Supplement to Rudolf Carnap

D. Methodology

The traditional representation of Carnap’s philosophical goals and methods emphasizes the negative aspect at the expense of the positive—the exclusion of metaphysics, the critique of Heidegger, the abandonment of ontological questions. But these were side shows on the larger canvas of Carnap’s philosophical priorities. Foremost in his own mind was the effort to reshape the human conceptual system, the way humans arrive at what they think they know, and how they use that knowledge in deciding how to arrange our lives and our societies. Certainly this involved sweeping away rubbish, in the spirit of Locke, but it mainly involved building new things to replace the rubbish. This positive impulse of conceptual engineering was the driving force of Carnap’s philosophy in all its aspects.

This constructive project took many different forms, but was always gradualist and detail-oriented, not comprehensive and revolutionary. Through all phases of Carnap’s career, the engineering projects he envisaged were not sweeping and global but piecemeal, concept by concept. This replacement of one concept at a time is what Carnap called rational reconstruction or explication. “Explication” is the more recent term used by Carnap, and we address it first, in sections 1 and 2; in section 3 we turn to “rational reconstruction”. The two terms as used by Carnap are approximately synonymous, except that explication is restricted to concepts while rational reconstruction applies more broadly. Until about 1945 he used the term “rational reconstruction”, while “explication” came after that, though “rational reconstruction” still occurred occasionally. So it is likely that around that time Carnap started referring to his philosophical method as explication. Carus (2007a,b) argues that the transition from rational reconstruction to explication is tied to the emergence of Carnap’s principle of tolerance in the early 1930s—see the supplement on Tolerance, Metaphysics, and Meta-Ontology). Roughly, explication is rational reconstruction with tolerance about logic—tolerance about linguistic frameworks. Friedman 2012 presents the same transition as going hand in hand with Carnap’s change of focus from epistemology towards the logic of science.)

Both rational reconstruction and explication, understood in Carnap’s constructive sense, are expressions of the voluntaristic conceptual engineering ethos we describe in the main entry (Section 1). From this viewpoint, though he was strongly influenced by Frege, Russell, and Wittgenstein, and though he himself influenced Quine and other later analytic philosophers, he does not really belong in the tradition of “analytic” philosophy, since his top priority was not analysis but construction, the design and building of new concepts and new conceptual systems. This has little to do with either the form of reductive analysis originally championed by Russell or the “connective” analysis later contrasted with reductive analysis by Strawson (1992).

1. Explication

“Explication” is introduced in 1945 (Carnap 1945a), then in Meaning and Necessity (1947), and is explained in most detail in the first chapter of Logical Foundations of Probability (1950b); the term accurately describes much of Carnap’s philosophical work. Carnap’s understanding of explication was influenced by Karl Menger’s conception of the methodological role of definitions in mathematics, exemplified by Menger’s own explicative definition of dimension in topology. (Carnap 1950b: §3 cites Menger, who was an important mathematician based first in Vienna, where he contributed to the Vienna Circle, and later in the US.) We will now explain explication more generally and then illustrate what it means by a concrete example in Carnap’s work.

Explication in Carnap’s sense is the replacement of a somewhat unclear and inexact concept C, the explicandum, by a new, clearer, and more exact concept \(C^*\), the explicatum. (Exactness may itself come in degrees. See Carnap 1963b: 936–7: “The only essential requirement is that the explicatum be more precise than the explicandum; it is unimportant to which part of the language it belongs… [how far to] move from ordinary language will depend on what [is] useful in the given case. I should like to emphasize… that this is a matter of degree”.) The explicandum C may belong to everyday language or to a previous stage of inquiry. Before an explication is sought, the explicandum C is to be clarified by examples and informal explanations that single out the intended context and purpose of the explication, e.g., aiming to sharpen those applications of C that serve a special function in a certain kind of context. (Tarski (1933 [1935]), for instance, famously explicated the truth predicate as it occurs in “true sentence” but not as it is used in “true proposition” or “true cause” or “true friend”, which would require separate explications.) An explication is only needed if C is not clear or exact enough for the purpose in question; otherwise C may be left intact until the need for greater precision arises.

