Supplement to Rudolf Carnap

A. Aufbau

It was long assumed that the sole point of Carnap’s Aufbau was the one Quine (1951: 39) attributed to it:

Radical reductionism… set itself the task of specifying a sense-datum language and showing how to translate the rest of significant discourse … into it. Carnap embarked on this project in the Aufbau.

A similar conception, though more appreciative of the book’s merits, was endorsed by Nelson Goodman (1951) and in subsequent critique of the Aufbau. Michael Friedman (1987) cast doubt on such a view, pointing out that it is inconsistent with many features of the text, not least its overriding preoccupation with the structural content of predicates and sentences. Friedman (2000, 2007) and subsequent investigators (Richardson 1998; Mormann 2003, 2004; Pincock 2002, 2005; Nasrin 2004; Tsou 2003; Carus 2007a: Ch. 5–6; the papers in Damböck 2016) have explored these questions further, but can hardly be said to have got to the bottom of this rich and enigmatic book. It continues to fascinate, and cannot be reduced to a single doctrine or preoccupation. The literature on it has grown to formidable proportions. Here we restrict ourselves to a few basic perspectives that recent philosophers have been particularly interested in: the constitution systems of the Aufbau, Carnap’s structuralism in the Aufbau, the reception and later discussion of the book, and finally a section on one particular response to it, Quine’s criticism of Carnap’s construction of three-dimensional space from the two-dimensional visual field in the Aufbau.

1. Constitution Systems

Carnap’s overall goal in the Aufbau is the design, study, and application of so-called constitution systems (“Konstitutionssysteme”, translated as “constructional systems” in the English translation of the Aufbau, though we prefer the term “constitution systems”): linguistic frameworks supplying all of the (names for) objects and concepts required by science. (Though these frameworks are not yet investigated with the help of a formalized metatheory—a “syntax theory”—as this would be the case later in Carnap’s Logical Syntax; see the supplement on Logical Syntax of Language.) Any such constitution system is supposed to be “a rational reconstruction of the entire formation of reality, which, in cognition, is carried out for the most part intuitively” (Aufbau: §100). In line with the “unity of science” ideal prevailing in the Vienna Circle at the time, each constitution system should suffice for all of science: while Carnap acknowledges that there are various different kinds, types, or levels of objects and concepts (subjective ones, physical ones, cultural ones, and so on), he also maintains that sentences about any such kind may always be transformed into sentences of a more basic kind until every sentence is translated into one consisting only of basic concepts and concerning only basic individuals.

The method by which higher-level objects and concepts are to be constituted from basic ones is definition (see §2 in the Aufbau), where definitions may be “explicit” (by which Carnap means definitional equalities, as in “\(R =\ldots\)”, §38) or “definitions in use”, which include what we now call explicit definitions of predicates (e.g., for all x, \(y: R(x, y) \leftrightarrow_{\df} \ldots x\ldots y\ldots)\) as well as contextual definitions (e.g., Russell’s elimination of definite descriptions in sentential contexts, §39).

Thus, a constitution system in the Aufbau is nothing but:

An interpreted language with both syntactic and semantic components, even though neither syntax nor semantics are determined in formally precise terms in the Aufbau.

(This contrasts with Carnap’s later works, such as The Logical Syntax of Language, in which the syntax of languages is developed with formal precision, and Meaning and Necessity, where both syntax and semantics are laid down precisely. See the supplements on Logical Syntax of Language and Semantics, respectively.)

A system of definitions.

Both parts of a constitution system are discussed metalinguistically, using informal expressions from natural language, mathematics, science, and traditional philosophy.

The language of any such constitution system is given jointly by its descriptive vocabulary (primitive predicates expressing the basic concepts), logical operators, and variables. The syntactic formation rules of the language are those of the logical system of simple type theory, although the rules are not stated explicitly in the Aufbau. Accordingly, for every constitution system envisaged in the Aufbau, its logical operators are those of simple type theory, which includes separate quantifiers and variables for individuals (basic objects), properties and relations of individuals, properties and relations of such properties and relations, and so forth. By means of the definitions, all sentences with defined terms are translatable into sentences involving only primitive predicates, logical operators, and variables. In the same way, mathematical concepts are meant to be reduced to logical ones (just as modern set theory reduces mathematical concepts to logical concepts and the membership relation). In this way, mathematical laws are translatable into laws of simple type theory which Carnap regards as logical laws, in line with the form of logicism (reducibility of mathematics to logic) that he defends at the time. (Carnap’s later 1931 article on “The Logicist Foundations of Mathematics” gives a very good survey of logicism about mathematics more generally.)

When some high-level statement is reduced to one that is solely expressed in terms of primitive expressions, the resulting reduction is only supposed to preserve extension (“logical value”), not (Fregean) sense or intension (“epistemic value”, Aufbau: §50). As Carnap argues, different senses may be attached to one and the same formula in one and the same constitution system: e.g., sentences in his phenomenalist constitution system (about which more below) may be paraphrased in everyday terms, or in the terms of the realistic language that is customary in the empirical sciences, or even in the terms of “fictitious constructive operations” (which resemble instructions in computer programs: see III.E in the Aufbau). While such paraphrases of one and the same constitution-system expression may differ in sense, they still coincide extensionally, and their extension is pinned down uniquely by the constitution formula. That is why Carnap regards the “actual language” of a constitution system to be the “symbolic language of logic” (§96). The point of assigning different readings to the formulas is merely to “facilitate” the “comprehension and examination” (§95) of the official logical language of the constitution system, amounting to a pluralism of choices of how to interpret and discuss a constitution system (as we would now say) at the metalevel.

