are discussed in detail in the entry on relations.

In §1 we consider some most fundamental themes, including the main motivations and arguments for including properties in one’s ontology. In §2 we deal with the central topic of what it is for properties to be exemplified. In §3 we tackle the intertwined issues of the existence and identity conditions for properties. In §4 we consider different senses in which properties may be structurally complex. In §5 we survey the frequent appeal to properties in current metaphysics of science. In §6 we conclude with a review of formal accounts of properties and their applications in natural language semantics and the foundations of mathematics, which provide additional motivations for an ontological commitment to properties.

1. Properties: Basic Ideas

There are some crucial terminological and conceptual distinctions that are typically made in talking of properties. There are also various sorts of reasons that have been adduced for the existence of properties and different traditional views about whether and in what sense properties should be acknowledged. We shall focus on such matters in the following subsections.

1.1 How We Speak of Properties

Properties are expressed, as meanings, by predicates. In the past “predicate” was often used as synonym of “property”, but nowadays predicates are linguistic entities, typically contrasted with singular terms, i.e., simple or complex noun phrases such as “Daniel”, “this horse” or “the President of France”, which can occupy subject positions in sentences and purport to denote, or refer to, a single thing. Following Frege, predicates are verbal phrases such as “is French” or “drinks”. Alternatively, predicates are general terms such as “French”, with the copula “is” (or verbal inflection) taken to convey an exemplification link (P. Strawson 1959; Bergmann 1960). We shall conveniently use “predicate” in both ways. Predicates are predicated of singular terms, thereby generating sentences such as “Daniel is French”. In the familiar formal language of first-order logic, this would be rendered, say, as “\(F(d)\)”, thus representing the predicate with a capital letter. The set or class of objects to which a predicate veridically applies is often called the extension of the predicate, or of the corresponding property. This property, in contrast, is called the intension of the predicate, i.e., its meaning. This terminology traces back to the Middle Age and in the last century has led to the habit of calling sets and properties extensional and intensional entities, respectively. Extensions and intensions can hardly be identified; this is immediately suggested by paradigmatic examples of co-extensional predicates that appear to differ in meaning, such as “has a heart”, and “has kidneys” (see §3.1).

Properties can also be referred to by singular terms, or so it seems. First of all, there are singular terms, e.g., “being honest” or “honesty”, that result from the nominalization of predicates, such as “is honest” or “honest” (some think that “being \(F\)” and “\(F\)-ness” stand for different kinds of property (Levinson 1991). Further, there are definite descriptions, such as “Mary’s favorite property”. Finally, though more controversially, there are demonstratives, such as “that shade of red”, deployed while pointing to a red object (Heal 1997).

Frege (1892) and Russell (1903) had different opinions regarding the ontological import of nominalization. According to the former, nominalized predicates stand for a “correlate” of the “unsaturated” entity that the predicate stands for (in Frege’s terminology they are a “concept correlate” and a “concept”, respectively). According to the latter, who speaks of “inextricable difficulties” in Frege’s view (Russell 1903: §49), they stand for exactly the same entity. Mutatis mutandis, they similarly disagreed about other singular terms that seemingly refer to properties. The ontological distinction put forward by Frege is mainly motivated by the fact that grammar indeed forbids the use of predicates in subject position. But this hardly suffices for the distinction and it is dubious that other motivations can be marshalled (Parsons 1986). We shall thus take for granted Russell’s line here, although many philosophers support Frege’s view or at least take it very seriously (Castañeda 1976; Cocchiarella 1986a; Landini 2008).

1.2 Arguments for Properties

Properties are typically invoked to explain phenomena of philosophical interest. The most traditional task for which properties have been appealed to is to provide a solution to the so-called “one over many problem” via a corresponding “one over many argument”. This traces back at least to Socrates and Plato (e.g., Phaedo, 100 c-d) and keeps being rehearsed (Russell 1912: ch. 9; Butchvarov 1966; Armstrong 1978a: ch. 7; Loux 1998: ch.1). The problem is that certain things are many, they are numerically different, and yet they are somehow one: they appear to be similar, in a way that suggests a uniform classification, their being grouped together into a single class. For example, some objects have the same shape, certain others have the same color, and still others the same weight. Hence, the argument goes, something is needed to explain this phenomenon and properties fill the bill: the objects in the first group, say, all have the property spherical, those in the second red, and those in the third weighing 200 grams.

Relatedly, properties have been called for to explain our use of general terms. How is it, e.g., that we apply “spherical” to those balls over there and refuse to do it for the nearby bench? It does not seem to be due to an arbitrary decision concerning where, or where not, to stick a certain label. It seems rather the case that the recognition of a certain property in some objects but not in others elicits the need for a label, “spherical”, which is then used for objects having that property and not for others. Properties are thus invoked as meanings of general terms and predicates (Plato, Phaedo, 78e; Russell 1912: ch. 9). In contrast with this, Quine (1948; 1953 [1980: 11, 21, 131] ) influentially argued that the use of general terms and predicates in itself does not involve an ontological commitment to entities corresponding to them, since it is by deploying singular terms that we purport to refer to something (see also Sellars 1960). However, as noted, predicates can be nominalized and thus occur as singular terms. Hence, even if one agrees with Quine, nominalized predicates still suggest the existence of properties as their referents, at least to the extent that the use of nominalized predicates cannot be paraphrased away (Loux 2006: 25–34; entry on platonism in metaphysics, §4).

After Quine (1948), quantificational idiom is the landmark of ontological commitment. We can thus press the point even more by noting that we make claims and construct arguments that appear to involve quantification over properties, with quantifiers reaching (i) over predicate positions, or even (ii) over both subject and predicate positions (Castañeda 1976).[2] As regards (i), consider: this apple is red; this tomato is red; hence, there is something that this apple is and this tomato also is. As for (ii), consider: wisdom is more important than beauty; Mary is wise and Elisabeth is beautiful; hence, there is something that Mary is which is more important than something that Elisabeth is.

Quantification over properties seems ubiquitous not just in ordinary discourse but in science as well. For example, the inverse square law for dynamics and the reduction of temperature to mean molecular energy can be taken to involve quantification over properties such as masses, distances and temperatures: the former tells us that the attraction force between any two bodies depends on such bodies’ having certain masses and being at a certain distance, and the latter informs us that the fact that a sample of gas has a given temperature depends on its having such and such mean kinetic energy.

Swoyer (1999: §3.2) considers these points within a long list of arguments that have been, or can be, put forward to motivate an ontological commitment to properties. He touches on topics such as a priori knowledge, change, causation, measurement, laws of nature, intensional logic, natural language semantics, numbers (we shall cover some of this territory in §5 and §6).

Despite all this, whether, and in what sense, properties should be admitted in one’s ontology appears to be a perennial issue, traditionally shaped as a controversy about the existence of universals.

1.3 Traditional Views about the Existence of Universals

Do universals really exist? There are three long-standing answers to this question: realism, nominalism, and conceptualism.

According to realists, universals exist as mind-independent entities. In transcendent realism, put forward by Plato, they exist even if uninstantiated and are thus “transcendent” or “ante res” (“before the things”). In immanent realism, defended by Aristotle in opposition to his master, they are “immanent” or “in rebus” (“in things”), as they exist only if instantiated by objects. Contemporary notable supporters are Russell (1912) for the former and Armstrong (1978a) for the latter (for recent takes on this old dispute see the essays by Loux, Van Inwagen, Lowe and Galluzzo in Galluzzo & Loux 2015). Transcendentism is of course a less economical position and elicits epistemological worries regarding our capacity to grasp ante res universals. Nevertheless, such worries may be countered in various ways (cf. entry on platonism in metaphysics, §5; Bealer 1982: 19–20; 1998: §2; Linsky & Zalta 1995), and uninstantiated properties may well have work to do, particularly in capturing the intuitive idea that there are unrealized possibilities and in dealing with cognitive content (see §3). A good summary of pro-transcendentist arguments and immanentist rejoinders is offered by Allen (2016: §2.3). See also Costa forthcoming for a new criticism of immanentism, based on the notion of grounding.

Nominalists eschew mind-independent universals. They may either resort to tropes in their stead, or accept predicate nominalism, which tries to make it without mind-independent properties at all, by taking the predicates themselves to do the classifying job that properties are supposed to do. This is especially indigestible to a realist, since it seems to put the cart before the horse by making language and mind responsible for the similarities we find in the rich varieties of things surrounding us. Some even say that this involves an idealist rejection of a mind-independent world (Hochberg 2013). Conceptualists also deny that there are mind-independent universals, and because of this they are often assimilated to nominalists. Still, they can be distinguished insofar as they replace such universals with concepts, understood as non-linguistic mind-dependent entities, typically functioning as meanings of predicates. The mind-dependence of concepts however makes conceptualism liable to the same kind of cart/horse worry just voiced above in relation to predicate nominalism.[3]

The arguments considered in §1.2 constitute the typical motivation for realism, which is the stance that we take for granted here. They may be configured as an abductive inference to the best explanation (Swoyer 1999). Thus, of course, they are not foolproof, and in fact nominalism is still a popular view, which is discussed in detail in the entry on nominalism in metaphysics, as well as in the entry on tropes. Conceptualism appears to be less common nowadays, although it still has supporters (cf. Cocchiarella 1986a: ch. 3; 2007), and it is worth noting that empirical research on concepts is flourishing.

1.4 Properties in Propositions and States of Affairs

We have talked above in a way that might give the impression that predication is an activity that we perform, e.g., when we say or think that a certain apple is red. Although some philosophers might think of it in this way, predication, or attribution, may also be viewed as a special link that connects a property to a thing in a way that gives rise to a propositions, understood as a complex featuring the property and the thing (or concepts of them) as constituents with different roles: the latter occurs in the proposition as logical subject or argument, as is often said, and the former as attributed to such an argument. If the proposition is true (the predication is veridical), the argument exemplifies the property, viz. the former is an instance of the latter. The idea that properties yield propositions when appropriately connected to an argument motivates Russell’s (1903) introduction of the term “propositional function” to speak of properties. We take for granted here that predication is univocal. However, according to some neo-Meinongian philosophers, there are two modes of predication, sometimes characterized as “external” and “internal” (Castañeda 1972; Rapaport 1978; Zalta 1983; see entry on nonexistent objects). Zalta (1983) traces back the distinction to Mally and uses “exemplification” to characterize the former and “encoding” to characterize the latter. Roughly, the idea is that non-existent objects may encode properties that existent objects exemplify. For instance, winged is exemplified by that bird over and is encoded by the winged horse.

It is often assumed nowadays that, when an object exemplifies a property, there is a further, complex, entity, a fact or state of affairs (Bergmann 1960; Armstrong 1997, entries on facts and states of affairs), having the property (qua attributed) and the object (qua argument) as constituents (this compositional conception is not always accepted; see, e.g., Bynoe 2011 for a dissenting voice). Facts are typically taken to fulfill the theoretical roles of truthmakers (the entities that make true propositions true, see entry on truthmakers) and causal relata (the entities connected by causal relations; see entry on the metaphysics of causation, §1). Not all philosophers, however, distinguish between propositions and states of affairs; Russell (1903) acknowledges only propositions and, for a more recent example, so does Gaskin (2008).

