The Concept of Evil
Since World War II, moral, political, and legal philosophers have become increasingly interested in the concept of evil. This interest has been partly motivated by ascriptions of ‘evil’ by laymen, social scientists, journalists, and politicians as they try to understand and respond to various atrocities and horrors, such as genocides, terrorist attacks, mass murders, and tortures and killing sprees by psychopathic serial killers. It seems that we cannot capture the moral significance of these actions and their perpetrators by calling them ‘wrong’ or ‘bad’ or even ‘very very wrong’ or ‘very very bad.’ We need the concept of evil.
To avoid confusion, it is important to note that there are at least two concepts of evil: a broad concept and a narrow concept. The broad concept picks out any bad state of affairs, wrongful action, or character flaw. The suffering of a toothache is evil in the broad sense as is a harmless lie. Evil in the broad sense has been divided into two categories: natural evil and moral evil. Natural evils are bad states of affairs which do not result from the intentions or negligence of moral agents. Hurricanes and toothaches are examples of natural evils. By contrast, moral evils do result from the intentions or negligence of moral agents. Murder and lying are examples of moral evils.
Evil in the broad sense, which includes all natural and moral evils, tends to be the sort of evil referenced in theological contexts, such as in discussions of the problem of evil. The problem of evil is the problem of accounting for evil in a world created by an all-powerful, all-knowing, all-good God. It seems that if the creator has these attributes, there would be no evil in the world. But there is evil in the world. Thus, there is reason to believe that an all-powerful, all-knowing, all-good creator does not exist.
In contrast to the broad concept of evil, the narrow concept of evil picks out only the most morally despicable sorts of actions, characters, events, etc. As Marcus Singer puts it “‘evil’ [in this sense] … is the worst possible term of opprobrium imaginable” (Singer 2004, 185). Since the narrow concept of evil involves moral condemnation, it is appropriately ascribed only to moral agents and their actions. For example, if only human beings are moral agents, then only human beings can perform evil actions. Evil in this narrower sense is more often meant when the term ‘evil’ is used in contemporary moral, political, and legal contexts. This entry will focus on evil in this narrower sense. The entry will not discuss evil in the broad sense or the problem of evil to any significant degree (these topics will be discussed briefly only in section 2).
The main issues discussed by philosophers on the topic of evil have been: Should we use the term ‘evil’ in our moral, political, and legal discourse and thinking, or is evil an out-dated or empty concept which should be abandoned? What is the relationship between evil and other moral concepts such as badness and wrongdoing? What are the necessary and sufficient conditions for evil action? What are the necessary and sufficient conditions for evil character? What is the relationship between evil action and evil character? What types of evil actions and characters can exist? What is the proper analysis of derivative concepts such as evil institution?
This entry gives an overview of answers to these questions found in the literature.
- 1. Evil-Skepticism Versus Evil-Revivalism
- 2. The History of Theories of Evil
- 3. Contemporary Theories of Evil Action
- 4. Contemporary Theories of Evil Character/Personhood
- 5. Evil Institutions
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
Evil-skeptics believe we should abandon the concept of evil. On this view we can more accurately, and less perniciously, understand and describe morally despicable actions, characters, and events using more pedestrian moral concepts such as badness and wrongdoing. By contrast, evil-revivalists believe that the concept of evil has a place in our moral and political thinking and discourse. On this view, the concept of evil should be revived, not abandoned (see Russell 2006 and 2007).
Someone who believes that we should do away with moral discourse altogether could be called a moral-skeptic or a moral nihilist. Evil-skepticism is not as broad. Evil-skeptics believe the concept of evil is particularly problematic and should be abandoned while other moral concepts, such as right, wrong, good, and bad, are worth keeping.
Evil-skeptics give three main reasons to abandon the concept of evil: (1) the concept of evil involves unwarranted metaphysical commitments to dark spirits, the supernatural, or the devil; (2) the concept of evil is useless because it lacks explanatory power; and (3) the concept of evil can be harmful or dangerous when used in moral, political, and legal contexts, and so, it should not be used in those contexts, if at all.
The concept of evil is often associated with supernatural powers or creatures, especially in fictional and religious contexts. The monsters of fictions, such as vampires, witches, and werewolves, are thought to be paradigms of evil. These creatures possess powers and abilities that defy scientific explanation, and perhaps human understanding. Many popular horror films also depict evil as the result of dark forces or Satanic possession. We find similar references to supernatural forces and creatures when the term ‘evil’ is used in religious contexts. Some evil-skeptics believe that the concept of evil necessarily makes reference to supernatural spirits, dark forces, or creatures. According to these theorists if we do not believe that these spirits, forces, or monsters exist, we should only use the term ‘evil’ in fictional contexts, if at all (See Clendinnen 1999, 79–113; Cole 2006, 2019).
Evil-revivalists respond that the concept of evil need not make reference to supernatural spirits, dark forces, or monsters. There is a secular moral concept of evil which is distinct from fictional or religious conceptions, and it is this secular conception of evil that is meant most often when the term ‘evil’ is used in moral and political contexts (see Garrard 2002, 325; Card 2010, 10–17). Evil-revivalists seek to offer plausible analyses of evil which do not make reference to supernatural spirits, dark forces, or monsters, but which fully capture secular uses of the term ‘evil.’ Evil-revivalists believe that if they are able to offer plausible analyses of evil which do not make reference to the supernatural, they will have successfully defended the concept of evil from the objection that ascriptions of evil necessarily imply unwarranted metaphysical commitments (see sections 3 and 4 for secular accounts of evil).
Some evil-skeptics argue that we should abandon the concept of evil because it lacks explanatory power and therefore is a useless concept (see, e.g., Clendinnen 1999, 79–113; Cole 2006, 2019; Baron-Cohen 2011). The concept of evil would have explanatory power, or be explanatorily useful, if it were able to explain why certain actions were performed or why these actions were performed by certain agents rather than by others. Evil-skeptics such as Inga Clendinnen and Philip Cole argue that the concept of evil cannot provide explanations of this sort and thus should be abandoned.
According to Clendinnen the concept of evil cannot explain the performance of actions because it is an essentially dismissive classification. To say that a person, or an action, is evil is just to say that that person, or action, defies explanation or is incomprehensible (see Clendinnen 1999, 81; Baron-Cohen 2011, 5-7; see also, Pocock 1985). (Joel Feinberg (2003) also believes that evil actions are essentially incomprehensible. But he does not think that we should abandon the concept of evil for this reason.)