More importantly, the primitive descriptive terms and the definitions that determine a constitution system may themselves be chosen in different ways: there is a whole variety of constitution systems available, each having its own distinctive virtues or shortcomings. We will first sketch the constitution system actually constructed in the Aufbau—the phenomenalist one—before we turn to some of the alternative systems that Carnap also mentions.

The advantage of the phenomenalist constitution system that Carnap develops in most detail in the Aufbau is supposed to be that the “logical” priority relation given by its chains of definitions reflects the epistemic priority between the defined concepts and objects (§54): when a relation R is defined in the system, say, on the basis of P and Q, then this ought to reflect that recognizing that something is R is based on, or presupposes, recognizing something to be P and recognizing something to be Q. For instance: cultural phenomena, such as the religion of a society, may be ascertained

through the representations, emotions, thoughts, volitions of a religious sort which occur with the members of this society; also, documents in the form of writing, pictures, and buildings are considered. (Aufbau: §55)

That is why psychological and physical objects may be viewed as epistemically prior to cultural ones. In turn, we can find out about (“hetero-”)psychological phenomena (occurring in other people), such as their emotions, by studying the physical ways in which they get expressed: by the pitch of a voice, facial expressions, gestures, and the like (§15). In this sense, physical objects may be regarded epistemically prior to (“hetero-”)psychological ones. Finally, the properties and relations of physical objects can be determined by their perceptible indicators, which Carnap takes to be subjective sensory qualities that one is consciously aware of. But one’s own (“auto-psychological”) conscious states and processes may be recognized without having to inspect entities of any other kind. In this sense, one’s own sensory experiences may be regarded epistemically prior to physical objects. On the logical side, this hierarchy of epistemic priority relations is reconstructed by the corresponding hierarchy of definitions in Carnap’s phenomenalist constitution system, which is the reason why Carnap believes the system to be particularly useful for epistemological purposes (§54, §59). (Carnap’s explicit definition of “auto-psychological” qualities from a given phenomenal similarity relation is described in detail in the supplement on Methodology (Section 3). This belongs to the part of the phenomenalist constitution system that concerns the definition of “auto-psychological” concepts.)

The choice of an “auto-psychological” basis still leaves many different options open. Traditional empiricism, such as that of Locke or Hume—and more recently Mach—had taken as basis the smallest identifiable element of sense perception, e.g., the equivalent of a pixel in the field of vision or a specific sound-quality at a particular pitch heard in a specious present moment. Instead, Carnap chose the entire experience of a specious present, prior to any differentiation even into a distinction between exogenous and endogenous experience, or into separate sense modalities, as his basic building block. This choice was motivated at least partly by psychological findings from empirical science. Carnap interpreted Gestalt psychology (Aufbau: §67) to indicate that “holistic” experiences are epistemically prior to “atomic” individual sensations (as in traditional empiricism). Accordingly, the single basic binary relation Er in his phenomenalist constitution system is a “holistic” recollection-of-similarity relation. Er applies to the basic elements of the system, the so-called elementary experiences (“Elementarerlebnisse”), which are temporal slices of one’s total stream of experience, including all of one’s conscious experiences at one extended subjective “specious present”, whether these experiences relate to some sensory modality (e.g., the experience of the left-upper corner of one’s visual field to be dark-blue) or some kind of inner experience, such as, e.g., a feeling. The basic predicate ‘Er’ is meant to apply to elementary experiences x and y (that is, \(x \Er y)\), if and only if the subject of the experiences recollects x to be similar to y in some respect. What this means exactly is a bit tricky, but the point is that there is both a temporal and a qualitative aspect to Er: on the one hand, x took place before y, and on the other hand, x and y are qualitatively similar-in-part: e.g., x might involve the experience of the left-upper corner of one’s visual field to be dark blue; and (the later) y includes the experience of the left-middle corner of one’s visual field to be light blue (and hence the experience of a similar color at a similar place). Other than visual sensations, x and y might also have something else in common, e.g., they might include similar auditory or tactile sensations as their parts, or similar emotions.

