Supplement to Rudolf Carnap

H. Tolerance, Metaphysics, and Meta-Ontology

As discussed in the main entry (Section 3) on Carnap, the principle of tolerance was central to Carnap’s philosophy, as was the pluralism about possible language (and logic) forms that comes with it. Tolerance was introduced explicitly in 1932, first in a paper replying to Neurath (Carnap 1932e) on the question of the appropriate form of “protocol sentences” (sentences in which empirical observations are recorded), and then most famously in §17 of the Logical Syntax, which we will discuss below. A case can be made (e.g., Friedman 2007; Carus 2007b), though, that the principle of tolerance is also implicit in much of Carnap’s earlier work (see the supplement on Aufbau (Section 1)). Certainly it remained fundamental to all of Carnap’s ideas after its enunciation in late 1932.

It is fair to say that the principle of tolerance taken by itself (independently of, e.g., analyticity) was hardly discussed, or even noticed, before its present, belated reception in the Carnap literature. It is a new idea on the philosophical scene even today, whose consequences are still being digested. It has certainly lost none of its explosive revolutionary force as a radical program for philosophy (Creath 2009), which is what has most divided commentators. Like most revolutionary ideas, it has encountered steadfast and vocal resistance. Most commentators have been concerned to limit the scope of the principle of tolerance, to dilute it or trivialize it, while the appreciative minority has mostly remained defensive. Much of the literature, therefore, is devoted to clarification and the correction of misunderstandings rather than positive explorations of the principle of tolerance and its consequences (with a few exceptions: Carus 2007a; Kitcher 2008; Creath 2009; Yap 2010; Kutz, Mossakowski, and Lücke 2010; and Justus 2012). In section 1, we discuss the context of Carnap’s original introduction of the principle in Logical Syntax, and then review some of its consequences for his views concerning metaphysics and ontology in sections 2 and 3. Throughout these sections it should be kept in mind that languages are calculi for Carnap (§2 of Logical Syntax), including both rules of formation and rules of inference (see the supplement on Logical Syntax of Language). So languages in Carnap’s sense are not restricted to specifications of well-formed terms and formulas.

1. Tolerance in the Logical Syntax

In the Logical Syntax, Carnap motivates tolerance by considering the properties of the two mathematical languages he has constructed (see the supplement on Logical Syntax of Language for the details): Language I can be shown to have the property that for each of its closed formulas (without free variables), it is either the case that the formula is derivable from the axioms of the system or its negation is derivable from the axioms. (By Gödel’s incompleteness theorems, this does not hold for all open formulas.) Moreover, all of the predicates that can be formulated in Language I are decidable: in Carnap’s terms, Language I is definite. This feature constitutes one reason why Language I seems particularly suitable as a rational reconstruction of constructivist or intuitionistic mathematics. In particular, the only provable existence statements in Language I are finitely restricted ones that allow for the construction of verifying instances, as demanded by intuitionists.

On the other hand, Carnap does not claim that Language I satisfies each and every feature that one finds discussed in the finitist-constructivist-intuitionist literature. For instance, intuitionists notoriously refrain from certain applications of the logical rule of reductio ad absurdum that would yield unrestricted existence statements (which they nonetheless consider well-formed), whereas Carnap prefers to preserve classical logic and avoids such inferences instead by restricting the syntactic formation rules of Language I. In the terms Carnap used with respect to explication (see supplement on Methodology), Language I should only be viewed as sufficiently “similar” to constructivist mathematics to count as a reasonably adequate reconstruction; or in Carnap’s terms in the Syntax:

Some of tendencies which are commonly designated as “finitist” or “constructivist” find, in a certain sense, their realization in our definite Language I. “In a certain sense”, let it be noted; for inasmuch as these tendencies are, as a rule, only vaguely formulated, an exact statement is not possible… We hold that the problems dealt with by Intuitionism can be exactly formulated only by means of the construction of a calculus, and that all the non-formal discussions are to be regarded merely as more or less vague preliminaries to such a construction (LSS: §16).

As Carnap shows, both his constructivist Language I and the second language that he considers in the Logical Syntax—the indefinite Language II that reflects classical mathematics and allows for undecidable formulas and unrestricted quantification—may be constructed in precise terms; both of them may turn out to be useful for certain purposes; and neither of them needs to be regarded as “the” uniquely determined “correct” foundation of mathematics:

Once the fact is realized that all the pros and cons of the intuitionist discussions are concerned with the forms of a calculus, questions will no longer be put in the form: “What is this or that like?” but instead we shall ask: “How do we wish to arrange this or that in the language to be constructed?” or, from the theoretical standpoint: “What consequences will ensue if we construct a language in this or that way? On this view the dogmatic attitude which renders so many discussions unfruitful disappears. When we here construct Language I in such a way that it is a definite language, and thus fulfils certain conditions laid down by Intuitionism, we do not mean thereby to suggest that this is the only possible or justifiable form of language. (LSS: §16)

In analogy with the existence of different types of geometry (e.g., Euclidean vs. Non-Euclidean geometries), which he had investigated in his doctoral dissertation (see the main entry (Section 2.2)), Carnap points to the existence of multiple types of logical frameworks we might construct, investigate, and apply for different purposes. For instance, since Language II happens to be more expressive than Language I (as mentioned in the supplement on Logical Syntax of Language, e.g., derivability for Language I can only be formally defined in Language II), it is more suitable as a rational reconstruction of the “syntax language” (metalanguage) of Language I. For the same reason, various concepts, principles, and arguments from real analysis, set theory, and physics (e.g., indefinite and impredicative concepts from set theory, set-theoretic existence principles, and certain scientific concepts for physical magnitudes) can only be reconstructed in Language II (§26, §38a, §40) while not being available in Language I. Carnap summarizes the situation in §40:

For anyone who takes the point of view of physicalism [the claim that scientific terms are reducible to physical terms], it follows that our Language II forms a complete syntactical framework for science,

which suggests that Language II is preferable over Language I for particular scientific purposes (though not for all purposes whatsoever).

This leads Carnap to formulate his famous

Principle of Tolerance: It is not our business to set up prohibitions, but to arrive at conventions (LSS: §17)

in which “convention” means that every formal language is “a matter of free choice” (§86). In other words:

In logic, there are no morals. Everyone is at liberty to build up his own logic, i.e., his own form of language, as he wishes. All that is required of him is that, if he wishes to discuss it, he must state his methods clearly, and give syntactical rules instead of philosophical arguments (LSS: §17).