Similarly, Cole believes that the concept of evil is often employed when we lack a complete explanation for why an action was performed. For instance, we might wonder why two ten-year-old boys, Robert Thompson and Jon Venerables, tortured and murdered two-year-old James Bulger while other ten-year-old boys with similar genetic characteristics and upbringings cause little harm? Cole believes that the concept of evil is employed in these cases to provide the missing explanation. However, Cole argues that the concept of evil does not provide a genuine explanation in these cases because to say that an action is evil is just to say either that the action resulted from supernatural forces or that the action is a mystery. To say that an event resulted from supernatural forces is not to give a genuine explanation of the event because these forces do not exist. To say that an event is a mystery is not to give a genuine explanation of an event, but rather, it is to suggest that the event cannot be explained (at least with the information currently available) (2006, 6–9).
Evil-revivalists have offered several responses to the objection that the concept of evil should be abandoned because it is explanatorily useless. One common response is that the concept of evil might be worth keeping for descriptive or prescriptive purposes even if it isn’t explanatorily useful (Garrard 2002, 323–325; Russell 2009, 268–269).
Another common response is to argue that evil is no less explanatorily useful than other moral concepts such as good, bad, right, and wrong (Garrard 2002, 322–326; Russell 2009, 268–269). Thus, if we should abandon the concept of evil we should abandon these other moral concepts as well.
Eve Garrard and Luke Russell also point out that even if the concept of evil cannot provide a complete explanation for the performance of an action, it can provide a partial explanation. For instance, Garrard argues that evil actions result from a particular kind of motivation. Call this an E-motivation. Thus, to say that an action is evil is to say that it has resulted from an E-motivation. This provides a partial explanation for why the action was performed. Furthermore, Garrard has argued that if evil actions result from particularly unsavory motivational states then the concept of evil is able to explain why we react with horror in the face of evil actions. That is, we react with horror in the face of evil actions because they result from particularly despicable motivational states (Garrard 2019, 197. See also, de Wijze 2019, 212).
Some evil-skeptics believe that we should abandon the concept of evil because it is too harmful or dangerous to use (See e.g., Cole 2006, 21, and 2019; Held 2001, 107). No one can deny that the term ‘evil’ can be harmful or dangerous when it is misapplied, used perniciously, or used without sensitivity to complicated historical or political contexts. For instance, it is likely that by calling terrorists ‘evildoers’ and Iraq, Iran, and North Korea ‘the axis of evil’ former U.S. President George W. Bush made it more likely that suspected terrorists would be mistreated and less likely that there would be peaceful relations between the peoples and governments of Iraq, Iran, and North Korea and the peoples and government of the United States.
But should we abandon the concept of evil because it leads to harm when it is misapplied or abused? Claudia Card argues that “If the likelihood of the ideological abuse of a concept were sufficient reason to abandon the concept, we should probably abandon all normative concepts, certainly ‘right’ and ‘wrong.’” (Card 2010, 15) And yet evil-skeptics do not believe that we should abandon all normative concepts. So why do they believe that we should abandon the concept of evil?
An evil-skeptic might reply that we should abandon only the concept of evil, and not other normative concepts, because the concept of evil is particularly dangerous or susceptible to abuse. We can discern several reasons why ascriptions of evil might be thought to be more harmful or dangerous than ascriptions of other normative concepts such as badness or wrongdoing. First, since ascriptions of evil are the greatest form of moral condemnation, when the term ‘evil’ is misapplied we subject someone to a particularly harsh judgement undeservedly. Furthermore, it is reasonable to assume that evildoers not only deserve the greatest form of moral condemnation but also the greatest form of punishment. Thus, not only are wrongfully accused evildoers subjected to harsh judgments undeservedly, they may be subjected to harsh punishments undeservedly as well.
Another reason that ascriptions of evil can be particularly harmful or dangerous is that it isn’t always clear what people mean when they use the term ‘evil.’ As Eve Garrard puts it “the general obscurity surrounding the term makes some thinkers very reluctant to appeal to the idea of evil”(Garrard 2002, 322). For instance, some people believe that to say that someone performed an evil action implies that that person acted out of malevolence (see e.g., Kekes 2005), while others believe that evildoing can result from many different sorts of motives, even good motives (see e.g., Card 2002). Given this ambiguity, it might be unclear whether an attribution of evil attributes despicable psychological attributes to an evildoer, and this ambiguity might result in an overly harsh judgment.
Other ambiguities concerning the meaning of the term ‘evil’ may be even more harmful. For instance, on some conceptions of evil, evildoers are possessed, inhuman, incorrigible, or have fixed character traits (See Cole 2006, 1–21 and 2019; Russell 2006, 2010, and 2014; Haybron 2002a and 2002b). These metaphysical and psychological theses about evildoers are controversial. Many who use the term ‘evil’ do not mean to imply that evildoers are possessed, inhuman, incorrigible, or that they have fixed character traits. But others do. If evildoers have these traits, and thus will continue to perform evil actions no matter what we do, the only appropriate response might be to isolate them from society or to have them executed. But if evildoers do not have these fixed dispositions and they are treated as if they do, they will likely be mistreated.
Thus, while most theorists agree that the concept of evil can be harmful or dangerous there is considerable disagreement about what conclusion should be drawn from this fact. Evil-skeptics believe that because the concept of evil is harmful or dangerous we should abandon it in favour of less dangerous concepts such as badness and wrongdoing. Evil-revivalists believe that because the concept of evil is harmful or dangerous more philosophical work needs to be done on it to clear up ambiguities and reduce the likelihood of abuse or misuse. Card and Kekes argue that it is more dangerous to ignore evil than to try to understand it (Card 2002 and 2010; Kekes 1990). For if we do not understand evil we will be ill-equipped to root out its sources, and thus, we will be unable to prevent evils from occurring in the future.
The most celebrated evil-skeptic, nineteenth century German philosopher Friedrich Nietzsche, also argues that the concept of evil should be abandoned because it is dangerous. Like contemporary evil-skeptics whom he inspired, Nietzsche argues that the concept of evil should be abandoned because it does not describe a moral reality, but instead, is merely used to demonize enemies. In addition, he also argues that the concept of evil is dangerous because it has negative effects on human potential and vitality by promoting the weak in spirit and suppressing the strong. In On the Genealogy of Morality: A Polemic, Nietzsche argues that the concept of evil arose from the negative emotions of envy, hatred, and resentment (he uses the French term ressentiment to capture an attitude that combines these elements). He contends that the powerless and weak created the concept of evil to take revenge against their oppressors. Nietzsche believes that the concepts of good and evil contribute to an unhealthy view of life which judges relief from suffering as more valuable than creative self-expression and accomplishment. For this reason Nietzsche believes that we should seek to move beyond judgements of good and evil (Nietzsche 1886 and 1887).