It is important to be clear about the language levels that are involved here (see section 9 of Leitgeb 2007): any such explanation of the intended interpretation of ‘Er’ must be formulated on a metalevel relative to the (object) language of the constitution system. Within the constitution system itself, however, ‘Er’ is a primitive term that is not defined or explained at all. A similar distinction applies when one says that elementary experiences are similar “in part” or that they are “one’s” or “my” experiences: in the constitution system, terms for parts of elementary experiences and for the subject of experience are to be defined on the basis of ‘Er’, at some level high up in the constitution system. But within the metalanguage, these terms may be assumed to be understood already (if only imprecisely) and may therefore be used as a guide to the meaning of ‘Er’ as described on the metalevel. While the Carnap of the Aufbau does not yet possess the Tarskian apparatus of formally distinguishing object language from metalanguage, he clarifies and explains the corresponding language levels rather carefully throughout the Aufbau: e.g., in §108, his presentation of the relation Er as basic (primitive) in his phenomenalist constitution system is clearly distinguished from his informal paraphrases of Er in which Er is explained on the basis of other terms (in realistic language or in the language of “fictitious constructive operations”). And in §75–81 he distinguishes between terms as understood in the constitution system and terms as used in informal explanations by a simple synactic device: the former terms are enclosed by two occurrences of ‘K’ for ‘Konstitutionsystem’ whereas the latter terms are enclosed by occurrences of ‘P’ for ‘language of psychology’.

Although Part IV of the Aufbau focuses on this phenomenalist constitution system, Carnap emphasizes the existence of a great variety of alternative ways of building constitution systems: as the title of Part IV of the Aufbau expresses, it is merely an “Outline of a Constitutional System” (our emphasis); it is nowhere suggested that the phenomenalist constitution system is “the best” or “most natural” such system for all purposes whatever—let alone “the true” system, as suggested by Quine’s interpretation of the Aufbau. Even as far as matters of epistemic priority are concerned, Carnap acknowledges that other paths of recognition or ascertainment are available that could be reconstructed by means of alternative chains of definition; e.g., even one’s own inner states might be determined from their bodily expressions, or, once neuroscience will have progressed sufficiently, they might be detected through the brain processes that accompany them (§57). If the paths of definitions were adjusted accordingly, the resulting constitution systems might serve epistemological purposes just as well as, or even better than, the phenomenalist constitution system of the Aufbau.

What is more, one might construct constitution systems for completely different purposes than those of epistemology, e.g., with the goal of maximizing the convenience and simplicity by which empirical laws can be reconstructed in precise terms in the system. If that is the goal, a “system with a physical basis constitutes a more appropriate arrangement of concepts than any other” (§59). Carnap suggests that the basis of such a physicalist system might consist, e.g., of subatomic particles as basic objects, and their spatial and temporal relations as basic relations (nor does he require any observability conditions of such a physicalist basis). Or, alternatively, space-time points of the four-dimensional space-time continuum might serve as basic objects, and their relative positions in the continuum, augmented by certain physical relations between real numbers and space-time points, as basic relations (§62); and so forth.

The claim that multiple basic elements and relations, and multiple systems of definitions, are available from which one may choose freely for different purposes is clearly a predecessor of Carnap’s later principle of tolerance in the Logical Syntax (see supplement on Tolerance, Metaphysics, and Meta-Ontology (Section 1)). This said, Carnap soon realized that the “tolerance” of the Aufbau did not go far enough: on the one hand, restricting the methods of concept formation to that of definition turned out to be overly restrictive. (See section 4 below; later critiques and responses to this problem are discussed in the supplement on Reconstruction of Scientific Theories.) On the other hand, tolerance does not as yet extend to logic itself (as it later would in the Logical Syntax), as one and the same logical system of simple type theory is used for all of the constitution systems discussed in the Aufbau. Finally, neither the constitution systems nor their metalinguistic discussion is constructed formally, as the languages in Syntax would later be. For Carnap’s own later purposes and by his own later standards, therefore, the procedures of concept formation in the Aufbau are not yet precise enough.

2. Structuralism in the Aufbau

Since Carnap’s central example of a constitution system in the Aufbau is a phenomenalist one with a subjective basis, the obvious question arises whether it is feasible on that basis to constitute the objects and concepts of the objective or intersubjective world of science, and especially of the physical world—a world presumed to be (at least approximately) the same for all of us. The reason why Carnap thinks this is possible is that he regards science as dealing only with the structure of objects (§§10–16): with their form, not their “content”. That is why it should be possible, he says, to reconstruct scientific statements as structural statements (dealing with the structure of subjective experience in the phenomenalist constitution system, the structure of physical entities in a physicalist constitution system, and so on). Even when their content is ultimately subjective, as it is in a phenomenalist constitution system, their special logical form would still leave these structural statements with the required scientific objectivity.

But what exactly is a “structural statement”? With a reference to Poincaré (§16), Carnap suggests that not sensations themselves but only the relations between sensations can be regarded as objective (and in §7 he claims that in a constitution system the system of basic relations is, in a sense, prior to the basic elements). Moreover, in the course of scientific development, predicates for properties (such as x is blue) became definable or reconstructible in terms of relations that can be expressed in mathematical terms (such as x emits a light wave that has a rate of oscillation of…, §10). Indeed, in the meantime, “almost all physical concepts have been transformed into purely structural concepts”. This paraphrases the more detailed discussion of the progression from qualitative to comparative to quantitative scientific concepts in Physical Concept Formation (Carnap 1926), which remains unchanged a quarter century later in §§4–5 of Chapter 1 of the Logical Foundations of Probability in the context of the explication of concepts (see the supplement on Methodology (Section 1)). Carnaps says about mathematical and physical concepts:

All mathematical concepts are reducible to concepts which stem from the theory of relations: four-dimensional tensor and vector fields are structural schemata; the network of world lines with the relations of coincidence and local time order is a structural schema in which only two relations are still names; and even these are uniquely determined through the character of the schema. (Aufbau, §16)

But replacing predicates for properties by predicates for relations is just the first step in making a statement “structural”:

From the relations, we must go on to the structures of relations if we want to reach completely formalized entities. Relations themselves are not intersubjectively communicable in their qualitative peculiarity. It was not until Russell [Introduction to Mathematical Philosophy] that the importance of structure for the achievement of objectivity was pointed out. (Aufbau, §16)

So the next step is to replace predicates for relations by yet more structural descriptions of the formal higher-order properties of these relations (e.g., a relation R being reflexive, symmetric, and transitive). Finally, such formal higher-order properties can be expressed with the help of logical terms (e.g.: (i) R is reflexive: for all x, \(x R x\). (ii) R is symmetric: for all x, y, if \(x R y\) then \(y R x\). (iii) R is transitive: for all x, y, z, if \(x R y\) and \(y R z\), then \(x R z)\). (Here and in what follows, we replace Carnap’s own symbols in the Aufbau by modern ones, for the sake of readability.) The idea is that ultimately every scientific predicate may be reconstructed by means of such logical descriptions of structural higher-order properties of relations—properties that are invariant under isomorphisms (one-to-one and onto structure-preserving mappings of the domain of the relation R; accordingly, the structure of a relation R can be defined as the class of relation extensions that are isomorphic to R; §34). In this way, science heads towards “formalization and dematerialization” (§23), and “each scientific statement can in principle be so transformed that it is nothing but a structure statement” (§16). (As we explain in the supplement on Reconstruction of Scientific Theories (Section 5), his preferred mature reconstructions of science also involve a detailed reconstruction of the structural content of sentences and theories, but only with respect to theoretical terms rather than observational terms, and on a strictly physicalistic basis.)

Carnap illustrates this idea, which he regards as closely related to Hilbert’s (1899) famous “implicit definitions” of geometric terms, by his example of a schematic railway map:

Let us look at the railroad map of, say, the Eurasian railroad network… It does not represent the distances, but only the connections within the network; (to use the terminology of geometry) it indicates only the topological, not the metrical, properties of the network… We assume now that all stations are marked as points, but the map is not to contain any names nor any entries other than rail lines. The question now is: can we determine the names of the points on the map through an inspection of the actual railroad network? … we look up the intersections of highest order, i.e., those in which the largest number of lines meet. We will find only a small number of these. Assume that we find twenty intersections in which eight lines meet. We then count, for each such point, the number of stations between it and the next intersection on each of the eight lines, and we will hardly find two of the eight to coincide in all eight numbers. Thus we have identified all twenty points. But if there are still two, or even all twenty, which have the same numbers, then all we have to do is to consider the connections between each of the eight neighboring intersections: whether or not they have direct connections, how many stations there are between them, how many lines meet in these neighboring connections, etc. But what happens if there are two intersections for which we cannot find any difference even after surveying the entire system? This simply means that there are two points with identical structural characteristics (homotopic points) as far as the relation to neighboring railroad stations is concerned. […] If there should still be two locations for which we have found no difference even after exhausting all available scientific relations, then they are indistinguishable, not only for geography, but for science in general. They may be subjectively different: I could be in one of these locations, but not in the other. But this would not amount to an objective difference, since there would be in the other place a man just like myself who says, as I do: I am here and not there. (Aufbau, §14)

Within the phenomenalist constitution system in the Aufbau, Carnap aims to realize this idea by defining concepts in logical-structural terms. For example: from the given relation Er of resemblance collection, he defines the class erl of elementary experiences as the field of \(\Er(\erl = \{x \mid \exists y: x \Er y\} \cup \{y \mid \exists x: x \Er y\}).\) Then he defines the relation Ae of qualitative phenomenal similarity as the reflexive transitive closure of Er (the least reflexive and transitive relation of elementary experiences that is a superset of Er). This being in place, he defines the class of what he calls similarity circles; a similarity circle is a maximal class of elementary experiences all members of which stand in the Ae relation. This is an application of Carnap’s logical abstraction method of quasianalysis, which we explain in detail in the supplement on Methodology (Section 3). The idea is that, while elementary experiences are unanalyzable into components in the phenomenalist constitution system, as they constitute the basic (primitive) elements of the system, it is still possible to define logical reconstructions of “component talk” in the system by exploiting the relations in which elementary experiences stand to each other. (Hence this is quasianalysis; see §68–69.) Similarity circles serve as the logical reconstructions of extended qualities that, in informal talk, are said to be exemplified by elementary experiences (e.g., such qualities may correspond to regions in color space, such as the region for red). Carnap uses another variant of quasianalysis to define the so-called “quality classes”, which logically reconstruct pointwise phenomenal qualities (e.g., points in color space, such as a particular red tone), and a similarity relation Aq on these quality classes. The transitive closure of Aq (the least transitive relation of quality classes that is a superset of Aq) may then be seen to be an equivalence relation, from which equivalence classes can be determined just as usual in mathematics. Carnap argues that these equivalence classes reconstruct sense classes (visual, auditory, tactile,…). In order to identify which of the equivalence classes of the transitive closure of Aq corresponds to which sense class—the system does not “know” this as yet, since Aq had not been tied to any sensory modality in particular—Carnap considers the structural properties of sense classes: in particular, he proposes to determine the topological dimension of Aq on any such sense class when Aq is viewed as a neighborhood relation on its quality classes. For instance, Carnap claims (on empirical grounds) that the all-important visual sense class can be singled out as the only one that is five-dimensional (§86): two dimensions relating to the place in the visual field, and three dimensions for the hue, saturation, and brightness of the color at a place. Hence, gesicht (“sight”, the visual sense class) can be defined as the set of quality classes that are members of the sense class of dimension 5 (§115)—a definition that can formalized by expressing topological dimensionality in terms of Aq and logical symbols. This constitutes a typical instance of what is called a “structural definite description” in the Aufbau. (Unfortunately, as noted by Goodman (1951: chapter X), Carnap’s method of identifying the visual sense class by its dimension does not actually work. The reason is that the standard definition of topological dimension presupposed by Carnap assigns to any finite topological space a dimension of 0. Thus, if the underlying set of basic elements is finite, as Carnap assumes, gesicht will also have a dimension of 0—which no longer distinguishes it from the other sense classes; see Schoch (2001) for further details. As Leitgeb (2011) shows, by invoking a different notion of dimensionality combined with an alternative phenomenalist basis, this problem can be solved.)