It appears that properties can have a double role that no other entities can have: they can occur in propositions and facts both as arguments and as attributed (Russell 1903: §48). For example, in truly saying that this apple is red and that red is a color, we express a proposition wherein red occurs as attributed, and another proposition wherein red occurs as argument. Correspondingly, there are two facts with red in both roles, respectively. This duplicity grounds the common distinction between different orders or types of properties: first-order ones are properties of things that are not themselves predicables; second-order ones are properties of first-order properties; and so on. Even though the formal and ontological issues behind this terminology are controversial, it is widely used and is often connected to the subdivision between first-order and higher-order logics (see, e.g., Thomason 1974; Oliver 1996; Williamson 2013; entry on type theory). It originates from Frege’s and Russell’s logical theories, especially Russell’s type theory, wherein distinctions of types and orders are rigidly regimented in order to circumvent the logical paradoxes (see §6).

1.5 Relations

A relation is typically attributed to a plurality of objects. These jointly instantiate the relation in question, if the attribution is veridical. In this case, the relata (as arguments) and the relation (as attributed) are constituents of a state of affairs. Depending on the number of objects that it can relate, a relation is usually taken to have a number of “places” or a “degree” (“adicity”, “arity”), and is thus called “dyadic” (“two-place”), “triadic” (“three-place”), etc. For example, before and between are dyadic (of degree 2) and triadic (of degree 3), respectively. In line with this, properties and propositions are “monadic” and “zero-adic” predicables, as they are predicated of one, and of no, object, respectively, and may then be seen as limiting cases of relations (Bealer 1982, where properties, relations and propositions are suggestively grouped under the acronym “PRP;” Dixon 2018; Menzel 1986; 1993; Swoyer 1998; Orilia 1999; Van Inwagen 2004; 2015; Zalta 1983). This terminology is also applied to predicates and sentences; for example, the predicate “between” is triadic, and the sentence “Peter is between Tom and May” is zero-adic. Accordingly, standard first-order logic employs predicates with a fixed degree, typically indicated by a superscript, e.g., \(P^1\), \(Q^2\), \(R^3\), etc.

In natural language, however, many predicates appear to be multigrade or variably polyadic; i.e., they can be used with different numbers of arguments, as they can be true of various numbers of things. For example, we say “John is lifting a table”, with “lifting” used as dyadic, as well as “John and Mary are lifting a table”, with “lifting” used as triadic. Moreover, there is a kind of inference, called “argument deletion”, which also suggests that many predicates that prima facie could be assigned a certain fixed degree are in fact multigrade. For example, “John is eating a cake” suggests that “is eating” is dyadic, but since, by argument deletion, it entails “John is eating”, one could conclude that it is also monadic and thus multigrade. Often one can resist the conclusion that there are multigrade predicates. For example, it could be said that “John is eating” is simply short for “John is eating something”. But it seems hard to find a systematic and convincing strategy that allows us to maintain that natural language predicates have a fixed degree. This has motivated the construction of logical languages that feature multigrade predicates in order to provide a more appropriate formal account of natural language (Grandy 1976; Graves 1993; Orilia 2000a). Since natural language predicates appear to be multigrade, one may be tempted to take the properties and relations that they express to also be multigrade, and the metaphysics of science may lend support to this conclusion (Mundy 1989).

Seemingly, relations are not jointly instantiated simpliciter; how the instantiation occurs also plays a role. This comes to the fore in particular with non-symmetric relations such as loving. For example, if John loves Mary, then loving is jointly instantiated by John and Mary in a certain way, whereas if it is Mary who loves John, then loving is instantiated by John and Mary in another way. Accordingly, relations pose a special problem: explicating the difference between facts, such as Abelard loves Eloise and Eloise loves Abelard, that at least prima facie involve exactly the same constituents, namely a non-symmetric relation and two other items (loving, Abelard, Eloise). Such facts are often said to differ in “relational order” or in the “differential application” of the non-symmetric relation in question, and the problem then is that of characterizing what this relational order or differential application amounts to.

Russell (1903: §218) attributed an enormous importance to this issue and attacked it repeatedly. Despite this, it has been pretty much neglected until the end of last century, with only few others confronting it systematically (e.g., Bergmann 1992; Hochberg 1987). However, Fine (2000) has forcefully brought it again on the ontological agenda and proposed a novel approach that has received some attention. Fine identifies standard and positionalist views (analogous to two approaches defended by Russell at different times (1903; 1984); cf. Orilia 2008). According to the former, relations are intrinsically endowed with a “direction”, which allows us to distinguish, e.g., loving and being loved: Abelard loves Eloise and Eloise loves Abelard differ, because they involve two relations that differ in direction (e.g., the former involves loving and the latter being loved). According to the latter, relations have different “positions” that can somehow host relata: Abelard loves Eloise and Eloise loves Abelard differ, because the two positions of the very same loving relation are differently occupied (by Abelard and Eloise in one case and by Eloise and Abelard in the other case). Fine goes on to propose and endorse an alternative, “anti-positionalist” standpoint, according to which relations have neither direction nor positions. The literature on this topic keeps growing and there are now various proposals on the market, including new versions of positionalism (Orilia 2014; Donnelly 2016; Dixon 2018), and primitivism, according to which differential application cannot be analyzed (MacBride 2014).

Russell (1903: ch. 26) also had a key role in leading philosophers to acknowledge that at least some relations, in particular spatio-temporal ones, are external, i.e., cannot be reduced to monadic properties, or the mere existence, of the relata, in contrast to internal relations that can be so reduced. This was a breakthrough after a long tradition tracing back at least to Aristotle and the Scholastics wherein there seems to be hardly any place for external relations (see entry on medieval theories of relations).[4]

1.6 Universals versus Tropes

According to some philosophers, universals and tropes may coexist in one ontological framework (see, e.g., Lowe 2006 for a well-known general system of this kind, and Orilia 2006a, for a proposal based on empirical data from quantum mechanics). However, nowadays they are typically seen as alternatives, with the typical supporter of universals (“universalist”) trying to do without tropes (e.g., Armstrong 1997) and the typical supporter of tropes (“tropist”) trying to dispense with universals (e.g., Maurin 2002).[5] In order to clarify how differently they see matters, we may take advantage of states of affairs. Both parties may agree, say, that there are two red apples, \(a\) and \(b\). They will immediately disagree, however, for the universalist will add that

  1. there are two distinct states of affairs, that a is red and that b is red,
  2. such states are similar in having the universal red as constituent, and
  3. they differ insofar as the former has \(a\) as constituent, whereas the latter has \(b\).

The tropist will reject these states of affairs with universals as constituents and rather urge that there are two distinct tropes, the redness of \(a\) and the redness of \(b\), which play a theoretical role analogous to the one that the universalist would invoke for such states of affairs. Hence, tropists claim that tropes can be causal relata (D. Williams 1953) and truthmakers (Mulligan, Simons, & Smith 1984).

Tropes are typically taken to be simple, i.e., without any subconstituent (see Section 2.2 of the entry on tropes). Their playing the role of states of affairs with universals as constituents depends on this: universals combine two functions, only one of which is fulfilled by tropes. On the one hand, universals are characterizers, inasmuch as they characterize concrete objects. On the other hand, they are also unifiers, to the extent that different concrete objects may be characterized by the very same universal, which is thus somehow shared by all of them; when this is the case, there is, according to the universalist, an objective similarity among the different objects (see §1.2). In contrast, tropes are only characterizers, for, at least as typically understood, they cannot be shared by distinct concrete objects. Given its dependency on one specific object, say, the apple \(a\), a trope can do the work of a state of affairs with \(a\) as constituent. But for tropes to play this role, the tropist will have to pay a price and introduce additional theoretical machinery to account for objective similarities among concrete objects. To this end, she will typically resort to the idea that there are objective resemblances among tropes, which can then be grouped together in resemblance classes. These resemblance classes play the role of unifiers for the tropist. Hence, from the tropist’s point of view “property” is ambiguous, since it may stand for the characterizers (tropes) or for the unifiers (resemblance classes) (cf. entry on mental causation, §6.5). Similarly, “exemplification” and related words may be regarded as ambiguous insofar as they can be used either to indicate that an object exemplifies a certain trope or to indicate that the object relates to a certain resemblance class by virtue of exemplifying a trope in that class.[6]

1.7 Kinds of Properties

Many important and often controversial distinctions among different kinds of properties have been made throughout the whole history of philosophy until now, often playing key roles in all sorts of disputes and arguments, especially in metaphysics. Here we shall briefly review some of these distinctions and others will surface in the following sections. More details can be found in other more specialized entries, to which we shall refer.

Locke influentially distinguished between primary and secondary qualities; the former are objective features of things, such as shapes, sizes and weights, whereas the latter are mind-dependent, e.g., colors, tastes, sounds, and smells. This contrast was already emphasized by the Greek atomists and was revived in modern times by Galileo, Descartes, and Boyle.

At least since Aristotle, the essential properties of an object have been contrasted with its accidental properties; the object could not exist without the former, whereas it could fail to have the latter (see entry on essential vs. accidental properties). Among essential properties, some acknowledge individual essences (also called “haecceities” or “thisnesses”), which univocally characterize a certain individual. Adams (1979) conceives of such properties as involving, via the identity relation, the very individual in question, e.g., Socrates: being identical to Socrates, which cannot exist if Socrates does not exist. In contrast, Plantinga (1974) views them as capable of existing without the individuals of which they are essences, e.g., Socratizing, which could have existed even if Socrates had not existed. See §5.2 on the issue of the essences of properties themselves.

Sortal properties are typically expressed by count nouns like “desk” and “cat” and are taken to encode principles of individuation and persistence that allow us to objectively count objects. For example, there is a fact of the matter regarding how many things in this room instantiate being a desk and being a cat. On the other hand, non-sortal properties such as red or water do not allow us to count in a similarly obvious way. This distinction is often appealed to in contemporary metaphysics (P. Strawson 1959: ch. 5, §2; Armstrong 1978a: ch. 11, §4), where, in contrast, the traditional one between genus and species plays a relatively small role. The latter figured conspicuously in Aristotle and in much subsequent philosophy inspired by him. We can view a genus as a property more general than a corresponding species property, in a hierarchically relative manner. For example, being a mammal is a genus relative to the species being a human, but it is a species relative to the genus being an animal. The possession of a property called differentia is appealed to in order to distinguish between different species falling under a common genus; e.g., as the tradition has it, the differentia for being human is being rational (Aristotle, Categories, 3a). Similar hierarchies of properties, however without anything like differentiae, come with the distinction of determinables and determinates, which appears to be more prominent in current metaphysics. Color properties provide typical examples of such hierarchies, e.g., with red and scarlet as determinable and determinate, respectively.