Nietzsche’s skeptical attack on the concept of evil has encouraged philosophers to ignore the nature and moral significance of evil and instead focus on the motives people might have for using the term ‘evil’ (Card 2002, 28; Cole 2019, 178).
In the Atrocity Paradigm, Claudia Card defends the concept of evil from Nietzsche’s skeptical attack (Card 2002, 27–49). Card rejects Nietzsche’s view that ascriptions of evil merely demonize enemies and indicate a negative life-denying perspective. Instead, she argues that judgments of evil often indicate a healthy recognition that one has been treated unjustly. Eve Garrard and David McNaughton go even further in their rejection of Nietzsche’s form of evil-skepticism, arguing that it is morally objectionable to question ascriptions of evil by victims of atrocious crimes (Garrard and McNaughton 2012, 11–14).
Card also argues that we have just as much reason to question the motives of people who believe we should abandon the concept of evil as we do to question the motives of people who use the concept. She suggests that people who want to abandon the concept of evil may be overwhelmed by the task of understanding and preventing evil and would rather focus on the less daunting task of questioning the motives of people who use the term (Card 2002, 29).
Some people believe that we should not abandon the concept of evil because only the concept of evil can capture the moral significance of acts, characters, and events such as sadistic torture, serial killers, Hitler, and the Holocaust. As Daniel Haybron puts it “Prefix your adjectives [such as ‘wrong’ or ‘bad’] with as many ‘very’s as you like; you still fall short. Only ‘evil’, it seems, will do” (Haybron 2002b, 260). According to this line of argument, it is hard to deny that evil exists; and if evil exists, we need a concept to capture this immoral extreme. Eve Garrard and David McNaughton argue similarly that the concept of evil captures a distinct part of our moral phenomenology, specifically, “collect[ing] together those wrongful actions to which we have ... a response of moral horror” (Garrard and McNaughton 2012, 13–17).
A second argument in favour of the concept of evil is that it is only by facing evil, i.e., by becoming clear about its nature and origins, that we can hope to prevent future evils from occurring and live good lives (Kekes 1990, Card 2010).
A third reason to keep the concept of evil is that categorizing actions and practices as evil helps to focus our limited energy and resources. If evils are the worst sorts of moral wrongs, we should prioritize the reduction of evil over the reduction of other wrongs such as unjust inequalities. For instance, Card believes that it is more important to prevent the evils of domestic violence than it is to ensure that women and men are paid equal wages for equal work (Card 2002, 96–117).
A fourth reason not to abandon the concept of evil is that by categorizing actions and practices as evil we are better able to set limits to legitimate responses to evil. By having a greater understanding of the nature of evil we are better able to guard against responding to evil with further evils (Card 2010, 7–8).
Prior to World War II there was very little philosophical literature on the concept of evil in the narrow sense. However, philosophers have considered the nature and origins of evil in the broad sense since ancient times. Although this entry is primarily concerned with evil in the narrow sense, it is useful to survey the history of theories of evil in the broad sense since these theories provide the backdrop against which theories of evil in the narrow sense have been developed.
The history of theories of evil began with attempts to solve the problem of evil, i.e., attempts to reconcile the existence of evil (in the broad sense) with an all-powerful, all-knowing, all-good God or creator. Philosophers and theologians have recognized that to solve the problem of evil it is important to understand the nature of evil. As the Neoplatonist Plotinus put it “Those inquiring whence Evil enters into beings, or rather into a certain order of beings, would be making the best beginning if they established, first of all, what precisely Evil is” (Plotinus, Enneads, I, 8, 1).
One theory of evil that provides a solution to the problem of evil is Manichaean dualism. According to Manichaean dualism, the universe is the product of an ongoing battle between two coequal and coeternal first principles: God and the Prince of Darkness. From these first principles follow good and evil substances which are in a constant battle for supremacy. The material world constitutes a stage of this cosmic battle where the forces of evil have trapped the forces of goodness in matter. For example, the human body is evil while the human soul is good and must be freed from the body through strict adherence to Manichaean teaching. The Manichaean solution to the problem of evil is that God is neither all-powerful nor the sole creator of the world. God is supremely good and creates only good things, but he or she is powerless to prevent the Prince of Darkness from creating evil. (For more about Manichaeanism see Coyel 2009 and Lieu 1985; Greenless 2007).
Since its inception, Manichaean dualism has been criticized for providing little empirical support for its extravagant cosmology. A second problem is that, for a theist, it is hard to accept that God is not an all-powerful sole creator. For these reasons influential, early Christian philosophers such as Saint Augustine, who initially accepted the Manichaean theory of evil, eventually rejected it in favor of the Neoplatonist approach. (See Augustine, Confessions; On the Morals of the Manichaeans; Reply to Manichaeus; Burt, Augustine’s World.)
According to the Neoplatonists, evil does not exist as a substance or property but instead as a privation of substance, form, and goodness (Plotinus, Enneads, I, 8; See also O’Brien 1996). For instance, the evil of disease consists in a privation of health, and the evil of sin consist in a privation of virtue. The Neoplatonist theory of evil provides a solution to the problem of evil because if evil is a privation of substance, form, and goodness, then God creates no evil. All of God’s creation is good, evil is a lack of being and goodness.
One problem with the privation theory’s solution to the problem of evil is that it provides only a partial solution to the problem of evil since even if God creates no evil we must still explain why God allows privation evils to exist (See Calder 2007a; Kane 1980). An even more significant problem is that the privation theory seems to fail as a theory of evil since it doesn’t seem to be able to account for certain paradigmatic evils. For instance, it seems that we cannot equate the evil of pain with the privation of pleasure or some other feeling. Pain is a distinct phenomenological experience which is positively bad and not merely not good. Similarly, a sadistic torturer is not just not as good as she could be. She is not simply lacking in kindness or compassion. She desires her victims’ suffering for pleasure. These are qualities she has, not qualities she lacks, and they are positively bad and not merely lacking in goodness (Calder 2007a; Kane 1980. See Anglin and Goetz 1982 and Grant 2015 for replies to these objections).
Immanuel Kant, in his Religion Within the Limits of Reason Alone, was the first to offer a purely secular theory of evil, i.e., a theory that does not make reference to supernatural or divine entities and which is not developed as a response to the problem of evil. Kant’s concern is to make sense of three apparently conflicting truths about human nature: (1) we are radically free, (2) we are by nature inclined toward goodness, (3) we are by nature inclined toward evil.
