Philosophy and Christian Theology
Many of the doctrines central to Christianity have important philosophical implications or presuppositions. In this article, we begin with a brief general discussion of the relationship between philosophy and Christian dogma, and then we turn our attention to three of the most philosophically challenging Christian doctrines: the trinity, the incarnation, and the atonement. We take these three as our focus because, unlike (for example) doctrines about providence or the attributes of God, these are distinctive to Christian theology and, unlike (for example) the doctrine of original sin or the Real Presence of Christ in the eucharist, these have been the subject of a great deal of discussion over the past couple of decades.
- 1. Philosophy and Christian Theology
- 2. Trinity
- 3. Incarnation
- 4. Atonement
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In the history of Christian theology, philosophy has sometimes been seen as a natural complement to theological reflection, whereas at other times practitioners of the two disciplines have regarded each other as mortal enemies. Some early Christian thinkers such as Tertullian were of the view that any intrusion of secular philosophical reason into theological reflection was out of order. Thus, even if certain theological claims seemed to fly in the face of the standards of reasoning defended by philosophers, the religious believer should not flinch. Other early Christian thinkers, such as St. Augustine of Hippo, argued that philosophical reflection complemented theology, but only when these philosophical reflections were firmly grounded in a prior intellectual commitment to the underlying truth of the Christian faith. Thus, the legitimacy of philosophy was derived from the legitimacy of the underlying faith commitments.
Into the High Middle Ages, Augustine's views were widely defended. It was during this time however that St. Thomas Aquinas offered yet another model for the relationship between philosophy and theology. According to the Thomistic model, philosophy and theology are distinct enterprises, differing primarily in their intellectual starting points. Philosophy takes as its data the deliverances of our natural mental faculties: what we see, hear, taste, touch, and smell. These data can be accepted on the basis of the reliability of our natural faculties with respect to the natural world. Theology, on the other hand takes as its starting point the divine revelations contained in the Bible. These data can be accepted on the basis of divine authority, in a way analogous to the way in which we accept, for example, the claims made by a physics professor about the basic facts of physics.
On this way of seeing the two disciplines, if at least one of the premises of an argument is derived from revelation, the argument falls in the domain of theology; otherwise it falls into philosophy's domain. Since this way of thinking about philosophy and theology sharply demarcates the disciplines, it is possible in principle that the conclusions reached by one might be contradicted by the other. According to advocates of this model, however, any such conflict must be merely apparent. Since God both created the world which is accessible to philosophy and revealed the texts accessible to theologians, the claims yielded by one cannot conflict with the claims yielded by another unless the philosopher or theologian has made some prior error.
Since the deliverances of the two disciplines must then coincide, philosophy can be put to the service of theology (and perhaps vice-versa). How might philosophy play this complementary role? First, philosophical reasoning might persuade some who do not accept the authority of purported divine revelation of the claims contained in religious texts. Thus, an atheist who is unwilling to accept the authority of religious texts might come to believe that God exists on the basis of purely philosophical arguments. Second, distinctively philosophical techniques might be brought to bear in helping the theologian clear up imprecise or ambiguous theological claims. Thus, for example, theology might provide us with information sufficient to conclude that Jesus Christ was a single person with two natures, one human and one divine, but leave us in the dark about exactly how this relationship between divine and human natures is to be understood. The philosopher can provide some assistance here, since, among other things, he or she can help the theologian discern which models are logically inconsistent and thus not viable candidates for understanding the relationship between the divine and human natures in Christ.
For most of the twentieth century, the vast majority of English language philosophy—including philosophy of religion—went on without much interaction with theology at all. While there are a number of complex reasons for this divorce, three are especially important.
The first reason is that atheism was the predominant opinion among English language philosophers throughout much of that century. A second, quite related reason is that philosophers in the twentieth century regarded theological language as either meaningless, or, at best, subject to scrutiny only insofar as that language had a bearing on religious practice. The former belief (i.e., that theological language was meaningless) was inspired by a tenet of logical positivism, according to which any statement that lacks empirical content is meaningless. Since much theological language, for example, language describing the doctrine of the Trinity, lacks empirical content, such language must be meaningless. The latter belief, inspired by Wittgenstein, holds that language itself only has meaning in specific practical contexts, and thus that religious language was not aiming to express truths about the world which could be subjected to objective philosophical scrutiny.
A third reason is that a great many academic theologians also became skeptical of our ability to think and speak meaningfully about God; but, rather than simply abandon traditional doctrines of Christianity, many of them turned away from more “metaphysical” and quasi-scientific ways of doing theology, embracing instead a variety of alternative construals and developments of these doctrines—including, but not limited to, metaphorical, existentialist, and postmodern construals. This, we might add, seems to be one reason why the methodological rift between so-called “analytic” and “non-analytic” philosophers has to some extent been replicated as a rift between analytic philosophers of religion and their counterparts in theology.
In the last forty years, however, philosophers of religion have returned to the business of theorizing about many of the traditional doctrines of Christianity and have begun to apply the tools of contemporary philosophy in ways that are somewhat more eclectic than what was envisioned under the Augustinian or Thomistic models. In keeping with the recent academic trend, contemporary philosophers of religion have been unwilling to maintain hard and fast distinctions between the two disciplines. As a result, it is often difficult in reading recent work to distinguish what the philosophers are doing from what the theologians (and philosophers) of past centuries regarded as strictly within the theological domain. Indeed, philosophers and theologians alike are now coming to use the term “analytic theology” to refer to theological work that aims to explore and unpack theological doctrines in a way that draws on the resources, methods, and relevant literature of contemporary analytic philosophy. The use of this term reflects the heretofore largely unacknowledged reality that the sort of work now being done under the label “philosophical theology” is as much theology as it is philosophical.