In some sense, however, one might think that structural descriptions such as that of the visual sense class are still not structural enough: after all, they are based on definitions such as

gesicht \(= \{x | x\) is a quality class andx…\(\}\)

in which the clause “x is a quality class and …x…” reduces ultimately not only to logical symbols and the variable “x”, but also (after unpacking all defined expressions by their defining terms) the primitive predicate “Er”, which is the sole descriptive member of the vocabulary of Carnap’s phenomalist constitution system. To turn this into a completely structural description of the visual sense class, it seems, this remaining descriptive component would have to be eliminated in favor of purely logical expressions.

Indeed, the very last part of Carnap’s discussion of the phenomenalist system (Aufbau: §§153–155), which he says the reader “may skip”, is devoted to an attempt to define even the basic relation Er just by means of logical concepts. (In the resulting constitution system, which would not coincide with the original phenomenalist system anymore, ‘Er’ would no longer count as primitive, and every sentence in which ‘Er’ had been the only descriptive term could now be transformed into a purely logical statement.)

Carnap suggests that this might be achieved in two steps: first, he singles out some “sufficiently high-level empirical theorem about Er” (§155); let us call that statement: Th[Er]. For instance, Th[Er] might express the three-dimensionality of the color solid (disregarding locations now), as formulated previously by means of ‘Er’ and logical symbols. Secondly, ‘Er’ might be defined to be one of the binary relations R that satisfy the open formula Th[R] (in which the second-order variable ‘R’ replaces ‘Er’). But which one? (Assuming the existence of such an R has been established.) Carnap is well aware of the existence of relations \(\Er'\) that are isomorphic to Er—and hence satisfy Th[R] just in case Er does—without being extensionally identical to Er. Such alternative relations \(\Er'\) may even be definable in terms of permutations of elementary experiences, as Carnap points out in §154. His remedy for such (in the modern terminology) isomorphic but still “non-intended models” is to extend the purely logical vocabulary of simple type theory by the new term ‘fund’ (for “fundiert”, founded), such that fund(R) is supposed to express that R corresponds to an “experienceable, ‘natural’” relation: pairs of elementary experiences that belong to the extension of any such founded R “have something in common that can be experienced” (§154). So, if ‘Er’ is finally defined by means of another, supposedly, structural definite description of the form

Er = the binary relation R, such that fund(R) and Th[R],

and if it holds that there is one and only one R such that fund(R) and Th[R] are the case, then, by the intended interpretation of ‘fund’, the “right” relation of elementary experiences would be assigned to ‘Er’. (As mentioned in the supplement on Reconstruction of Scientific Theories (Section 4), this anticipates D. Lewis’s (1970) method of defining theoretical terms.) If, finally, ‘fund’ can be shown to be a logical term, the resulting constitution system would only involve primitive terms that are logical, and every scientific statement expressible in the original phenomenalist constitution system based on ‘Er’ could now be reformulated in perfectly structural terms. The language of empirical science could ultimately dispense with primitive terms the meaning of which would be given non-structurally (e.g., by acquaintance or ostension) and hence subjectively.