Accordingly, Carnap views the classical debates in the foundations of mathematics—such as those about mathematical realism, intuitionism, logicism, and formalism—as debates concerning proposals of languages for mathematics (§78, §84), which are not to be settled on factual or inferential grounds. (For the same reason, the “logicism” endorsed by Carnap in the Logical Syntax (§84) is no longer the familiar reductive logicism of Frege or Russell.) As Carnap points out (p. 52), the new position merely generalizes to philosophy, or to knowledge as a whole, what mathematicians have routinely practiced for centuries; he particularly cites the mathematician Karl Menger (1930), who contributed to the discussions in the Vienna Circle, and had already begun to extend this attitude from mathematics to the philosophy of mathematics, arguing for a version of tolerance about different formulations of intuitionistic logic (without using the word “tolerance” explicitly).

While Carnap does not say much about this in the Logical Syntax itself, it is clear that tolerance must extend also to non-logical and non-mathematical languages. Soon after, in Testability and Meaning (1936–37), he says about empirical terms,

It should be noticed that the term “atomic sentence”, as here defined, is not at all understood to refer to ultimate facts. Our theory does not assume anything like ultimate facts. It is a matter of convention which predicates are taken as primitive predicates of a certain language L. (TM1: 448)

As described in the supplement on Reconstruction of Scientific Theories (Section 1), Carnap constructs a whole sequence of “empiricist languages” in Testability and Meaning, leaving open the question whether to choose any of them at all. And as we point out in the supplement on Reconstruction of Scientific Theories (Section 6), Carnap (1966) acknowledges the particular utility of a “realistic language” for the purposes of the working scientist. Accordingly, in his “Empiricism, Semantics, and Ontology” (1950a, hereafter ESO), which we discuss in more detail in sections 2 and 3 below, he again emphasizes the pragmatic dimension of scientific language choice:

To decree dogmatic prohibitions of certain linguistic forms instead of testing them by their success or failure in practical use, is worse than futile; it is positively harmful because it may obstruct scientific progress… Let us be cautious in making assertions and critical in examining them, but tolerant in permitting linguistic forms (ESO: 221)

Nonetheless, Carnap’s tolerant pluralism is still often misunderstood. In the recent literature on logical pluralism (Shapiro 2014 gives an overview), for instance, which was triggered by a series of papers culminating in Beall and Restall (2006), Carnapian tolerance serves as one of the starting points. But Restall (2002) presents Beall’s and Restall’s “new” logical pluralism as one concerning different logical consequence relations on one and the same language, which he distinguishes from Carnap’s supposed pluralism about different languages. However, that demarcation is questionable: as explained in the main entry (Section 2), Carnap was interested in the proof-theoretic and, after his semantic turn, model-theoretic construction of artificial logical frameworks. He individuated such frameworks just as any modern logician would do, including Beall and Restall: in particular, logical frameworks may be distinct in virtue of distinct sets of rules of formation, distinct sets of rules of inference, or distinct sets of models and semantic rules of evaluation. Carnap would not have denied that two distinct frameworks, such as, e.g., frameworks for classical and intuitionistic logic, may be based on one and the same formal object language (such that the two frameworks involve the same logical vocabulary and the same syntactic formation rules but distinct rules of inference and distinct sets of models and semantic rules). Nor would he have denied that two distinct frameworks may be used to logically reconstruct one and the same fragment of informal language and reasoning, such as, e.g., the logic of a fragment of mathematics, and that they may be equally or variably successful in doing so (by being more or less similar to what is reconstructed, or more or less fruitful, and so forth—see supplement on Methodology), relative to their respective purposes and contexts. It is true that, in addition, Carnap would also have distinguished classical negation, as being proof-theoretically and/or semantically interpreted in a classical framework, from intuitionistic negation, as being proof-theoretically and/or semantically interpreted in an intuitionistic framework: but it is hard to see why this fairly innocent move should exclude him from being a logical pluralist of Beall and Restall’s preferred type. After all, Carnap would still allow for negation in the constructed classical framework and negation in the constructed intuitionistic framework to be rival explications of one and the same connective in natural language, that is, of the “not” of mathematical practice.

Similarly for logical consequence: Restall states that

As a pluralist about logical consequence, I take it that there is no further fact of the matter as to whether explosion, or disjunctive syllogism, are really valid. For me, that question makes no more sense than to ask if a function on the real line is really smooth, without saying more about the notion of smoothness… The same goes for logical consequence. I take it that this is a pretheoretic notion which may be made precise in a number of different ways. (2002: section 1)

But Carnap (1950a) takes exactly this position; there is no further fact of the matter whether any principle of logic is really valid, any more than there is any fact of the matter whether the external world really exists (see section 3 below). And moreover, what Restall says is precisely Carnap’s position on the explication of concepts in general—that is, regarding the transformation of a more or less inexact concept into a more exact one (see the supplement on Methodology (Section 1)):

In a problem of explication the datum, viz., the explicandum, is not given in exact terms… if a solution for a problem of explication is proposed, we cannot decide in an exact way whether it is right or wrong. Strictly speaking, the question whether the solution is right or wrong makes no good sense because there is no clear-cut answer. The question should rather be whether the proposed solution is satisfactory, whether it is more satisfactory than another one, and the like (Carnap 1950b: §2)

where “satisfactory” here means relative to some norm or practical requirement. E.g., in §2 of Meaning and Necessity, Carnap describes explicitly his aim of explicating, in precisely that sense, logical or analytic truth and consequence, which are “customary, but not quite exact, concepts”, and he goes about explicating consequence by quantification over a suitable space of points of evaluation (see the supplement on Semantics) that can be constructed in different ways, just as Beall and Restall (2006) suggest.

Much of the recent discussion of the principle of tolerance was inspired by Gödel’s critique of it, unpublished until 1995, that was originally intended for the Schilpp (1963) volume on Carnap in the Library of Living Philosophers. Gödel withdrew his paper, but six successive drafts of it were found in his Nachlaß, of which several have now been published (Gödel *1953/9). It appears, from its title (“Is Mathematics Syntax of Language?”) and exposition, to focus specifically on the “syntax” thesis, or more generally on the “linguistic” accounts of the foundations of mathematics deriving from Wittgenstein’s Tractatus (Goldfarb 1995: 325). However, Gödel himself understood that Carnap had meanwhile left behind that view (in its Logical Syntax form), and recent commentary has focused on the principle of tolerance.

Gödel’s critique is based on his second incompleteness theorem. For mathematics to be regarded as purely syntactical (and thus devoid of empirical content), he argues, it must be proven that no purely linguistic stipulation can possibly have empirical consequences; otherwise mathematics would be in danger of making empirical claims on purely arbitrary or definitional grounds. In particular, it needs to be proven that the linguistic framework in question is consistent, for otherwise all sentences, including all empirical sentences, would be provable in it. But by the second incompleteness theorem, no framework that includes enough mathematics has the resources to prove its own consistency; and any consistency proof presupposes the consistency of a stronger meta-framework that is required for the proof. Therefore, any attempt to prove consistency either leads to an infinite regress or to a mathematical framework that is simply taken as given and which (in Gödel’s view) refers to some realm of abstract entities again.