In what follows, we provide a brief survey of work on the three topics in contemporary philosophical theology that—aside from general issues concerning the nature, attributes, and providence of God—have received the most attention from philosophers of religion over the past quarter century. We thus leave aside such staple topics in philosophy of religion as traditional arguments for the existence of God, the problem of evil, the epistemology of religious belief, the nature and function of religious language. We also leave aside a variety of important but less-discussed topics in philosophical theology, such as the nature of divine revelation and scripture, original sin, the authority of tradition, and the like. (For discussions of work falling under some of these topics, see the Related Entries section below, as well as the works under the “General” heading in the bibliography.)
From the beginning, Christians have affirmed the claim that there is one God, and three persons—Father, Son, and Holy Spirit—each of whom is God. In 675 C.E., the Council of Toledo framed this doctrine as follows:
Although we profess three persons we do not profess three substances but one substance and three persons … If we are asked about the individual Person, we must answer that he is God. Therefore, we may say God the Father, God the Son, and God the Holy Spirit; but they are not three Gods, he is one God … Each single Person is wholly God in himself and … all three persons together are one God.
Cornelius Plantinga, Jr., reflecting on the Council of Toledo's formulation, remarks that it “possesses great puzzling power” (Plantinga 1989, 22). No doubt this is an understatement. The doctrine of the trinity is deeply puzzling, and it is so in a way that has led some of Christianity's critics to claim that it is outright incoherent. Indeed, it looks like we can derive a contradiction from the doctrine, as follows: The doctrine states that there is exactly one God; that the Father is God, the Son is God, and the Spirit is God; and that Father, Son, and Spirit are distinct. Now, ‘is God’ either means ‘is identical God’ or ‘is divine’. Either way, however, we have a problem. If the Father is identical to God and the Son is identical to God, then (by the transitivity of identity) the Father is identical to the Son, contrary to the doctrine. On the other hand, if the Father is divine and the Son is divine and the Father is distinct from the Son, then there are at least two divine persons—i.e., two Gods—also contrary to the doctrine. Either way, then, the doctrine seems incoherent.
This puzzle is sometimes called “the threeness-oneness problem”, or “the logical problem of the trinity”. At first blush, it might seem rather easy to solve. Why not say, for example, that God is the Father, Son, and Holy Spirit in much the same way that Clark Kent is the mild-mannered friend of Lois Lane, the biological son of Jor-El the Kryptonian, and the Man of Steel? Or why not say that Father, Son, and Spirit count as one God in just the way that the various items in your shopping cart might count as “one order”? The answer, in short, is that the Christian tradition has set boundaries on how the doctrine is to be explicated, and these sorts of models fall afoul of those boundaries. Two of the most salient “errors” to be avoided are modalism and tritheism. In the words of the so-called Athanasian Creed, the doctrine of the trinity is to be understood without either “confounding the persons” or “dividing the substance”. Modalism confounds the persons. It is the view that Father, Son, and Holy Spirit are mere manifestations, modes, or roles played by the one and only God. Ruling out modalism thus rules out analogies like the Superman analogy just given. Tritheism divides the substance. It is a bit tricky (because controversial) to say exactly what tritheism, or polytheism more generally, is. (For discussion, see Rea 2006.) But whatever else it might be, it is certainly implied by the view that there are three distinct divine substances. Assuming the items in your shopping cart count as multiple distinct substances, then, the problem with the shopping cart analogy is that it suggests polytheism.
In what follows, we will consider several more sophisticated models of the trinity: the social model, the psychological model, and the constitution model. These do not exhaust the field of possible solutions, but they are the ones to which the most attention has been paid in the recent literature. (For more detailed surveys, see Rea (2009) and, at book length, McCall (2011).)
Throughout the gospels, the first two persons of the trinity are referred to as ‘Father’ and ‘Son’. This suggests the analogy of a family, or, more generally, a society. Thus, the persons of the trinity might be thought of as one in just the way that the members of a family are one: they are three individual human beings, but taken together they are a single family. Since there is no contradiction in thinking of a family as three and one in this way, this analogy appears to solve the problem. Those who attempt to understand the trinity primarily in terms of this analogy are typically called social trinitarians. This approach has been (controversially) associated with the Eastern Church, tracing its roots to the Cappadocian Fathers—Basil of Caesarea, his brother Gregory of Nyssa, and their friend Gregory Nazianzen. (Until recently, it was fairly common to distinguish “Latin” or “Western” models of the Trinity from “Greek” or “Eastern” models. Against this practice, see especially Ayres 2004 and Barnes 1995b.)
Critics point out that if ‘familial unity’ is all there is to trinitarian oneness, and so all that is required for monotheism, then it is hard to see why various polytheistic systems fail to count as versions of monotheism. Consider, for example, the children of Chronos in Greek mythology, of whom Zeus was the liberator. These children included Zeus, Hera, Ares, and a variety of other Olympian deities—all members of a divine family. Nobody, however, thinks that the fact that Zeus and his siblings (nor even, say, Zeus and his begotten daughter Athena) count in any meaningful sense as one god.
For this reason, social trinitarians are often quick to note that there are other relations that hold between members of the trinity that contribute, along with their being members of a single divine family, to their counting as one God. Richard Swinburne, for example, has defended a version of this view according to which the unity among the divine persons is secured by several facts in conjunction with one another. First, the divine persons share all of the essential characteristics of divinity: omniscience, omnipotence, moral perfection, and so forth. Second, unlike the deities of familiar polytheistic systems, their wills are necessarily harmonious, so that they can never come into conflict with one another. Third, they stand in a relationship of perfect love and necessary mutual interdependence. On this sort of view, there is one God because the community of divine persons is so closely interconnected that, although they are three distinct persons, they nonetheless function as if they were a single entity. One might think that if we were to consider a group of three human persons who exhibited these characteristics of necessary unity, volitional harmony, and love, it would likewise be hard to regard them as entirely distinct. And that is, of course, just the intuition that the view aims to elicit.