2. Exemplification

We saw right at the outset that objects exemplify, or instantiate, properties. More generally, items of all sorts, including properties themselves, exemplify properties, or, in different terminology, bear, have or possess properties. Reversing order, we can also say that properties characterize, or inhere in, the items that exemplify them. There is then a very general phenomenon of exemplification to investigate, which has been labeled in various ways, as the variety of terms of art just displayed testifies. All such terms have often been given special technical senses in the rich array of different explorations of this territory since Ancient and Medieval times up to the present age (see, e.g., Lowe 2006: 77). These explorations can hardly be disentangled from the task of providing a general ontological picture with its own categorial distinctions. In line with what most philosophers do nowadays, we choose “exemplification”, or, equivalently, “instantiation” (and their cognates), to discuss this phenomenon in general and to approach some different accounts that have been given of it in recent times. This sweeping use of these terms is to be kept distinct from the more specialized uses of them that will surface below (and to some extent have already surfaced above) in describing specific approaches by different philosophers with their own terminologies.

2.1 Monist vs. Pluralist Accounts

We have taken for granted that there is just one kind of exemplification, applying indifferently to different categories of entities. This monist option may indeed be considered the default one. A typical recent case of a philosopher who endorses it is Armstrong (1997). He distinguishes three basic categories, particulars, properties or relations, and states of affairs, and takes exemplification as cutting across them: properties and relations are exemplified not only by particulars, but by properties or relations and states of affairs as well. But some philosophers are pluralist: they distinguish different kinds of exemplification, in relation to categorial distinctions in their ontology.

One may perhaps attribute different kinds of exemplification to the above-considered Meinongians in view of the different sorts of predication that they admit (see, e.g., Monaghan’s (2011) discussion of Zalta’s theory). A more typical example of the pluralist alternative is however provided by Lowe (2006), who distinguishes “instantiation”, “characterization” and “exemplification” in his account of four fundamental categories: objects, and three different sorts of properties, namely kinds (substantial universals), attributes and modes (tropes).[7] To illustrate, Fido is a dog insofar as it instantiates the kind dog, \(D\), which in turn is characterized by the attribute of barking, \(B\). Hence, when Fido is barking, it exemplifies \(B\) occurrently by virtue of being characterized by a barking mode, \(b\), that instantiates \(B\); and, when Fido is silent, it exemplifies \(B\) dispositionally, since \(D\), which Fido instantiates, is characterized by \(B\) (see Gorman 2014 for a critical discussion of this sort of view).

2.2 Compresence and Partial Identity

Most philosophers, whether tacitly or overtly, appear to take exemplification as primitive and unanalyzable. However, on certain views of particulars, it might seem that exemplification is reduced to something more fundamental.

A well-known such approach is the bundle theory, which takes particulars to be nothing more than “bundles” of universals connected by a special relation, commonly called compresence, after Russell (1948: Pt. IV, ch. 8)[8]. Despite well-known problems (Van Cleve 1985), this view, or approaches in its vicinity, keep having supporters (Casullo 1988; Curtis 2014; Dasgupta 2009; Paul 2002; Shiver 2014; J. Russell 2018; see Sider 2020, ch. 3, for a recent critical analysis). From this perspective, that a particular exemplifies a property amounts to the property’s being compresent with the properties that constitute the bundle with which the particular in question is identified. It thus looks as if exemplification is reduced to compresence. Nevertheless, compresence itself is presumably jointly exemplified by the properties that constitute a given bundle, and thus at most there is a reduction, to compresence, of exemplification by a particular (understood as a bundle), and not an elimination of exemplification in general.

Another, more recent, approach is based on partial identity. Baxter (2001) and, inspired by him, Armstrong (2004), have proposed related assays of exemplification, which seem to analyze it in terms of such partial identity. These views have captured some interest and triggered discussions (see, e.g., Mumford 2007; Baxter’s (2013) reply to critics and Baxter’s (2018) rejoinder to Brown 2017).

Baxter (2001) relies on the notion of aspect and on the relativization of numerical identity to counts. In his view, both particulars and properties have aspects, which can be similar to distinct aspects of other particulars or properties. The numerical identity of aspects is relative to standards for counting, counts, which group items in count collections: aspects of particulars in the particular collection, and aspects of universals, in the universal collection. There can then be a cross-count identity, which holds between an aspect in the particular collection, and an aspect in the universal collection, e.g., the aspects Hume as human and humanity as had by Hume. In this case, the universal and the particular in question (humanity and Hume, in our example) are partially identical. Instantiation, e.g., that Hume instantiates humanity, then amounts to this partial identity of a universal and a particular. One may have the feeling, as Baxter himself worries (2001: 449), that in this approach instantiation has been traded for something definitely more obscure, such as aspects and an idiosyncratic view of identity. It can also be suspected that particulars’ and properties’ having aspects is presupposed in this analysis, where this having is a relation rather close to exemplification itself.

Armstrong (2004) tries to do without aspects. At first glance it seems as if he analyzes exemplification, for he takes the exemplification of a property (a universal) by a particular to be a partial identity of the property and the particular; as he puts it (2004: 47), “[i]t is not a mere mereological overlap, as when two streets intersect, but it is a partial identity”. However, when we see more closely what this partial identity amounts to, the suspicion arises that it presupposes exemplification. For Armstrong appears to identify a particular via the properties that it instantiates and similarly a property via the particulars that instantiate it. So that we may identify a particular, \(x\), via a collection of properties qua instantiated by \(x\), say \(\{F_x,\) \(G_x,\) \(H_x,\) …, \(P_x,\) \(Q_x,\) \(\ldots\};\) and a property, \(P\), via a collection of particulars qua instantiating \(P\), say \(\{P_a, P_b , \ldots ,P_x, P_y , \ldots \}\). By putting things in this way, we can then say that a particular is partially identical to a property when the collection that identifies the particular has an element in common with the collection that identifies the property. To illustrate, the \(x\) and the \(P\) of our example are partially identical because they have the element \(P_x\) in common. Now, the elements of these collections are neither properties tout court nor particulars tout court, which led us to talk of properties qua instantiated and particulars qua instantiating.[9] But this of course presupposes instantiation. Moreover, there is the unwelcome consequence that the world becomes dramatically less contingent than we would have thought at first sight, for neither a concrete particular nor a property can exist without it being the case that the former has the properties it happens to have, and that the latter is instantiated by the same particulars that actually instantiate it; we get, as Mumford puts it (2007: 185), “a major new kind of necessity in the world”.

2.3 Bradley’s Regress

One important motivation, possibly the main one, behind attempts at analysis such as the ones we have just seen is the worry to avoid the so-called Bradley’s regress regarding exemplification (Baxter 2001: 449; Mumford 2007: 185), which goes as follows. Suppose that the individual \(a\) has the property \(F\). For \(a\) to instantiate \(F\) it must be linked to \(F\) by a (dyadic) relation of instantiation, \(I_1\). But this requires a further (triadic) relation of instantiation, \(I_2\), that connects \(I_1, F\) and \(a\), and so on without end. At each stage a further connecting relation is required, and thus it seems that nothing ever gets connected to anything else (it is not clear to what extent Bradley had this version in mind; for references to analogous regresses prior to Bradley’s, see Gaskin 2008: ch. 5, §70).

This regress has traditionally been regarded as vicious (see, e.g., Bergmann 1960), although philosophers such as Russell (1903: §55) and Armstrong (1997: 18–19) have argued that it is not. In doing so, however, they seem to take for granted the fact that \(a\) has the property \(F\) (pretty much as in the brute fact approach; see below) and go on to see \(a\)’s and \(F\)’s instantiating \(I_1\) as a further fact that is merely entailed by the former, which in turn entails \(a\)’s, \(F\)’s and \(I_1\)’s instantiating \(I_2\), and so on. This way of looking at the matter tends to be regarded as a standard response to the regress. But those who see the regress as vicious assume that the various exemplification relations are introduced in an effort to explain the very existence of the fact that \(a\) has the property \(F\). Hence, from their explanatory standpoint, taking the fact in question as an unquestioned ground for a chain of entailments is beside the point (cf. Loux 1998: 31–36; Vallicella 2002).

It should be noted, however, that this perspective suggests a distinction between an “internalist” and an “externalist” version of the regress (in the terminology of Orilia 2006a). In the former, at each stage we postulate a new constituent of the fact, or state of affairs, \(s\), that exists insofar as \(a\) has the property \(F\), and there is viciousness because \(s\) can never be appropriately characterized.[10] In the latter, at each stage we postulate a new, distinct, state of affairs, whose existence is required by the existence of the state of affairs of the previous stage. This amounts to admitting infinite explanatory and metaphysical dependence chains. However, according to Orilia (2006b: §7), since no decisive arguments against such chains exist, the externalist regress should not be viewed as vicious (for criticisms, see Maurin 2015 and Allen 2016: §2.4.1; for a similar view about predication, see Gaskin 2008).

A typical line for those convinced that the regress is vicious has consisted in proposing that instantiation is not a relation, or at least not a normal one. Some philosophers hold that it is a sui generis linkage that hooks things up without intermediaries. Peter Strawson (1959) calls it a non-relational tie and Bergmann (1960) calls it a nexus. Broad (1933: 85) likened instantiation to glue, which just sticks two sheets of paper together, without needing anything additional; similarly, instantiation just relates. An alternative line has been to reject instantiation altogether. According to Frege, it is not needed, because properties have “gaps” that can be filled, and according to a reading of Wittgenstein’s Tractatus, because objects and properties can be connected like links in a chain. However, both strategies are problematic, as argued by Vallicella (2002). His basic point is that, if \(a\) has property \(F\), we need an ontological explanation of why \(F\) and \(a\) happen to be connected in such a way that \(a\) has \(F\) as one of its properties (unless \(F\) is a property that \(a\) has necessarily). But none of these strategies can provide this explanation. For example, the appeal to gaps is pointless: \(F\) has a gap whether or not it is filled by \(a\) (for example, it could be filled in by another object), and thus the gap cannot explain the fact that \(a\) has \(F\) as one of its properties.

Before turning to exemplification as partial identity, Armstrong (1997: 118) has claimed that Bradley’s regress can be avoided by taking a state of affairs, say \(x\)’s being \(P\), as capable by itself of holding together its constituents, i.e., the object \(x\) and the property \(P\) (see also Perovic 2016). Thus, there is no need to invoke a relation of exemplification linking \(x\) and \(P\) in order to explain how \(x\) and \(P\) succeed in giving rise to a unitary item, namely the state of affairs in question. There seems to be a circularity here for it appears that we want to explain how an object and a property come to be united in a state of affairs by appealing to the result of this unification, namely the state of affairs itself. But perhaps this view can be interpreted as simply the idea that states of affairs should be taken for granted in a primitivist fashion without seeking an explanation of their unity by appealing to exemplification or otherwise; this is the brute fact approach, as we may call it (for supporters, see Van Inwagen (1993: 37) and Oliver (1996: 33); for criticisms and a possible defense, see Vallicella 2002, and Orilia 2016, respectively).