Gödel’s criticism has been widely discussed (Richardson 1994; Ricketts 1994, 1996; Parsons 1999; Friedman 1999; Potter 2000; Ben-Menahem 2006). It is, however, not clear whether it is actually relevant to Carnap’s conception of mathematics in the Logical Syntax. After all, Carnap does hold that “pure syntax is nothing other than a part of arithmetic” (§24), a fact which he himself exploited when he arithmetized Language I along Gödelian lines in Part II of the Logical Syntax. Carnap was well aware that his consistency proof for Language II in Part III of the Logical Syntax did not give him

absolute certainty that contradictions in the object-language II cannot arise… since the proof is carried out in a syntax-language which has richer resources than Language II. (LSS: §34)

From Carnap’s point of view, mathematical theories were to be reconstructed as particular linguistic frameworks, and “pure” linguistic frameworks (without empirical consequences) could always be viewed as mathematical theories. Consequently, just as he thinks that there is no need to justify language forms and their logics so long as they turn out to be practically useful, there is also no need to justify mathematical systems other than by their practical consequences; in particular, no consistency proof is required. He did not think either the mere acceptance of a linguistic framework would somehow guarantee the logical and mathematical theorems provable in the framework to be true (see Ebbs 2017: Section 1.6). If a mathematical system turned out to be inconsistent, its postulates would have to be modified; that’s it. (Compare his later expression of the same thought in Carnap 1958: 240. This is similar to the attitude of the practicing mathematician who may presuppose ZFC set theory as a foundation without demanding a consistency proof for it.) As Awodey & Carus (2003, 2004) point out, Gödel was mistaken to require of a proposed linguistic framework that it be provably consistent. The syntactical approach requires only that the stipulated logical system be consistent (that is, it is not the case that every statement logically implies every other statement, for otherwise the system would not be mathematically or scientifically useful)—not that it be provably consistent.

This apparently subtle difference is very important, though. It might be true that a proof of the principle of tolerance understood as a claim concerning a range of logical systems would require provable consistency of these systems. And Gödel’s argument does show that, understood this way, the principle of tolerance cannot be proven. But Carnap did not regard it as a claim, nor of course did he attempt to prove it. Gödel did regard it as a claim, which he set out to refute; moreover, some modern commentators regard this refutation as successful, and the principle of tolerance accordingly as refuted (Potter 2000: Ch. 11; Ben-Menahem 2006: Ch. 5); they argue explicitly what Gödel had assumed, viz. that Carnap’s principle of tolerance requires provable consistency (Potter 2000, especially pp. 270–277). But this appears to be a misunderstanding (Awodey & Carus 2004: 211–13); the principle of tolerance consisted for Carnap in something like a proposed set of regulative principles: the development of new language forms should not be “hampered by the striving for ‘correctness’”, instead we should embark on the exploration of “the boundless ocean of unlimited possibilities” that lies before us (Logical Syntax, Foreword).

2. Tolerance and Metaphysics

As briefly indicated in the main article on Carnap, his positive conceptual engineering program, though far more important in his own mind, has been overshadowed in the folklore about Carnap by the negative corollary that ontological claims outside a language framework (addressing external questions, in the terminology of “Empiricism, Semantics, and Ontology”, to be discussed further below) should be ignored or left aside. They should in any case not be taken literally, Carnap suggested, but re-interpreted as practical questions about which language framework or explication is appropriate to the particular use that one is making of the concept in the context at hand.

With the recent revival of metaphysics within analytic philosophy, this attitude has now come under a cloud. As the title of Carnap (1932a) says famously (or rather infamously), metaphysics could and should be “overcome” by the logical analysis of language. We will first summarize the basic ingredients of Carnap’s philosophy on which this view on metaphysics rests, which will allow us to position the different criticisms of metaphysics that Carnap developed over the years vis-à-vis the main themes of his work and contemporary views of metaphysics. This in turn leads us to a sketch of what might be regarded as a Carnapian successor project to certain aspects of traditional metaphysics. Finally, in section 3, we will present Carnap’s account of ontology and show how it remained largely unchanged in essentials throughout his career even when the way of articulating it changed in response to such turning points as the principle of tolerance or the introduction of semantics.

For Carnap, one task (perhaps the central task) of philosophy was the logical reconstruction of scientific sentences in formally precise linguistic frameworks (see supplement on Reconstruction of Scientific Theories); this presupposes that, if these sentences belong to a sufficiently empirically successful part of science, it will be possible to reconstruct them with sufficient formal precision. In any such reconstruction, the parts of science in question will be internal to the framework in which it is reconstructed, in the terms of Carnap’s best-known paper, “Empiricism, Semantics, and Ontology” (1950a). By this Carnap meant that the scientific sentences accepted in that part of science can all be derived or supported with the help of logical rules, analytic postulates or inductive rules laid down by the framework. Let us call such frameworks in which scientific languages and theories are reconstructed object frameworks.

In “Empiricism, Semantics, and Ontology”, Carnap went on to contrast such “internal” sentences and questions with the “external” ones that are often asked in traditional metaphysics. These do not ask whether something exists within the rules of some (explicitly specified) framework, but whether something exists period, quite independently of any language framework in which the question might be articulated. Taken literally, at face value, external questions and sentences have no cognitive significance, in Carnap’s view; they cannot be true or false. The only sense he could make of them was to regard them as practical sentences and questions concerning framework choice, such as “Shall we introduce this form of expression into our language?” or “Should we—for a specified purpose—use this language or that one?” (ESO: section 3).

Philosophical sentences, then, to be comprehensible, should be reconstructed, in Carnap’s view, as being about the construction and the properties of the formal linguistic object frameworks in which the scientific sentences are framed. Such philosophical sentences are then at the meta-level with respect to those object frameworks, and may either be reconstructed in formal meta-frameworks (as Carnap does, e.g., in the Logical Syntax); then they are internal to those meta-frameworks. Or they may be left semi-formal (just as ordinary mathematics is developed in a semi-formal manner). Either way, they are external to the object-framework of the scientific sentences.