Still, many regard the sort of unity just described as not strong enough to secure a respectable monotheism. Thus, some social trinitarians have attempted to give other accounts of what unifies the divine persons. Perhaps the most popular such account is the part–whole model. C.S. Lewis's version of this analogy (Lewis 1958, Bk IV, Ch 2) has it that God is “three Persons while remaining one Being, just as a cube is six squares while remaining one cube”. More recently, J. P. Moreland and William Lane Craig (2003) have argued that the relation between the persons of the Trinity can be thought of as analogous to the relation we might suppose to obtain between the three dog-like beings that compose Cerberus, the mythical guardian of the underworld. One might say that each of the three heads—or each of the three souls associated with the heads—is a fully canine individual, and yet there is only one being, Cerberus, with the full canine nature. Three “persons” of a sort, and yet just one dog.
The Moreland & Craig proposal is clearly quite different from Swinburne's and, as should be obvious, it in no way invokes the analogy of a family or a society. At this point, therefore, it is natural to wonder what exactly it is that makes both proposals count as versions of social trinitarianism. Unfortunately, this is a question to which self-proclaimed social trinitarians have not given a very clear answer. Perhaps the most common answer is that part–whole models like Moreland & Craig's resemble society and family models simply by virtue of “starting with the threeness in the Trinity and trying to explain the oneness”. However, this answer is less than fully illuminating. What is needed is some characterization of the common core underlying the diverse views that are generally regarded as versions of social trinitarianism. The following two theses seem to capture that core: (i) the divine persons are not numerically the same substance, and (ii) monotheism does not require that there be exactly one divine substance—rather, it can be secured by the obtaining of relations like the part—whole relation, or necessary mutual interdependence, or some other sort of relation among numerically distinct divine substances. Together, these two theses seem to express the central idea underlying both the family analogy and the models developed by Swinburne and Moreland & Craig. As explained earlier, this core idea provides a solution to the problem of the trinity by showing how one might deny the inference from ‘the Father is divine, the Son is divine, and the Spirit is divine; and Father, Son, and Spirit are distinct from one another’ to the conclusion that there is more than one God.
Still, despite its attractions, many critics remain unsatisfied by the Moreland & Craig proposal. One of the more serious problems is that it is inconsistent with the Nicene Creed. The creed opens with “I believe in God, the Father Almighty”; but proponents of the Moreland & Craig model cannot say this because, on their view, God (analogous to Cerberus) is not the Father Almighty (analogous to one of the heads, or the soul of one of the heads). Likewise, the Creed says that Father and Son are consubstantial. This claim is absolutely central to the doctrine of the trinity, and the notion of consubstantiality lay at the very heart of the debates in the 4th Century C.E. that shaped the Nicene Creed's expression of the doctrine. But the three souls, or centers of consciousness, of the heads of Cerberus are not in any sense consubstantial. If they are substances at all (which Moreland & Craig take them to be), they are three distinct substances.
Other versions of the part–whole model raise further worries. A cube, for example, is a seventh thing in addition to its six sides; but we do not want to say that God is a fourth thing in addition to its three parts. The reason is that saying this forces a dilemma: Either God is a person, or God is not. If the former, then we have a quaternity rather than a trinity. If the latter, then we seem to commit ourselves to claims that are decidedly anti-theistic: God doesn't know anything (since only persons can be knowers); God doesn't love anybody (since only persons can love); God is amoral (since only persons are part of the moral community); and so on. Bad news either way, then. Thus, many are motivated to seek other models.
Many theologians have looked to features of the human mind or “psyche” to find models to help illuminate the doctrine of the trinity. Historically, the use of psychological analogies is especially associated with thinkers in the Latin-speaking West, particularly from Augustine onward. Augustine himself suggested several important analogies, as did others in the medieval Latin tradition. However, since our focus in this article is on more contemporary models, we will pass over these here and focus instead on two more recently developed psychological analogies.
Thomas V. Morris has suggested that we can find an analogy for the trinity in the psychological condition known as multiple personality disorder: just as a single human being can have multiple personalities, so too a single God can exist in three persons (though, of course, in the case of God this is a cognitive virtue, not a defect) (Morris 1986). Others—Trenton Merricks for example—have suggested that we can conceive of the divine persons on analogy with the separate spheres of consciousness that result from commissurotomy(Merricks 2006). Commissurotomy is a procedure, sometimes used to treat epilepsy, that involves cutting the bundle of nerves (the corpus callosum) by which the two hemispheres of the brain communicate. Those who have undergone this procedure typically function normally in daily life; but, under certain kinds of experimental conditions, they display psychological characteristics that suggest that there are two distinct spheres of consciousness associated with the two hemispheres of their brain. Thus, according to this analogy, just as a single human can, in that way, have two distinct spheres of consciousness, so too a single divine being can exist in three persons, each of which is a distinct sphere of consciousness.
As with social trinitarianism, each of these analogies solves the problem of the trinity by offering a way of denying the inference from ‘the Father is divine, the Son is divine, and the Spirit is divine; and Father, Son, and Spirit are distinct from one another’ to the conclusion that there is more than one God. Moreover, both analogies seem to have this advantage over social trinitarianism: both seem to present real-life cases in which a single rational substance is nonetheless “divided” into multiple personalities or centers of consciousness. Precisely this feature of the analogies, however, also raises the spectre of modalism. In the case of multiple personality disorder, there is no real temptation to reify the distinct personalities, to treat them as distinct person-like beings subsisting in or as a single substance. They are, rather, quite straightforwardly understandable as distinct aspects of a single, albeit fragmented, psychological subject. Similarly in the case of the commissurotomy analogy. It is highly unnatural to treat the distinct centers of consciousness as distinct persons; rather, it is most plausible to treat them as mere aspects of a single subject. Note, too, that it is hard to see how the personalities and centers of consciousness that figure into these analogies could be viewed as the same substance as one another, as the doctrine of the trinity requires us to say of the divine persons. Again, it is natural to see them merely as distinct aspects of a single substance. This, then, seems to be the primary objection that proponents of these sorts of analogies need to overcome.