Carnap adduces a number of obvious desiderata for an explication. He does not offer this list as exhaustive, let alone as anything like necessary and/or sufficient conditions for an explication, but merely for clarification of the kind of thing he has in mind. The first desideratum he mentions is exactness, by which Carnap means that the explication should where possible be embedded in some sufficiently clear and exact linguistic framework (see the main entry (Section 1.2)). The second is similarity to the explicandum (in the sense that at least many of its intended uses, brought out in the clarification step, are preserved in the explicatum). However, the extensions of C and \(C^*\) are not required to be identical. Indeed, “considerable differences are permitted” (Carnap 1950b: 7) when this serves the purposes of explication. First of all, some of the applications of C that might have been indeterminate originally may be decided in the course of explication (e.g., in the case of Tarski’s explication of truth, it may originally have been unclear how to deal with paradoxical sentences, such as the famous Liar sentence ‘This sentence is not true’, but then after explication the same sentence may, e.g., turn out to be non-well-formed). Secondly, even changes of clear-cut applications are acceptable when this serves desiderata other than similarity. (Carnap 1950b gives the example of re-classifying whales as non-fish, which happened to be useful for the purposes of biological research, even though the common-sense concept fish originally applied to whales.) Here we see another crucial desideratum in action, that is, fruitfulness: the explicatum should be usefully applicable in scientific or philosophical theorizing and discourse, e.g., in the formulation of lawlike statements, or by creating deductive or inductive links to established theories that are themselves sufficiently clear, exact, and successful. Fruitfulness is itself regarded as a comparative notion or a “matter of degree” (cf. Carnap 1956a: 62); the explicatum ought to be more fruitful than the explicandum. Carnap’s final desideratum for explications is simplicity. That is, once all other desiderata have been satisfied, the simplest available explication is to be preferred over more complicated alternatives.

While similarity is meant to ensure thaty the explication does not miss the relevant context crystallized out in the clarification step (\(C^*\) being an explication of C), the other three desiderata are to make sure that \(C^*\) actually improves upon C, so that it will pay off to replace C by \(C^*\) for the relevant purposes. In many cases, the desiderata of exactness and fruitfulness may be realized by giving the explicatum in terms of logical or mathematical concepts, which is why explication in Carnap’s mind often involves a certain degree of formalization. Indeed, as Carnap (1950b) points out, in many salient cases the development of scientific concepts seems to have led from a categorical or qualitative scale of concepts (“warm”), to a comparative or ordinal scale (“warmer than”), to concepts on a numerical or quantitative scale (“has a temperature of 25 degrees centigrade”) that crucially involves the assignment of numbers. At the same time, explication is also supposed to be an open-ended process that allows for iterated diachronic clarification and ever higher degrees of precision (\(C^*\), \(C^{**}\),…) of one and the same explicandum C, and which is also compatible with the synchronic co-existence of different explications (\(C_{1}^*\), \(C_{2}^*\),…) of one and the same C, possibly in different contexts or for different purposes.

Here is an example of an explication carried out by Carnap himself in his Logical Foundations of Probability (1950b): the explication of the scientific concept of confirmation. Scientists often use phrases such as “theory so-and-so is very well confirmed by the known data” or “this experiment confirmed our hypothesis” when they comment informally on their work, but the underlying concept of confirmation is neither particularly clear nor exact. What is more, combining apparent truisms about confirmation in ordinary language may easily lead to the paradoxical result that every statement seems to confirm every other statement (as observed by Hempel 1945 in the context of his own theory of confirmation and his discussion of the famous Paradox of Confirmation). Hence, philosophers of science should be interested in explicating the concept of confirmation, starting from some widely accepted instances and patterns regarding the confirmation of scientific hypotheses H by empirical evidence E and systematizing them into a more precise formulation of a widely applicable explication.

In this case, Carnap (1962: xvi, the preface to the second edition of Logical Foundations of Probability) proposes to carry out the explication in probabilistic terms, distinguishing between what we now call absolute and incremental confirmation: (i) H is absolutely confirmed by E relative to a probability measure P just in case the conditional probability \(P(H \mid E)\) of H given E is greater than some given threshold value. On the other hand, (ii) H is incrementally confirmed by E relative to a probability measure P just in case the conditional probability \(P(H \mid E)\) of H given E is greater than the prior probability \(P(H)\) of H. While absolute confirmation captures the explicandum “H is likely to be true given E”, incremental confirmation expresses the explicandum “E adds to the support of H”. In each of the two definitional equivalences (i) and (ii) above, the two sides of the equivalence express one and the same explicatum. The more or less vague pre-theoretic concept of confirmation is made more precise, in each case, by at least one of the two explicata, that is, “is absolutely confirmed by” or “is incrementally confirmed by”. (As Carnap says in the same preface, pp. xvii–xviii, he himself had failed to distinguish properly between the two explicata in some parts of the first edition. But Chapter VI, for instance, is entirely devoted to matters of probabilistic relevance, that is, incremental support.) Carnap also shows that the two explicata allow for comparative or quantitative variants, e.g., measuring the degree of incremental confirmation by means of the numerical difference \(P(H \mid E) - P(H)\) or by some other numerical confirmation measure.