Whether on the object level or on the meta-level, artificial linguistic frameworks are constructed by laying down their syntactic formation rules, rules of inference, (later, from the mid-1930s) semantic rules (see the supplement on Semantics), and (later still, from the mid-1940s) inductive rules (see the supplement on Inductive Logic); for more on frameworks, see the main entry (Section 2). At the same time, part of what it means to choose or construct a framework is to choose or determine the sentences that “come with” the framework: these are the sentences that are analytic(ally true) in the framework (see supplements on Carnap versus Quine on the Analytic-Synthetic Distinction and Reconstruction of Scientific Theories). Such analytic sentences, which include the logical and mathematical truths of the framework, are simultaneously internal to “their” framework and reflect some of its features—as they are provable just from the rules of inference of the framework itself, true in virtue of the semantic rules of the framework alone (see the supplement on Semantics), and they cannot be disconfirmed by those parts of science that are reconstructed within the framework. The status of such analytic statements may always be conveyed by metalinguistic claims, such as “sentence A is analytic-in-framework-L”, which can be derived from the definition of the framework L. In contrast, synthetic sentences in a framework may turn out to be false, and they can only be tested, and thus confirmed or disconfirmed, empirically. While frameworks may be chosen freely (if they only include logical-mathematical rules and semantic postulates, as in the case of the abstract frameworks for semantics discussed in “Empiricism, Semantics, and Ontology”), they may still differ concerning their practical utility for different purposes. The same holds for the rational reconstructions or explications that are carried out within them (which may be more or less exact, more or less fruitful, more or less simple, and so forth—see supplement on Methodology). The same body of mathematical and scientific knowledge before reconstruction can be reconstructed within different linguistic frameworks, the choice of which for that very purpose may pay off pragmatically in different ways. In that sense, mathematics and science delineate structural invariances across different frameworks (compare supplement on Reconstruction of Scientific Theories (Section 6)); all of these are key components of Carnap’s philosophical program.

When Carnap’s program, as just sketched, is applied to traditional metaphysical claims, there are three possibilities: these claims can either be reconstructed as scientific claims in a precise enough linguistic object-framework. Or they can be reconstructed—formalized in a formal meta-framework, or otherwise at least semi-formalized—as philosophical proposals or claims concerning the linguistic (syntactic, logical, semantic, pragmatic) properties of such an object framework for the reconstruction of science. In this case they are external to such an object framework. Or, finally, it may not be possible to reconstruct them logically in sufficiently clear and precise terms at all.

The last possibility corresponds to the first type of criticism of metaphysics that one can find in Carnap’s work: for some metaphysical statements, it seems they cannot be reconstructed formally or semi-formally at all, on whatever language level. That is the main worry expressed by Carnap in his notorious “Überwindung der Metaphysik durch logische Analyse der Sprache” (Carnap 1932a); some metaphysical sentences either seem to include words without meaning (e.g., “the absolute”, “thing in itself”), or they are not well-formed in logical syntax (even when they might be well-formed in the grammar of natural language), or both—such as, Carnap claims, Heidegger’s well-known claim, “Das Nichts selbst nichtet” (“The Nothing itself nihilates”). Such metaphysical sentences—into which we can be misled by the logical shortcomings of natural languages—are revealed to be pseudo-sentences by logical analysis. They are nonsense, in the sense of not having any theoretical content; they are not answers to any coherently expressible questions. If anything, they merely manage to convey an attitude towards life, in which case the more appropriate means of expressing their intended Lebensgefühl [attitude toward life] would be works of art that do not pretend to convey theoretical content. (Carnap mentions Nietzsche’s Zarathustra as a positive instance of an application of poetic means to that effect.) Similar criticisms of metaphysical language can be found in the Aufbau (1928a, see §30–31 on the “confusion of spheres”) and in his Scheinprobleme der Philosophie (1928b). Just as formal type theory avoided Russell’s famous paradox of “the class of all classes that do not include themselves as member” by making it impossible to even formulate the corresponding description, certain never-ending metaphysical debates could be avoided by realizing that they could not even be formulated in the languages of Aufbau-type constitution systems (see supplement on Aufbau). From the viewpoint of Carnap’s later philosophy, what the Carnap of 1932 overlooked in his early criticism of metaphysics was that there was not anything like the logical system in which metaphysical sentences could be reformulated. He had not yet attained his post-Syntax radical tolerance about logic (section 1 above). (Similarly, in the now standard first-order language of set theory, the description of the Russell class can be formulated—but one can prove that this description does not denote a set.) On the other hand, even the Carnap of the Logical Syntax regarded the lasting resistance of certain metaphysical sentences to logical regimentation as evidence against them being sentences in the logical sense of the term. Indeed, he affirms his earlier view when he says

… syntactical problems acquire a greater significance by virtue of the anti-metaphysical attitude represented by the Vienna Circle. According to this view, the sentences of metaphysics are pseudo-sentences which on logical analysis are proved to be either empty phrases or phrases which violate the rules of syntax. (LSS: §2)

although it is not clear if he takes this description of pseudo-sentences as a definition of the “sentences of metaphysics” or as a substantive characterization of many or all sentences of traditional metaphysics. Either way, this part of Carnap’s criticism of metaphysics would hardly be an issue for much of present-day analytic metaphysics in which metaphysical statements are indeed often formulated using logical languages (e.g., of modal logic) in which these statements are logically well-formed.

So let us assume that a given metaphysical sentence can in fact be reconstructed in sufficiently clear and precise terms within a well-specified framework. Carnap’s next question would be: is it meant to be a scientific sentence in an object framework? This leads us to Carnap’s second type of criticism of metaphysics: when a metaphysical sentence is scientific, it should be synthetic in the framework in which it is reconstructed, and it should be possible, at least in principle and in the long run, to test and disconfirm it empirically:

The first efforts at explanation, those of Ionian natural philosophers, were certainly metaphysical; the world is all fire, or all water, or all change. Those early efforts at scientific explanation can be viewed in two different ways. We can say:

This is not science, but pure metaphysics. There is no possibility of confirmation, no correspondence rules for connecting the theory with observable phenomena.

On the other hand, we can say:

These Ionian theories are certainly not scientific, but at least they are pictorial visions of theories. They are the first primitive beginnings of science.

