# Cellular Automata

*First published Mon Mar 26, 2012; substantive revision Fri Dec 15, 2023*

Cellular automata (henceforth: CA) are *discrete*, *abstract
computational systems* that have proved useful both as general
models of complexity and as more specific representations of
non-linear dynamics in a variety of scientific fields. Firstly, CA are
(typically) spatially and temporally *discrete*: they are
composed of a finite or denumerable set of homogeneous, simple units,
the *atoms* or *cells*. At each time unit, the cells
instantiate one of a finite set of states. They evolve in parallel at
discrete time steps, following state update functions or dynamical
transition rules: the update of a cell state obtains by taking into
account the states of cells in its local neighborhood (there are,
therefore, no actions at a distance). Secondly, CA are
*abstract*: they can be specified in purely mathematical terms
and physical structures can implement them. Thirdly, CA are
*computational* systems: they can compute functions and solve
algorithmic problems. Despite functioning in a different way from
traditional, Turing machine-like devices, CA with suitable rules can
emulate a universal
Turing machine (see entry),
and therefore compute, given Turing’s thesis (see entry on
Church-Turing thesis),
anything computable.

The mark of CA is in their displaying complex emergent behavior, starting from simple atoms following simple local rules. Because of this, CA attract a growing number of researchers from the cognitive and natural sciences willing to study pattern formation and complexity in a pure, abstract setting. This entry provides an introduction to CA and focuses on some of their philosophical applications: these range from the philosophy of computation and information processing, to accounts of reduction and emergence in metaphysics and cognition, to debates around the foundations of physics.

We will proceed as follows. In the introductory Section 1, CA are first explained via an example: Section 1.1 describes a simple one-dimensional automaton displaying an intuitively manifest behavior. Sections 1.2–1.3 provide a short survey of the history and main applications of CA.

In Section 2, the general theory of CA is explained, together with a selection of computational and complexity-theoretic results in the field. Section 2.1 provides a fourfold schematic definition of CA. Sections 2.2–2.3 explain the classification of one-dimensional CA proposed by Stephen Wolfram. Section 2.4 introduces the Edge of Chaos hypothesis, a key CA-related conjecture in complexity theory. Sections 2.5–2.7 generalize to automata occupying more than one spatial dimension, and/or relaxing some parameters in the definition of 2.1. We focus on the Game of Life—possibly the most popular CA—and its computational capabilities.

Section 3 describes four main uses of CA in philosophical
investigation. Firstly, since CA display complex behavioral patterns
emerging from simple local rules, they have been naturally linked to
*emergence*: this topic is dealt with in Section 3.1, where
different notions of emergence are considered. Secondly, Section 3.2
explores how CA have been put to work, both by philosophers and by
scientists, to address the traditional philosophical problems of
*free will* and *determinism*. Thirdly, Section 3.3
describes the impact of CA theories on the philosophy of computation.
Finally, Section 3.4 addresses ontological issues ranging from the
sense in which CA count as modelling portions of reality, to the bold
philosophical conjecture of some scientists, who claim that the
physical world itself may be, at its bottom, a discrete, digital
automaton.

- 1. Introduction
- 2. Some Basic Notions and Results
- 3. CA and Philosophy
- 4. Concluding Remarks
- Bibliography
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Introduction

### 1.1 Getting Started: A Very Simple CA

We introduce CA using a simple example. Think of an automaton as a
one-dimensional grid of simple elements (the cells). Each of them can
only instantiate one of two states; let us say that each cell can be
turned *on* or *off*. The evolution of the system is
determined by a transition rule, to be thought of as implemented in
each cell. At each time step, each cell updates its status in response
to what happens to its neighboring cells, following the rule.

Fig. 1

Although CA are abstract, having a concrete instance in mind can help in the beginning. So think of Fig. 1 as representing the front row of a high school classroom. Each box stands for a student wearing (black) or not wearing (white) a hat. Let us make the two following assumptions:

Hat rule: a student will wear the hat in the following class if one or the other—but not both—of the two classmates sitting immediately on her left and on her right has the hat in the current class (if nobody wears a hat, a hat is out of fashion; but if both neighbors wear it, a hat is now too popular to be trendy).

Initial class: during the first class in the morning, only one student in the middle shows up with a hat (see Fig. 2).

Fig. 2

Fig. 3 shows what happens as time goes by. Consecutive rows represent the evolution in time through subsequent classes.

Fig. 3

Fig. 3 may be surprising. The evolutionary pattern displayed contrasts with the simplicity of the underlying law (the “Hat rule”) and ontology (for in terms of object and properties, we only need to take into account simple cells and two states). The global, emergent behavior of the system supervenes upon its local, simple features, at least in the following sense: the scale at which the decision to wear the hat is made (immediate neighbors) is not the scale at which the interesting patterns become manifest.

This example is a paradigmatic illustration of what makes CA appealing to a vast range of researchers:

even perfect knowledge of individual decision rules does not always allow us to predict macroscopic structure. We get macro-surprises despite complete micro-knowledge. (Epstein 1999: 48)

Since the notion of *emergence* and the micro-macro interplay
have such an important role in science and philosophy (see the entries
on
supervenience
and
emergent properties;
for a sample of scientific applications, see Mitchell 2009:
2–13; Gell-Mann 1994: Ch. 9), it has been suggested that many
scientific as well as conceptual puzzles can be addressed by adopting
the CA perspective. Stephen Wolfram has gone as far as claiming that
CA may help us to solve longstanding issues in philosophy:

Among them [the fundamental issues philosophers address] are questions about the ultimate limits of knowledge, free will, the uniqueness of the human condition and the inevitability of mathematics. Much has been said over the course of philosophical history about each of these. Yet inevitably it has been informed only by current intuitions about how things are supposed to work. But my discoveries in this book [A New Kind of Science] lead to radically new intuitions. (Wolfram 2002: 10)

These are very bold claims. In order to assess them, let us take a closer look at the field.

### 1.2 An Overview of CA’s Capabilities

The surprising patterns in the aforementioned classroom example were generated by boxes in a line with just two states and a simple rule. One may wonder how many variations are possible on such a basic framework. To address this issue, let us begin by considering how Andrew Ilachinski, in his review of the literature, narrows down CA applications to four main areas, which will be referred to in the rest of this entry (Ilachinski 2001: 7):

- (CA
_{1}) - As powerful computational engines.
- (CA
_{2}) - As discrete dynamical system simulators.
- (CA
_{3}) - As conceptual vehicles for studying pattern formation and complexity.
- (CA
_{4}) - As original models of fundamental physics.

(CA_{1})
emphasizes that CA perform computations. Just like Turing machines,
they can be specified in mathematical terms, and implemented in
different physical systems. However, CA are peculiar in two important
ways. First, unlike Turing machines and von Neumann-architecture
conventional computers, CA compute in a *parallel*, distributed
fashion. Second, computation is pretty much “in the eye of the
beholder”: there is no tape, but the evolution of the
cells’ states can often be interpreted as a meaningful
computational procedure (e.g., bits can be encoded using the
*white*/*black* cell states). Computational hardware
inspired by CA can help solve important technological problems (see
Ilachinski 2001: 8), but apart from engineering issues,
(CA_{1})
also points to major conceptual questions, such as how exactly a
universal Turing machine and an automaton can be rigorously compared
(see Beraldo-de-Araújo & Baravalle forthcoming) and what
are, if any, the philosophical implications of this comparison (see
Wolfram 2002: Ch. 12).

(CA_{2})
comprises scientific applications of CA to the modelling of specific
problems—to mention just a few: urban evolution (Batty 2005),
Ising models (Creutz 1986), neural networks (Franceschetti, et al.
1992: 124–128), lattice fluids (Barberousse & Imbert 2013),
security (Ray et al. 2023 [Other Internet Resources]), bioinformatics
(Xiao et al. 2011), and
even turbulence phenomena (Chen et al. 1983). As Ilachinski remarks,
for instance, discrete models of turbulence show that

very simple finite dynamical implementations of local conservation laws are capable of exactly reproducing continuum system behavior on the macroscale. (Ilachinski 2001: 8)

(CA_{3})
and
(CA_{4})
enter very directly into the philosophical arena: as for
(CA_{3}),
Daniel Dennett has resorted to a famous automaton we describe below,
Conway’s *Game of Life*, to make his point on determinism
and the attribution of high-level concepts to emergent patterns
(Dennett 1991, 2003). As for
(CA_{4}),
CA can provide an account of microphysical dynamics by representing
discrete counterparts of quantum field theories (see entry on
Quantum Field Theory)
alternative to the standard continuous frames. But the more
philosophical, and quite bolder, claim in this area is that nature
itself may be a CA: Edward Fredkin, for instance, has advanced his
“Finite Nature” hypothesis that our universe is an
automaton which, at each time step, digitally and locally processes
its state for the next time step (see Fredkin 1993). Apart from the
interest generated by Fredkin’s claim, entertaining the
hypothesis raises a number of questions at the crossroads of physics
and metaphysics (what is a natural law?), epistemology (what are the
limits of physical systems predictability?) and the philosophy of
information (what is the role of information in the physical world?).
We will address each of these questions in the third Section of this
entry.

### 1.3 A Brief History

The father of CA is John von Neumann (von Neumann 1951). Working on
self-replication and attempting to provide a reductionist theory of
biological development, von Neumann was trying to conceive a system
capable of producing exact copies of itself. Now biology *prima
facie* appears to be the realm of fluidity and continuous
dynamics. But following a suggestion of his colleague Stanislaw Ulam,
von Neumann decided to focus on a discrete, two-dimensional system.
Instead of just *black*-or-*white* cells, von
Neumann’s automaton used 29 different states and rather
complicated dynamics, and was capable of self-reproduction. Von
Neumann’s CA was also the first discrete parallel computational
model in history formally shown to be a universal computer, i.e.,
capable of emulating a universal Turing machine and computing all
recursive functions (see entry).