Lowe (2006) has tried to tackle Bradley’s regress within his pluralist approach to exemplification. In his view, characterization, instantiation and exemplification are “formal” and thus quite different from garden-variety relations such giving or loving. This guarantees that these three relations escape Bradley’s regress (Lowe 2006: 30, 80, 90).[11] Let us illustrate how, by turning back to the Fido example of §2.1. What a mode instantiates and what it characterizes belong to its essence. In other words, a mode cannot exist without instantiating the attribute it instantiates and characterizing the object it characterizes. Hence, mode \(b\), by simply existing, instantiates attribute \(B\) and characterizes Fido. Moreover, since exemplification (the occurrent one, in this case) results from “composing” characterization and instantiation, \(b\)’s existence also guarantees that Fido exemplifies \(B\). According to Lowe, we thus have some truths, that \(b\) characterizes Fido, that \(b\) instantiates \(B\), and that Fido exemplifies \(B\) (i.e., is barking), all of which are made true by \(b\). Hence, there is no need to postulate as truthmakers states of affairs with constituents, Fido and \(b\), related by characterization, or \(b\) and \(B\), related by exemplification, or Fido and \(B\), related by exemplification. This, in Lowe’s opinion, eschews Bradley’s regress, since this arises precisely because we appeal to states of affairs with constituents in need of a glue that contingently keep them together. Nevertheless, there is no loss of contingency in Lowe’s world picture, for an object need not be characterized by the modes that happen to characterize it. Thus, for example, mode \(b\) might have failed to exist and there could have been a Fido silence mode in its stead, in which case the proposition that Fido is barking would have been false and the proposition that Fido is silent would have been true. One may wonder however what makes it the case that a certain mode is a mode of just a certain object and not of another one, say another barking dog. Even granting that it is essential for \(b\) to be a mode of Fido, rather than of another dog, it remains true that it is of Fido, rather than of the other dog, and one may still think that this being of is also glue of some sort, perhaps with a contingency inherited from the contingency of \(b\) (which might have failed to exist). The suspicion then is that the problem of accounting for the relation between a mode and an object has replaced the Armstrongian one of what makes it the case that a universal \(P\) and an object \(x\) make up the state of affairs \(x\)’s being \(P\). But the former problem, one may urge, is no less thorny than the latter, and some universalists like Armstrong may consider uneconomical Lowe’s acceptance of tropes in addition to universals (for accounts of Bradley’s regress analogous to Lowe’s, but within a thoroughly tropist ontology, see Section 3.2 of the entry on tropes.)

As it should be clear from this far from exhaustive survey, Bradley’s regress deeply worries ontologists and the attempts to tame it keep flowing.[12]

2.4 Self-exemplification

Presumably, properties exemplify properties. For example, if properties are abstract objects, as is usually thought, then seemingly every property exemplifies abstractness. But then we should also grant that there is self-exemplification, i.e., a property exemplifying itself. For example, abstractness is itself abstract and thus exemplifies itself. Self-exemplification however has raised severe perplexities at least since Plato.

Plato appears to hold that all properties exemplify themselves, when he claims that forms participate in themselves. This claim is crucially involved in his so-called third man argument, which led him to worry that his theory of forms is incoherent (Parmenides, 132 ff.). As we see matters now, it is not clear why we should hold that all properties exemplify themselves (Armstrong 1978a: 71); for instance, people are honest, but honesty itself is not honest (see, however, the entry on Plato’s Parmenides, and Marmodoro forthcoming).

Nowadays, a more serious worry related to self-exemplification is Russell’s famous paradox, constructed as regarding the property of non-self-exemplification, which appears to exemplify itself iff it does not, thus defying the laws of logic, at least classical logic. The discovery of his paradox (and then the awareness of related puzzles) led Russell to introduce a theory of types, which institutes a total ban on self-predication by a rigid segregation of properties into a hierarchy of types (more on this in §6.1). The account became more complex and rigid, as Russell moved from simple to ramified type theory, which involves a distinction of orders within types (see entries on type theory and Russell’s paradox, and, for a detailed reconstruction of how Russell reacted to the paradox, Landini 1998).

In type theory all properties are, we may say, typed. This approach has never gained unanimous consensus and its many problematic aspects are well-known (see, e.g., Fitch 1952: Appendix C; Bealer 1989). Just to mention a few, the type-theoretical hierarchy imposed on properties appears to be highly artificial and multiplies properties ad infinitum (e.g., since presumably properties are abstract, for any property \(P\) of type \(n\), there is an abstractness of type \(n+1\) that \(P\) exemplifies). Moreover, many cases of self-exemplification are innocuous and common. For example, the property of being a property is itself a property, so it exemplifies itself. Accordingly, many recent proposals are type-free (see §6.1) and thus view properties as untyped, capable of being self-predicated, sometimes veridically. An additional motivation to move in this direction is a new paradox proposed by Orilia and Landini (2019), which affects simple type theory. It is “contingent” in that it is derived from a contingent assumption, namely that someone, say John, is thinking just about the property of being a property \(P\) such that John is thinking of something that is not exemplified by \(P\).

3. Existence and Identity Conditions for Properties

Quine (1957 [1969: 23]) famously claimed that there should be no entity without identity. His paradigmatic case concerns sets: two of them are identical iff they have exactly the same members. Since then it has been customary in ontology to search for identity conditions for given categories of entities and to rule out categories for want of identity conditions (against this, see Lowe 1989). Quine started this trend precisely by arguing against properties and this has strictly intertwined the issues of which properties there are and of their identity conditions.[13]

3.1 From Extensionality to Hyperintensionality

In an effort to provide identity conditions for properties, one could mimic those for sets, or equate the former with the latter (as in class nominalism; see note 3), and provide the following extensionalist identity conditions: two properties are identical iff they are co-extensional. This criterion can hardly work, however, since there are seemingly distinct properties with the same extension, such as having a heart and having kidneys, and even wildly different properties such as spherical and weighing 2 kilos could by accident be co-extensive.

One could then try the following intensional identity conditions: two properties are identical iff they are co-intensional, i.e., necessarily co-extensional, where the necessity in question is logical necessity. This guarantees that spherical and weighing 2 kilos are different even if they happen to be co-extensional. Following this line, one may take properties to be intensions, understood as, roughly, functions that assign extensions (sets of objects) to predicates at logically possible worlds. Thus, for instance, the predicates “has a heart” and “has kidneys” stand for different intensions, for even if they have the same extension in the actual world they have different extensions at worlds where there are creatures with heart and no kidneys or vice versa. This approach is followed by Montague (1974) in his pioneering work in natural language semantics, and in a similar way by Lewis (1986b), who reduces properties to sets of possible objects in his modal realism, explicitly committed to possible worlds and mere possibilia inhabiting them. Most philosophers find this commitment unappealing. Moreover, one may wonder how properties can do their causal work if they are conceived of in this way (for further criticisms see Bealer 1982: 13–19, and 1998: §4; Egan 2004). However, the criterion of co-intensionality may be accepted without also buying the reduction of properties to sets of possibilia (Bealer views this as the identity condition for his conception 1 properties; see below). Still, co-intensionality must face two challenges coming from opposite fronts.

On the one hand, from the perspective of empirical science, co-intensionality may appear too strong as a criterion of identity. For the identity statements of scientific reductions, such as that of temperature to mean kinetic energy, could suggest that some properties are identical even if not co-intensional. For example, one may accept that having absolute temperature of 300K is having mean molecular kinetic energy of \(6.21 \times 10^{-21}\) (Achinstein 1974: 259; Putnam (1970: §1) and Causey (1972) speak of “synthetic identity” and “contingent identity”, respectively). Rather than logical necessity, it is nomological necessity, necessity on the basis of the causal laws of nature, that becomes central in this line of thought. Following it, some have focused on the causal and nomological roles of properties, i.e., roughly, the causes and effects of their being instantiated, and their involvement in laws of nature, respectively. They have thus advanced causal or nomic criteria. According to them, two properties are identical iff they have the same causal (Achinstein 1974: §XI; Shoemaker 1980) or nomological role (Swoyer 1982; Kistler 2002). This line has been influential, as it connects to the “pure dispositionalism” discussed in §5.2. There is however a suspicion of circularity here, since causal and nomological roles may be viewed as higher-order properties (see entry on dispositions, §3).

On the other hand, once matters of meaning and mental content are taken into account, co-intensionality might seem too weak, for it makes a property \(P\) identical to any logically equivalent property, e.g., assuming classical logic, \(P\) and (\(Q\) or not \(Q\)). And with a sufficiently broad notion of logical necessity, even, for example, being triangular and being trilateral are identical. However, one could insist that “trilateral” and “triangular” appear to have different meanings, which somehow involve the different geometrical properties having a side, and having an angle, respectively. And if being triangular were really identical to being trilateral, from the fact that John believes that a certain object has the former property, one should be able to infer that John also believes that such an object has the latter property. Yet, John’s ignorance may make this conclusion unwarranted. In the light of this, borrowing a term from Cresswell (1975), one may move from intensional to hyperintensional identity conditions, according to which two properties, such as trilaterality and triangularity, may be different even if they are co-intensional. In order to implement this idea, Bealer (1982) take two properties to be identical iff they have the same analysis, i.e., roughly, they result from the same ultimate primitive properties and the same logical operations applied to them (see also Menzel 1986; 1993). Zalta (1983; 1988) has developed an alternative available to those who admit two modes of predication (see §1.4): two properties are identical iff they are (necessarily) encoded by the same objects.

Hyperintensional conditions make of course for finer distinctions among entities than the other criteria we considered. Accordingly, the former are often called “fine-grained” and the latter “coarse-grained”, and the same denominations are correspondingly reserved for the entities that obey the conditions in question. Coarse- or fine-grainedness is a relative matter. The extensional criterion is more coarse-grained than the intensional or causal/nomological ones. And hyperintensional conditions themselves may be more or less fine-grained: properties could be individuated almost as finely as the predicates expressing them, to the point that, e.g., even being \(P\) and \(Q\) and being \(Q\) and \(P\) are kept distinct, but one may also envisage less stringent conditions that make for the identification of properties of that sort (Bealer 1982: 54). It is conceivable, however, that one could be logically obtuse to the point of believing that something has a certain property without believing that it has a trivially equivalent property. Thus, to properly account for mental content, maximal hyperintensionality appears to be required, and it is in fact preferred by Bealer. Even so, the paradox of analysis raises a serious issue. One could say, for example, that being a circle is being a locus of points equidistant from a point, since the latter provides the analysis of the former. In reply, Bealer distinguishes between “being a circle” as designating a simple “undefined” property, which is an analysandum distinct from the analysans, being a locus of points equidistant from a point, and “being a circle” as designating a complex “defined” property, which is indeed identical to that analysans. Orilia (1999: §5.5) similarly distinguishes between the simple analysans and the complex analysandum, without admitting that expressions for properties such as “being a circle” could be ambiguous in the way Bealer suggests. Orilia rather argues that the “is” of analysis does not express identity but a weaker relation, which is asymmetrical in that analysans and analysandum play different roles in it. The matter keeps being discussed. Rosen (2015) appeals to grounding to characterize the different role played by the analysans. Dorr (2016) provides a formal account of the “is” used in identity statements involving properties, according to which it stands for a symmetric “identification” relation.