Kant’s thoughts on evil and morality have had an important influence on subsequent philosophers writing about the nature of evil such as Hanna Arendt, Claudia Card, and Richard Bernstein. However, most theorists acknowledge that Kant’s theory is disappointing as a theory of evil in the narrow sense since it does not pick out only the morally worst sorts of actions and characters. (See, e.g., Card 2010, 37). Instead, Kant equates evil with having a will that is not fully good.
According to Kant, we have a morally good will only if we choose to perform morally right actions because they are morally right (Kant 1785, 4: 393–4:397; Kant 1793, Bk I). On Kant’s view, anyone who does not have a morally good will has an evil will. There are three grades of evil which can be seen as increasingly more evil stages of corruption in the will. First there is frailty. A person with a frail will attempts to perform morally right actions because these actions are morally right, but she is too weak to follow through with her plans. Instead, she ends up doing wrong due to a weakness of will (Kant 1793, Bk I, 24–25).
The next stage of corruption is impurity. A person with an impure will does not attempt to perform morally right actions just because these actions are morally right. Instead, she performs morally right actions partly because these actions are morally right and partly because of some other incentive, e.g., self-interest. Someone with an impure will performs morally right actions, but only partly for the right reason. Kant believes that this form of defect in the will is worse than frailty even though the frail person does wrong while the impure person does right. Impurity is worse than frailty because an impure person has allowed an incentive other than the moral law to guide her actions while the frail person tries, but fails, to do the right thing for the right reason (Kant 1793, Bk I, 25–26).
The final stage of corruption is perversity, or wickedness. Someone with a perverse will inverts the proper order of the incentives. Instead of prioritizing the moral law over all other incentives, she prioritizes self-love over the moral law. Thus, her actions conform to the moral law only if they are in her self-interest. Someone with a perverse will need not do anything wrong because actions which best promote her self-interest may conform to the moral law. But since the reason she performs morally right actions is self-love and not because these actions are morally right, her actions have no moral worth and, according to Kant, her will manifests the worst form of evil possible for a human being. Kant considers someone with a perverse will an evil person (Kant 1793, Bk I, 25).
Most contemporary theorists reject Kant’s view that the worst form of evil involves prioritizing self-interest over the moral law (See, e.g., Card 2010, 37 and 2002; Garrard 2002; Kekes 2005). Whether, and to what extent, a person, or her will, is evil seems to depend on details about her motives and the harms she brings about and not just on whether she prioritizes self-interest over the moral law. For instance, it seems far worse to torture someone for sadistic pleasure than to tell the truth to gain a good reputation. In fact, it seems reasonable to suppose that the first act (sadistic torture) indicates an evil will while the second act (telling the truth for self-interest) indicates a will that is merely lacking in moral goodness. But for Kant, both acts indicate wills that are equally evil (for attempts to address this criticism see Garcia 2002, Goldberg 2017, and Timmons 2017).
Kant makes several other controversial claims about the nature of evil in Religion Within the Limits of Reason Alone. One of these claims is that there is a radical evil in human nature. By this he means that all human beings have a propensity to subordinate the moral law to self-interest and that this propensity is radical, or rooted, in human nature in the sense that it is inextirpable. Kant also believes that we are imputable for this propensity to evil (Kant 1793, Bk I). Richard Bernstein argues that Kant cannot coherently hold both of these theses since we could not be responsible for a propensity that is in us originally and that we cannot be rid of (Bernstein 2002, 11–35). Notwithstanding this important criticism, several philosophers have argued that Kant’s thoughts on radical evil offer important insights into the nature of evil. For example, Paul Formosa argues that Kant’s reflections on radical evil draw our attention to the fact that even the best of us can revert to evil, and thus, that we must be constantly vigilant against the radical evil of our natures (Formosa 2007. See also, Bernstein 2002 and Goldberg 2017).
In his Confessions, Saint Augustine tells us that one day he stole some pears for the sole sake of doing something wrong (Augustine, Confessions, II, v-x). Kant rejects the idea that human beings can be motivated in this way (Kant 1793, Bk I, sect. 2). For Kant, human beings always have either the moral law or self-love as their incentive for acting. Only a devil could do what is wrong just because it is wrong. (For more about Kant and diabolical evil see Bernstein 2002, 36–42; Card 2010 and 2016, 36–61; Allison 2001, 86–100; and Timmons 2017, 319–327).
Secular analyses of the concept of evil in the narrow sense began in the twentieth century with the work of Hanna Arendt. Arendt’s thoughts on the nature of evil stem from her attempt to understand and evaluate the horrors of the Nazi death camps. In the Origins of Totalitarianism (1951), Arendt borrows Kant’s term ‘radical evil’ to describe the evil of the Holocaust. However, Arendt does not mean what Kant means by ‘radical evil’ (see section 2.2 for Kant’s view of radical evil). Instead, Arendt uses the term to denote a new form of wrongdoing which cannot be captured by other moral concepts. For Arendt, radical evil involves making human beings as human beings superfluous. This is accomplished when human beings are made into living corpses who lack any spontaneity or freedom. According to Arendt a distinctive feature of radical evil is that it isn’t done for humanly understandable motives such as self-interest, but merely to reinforce totalitarian control and the idea that everything is possible (Arendt 1951, 437–459; Bernstein 2002, 203–224).
In Origins of Totalitarianism Arendt’s analysis of evil focuses on evils which results from systems put in place by totalitarian regimes. Her analysis does not address the character and culpability of individuals who take part in the perpetration of evil. In Eichmann in Jerusalem: A Report on the Banality of Evil, Arendt turns her attention to individual culpability for evil through her analysis of the Nazi functionary Adolf Eichmann who was tried in Jerusalem for organizing the deportation and transportation of Jews to the Nazi concentration and extermination camps. Arendt went to Jerusalem in 1961 to report on Eichmann’s trial for The New Yorker magazine. In Eichmann in Jerusalem, she argues that “desk murderers” such as Eichmann were not motivated by demonic or monstrous motives. Instead, “It was sheer thoughtlessness—something by no means identical with stupidity—that predisposed [Eichmann] to become one of the greatest criminals of that period” (Arendt 1963, 287–288). According to Arendt, Eichmann’s motives and character were banal rather than monstrous. She describes him as a “terrifyingly normal” human being who simply did not think very deeply about what he was doing.