In the early Sixties, E.F. Moore (1962) and Myhill (1963) proved the
Garden-of-Eden theorems stating conditions for the existence of
so-called Gardens of Eden, i.e., patterns that cannot appear on the
lattice of a CA except as initial conditions. Gustav Hedlund (1969)
investigated cellular automata within the framework of symbolic
dynamics. In 1970 the mathematician John Conway introduced his
aforementioned *Life* game (Berkelamp, Conway, & Guy 1982),
arguably the most popular automaton ever, and one of the simplest
computational models ever proved to be a universal computer. In 1977,
Tommaso Toffoli used cellular automata to directly model physical
laws, laying the foundations for the study of reversible CA (Toffoli
1977).

Stephen Wolfram’s works in the 1980s contributed to putting the
growing community of CA followers on the scientific map. In a series
of papers, Wolfram extensively explored one-dimensional CA, providing
the first qualitative taxonomy of their behavior and laying the
groundwork for further research. A particular transition rule for
one-dimensional CA, known as *Rule 110*, was conjectured to be
universal by Wolfram. Some twenty years after the conjecture, Matthew
Cook proved that *Rule 110* is capable of universal computation
(Cook 2004; Wolfram 2002 also contains a sketch of the proof).

## 2. Some Basic Notions and Results

### 2.1 Basic Definitions

We are now taking a closer look at CA, focusing on models and results of philosophical interest. Although the variety of systems to be found in the CA literature is vast, one can generate virtually all CA by tuning the four parameters that define their structure:

*Discrete n-dimensional lattice of cells*: We can have one-dimensional, two-dimensional, … ,*n*-dimensional CA. The atomic components of the lattice can be differently shaped: for example, a 2D lattice can be composed of triangles, squares, or hexagons. Usually*homogeneity*is assumed: all cells are qualitatively identical.*Discrete states*: At each discrete time step, each cell is in one and only one state, \(\sigma \in \Sigma, \Sigma\) being a set of finite cardinality \(|\Sigma| = k\).*Local interactions*: Each cell’s behavior depends only on what happens within its local*neighborhood*of cells (which may or may not include the cell itself). Lattices with the same basic topology may have different definitions of neighborhood, as we will see below. It is crucial, however, to note that “actions at a distance” are not allowed.*Discrete dynamics*: At each time step, each cell updates its current state according to a deterministic transition function \(\phi: \Sigma^n \rightarrow \Sigma\) mapping neighborhood configurations (*n*-tuples of states of \(\Sigma\)) to \(\Sigma\). It is also usually, though not necessarily, assumed that (i) the update is*synchronous*, and (ii) \(\phi\) takes as input at time step*t*the neighborhood states at the immediately*previous*time step \(t - 1\).

One can exhaustively describe, for instance, the automaton of our classroom example:

- 1-dimensional lattice of square cells on a line.
- \(\Sigma = {1, 0}\) (1 = black or hat on, 0 = white or hat off), so \(|\Sigma| = 2\).
- Each cell’s neighborhood is composed by the two nearest
cells. If we index the cells by the integers, so that \(c_i\) is cell
number
*i*, then the neighborhood of \(c_i\) is \(N(c_i) = \langle c_{i - 1}, c_{i + 1}\rangle\). - The transition rule \(\phi\) is simple: At each time step
*t*, a cell state is 1 if exactly one of the neighboring cells was 1 at \(t - 1, 0\) otherwise.

A rule for a CA can be expressed as a conditional instruction:
“If the neighborhood is this-and-this, then turn to state
*s*”. One can write the general form of the rule for
one-dimensional CA:

Where \(\sigma_{i}(t) \in \Sigma = \{0, 1, \ldots, k - 1\}\) is the
state of cell number *i* at time step *t*; *r*
specifies the *range*, that is, how many cells on any side
count as neighbors for a given cell; and \(\phi\) is defined
explicitly by assigning values in \(\Sigma\) to each of the \(k^{2r+1}
(2r + 1)\)-tuples representing all the possible neighborhood
configurations. For example, with \(r = 1, \Sigma = \{1, 0\}\), a
possible transition rule \(\phi\) can be expressed as in
Fig. 4
(with 1 being represented as *black*, 0 as *white*):

Fig. 4

For a given cell, each triple at the top represents a possible
neighborhood configuration at *t*, the cell at issue being the
one in the middle: for each configuration, the square at the bottom
specifies the cell’s state at \(t + 1\). This is our classroom
example: you will have a black cell just in case precisely one of the
neighbors was black.

### 2.2 The Wolfram Classification Scheme

This simple representation is also at the core of the widely adopted
Wolfram code (Wolfram 1983), assigning to each rule a number: with
*black* = 1 and *white* = 0, the bottom row can be read
as a binary number (01011010); converting to decimal gives you the
rule’s name (in this case, *Rule 90*). Since rules for CA
with \(r = 1\) and \(k = 2\) differ just in the bottom row of the
diagram, this encoding scheme effectively identifies each possible
rule in the class. One-dimensional CA with \(r = 1\) and \(k = 2\) are
among the simplest CA one can define, yet their behavior is at time
quite interesting. When Stephen Wolfram started to explore this field
in the Eighties, that class seemed a perfect fit. With \(r = 1\),
there are 8 possible neighbors (see
Fig. 4
above) to be mapped to \({1, 0}\), giving a total of \(2^8 = 256\)
rules. Starting with random initial conditions, Wolfram went on to
observe the behavior of each rule in many simulations. As a result, he
was able to classify the qualitative behavior of each rule in one of
four distinct classes. Repeating the original experiment, we simulated
the evolution of two rules for each class of Wolfram’s
scheme.

### 2.3 The Classes of the 256 Rules

Class_{1} rules leading to
homogeneous states, all cells stably ending up with the same value:

*Rule 250*

*Rule 254*

Class_{2} rules leading to
stable structures or simple periodic patterns:

*Rule 4*

*Rule 108*

Class_{3} rules leading to
seemingly chaotic, non-periodic behavior:

*Rule 30*

*Rule 90*

Class_{4} rules leading to
complex patterns and structures propagating locally in the lattice:

*Rule 54*

*Rule 110*

Class_{1} comprises the rules that quickly produce uniform
configurations. Rules in Class_{2} produce a uniform final
pattern, or a cycling between final patterns, depending on the initial
configurations. The configurations produced by members of
Class_{3} are pretty much random-looking, although some
regular patterns and structures may be present.

Class_{4} deserves special attention. If we observe the
universe generated by *Rule 110* we see regular patterns
(although not as regular as in *Rule 108*) as well as some
chaotic behavior (although not as noisy as in *Rule 90*). Now
the basic feature a CA needs to perform computations is the capacity
of its transition rule of producing “particle-like persistent
propagating patterns” (Ilachinski 2001: 89), that is, localized,
stable, but non-periodic configurations of groups of cells, sometimes
called *solitons* in the literature, that can preserve their
shape. These configurations can be seen as *encoding* packets
of information, *preserving* them through time, and
*moving* them from one place to another: information can
propagate in time and space without undergoing important decay. The
amount of unpredictability in the behavior of Class_{4} rules
also hints at computationally interesting features: by the Halting
Theorem (see section in entry on
Turing machines),
it is a key feature of universal computation that one cannot in
principle predict whether a given computation will halt given a
certain input. These insights led Wolfram to conjecture that
Class_{4} CA were (the only ones) capable of universal
computation. Intuitively, if we interpret the initial configuration of
a Class_{4} CA as its input data, a universal
Class_{4} CA can evaluate any effectively computable function
and emulate a universal Turing machine. As we mentioned above,
*Rule 110* was indeed proved to be computationally
universal.

(See the supplementary document The 256 Rules.)

### 2.4 The Edge of Chaos

The intermediate nature of Class_{4} rules is connected to the
idea that *interesting* complexity, such as the one displayed
by biological entities and their dynamics, lies in a middle area
between the two extremes of boring regularities and noisy chaos:

Perhaps the most exciting implication [of CA representation of biological phenomena] is the possibility that life had its origin in the vicinity of a phase transition and that evolution reflects the process by which life has gained local control over a successively greater number of environmental parameters affecting its ability to maintain itself at a critical balance point between order and chaos. (Langton 1990: 13)

CA provided not just the intuition, but a formal framework to
investigate the hypothesis. In the late Eighties the “Edge of
Chaos” picture received considerable interest by CA
practitioners. Packard 1988 and Langton 1990 were the first studies to
give to the Edge of Chaos a now well-known interpretation in the CA
context. As Miller and Page put it, “these early experiments
suggested that systems poised at the edge of chaos had the capacity
for emergent computation” (Miller & Page 2007: 129). The
idea is simple enough: what happens if we take a rule like *Rule
110* and introduce a small perturbation? If we are to believe the
Edge of Chaos hypothesis, we should expect the rules obtained by small
changes in *Rule 110* to exhibit either simple or chaotic
behavior. Let us consider a single switch from 1 to 0 or 0 to 1 in the
characteristic mapping of *Rule 110*. The results are the
following eight neighboring rules, each differing from *Rule
110* by a single bit (the diagonal in the array, with numbers in
italics):

110 |
111 |
108 |
106 |
102 |
126 |
78 |
46 |
228 | |

000 |
0 | 1 |
0 | 0 | 0 | 0 | 0 | 0 | 0 |

001 |
1 | 1 | 0 |
1 | 1 | 1 | 1 | 1 | 1 |

010 |
1 | 1 | 1 | 0 |
1 | 1 | 1 | 1 | 1 |

011 |
1 | 1 | 1 | 1 | 0 |
1 | 1 | 1 | 1 |

100 |
0 | 0 | 0 | 0 | 0 | 1 |
0 | 0 | 0 |

101 |
1 | 1 | 1 | 1 | 1 | 1 | 0 |
1 | 1 |

110 |
1 | 1 | 1 | 1 | 1 | 1 | 1 | 0 |
1 |

111 |
0 | 0 | 0 | 0 | 0 | 0 | 0 | 0 | 1 |

Class | 4 | 2 | 2 | 3 | 3 | 3 | 1 | 2 | 1 |

At a first approximation, the Edge of Chaos hypothesis is confirmed:
three of the eight neighbors are Class_{3}, three are
Class_{2}, two are Class_{1}: *Rule 110* is the
only Class_{4} in the table. To generalize these findings to
the entire class of rules for one-dimensional CA, Langton introduced a
parameter, \(\lambda\), that applies to each \(\phi\): for \(k = 2\),
\(r = 1\) (binary-state, unary-range) CA, \(\lambda(\phi)\) can be
computed as the fraction of entries of the transition rule table that
are mapped to a non-zero output (see Langton 1990: 14 for the general
definition). In our case this means: \(\lambda(\phi)\) will be equal
to the number of ones in the rule column—e.g., \(\lambda(\phi) =
5/8\) for \(\phi\) = *Rule 110* and \(\lambda(\phi) = 1/2\) for
\(\phi\) = *Rule 46*. Langton’s major finding was that a
simple measure such as \(\lambda\) correlates with the system
behavior: as \(\lambda\) goes from 0 to 1, the average behavior of the
systems goes from freezing to periodic patterns to chaos. Langton
singled out 1/2 as the value of \(\lambda\) at which the average
behavior first shows evidence of chaos: rules \(\phi\) with
\(\lambda(\phi) \sim 1/2\) were highlighted as being on the Edge (see
Miller & Page 2001: 133).