The third and final solution to the problem of the trinity that we want to explore invokes the notion of “relative sameness.” This is the idea that things can be the same relative to one kind of thing, but distinct relative to another. More formally:
Relative Sameness: It is possible that there are x, y, F, and G such that x is an F, y is an F, x is a G, y is a G, x is the same F as y, but x is not the same G as y.
If this claim is true, then it is open to us to say that the Father, Son, and Holy Spirit are the same God but distinct persons. Notice, however, that this is all we need to make sense of the trinity. If the Father, Son, and Holy Spirit are the same God (and there are no other Gods), then there will be exactly one God; but if they are also distinct persons (and there are only three of them), then there will be three persons.
The main challenge for this solution is to show that the Relative Sameness assumption is coherent, and to show that the doctrine of the trinity can be stated in a way that is demonstrably consistent given the assumption of relative identity. Peter van Inwagen's work on the trinity (1988, 2003) has been mostly concerned with addressing this challenge. An additional, related challenge, however, is to provide some further explanation or analogy that can help us to see what it might mean to say that Father, Son, and Holy Spirit stand in the relation of ‘relative sameness’. Initially, it is not at all clear what this might mean, for it seems that the statement ‘x is the same F as y’ means nothing more or less than ‘x is an F, y is an F and x=y’, contrary to the assumption of Relative Sameness (above). This challenge has been undertaken by Michael Rea and Jeffrey Brower (2005a, b; Brower 2004; Rea 2009c). Their suggestion is that reflection on cases of material constitution (e.g., statues and the lumps of matter that constitute them) can help us to see how two things can be the same material object but otherwise different entities. If this is right, then, by analogy, such reflection can also help us to see how Father, Son, and Holy Spirit can be the same God but three different persons.
Consider Rodin's famous bronze statue, The Thinker. It is a single material object; but it can be truly described both as a statue (which is one kind of thing), and as a lump of bronze (which is another kind of thing). A little reflection, moreover, reveals that the statue is distinct from the lump of bronze. For example, if the statue were melted down, we would no longer have both a lump and a statue: the lump would remain (albeit in a different shape) but Rodin's Thinker would no longer exist. This seems to show that the lump is something distinct from the statue, since one thing can exist apart from another only if they're distinct. If this is right, then this is not a case in which one thing simply appears in two different ways, or is referred to by two different labels. It is, rather, a case in which two distinct things occupy exactly the same region of space at the same time.
Most of us readily accept the idea that distinct things, broadly construed, can occupy the same place at the same time. The event of your sitting, for example, occupies exactly the same place that you do when you are seated. But we are more reluctant to say that distinct material objects occupy the same place at the same time. Philosophers have therefore suggested various ways of making sense of the phenomenon of material constitution. One way of doing so is to say that the statue and the lump are the same material object even though they are distinct relative to some other kind (e.g., hylomorphic compound). The advantage of this idea is that it allows us to say that the statue and the lump count as one material object, thus preserving the principle of one material object to a place. The cost, however, is that we commit ourselves to the initially puzzling idea that two distinct things can be the same material object. What, we might wonder, would it even mean for this to be true? But suppose we add that all it means for one thing and another to be “the same material object” is just for them to share all of their matter in common. It is hard to see why such a claim should be objectionable; and if it is right, then our problem is solved. The lump of bronze in our example is clearly distinct from The Thinker, since it can exist without The Thinker; but it also clearly shares all the same matter in common with The Thinker, and hence, on this view, counts as the same material object.
Likewise, then, we might say that all it means for one person and another to be the same God is for them to do something analogous to sharing in common all of whatever is analogous to matter in divine beings. On this view, the Father, Son, and Holy Spirit are the same God but different persons in just the way a statue and its constitutive lump are the same material object but different form-matter compounds. Of course, God is not material; so this can only be an analogy. But still, it helps to provide an illuminating account of inter-trinitarian relations, and it does so in a way that seems (at least initially) to avoid both modalism and polytheism. Brower and Rea maintain that each person of the trinity is a substance; thus, none is a mere aspect of a substance, and so modalism is avoided. And yet they are the same substance; and so polytheism is avoided.
This account is not entirely free of difficulties however. It is tempting to see the view as simply playing a verbal trick: Brower and Rea say that Father, Son, and Holy Spirit are to be counted as one God; but since the divine Persons are fully distinct from one another, it is natural to take the admonition to ‘count them as one’ as nothing more than the proposal of a mere linguistic convention. Critics also object that this view does not directly answer the question of how many material objects are present for any given region, lump, or chunk. Is there an objective way of deciding how many objects are constituted by the lump of bronze that composes The Thinker? Are there only two things (statue and lump) or are there many more (paperweight, battering ram, etc.)? And if there are more, what determines how many there are? Unless we can answer this question it is hard to know why the “divine matter” constitutes exactly three persons (and not more).
The doctrine of the Incarnation holds that, at a time roughly two thousand years in the past, the second person of the trinity took on himself a distinct, fully human nature. As a result, he was a single person in full possession of two distinct natures, one human and one divine. The Council of Chalcedon (451 C.E.) articulates the doctrine as follows:
We confess one and the same our Lord Jesus Christ… the same perfect in Godhead, the same in perfect manhood, truly God and truly man … acknowledged in two natures without confusion, without change, without division, without separation—the difference of natures being by no means taken away because of the union, but rather the distinctive character of each nature being preserved, and combining into one person and hypostasis—not divided or separated into two persons, but one and the same Son and only begotten God, Word, Lord Jesus Christ.