This not only sounds, but unfortunately is, incredible. The idea will only work if the crucial condition is met that Carnap’s new primitive term ‘fund’ can be regarded as logical—for which Carnap in fact gives no argument other than pointing to the “generality” of the term (Aufbau: §158). Indeed, ‘fund’ would not count as logical according to Tarski’s later (1986) invariance criterion precisely because ‘fund’ is not isomorphism-invariant (see the discussion in teh suppplement Reconstruction of Scientific Theories (Section 6)), and no one in the more recent literature on logical concepts would regard anything like fund as logical. The reason Carnap thought the relevant paragraphs of the Aufbau “may be omitted” was probably that he recognized the severity of the problem. In a nutshell: §§153–155 of the Aufbau fail, since structural descriptions in reconstructions of empirical science cannot be formulated solely by means of logical terms. But that was a rather paradoxical goal, anyway, since empirical science is, after all, empirical. What the failure of §§153–5 does not mean is that the method or aim of reconstructing scientific statements as structural descriptions that involve primitive empirical terms (such as ‘Er’) is undermined. Within the phenomenalist system of the Aufbau, higher-order logical descriptions involving ‘Er’ may still describe the structure of a subject’s experience, based on definitions (such as of the visual sense class) that will be applicable to a broad (though not unconstrained) range of subjects having different though structurally analogous experiences. Reconstructing scientific concepts in ever more structural terms makes these concepts ever more subject-invariant. What the failure of §§153–5 shows, from the modern point of view, is merely that there cannot be a “maximally structural” logical definition of these concepts at the apparently natural limit of this ever increasing degree of invariance.

3. Reception and Later Discussion of the Aufbau

The book was widely discussed among philosophers and became, along with Wittgenstein’s Tractatus, one of the main reference points for the Vienna Circle’s brand of philosophy, which Neurath wanted to call “logical positivism”, while Carnap (among others) preferred “logical empiricism”. The first book-length treatment and critique of the Aufbau was Eino Kaila’s 1930 Der logische Neopositivismus, based not only on a detailed reading of the text but also on extensive conversations with Carnap during Kaila’s visit to Vienna in 1929. Kaila’s critique is very much along the realistic lines that would later be spelled out at greater length by Reichenbach in Experience and Prediction (1938), who however hardly mentions Carnap or the Aufbau by name, preferring to criticize unnamed “positivists”. Kaila’s critique has two main parts. First, he devotes a great deal of time to Carnap’s constitutional definitions, claiming by various arguments that they are phenomenologically inadequate and that extensional reconstructions of them (even of the concept of “ordered pair” in mathematics) are impossible. Second, he claimed that the practice of science requires assumptions that Carnap either denied or could not account for within the Aufbau system. Here Kaila follows Reichenbach quite closely in his then recent “Goals and paths of physical knowledge [Ziele und Wege der physikalischen Erkenntnis]” (Reichenbach 1929), stressing especially the importance of probability in science, and its absence in the Aufbau. Though Kaila’s critique was not widely discussed outside of Vienna, Carnap took it very seriously indeed. He not only reviewed Kaila’s book, quite generously (Carnap 1930d), but also worked for a year or so on a paper responding to Kaila’s second criticism, which he provisionally called “The constitution of the non-given” [“Die Konstitution des Nicht-Gegebenen”] (Carnap 1930e, summarized and discussed by Carus 2007a, Ch. 7-8; see also Neuber 2018: Ch. 9).

A.J. Ayer’s Language, Truth, and Logic (1936) may have implicitly been included (though it was not cited) in Reichenbach’s 1938 critique of “positivists”. Certainly to anyone outside the immediate environs of the Vienna Circle, Ayer’s book was by far the most popular and accessible account of the Aufbau’s main ideas, and certainly contributed to Carnap’s celebrity in the English-speaking world. However, Ayer’s treatment, combined with the unavailability of the actual Aufbau in English until 1967, was also largely responsible for many of the fundamental misunderstandings of the book that persisted for most of the twentieth century. (Even in this century, they have not been entirely expunged; it was still possible as recently as 2003 for a respected history of analytic philosophy to use Ayer as the main representative of “logical positivism” (Soames 2003).)

Unmoved by such misunderstandings, but prone to subtler ones, were a few of Carnap’s immediate acquaintances. Quine took the Aufbau as his prime example of the “second dogma” (of reductionism) he criticized in his famous paper attacking Carnap (Quine 1951); see the supplement on Reconstruction of Scientific Theories (Section 1). In that same paper, Quine also drew attention to a flaw in Carnap’s construction of three-dimensional space from the two-dimensional visual field in §§125–6 of the Aufbau: see section 4 below. A much more detailed and comprehensive account of the Aufbau was given in the same year by Nelson Goodman’s book The Structure of Appearance. This was perhaps the first time the book was taken seriously in its own terms, and certainly the first engagement with its technical infrastructure. Goodman advanced most of the more specific arguments against Carnap’s constitution system that are still taken to be decisive: they concern quasianalysis, that is, the logical method of abstraction Carnap applies in the Aufbau; see supplement on Methodology (Section 3) for details.

By the time the Aufbau finally appeared in English in 1967, it was no longer considered of much importance, and was hardly attended to. It took another two decades before a revaluation set in, launched by Michael Friedman in a series of papers beginning in 1987, and later collected in his book Reconsidering Logical Positivism (1999). Friedman took issue with the entire English-speaking tradition, dating back to Ayer, of interpreting the Aufbau as pursuing mainly a phenomenalist program of reducing all knowledge to sense-impressions on the model of Hume or Mach. Instead, Friedman pointed out, we have to take seriously the early Carnap’s emergence from the neo-Kantian schools of the late nineteenth and early twentieth centuries, especially the Marburg school and its then-foremost representatives Paul Natorp and Ernst Cassirer. Seen in this context, the book may be better understood as seeking a new basis for scientific objectivity; Friedman was able to point, for instance, to the strong emphasis in Carnap’s text on the achievement of objective knowledge despite the subjective starting point of individual perception, and the frequent invocation of structuralism (the heavy use of “purely structural direct descriptions”) and structuralist metaphors such as that of the railway map in §14, and the theme enunciated in the title of §16: “All scientific statements are structural statements”. (Carnap’s structuralism in the Aufbau is discussed in section 2 above.)