\(\lambda\) |
All Rules |
Chaotic Rules |
Complex Rules |

0 |
1 | 0 | 0 |

1/8 |
8 | 0 | 0 |

1/4 |
28 | 2 | 0 |

3/8 |
56 | 4 | 1 |

1/2 |
70 | 20 | 4 |

5/8 |
56 | 4 | 1 |

3/4 |
28 | 3 | 0 |

7/8 |
8 | 0 | 0 |

1 |
1 | 0 | 0 |

Both chaotic and complex rules have an average \(\lambda\) value around 1/2, thus apparently supporting the Edge of Chaos hypothesis. It is fair to say, though, that some have cast doubts on the explanatory role of parameter \(\lambda\) and the inferences drawn from it. In particular, the transition region of the Edge of Chaos seems to be itself complex. Miller and Page note that “there are multiple edges, not just a single one” (Miller & Page 2007: 133). Aggregate results do not hold when we analyze individual rules, even paradigmatic ones:

110 |
111 |
108 |
106 |
102 |
126 |
78 |
46 |
228 | |

\(\lambda\) | 5/8 | 3/4 | 1/2 | 1/2 | 1/2 | 3/4 | 1/2 | 1/2 | 3/4 |

As the table shows, among the *Rule 110* neighbors, some
chaotic rules \(\phi\) have \(\lambda(\phi) = 3/4\), some cyclic ones
have \(\lambda(\phi) = 1/2\) and, indeed,

every one of the rules classified as complex in this space has at least one chaotic neighbor with a lower \(\lambda\) value and one with higher value. (Miller & Page 2007: 135)

Melanie Mitchell, Peter Hraber and James Crutchfield replicated Langton and Packard’s experiments, reporting very different results (Mitchell, Hraber, & Crutchfield 1994). In particular, they report that serious computational phenomena take place much closer to a chaotic \(\lambda(\phi) = 1/2\) than it was previously thought. Apart from technical points, a conceptual flaw in the original findings is the use of aggregate statistics, which are difficult to interpret in a high variance context:

if, instead, the hypotheses are concerned with generic, statistical properties of CA rule space—the “average” behavior of an “average CA” at a given \(\lambda\)—then the notion of “average behavior” must be better defined. (Mitchell, Hraber, & Crutchfield 1994: 14).

While it is fair to conclude that complex behavior does not lie at the Edge of Chaos taken in a simplistic sense (i.e., it is not straightforwardly correlated with the simple \(\lambda\)), the interest in the connection between computational capabilities and phase transitions in the CA rule space has been growing since then. We will consider such developments below, specifically in the context of CA and the philosophy of computation.

### 2.5 CA in More Dimensions: the *Game of Life*

Notwithstanding the computational interest of one-dimensional CA,
philosophical issues have been discussed more often in connection with
two-dimensional CA. The first CA, von Neumann’s self-reproducing
automaton, inhabited a two-dimensional grid. Besides, two-dimensional
CA are suitable for representing many physical, biological, and even
human phenomena, ranging from the dynamics of perfect gases to the
movements of birds in a storm and soldiers on a battlefield. The most
common configurations have either square or hexagonal cells, given
their translational and rotational symmetries. Moving to two
dimensions, of course, also expands the possibly interesting
combinations of rules and neighborhoods. As for the latter, the two
most common options in a grid of squares are the *von Neumann*
neighborhood, where each cell interacts only with its four horizontal
and vertical adjacent mates, and the *Moore* neighborhood,
comprising all the eight immediately adjacent cells.

By way of example, we introduce the famous *Game of Life* (or,
more briefly, *Life*) by John Conway (see Berkelamp, Conway,
& Guy 1982). *Life* fits well with our usual schema:

- 2-dimensional lattice of square cells in an orthogonal grid.
- \(\Sigma = \{1, 0\}\), so \(|\Sigma| = 2\) (for reasons we are about to see, we can picture 1 as the state of being alive for a given cell, 0 as the state of being dead).
- Each cell’s neighborhood is composed of all its eight neighboring cells (the Moore neighborhood).
*Life*’s transition rule goes as follows. At each time step*t*exactly one of three things can happen to a cell:*Birth*: If the cell state at \(t - 1\) was 0 (dead), the cell state becomes 1 (alive) if exactly three neighbors were 1 (alive) at \(t - 1\);*Survival*: If the cell state at \(t - 1\) was 1 (alive), the cell state is still 1 if either two or three neighbors were 1 (alive) at \(t - 1\);-
*Death*: If the cell state at \(t - 1\) was 1 (alive), the cell state becomes 0 (dead) if either fewer than two or more than three neighbors were 1 (alive) at \(t - 1\) (cells can die of “loneliness” or “overpopulation”).

*Life* would definitely be considered a Class_{4} CA by
Wolfram’s taxonomy. In this simple setting, periodic structures,
stable blocks and complex moving patterns come into existence, even
starting from a very simple initial configuration. Conway remarked:

It’s probable, given a large enough

Lifespace, initially in a random state, that after a long time, intelligent, self-reproducing animals will emerge and populate some parts of the space. (cited in Ilachinski 2001: 131)

*Life*-fans explored the CA’s possible patterns of
evolution, and shared their findings in what has been called
*Life*’s zoology (Dennett 2003: 41). Here is a small
gallery of samples together with snapshots of a typical simulation
(for more pictures and animations, see
Other Internet Resources
at the end). *Gliders* are the most popular among the basic
*Life* inhabitants: a simple 5-bit structure, a glider can
travel the *Life* grid in a 4-time step cycle:

*Glider*

\(t_{0}\)

\(t_{1}\)

\(t_{12}\)

*Toads* are period 2 blinking configurations: together with
*Blinkers* and *Beacons* they are the simplest
oscillators of the universe.

*Toad*

\(t_{0}\)

\(t_{1}\)

\(t_{3}\)

*Eaters* have the feature of devouring other configurations,
e.g., gliders, maintaining intact their own form (because of this,
they play an important role for *Life*’s computational
abilities).

*An Eater devouring a Glider*

\(t_{0}\)

\(t_{2}\)

\(t_{4}\)

A typical evolution of *Life* starting from random initial
conditions may contain all of the above notable figures and much more.
Some initial configuration may end up, even after few time steps, into
static or simple periodic structures. Other configurations, though,
can produce non-periodic, increasingly complex environments whose
development can be unpredictable (even in the computational sense we
are about to explore). As Ilachinski has suggestively conjectured from
this:

Upon observing the seemingly unlimited complexity and variety of

Life’s evolving patterns, it becomes almost impossible to refrain from imagining, along with Conway, that, were the game really to be played on an infinite lattice, there must surely arise true living “life-forms”, perhaps themselves evolving into more complex, possibly sentient, “organisms”. (Ilachinski 2001: 133)

\(t_{0}\)

\(t_{10}\)

\(t_{20}\)

\(t_{30}\)

\(t_{40}\)

\(t_{175}\)

The mathematical literature on CA does not refrain from describing the
*Life* configurations using the same imaginative vocabulary we
used: items are *born*, *live*, *move* around,
*eat* other figures, *die*, etc. The universe these
patterns inhabit may also be described, though, as a collection of
individual cells, each of which does not directly depend on what is
happening on the macro-scale. And the life on *Life* can also
be described in the simple mathematical language of matrices and
discrete sequences. But if one is only told the basic *Life*
rule, one could hardly imagine the complexity it can
generate—until one sees it. *Life*’s reputation
among scientists and philosophers arguably comes from its challenging
naive intuitions about complexity, pattern formation and reality,
persistence, and continuity: as a toy universe we ourselves built, we
feel we should know in advance what dynamics are allowed. This has
been shown to be impossible, in a mathematically precise sense.

### 2.6 *Life* as a Universal Turing Machine

Like any other CA, *Life* can be considered a computational
device: an initial configuration of the automaton can encode an input
string. One can let the system run and, at some point, read the
current configuration as the result of the computation performed so
far, decoding it into an output string. But exactly what can
*Life* compute? It turns out that *Life* can compute
everything a universal Turing machine can and therefore, taking on
board Turing’s Thesis, function as a general purpose computer: a
suitable selection of initial conditions can ensure that the system
carry out arbitrary algorithmic procedures.

The proof of the universal computational capacities of *Life*
presented in Berkelamp, Conway, and Guy 1982 consists in showing that
the basic building blocks or primitives of standard digital
computation can be emulated by appropriate patterns generated by
*Life*—in particular: (a) data storage or memorization,
(b) data transmission requiring wires and an internal clock, and (c)
data processing requiring a universal set of logic gates, like
negation, conjunction and disjunction—an actual Turing machine
was later explicitly implemented in *Life* by Paul Rendell (see
Other Internet Resources).