Carnap (1950b: 23f) distinguishes two possible interpretations of the probabilistic function symbol ‘P’ in the above definitions, which need to be clearly distinguished, as they correspond to two different explicanda of probability: degrees of confirmation (or probability1) on the one hand, and long-run relative frequencies or statistical probabilities (or probability2) on the other hand. While degrees of confirmation apply to sentences or propositions, relative frequencies are an empirical matter and apply to open formulas or properties. Only probability1 applies to the explication of the confirmation of hypotheses by evidence. What is more, Carnap (1950b) still aimed to define mathematically a uniquely determined confirmation measure P with a purely logical or semantic interpretation (see the supplement on Inductive Logic). Present-day Bayesian philosophers of science prefer, rather, merely to characterize the relevant measures P as some ideal agent’s rational degree-of-belief functions, assuming only that these functions satisfy variants of the axioms of probability. (Carnap’s later understanding of confirmation measures, in his work after 1950, in which he deals with ever-growing classes of confirmation measures, comes closer to that modern Bayesian conception. See Sznajder (2017, 2018) for more on Carnap’s final take on inductive logic. Even by the standards of Carnap 1950b, understanding the underlying confirmation measure to be logical does not by itself entail the confirmation measure to be determined uniquely.)

In any case, as Carnap demonstrates (1950b: xix, 468–478), distinguishing carefully between the two notions of confirmation avoids Hempel’s (1945) triviality result by which Hempel had demonstrated that combining various apparently plausible assumptions on confirmation led to the conclusion that every hypothesis would have to confirm every other hypothesis: while some of the premises of the result really concern absolute confirmation, others pertain to incremental confirmation, and the paradoxical conclusion derives from failing to distinguish between them. (Hempel’s own syntactic and non-probabilistic definition of confirmation also avoided the triviality result by not satisfying all of its seemingly innocuous premises.) By utilizing the probabilistic background framework, both of Carnap’s explicata are more exact than their informal predecessor concept (so the criterion of exactness is satisfied). Various traditional patterns of inductive inference in science and statistics can be shown to follow by combining the definitions above with the axioms of probability and some additional mathematical constraints on P (1950b: 567–575, yielding similarity). Thereby, the explication builds a bridge between scientific confirmation and those areas in which probability theory is applied successfully, such as statistics and economics (in line with the fruitfulness desideratum). Finally, the explicata are no more complex than the notion of conditional probability itself, which is easy enough to define and understand (as required by simplicity). Although, in the meantime, this explication of confirmation has been refined and extended in multiple directions (see Fitelson 1999), and although it has attracted criticism, of course (see, e.g., Putnam 1963 and Glymour 1980), it remains one of the success stories of general philosophy of science and formal epistemology—one to which Carnap made a substantial contribution.

A characteristic feature of Carnapian explication—that Carnap himself, however, did not really discuss explicitly—is its open-endedness. There can be no “correct” explicatum of any given explicandum any more than there can be a “correct” choice of language. And the question whether whether one explicatum is better or more suitable for a given purpose than another is, as Howard Stein (1992) pointed out, an external question (in the sense of Carnap 1950a; see the supplement on Tolerance, Metaphysics, and Meta-Ontology), since it must be posed in a language other than that of any proposed explicatum. This distinguishes it from most other conceptions of explication or analysis, e.g., the older Russellian idea of analysis or what Quine called “explication” (but is actually not so different from Russell; see the following section below). In these views, explication (or analysis) has a more ontologically eliminative motivation and it is possible to distinguish between “correct” and “incorrect” explications or analyses; see Carus (2017) for further discussion of this aspect of Carnapian explication.