Friedman’s re-interpretation was elaborated not only by himself but by others (e.g., Richardson 1998) and variously incorporated into a range of hybrid views that attempt to do justice to the Russellian as well as the neo-Kantian and phenomenological contexts of Carnap’s work during the 1920s (Mormann 2000; Pincock 2005, 2009; Carus 2007a, 2016). A number of other influences are also being excavated; a good example is the collection of papers on the Aufbau edited by Christian Damböck (2016).

This interpretative reconstruction of Carnap’s philosophical aims and contexts has also given rise to a new focus on the reconstruction of the Aufbau’s constitution system. Recent discussions of the method of quasianalysis (Mormann 1994, 1997, 2009; Leitgeb 2007) pick up the thread of the 1951 critique by Goodman and explore strategies for blunting those critiques (see supplement on Methodology (Section 3)). Building on this, Leitgeb (2011) has gone further and argued that once the goal of Carnap’s constitution system is limited to the preservation of empirical content, all of Goodman’s and Quine’s (1951) objections (discussed in section 4 below and the supplement on Reconstruction of Scientific Theories (Section 1)) can be avoided.

All the discussion of the Aufbau cited here up to this point is either interpretative work based directly on the text, or takes Carnap’s own framework and aims as its starting point. But there are also wider-ranging emulations of the Aufbau that leave aside Carnap’s own aims but still share the ambition of building some larger or even all-encompassing conceptual system on ta simpler basis. (The best-known example in recent years is Constructing the World by David J. Chalmers (2012); see supplement on Reconstruction of Scientific Theories.)

4. Quine’s Critique of the Construction of Space and the Limits of Definition

It turned out that there were at least two major problems with Carnap’s proposal that all scientific terms are definable from the basic elements and basic properties and relations as described in section 1 above. One of these problems was pointed out by Quine in “Two Dogmas of Empiricism” (concerning the “dogma” of radical reductionism), the other (concerning disposition terms) was diagnosed by Carnap himself in Testability and Meaning. We will only deal here with Quine’s (1951) criticism of Carnap’s attempt of defining three-dimensional space from the two-dimensional visual field in the Aufbau. For more on Quine’s more general criticism of Carnap’s “radical” reductionism in the Aufbau, and of the later Carnap’s alleged “non-radical” reductionism, see supplement on Reconstruction of Scientific Theories (Section 1)”. Carnap’s own insight that disposition terms cannot be reconstructed by explicit definitions on the basis of observation terms alone, which is why they require a more flexible method of concept reconstruction, is discussed in the supplement on Reconstruction of Scientific Theories (Section 2). (In addition to these two well-known major problems, there are others, e.g., that the Aufbau does not include explicit definitions of probabilistic scientific terms either; again, Carnap later corrected this deficiency. His later treatment of probability is the topic of the supplement on Inductive Logic.)

Carnap’s thought in IV.B of the Aufbau is the projection of one’s temporally ordered subjective color sensations, which would make up the two-dimensional order of one’s visual field at any point in time (the relevant concepts of which he had already defined at that point), into four-dimensional, purely mathematical Euclidean spacetime. That is to be done in such a way that twelve desiderata are satisfied which Carnap enumerates in §§126–127. Essentially (cf. Leitgeb 2011: 278), they amount to the following: (D1) there should be a continuous curve comprising the subject’s points of sight in spacetime; (D2) from these points of sight, phenomenal color qualities are to be projected into spacetime along straight lines of sight, such that subjective temporal order and the neighborhood relation between visual sensations are respected; (D3) the color qualities themselves are meant to “travel” on segments of continuous world-lines through spacetime; and (D4) certain maxims of continuity are to be satisfied, e.g.: colors on world-lines ought to change as slowly as possible; the curvature of their world-lines should be as small as possible; the colors should move along world-lines as slowly as possible; world-lines should preserve their spatial distances as much as possible; and the like. (In order to fulfill these desiderata of continuity and inertness, it might be necessary to “fill in” colors of “unseen” points, as Carnap notes explicitly.)

Based on the resulting assignment, say, col, of colors to “world points”, Carnap sketches definitions of concepts such as: visual thing (classes of proximate spacetime points the colors of which are sufficiently stable in time); my body (a special visual thing close to one’s point of view with some distinctive properties, e.g., it being touched by something correlating with one’s tactile sensations); an expansion of the domain of my consciousness (as constructed in prior steps) to that of the complete auto-psychological domain that also includes unconscious objects and states; and perceptual things (things having various sense qualities simultaneously: visual, tactile, taste,…). The emerging “perceptual world” is to be completed by some principles of “analogy” (a postulate of causality and a postulate of substance, §135). This being set up, the final step into the “world of physics” should be taken, first, by changing the Euclidean metric of perceptual space into a non-Euclidean metric, as demanded by the general theory of relativity, and, secondly, by replacing the color qualities that are mapped by col into spacetime by certain numerical physical-state magnitudes that would stand to these qualities in “physico-qualitative correlation” (§136).