This finding is not of great engineering importance (no one would
spend their time translating “\(24 + 26 / 13\)” into
*Life*). However, it raises a conceptual issue about any
universe sharing the capacity of producing and hosting universal
computers: because of the aforementioned Halting Theorem, no general
algorithm is to decide whether, given some initial configuration as
input, *Life* will eventually die out or halt. It is in this
sense that the evolution of the automaton is unpredictable. Given that
the development of CA that are computationally universal cannot be
predicted by direct mathematical analysis alone, it is no surprise
that CA practitioners have adopted the language of philosophy and
talked of *phenomenological studies* of CA (we will come back
to this terminology in more detail in
Section 3.4
below, discussing how CA model whatever they can model). Here the
automaton is realized as a computer software, and the observable
emergent properties of its evolution are empirically registered as the
computer simulation advances. In Wolfram’s turn of phrase,
*Life* is *algorithmically irreducible*: no algorithmic
shortcut is available to anticipate the outcome of the system given
its initial input. “*Life*—like all computationally
universal systems—defines the most efficient simulation of its
own behavior” (Ilachinski 2001: 15). This raises the important
philosophical question of the limits of the predictability of any
universe capable, just as *Life* is, of producing and hosting
universal computers.

### 2.7 Further CA

Notwithstanding the historical and conceptual centrality of the CA
described in this section, many important developments in the field
could not be presented in the space allowed for this entry. One can
relax some of the assumptions in the general characterization of CA
provided in
Section 2.1
and get interesting results. The transition rule can be
*probabilistic* and take into consideration more than just one
time step (see Richards, Meyer, & Packard 1990: probabilistic
automata are widely used to represent the stochastic dynamics of
microphysical systems); the cell state updating can be
*asynchronous* (see Ingerson & Buvel 1984); the lattice can
be made of *non-homogeneous* cells following different
transition rules (see Kauffman 1984); even the discreteness constraint
can be relaxed by having the set of states be the set of *real
numbers* (see Wolfram 2002: 155–157).

CA are also being fruitfully used in connection to the issue of the thermodynamic limits of computation: is there a minimum amount of energy needed to perform a logical operation? Landauer (1961) argued that irreversible logical operations (i.e., operations that, not corresponding to bijections, cannot be run backwards as they entail some information loss) necessarily dissipate energy. The invention of the Fredkin reversible logical gate and of the Billiard Ball Model of reversible computation (Fredkin & Toffoli 1982) strengthened the importance of the link between universal reversible automata and the physical properties of computation (for an overview, see Ilachinski 2001: 309–323; for a sample reversible CA, see Berto, Rossi, & Tagliabue 2016).

In recent years, the growth of Artificial Intelligence (AI) as a prominent sub-field in computer science led to interesting contamination between AI and CA. On the one hand, prominent AI researchers explicitly mentioned contributions from the complex system literature – such as CA – as alternative ways to model collective behavior (Ha & Tang 2022). On the other, traditional CA-based modeling has been extended to leverage the “powerful language of loss functions” (Mordvintsev et al. 2020) for differentiable rules, and take advantage of the extensive tooling built for gradient-based numerical optimization: CA built on top of neural networks showcase (learned) asynchronous rules (Mordvintsev et al. 2020) for morphogenesis, as well as (learned) variable neighborhood composition (Grattarola et al. 2021).

Finally, it is worth mentioning that *genetic algorithms* have
been used with CA to study how evolution creates computation (for a
survey of important results, see Mitchell, Crutchfield, & Das
1996). While the aforementioned sources further explore these
possibilities, the sample CA models discussed so far will be
sufficient for the philosophical arguments we are going to address
henceforth.

## 3. CA and Philosophy

A growing number of CA-related philosophical arguments are being produced, both by philosophers and by scientists interested in the conceptual implications of their work. Among the interesting issues addressed through the CA approach in the philosophical market are the structure of emergence, free will, the nature of computation, and the physical plausibility of a digital world.

### 3.1 CA and Emergence

CA can be considered a paradigmatic locus for the study of phenomena
related to *emergence* (for an introduction, see the entry on
emergent properties).
One can initially divide the problem of emergence into two separate
questions, roughly corresponding to epistemological and ontological
issues: How can we *recognize* emergence? What is the
*ontological status* of the high-level properties and features?
As a matter of historical fact, CA have been invoked mainly to address
the former, but we will see in
Section 3.4
below that there is work for CA also on the ontological side.

Epistemological issues have often been raised in connection with complex systems in general. In their open agenda for complex social systems, Miller and Page include the following question: “Is there an objective basis for recognizing emergence and complexity?” (Miller & Page 2007: 233–234). The literature on CA has variously addressed the issue. On the one hand, being a low-level simple and controllable environment, CA present themselves as a natural framework for tackling the problem in its purest form. On the other hand, CA researchers have recognized how the systemic and global features of a complex CA system can be hard to predict even with perfect knowledge of low-level entities and laws:

Over and over again we will see the same kind of thing: that even though the underlying rules for a system are simple, and even though the system is started from simple initial conditions, the behavior that the system shows can nevertheless be highly complex. (Wolfram 2002: 28)

Due to the local nature of a CA’s operations, it is typically very hard, if not impossible, to understand the CA’s global behavior (…) by directly examining either the bits in the lookup table or the temporal sequence of raw 1–0 spatial configurations of the lattice. (Hordijk, Crutchfield, & Mitchell 1996: 2)

Now the issue of detecting emergence is connected to the conceptual
problems of defining what an emerging feature is: we need
*some* idea of what we are looking for in order to scan the
space-time evolution of a system and recognize its patterns. We may
start with the fourfold characterization of emergence provided in
Clark 2013. Emergence may be taken:

- (E1)
- As collective self-organisation.
- (E2)
- As unprogrammed functionality.
- (E3)
- As interactive complexity.
- (E4)
- As incompressible unfolding.

In the first sense, an emergent feature is “any interesting
behaviour that arises as a direct result of multiple self-organizing
… interactions occurring in a system of simple elements”
(Clark 2013: 132). CA clearly fit the
E1
bill, but that is because this is a rather generic characterization
(What counts as interesting? What is self-organization?). Things get a
bit more precise with
E2:
emergent features here are taken as *unprogrammed*, that is,
as such that there is no program explicitly encoding the relevant
phenomena, features, or processes in the target system (a typical
example is cricket phonotaxis, see Clark 2013: 120: female crickets
move towards males via a mechanical body system directing them to the
source of sounds of particular wavelengths; one can describe this as
females aiming towards males after hearing their sound, but what is
encoded in the cricket’s body functions is just an automatic
earlier activation of the side of the body first reached by the
sounds). According to the concept embodied in
E3,
we get emergence as interactive complexity when “complex,
cyclic interactions give rise to stable and salient patterns of
systemic behavior” (Clark 2013: 134); in particular, the
interactions are supposed to be nonlinear (a typical example are
convection rolls in a fluid heated in a pan: see Kelso 1995: 5).

Now the emergent properties attracting CA scholars’ attention, unsurprisingly, have mainly been computational properties, i.e., the features enabling a system to perform complex calculations in spite of not being explicitly computationally encoded at the base level (which sits in the vicinity of E2). Additionally, as we have seen during our discussion of the Edge of Chaos hypothesis, CA scholars have focused on the study of nonlinear global dynamics emerging from the local interactions of the CA cells (which sits in the vicinity of E3). In order to introduce the formal work on emergent CA computation, and to compare these findings with the available philosophical accounts, we can start again with a concrete example. This is the “classification problem”.

We want to design a one-dimensional automaton that answers a simple question: Are there more white or black cells at a given time \(t_0\)? Starting from any initial conditions with more white (black) cells, the ideal automaton will halt having all its cells turned white (black) after a given number of time steps (designing an automaton that always gives the right answer is not feasible in practice; so the performance is judged by the fraction of random initial conditions that are correctly classified).

\(t_0\)

\(t_n\)

The task is far from trivial in a CA, involving the intricacy of the
emergence in both
E2
and
E3
sense. The answer requires a global perspective (how many cells are
white (black) in the lattice as a whole?). However, the cells work
with only local rules explicitly encoded in them: no single cell can
do the counting. The ideal automaton should find a way to aggregate
information from several parts of its own lattice to give the final
answer. A kind of emergent computation is needed to successfully solve
this density classification task. It has been proved that no CA can
solve this problem precisely (see Land & Belew 1995). Since,
however, CA with larger neighborhoods achieve better results in tasks
of this kind, *genetic algorithms* are used to efficiently
search the solution space (genetic algorithms are computational
analogues of genetic evolution, in which a computational problem is
addressed by producing, combining and selecting solutions to it; the
details of the procedure as applied to the classification problem are
not important for our purpose, but, for an accessible presentation,
see Mitchell 2009: 22; for a general introduction see Mitchell 1998).
The following is a diagram of the “Rule \(\phi_{17083}\)”,
discovered by James Crutchfield and Melanie Mitchell (1995). The CA
implementing the rule starts from an initial state with more white
cells:

Fig. 5

At time step 250 (not shown in Fig. 5), the grey areas disappear and all cells end up white, i.e., the classification made by the automaton is correct. A high-level description of what is going on would have it that the white, black and grey regions are “expanding”, “contracting”, “moving”, these being nonlinear effects of the low-level working of the cells computing their local states, and by so doing manage to carry signals along the lattice. But how are we to explain the emergent computation CA of this kind perform via such nonlinear dynamics? Building on previous works on computation theory applied to CA (Hanson & Crutchfield 1992; Crutchfield & Hanson 1993), Mitchell and Crutchfield filtered out from the original diagram what they call “domains”, i.e., dynamically homogeneous spatial regions (Crutchfield & Mitchell 1995: 10745):

Fig. 6

Although in this case the “domains” are manifest, it is crucial to point out that their definition is rigorously mathematical. The whole process of domain-detection can be carried out algorithmically (see Hanson & Crutchfield 1992 for details). When the boundary of a domain remains spatially localized over time, then the domain becomes a “particle”:

Embedded particles are a primary mechanism for carrying information (…) over long space-time distances. (…) Logical operations on the signals are performed when the particles interact. The collection of domains, domain walls, particles and particle interactions for a CA represents the basic information processing elements embedded in the CA’s behavior—the CA’s “intrinsic” computation. (Crutchfield & Mitchell 1995: 10744)

There are five stable particles (termed α, γ, δ, ε, µ) and one unstable particle (β) for this automaton: their interaction (annihilation, decay, reaction) supports the emergent logic of the system. The two circles in the image above are examples of what may happen during an interaction. In the first case, \(\alpha + \delta \rightarrow \mu\), a spatial configuration representing high, low, and then ambiguous densities is mapped to a high-density signal µ; in the second, \(\mu + \gamma \rightarrow \alpha\), a spatial configuration representing high, ambiguous, and then low density is mapped to an ambiguous-density signal α (Crutchfield & Mitchell 1995: 10745). The whole computational mechanics is worth being explored in more detail, but we can already safely generalize to the basic philosophical point of this and related works.