2. Later Discussion of Explication

In recent years, the underlying methodology of explication has itself become a major research topic. In the Schilpp volume on Carnap, Peter Strawson argued that by replacing an explicandum by an explicatum, Carnapian explication fails to address the philosophical problem it began with, since this “is not to solve the typical philosophical problem, but to change the subject” (1963: 506). Carnap replied that the traditional articulation of most philosophical problems is framed in ordinary language, with all its attendant vagueness and imprecision. In many cases this means that the problems themselves, and the ordinary-language intuitions underlying them, result from the imprecision and ambiguity of ordinary language, and these confusions can be revealed when more precise and less ambiguous languages are brought to bear on the problems. Yes, it is true that the original problem in its original articulation may disappear and be replaced by a clearer and more precisely stated problem, but that is because the original problem was a fake problem; it resulted from the way it was put—it represented nothing but entanglement in the ambiguities of ordinary language.

Carnap argued against the idea that our current version of ordinary language (in, e.g., English) is somehow a permanent or essential component of human mentality. We should not give that particular language such paramount centrality or regard other language forms (e.g., constructed languages) as merely parasitic on that ordinary language because it is possible to imagine being enculturated into very different language forms from our present ordinary languages. It is entirely contingent that we are presently enculturated (mostly) into a local ordinary language. Also, Carnap points out, Strawson’s idea that constructed languages are parasitic on natural languages requires there to be a sharp distinction between them, and such a distinction can only be arbitrary. Historically, he points out, the precision of constructed languages developed very gradually, so it would be arbitrary to place some sharp dividing line somewhere along this continuum (Carnap 1963: 934–6).

This exchange has been widely discussed in recent literature, with some authors concerned to sharpen and heighten the contrast between Carnap and Strawson (Loomis & Juhl 2006; Juhl & Loomis 2010), others to reconcile their positions (Justus 2012; Pinder forthcoming); the issues raised here have also been brought to bear on experimental philosophy (Shepherd & Justus 2015), the complementarity between experimental and formal philosophy (Schupbach 2017), and statistical prediction rules (Dutilh Novaes & Reck 2017).

Quine initially rejected Carnap’s project of explication, in “Two Dogmas” (1951), but later, in Word and Object (1960a), embraced it. Or at least he embraced the word “explication”. On closer inspection, it turns out that what he had in mind is closer to classical Russellian analysis than Carnapian explication; for Quine, “explication is elimination”. The difference between Carnap’s and Quine’s conceptions of explication is highlighted especially by Carus (2007a: 22–6), Richardson (2007), and Gustafsson (2014). There have also been more general discussions of Carnapian explication, e.g., by Maher (2007), Kitcher (2008), Brun (2016), and the papers in Wagner (2012). See Dutilh Novaes (forthcoming) for a comparison between explication and Sally Haslanger’s recent conception of ameliorative analysis.

3. Rational Reconstruction

In his earlier work, Carnap did not speak of explication but of rational reconstruction (“rationale Nachkonstruktion”), which he also applies somewhat more broadly—not just to concepts but to all sorts of human cognitive or proto-cognitive artifacts. For instance, Carnap (1945b: 95) refers to the rational reconstruction of “a body of generally accepted but more or less vague beliefs” [our emphasis] in the form of an exact theory, and he regards his system of inductive logic as a rational reconstruction of inductive reasoning. In the Aufbau, Carnap intends to replace classifications based on empathy and intuition by classifications based on rational conceptual criteria (§49), he aims to rationally reconstruct various kinds of human constructions (“rational reconstruction of an entity which has already been constructed in a partly intuitive, partly rational way in daily life or in the sciences”, §98), and he regards his project as one of rationally reconstructing cognition, where

The construction does not represent the actual process of cognition in its concrete manifestations, but… it is intended to give a rational reconstruction of the formal structure of this process. (Aufbau: §143)

As in explication, the output of a rational reconstruction differs from the input or reconstruendum (“This viewpoint allows and even requires deviations of the construction from the actual process of cognition”, §143), and it is consistent with a “multiplicity of possibilities” (§92) regarding the procedure for carrying out the rational reconstruction.

The formal method that is typical of Carnap’s early rational reconstructions is that of abstraction or logical construction: “intuitive” cognitive processes of abstraction are reconstructed in the form of precise logical definitions of higher-order entities (sets or higher-order concepts) based on some “given” lower-order entities (individuals).

Here is an example from the Aufbau: Carnap’s rational reconstruction of the formation of qualities from similarity by a method of abstraction which he calls “quasianalysis” and which is an extension of Frege’s and Whitehead and Russell’s method of defining equivalence classes on the basis of an equivalence relation (see sections 2.2 and 3.2–3.3 of the main entry for the historical background).