Critics have held this doctrine to be “impossible, self-contradictory, incoherent, absurd, and even unintelligible.” (Morris 1986: 18) The central difficulty for the doctrine is that it seems to attribute to one person characteristics that are not logically compatible. For example, it seems on the one hand that human beings are necessarily created beings, and that they are necessarily limited in power, presence, knowledge, and so on. On the other hand, divine beings are essentially the opposite of all those things. Thus, it appears that one person could bear both natures, human and divine, only if such a person could be both limited and unlimited in various ways, created and uncreated, and so forth. And this is surely impossible.
Two main strategies have been pursued in an attempt to resolve this apparent paradox. The first is the kenotic view. The second is the two-minds view. We shall take each in turn.
The kenotic view (from the Greek kenosis meaning ’to empty’) finds its motivation in a New Testament passage which claims that Christ Jesus
“…though he was in the form of God, did not regard equality with God as something to be exploited, but emptied himself, taking the form of a slave, being born in human likeness. And being found in human form, he humbled himself and became obedient to the point of death…”. (Phillipians 2:6–8, NRSV).
According to this view, in becoming incarnate, God the Son voluntarily and temporarily laid aside some of his divine attributes in order to take on a human nature and thus his earthly mission.
If the kenotic view is correct, then (contrary to what theists are normally inclined to think) properties like omnipotence, omniscience, and omnipresence are not essential to divinity: something can remain divine even after putting some or all of those properties aside. The problem, however, is that if these properties aren't essential to divinity, then it is hard to see what would be essential. The so-called ‘omni-properties’ seem to be constitutive of divinity; they are the properties in terms of which divinity is defined. If we say that something can be divine while lacking those properties, then we lose all grip on what it means to be divine.
One might respond to this worry by saying that the only property that is essential to divine beings as such is the property being divine. This reply, however, makes divinity out to be a primitive, unanalyzable property. Critics like John Hick (1993: 73) complain that such a move makes divinity out to be unacceptably mysterious. Alternatively, one might simply deny that any properties are necessary for divinity. It is widely held in the philosophy of biology, for example, that there are no properties possession of which are jointly necessary andsufficient for membership in, say, the kind humanity. Moreover, it is very hard to find any interesting properties—apart from properties like ‘having mass’ or ‘being an organism'—that are even merely necessary for being human. That is, it seems that for any (interesting) property you might think of as partly definitive of humanity, there are or could be humans who lack that property. Thus, many philosophers think that membership in the kind is determined simply by family resemblance to paradigm examples of the kind. Something counts as human, in other words, if, and only if, it shares enough of the properties that are typical of humanity. If we were to say the same thing about divinity, there would be no in-principle objection to the idea that Jesus counts as divine despite lacking omniscience or other properties like, perhaps, omnipotence, omnipresence, or even perfect goodness. One might just say that he is knowledgeable, powerful, and good enough that, given his other attributes, he bears the right sort of family resemblance to the other members of the Godhead to count as divine.
Some have offered more refined versions of the kenotic theory, arguing that the basic view mischaracterizes the divine attributes. According to these versions of the kenotic view, rather than attribute to God properties like ommniscience, omipotence, and the like, we should instead say that God has properties like the following: being omniscient-unless-temporarily-and-freely-choosing-to-be-otherwise, being omnipotent-unless-temporarily-and-freely-choosing-to-be-otherwise, and so forth. These latter sorts of properties can be retained without contradiction even when certain powers are laid aside. In this way, then, Jesus can divest himself of some of his powers to become fully human while still remaining fully divine. (Feenstra, 1989: 128–152) Unfortunately, however, this response only raises a further question, namely: if Christ's incarnation required his temporarily surrendering omniscience, then his later exaltation must have involved continued non-omniscience or the loss of his humanity. However, Christians have typically argued that the exalted Christ is omniscient while retaining his humanity. It is hard to see how this view can respond to such an objection. (But for one response see Feenstra 2007: 539).
Moving away from the standard version of the kenotic theory, some philosophers and theologians endorse views according to which it only seems as if Christ lacked divine attributes like omniscience, omnipotence, and so on. Views according to which it simply seems to us (ordinary human beings) as if he lacks those attributes are called “krypsis” accounts of the incarnation. They are views according to which the apparent loss of divine attributes is only pretense or illusion. Among other things, this raises the concern that the incarnation is somehow a grand deception, thus casting doubt on Christ's moral perfection. More acceptable, then, are views according to which it somehow seems even to Christ himself as if certain divine attributes which he actually possesses have been laid aside. On this view, the loss of omniscience, omnipotence, and so on is only simulated. Christ retains all of the traditional divine attributes. But from his point of view it is, nevertheless, as if those attributes are gone. A view like this might be characterized as positing a “functional kenosis.” (Cf. Crisp 2007, Ch. 2.)
One concern that might be raised with respect to the doctrine of functional kenosis is that it is hard to see how a divine being could possibly simulate (to himself, without outright pretense) the loss of attributes like omniscience or omnipotence. But perhaps the resources for addressing this worry are to be found in what is now widely seen as the main rival to the traditional kenotic theory: Thomas V. Morris's “two minds view.”
Morris (1986) develops the two minds view in two steps, one defensive, the other constructive. First, Morris claims that the incoherence charge against the incarnation rests on a mistake. The critic assumes that, for example, humans are essentially non-omniscient. But what are the grounds for this assertion? Unless we think that we have some special direct insight into the essential properties of human nature, our grounds are that all of the human beings we have encountered have that property. But this merely suffices to show that the property is common to humans, not that it is essential. As Morris points out, it may be universally true that all human beings, for example, were born within ten miles of the surface of the earth, but this does not mean that this is an essential property of human beings. An offspring of human parents born on the international space station would still be human. If this is right, the defender of the incarnation can reject the critic's characterization of human nature, and thereby eliminate the conflict between divine attributes and human nature so characterized.
This merely provides a way to fend off the critic, however, without supplying any positive model for how the incarnation should be understood. In the second step, then, Morris proposes that we think about the incarnation as the realization of one person with two minds: a human mind and a divine mind. If possession of a human mind and body is sufficient for something's being human, then “merging” the divine mind with a human mind and conjoining both to a human body will yield one person with two natures. During his earthly life, Morris proposes, Jesus Christ had two minds, with consciousness centered in the human mind. This human mind had partial access to the contents of the divine mind, while God the Son's divine mind had full access to the corresponding human mind.