It must not be forgotten that, both in the history of science and in the psychological history of a creative scientist, a theory has often first appeared as a kind of visualization, a vision that comes as an inspiration to a scientist long before he has discovered correspondence rules that may help in confirming his theory. When Democritus said that everything consists of atoms, he certainly had not the slightest confirmation for his theory. Nevertheless, it was a stroke of genius, a profound insight, because two thousand years later his vision was confirmed. We should not, therefore, reject too rashly any anticipatory vision of a theory, provided it is one that may be tested at some future time. We are on solid ground, however, if we issue the warning that no hypothesis can claim to be scientific unless there is the possibility that it can be tested… When a theory is first proposed, we should not demand more than this. (Carnap 1966: 244f)

In the more recent literature, Ladyman and Ross’s (2007) naturalized view of metaphysics, which urges metaphysicians to reflect, and contribute to, current scientific practice, might get close to what Carnap had in mind here. (Indeed, Ladyman and Ross 2007 begins with a quotation from Carnap and goes on to identify itself, in this respect, explicitly with Carnap’s standpoint: “Fortunately, in philosophy’s previous episodes of detachment from empirical inquiry, the Humes, Russells, and Carnaps have turned up when needed to save the enterprise from itself. While not claiming a mantle of their magnitude, we are here embarked on a mission of disciplinary rescue in their spirit” (2007: 27).)

However, Carnap was never able to make this second type of criticism sufficiently precise for it to be applicable in practice. Even his later attempt, in “The Methodological Character of Theoretical Concepts” (1956a: §VI–VII), to explicate the distinction between empirically significant descriptive theoretical terms in science and empirically insignificant descriptive terms in metaphysics turned out to be unsuccessful, as was the further step, based on this distinction for terms, of distinguishing empirically significant sentences from insignificant ones (1956a: §VIII). (Though Lutz (2012c: 283–285, 289–290, and 293–295) not only provides a detailed reconstruction of these attempts and a survey of the relevant literature on the counterexamples to such definitions, but also suggests amendments, building on earlier suggestions by Creath (1976) and others, and argues for a more positive overall assessment of the project of explicating empirical significance.)

Alternatively, once made sufficiently precise, metaphysical claims might not turn out to be scientific-synthetic claims at the object level, but either refer explicitly to features of a linguistic framework, in which case they would be metalinguistic and framework-relative; or they would be analytic in a framework, in which case they would be object-linguistic and framework-relative, while their status could still be expressed and derived by metalinguistic means. This leads us to Carnap’s third type of criticism of metaphysics, which he combines with a criticism of Wittgenstein:

The fact that Wittgenstein does not believe in the possibility of the exact formulation of the sentences of the logic of science has as its consequence that he does not demand any scientific exactitude in his own formulations, and that he draws no sharp line of demarcation between the formulations of the logic of science and those of metaphysics

… translatability into the formal mode of speech—that is, into syntactical sentences—is the criterion which separates the proper sentences of the logic of science from the other philosophical sentences—we may call them metaphysical. (LSS: §73)

Here metaphysical sentences are characterized and criticized as those philosophical sentences which cannot be reconstructed as sentences expressing syntactic (or, in his later work, semantic or pragmatic) properties of a linguistic framework or its members. But actually, as we will see in the following paragraphs below, there is more continuity than meets the eye between a number of traditional metaphysical questions and Carnap’s pragmatic explication of external questions as questions about frameworks. His 1934 ad hoc negative definition of metaphysics does not actually exhaust the traditional category—as he himself later admitted. There would appear to be room, in other words, for a successor project to (some parts of) traditional metaphysics within Carnap’s apparently quite rigid strictures. Such a successor project would encompass those statements that characterize linguistic frameworks and considerations bearing on framework construction and on comparisons or choices among frameworks. Also included would be statements (on a more local scale) that characterize particular explications and considerations bearing on the suitability of, and choice among, explications. These statements can be external to a framework (syntactic, semantic, and pragmatic metastatements about frameworks), or internal to a framework but express properties of the framework internally (analytic sentences). The investigation and rational appraisal of such statements might be called an “enlightened” Carnapian successor project to traditional metaphysics.

Does this mean that philosophy, in Carnap’s eyes, is clearly demarcated from science, as the “internal to an object framework” versus “external to an object framework” distinction seems to suggest? Or is the logic of science simply a part of (meta-)science? Dreben (1990, 1994), following the lead of Quine, thought that Carnap’s supposedly “fundamental distinction” between analytic and synthetic sentences served the goal of preserving a space for philosophy distinct from science. Versions of the same thought can be found, e.g., in Hylton (1998: 46–49; 2007), Ricketts (2004, 2009), and Maddy (2007: 65–84). Indeed, Carnap certainly had a form of “two-level” conception (Maddy 2007: 47), and there is undoubtedly an analogy between Carnap’s internal-external distinction and Kant’s empirical-transcendental distinction (Bird 2006: 92–96) which both philosophers employed in their criticism of metaphysics. On the other hand, where Kant had wanted to build a leaner and meaner metaphysics on a more modest basis, Carnap thought he could do without it entirely—though he may well have been willing to countenance a “successor project” to some parts of metaphysics as we have outlined it here.

In the above anti-metaphysical quotation from §73 of the Logical Syntax, the legitimate sentences of Wissenschaftslogik (the logic of science) are distinguished from metaphysical ones by a criterion—translatability into the formal mode of speech—that Carnap himself would give up only a year or so after these lines appeared in print. And in fact, although he continued to seek a way of making the distinction between meaningful scientific sentences and metaphysical ones precise (in which, as we saw, he never succeeded), he eventually gave up on the whole idea of distinguishing a legitimate domain of “philosophical” sentences from the cognitively meaningless ones with full precision:

In earlier periods, I sometimes made attempts to give an explication of the term “philosophy”. The domain of those problems which I proposed to call “philosophical” became step by step more comprehensive… Yet actually none of my explications seemed fully satisfactory to me even when I proposed them; and I did not like the explications proposed by others any better. Finally, I gave up the search… it is unwise to attempt such an explication because each of them is more or less artificial. It seems better to leave the term “philosophy” without any sharp boundary lines. (Carnap 1963b: 862)

It was consistent with this admission of defeat that Carnap also allowed that some of what he might previously have excluded as “metaphysical” could be regarded as concerned with legitimate framework problems;

many metaphysical theses and discussions can certainly be regarded as more or less conscious preparatory stages on the way to a systematic logic and science, and as preliminary to framework analyses. (1963b: 862)

He mentions the work of Aristotle, Leibniz, Kant, Peirce, Whitehead, and Dewey as examples. Moreover, he thought of these problems as having fundamental importance, and had no desire to marginalize or downplay them:

In particular, many problems concerning conceptual frameworks seem to me to belong to the most important problems of philosophy. I am thinking here both of theoretical investigations and of practical deliberations and decisions with respect to an acceptance or a change of frameworks, especially of the most general frameworks containing categorial concepts which are fundamental for the representation of all knowledge. (1963b: 862)

So these “theoretical investigations” and “practical deliberations and decisions” concerning “an acceptance or a change of frameworks” (particular the most general ones “containing categorial concepts”) may be viewed as Carnap’s replacement for (and explication of, in the sense given in the supplement on Methodology) traditional metaphysics.