An equivalence relation R is a binary relation on a set of objects x that is reflexive (for all x, \(x R x)\), symmetric (for all x, if \(x R y\) then \(y R x)\), and transitive (for all x, if \(x R y\) and \(y R z\), then \(x R z)\). An equivalence class determined by R is a maximal set of objects each two of which are equivalent as determined by the given equivalence relation R. It is easy to show then that every object x is a member of one, and only one, equivalence class (“its” equivalence class). For example, the set of all VW Beetle cars is one of the equivalence classes of the equivalence relation is of the same car model as, and it is the uniquely determined equivalence class to which each actual instance of a VW Beetle belongs. The abstract type or quality VW Beetle may thus be identified with—or rationally reconstructed as—that equivalence class. Whether the reconstruction is a good one will depend partially on empirical circumstances; e.g., if it happened to be the case that there did not exist any instances of a VW Beetle, there also would not be a non-empty set of all VW Beetle instances, in which case VW Beetle could not be reconstructed successfully as the corresponding equivalence class.

As part of his project in the Aufbau, Carnap generalizes this method of abstraction to binary similarity relations, which are reflexive and symmetric but not necessarily transitive: if x is similar to y, and y is similar to z, then it is not necessarily that case that x is similar to z, as minor differences between x and y and between y and z may “add up”. Nevertheless, given a similarity relation, Carnap still proposes to turn to the class of maximal sets of pairwise similar elements in order to abstract qualitative “respects of similarity” from the given relation. Bertrand Russell (1914a) had put forward a similar idea when he suggested to define points of time as maximal sets of temporally overlapping events, the “similarity” relation in that case being the relation of overlap between events (see Lück 2006 and Mormann 2009 for more details).

In one of Carnap’s applications of the method in the Aufbau, the similarity relation is a binary relation Ae of qualitative phenomenal similarity that holds between total momentary slices x of a subject’s stream of experience, so-called “elementary experiences”. (Ae can be defined from the single primitive binary predicate Er of resemblance recollection that belongs to the “basis” of Carnap’s phenomenalist constitution system; for details see the supplement on Aufbau.) For example, it might be the case that \(x \Ae y\), because x involves an experience to the effect that the left-upper corner of one’s visual field contains a dark blue patch, while the elementary experience y at some different time includes an experience to the effect that the left-middle corner of one’s visual field contains a light blue patch (and hence the experience of a similar color at a similar place if compared to x). Other than visual sensations, x and y might also have something else in common, e.g., they might include similar auditory or tactile sensations or similar emotions. Given Ae, Carnap considers the set Ähnl of maximal sets X of pairwise similar elementary experiences, which can be defined by:

\[ \begin{align} \textit{Ähnl} = \{X \mid {} & (\textrm{i}) && \forall x, y \in X: x \Ae y,\\ & (\textrm{ii}) && \forall y \not\in X \neg\forall x \in X: x \Ae y\}. \end{align} \]

Here, (i) expresses that every two members of any such X are similar to each other, whereas (ii) ensures that X is maximal having this property (since there is no y outside of X that would still be similar to all of X’s elements). The members of Ähnl are no longer called “equivalence classes” but “similarity circles” (“Ähnlichkeitskreise” in German, hence the term “Ähnl”). In contrast to equivalence classes, similarity circles may overlap: for instance, a certain elementary experience involving a purple color patch at some spot in one’s visual field may share a similarity circle with an elementary experience that has a red color patch at a similar spot; but it may also share another similarity circle with an elementary experience that has a blue color patch at a similar place. (The one similarity is due to the red-purple similarity, the other one to the purple-blue similarity.) Hence, the corresponding members of Ähnl may serve as reconstructions of “extended” qualities, such as, e.g., extended regions in the “colored-place space”: one region of colored places that include red-purple shades at some set of locations, another region that includes purple-blue shades at some set of positions, and so on. At the same time, the elementary experience with the purple color spot may also include a certain kind of feeling in virtue of which it shares a third similarity circle with an elementary experience that involves a feeling of a similar kind. The corresponding similarity circle would thus represent an extended feeling quality; and so forth. In this way, one and the same elementary experience may inhabit various similarity circles representing different respects of similarity. That is because Ae itself does not differentiate between different kinds of similarity: \(x \Ae y\) may hold for various different “qualitative reasons”; and the method of quasi-analysis does not “know” about these reasons but needs to reconstruct them given just the similarity relation Ae itself. Carnap’s similarity circles result from logically reconstructing these “qualitative reasons” as higher-order entities (properties or classes of elementary experiences), while the application of the method of quasianalysis in that particular context may itself be considered as a rational reconstruction of the psychological process by which qualities are formed from similarity judgments (which may normally take place “intuitively” and unconsciously in the human cognitive system). The background framework for the rational reconstruction is, in this case, a system of higher-order logic or set theory (more particularly, in the case of Carnap’s Aufbau, the so-called simple theory of types).