According to O’Connor and Wong 2015, in the context of dynamic systems and the study of complexity, emergence is characterized by most authors

strictly in terms of limits on human knowledge of complex systems. Emergence for such theorists is fundamentally an epistemological, not metaphysical, category. (O’Connor & Wong 2015: Sec. 2)

But the Crutchfield-Mitchell approach suggests a different
perspective. Firstly, the emergent (both in the
E2-
and in the
E3-
sense) computational properties in CA can in an important sense be
objectively defined (see Crutchfield 1994a and the more accessible
Crutchfield 1994b): although it is customary in this setting to talk
of emergent computation being “in the eye of the
beholder”, because not explicitly encoded at the base level, the
detection and classification of patterns is itself algorithmic.
Secondly, Crutchfield characterizes CA-emergence of this kind as, in a
sense, intrinsic: the emerging patterns “are important
*within* the system” (Crutchfield 1994b: 3), not merely
important for an observer *outside* the system. More precisely:
they are mathematically grounded on the basic features of the system,
despite not being explicitly mentioned in the standard abstract
characterization of the program, that is, the transition rule
implemented in the CA cells (Crutchfield mentions as non-intrinsic
emergent phenomena the patterns in the Belousov-Zhabotinsky reaction
and the energy recurrence in an harmonic oscillator chains reported by
Fermi, Pasta and Ulam—see Crutchfield 1994b).

Crutchfield infers from this that many cases of emergence are indeed not reducible to some interaction with an observer. They are genuine instances of an intrinsic phenomenon, not the results of some human-biased discovery (Crutchfield 1994b: 2). If emergence was not intrinsic, scientific activity would indeed be a subjective enterprise of “pattern discovery”:

Why? Simply because emergence defined without this closure leads to an infinite regress of observers detecting patterns of observers detecting patterns… (Crutchfield 1994b: 10)

Summarizing Crutchfield’s work, Miller and Page say that the concept of emergence

has thus made the transition from metaphor to a measure, from something that could only be identified by ocular magic to something that can be captured using standard statistics. (Miller & Page 2007: 234)

Such remarks may sound philosophically naive to a trained
epistemologist. It is not obvious, for instance, that the existence of
a mathematical or specifically algorithmic emergent pattern would
block a supposed regress entailed by a non-mathematical emergence. Why
would science as an activity of (occasionally) non-algorithmic pattern
discovery be a merely subjective enterprise? If these claims can be
re-phrased in a philosophically sophisticated way, though, they may
challenge standard definitions of *weakly emergent* properties
(in the sense of Chalmers 2002). Teller 1992, Clark 1996, and Bedau
1997, for instance, all run together instances of “pattern
discovery”—, taken as a subjective, observer-dependent
activity—with instances of intrinsic emergence—a
phenomenon that, as we have just seen, can be characterized in the
context of CA as objective and statistically significant (see the
relevant section of the entry on
emergent properties).

Finally, on to
E4:
emergence as incompressible unfolding. Bedau 1997 defines a
macro-state *emergent* in this sense just in case it can be
derived from knowledge of the system’s micro-components only by
direct simulation of the overall system evolution. Here the idea is
one of “emergent phenomena as those for which
*prediction* requires *simulation*” (Clark 2013:
134):
E4-emergent
macro-features would be those that can only be predicted by directly
modelling the micro-features, with no computational shortcut to
compress the information at micro-level. The first thing to notice,
according to Clark, is that this notion of emergence is at odds with
at least some of the previous ones:
E3-emergence
has it that

emergent phenomena are often

preciselythose phenomena in which complex interactions yield robust, salient patterns capable of supporting prediction. (ibid)

that is, patterns that deliver compressible information. Next, while the characterization of E4, Bedau-style emergence may work pretty well in the case of completely chaotic systems, it does not sit well with such CA as Rule \(\phi_{17083}\). According to the proposed definition, the answer to the classification problem given by Rule \(\phi_{17083}\) is an emergent phenomenon just in case the only way to go from \(t_0\) to \(t_n\) is by explicitly simulating the system evolution.

\(t_0\)

\(t_n\)

As it turns out, however, this is not the case. Using Crutchfield’s particle model it is possible to predict the result of the classification by simply making particle-calculations, without bothering about the underlying dynamics (Hordijk, Crutchfield, & Mitchell 1996). Here then, the emerging computation in the CA would not be a case of emergence for Bedau.

What about the ontological side of emergence? The issue of the reality
of emerging patterns in CA has been examined both by reductionist
(Dennett 2003) and by emergentist philosophers (Thompson 2007). It is
fair to say that the CA literature so far has not significantly
contributed to the ongoing philosophical debate on the purely
ontological side of reductionism. CA patterns that are
“objectively” detected via computation, as per the
Mitchell-Crutchfield approach, are not *ipso facto* new
primitives to be included in an ontology. It may well be that features
of a CA that are objective, in the sense of not depending on the
interaction with an observer, are nevertheless ontologically reducible
to more basic entities via suitable definitions (see Kim 1999; Dennett
1991).

### 3.2 CA and Free Will

Philosophers have debated the relationship between determinism and
free will for over two millennia. Two opposite stances can be taken
towards the problem: *compatibilism* maintains that free will
is compatible with a deterministic world, which
*incompatibilism* denies (see the entries on
free will
and
compatibilism).
Surprisingly enough, both Daniel Dennett and Stephen Wolfram argued
that adopting the CA perspective can provide a solution, or perhaps a
dissolution, of the longstanding mystery of free will.

A major obstacle to accepting compatibilism is our persuasion that
determinism implies inevitability (Dennett 2003: 25). We may thus make
compatibilism palatable by exhibiting an intuitive counterexample to
that conviction: a deterministic world in which, however, not
everything is inevitable, i.e., something is avoidable (Ibid: 56).
Dennett maintains that CA can do this. He takes *Life* as a
vivid illustration of how, in a deterministic but complex enough
world, we can abstract away from the bottom level and the micro-laws
deterministically governing it, and describe what is happening by
taking the emergent level seriously. Recall the eater-glider dynamics:

*An Eater devouring a Glider*

\(t_0\)

\(t_2\)

\(t_4\)

At \(t_0\), an observer aiming at predicting the evolution of this
space-time region has basically two choices: she can take into account
(what Dennett calls) the *physical level*, and compute pixel by
pixel the value of each cell state at each time step; or, she can
focus on the *design level*, and employ high-level concepts
such as those of *glider* and *eater* to ground her
predictions (Dennett 2003: 39). The first option is perfectly
deterministic, but has a flaw: it is time consuming, in such a way
that, by the time you have made the required computation, the world
has already evolved (this is especially true of a *universal*
CA—as we have already hinted at above, and shall expand on
soon). The second option is much faster: you know without much
calculation what is going to happen to a glider meeting an eater. The
predictions though, cannot be 100% reliable:

Whereas at the physical level, there are absolutely no exceptions to the general law, at the design level our generalizations have to be hedged: they require “usually” clauses (…). Stray bits of debris from earlier events can “break” or “kill” one of the objects in the ontology at this level. Their salience as real things is considerable, but not guaranteed. (Dennett 2003: 40)

Dennett’s point is that *avoidance* itself is a
high-level concept. As such, it is compatible with a deterministic
bottom level (because the concepts at the emergent level are, by
design, independent from the micro-laws). The *physical
description* and the *design description* of *Life*
are different interpretations of the same basic ontology, namely, the
sparse ontology of CA. While in theory we could avoid the introduction
of emergent concepts, in practice it is only by speaking of gliders,
movements and avoidance that we can make sense of the evolution of the
system (Dennett 2003: 43–44). Even without knowing
*Life*’s physics, we could do a good job if we predicted
the future by mentioning only high level patterns. *Life* is
just a toy universe but, Dennett claims, these new intuitions are
sufficient to see that, in some deterministic worlds, something is
avoidable. For instance, it is true at the design level that gliders
actually avoid eaters. Thus, the inference from determinism to
inevitability can be blocked.