Such reconstructions of metaphysical statements would mostly take the form not of

an assertion but of a proposal [of a language or an explication]. Any dispute about the truth or falsehood of such a thesis is quite mistaken … we can at most discuss the utility of the proposal, or investigate its consequences. (LSS: §78)

And a proposal, unlike an assertion, takes the form of what Carnap would later, in the final chapter of his replies to critics (the Reply to Kaplan, Carnap 1963b), call an “optative”, i.e., a normative sentence. For Carnap, it makes no more sense to attribute truth or falsity to a proposal than it does to attribute truth or falsity to any other normative sentence. It was in this sense that he had sometimes said in earlier writings that normative (including value) sentences have no cognitive meaning. In his later writing, he was at pains to stress that this did not mean (as many had taken him to mean) that normative and value sentences are altogether meaningless, like some sentences of metaphysics. This functional classification of different uses of language, especially normative language, had sometimes (following Ayer 1935 and Stevenson 1944) been called “emotivism”, but Carnap thought the connotations of this name were highly misleading and coined the new term “non-cognitivism”—which has stuck. And this Carnapian functionalism (Creath 1994) has been generalized—along Carnapian lines, with explicit reference to Carnap—by Huw Price (1997). Carus (2018) argues that much of Price’s globalized functionalism is already implicit or even explicit in Carnap’s own writings; in a reply, Price (2018) largely agrees.

Such linguistic proposals would thus be answers to “external questions”, in the terminology of “Empiricism, Semantics, and Ontology” (ESO: 378), that is, just what might previously have been called metaphysical “questions concerning the existence or reality of the system of entities as a whole”, and in fact they are in Carnap’s view entirely legitimate external questions once they are understood as (non-cognitive) practical questions regarding the acceptance or use of frameworks or explications.

Those who raise [such a] question… have perhaps in mind not a theoretical question as their formulation seems to suggest, but rather a practical question, a matter of a practical decision concerning the structure of our language. We have to make the choice whether or not to accept and use the forms of expression in the framework in question. (ESO: 378–379)

Many have supposed (e.g., George 2012, Irzik 2003) that Carnap’s non-cognitivism leads to a certain irrationalism, since it may be thought to preclude application of reason to value questions or practical decisions, including decisions among proposed cognitive frameworks or explications. There can be no rational assertion for Carnap, according to this line of thought, no “judgement”, anterior to any linguistic framework, e.g., bearing on the choice among frameworks. The choice among frameworks (and also—though this is usually not made explicit—the choice among explications for a particular explicandum) must therefore, it seems, take place outside any rational framework. As George (2012) puts it, for Carnap, practical deliberation can “at best exert a non-rational influence on an agent who is choosing which framework to adopt”.

Talk of rational constraint only has its place within a framework, once a language and rules of reasoning and inquiry have been settled upon. For Carnap, this observation is critical in understanding why traditional philosophical disputes have proven to be so frustratingly irresolvable and so different from scientific disagreements: philosophers, unlike scientists, typically dispute about which framework to adopt, which language to speak, and no facts about the world can rationally bear on such disagreements. The empirical facts only come into focus, and talk of rational relevance only gets a grip, once a particular linguistic framework has been adopted. (2012: 10)

This diagnosis can also take the form of suspecting an infinite regress in the choice of meta-frameworks required for framework choice, meta-meta-frameworks for meta-framework choice, and so on (Steinberger 2016). But as Stein (1992) has argued, a kind of dialectic can be discerned in the later Carnap, between the cognitive and practical (or the theoretical and normative) realms. Rather than a hierarchy of languages in which choices among frameworks or explications could rationally be articulated, Stein sees a continuous mutual feedback between the cognitive realm and the practical, in which values are informed by knowledge, and knowledge requires values for the choice of framework. As values adjust to what we know, our way of articulating what we know adjusts to our values; neither side has the final word—there is no final word, but only a continuous adjustment and re-adjustment. (This conception is worked out in more detail by Carus (2017), who also draws on a newly-discovered continuation of Carnap’s reply to Kaplan (Carnap 2017).)

Not all formerly metaphysical questions or statements, however, are appropriately reconstructed as questions or statements concerning framework proposals. In some cases, after reconstruction, the metaphysical statements in question might simply turn out to be descriptive sentences about frameworks which would thus be true or false on the metalevel (and some metaphysical questions might concern the truth or falsity of such metasentences). In such a case, making the (from Carnap’s point of view) tacit reference to frameworks explicit may still pay off, e.g., by helping philosophers avoid pseudo-debates about what merely seem to be mutually exclusive metaphysical theses: e.g., while the logicist thesis “Numbers are classes of classes of things” seems to rule out the formalist thesis “Numbers belong to a special primitive kind of objects”, their respective syntactic meta-counterparts “Numerical expressions (in the logicist language) are class-expressions of the second level” and “Numerical expressions (in the formalist language) are expressions of the zero-level” are perfectly consistent with each other. The same holds for the only apparent contradiction between the positivistic “A thing is a complex of sense-data” and a more realistic “A thing is a complex of atoms”, which turn out to be compatible, once they have been replaced, respectively, by “Every sentence in which a thing-designation occurs can be reconstructed as a class of sentences in the phenomenalist language” and “Every sentence in which a thing-designation occurs can be reconstructed as a sentence in the physicalist language”. (These examples are minor modifications of some of Carnap’s own examples in §78 of the Logical Syntax.)

In the same sense, some metaphysical sentences might turn out to be reconstructible as analytic in an object framework, in which case their analyticity could still be expressed by true sentences on the metalevel again: e.g., “\(\exists x \textit{Prime}(x)\)” (there is a prime number) is analytic in Language II of the Logical Syntax, hence “‘\(\exists x \textit{Prime} (x)\)’ is analytic-in-Language II” is true, whereas “‘\(\exists x\textit{Prime}(x)\)’ is analytic-in-Language I” is not (as “\(\exists x\textit{Prime}(x)\)” is not even well-formed in Language I of the Logical Syntax, see the supplement on Logical Syntax of Language). Such analytic existence claims in a framework would be answers to what Carnap calls “internal questions” in “Empiricism, Semantics and Ontology” (ESO: 378), that is, “questions of the existence of certain entities of the new kind within the framework”, where—in cases such as “\(\exists x\textit{Prime}(x)\)”—“The answers may be found… by purely logical methods” (ESO: 378). (In the case of empirical sentences, the answers would need to be found by empirical methods.) Carnap’s interpretation of ontological claims like \(\exists x\textit{Prime} (x)\) will be addressed in the next section, where we will also point to some closely related references in the recent metaphysical literature.