Quine (1951) addressed this part of Carnap’s phenomenalist constitution system in a well-known criticism along the following lines:

In a series of constructions in which he exploits the resources of modern logic with much ingenuity, Carnap succeeds in defining a wide array of important additional sensory concepts which, but for his constructions, one would not have dreamed were definable on so slender a basis. Carnap was the first empiricist who, not content with asserting the reducibility of science to terms encoding immediate experience, took serious steps toward carrying out the reduction. But even supposing Carnap’s starting point to be satisfactory, his constructions were, as he himself stressed, only a fragment of the full program. The construction of even the simplest statements about the physical world was left in a sketchy state. However briefly hinted at, though, Carnap’s ideas on this subject are very suggestive. He explained spatio-temporal point-instants as quadruples of real numbers and envisaged assignment of sense qualities to point-instants according to certain canons. Roughly summarized, the plan was that qualities should be assigned to point-instants in such a way as to achieve the laziest world compatible with our experience. The principle of least action was to be our guide in constructing a world from experience.

Carnap did not seem to recognize, however, that his treatment of physical objects fell short of reduction not merely through sketchiness, but in principle. Statements of the form “Quality q is at point-instant x; y; z; t” were, according to his canons, to be apportioned truth values in such a way as to maximize and minimize certain over-all features, and with growth of experience the truth values were to be progressively revised in the same spirit. We consider this a good schematization (deliberately oversimplified, to be sure) of what science really does. But it provides no indication, not even the sketchiest, of how a statement of the form “Quality q is at point-instant x; y; z; t” could ever be translated into Carnap’s initial language of sense data and logic. The connective “is at” remains an added undefined connective; the canons counsel us in its use but not in its elimination. (Quine 1951: 37f)

As Quine rightly observes, Carnap had not delivered in Chapter IV.B of the Aufbau what he had promised before: to state definitions of all non-primitive terms, such as for the color assignment function symbol. Instead, Carnap merely lays down (sketches of) postulates for what a color assignment function ought to be like, which leaves completely unclear how an occurrence of the color assignment term could be eliminated in favor of the primitive terms of the constitution system.

How problematic is this from the modern point of view? Maybe not as problematic as it seemed to Quine (cf. Leitgeb 2011: Section 5). In Carnap’s later terms, what is going on here is that, relative to the meager phenomenalist basis of Carnap’s system, the intended assignment col of colors to points in spacetime is expressed by a theoretical term that might still be rationally reconstructed in ways Carnap himself supplied in the Aufbau itself and afterwards. For instance, in §§153–155 of the Aufbau, Carnap considers defining the basic predicate ‘Er’ of his phenomenalist system on the basis of yet more fundamental terms by means of an equality statement that takes a definite description on its right-hand side:

Er = the binary relation R, such that… [fill in constraint on R]

(See section 2 above for the details on this step.) Carnap could have applied the same strategy in the step in which he aims to construct physical space by defining the required color assignment mapping by means of:

col = the function f, such that… [fill in Carnap’s postulates for f].

In fact, that would have been the method by which more than several decades later David Lewis (1970) suggested defining theoretical terms in general; it is a variant of Ramsey’s treatment of theoretical terms that Carnap had rediscovered in the 1950s and 60s (Carnap’s papers are cited by Lewis 1970), as we discuss in the supplement on Reconstruction of Scientific Theories (Section 4). Of course, any such definition by definite description would come with the presupposition that there is one, and only one, f that satisfies the relevant postulates. Apart from that kind of difficulty, the strategy seems viable. However, Carnap did not actually follow any of these threads of reasoning in the Aufbau. (There are further problems concerning the phenomenalist constitution of the physical world in the Aufbau: see e.g. Friedman 1999: 160f.)

In any case, the step from the “world of experience” into the physical world seems to require means of concept formation that exceed those of the standard explicit definition of predicates as investigated in the modern theory of first-order definitions (see, e.g., Chapter 8 of Suppes 1957); firstly, because standard explicit definitions of predicates in the modern sense of the term do not involve definite descriptions, such as the “the binary relation R, such that” or “the function f, such that” above). And secondly, because standard explicit definitions of predicates only involve first-order quantification, while ‘R’ and ‘f’ in the examples just given are higher-order variables for relations and functions of individuals, not first-order variables for individuals. Carnap himself did not restrict definitions in the Aufbau to first-order definitions but exploited the full expressive power of the language of the simple theory of types; however, he left this aside when he took the crucial step into the physical world.

That parts of the Aufbau, including its proposals for concept formation, needed amendment, was the diagnosis that Carnap himself arrives at in Testability and Meaning (1936–37) less than ten years after the Aufbau, when he observes that the meaning of disposition terms (such as “soluble in water”) cannot be determined in any straightforward manner by standard explicit definitions that are based solely on observational terms (see supplement on Reconstruction of Scientific Theories (Section 2)).

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Hannes Leitgeb <>
André Carus <>

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