3.2 The Sparse and the Abundant Conceptions

Bealer (1982) distinguishes between conception 1 properties, or qualities, and conception 2 properties, or concepts (understood as mind-independent). With a different and now widespread terminology, Lewis (1983, 1986b) followed suit, speaking of a sparse and an abundant conception of properties. According to the former, there are relatively few properties, namely just those responsible for the objective resemblances and causal powers of things; they cut nature at its joints, and science is supposed to individuate them a posteriori. According to the latter, there are immensely many properties, corresponding to all meaningful predicates we could possibly imagine and to all sets of objects, and they can be assumed a priori. (It should be clear that “few” and “many” are used in a comparative sense, for the number of sparse properties may be very high, possibly infinite). To illustrate, the sparse conception admits properties currently accepted by empirical science such as having negative charge or having spin up and rejects those that are no longer supported such as having a certain amount of caloric, which featured in eighteenth century chemistry; in contrast, the abundant conception may acknowledge the latter property and all sorts of other properties, strange as they may be, e.g., negatively charged or disliked by Socrates, round and square or Goodman’s (1983) notorious grue and bleen. Lewis (1986b: 60) tries to further characterize the distinction by taking the sparse properties to be intrinsic, rather than extrinsic (e.g., being 6 feet tall, rather than being taller than Tom), and natural, where naturalness is something that admits of degrees (for example, he says, masses and charges are perfectly natural, colors are less natural and grue and bleen are paradigms of unnaturalness). Much work on such issues has been done since then (see entries on intrinsic vs. extrinsic properties and natural properties).

Depending on how sparse or abundant properties are, we can have two extreme positions and other more moderate views in between.

At one end of the spectrum, there is the most extreme version of the sparse conception, minimalism, which accepts all of these principles:

  1. there are only coarse-grained properties,
  2. they exist only if instantiated and thus are contingent beings,
  3. they are all instantiated by things in space-time (setting aside those instantiated by other properties),
  4. they are fundamental and thus their existence must be sanctioned by microphysics.

This approach is typically motivated by physicalism and epistemological qualms regarding transcendent universals. The best-known contemporary supporter of minimalism is Armstrong (1978a,b, 1984). Another minimalist is Swoyer (1996).

By dropping or mitigating some of the above principles, we get less minimalist versions of the sparse conception. For example, some have urged uninstantiated properties to account for features of measurement (Mundy 1987), vectors (Bigelow & Pargetter 1991: 77), or natural laws (Tooley 1987), and some even that there are all the properties that can be possibly exemplified, where the possibility in question is causal or nomic (Cocchiarella 2007: ch. 12). In line with positions traditionally found in emergentism (see §5.1), Schaffer (2004) proposes that there are sparse properties as fundamental, and in addition, as grounded on them, the properties that need be postulated at all levels of scientific explanations, e.g., chemical, biological and psychological ones. Even Armstrong goes beyond minimalist strictures, when in his later work (1997) distinguishes between “first-class properties” (universals), identified from a minimalist perspective, and “second-class properties” (supervening on universals). All these positions appear to be primarily concerned with issues in the metaphysics of science (see §5) and typically display too short a supply of properties to deal with meaning and mental content, and thus with natural language semantics and the foundations of mathematics (see §6). However, minimalists might want to resort to concepts, understood as mind-dependent entities, in dealing with such issues (e.g., along the lines proposed in Cocchiarella 2007).

Matters of meaning and mental content are instead what typically motivate the views at the opposite end of the spectrum. To begin with, maximalism, i.e., the abundant conception in all its glory (Bealer 1982; 1993; Carmichael 2010; Castañeda 1976; Jubien 1989; Lewis 1986b; Orilia 1999; Zalta 1988; Van Inwagen 2004): properties are fine-grained necessary entities that exist even if uninstantiated, or even impossible to be instantiated. In its most extreme version, maximalism adopts identity conditions that differentiate properties as much as possible, but more moderate versions can be obtained by slightly relaxing such conditions. Views of this sort are hardly concerned with physicalist constraints or the like and rather focus on the explanatory advantages of hyperintensionality. These may well go beyond the typical motivations considered above: Nolan (2014) argues that hyperintensionality is increasingly important in metaphysics in dealing with issues such as counter-possible conditionals, explanation, essences, grounding, causation, confirmation and chance.

Rather than choosing between the sparse and abundant conceptions, the very promoters of this distinction have opted in different ways for a dualism of properties, according to which there are properties of both kinds. Lewis endorses abundant properties as reduced to sets of possibilia, and sparse properties either viewed as universals, and corresponding to some of the abundant properties (1983), or as themselves sets of possibilia (1986b: 60). Bealer (1982) proposes a systematic account wherein qualities are the coarse-grained properties that “provide the world with its causal and phenomenal order” (1982: 183) and concepts are the fine-grained properties that can function as meanings and as constituents of mental contents. He admits a stock of simple properties, which are both qualities and concepts (1982: 186), wherefrom complex qualities and complex concepts are differently constructed: on the one hand, by thought-building operations, which give rise to fine-grained qualities; on the other hand, by condition-building operations, which give rise to coarse-grained qualities. Orilia (1999) has followed Bealer’s lead in also endorsing both coarse-grained qualities and fine-grained concepts, without however identifying simple concepts and simple qualities. In Orilia’s account concepts are never identical to qualities, but may correspond to them; in particular, the identity statements of intertheoretic reductions should be taken to express the fact that two different concepts correspond to the same quality. Despite its advantages in dealing with a disparate range of phenomena, dualism has not gained any explicit consensus. Its implicit presence may however be widespread. For example, Putnam’s (1970: §1) distinction between predicates and physical properties, and Armstrong’s above-mentioned recognition of second-class properties may be seen as forms of dualism.

4. Complex Properties

It is customary to distinguish between simple and complex properties, even though some philosophers take all properties to be simple (Grossmann 1983: §§58–61). The former are not characterizable in terms of other properties, are primitive and unanalyzable and thus have no internal structure, whereas the latter somehow have a structure, wherein other properties, or more generally entities, are parts or constituents. It is not obvious that there are simple properties, since one may imagine that all properties are analyzable into constituents ad infinitum (Armstrong 1978b: 67). Even setting this aside, to provide examples is not easy. Traditionally, determinate colors are cited, but nowadays many would rather appeal to fundamental physical properties such as having a certain electric charge. It is easier to provide putative examples of complex properties, once some other properties are taken for granted, e.g., blue and spherical or blue or non-spherical. These logically compound properties, which involve logical operations, will be considered in §4.1. Next, in §4.2 we shall discuss other kinds of complex properties, called structural (after Armstrong 1978b), which are eliciting a growing interest, as a recent survey testifies (Fisher 2018). Their complexity has to do with the subdivisions of their instances into subcomponents. Typical examples come from chemistry, e.g., H2O and methane understood as properties of molecules.

It should be noted that it is not generally taken for granted that complex properties literally have parts or constituents. Some philosophers take this line (Armstrong 1978a: 36–39, 67ff.; Bigelow & Pargetter 1989; Orilia 1999), whereas others demur, and rather think that talk in terms of structures with constituents is metaphorical and dependent on our reliance on structured terms such as “blue and spherical” (Bealer 1982; Cocchiarella 1986a; Swoyer 1998: §1.2).

4.1 Logically Compound Properties

At least prima facie, our use of complex predicates suggests that there are corresponding complex properties involving all sorts of logical operations. Thus, one can envisage conjunctive properties such as blue and spherical, negative properties such as non-spherical, disjunctive properties such as blue or non-spherical, existentially or universally quantified properties such as loving someone or loved by everyone, reflexive properties such as loving oneself, etc. Moreover, one could add to the list properties with individuals as constituents, which are then denied the status of a purely qualitative property, e.g., taller than Obama.

It is easy to construct complex predicates. But whether there really are corresponding properties of this kind is a much more difficult and controversial issue, tightly bound to the sparse/abundant distinction. In the sparse conception the tendency is to dispense with them. This is understandable since in this camp one typically postulates properties in rebus for empirical explanatory reasons. But then, if we explain some phenomena by attributing properties \(F\) and \(G\) to an object, while denying that it does not exemplify \(H\), it seems of no value to add that it also has, say, F and G, F or H, and non-H. Nevertheless, Armstrong, the leading supporter of sparseness, has defended over the years a mixed stance without disjunctive and negative properties, but with conjunctive ones. Armstrong’s line has of course its opponents (see, e.g., Paolini Paoletti 2014; 2017a; 2020a; Zangwill 2011 argues that there are negative properties, but they are less real than positive ones). On the other hand, in the abundant conception, all sorts of logically compound properties are acknowledged. Since the focus now is on meaning and mental content, it appears natural to postulate such properties to account for our understanding of complex predicates and of how they differ from simple ones. Even here, however, there are disagreements, when it comes to problematic predicates such the “does not exemplify itself” of Russell’s paradox. Some suggest that in this case one should deny there is a corresponding property, in order to avoid the paradox (Van Inwagen 2006). However, we understand this predicate and thus it seems ad hoc that the general strategy of postulating a property fails. It seems better to confront the paradox with other means (see §6).

4.2 Structural Properties

Following Armstrong (1978b: 68–71; see also Fisher 2018: §2), a structural property \(F\) is typically viewed as a universal, and can be characterized thus:

  1. an object exemplifying \(F\), say \(x\), must have “relevant” proper parts that do not exemplify \(F\);
  2. there must be some other “relevant” properties somehow involved in \(F\) that are not exemplified by the object in question;
  3. the relevant proper parts must rather exemplify one or the other of the relevant properties involved in \(F\).

For instance, a molecule \(w\) exemplifying H2O has as parts two atoms \(h_1\) and \(h_2\) and an atom \(o\) that do not exemplify H2O; this property involves hydrogen and oxygen, which are not exemplified by \(w\); \(h_1\) and \(h_2\) exemplify hydrogen, and \(o\) exemplifies oxygen. For relational structural properties, there is the further condition that

  1. a certain “relevant” relation that links the relevant proper parts must also be involved.

H2O is a case in point: the relevant (chemical) relation is bonding, which links the three atoms in question. Another, often considered, example is methane as a structural property of methane-molecules (CH4), which involves a bonding relation between atoms and the joint instantiation of hydrogen (by four atoms) and carbon (by one atom). Non-relational structural properties do not require condition (iv). For instance, mass 1 kg involves many relevant properties of the kind mass n kg, for \(n \lt 1\), which are instantiated by relevant proper parts of any object that is 1 kg in mass, and these proper parts are not linked by any relevant relation (Armstrong 1978b: 70).