The chief difficulty this view faces concerns the threat of Nestorianism (the view, formally condemned by the Church, that there are two persons in the incarnate Christ). It is natural simply to identify persons with minds—or, at the very least, to assume that the number of minds equals the number of persons. If we go with such very natural assumptions, however, the two minds view leads directly to the view that the incarnation gives us two persons, contrary to orthodoxy. Moreover, one might wonder whether taking the two minds model seriously leads us to the view that Christ suffers from something like multiple personality disorder. In response to both objections, however, one might note that contemporary psychology seems to provide resources which support the viability of the two minds model. As Morris points out elsewhere, the human mind is sometimes characterized as a system of somewhat autonomous subsystems. The normal human mind, for example, includes (on these characterizations) both a conscious mind (the seat of awareness) and an unconscious mind. It does not really matter for present purposes whether this psychological story is correct; the point is just that it seems coherent, and seems neither to involve multiple personality nor to imply that what seems to be a single subject is, in reality, two distinct persons. Morris proposes, then, that similar sorts of relations can be supposed to obtain between the divine and human mind of Christ.
Traditional Christianity maintains that human beings are subject to death and eternal separation from God as a result of their sinfulness, but that they can be saved from this condition somehow as a result of what we might refer to as “the work of Jesus”, which work includes at least his suffering and death on the cross, and perhaps also his sinless life, resurrection, and ascension. The so-called ‘theories of the atonement’ are theories about how the work of Jesus contributes to human salvation.
First, a brief note about terminology. We have used the term ‘theories of the atonement’ here because that is the term most commonly used in the philosophical literature on this topic, and it is a term often enough used in theology as well. But it is not a neutral term. Rather, it already embodies a partial theory about what human salvation involves and about what the work of Christ accomplishes. In particular, it presupposes that saving human beings from death and separation from God primarily involves atoning for sin rather than (say) delivering human beings from some kind of bondage, repairing human nature, or something else. In the New Testament we find various terms and phrases (in addition to ‘salvation’) used to characterize or describe what the work of Jesus accomplished on behalf of humanity—e.g., justification, redemption or ransom, reconciliation, deliverance from sin, re-creation or rebirth, the offering of an atoning sacrifice, abundant life, and eternal life. Obviously these terms are not all synonymous; so part of the task of an overall theology of salvation—a soteriology—is to sort out the relations among these various terms and phrases (is salvation simply to be identified with eternal life, for example?), to determine which are to be taken literally and which are mere metaphors, and to explain which effects have been brought about by Jesus' life, which by his death, which by his resurrection, and so on. In light of all this, some theologians and philosophers deliberately avoid talking about ‘theories of the atonement’ and talk instead about (e.g.) ‘the theology of reconciliation’ or theories about ‘the redemption’, etc. That said, however, we do not ourselves intend to advocate on behalf of any particular terminology. Instead, we simply note the issue and move on, retaining the language of ‘atonement’, but without intending to prejudge questions about what is primarily accomplished by the work of Christ.
In what follows, we shall discuss only three of the most well-known and widely discussed theories (or families of theories) about what the work of Jesus accomplishes on behalf of human beings. All take the suffering and death of Jesus to be an integral part of his work on our behalf; but the first theory holds Jesus' resurrection and ascension also to be absolutely central to that work, and the second theory holds his sinless life to be of near-equal importance. Discussing these theories under three separate headings as we do below may foster the illusion that what we have are three mutually exclusive views, each marking off a wholly distinct camp in the history of soteriological theorizing, and each aiming to provide a full accounting of what Jesus' work contributes to human salvation from death and separation from God. As we have already indicated, however, a variety of terms and images are used in the Bible to characterize what Jesus accomplished and, in contrast with the doctrines of the trinity and incarnation, we do not have for the doctrine of salvation an ecumenical conciliar prononouncement (i.e., a pronouncement from a Church Council whose authority will be recognized by the Roman Catholic, Orthodox, and Protestant churches alike) that tells us how exactly we are to understand the images and events that are generally associated with salvation. Consequently, it is no surprise that many thinkers appropriate imagery from more than one of the theories described below (or others besides) to explain their understanding of the nature and efficacy of Jesus' work.
The ransom theory, also known as the Christus Victor theory is generally regarded as the dominant theory of the Patristic period, and has been attributed to such early Church Fathers as Origen, Athanasius, and especially Gregory of Nyssa. (One might question, however, whether any of these theologians ever intended to offer the ransom story about to be described as a theory of the atonement, rather than simply an extended metaphor. What does seem clear, however, is that they at least intended to emphasize victory over sin, death, and so on as one of the principle salvific effects of the work of Christ.) The theory was revived more recently by Gustaf Aulén (1931), and was given popular expression in C.S. Lewis's The Lion, The Witch, and the Wardrobe.
The ransom theory takes as its point of departure the idea that human beings are in a kind of bondage to sin, death, and the Devil. The basic view, familiar enough now from literature and film, is that God and the Devil are in a sort of competition for souls, and the rules of the competition state that anyone stained by sin must die and then forever exist as the Devil's prisoner in hell. As the view is often developed, human sin gives the Devil a legitimate right to the possession of human souls. Thus, much as God loves us and would otherwise desire for us never to die and, furthermore, to enjoy life in heaven with him, the sad fact is that we, by our sins, have secured a much different destiny for ourselves.
But here is where the work of Christ is supposed to come in. According to the ransom view, it would be unfitting for God simply to violate the pre-ordained rules of the competition and snatch our souls out of the Devil's grasp. But it is not at all unfitting for God to pay the Devil a ransom in exchange for our freedom. Christ's death is that ransom. By living a sinless life and then dying like a sinner, Christ pays a price that, in the eyes of all parties to the competition, earns back for God the right to our souls, and thus effects a great triumph over the Devil, sin, and death.