Arendt’s reflections on Eichmann and her concept of the banality of evil have been both influential and controversial (For theorists who believe Arendt’s thoughts are particularly pertinent today, see Bar On 2012 and Bernstein 2008. For a discussion of the controversy see Young-Bruehl 1982). Some theorists take Arendt’s thesis of the banality of evil as a datum to be explained. For instance, social psychologists Stanley Milgram (1974) and Philip Zimbardo (2007) have attempted to explain how social conditions can lead ordinary people to perform evil actions. Others have contested Arendt’s suggestion that ordinary people can be regular sources of evil (see Card 2010; Calder 2003 and 2009).
There is also controversy concerning the relationship between Arendt’s notions of radical and banal evil. In a letter she wrote to Gershom Scholem in response to some critical comments he made about Eichmann in Jerusalem, Arendt writes “You are completely right that I have changed my mind and no longer speak of radical evil” (Arendt and Scholem 2017, 209). This suggests that by the time Arendt wrote Eichmann in Jerusalem she had abandoned the notion of radical evil. However, several Arendt scholars reject this view (Berstein 2002; Birmingham 2019). For example, Peg Birmingham argues that “Arendt never wavers in her claim that extreme [or radical] evil is the systematic production of perfect superfluousness” (Birmingham 2019, 160). According to Birmingham, “[Arendt’s] account of the banality of evil is an account of the production of the moral thoughtlessness that is concomitant with [radical evil]. They are interdependent” (Birmingham 2019, 160).
Spurred on by Arendt’s work, and dissatisfied with analyses of evil found in the history of philosophy, several theorists since the 1980s have sought to offer necessary and sufficient conditions for evil. Some theorists focus on evil character, or evil personhood, as the root concept of evil (See, e.g., Haybron 2002b, 280; Perrett 2002, 304–305; Singer 2004, 190). These theorists consider the concept of evil action to be a derivative concept, i.e., they define an evil action as the sort of action that an evil person performs. But just as many theorists, or more, believe that the concept of evil action is the root concept of evil (See, e.g., Garrard 1998, 44; Russell 2014, 31–34; Kekes 2005, 2; Thomas 1993, 74–82). These theorists consider the concept of evil personhood to be a derivative concept, i.e., they define an evil person as someone who performs, or is prone to perform, evil actions. Some theorists who believe that evil action is the root concept believe that only one or two component properties are essential for evil action, while others believe that evil action has a multitude of essential components. This section discusses different views about the essential components of evil action.
Most philosophers, and laypeople, assume that wrongfulness is an essential component of evil action (See e.g., Card 2002, Garrard 1998, Formosa 2008). It seems that, to be evil, an action must, at least, be wrong. However, this claim is not universally accepted (Calder 2013). The central question for most theorists is: what more is required for evil than mere wrongdoing? One controversial answer to this question is that nothing more is required: an evil action is just a very wrongful action (Russell 2007 and 2014). This position is resisted by most evil-revivalists who claim instead that evil is qualitatively, rather than merely quantitatively, distinct from mere wrongdoing (See, e.g., Steiner 2002; Garrard 1998 and 2002; Calder 2013 and 2019).
To determine whether evil is qualitatively distinct from mere wrongdoing we must first understand what it is for two concepts to be qualitatively distinct. According to some theorists two concepts are qualitatively distinct if, and only if, all instantiations of the first concept share a property which no instantiation of the second concept shares (Steiner 2002; Garrard 1998, 2002; Russell, 2007). For instance, Hillel Steiner claims that “evil acts are distinguished from ordinary wrongs through the presence of an extra quality that is completely absent in the performance of ordinary wrongs” (Steiner 2002, 184). According to Steiner, the extra quality shared by all evil actions and lacking from merely wrongful actions, is the perpetrator’s pleasure; evil action consists in taking pleasure in doing wrong. No merely wrongful action is pleasurable for its doer (for more about Steiner’s theory of evil see Section 3.4).
Todd Calder (2013) disputes this understanding of what it is for two concepts to be qualitatively distinct, arguing instead that two concepts are qualitatively distinct provided they do not share all of their essential properties. Thus, evil actions are qualitatively distinct from merely wrongful actions provided the essential properties of evil actions are not also the essential properties of merely wrongful actions but had to a greater degree.
Calder argues that on plausible theories of evil and wrongdoing, evil and wrongdoing do not share all of their essential properties, and thus, evil and wrongdoing are qualitatively distinct. For instance, Calder argues that it is an essential property of evil actions that the evildoer intends that his victim suffer significant harm while it is not an essential property of wrongful actions that the wrongdoer intend to cause harm. For instance, cheating, lying, and risky behaviour can be wrongful even if the wrongdoer does not intend to cause harm (Calder 2013).
Hallie Liberto and Fred Harrington go even further than Calder in arguing that two concepts can be non-quantitatively distinct even though instantiations of the two concepts share properties (Liberto and Harrington 2016). According to Liberto and Harrington, two concepts are non-quantitatively distinct provided one of the concepts has a property which determines the degree to which that concept is instantiated that does not determine the degree to which the second concept is instantiated. For instance, Liberto and Harrington suggest that both altruistic and heroic actions have the following essential properties: (1) they are performed for the sake of others, and (2) they are performed at some cost or risk to the agent. However, the degree to which an action is altruistic is determined by the degree to which it is performed for the sake of others (and not by the degree to which it is performed at some cost or risk to the agent) while the degree to which an action is heroic is determined by the degree to which it is performed at some cost or risk to the agent (and not by the degree to which it is performed for the sake of others). They call this form of concept distinctness “quality of emphasis distinctness” (Liberto and Harrington 2016, 1595).
Importantly, if Liberto and Harrington are right that two concepts can be non-quantitatively distinct by being quality of emphasis distinct, then Calder is wrong to think that two concepts can be non-quantitatively distinct only if they do not share all of their essential properties. Liberto and Harrington argue further that evil and wrongdoing are non-quantitatively distinct in the sense of being quality of emphasis distinct. Consider, for example, Claudia Card’s theory of evil according to which “evil is reasonably foreseeable intolerable harm, produced by inexcusable wrongs” (Card 2010, 16). Liberto and Harrington argue that using this theory we could say that degrees of evil are determined by degrees of harm, while degrees of wrongdoing are not. If so, evil and wrongdoing are non-quantitatively distinct by being quality of emphasis distinct. (For a rebuttal of Liberto’s and Harrington’s quality of emphasis account of non-quantitative distinctness see Calder 2019, 225–226.)
Most theorists writing about the concept of evil believe that evil actions must cause or allow significant harm to at least one victim (see, e.g., Card 2002; Kekes 2005; Veltlesen 2005; Calder 2013 and 2019; Formosa 2013 and 2019; Goldberg 2019). However, three sorts of arguments have been used to contest this claim.