In most approaches, including Armstrong’s, the relevant properties and the relevant relation, if any, are conceived of as parts, or constituents, of the structural property in question, and thus their being involved in the latter is a parthood relation. For instance, hydrogen, oxygen and bonding are constituents of H2O. Moreover, the composition of structural properties is isomorphic to that of the complexes exemplifying them. These two theses characterize what Lewis (1986a) calls the “pictorial conception”. It is worth noting that structural properties differ from conjunctive properties such as human and musician, in that the constituents of the latter (i.e., human and musician) are instantiated by whatever entity exemplifies the conjunctive property (i.e., a human being who is also a musician), whereas the constituents of a structural property (e.g., hydrogen, oxygen and bonding) are not instantiated by the entities that instantiate it (e.g., H2O molecules).

Structural properties have been invoked for many reasons. Armstrong (1978b: ch. 22) appeals to them to explain the resemblance of universals belonging to a common class, e.g., lengths and colors. Armstrong (1988; 1989) also treats physical quantities and numbers through structural properties. The former involve, as in the above mass 1 kg example, smaller quantities such as mass 0.1 kg and mass 0.2 kg (this view is criticized by Eddon 2007). The latter are internal proportion relations between structural properties (e.g., being a nineteen-electrons aggregate) and unit-properties (e.g., being an electron). Moreover, structural properties have been appealed to in treatments of laws of nature (Armstrong 1989; Lewis 1986a), some natural kinds (Armstrong 1978b, 1997; Hawley & Bird 2011), possible worlds (Forrest 1986), ersatz times (Parsons 2005), emergent properties (O’Connor & Wong 2005), linguistic types (Davis 2014), ontic structural realism (Psillos 2012). However, structural universals have also been questioned on various grounds, as we shall now see.

Lewis (1986a) raises two problems for the pictorial conception. First, it is not clear how one and the same universal (e.g., hydrogen) can recur more than once in a structural universal. Let us dub this “multiple recurrence problem”. Secondly, structural universals violate the Principle of Uniqueness of Composition of classical mereology. According to this principle, given a certain collection of parts, there is only one whole that they compose. Consider isomers, namely, molecules that have the same number and types of atoms but different structures, e.g., butane and isobutane (C4H10). Here, butane and isobutane are different structural universals. Yet, they arise from the same universals recurring the same number of times. Let us dub this “isomer problem.”

Two further problems may be pointed out. First, even molecules with the same number and types of atoms and the same structures may vary in virtue of their spatial orientation (Kalhat 2008). This phenomenon is known as chirality. How can structural properties account for it? Secondly, the composition of structural properties is restricted: not every collection of properties gives rise to a structural property. This violates another principle of classical mereology: the Principle of Unrestricted Composition.

Lewis dismisses alternatives to the pictorial conception, such as the “linguistic conception” (in which structural universals are set-theoretic constructions out of simple universals) and the “magic conception” (in which structural universals are not complex and are primitively connected to the relevant properties). Moreover, he also rejects the possibility of there being amphibians, i.e., particularized universals lying between particulars and full-fledged universals. Amphibians would solve the multiple recurrence problem, as they would be identical with multiple recurrences of single universals. For example, in methane, there would be four amphibians of hydrogen.

To reply to Lewis’ challenges, two main strategies have been adopted on behalf of the pictorial conception: a non-mereological composition strategy, according to which structural properties do not obey the principles of classical mereology, and a mereology-friendly strategy. Let us start with the former.

Armstrong (1986) admits that the composition of structural universals is non-mereological. In his 1997, he emphasizes that states of affairs do not have a mereological kind of composition, and views universals, including structural ones, as states of affairs-types which, as such, are not mereological in their composition. Structural universals themselves turn out to be state of affairs-types of a conjunctive sort (1997: 34 ff.). To illustrate, let us go back to the above example with H2O exemplified by the water molecule \(w\). It involves the conjunction of these states of affairs:

  1. atom \(h_1\) being hydrogen,
  2. atom \(h_2\) being hydrogen,
  3. atom \(o\) being oxygen,
  4. \(h_1\), \(h_2\), and \(o\) being bonded.

This conjunction of states of affairs provides an example of a state of affairs-type identifiable with the structural universal H2O.

In pursuit of the non-mereological composition strategy, Forrest (1986; 2006; 2016) relies on logically compound properties, in particular (in his 2016) conjunctive, existentially quantified and reflexive ones. Bennett (2013) argues that entities are part of further entities by occupying specific slots within the latter. Parthood slots are distinct from each other. Therefore, which entity occupies which slot matters to the composition of the resultant complex entity. Hawley (2010) defends the possibility of there being multiple composition relations. In a more general way, McDaniel (2009) points out that the relation of structure-making does not obey some of the principles of classical mereology. Mormann (2010) argues that distinct categories (to be understood as in category theory) come together with distinct parthood and composition relations.

As regards the mereology-friendly strategy, it has been suggested that structural properties actually include extra components accounting for structures, so that the Principle of Uniqueness of Composition is safe. Considering methane, Pagès (2002) claims that such a structural property is composed of the properties carbon and hydrogen, a bonding relation and a peculiar first-order, formal relation between the atoms. According to Kalhat (2008), the extra component is a second-order arrangement relation between the first-order properties. Ordering formal relations—together with causally individuated properties—are also invoked by McFarland (2018).

At the intersection of these strategies, Bigelow and Pargetter (1989, 1991) claim that structural universals are internally relational properties that supervene on first-order properties and relations and on second-order proportion relations. Second-order proportion relations are relations such as having four times as. They relate first-order properties and relations. For example, in methane, the relation having four times as relates two conjunctive properties: (i) hydrogen and being part of this molecule; (ii) carbon and being part of this molecule.

Campbell (1990) solves the multiple recurrence problem and the isomer problem by appealing to tropes. In methane, there are multiple hydrogen tropes. In butane and isobutane, distinct tropes entertain distinct structural relations.

Despite Lewis’ dismissal, a number of theories appeal to amphibians (i.e., particularized universals lying between particulars and full-fledged universals) or, more precisely, to entities similar to amphibians. Fine (2017) suggests that structural properties should be treated by invoking arbitrary objects (Fine 1985). Davis’ (2014) account of linguistic types as structural properties confronts the problem of the multiple occurrence of one type, e.g., “dog”, in another (e.g., “every dog likes another dog”) (Wetzel 2009). In general, the idea that types are properties of tokens is a natural one, although there are also alternative views on the matter (see entry on types and tokens). Be this as it may, Davis proposes that types cannot occur within further types as tokens: they can only occur as subtypes. Therefore, subtypes lie, like amphibians, between types and tokens. Subtypes are individuated by their positions in asymmetric wholes, whereas they are primitively and non-qualitatively distinct in symmetric ones. The approach could be extended to properties such as methane, which would be taken to have four distinct hydrogen subtypes.

5. Properties in the Metaphysics of Science

When it comes to the metaphysical underpinnings of scientific theories, properties play a prominent role: it appears that science can hardly be done without appealing to them. This adds up to the case for realism about properties and to our understanding of them. We shall illustrate this here first by dwelling on some miscellaneous topics and then by focusing on a debate regarding the very nature of the properties invoked in science, namely whether or not they are essentially dispositional. Roughly, an object exemplifies a dispositional property, such as soluble or fragile, by having a power or disposition to act or being acted upon in a certain way in certain conditions. For example, a glass’ disposition of being fragile consists in its possibly shattering in certain conditions (e.g., if struck with a certain force). In contrast, something exemplifies a categorical property, e.g., made of salt or spherical, by merely being in a certain way (see entry on dispositions).

5.1 Miscellaneous Topics

Many predicates in scientific theories (e.g., “being a gene” and “being a belief”) are functionally defined. Namely, their meaning is fixed by appealing to some function or set of functions (e.g., encoding and transmitting genetic information). To make sense of functions, properties are needed. First, functions can be thought of as webs of causal relationships between properties or property-instances. Secondly, predicates such as “being a gene” may be taken to refer to higher-level properties, or at least to something that has such properties. In this case, the property of being a gene would be the higher-level property of possessing some further properties (e.g., biochemical ones) that play the relevant functions (i.e., encoding and transmitting genetic information). Alternatively, being a gene would be a property that satisfies the former higher-level property. Thirdly, the ensuing realization relationships between higher-level and function-playing properties can only be defined by appealing to properties (see entry on functionalism).

More generally, many ontological dependence and reduction relationships primarily concern properties: type-identity (Place 1956; Smart 1959; Lewis 1966) and token-identity (Davidson 1980) (see entry on the mind/brain identity theory), supervenience (Horgan 1982; Kim 1993; entry on supervenience); realization (Putnam 1975; Wilson 1999; Shoemaker 2007), scientific reduction (Nagel 1961). Moreover, a non-reductive relation such as ontological emergence (Bedau 1997; Paolini Paoletti 2017b) is typically characterized as a relation between emergent properties and more fundamental properties. Even mechanistic explanations often appeal to properties and relations in characterizing the organization, the components, the powers and the phenomena displayed by mechanisms (Glennan & Illari 2018; entry on mechanisms in science).

Entities in nature are typified by natural kinds. These are mostly thought of as properties or property-like entities that carve nature at its joints (Campbell, O'Rourke, & Slater 2011) at distinct layers of the universe: microphysical (e.g., being a neutron), chemical (e.g., being gold), biological (e.g., being a horse).

Physical quantities such as mass or length are typically treated as properties, specifiable in terms of a magnitude, a certain number, and a unit measure, e.g., kg or meter, which can itself be specified in terms of properties (Mundy 1987; Swoyer 1987). Following Eddon’s (2013) overview, it is possible to distinguish two main strands here: relational and monadic properties theories (see also Dasgupta 2013). In relational theories (Bigelow & Pargetter 1988; 1991), quantities arise from proportion relations, which may in turn be related by higher-order proportion relations. Consider a certain quantity, e.g., mass 3 kg. Here the thrice as massive as proportion relation is relevant, which holds of certain pairs of objects \(a\) and \(b\) such that \(a\) is thrice as massive as \(b\). By virtue of such relational facts, the first members of such pairs have a mass of 3 kg. Another relational approach is by Mundy (1988), who claims that mass 3 kg is a relation between (ordered pairs of) objects and numbers. For example, mass 3 kg is a relation holding between the ordered pair \(\langle a, b\rangle\) (assuming that \(a\) is thrice as massive as \(b\), and not the other way round) and the number 3; or—if relations have built-in relational order—between \(a, b\) and 3. Knowles (2015) holds a similar view, wherein physical quantities are relations that objects bear to numbers. According to the monadic properties approach, quantities are intrinsic properties of objects (Swoyer 1987; Armstrong 1988; 1989). As we saw, Armstrong develops such a view by taking quantities to be structural properties. Related metaphysical inquiries concern the dimensions of quantities (Skow 2017) and the status of forces (Massin 2009).