The moral exemplar theory, pioneered by Peter Abelard, holds that the work of Christ is fundamentally aimed at bringing about moral and spiritual reform in the sinner—a kind of reform that is not fully possible apart from Christ's work. The Son of God became incarnate, on this view, in order to set this example and thus provide a necessary condition for the moral reform that is, in turn, necessary for the full restoration of the relationship between creature and Creator. On this picture, Jesus' sinless life is as much a part of his soteriologically relevant work as his suffering and death on the cross.
Thus far, it may sound as if the exemplar theory says that all there is to the efficacy of Jesus' life and death for salvation is the provision of a fine example for us to imitate. According to Philip L. Quinn (1993), however, to present the theory this way is simply to caricature it. According to Quinn, the dominant motif in Abelard's exemplar theory is one according to which human moral character is, in a very robust sense transformed by Christ's love. He writes:
My suggestion is that what Abelard has to contribute to our thinking about the atonement is the idea that divine love, made manifest throughout the life of Christ but especially in his suffering and dying, has the power to transform human sinners, if they cooperate, in ways that fit them for everlasting life in intimate union with God. ... On [this] view, the love of God for us exhibited in the life of Christ is a good example to imitate, but it is not merely an example. Above and beyond its exemplary value, there is in it a surplus of mysterious causal efficacy that no merely human love possesses. And the operation of divine love in that supernatural mode is a causally necessary condition of there being implanted or kindled in us the kind of responsive love of God that, as Abelard supposes, enables us to do all things out of love and so to conquer the motives that would otherwise keep us enslaved to sin.
In Quinn's hands, then, the exemplar theory is one according to which the life and death of Christ do indeed provide an example for us to imitate--and an example that plays an important role in effecting the transformation that will make us fit for fellowship with God. But, in contrast to the usual caricature of that theory, the exemplary nature of Christ's love does not exhaust its transformative power.
Satisfaction theories start from the idea that human sin constitutes a grave offense against God, the magnitude of which renders forgiveness and reconciliation morally impossible unless something is done either to satisfy the demands of justice or to compensate God for the wrong done to him. These theories go on to note that human beings are absolutely incapable on their own of compensating God for the wrong they have done to him, and that the only way for them to satisfy the demands of justice is to suffer death and eternal separation from God. Thus, in order to avoid this fate, they are in dire need of help. Christ, through his death (and, on some versions, through his sinless life as well) has provided that help. The different versions of the satisfaction theory are differentiated by their claims about what sort of help the work of Christ has provided. Here we'll discuss three versions: St. Anselm's debt-cancellation theory, the penal substitution theory defended by John Calvin and many others in the reformed tradition, and the penitential substitution theory, attributed to Thomas Aquinas and defended most recently by Eleonore Stump and Richard Swinburne.
According to Anselm, our sin puts us in a kind of debt toward God. As our creator, God is entitled to our submission and obedience. By sinning, we therefore fail to give God something that we owe him. Thus, we deserve to be punished until we do give God what we owe him. Indeed, on Anselm's view, not only is it just for God to punish us; it is, other things being equal, unfitting for him not to punish us. For as long as we are not giving God his due, we are dishonoring him; and the dishonoring of God is maximally intolerable. By allowing us to get away with dishonoring him, then, God would be tolerating what is maximally intolerable. Moreover, he would be behaving in a way that leaves sinners and the sinless in substantially the same position before him, which, Anselm thinks, is unseemly. But, of course, once we have sinned, it is impossible for us to give God the perfect life that we owe him. So we are left in the position of a debtor who cannot, under any circumstances, repay his own debt and is therefore stuck in debtor's prison for the remainder of his existence.
By living a sinless life, however, Christ was in a different position before God. He was the one human being who gave God what God was owed. Thus, he deserved no punishment; he did not even deserve death. And yet he submitted to death anyway for the sake of obeying God. In doing this, he gave God more than he owed God; and so, on Anselm's view, put God in the position of owing him something. According to Anselm, just as it would be unfitting for God not to punish us, so too it would be unfitting for God not to reward Jesus. But Jesus, as God incarnate, has already at his disposal everything he could possibly need or desire. So what reward could possibly be given to him? None, of course. But, Anselm argues, the reward can be transferred; and, under the circumstances, it would be unfitting for God not to transfer it. Thus, the reward that Jesus claims is the cancellation of the collective debt of his friends. This allows God to pay what he owes, and it allows him to suffer no dishonor in failing to collect what is due him from us.
As should be clear, the notion of substitution isn't really a part of Anselm's theory of the atonement. (Contrary to the more common view in the liteature, Richard Cross (2001) doesn't even take satisfaction to be part of Anselm's theory. Instead, he characterizes Anselm's view as a ‘merit’ theory. Perhaps he is right—the question seems to turn on whether part of what God the Father receives in the overall transaction with Jesus is a kind of compensation for the harm done by human sin. Many take the answer to be ‘yes’, and we shall not dispute that here.)
Nevertheless, substitution is a central part of other satisfaction theories. Thus, consider the penal substitution theory. According to this theory, the just punishment for sin is death and separation from God. Moreover, on this view, though God strongly desires for us not to receive this punishment it would be unfitting for God simply to waive our punishment. But, as in the case of monetary fines, the punishment can be paid by a willing substitute. Thus, out of love for us, God the Father sent the willing Son to be our substitute and to satisfy the demands of justice on our behalf.