First, some theorists argue that evil actions need not cause or allow significant harm because we can perform evil actions by attempting (or seriously risking) to cause harm, even if we fail. For example, on this view, it would be evil to attempt to detonate a bomb in a room full of innocent people, even if the attempt is thwarted by the police (See Kramer 2011, 204–205; Russell 2014 52–53; Formosa 2019, 263–262).
Second, some theorists argue that evil actions need not cause or allow significant harm because we can perform evil actions by merely taking pleasure in a victim’s suffering (Calder 2002, 56; Garrard 2002, 327; Kramer 2011, 211; Formosa 2019, 262–263). For instance, imagine that Alex takes pleasure in witnessing Carol’s extreme suffering, but that Alex does not cause Carol’s suffering. Some people would call this act of sadistic voyeurism evil even though it causes no additional harm to the victim (we can imagine that Carol is not aware that Alex takes pleasure in her suffering so that the witnessing of her suffering does not aggravate the harm).
Theorists who believe that cases of failed attempts and/or sadistic voyeurism show that evil actions need not cause or allow significant harm nevertheless tend to believe that evil actions must be connected in an appropriate way to significant harm (See, e.g., Kramer 2011, 203–223; Russell 2007, 676; Formosa 2019, 262–265). However, others dispute this contention. These theorists argue instead that there can be cases of “small-scale evil” where evil actions involve very little or no harm (De Wijze 2018; Garrard 1998 and 2002; Morton 2004, 60). These cases constitute the third sort of argument against the claim that evil actions must cause or allow significant harm. For example Eve Garrard has suggested that schoolyard bullies perform evil actions even though they do not cause very much harm (Garrard 1998, 45), while Stephen de Wijze has argued that torturing and killing what you know to be a lifelike robot would be evil even if the robot has no conscious life (De Wijze 2018, 34).
Two sorts of responses can be given to these sorts of cases. First, we can argue that, while the action in question is evil, it does, in fact, involve significant harm. This sort of response seems appropriate for the bullying case (See Kramer 2011, 218). Second, we can argue that, while the action in question wouldn’t be harmful, it wouldn’t be evil either. This sort of response seems appropriate for the robot case.
Furthermore, in response to all three arguments for the claim that evil actions need not cause or allow significant harm (i.e. failed attempts, sadistic voyeurs, and small-scale evil), we can argue that theorists who deploy these arguments confuse evil actions with evil characters. For example, we can argue that failed attempts seem evil because attempting to perform an evil action is an indication that the agent performing the action has an evil character and not because the action itself is evil (See Calder 2015a, 121). Similarly, we can argue that given their intentions, motives, and feelings, sadistic voyeurs and robot torturers are evil persons even though they do not perform evil actions (for more about evil character see Section 4).
Assuming that harm is an essential component of evil, the question then becomes how much, or what type of, harm is required for evil? In the Roots of Evil John Kekes argues that the harm of evil must be serious and excessive (Kekes 2005, 1–3). In an earlier work, Kekes specifies that a serious harm is one that “interferes with the functioning of a person as a full-fledged agent.” (Kekes 1998, 217). Claudia Card describes the harm of evil as an intolerable harm. By an intolerable harm, Card means a harm that makes life not worth living from the point of view of the person whose life it is. Examples of intolerable harms include severe physical or mental suffering as well as the deprivation of basics such as food, clean drinking water, and social contact (Card 2002, 16). According to Paul Formosa, evil actions involve significant harms, which are typically instantiated by life-ending, life-wrecking, or severely autonomy impairing harms (Formosa 2013 and 2019). (For further discussion of the harm component see Russell 2014, 64–68).
Most theorists writing about evil believe that evil action requires a certain sort of motivational state. Once again, this claim is somewhat controversial. In the Atrocity Paradigm, Claudia Card makes a point of defining evil without reference to perpetrator motives. She does this because she wants her theory to focus on alleviating the suffering of victims rather than on understanding the motives of perpetrators (Card 2002, 9). Card’s theory also has the virtue of being able to count as evil actions which stem from a variety of motives.
However, while Card claims that the atrocity paradigm does not have a motivation component, part of the plausibility of her theory comes from the fact that it restricts the class of evil actions to those that follow from certain sorts of motives. Card’s theory of evil is “that evils are reasonably foreseeable intolerable harms produced by inexcusable wrongs” (Card 2010, 16). While this account of evil allows for a wide range of motivations, it does specify that evildoers must foresee the harm they produce and lack a moral justification for producing the harm. In other words, for Card, evildoers are motivated by a desire for some object or state of affairs which does not justify the harm they foreseeably inflict.
Other philosophers have suggested that evildoers desire to cause harm, or to do wrong, for more specific reasons such as pleasure (Steiner 2002), the desire to do what is wrong (Perrett 2002), the desire to annihilate all being (Eagleton 2010), or the destruction of others for its own sake (Cole 2006). When evil is restricted to actions that follow from these sorts of motivations, theorists sometimes say that their subject is pure, radical, diabolical, or monstrous evil. This suggests that their discussion is restricted to a type, or form, of evil and not to evil per se.
While some philosophers argue that certain motives, such as malevolence or malice, are necessary for evil, others focus instead on motives or desires that evildoers lack. For instance, Adam Morton contends that evildoers are crucially uninhibited by barriers against considering harming or humiliating others that ought to be there (Morton 2004, 57). Similarly, Laurence Thomas contends that one distinctive feature of an evildoer is that “whereas normally a person’s moral sensibilities would get in the way of his performing an act of such moral gravity [i.e., one that results in serious harm], this does not happen when a person performs an evil act” (Thomas 1993, 77).
Eve Garrard’s theory of evil also focuses on a deficiency in the motivational structure of the evildoer. To understand Garrard’s theory of evil we need to understand the difference between metaphysical and psychological silencers. A metaphysical silencer is a reason which is so weighty that, objectively speaking, it takes away the reason-giving force of some other consideration. When this happens we say that the less weighty consideration has been metaphysically silenced. By contrast, a psychological silencer is a reason which is so weighty for an individual that, subjectively, it takes away the reason-giving force of some other consideration. When this happens we say that the consideration has been psychologically silenced for the individual.