A reply to Dennett’s argument consists in denying that
*Life*-avoidance is real avoidance. Dennett himself puts a
version of this argument in the mouth of Conrad, a fictional skeptic
philosopher discussing Dennett’s idea throughout his book:

It may look like avoidance, but it’s not real avoidance. Real avoidance involves changing something that was going to happen into something that doesn’t happen. (Dennett 2003: 58)

Rephrasing Dennett’s example, we can identify an ambiguity in
Conrad’s argument. Imagine that a baseball is *going to*
hit you in the face—but you dodge it: a clear case of
*real* human avoidance. In what sense was the baseball
“going to” hit you in the face? (Dennett 2003: 59) One
might say that it was *never* really going to hit you,
precisely because it triggered the reaction of whatever
“avoidance system” you have. What is the difference
between this avoidance and *Life*-avoidance? For Dennett, this
is not a difference in kind, but in complexity: gliders and humans
both have avoidance systems, but human systems are much more
sophisticated. The choice of a universal CA as a toy universe allows
us to draw a stronger conclusion: since we know that *Life* is
equivalent to a universal Turing machine, as explained above, some
patterns in that universe may display avoidance systems at least as
complex as ours. Dennett claims that compatibilism has thus won the
first round:

you agree that (…) I’ve shifted the burden of proof: there shall be no inferring inevitability in any sense from determinism without mounting a supporting argument. (Dennett 2003: 61)

Stephen Wolfram addresses the phenomenon of free will in his book on CA, with an ambitious tone:

From the discoveries in this book it finally now seems possible to give an explanation for this [free will]. And the key, I believe, is the phenomenon of computational irreducibility. (Wolfram 2002: 750)

We have introduced the issue of computational (or algorithmic) irreducibility when we explained the philosophical consequence of a universality proof for an automaton, namely that, although a system follows definite underlying laws, “its overall behavior can still have aspects that fundamentally cannot be described by reasonable laws” (Wolfram 2002: 750). This is again the issue of predictability via step by step micro-computations. In this “separation between the underlying rules for the system and its overall behavior” (Wolfram 2002: 751) lies the secret of free will, since it seems that we attribute free will to a system just when “we cannot readily make predictions about the behavior of the system” (Wolfram 2002: 751). According to Wolfram, CA play a leading role in providing a new framework to understand the phenomenon. While explanations from chaos theory and quantum randomness have recently been proposed (see the entry on chaos), “nothing like this is actually needed” (Wolfram 2002: 752). By observing CA, we can understand how something with simple and definite micro-rules, like those governing our neurons, can produce a behavior free of obvious rules:

the crucial point is that this happens just through the intrinsic evolution of the system—without the need for any additional input from outside or from any sort of explicit source of randomness. (Wolfram 2002: 752)

Wolfram’s point is similar to some of Dennett’s remarks, namely: taking some sort of “design stance”, Wolfram suggests that one can talk about a cellular automaton as if it just “decides” to do this or that—“thereby effectively attributing to it some sort of free will” (Wolfram 2002: 752). One easily sees the closeness to Dennett’s famous intentional stance (Dennett 1987; see the entry on intentionality, esp. Section 9).

How important are CA to these accounts? Dennett and Wolfram both use CA as intuition pumps. However, their positions seem to be slightly different. For while the former sees CA as a “useful toolkit” to develop intuitions and vividly illustrate his arguments (Dennett 2003: 40), the latter claims that CA provides a “new kind of intuition”, one that “no branch of everyday experience” could provide (Wolfram 2002: 41).

The importance Wolfram attaches to CA seems to rely on a single, generic “indispensability argument” to the conclusion that CA justify the foundation of “a new kind of science” (Wolfram 2002: 7–16). We can reconstruct this argument as follows:

- (NKS
_{1}) - The observation of CA evolution leads to a scientific discovery: “very simple rules produce highly complex behavior” (Wolfram 2002: 39).
- (NKS
_{2}) - This discovery—the “new intuition”—promises to explain old and new phenomena and uncover important regularities.
- (NKS
_{3}) - Therefore, the core of our current scientific practices (based on the “old intuition”) should be radically changed to accommodate this discovery.

(NKS_{1})
is to be taken at face value. It entails that the concepts involved
were not previously known. Wolfram talks in terms of “the single
most surprising scientific discovery I have ever made” (Wolfram
2002: 27). Is
(NKS_{1})
true? For sure, the idea that a deterministic and simple system may
produce unpredictable behavior started circulating in the scientific
community well before Wolfram’s work. Signs of what is now chaos
theory can be traced back to the 19th and early 20th century, e.g., to
the work of Poincaré 1914. One might grant that CA allowed the
discovery that *simple* systems may produce *complex*
behavior via the proof that they have unpredictable emergent
computational complexity (although this discovery itself, as outlined
in our brief historical section, was not made but only greatly
publicized by Wolfram). Why was this discovery not made earlier?
Wolfram’s own diagnosis is twofold: on the one hand, we have the
“engineering” intuition that to produce something complex
we should build something complex—that is because this is how
ordinary machines work. On the other, CA were not obviously connected
to any established discipline, and therefore they were not studied in
academic circles.

As for
(NKS_{2}),
we just examined the case of free will. In Wolfram’s
perspective, free will looks just like another puzzling philosophical
phenomenon explained away by the advance of (a new kind of) science.
Just as life was puzzling before the discovery of the double helix,
free will was puzzling before the discovery of a suitable scientific
theory, one that can finally account for the separation between micro
and macro level. Many reductionist philosophers are no strangers to
this kind of argument. The concepts and intuitions used in
contemporary philosophy are often rooted in current scientific
practices. When groundbreaking discoveries are made, old arguments may
be revised: troublesome concepts become harmless and new challenges
are introduced. From this perspective, Wolfram’s account of the
free will problem may lack philosophical rigor, but it is a promising
start to re-address the challenge armed with new scientific models of
determinism and complexity—pretty much as Dennett does. While
many successful applications are needed to fully vindicate
(NKS_{2}),
our first assessment concludes that, at the very least, it is not
obviously false. As for the “new regularities” promised by
(NKS_{2}),
we will address them in the next section.

### 3.3 CA and the Philosophy of Computation

CA are computational systems that perform complex tasks on the basis of the collective behavior of simple items. What, if anything, does it tell us about the importance of computation for systems in nature?

Different conclusions have been drawn by practitioners in the field. Some have endorsed the more modest claim that the computational features of CA are important to understand and compare social, biological, and physical systems modeled by them; but others have taken CA to support the view that computation and information processing in a discrete setting lie at the very foundations of reality. We will explore the stronger claim in Section 3.4 below. As for the weaker claim, it is not possible here to address the general importance of computational properties across the sciences (see Mitchell 2009: 169–185). We will focus instead on a specific, and controversial, principle put forward by Stephen Wolfram, the so-called “Principle of Computational Equivalence”:

There are various ways to state the Principle of Computational Equivalence, but probably the most general is just to say that almost all processes that are not obviously simple can be viewed as computations of equivalent sophistication. (Wolfram 2002: 716–717)

The Principle is the most fundamental law of Wolfram’s *New
Kind of Science*, as well as a prominent regularity featured by
(NKS_{2}):
“its implications are broad and deep, addressing a host of
longstanding issues not only in science, but also in mathematics,
philosophy and elsewhere” (Wolfram 2002: 715). Contrary to
Wolfram’s claims, the Principle may not be new to philosophy at
all. That “all processes can be viewed as computations”
(Wolfram 2002: 715) has often been argued for in the history of
philosophy, just as the claim that universal computation is a
widespread phenomenon in the natural world (see, e.g., Searle 1992;
Putnam 1988 and the entry on
computation in physical systems).
However, Wolfram’s explanation of the Principle includes two
further, and more specific, statements: *i*) No natural system
can compute more things than a universal digital computer (see Wolfram
2002: 730), that is, “universal computation is an upper limit on
the complexity of computation” (Mitchell 2009: 157); and
*ii*) The computations performed by natural systems are
essentially equivalent in sophistication (see Wolfram 2002:
719–726).

The first point is relevant once we compare digital computation with the idea of a computer working with real numbers in continuous time. It has been proved (see C. Moore 1996) that such a device would be able to compute more functions than a traditional Turing machine. However, proponents of a discrete space-time like Wolfram treat continuous processes as, in a sense, epiphenomenal, since they already have independent reasons (some of which will be addressed below) to believe in a fundamentally discrete universe. As for the second point, its main problem is that the interpretation of “equivalent sophistication” is not straightforward. For even assuming that universal computation is widespread, it does not seem to follow that all computation is equivalent in sophistication. Complexity scientists, even after having agreed with Wolfram on the importance of computation for social, biological and physical systems, and even on the extent to which universal computation is supported in nature, are puzzled by his claim:

I find it plausible that my brain can support universal computation (…) and that the brain of the worm

C. elegansis also (approximately) universal, but I don’t buy the idea that the actual computations we engage in, respectively, are equivalent in sophistication. (Mitchell 2009: 158)

It is not clear what to make of computational equivalence. Yes, there is a threshold in which systems are related to one another, but given the difficulty of moving among them, is this any more useful than saying that skateboards and Ferraris are equivalent means of moving about? (Miller & Page 2007: 232)

Miller and Page argue that, for all scientific purposes, “representations do matter, and what can be easily computed in one system is often difficult (but still possible) to compute in another”. Even if Wolfram is right when he claims that a simple automaton can calculate the first few prime numbers (Wolfram 2002: 640), the calculation we have to do to encode the input and decode the output is very complex:

This latter calculation could be much more “difficult” to compute than the original problem, just as the complexity of a compiler can far exceed the complexity of the programs it produces. (Miller & Page 2007: 232)

Taking these objections ever further, the crucial consideration is that any system with a large enough state space could be shown to be (in Wolfram sense) equivalent to “intelligent systems”. Far from supporting some form of universality, Aaronson argues that this type of “equivalence” stems from a misunderstanding of the role of computational reductions:

Suppose we want to claim, for example, that a computation that plays chess is “equivalent” to some other computation that simulates a waterfall. Then our claim is only non-vacuous if it’s possible to exhibit the equivalence (i.e., give the reductions) within a model of computation that isn’t itself powerful enough to solve the chess or waterfall problems. (2011: 285–286)

In other words, unless it can be proved that the encoding/decoding functions are not doing all the heavy lifting (and just use a secondary system, a waterfall or a CA, to vacuously transmit information), it is hard to consider the alleged “equivalence” meaningful at all: “we are merely trading an infeasible search among programs for an infeasible search among input encoding schemes” (Aaronson 2002: 413). Moreover, a rationale for studying CA (Ilachinski 2001: 8) is that their implementation can be massively optimized for specific problems with significant performance gain on standard computers (see for example Zaheer et al. 2016). Unless Wolfram’s notion of “equivalent sophistication” simply means “they compute the same functions”—in which case, the claim is a truism—, the Principle cannot explain this empirical difference. The Principle may have a more substantive reading if understood as a metaphysical thesis about the universe in general, not as a scientific generalization having merely heuristic value. Under this stronger reading, the Principle is no more concerned with particular systems that can be fruitfully analyzed via computation theory, but with the fact that (different epistemological properties notwithstanding) the world itself is a computer. In a sense, any system would just be the emergent manifestation of a unique, underlying computational reality. Which naturally leads us to finally address the boldest question: What if the universe itself was a CA?