Lastly, properties play a prominent role in two well-known accounts of the laws of nature: the nomological necessitation account and law dispositionalism. The former has been expounded by Tooley (1977; 1987), Dretske (1977) and Armstrong (1983). Roughly, following Armstrong, a law of nature consists in a second-order and external nomological necessitation relation \(\rN\), contingently holding between first-order universals \(P\) and \(Q\): \(\rN(P, Q)\). Such a higher-order fact necessitates certain lower-order regularities, i.e., all the objects that have \(P\) also have \(Q\) (by nomological necessity, in virtue of \(\rN(P, Q))\). Law dispositionalism interprets laws of nature by appealing to dispositional properties. According to it, laws of nature “flow” from the essence of such properties. This implies that laws of nature hold with metaphysical necessity: whenever the dispositions are in place, the relevant laws must be in place too (Cartwright 1983; Ellis 2001; Bird 2007; Chakravartty 2007; Fischer 2018; see also Schrenk 2017 and Dumsday 2019). (For criticisms, see, e.g., van Fraassen 1989 as regards the former approach, and McKitrick 2018 and Paolini Paoletti 2020b, as regards the latter).

5.2. Essentially Categorical vs. Essentially Dispositional Properties

There is a domestic dispute among supporters of properties in the metaphysics of science, regarding the very nature of such properties (or at least the fundamental ones). We may distinguish two extreme views, pure dispositionalism and pure categoricalism. According to the former, all properties are essentially dispositional (“dispositional”, for brevity’s sake, from now on), since they are nothing more than causal powers; their causative roles, i.e., which effects their instantiations can cause, exhaust their essences. According to pure categoricalism, all properties are essentially categorical (in brief, “categorical”, in the following), because their causative roles are not essential to them. If anything is essential to a property, it is rather a non-dispositional and intrinsic aspect called “quiddity” (after Armstrong 1989), which need not be seen as an additional entity over and above the property itself (Locke 2012, in response to Hawthorne 2001). Between such views there lie a number of intermediate positions.

Pure dispositionalism has been widely supported in the last few decades (Mellor 1974; 2000; Shoemaker 1984: ch. 10 and 11 [in terms of causal roles]; Mumford 1998; 2004; Bird 2005; 2007; Chakravartty 2007; Whittle 2008; see Tugby 2013 for an attempt to argue from this sort of view to a Platonist conception of properties). There are three main arguments in favor of it. First, pure dispositionalism easily accounts for the natural necessity of the laws of nature, insofar as such a necessity just “flows” from the essence of the dispositional properties involved. Secondly, dispositional properties can be easily known as they really are, because it is part of their essence that they affect us in certain ways. Thirdly, at the (presumably fundamental) micro-physical level, properties are only described dispositionally, which is best explained by their being dispositional (Ellis & Lierse 1994; N. Williams 2011).

Nevertheless, pure dispositionalism is affected by several problems. First, some authors believe that it is not easy to provide a clear-cut distinction between dispositional and would-be non-dispositional properties (Cross 2005). Secondly, it seems that the essence of certain properties does not include, or is not exhausted by, their causative roles: qualia, inert and epiphenomenal properties,[14] structural and geometrical properties, spatio-temporal properties (Prior 1982; Armstrong 1999; for some responses, see Mellor 1974 and Bird 2007; 2009). Thirdly, there can be symmetrical causative roles. Consider three distinct properties \(A\), \(B\) and \(C\) such that \(A\) can cause \(B\), \(B\) can cause \(A\), \(A\) and \(B\) can together cause \(C\) and nothing else characterizes \(A\) and \(B\). \(A\) and \(B\) have the same causative role. Therefore, in pure dispositionalism, they turn out to be identical, against the hypothesis (Hawthorne 2001; see also Contessa 2019). Fourthly, according to some, pure dispositionalism falls prey to (at least) three distinct regresses (for a fourth regress, see Psillos 2006). Such regresses arise from the fact that the essential causative role of a dispositional property \(P\) “points towards” further properties \(S\), \(T\), etc. qua possible effects. The essential causative roles of the latter “point towards” still other properties, and so on. The first regress concerns the identity of \(P\), which is never fixed, as it depends on the identity of further properties, which depend for their identity on still other properties, and so on (Lowe 2006; Barker 2009; 2013). The second regress concerns the knowability of \(P\) (Swinburne 1980). \(P\) is only knowable through its possible effects (i.e., the instantiation of \(S\), \(T\), etc.), included in its causative role. Yet, such possible effects are only knowable through their possible effects, and so on. The third regress concerns the actuality of \(P\) (Armstrong 1997). \(P\)’s actuality is never reached, since \(P\) is nothing but the power to give rise to \(S\), \(T\), etc., which are nothing but the powers to give rise to further properties, and so on. For responses to these regresses, see Molnar 2003; Marmodoro 2009; Bauer 2012; McKitrick 2013; see also Ingthorsson 2013.

Pure categoricalism seems to imply that causative roles are only contingently associated to a property. Therefore, on pure categoricalism, a property can possibly have distinct causative roles, which allows it to explain—among other things—the apparent contingency of causative roles and the possibility of recombining a property with distinct causative roles. Its supporters include Lewis (1986b, 2009), Armstrong (1999), Schaffer (2005), and more recently Livanios (2017), who provides further arguments based on the metaphysics of science. Kelly (2009) and Smith (2016) may be added to the list, although they take roles to be non-essential and necessary (for further options, see also Kimpton-Nye 2018, Yates 2018a, Coates forthcoming and Tugby forthcoming).

However, pure categoricalism falls prey to two sorts of difficulties. First, the contingency of causative roles has some unpalatable consequences: unbeknownst to us, two distinct properties can swap their roles; they can play the same role at the same time; the same role can be played by one property at one time and by another property at a later time; an “alien” property can replace a familiar one by playing its role (Black 2000). Secondly, and more generally, we are never able to know which properties play which roles, nor are we able to know the intrinsic nature of such properties. This consequence should be accepted with “Ramseyan humility” (Lewis 2009; see also Langton 1998 for a related, Kantian, sort of humility) or it should be countered in the same way as we decide to counter any broader version of skepticism (Schaffer 2005). On this issue, see also Whittle (2006); Locke (2009); Kelly (2013); Yates (2018b).

Let us now turn to some intermediate positions.

According to dualism (Ellis 2001; Molnar 2003), there are both dispositional and categorical properties. Dualism is meant to combine the virtues of pure dispositionalism and pure categoricalism. It then faces the charge of adopting a less parsimonious ontology, since it accepts two classes of properties rather than one, i.e., dispositional and categorical ones.

According to the identity theory (Heil 2003; 2012; Jaworski 2016; Martin 2008; G. Strawson 2008; see also N. Williams 2019), every property is both dispositional and categorical (or qualitative). The main problem here is how to characterize the distinction and relation of these two “sides”. Martin and Heil suggest that they are two distinct ways of partially considering one and the same property, whereas Mumford (1998) explores the possibility of seeing them as two distinct ways of conceptualizing the property in question. Heil claims that the qualitative and the dispositional sides need to be identified with one another and with the whole property. Jacobs (2011) holds that the qualitative side consists in the possession of some qualitative nature by the property, whereas the dispositional side consists in that property being (part of) a sufficient truthmaker for certain counterfactuals. Dispositional and qualitative sides may also be seen as essential, higher-order properties of properties, as supervenient and ontologically innocent aspects of properties (Giannotti 2019), or as constituents of the essence of properties (Taylor 2018). In general, the identity theory is between Scylla and Charybdis. If it reifies the dispositional and qualitative sides, it runs the risk of implying some sort of dualism. If it insists on the identity between them, it runs the opposite risk of turning into a pure dispositionalist theory (Taylor 2018).

6. Formal Property Theories and their applications

Formal property theories are logical systems that aim at formulating “general noncontingent laws that deal with properties” (Bealer & Mönnich 1989: 133). In the next subsection we shall outline how they work. In the two subsequent subsections we shall briefly consider their deployment in natural language semantics and the foundations of mathematics, which can be taken to provide further reasons for the acknowledgment of properties in one’s ontology, or at least of certain kinds of properties.

6.1 Logical Systems for Properties

These systems allow for terms corresponding to properties, in particular variables that are meant to range over properties and that can be quantified over. This can be achieved in two ways. Either (option 1; Cocchiarella 1986a) the terms standing for properties are predicates or (option 2; Bealer 1982) such terms are subject terms that can be linked to other subject terms by a special predicate that is meant to express a predication relation (let us use “pred”) pretty much as in standard set theory a special predicate, “\(\in\)”, is used to express the membership relation. To illustrate, given the former option, an assertion such as “there is a property that both John and Mary have” can be rendered as

\[\notag \exists P(P(j) \amp P(m)).\]

Given the second option, it can be rendered as

\[\notag \exists x(\textrm{pred}(x, j) \amp \textrm{pred}(x, m)).\]

(The two options can be combined as in Menzel 1986; see Menzel 1993 for further discussion).

Whatever option one follows, in spelling out such theories one typically postulates a rich realm of properties. Traditionally, this is done by a so-called comprehension principle which, intuitively, asserts that, for any well-formed formula (“wff”) \(A\), with \(n\) free variables, \(x_1 , \ldots ,x_n\), there is a corresponding \(n\)-adic property. Following option 1, it goes as follows:

\[\tag{CP} \exists R^n \forall x_1 \ldots \forall x_n(R^n(x_1 , \ldots ,x_n) \leftrightarrow A). \]

Alternatively, one can use a variable-binding operator, \(\lambda\), that, given an open wff, generates a term (called a “lambda abstract”) that is meant to stand for a property. This way to proceed is more flexible and is followed in the most recent versions of property theory. We shall thus stick to it in the following. To illustrate, we can apply “\(\lambda\)” to the open formula, “\((R(x) \amp S(x))\)” to form the one-place complex predicate “[\(\lambda x (R(x) \amp S(x))\)]”; if “\(R\)” denotes being red and “\(S\)” denotes being square, then this complex predicate denotes the compound, conjunctive property being red and square. Similarly, we can apply the operator to the open formula “\(\exists y(L(x, y))\)” to form the one-place predicate “[\(\lambda x \exists y(L(x, y))\)]”; if “\(L\)” stands for loves, this complex predicate denotes the compound property loving someone (whereas “[\(\lambda y \exists x(L(x, y))\)]” would denote being loved by someone). To ensure that lambda abstracts designate the intended property, one should assume a “principle of lambda conversion”. Given option 1, it can be stated thus:

\[\tag{\(\lambda\)-conv} [\lambda x_1\ldots x_n A](t_1 , \ldots ,t_n) \leftrightarrow A(x_1 /t_1 , \ldots ,x_n /t_n).\]

\(A(x_1 /t_1 , \ldots ,x_n /t_n)\) is the wff resulting from simultaneously replacing each \(x_i\) in \(A\) with \(t_i\) (for \(1 \le i \le n)\), provided \(t_i\) is free for \(x_i\) in \(A\)). For example, given this principle, [\(\lambda x (R(x) \amp S(x))](j)\) is the case iff \((R(j) \amp S(j))\) is also the case.