Whether our suggestion of an “enlightened” successor project to some aspects of metaphysics or Carnap’s own later partial endorsement of certain traditional metaphysical projects would or would not ultimately rule out the study and application of important traditional metaphysical concepts, such as, e.g., metaphysical necessity, the Ding an sich, or absolute spirit, remains an open question—as does the question whether metaphysics ultimately has a well-defined subject matter distinct from those of science, logic, and philosophy of science.

3. Ontology and Meta-Ontology

Ontology was one of the major bones of contention between Carnap and Quine, second only to the analytic-synthetic distinction (see supplement on Carnap versus Quine on the Analytic-Synthetic Distinction). Carnap’s “two-level” distinction between internal and external questions (see section 2 above) made the deductive or inductive justification of ontological statements (existence statements) an internal matter, while external questions concerned mainly pragmatic choices among language frameworks. For Quine, in contrast, there were only internal questions; no standpoint external to the “conceptual scheme” we find ourselves “within” was available, in his view, from which one could make a choice among such schemes. He acknowledged a distinction between descriptive and normative sentences, but considered the latter to be internal to a conceptual scheme in this sense as well; he rejected—or did not see (Creath 1994)—the functionalism in Carnap’s view discussed in section 2 above. Semantic ascent was allowed and useful Quine (1960a: §56) thought, but statements in the metalanguage were restricted to (translations of) the terms of the conceptual scheme canonically stated in the scientific object language:

This ascent to a linguistic plane of reference is only a momentary retreat from the world, for the utility of the truth predicate is precisely the cancellation of linguistic reference. The truth predicate is a reminder that, despite a technical ascent to talk of sentences, our eye is on the world. (Quine 1970a: 12)

Quine (1969) did admit the possibility of different conceptual schemes with different ontologies, but he saw no possibility of choosing among these from “outside”—while we are “inside” our present scheme, we have no way of stepping outside it (Quine 1986: 157). As Hintikka (1990) pointed out, this insistence on the inescapability of our current conceptual scheme harks back to the “universal” conception of language of Frege, Russell, and Wittgenstein (van Heijenoort 1967, Goldfarb 1979), which Carnap had criticized in the Logical Syntax (see section 1 above).

While Carnap accepts the Quinean maxim that “to be is to be the value of a bound variable” (§10 of Meaning and Necessity) for internal questions or assertions of existence, he makes these bound variables precise in artificial linguistic frameworks about which we do have a choice. His resulting approach to ontological questions, such as “What is real?” and “What exists?”, remained remarkably stable over the course of his career, as we now briefly survey.

We start with the Aufbau. Its final Part V concerns applications of the theory of constitution systems (see supplement on Aufbau) to philosophical problems. Carnap’s basic idea there is that the only concepts, objects, and statements that are scientifically (and hence philosophically) acceptable are those that can be expressed or denoted by formulas in a constitution system.

Take, for instance, the concept real (the central focus of Part V of the Aufbau). On the one hand, there is an empirical notion of reality that is perfectly acceptable to Carnap, because it can be defined, e.g., in his phenomenalist constitution system. As far as physical things are concerned, real ones are those that can be reconstructed as

classes of physical points which are located on connected bundles of world lines and have a place within the comprehensive four-dimensional system of the space-time world of physics. (§170)

In contradistinction, nonreal physical things are things that bear some similarities with the real ones but which for which no such place can be found (e.g., dreams, hallucinations, and the like). This

difference between reality and nonreality… retains its full meaning even in a constitution system which is based on an autopsychological basis. (§170)

(The real/nonreal distinction can then be extended from physical objects to psychological and cultural ones.)

On the other hand, sometimes philosophers also employ a metaphysical concept of reality according to which something is real just in case it exists independently from the cognizing subject. While different philosophical schools and traditions coincide in their verdicts about reality in the empirical sense (since these belong ultimately to empirical science), they diverge about metaphysical reality. For instance: realism regards physical objects as metaphysically real, while idealism and phenomenalism do not. These schools “agree within the field of epistemology. Constitution theory represents the neutral foundation which they have in common” (§178), however, the metaphysical concept of reality that seems to be required to express their differences cannot be reconstructed in a constitution system (§176), Carnap argues. And, for similar reasons, concepts such as thing-in-itself cannot be expressed by means of formulas in a constitution system either.

It is very important, therefore, not to mistake Carnap’s phenomenalist constitution system in the Aufbau (see supplement on Aufbau) for some form of metaphysical phenomenalism: the former is a linguistic system, the latter is (or, in Carnap’s view, merely seems to be) a thesis; the former constitutes one particular way of expressing the “neutral foundation” that the latter shares with its metaphysical rivals. Carnap calls this property of his phenomenalist system “methodological solipsism” in order to distinguish it from a solipsism that claims other subjects not to be “real” in the metaphysical sense. Similarly:

It is occasionally said that there is a (usually tacit) realism at the bottom of the practical procedures of the empirical sciences, especially of physics. However, we must here clearly distinguish between a certain kind of language usage and the assertion of a thesis. The realistic orientation of the physicist shows itself primarily in the use of realistic language; this is practical and justifiable. (§178)

This clearly anticipates Carnap’s later distinction between internal and external questions in “Empiricism, Semantic, and Ontology”. (Without using the terminology, he already distinguishes the two kinds of questions in an example in §175 of the Aufbau.)

So far as Carnap’s later work in the philosophy of science is concerned, Section IV of “The Methodological Character of Theoretical Concepts” (1956) contains a very similar discussion of different senses of “reality” to that in the Aufbau. The same holds for the second (1974) edition of Philosophical Foundations of Physics (crucially revised with respect to this very issue shortly before his death in 1970):

It is obvious that there is a difference between the meanings of the instrumentalist and the realist ways of speaking. My own view, which I shall not elaborate here, is essentially this. I believe that the question should not be discussed in the form: “Are theoretical entities real?” but rather in the form: “Shall we prefer a language of physics (and of science in general) that contains theoretical terms, or a language without such terms?” From this point of view the question becomes one of preference and practical decision. (Carnap 1974: 256; A footnote at the end of this paragraph, absent in the first edition, cites ESO)

The same can be said about Carnap’s approach to matters of “reality” or “existence” as these expressions occur in semantics, as he makes clear in Meaning and Necessity (see 1956b: 54f) and, most explicitly, in “Empiricism, Semantics and Ontology”. The relevant question is this: does the very use of semantics “commit” one to the existence (in some sense) of the objects referred to, or quantified over, in a language (whether in the object language or in the semantic metalanguage)? The semantics of almost any reasonably equipped mathematical object language would, in that case, commit its user (e.g., the physicist) to an extensive universe of abstract objects, as would using a semantic metalanguage in which one speaks of extensions or intensions understood as sets or classes of some kind. The response of most scientifically-minded philosophers at the time, ranging from Neurath to Quine, was to approach semantics with suspicion and to insist that, if used at all, it be interpreted in purely nominalistic or reductionist terms, dispensing with abstract objects (Carus 2019). One of the most vocal critics was Gilbert Ryle (1949), who accused Carnap of naively projecting the semantic relation between a proper name and its bearer onto all discourse, assuming there must be entities corresponding to all parts of speech just as there are to proper names, and so embracing what Ryle called the “‘Fido’-Fido principle”.