### 3.4 CA as Models of Reality

When discussing CA as models of reality we need to carefully
distinguish the different meanings of *modelling*.
(CA_{1})
above
(section 1.2)
discussed CA as “models of computation”: CA model
parallel computations in the rather trivial sense that they
*perform* them; for that is what their cells do: they associate
inputs to outputs by implementing algorithmic functions, together with
their mates. In other words, they model computation as Turing machines
do (but, of course, with different underlying ideas).

(CA_{2})
introduced a different sense of *modelling* for CA, i.e., the
idea that CA are fruitfully used in current scientific practices to
study an incredible variety of phenomena: chemical systems (e.g.,
Kier, Seybold, & Cheng 2005), urban growth (e.g., Aburas et al.
2016), traffic flow (e.g., Lárragaa et al. 2005), even warfare
(e.g., Ilachinski 2004). According to the characterization of
Barberousse, Franceschelli, and Imbert 2007
(Other Internet Resources),
a common technique is the “phenomenological” modelling.
Phenomenological modelling happens when one models in a direct way,
that is, without making use of a previous explanatory theory: one
looks at how traffic flows and tries to build a CA that reproduces a
sufficiently similar behaviour and allows to make useful predictions.
The key question for modellers here is,

Are there well established correspondence rules that I can use to translate features of the system I want to model into specifications for an adequate cellular automaton model of it? (Toffoli & Margolus 1990: 244)

In this sense, CA modelling is a special case of “agent-based modelling” (Miller & Page 2007): the modeller starts with micro-rules to explore macro-behavior: e.g. in social sciences, see the classic Schelling 1978, in decision theory see Grim et al. 1997, in political theory Grim et al. 2005.

Starting from
(CA_{2}),
it is natural to ask whether it is possible to push the boundaries
even further, i.e., using CA to model more “fundamental”
parts of reality. For example Toffoli 1984 conjectures that CA may
allow us to *replace* physical modelling with differential
equations (and related notions of real variables, continuity, etc.).
Computations with differential equations, Toffoli claims, are:

at least three levels removed from the physical world that they try to represent. That is, first (a) we stylize physics into differential equations, then (b) we force these equations into the mold of discrete space and time and truncate the resulting power series, so as to arrive at finite difference equations, and finally, in order to commit the latter to algorithms, (c) we project real-valued variables onto finite computer words (“round-off”). At the end of the chain we find the computer – again a physical system; isn’t there a less roundabout way to make nature model itself? (Toffoli 1984: 121)

Such a less roundabout way can be provided, so the proposal goes, by
CA. We see here a path, from the view that CA are useful as a
phenomenological heuristic to predict the behaviour of some aspects of
reality, to the claim that CA modelling may, in a sense, be closer to
the underlying physics than any non-discrete alternative, as
anticipated in
(CA_{4})
above.

We are now ready to move to the final step, taking us into speculative
metaphysics of physics. In the last fifty years various scientists
(see Zuse 1982; Fredkin 1993; Wolfram 2002) have advanced a bold
conjecture: that the physical universe *is*, fundamentally, a
discrete computational structure. Everything in our
world—quarks, trees, human beings, remote galaxies—is just
a pattern in a CA, much like a glider in *Life*.

One may dispute the very meaningfulness of claims of this kind, concerning the world as a whole: something that, to speak Kantian, is never given to us in experience. Floridi 2009 has argued against such digital ontology, not by defending a continuous picture of reality, but by arguing that the world is not the right kind of thing to which such notions as discreteness and continuity can meaningfully apply. These concern rather, in Kantian fashion, our ways of modelling reality, or “modes of presentation of being”. If one, on the contrary, thinks that there must be a fact of the matter about the discrete vs. continuous nature of the world (as argued in Berto & Tagliabue 2014, on the basis of considerations from cardinality and general mereology [see entry on mereology]), then the next issue is: what does (the philosophy of) fundamental physics have to say about this? It is fair to claim that the issue is open. Scholars such as Nobel prize winner ’t Hooft (1997) seriously explore discretist views, and approaches based on so-called causal set theory (see Dowker 2003; Malament 2006) take the geometry of real-world spacetime as such that at the Planck length (\(10^{-33}\) cm) it is discrete. Cognate strategies take spacetime as made of polysimplexes, usually polydimensional counterparts of tetrahedra (see Ambjorn et al. 2004) ; adding the claim that such polysimplexes compute functions takes us already in the vicinity of CA. Other scholars, instead, are against the idea of a digital world. Deutsch (2005) and Hardy (2005) reject the view that quantum probabilities and quantum computing vindicate a discrete structure of space-time, and claim that quantum mechanics complies with the idea that the world is continuous even more than classical physics. While we are, thus, in the realm of speculation, we can nevertheless single out two main reasons to investigate the provocative claim that the world is a discrete CA. First, the arguments put forward to support the view may be philosophically interesting in themselves. Second, the ontological structure of a CA-world can be fruitfully compared to existing metaphysical accounts. Let us take each point in turn.

The picture of nature as a CA is supported by an epistemological
*desideratum*, i.e., having exact computational models of the
physical world (see for instance the discussion of *ontic
pancomputationalism* in the entry on
computation in physical systems).
While this is certainly one of the arguments involved, it is not the
only one and probably not the strongest. As Piccinini points out, even
someone who shares that desire “may well question why we should
expect nature to fulfill it” (Piccinini 2010: Section 3.4).

Ilachinski proposes a different “argument from
epistemology” (Ilachinski 2001: 661–2). Let us consider
again the space-time diagram of *Rule 110*:

Fig. 7

Let us imagine we ignore its being generated by the iteration of a simple local rule, or even that it is an automaton. Then, says Ilachinski:

Noticing that the figure consists of certain particle-like objects sprinkled on a more-or-less static background, the simplest (most natural?) thing for you to do (…) is to begin cataloging the various “particles” and their “interactions.” (…) What you almost assuredly will not have, is any idea that the underlying physics really consists of a single—very simple—local deterministic rule(…).

How different is this alien two-dimensional world from our own? (Ilachinski 2001: 662).

This highlights how CA may generate situations that we view as
physically realistic. But one may consider this as a mere suggestion:
that we cannot rule out *a priori* our universe’s being,
at its bottom level, a CA does not entail that it actually *is*
a CA.

A firmer ground to explore the hypothesis comes from some independent
reasons of theoretical dissatisfaction with contemporary physics. We
will limit ourselves to what we may call *conceptual*
complaints, as opposed to ones more closely related to scientific
practice, such as the failure of reductions of quantum mechanics and
relativity to a *Theory of Everything*. We will examine the
following three: (*i*) the problem of infinity, (*ii*)
the need for a transparent ontology, (*iii*) the physical role
of information.

As for complaint (*i*): while infinite and infinitesimal
quantities provide us with powerful tools to model and advance
predictions on the physical world, it remains controversial what
ontological conclusions should be drawn from this fact. Since the
discovery of
Zeno’s Paradox (see entry),
the continuity of space-time, as well as other fundamental physical
variables, have puzzled philosophers and scientists alike. In the
words of the physicist Richard Feynman:

It bothers me that, according to the laws as we understand them today, it takes a computing machine an infinite number of logical operations to figure out what goes on in no matter how tiny a region of space, and no matter how tiny a region of time. How can all that be going on in that tiny space? Why should it take an infinite amount of logic to figure out what a tiny piece of space-time is going to do? So I have often made the hypothesis that ultimately physics will not require a mathematical statement, that in the end the machinery will be revealed and the laws will turn out to be simple, like the checker board with all its apparent complexities. (Feynman 1965)

One way theoretical physicists have approached the problem is to conjecture a fundamental layer of reality along the lines of Edward Fredkin’s “Finite Nature Hypothesis”:

Finite Nature is a hypothesis that ultimately every quantity of physics, including space and time, will turn out to be discrete and finite; that the amount of information in any small volume of space-time will be finite and equal to one of a small number of possibilities. (…) We take the position that Finite Nature implies that the basic substrate of physics operates in a manner similar to the workings of certain specialized computers called cellular automata. (Fredkin 1993: 116)

If a cellular automaton is a model satisfying this hypothesis, then “underneath the laws of physics as we know them today it could be that there lies a simple program from which all the known laws (…) emerge” (Wolfram 2002: 434). If, as we have seen above, currently there is no agreement on the issue whether physical reality is fundamentally continuous or discrete, at least the Finite Nature Hypothesis seems to be a no less falsifiable prediction (see Fredkin 1990) than many speculative metaphysical pictures. Unfortunately, although we have attempts to recapture field theory within CA theory (see, e.g., Svozil 1987, Lee 1986), there is no agreed-upon derivation of today’s continuous physics within a CA framework; it is therefore safe to say that no party has a clear advantage here.