Consider Peter Singer’s case of coming across a child drowning in a shallow pond (Singer 1972). If we came across a child drowning in a shallow pond, the need to rescue the child would be so morally important that it would metaphysically silence the desire to keep our clothes clean as a reason for acting or not acting. That is, when a child is in urgent need of rescue, considerations about keeping our clothes clean lose all of their reason-giving force. They cease to be reasons for acting or not acting. For many people, especially for virtuous people, considerations about keeping their clothes clean are also psychologically silenced by the urgent need to rescue a child drowning in a shallow pond. In other words, virtuous people are completely unmoved by considerations about keeping their clothes clean when presented with children in urgent need of rescue.
According to Garrard, the evildoer has a particularly despicable motivational structure. She psychologically silences considerations that are so morally weighty that they metaphysically silence the very considerations which move her to act (Garrard 1998, 55. See also Garrard 2002 and 2019). For instance, it would be evil to psychologically silence the urgent need to rescue a drowning child as a reason for acting because we desire to keep our clothes clean.
Critics of Garrard’s theory of evil argue that it is too restrictive since it does not count as evil actions which cause, or allow, significant harm for no good reason when the agent is slightly motivated by morally important considerations (Russell 2007, 675; Calder 2015a, 118). For instance, on Garrard’s theory it would not be evil for John to allow a child to drown in a shallow pond if he was slightly motivated to rescue her but not motivated enough to dirty his clothes. Yet it seems that John would do evil by allowing a child to drown for those reasons.
Other theorists have developed mixed accounts of the motivational component of evildoing. According to these theorists, some forms of evildoing are partly constituted by lacking motives that ought to exist while others are partly constituted by having bad motives. For example, Matthew Kramer argues that evil actions are motivated by either sadism, heartlessness, or recklessness (Kramer 2011, 187–203). Paul Formosa argues, contra Kramer, that some evil actions follow from other motives—not sadism, heartlessness, or recklessness—such as anger or fear, and that any attempt to construct a list of motivating states for evil action is bound to be incomplete or ad hoc (Formosa 2019, 261). Rather than offer a list of possible motivating states for evil action, Todd Calder’s motivational component of evildoing states that to perform an evil action an agent must desire his victim’s significant harm (or states of affairs inconsistent with the absence of this harm) for an unworthy goal, where an unworthy goal is a goal which “if attained, would not make for a better state of affairs than if the harm was averted and the goal not attained” (Calder 2015a, 120. See also Calder 2003, 266–267).
Some theorists believe that a perpetrator’s feelings or emotions at the time of acting are relevant to whether an action is evil. For example, Laurence Thomas believes that evildoers take delight in causing harm or feel hatred toward their victims (Thomas 1993, 76–77. See also Formosa 2019, 264). Hillel Steiner goes even further by contending that there are just two components of evil: pleasure and wrongdoing. According to Steiner “[e]vil acts are wrong acts that are pleasurable for their doer” (Steiner 2002, 189).
Critics of Steiner’s view argue that it is neither necessary nor sufficient for evil to take pleasure in performing wrongful actions. Critics argue that it is not necessary to take pleasure in doing wrong to perform an evil action since it is sufficient to intentionally cause significant harm for an unworthy goal such as self-interest (Calder 2013). Imagine that a serial killer tortures and kills his victims but that he does not take pleasure in torturing and killing. It seems that this serial killer is an evildoer even though he does not take pleasure in doing wrong.
Critics of Steiner’s view argue that it is not sufficient for performing an evil action to take pleasure in performing a wrongful action since we would not think that it was evil to take pleasure in performing a wrongful action if the victim did not suffer significant harm. For instance, it wouldn’t be evil to take pleasure in telling a white lie (Russell 2007).
Some theorists argue that the relationship between perpetrators and victims is an important element of evil action. For example, Nel Noddings (1989) argues that a primary form of evil consists in neglecting relations, while Zachary Goldberg (2019) argues that to fully understand evil we must understand the asymmetric power relations that exist between perpetrators and victims. Todd Calder (2022) argues that to make sense of the difference between evil action and complicity in evil we must incorporate a relational component into our theory of evil action. According to Calder’s relational component, to perform an evil action we must be close to our victim or their harm (either socially, physically, or agentially). Calder contends that if the relational component is not satisfied the connection between a perpetrator’s actions and their victim’s harm is too tenuous to support a charge of evil action and can, at most, support a charge of complicity in evil (Calder 2022, 474–475).
Other questions concerning the relationship between perpetrators of evil and their victims center on the relationship between evil and forgiveness. Some theorists define evil as the unforgivable. Others argue that it should be up to victims to decide whether perpetrators of evil can be forgiven (Norlock 2019, 283–285). Other interesting questions concerning the relationship between evil and forgiveness include whether forgiveness requires reconciliation, whether only the direct victims of evil can forgive perpetrators, and whether victims of evil can be obligated to forgive, or to not forgive. (See Norlock 2019; MacLachlin 2009; Thomas 2009).
It is universally accepted that to perform an evil action an agent must be morally responsible for what she does. Although hurricanes and rattle snakes can cause great harm, they cannot perform evil actions because they are not moral agents. Furthermore, moral agents only perform evil actions when they are morally responsible for what they do and their actions are morally inexcusable (see e.g., Kekes 2005; Card 2010; Formosa 2008 and 2013). To meet these conditions evildoers must act voluntarily, intend or foresee their victim’s suffering, and lack moral justification for their actions. It is particularly controversial whether these conditions are met in three sorts of cases: (1) serious harms brought about by psychopaths; (2) serious harms brought about by individuals who have had bad upbringings; and (3) serious harms brought about through ignorance.
Psychopathy is a syndrome that consists in lacking certain emotional, interpersonal, and behavioural traits and having others (Hare 1999). Some of the defining characteristics of psychopathy include shallow emotions, egocentricity, deceitfulness, impulsivity, a lack of empathy, and a lack of guilt and remorse. Particularly relevant for assessments of moral responsibility is the psychopath’s inability to care for others and for the rules of morality.
According to the M’Naughten rules for criminal insanity, a person is legally insane if, due to a disease of the mind at the time of acting, she is unable to know the nature or quality of her action or to know that what she is doing is wrong. For instance, a delusional schizophrenic who believes that her neighbour is a demon is not responsible for harming her neighbour since she does not understand that she is harming an innocent person; she believes she is defending herself from an inhuman malicious agent. Many philosophers believe that the M’Naughten rules give us the conditions for moral responsibility as well as the conditions for criminal responsibility (see, e.g., Wolf 1987).