This rational reconstruction of qualities through quasianalysis is not without problems, as Carnap himself had already recognized in §70 and §81 of the Aufbau, and Goodman (1951, 1963) would later diagnose in detail, followed by many others (D. Lewis 1969, Eberle 1975, Kleinknecht 1980, Proust 1986 [1989], Moulines 1991, Mormann 1994, 1997, Schoch 2001, Leitgeb 2011). The difficulties concern similarity relations for which quasianalysis either yields unintended similarity circles (“too many” similarity circles) or does not generate intended similarity circles (“too few” similarity circles) or both. In modern terminology: one may describe on the metalevel of the definition of Ähnl those qualities that one aims to reconstruct from similarity, and, in certain cases, quasianalysis may be shown not to deliver the similarity circles that correspond precisely to the qualities one intends to reconstruct. (Mormann 1994, 1997 interprets this as a kind of empirical underdetermination of theories by data.) Here is an example (of the type of difficulty that Goodman would call imperfect community later): assume that Ae looks as in Fig. 1, and that this is because elementary experiences 1, 2, 4 have quality A in common (constituting a reason for which 1, 2, 4 are pairwise similar), 2, 3, 5 have quality B in common (and thus are pairwise similar), 4, 5, 6 have quality C in common (again a reason for which they are pairwise similar), and that these are all of the relevant qualities that they have in common. Then quasi-analysis will determine the following similarity circles: \(\{1,2,4\},\) \(\{2,3,5\},\) \(\{4,5,6\}\), and \(\{2,4,5\}\). The first three of them are intended, as they reconstruct some of the qualities by which (speaking metalinguistically) the intended interpretation of ‘Ae’ had been explained. However, the fourth similarity circle \(\{2,4,5\}\) does not correspond to any of the original similarity-determining qualities: the reason it comes about is that 2 is similar to 4 in virtue of A, 2 is similar to 5 because of B, and 4 is similar to 5 in view of C (and no other elementary experience is similar to all of 2, 4, 5)—each two of them being similar for different reasons, which in this case has the effect that quasianalysis generates more qualities than intended.

An equilateral triangle with the corners labeled 1, 3, and 6. The midpoint between 1 and 3 is labeled 2. The midpoint between 3 and 6 is labeled 5. The midpoint between 1 and 6 is labeled 4. Points 2, 4, and 5 are also connected by lines to form a smaller equilateral triangle

Figure 1: A Similarity Relation

On the positive side, the formally precise definition of Ähnl makes it easy to criticize this method of abstraction, and to determine the exact conditions under which it delivers the intended distribution of similarity circles (Leitgeb 2007 provides results to that effect). For instance, as just mentioned, Carnap had already been aware of some of these worries, but he argued that so long as the subject in question had sufficiently many experiences of sufficiently varied character, these problems would not be relevant (Aufbau: §70), and that in those unfortunate circumstances in which quasianalysis were to fail, “the real process of cognition… would also not lead to normal results” (§81). However, as Leitgeb (2007) shows, based on formal theorems, even subjects with “realistic” experiences would be likely to suffer from imperfect community, in which case quasianalysis would over-generate similarity circles. In other cases (e.g., Russell’s abstraction of points of time from overlapping events), the same theorems demonstrate the viability of quasianalysis, given the “right” structure of the similarity relation in question.

The other benefit of the formality and precision of quasianalysis is that the same method may be applied in completely different contexts: e.g., in the definition of sentence meaning (see Quine’s From Stimulus to Science, 1995: 76), in metaphysical work on resemblance nominalism (Rodriguez-Pereyra 2002) and natural kinds (Quine 1970b, D. Lewis 1983), and in other areas.

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Hannes Leitgeb <>
André Carus <>

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