As for complaint (*ii*): one reason to adopt the view of CA as
models of a fundamentally discrete world is the desire for a
transparent ontology. Take a materialist philosopher for whom the task
of physics is to provide an ultimate description of reality on the
basis of a handful of basic physical properties and relations. As
argued in Beraldo-de-Araújo & Baravalle forthcoming, a
digital ontology may take different models of computation at its
foundation: by analyzing the ontological commitments of CA (vs.
traditional Turing machines), they conclude that CA are very close to
supporting a traditional form of physicalism. In this perspective, a
CA-based physics may provide a neat and elegant ontological picture:
one that would be describable in a first-order formal theory including
the axioms of standard
mereology (see entry)
(even of mereotopology, as presented, e.g., in Casati, Varzi 1999),
and whose theorems would be computable in finite time (see Berto,
Rossi, Tagliabue 2010: 73–87). Besides, CA make easier to
reconcile prima facie contradictory properties of different physical
laws, such as the *reversibility* of micro-laws and the
*irreversibility* of the Second Law of Thermodynamics (see for
example Wolfram 2002: 441–457; Berto, Rossi, Tagliabue 2010:
43–46). There is no agreement on whether the Second Law gives us
a fundamental feature of physical reality, or it is a spin-off of
underlying principles which are time-reversal invariant and act on an
initial state of the universe at low entropy (see Albert 2000). If the
world is discrete and temporal reversibility is fundamental,
reversible CA like, e.g., that of Berto, Rossi, Tagliabue (2016) may
be more than mere computational tools achieving some degree of
computational efficiency via their reversibility.

As for point (*iii*), concerning the physical role of
information: CA can accommodate a speculative hypothesis entertained
by a number of scientists (Wheeler 1990, Ilachinski 2001) and
philosophers (Chalmers 1996), namely that information is not just one
aspect of the physical world, but, in a sense, the most fundamental.
For instance, Fredkin’s Finite Nature Hypothesis not only
stresses the importance of the informational aspects of physics, but
“it insists that the informational aspects are all there is to
physics at the most microscopic level” (see Fredkin 1993).

One way in which this idea has been developed is the so-called
“*it from bit*” theory (see again Wheeler 1990). In
David Chalmers’ words, this approach “stems from the
observation that in physical theories, fundamental physical states are
individuated as *informational states*” (Chalmers 1996:
302). Physics is silent on what accomplishes the specified functional
roles, so “any realization of these information states will
serve as well for the purpose of a physical theory” (Chalmers
1996: 302). The “it from bit” approach is particularly
appealing to Chalmers as a philosopher of mind committed to
*qualia* being intrinsic, non-reducible properties, because it
allows for a simple unification: we need intrinsic properties to make
sense of conscious experience, and we need intrinsic properties to
ground the informational states that make up the world’s
physics. If we claim that all the informational states are grounded in
phenomenal or proto-phenomenal properties, we “get away with a
cheap and elegant ontology, and solve two problems in a single
blow” (Chalmers 1996: 305). The cell states in a CA fit the
bill: if we interpret them as proto-phenomenal properties, we obtain
the intrinsic structure of some sort of computational neutral monism
(for an historical introduction, see the entry on
neutral monism).

Albeit individually controversial, taken together the three points support a simple and elegant metaphysical picture which is not evidently false or incoherent.

Supposing that the actual physical world is a giant, discrete
automaton, are there philosophically interesting conclusions to be
drawn? A first one has already been partially explored in connection
with *Life*: if nature is a CA, it has to be a
*universal* CA, given that universal computers (e.g., the one
on which you are probably reading this entry) uncontroversially exist
in the physical world. Then its evolution is algorithmically
irreducible, given the Halting Problem. Notwithstanding the
opportunity of devising approximate forecast tools, we are left with a
universe whose evolution is unpredictable for a reason quite different
from the ones commonly adduced by resorting to standard physics, such
as quantum effects or random fluctuations: it is unpredictable just
because of its computational complexity.

A second philosophical topic is the connection between a CA-world and
one of the most famous and controversial contemporary metaphysical
theses, namely David Lewis’ *Humean Supervenience* (HS).
Using Ned Hall’s characterization (see section on
Humean supervenience in the entry on David Lewis’s metaphysics),
we can state HS as the collection of these four claims about the
structure of our world:

- (HS
_{1}) - There are particulars (space-time points).
- (HS
_{2}) - They are, or are wholly composed of, simples—particulars that have no other particulars as parts.
- (HS
_{3}) - These simples have various perfectly natural monadic properties.
- (HS
_{4}) - They stand in various spatiotemporal relations to one another.

If we substitute “space-time points” with
“cells”, HS gets very close to a CA ontology: cells are
arranged in a lattice, have various spatiotemporal relations to one
another (e.g., *being a neighborhood of*), and have monadic
properties (states) which can be considered *perfectly
natural*, i.e., the basic properties out of which any other can be
construed. A CA universe is thus a *prima facie* abstract model
of Lewis’ HS and can be fruitfully used to illustrate
Lewis’ original point, which was a reductionist one:

The point of defending Humean Supervenience is not to support reactionary physics, but rather to resist philosophical arguments that there are more things in heaven and earth than physics has dreamt of. (Lewis 1994: 474).

There are, however, two differences between the ontology naturally
suggested by CA theories and Lewis’ view. First, for Lewis
space-time is an essentially continuous, four-dimensional manifold,
eternalistically conceived (see the section on eternalism in the entry
on
time
and the discussion on four-dimensionalism in the entry on
temporal parts
for an introduction), while in a standard CA-driven ontology, it is
not. Second, Lewis reduces laws of nature to particulars while, as we
have seen in Section 2 above, CA rules are always included as a
*further* specification of the model.

The first disagreement may not be very substantial. A CA-world is compatible, for instance, with an eternalist conception. The idea that the world’s next state is computed at any time step can be seen as a merely heuristic device, a “shortcut” for a more proper eternalist description in which the cell’s states are once and for all “stuck” in their space-time position (we did this ourselves when describing the first picture in this section as the complete space-time evolution of a micro-universe).

The second disagreement concerning the laws of nature may instead be a
thorny issue. According to Lewis 1973, laws of nature are the true
generalizations found in the deductive system that best describes our
world (where “best” basically refers to the optimal
trade-off between strength and simplicity; see the entry on
laws of nature
for an introduction to, and further details on, this debate): laws of
nature supervene on the four-dimensional arrangement of particulars
and their properties. To the contrary, the standard description of a
CA does not take the space-time evolution for granted: it takes the
automaton’s initial conditions as given, and generates the
system evolution over time via the CA transition function. Particulars
depend on laws, not *vice versa*. A CA world is not laid out in
advance, but it grows as long as the laws are applied to particulars
(a similar point is also made in Wolfram 2002: 484–486).

On the other hand, one may tentatively interpret, in Lewisian fashion,
the laws of a CA as the generalizations contained within the deductive
system that best describes the CA behavior. Let us consider one last
time our micro-universe from *Rule 110*:

Fig. 7

A suitable deductive system for this space-time diagram may be
obtained with just two axioms, one stating the initial conditions of
the system, the other phrased as a conditional expressing the CA
transition rule. If this conditional is a true generalization embedded
in the deductive system that best describes our toy universe, then
*Rule 110* can count as a Lewisian law of nature in this
universe, as expected.

## 4. Concluding Remarks

Although some CA topics are still relatively untouched by philosophers (e.g., the nature of space and time (see Wolfram 2002: 481–496), the representation of knowledge in Artificial Intelligence (see Berto, Rossi, Tagliabue: 15–26), the relationship between information and energy (see Fredkin & Toffoli 1982)), there are many conceptual challenges raised in connection with CA. While in some cases the CA contribution was indeed overrated by practitioners, in others CA proved to be useful models of important phenomena.

As a final comment: what is left, from a purely scientific
perspective, of the *NKS Argument*? Let us go through it
again:

- (NKS
_{1}) - The observation of CA evolution leads to a scientific discovery: “very simple rules produce highly complex behavior” (Wolfram 2002: 39).
- (NKS
_{2}) - This discovery—the “new intuition”—promises to explain old and new phenomena and uncover important regularities.
- (NKS
_{3}) - Therefore, the core of our current scientific practices (based on the “old intuition”) should be radically changed to accommodate this discovery.

Even granting the truth of the two premises (that is, even granting
the troublesome Principle of Computational Equivalence), it is
doubtful the desired conclusion would follow. Surely, CA have provided
new intuitions and explanations for a set of phenomena—Wolfram
quite successfully applies his “discovery” to biology,
computer science, physics, finance. However, there is no evidence that
many of our best scientific explanations will soon be reduced to the
CA framework, and indeed many aspects of complexity itself still lie
outside the CA paradigm, with no unification in sight. Paradigm shifts
usually require the new paradigm to explain the same phenomena the old
one did, and some more. CA are a promising field, but many
developments are still needed for
(NKS_{3})
to be true.

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## Academic Tools

How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up topics and thinkers related to this entry at the Internet Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.

## Other Internet Resources

- Barberousse, A., Franceschelli, S., Imbert, C., 2007, “Cellular Automata, Modeling, and Computation,” manuscript available at the University of Pittsburgh Philosophy of Science Archive.
- Ray, Annie, Raymond Laflamme, and Aleksander Kubica, 2023, “Protecting information via probabilistic cellular automata”, manuscript at arXiv.org (2304.03240).
- Cellular Automata, MathWorld.
- Game of Life, MathWorld.
- Cellular Automata, Wikipedia.
*Rule 110*, WolframAlpha.- Game of Life, Wikipedia.
- NetLogo,
an easy-to-use Java-based platform, already containing examples of CA
(the pictures in this entry were generated using
*NetLogo*; code available under request) - MMoR, contains a tutorial, simulations of a 2D/3D universal reversible automaton and further references.
- Santa Fe Institute,
founded in 1984, the first research center on
*complex systems*; it has been playing since then a prominent role in shaping the field. - Turing machine in
*Life*, Paul Rendell’s web page.

### Acknowledgments

The authors would like to thank three anonymous referees, Scott Aaronson, Anouk Barberousse, Matteo Colombo, Michele Di Francesco, Cyrille Imbert, Giulia Livio, Massimo Mastrangeli, Mattia Pavoni, Andrea Polonioli, Gabriele Rossi, Marta Rossi, Katherine Yoshida for helpful comments, discussions, suggestions, and references, and Dr. Robert Plant for checking our English.