Standard second-order logic allows for predicate variables bound by quantifiers. Hence, to the extent that these variables are taken to range over properties, this system could be seen as a formal theory of properties. Its expressive power is however limited, since it does not allow for subject terms that stand for properties. Thus, for example, one cannot even say of a property \(F\) that \(F = F\). This is a serious limitation if one wants a formal tool for a realm of properties whose laws one is trying to explore. Standard higher order logics beyond the second order obviate this limitation by allowing for predicates in subject position, provided that the predicates that are predicated of them belong to a higher type. This presupposes a grammar in which predicates are assigned types of increasing levels, which can be taken to mean that the properties themselves, for which the predicates stand for, are arranged into a hierarchy of types. Thus, such logics appropriate one version or another of the type theory concocted by Russell to tame his own paradox and related conundrums. If a predicate can be predicated of another predicate only if the former is of a type higher than the latter, then self-predication is banished and Russell’s paradox cannot even be formulated. Following this line, we can construct a type-theoretical formal property theory. The simple theory of types, as presented, e.g., in Copi (1971), can be seen as a prototypical version of such a property theory (if we neglect the principle of extensionality assumed by Copi). The type-theoretical approach keeps having supporters. For example, it is followed in the property theories embedded in Zalta’s (1983) theory of abstract objects and more recently in the metaphysical systems proposed by Williamson (2013) and Hale (2013).

However, for reasons sketched in §2.4, type theory is hardly satisfactory. Accordingly, many type-free versions of property theory have been developed over the years and no consensus on what the right strategy is appears to be in sight. Of course, without type-theoretical constraints, given \((\lambda\)-conv) and classical logic (CL), paradoxes such as Russell’s immediately follow (to see this, consider this instance of \((\lambda\textrm{-conv}): [\lambda x {\sim}x(x)]([\lambda x {\sim}x(x)]) \leftrightarrow{\sim}[\lambda x {\sim}x(x)]([\lambda x {\sim}x(x)])\)). In formal systems where abstract singular terms or predicates may (but need not) denote properties (Swoyer 1998), formal counterparts of (complex) predicates like “being a property that does not exemplify itself” (formally, “[\(\lambda x {\sim}x(x)\)]”) could exist in the object language without denoting properties; from this perspective, Russell’s paradox merely shows that such predicates do not stand for properties (similarly, according to Schnieder 2017, it shows that it is not possible that a certain property exists). But we would like to have general criteria to decide when a predicate stands for a property and when it does not. Moreover, one may wonder what gives these predicates any significance at all if they do not stand for properties. There are then motivations for building type-free property theories in which all predicates stand for properties. We can distinguish two main strands of them: those that weaken CL and those that circumscribe \((\lambda\)-conv) (some of the proposals to be mentioned below are formulated in relation to set theory, but can be easily translated into proposals for property theory).

An early example of the former approach was offered in a 1938 paper by the Russian logician D. A. Bochvar (Bochvar 1938 [1981]), where the principle of excluded middle is sacrificed as a consequence of the adoption of what is now known as Kleene’s weak three-valued scheme. An interesting recent attempt based on giving up excluded middle is Field 2004. A rather radical alternative proposal is to embrace a paraconsistent logic and give up the principle of non-contradiction (Priest 1987). A different way of giving up CL is by questioning its structural rules and turn to a substructural logic, as in Mares and Paoli (2014). The problem with all these approaches is whether their underlying logic is strong enough for all the intended applications of property theory, in particular to natural language semantics and the foundations of mathematics.

As for the second strand (based on circumscribing \((\lambda\)-conv)), it has been proposed to read the axioms of a standard set theory such as ZFC, minus extensionality, as if they were about properties rather than sets (Schock 1969; Bealer 1982; Jubien 1989). The problem with this is that these axioms, understood as talking about sets, can be motivated by the iterative conception of sets, but they seem rather ad hoc when understood as talking about properties (Cocchiarella 1985). An alternative can be found in Cocchiarella 1986a, where \((\lambda\)-conv) is circumscribed by adapting to properties the notion of stratification used by Quine for sets. This approach is however subject to a version of Russell’s paradox derivable from contingent but intuitively possible facts (Orilia 1996) and to a paradox of hyperintensionality (Bozon 2004) (see Landini 2009 and Cocchiarella 2009 for a discussion of both). Orilia (2000; Orilia & Landini 2019) has proposed another strategy for circumscribing \((\lambda\)-conv), based on applying to exemplification Gupta’s and Belnap’s theory of circular definitions.

Independently of the paradoxes (Bealer & Mönnich 1989: 198 ff.), there is the issue of providing identity conditions for properties, specifying when it is the case that two properties are identical. If one thinks of properties as meanings of natural language predicates and tries to account for intensional contexts, one will be inclined to assume rather fine-grained identity conditions, possibly even allowing that [\(\lambda x(R(x) \amp S(x))\)] and [\(\lambda x(S(x) \amp R(x))\)] are distinct (see Fox & Lappin 2015 for an approach based on operational distinctions among computable functions). On the other hand, if one thinks of properties as causally operative entities in the physical world, one will want to provide rather coarse-grained identity conditions. For instance, one might require that [\(\lambda x A\)] and [\(\lambda x B\)] are the same property iff it is physically necessary that \(\forall x(A \leftrightarrow B)\). Bealer (1982) tries to combine the two approaches (see also Bealer & Mönnich 1989)[15].

6.2 Semantics and Logical Form

The formal study of natural language semantics started with Montague and gave rise to a flourishing field of inquiry (see entry on Montague semantics). The basic idea in this field is to associate to natural language sentences wffs of a formal language, in order to represent sentence meanings in a logically perspicuous manner. The association reflects the compositionality of meanings: different syntactic subcomponents of sentences correspond systematically to syntactic subcomponents of the wffs; subcomponents of wffs thus represent the meanings of the subcomponents of the sentences. The formal language eschews ambiguities and has its own formal semantics, which grants that formulas have logical properties and relations, such as logical truth and entailments, so that in particular certain sequences of formulas count as logically valid arguments. The ambiguities we normally find in natural language sentences and the entailment relations that link them are captured by associating ambiguous sentences to different unambiguous wffs, in such a way that when a natural language argument is felt to be valid there is a corresponding sequence of wffs that count as a logically valid argument. In order to achieve all this, Montague appealed to a higher-order logic. To see why this was necessary, one may focus on this valid argument:

every Greek is mortal;
the president of Greece is Greek;


the president of Greece is mortal.

To grant compositionality in a way that respects the syntactic similarity of the three sentences (they all have the same subject-predicate form), and the validity of the argument, Montague associates (1)–(3) to formulas such as these:

\[ \tag{1a} [\lambda F \forall x(\mathrm{G}(x) \rightarrow F(x)](\mathrm{M}); \] \[ \tag{2a} [\lambda F \exists x(\forall y(P(x) \rightarrow x = y) \amp F(x))](G); \] \[ \tag{3a} [\lambda F \exists x(\forall y(P(x) \rightarrow x = y) \amp F(x))](\mathrm{M}). \]

The three lambda abstracts in (1a)–(3a) represent, respectively, the meanings of the three noun phrases in (1)–(3). These lambda-abstracts occur in predicate position, as predicates of predicates, so that (1a)–(3a) can be read, respectively, as: every Greek is instantiated by being mortal; the president of Greece is instantiated by being Greek; the president of Greece is instantiated by being mortal. Given lambda-conversion plus quantifier and propositional logic, the argument is valid, as desired. It should be noted that lambda abstracts such as these can be taken to stand for peculiar properties of properties, classifiable as denoting concepts (after Russell 1903; see Cocchiarella 1989). One may then say then this approach to semantics makes a case for the postulation of denoting concepts, in addition to the more obvious and general fact that it grants properties as meanings of natural language predicates (represented by symbols of the formal language).

This in itself says nothing about the nature of such properties. As we saw in §3.1, Montague took them to be intensions as set-theoretically characterized in terms of possible worlds. Moreover, he took them to be typed, since, to avoid logical paradoxes, he relied on type theory. After Montague, these two assumptions have been typically taken for granted in natural language semantics, though with attempts to recover hyperintensionality somehow (Cresswell 1985) in order to capture the semantics of propositional attitudes verbs such as “believe”, affected by the phenomena regarding mental content hinted at in §3.1. However, the development of type-free property theories has suggested the radically different road of relying on them to provide logical forms for natural language semantics (Chierchia 1985; Chierchia & Turner 1988; Orilia 2000b; Orilia & Landini 2019). This allows one to capture straightforwardly natural language inferences that appear to presuppose type-freedom, as they feature quantifiers that bind simultaneously subject and predicate positions (recall the example of §1.2). Moreover, by endowing the selected type-free property theory with fine-grained identity conditions, one also accounts for propositional attitude verbs (Bealer 1989). Thus, we may say that this line makes a case for properties understood as untyped and highly fine-grained.

6.3 Foundations of Mathematics

Since the systematization in the first half of last century, which gave rise to paradox-free axiomatizations of set theory such as ZFC, sets are typically taken for granted in the foundations of mathematics and it is well known that they can do all the works that numbers can do. This has led to the proposal of identifying numbers with sets. Russell’s type theory was an alternative that rather relied on properties (viewed as propositional functions), in backing up a logicist reduction of mathematics to logic. In essence, the idea was that properties can do all the work that sets are supposed to do, thus making the latter dispensable. Hence, Russell spoke of his approach as a “no-classes” theory of classes (see Landini 2011: 115, and §2.4 of the entry on Russell’s logical atomism; cf. Bealer 1982: 111–119, and Jubien 1989 for followers of this line). Following this line, numbers are then seen as properties rather than sets.

The Russellian approach did not encounter among mathematicians a success comparable to that of set theory. Nevertheless, from an ontological point of view, it appears to be more economical in its relying on properties, to the extent that the latter are needed any way for all sorts of explanatory jobs, reviewed above, which sets, qua extensional entities, can hardly perform. As we have seen, type theory is problematic. However, type-free property theories can come to the rescue by replacing typed properties with untyped ones in the foundations of mathematics. And in fact the advocates of such theories have often proposed to recover the logicist program, in particular by identifying natural numbers with untyped properties of properties (Bealer 1982; Cocchiarella 1986b; Orilia 2000b). (See also entry on logicism and neologicism).


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Other Internet Resources


This entry was first authored by Chris Swoyer. In 2011 and 2016 Francesco Orilia proceeded to major updates by still relying on the original text by Swoyer, who accordingly remained a co-author. In this update, we performed a major restructuring and rewriting in order to cover new territory while aiming at the same time at a more concise entry. Hence, we did not use the original text and Swoyer is no longer a co-author. However, we are indebted to him for many ideas and choice of topics, and we gratefully acknowledge this. Help, advice and useful comments on Orilia’s previous updates were provided by Donald Baxter, Christopher von Bülow, Laura Celani, Michele Paolini Paoletti, Gideon Rosen, Edward Zalta. We now wish to thank in particular Anna Marmodoro and Jessica Wilson and an anonymous referee for their detailed and helpful comments on this new version.

This work was supported by the Italian Ministry of Education, University and Research through the PRIN 2017 program “The Manifest Image and the Scientific Image”, prot. 2017ZNWW7F_004.

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Francesco Orilia <>
Michele Paolini Paoletti <>

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