Richard Swinburne's (1988, 1989) version of the satisfaction theory also includes a substitutionary element. (See also Stump 1988. The views defended by Stump and Swinburne are quite similar, and both attribute the same basic view to Aquinas. Here we focus on Swinburne's development of the view.) According to Swinburne, in human relationships, the process of making atonement for one's sin has four parts: apology, repentance, reparation (where possible), and (in case of serious wrongs) penance. Thus, suppose you angrily throw a brick through the window of a friend's house. Later, you come to seek forgiveness. In order to receive forgiveness, you will surely have to apologize and repent—i.e., you will have to show regret and some sort of change of attitude toward your past behavior. You ought also to agree to fix the broken window. Depending on the circumstance, however, even this might not be enough. It might be that, in addition to apologizing, repenting, and making reparations, you ought to do something further to show that you are quite serious about your apology and repentance. Perhaps, for example, you will send flowers every day for a week; perhaps you will stand outside your friend's window with a portable stereo playing a meaningful song; perhaps you will offer some other sort of gift or sacrifice. This something further is penance. Importantly, penance isn't punishment: it's not a bit of suffering that you deserve to have inflicted upon you by someone else for the purpose of retribution, rehabilitation, deterrence, or compensation. Rather, it's a bit of suffering that you voluntarily undergo or a sacrifice that you voluntarily make in order to repair your relationship with someone.
According to Swinburne, the same four components are involved in our reconciliation with God. Apology and repentance we can do on our own, but reparation and penance we cannot. We owe God a life of perfect obedience. By sinning we have made it impossible for God to get that from us. If, upon apologizing to God and repenting of our sins we were thereafter to live a life of perfect obedience, we would only be giving God what we already owe him; we would not thereby be giving back to him anything that we have taken away. Thus, our very best efforts would not suffice even to make reparations for what we have done. There is nothing we can give God to compsensate him for his loss, and there is no extra gift we can give or extra sacrifice we can make in order to do penance.
According to Swinburne, it would be unfitting for God simply to overlook our sins, ignoring the need for reparation and penance. It would also be unfitting for God to leave us in the helpless situation of being unable to reconcile ourselves to him. Thus, on his view, God sent Christ to earth so that Christ might willingly offer his own sinless life and death as restitution and penance for the sin of the world. In this way, then, God helps us to make restitution and penance. We must apologize and repent on our own; we must also recognize our own helplessness to make up for what we have done. But then we can look to the life and death of Christ and offer that up to God on our own behalf as reparation and penance.
Although the Christus Victor theory is of historical importance and has exerted a great deal of literary influence, it has been widely rejected since the middle ages, in no small part because it is hard to take seriously the idea that God might be in competition with or have obligations toward another being (much less a being like the Devil) in the ways described above. Critics object to the idea, which is typically part of this view, that salvation involves a sort of transaction between God and the Devil; they object to the idea, present particularly in Gregory of Nyssa's version of the view, that Christ's victory over the Devil comes partly through divine deception (with Christ's divinity being hidden from the Devil until after Christ's death, when he triumphantly rises from the grave); and they sometimes also object to the reification and personification of the forces of sin, death, and evil. For this reason, the Abelardian and Anselmian views have been far and away the more popular theories for the past millennium. But each of these remaining theories faces its share of difficulties as well.
Penal substitutionary theories, for example, maintain that it is morally impossible for God simply to forgive our sins without exacting reparation or punishment. Some have argued that this entails that God does not forgive sin at all. (Stump, 1988: 61–5) Forgiveness involves a refusal to demand full reparation and a willingness to let an offense go without punishment. Moreover, the penal substitution theory faces the challenge of explaining how it could possibly be just to allow a substitute to bear someone else's punishment. As David Lewis (1997) notes, we do allow for penal substitution in the case of serious fines. But the idea of allowing a substitute to bear someone else's death sentence (or similarly serious punishment) seems, on the face of it, to be morally repugnant. Indeed, the penal substitution model is seen by critics to be morally offensive on multiple counts. Objectors claim that at the heart of the model is the image of a wrathful deity who can be appeased by violent and bloody sacrifice, and who has made the violent death of his own incarnate Son the necessary condition for showing love and forgiveness to his human creatures. (Cf. Finlan 2005, 2007) On this score, Swinburne's theory of penitential substitution is on somewhat surer footing; but one problem with Swinburne's view is that it is hard, ultimately, to see what it would even mean to offer up another person's life and death as one's own reparation or penance.
The Anselmian version of the satisfaction theory does not quite encounter these difficulties. But, together with the moral exemplar theory and various other versions of the satisfaction theory, it faces a different sort of problem. Both views seem unable to account for the Biblical emphasis on the necessity of Christ's passion to remedy the problems brought forth by sin. It is hard to see why Christ's death plays any essential role in establishing him as moral exemplar. Further, it is hard to see why it would be needed in order for him to merit the sort of reward that Anselm thinks the Father owes him. Given that Christ is a man, he owes it to the Father to live a sinless life; but why isn't the incarnation itself sufficiently supererogatory to merit the debt-cancelling reward? Moreover, even if we can discover some reason why Christ's death would be necessary under these theories, it is hard to see why it would have to involve such horrible suffering. For purposes of meriting a reward or for serving as an exemplar, why would it not suffice for Christ to dwell among us, live a perfect human life resisting all earthly temptation, and then die a quiet death at home? Indeed, these theories seem unable to account even for the value in Christ's passion, much less its necessity.
There are, of course, responses to these objections in the literature; and each of the theories just discussed has had able and prominent defenders within the past century. Moreover, insofar as there is no well-developed and formally recognized orthodoxy with respect to these matters, those who remain unsatisfied with the theories just described have populated the literature with a variety of alternative stories about the salvific efficacy of the work of Jesus. Thus, even more than the other two theological loci we have discussed in this article, the doctrine of salvation seems ripe for substantial further research.
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How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up topics and thinkers related to this entry at the Internet Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
- Key texts from the Church Fathers concerning the Trinity (compiled by Joseph Gallegos, Corunum Catholic Apologetic Web Site
- The Athanasian Creed (Christian Classics Ethereal Library)
- Boethius, The Trinity is One God (Christian Classics Ethereal Library)
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