Carnap addressed this question upfront in “Empiricism, Semantics, and Ontology” (see section 2. above). He denied that the adoption and use of a language implies a belief in the entities it posits (analogous to van Fraassen’s later constructive empiricism denying that the acceptance of a theory implies a belief in its unobservable portions). There is simply no question of fact or reality involved, just the practical question whether to use a certain tool. Since the decision to use a certain language is not a theory or claim, no form of inference can (for Carnap, a non-cognitivist about normative statements; see section 2 above) derive from that decision any conclusion about the existence of the entities referred to in some extra-linguistic sense. In fact, the thesis that some thing is trans- or extra-linguistically real cannot even be formulated in the language whose vocabulary contains a name of that thing. The “‘Fido’-Fido principle” is not a theory, as Ryle claims; it is simply “the practical decision to accept certain frameworks” (ESO: Section 4). This position, as Carnap points out, is entirely consistent with the Vienna Circle’s rejection of all questions of existence, outside an agreed language, as pseudo-questions. And rejecting the question is to be sharply distinguished, he reminds his readers, from nominalism and skepticism, which deny the existence of the entities in question. This was just as bad as affirming them, in Carnap’s view. The Vienna Circle position rejects the question itself as underspecified. An imaginary dialogue between a nominalist and a realist (Section 4 of ESO) results in a stand-off, with neither party recognizing the arguments of the other as relevant. Carnap is therefore compelled, he says, to regard the question of ultimate “reality” at issue between them as a pseudo-question,

until both parties to the controversy offer a common interpretation of the question as a cognitive question; this would involve an indication of possible evidence regarded as relevant by both sides. (ibid.)

Where does that leave matters of existence, then? As in the Aufbau (see above), Carnap distinguishes two senses of “exist”. Strictly speaking, we can only use it internally, he says, that is, relative to a language framework. For instance, in a suitably defined mathematical framework, the existence of numbers, prime numbers, square numbers,… is analytic in the framework, since the corresponding existential statements are provable by the deductive rules of the framework (see the discussion in the last section; and compare Ebbs 2017: Chapter 2). Similarly, in a framework for empirical science, existence claims for empirical entities can be formulated in the framework, these existence claims can be justified based on observations that can be described in the framework, and the manner in which these existence claims are justified can be explicated by methods of inductive reasoning that belong to the framework. Some philosophers, however, have also used “exist” externally. They are not interested in the (internal) question whether, say, numbers exist in the language of Zermelo-Frankel set theory—the answer is trivial. They want to know whether the system of numbers really exists as a whole, in some general, extra-linguistic sense, independently of us, beyond the realm of human whim and convention. As we saw, Carnap rejects such external questions, at least at face value, and suggests they be reinterpreted or explicated as questions about the desirability of alternative languages or frameworks, and their suitability to specified purposes (Flocke forthcoming-a). But this is a very different kind of discussion from traditional (or now once again prevalent) wrangles about ontology; the question is no longer about “what there is” but about the relative merit of different tools for different purposes:

… the choice of a certain language structure and, in particular, the decision to use certain types of variables is a practical decision like the choice of an instrument; it depends chiefly upon the purposes for which the instrument—here the language—is intended to be used and upon the properties of the instrument. I admit that the choice of a language suitable for the purposes of physics and mathematics involves problems quite different from those involved in the choice of a suitable motor for a freight airplane; but, in a sense, both are engineering problems, and I fail to see why metaphysics should enter into the first any more than into the second. (Carnap 1947: §10)

In this way, Carnap transforms external questions about “the existence or reality of the system of entities as a whole” (ESO: section 2)—the existence or reality of the system of things, the system of thing properties, the system of numbers, the system of propositions and other abstract entities in semantics—into the practical question whether a certain linguistic framework is to be adopted for a certain purpose. The acceptance of a kind of entities consists in the acceptance of a framework (see section 3 of ESO)—choosing suitable general terms (“universal words” in the language of §76 of the Logical Syntax), such as “thing”, “thing property”, “number”, and “proposition”, and the required sorts of variables for the quantifiers (and, of course, rules of different kinds).

In recent years, Carnap’s reconstruction of ontology has received a lot of attention from metaphysicians who are interested in meta-ontology (discourse about ontology) and deflationism about ontology (which holds that ontological questions are unsubstantial or merely verbal). Many of these authors aim to untangle the ontological internal versus external debate from the semantic analytic versus synthetic debate, in order not to be affected by Quine’s criticism (see supplement on Carnap versus Quine on the Analytic-Synthetic Distinction): for Quine had thought that

One conspicuous consequence of Carnap’s belief in this dichotomy [analytic-vs.-synthetic] may be seen in the attitude towards philosophical issues, e.g., as to what there is. It is only by assuming the cleavage between analytic and synthetic truths that he is able, e.g., to declare the problem of universals to be a matter not of theory but of linguistic decision. (Quine 1960b: Section 10)

Carnap (ESO) himself points out that internal questions may be answered on either analytic or empirical grounds, so the concept of analyticity is not always required to address internal existence questions. (Besides, Carnap leaves open the possibility of a language without analytic sentences—he thinks such a language would be highly impractical, but it is certainly conceivable.) See Thomasson (2014: Chapter 7) for more on this, see, e.g., Yablo (1998) for a proposal for how to disentangle the internal-external distinction from the analytic-synthetic distinction, and see Gallois (1998) for a criticism of Yablo’s proposal. In any case, since the set of analytic sentences in a Carnapian framework is a “by-product” of Carnap’s understanding of artificial linguistic frameworks, metaphysicians need to modify that understanding of analyticity or framework if they want to avoid the issue of analyticity when addressing external questions. See Yablo (1998, 2014), Thomasson (2009, 2014, 2016), Hirsch (2011), Hofweber (2016), Section 5 of Berto and Plebani (2015), and the edited collections of articles in Chalmers, Manley and Wasserman (2009) and Blatti and Lapointe (2016) for representative contributions to metaontological deflationism and related ongoing debates on ontology in the Carnapian tradition.

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