It is controversial whether psychopaths are insane according to the standard set by the M’Naughten rules since it is controversial whether psychopaths know that their actions are wrong. Motivational internalists believe that it is conceptually impossible to believe (and thus to know) that an action is morally wrong and yet be completely unmotivated to refrain from performing the action. That is, for the internalist, there is a conceptual connection between believing that an action is wrong and having a con-attitude toward the action. The internalist believes that one may be able to knowingly do what is wrong because, all things considered, she cares more about something that is incompatible with refraining from wrongdoing, provided she is at least somewhat inclined to refrain from doing what she knows to be wrong. Since psychopaths seem to be completely indifferent to whether their actions are right or wrong, motivational internalists believe that they do not truly believe, or understand, that what they do is morally wrong. At most, they might believe that their harmful actions break societal conventions. But it may be one thing to believe that one has broken a societal convention and quite another to believe that one has broken a moral rule. Philosophers who reject the internalist thesis, i.e., motivational externalists, are more willing to believe that psychopaths know the difference between right and wrong. According to motivational externalists, moral knowledge only requires an intellectual capacity to identify right and wrong, and not the ability to care about morality. Since psychopaths are not intellectually deficient, motivational externalists do not think there is any reason to believe that psychopaths cannot tell the difference between right and wrong. (For more about how the internalist and externalist theses relate to the moral responsibility of psychopaths see Brink 1989, 45–50; Duff 1977; Haksar 1965; and Milo 1984. See also Rosati 2006. Recently, some theorists writing about the moral responsibility of psychopaths have tried to avoid the internalist/externalist debate. It is beyond the purview of this entry to survey this literature. See Levy 2007 and 2014, Matravers 2008, Talbert 2008, Aharoni, Kiehl, and Sinnott-Armstrong 2011, Nelkin 2015.)
The degree to which deviant behavior is caused by bad upbringings rather than genetic starting points or individual choices is a difficult empirical question. Assuming that there is a strong causal connection between bad upbringings and deviant behaviour, there are two main arguments for the claim that we should not hold perpetrators morally responsible for behaviour that has resulted from bad upbringings. The first argument contends that since we do not choose our upbringings we should not be held responsible for crimes which result from our upbringings (See, e.g., Cole 2006, 122–147). Susan Wolf (1987) offers a variant of this argument. According to Wolf people who have had particularly bad upbringings are unable to make accurate normative judgements because they have been taught the wrong values. Wolf likens people who have been taught the wrong values to people suffering from psychosis because like psychotics they are unable to make accurate judgements about the world. For example, Wolf has us consider the case of Jojo, the son of Jo, a ruthless dictator of a small South American country. Jo believes that there is nothing wrong with torturing or executing innocent people. In fact, he enjoys expressing his unlimited power by ordering his guards to do just that. Jojo is given a special education which includes spending much of his day with his father. The predictable result of this education is that Jojo acquires his father’s values. Wolf argues that we should not hold Jojo responsible for torturing innocent people since his upbringing has made him unable to judge that these actions are wrong. Since Jojo is unable to judge that his actions are wrong he meets the conditions for insanity as stated in the M’Naghten rules (See section 3.5.1 above).
The second argument for the claim that we should not hold people morally responsible for crimes that result from bad upbringings begins with the supposition that we are morally responsible for our crimes only if we are appropriate objects of reactive attitudes, such as resentment (Strawson 1963). According to this argument, perpetrators of crimes who have had particularly bad upbringings are not appropriate objects of reactive attitudes since there is no point to expressing these attitudes toward these perpetrators. A proponent of this argument must then explain why there is no point to expressing reactive attitudes toward these perpetrators. In his paper “Responsibility and the Limits of Evil: Variations on a Strawsonian Theme” (1987) Gary Watson considers various ways to make sense of the claim that there is no point to expressing reactive attitudes toward people who commit crimes due to bad upbringings. Watson’s discussion centres on the case of Robert Alton Harris. As a child, Harris was an affectionate good-hearted boy. Family members say that an abusive mother and harsh treatment at corrections facilities turned him into a malicious cold-blooded murderer.
Sometimes ignorance is used as an excuse for putative evildoing (Jones 1999, 69–70). The argument goes something like this: if an agent has no good reason to believe that she causes significant harm without moral justification, then she is not morally responsible for causing this harm because she has no good reason to act otherwise. For instance, if Dorian shoots a gun into some bushes on a country estate without having any reason to believe that a man is hiding there, he is not morally responsible for harming a man who is hiding there (this case comes from Oscar Wilde’s A Picture of Dorian Gray). In this way ignorance can be a legitimate excuse for causing unjustified harm.
However, since Aristotle, theorists have recognized that ignorance is only a legitimate excuse for causing unjustified harm when we are not responsible for our ignorance, i.e., when the ignorance is non-culpable (Nichomachean Ethics, Bk III). One sort of culpable ignorance which has received a fair bit of attention from philosophers writing about evil is ignorance that results from self-deception. In self-deception we evade acknowledging to ourselves some truth or what we would see as the truth if our beliefs were based on an unbiased assessment of available evidence. “Self-deceivers are initially aware of moments when they shift their attention away from available evidence to something else, although they may not be aware of the overall project of their self-deception.” (Jones 1999, 82). Some tactics used by self-deceivers to evade acknowledging some truth, including (1) avoiding thinking about the truth, (2) distracting themselves with rationalizations that are contrary to the truth, (3) systematically failing to make inquiries that would lead to evidence of the truth and (4) ignoring available evidence of the truth or distracting their attention from this evidence (Jones 1999, 82). Several theorists writing about evil have suggested that self-deception plays a significant role in the production of evil actions and institutions (Calder 2003 and 2004; Jones 1999; Morton 2004, 57–58; Thomas 2012).
The terms ‘evil personhood’ and ‘evil character’ are used interchangeably in the literature. This entry will follow this convention.
Extant theories of evil personhood can be cross-listed as regularity or dispositional accounts on the one hand, and as action-based, affect-based, or motivation-based accounts on the other (aggregative accounts are also possible, however, it isn’t clear that any theorist currently holds an aggregative account [See Russell 2014, 139–153]). For example, John Kekes holds an action-based regularity account (Kekes 1990, 48; 1998, 217; 2005, 2), while Todd Calder holds a motive-based dispositional account (Calder 2009, 22–27).
According to regularity accounts, evil persons have evil-making properties habitually, or on a regular basis. According to dispositional accounts, evil persons need never have evil-making properties. It is sufficient to have a disposition to have evil-making properties.
Action-based accounts contend that evil-making properties are certain sorts of actions—evil actions. Affect-based accounts contend that evil-making properties are certain sorts of feelings—evil feelings. Motivation-based accounts contend that evil-making properties are certain sorts of motivations—evil desires.
Some theorists argue for more than one sort of evil-making property. For example, Luke Russell argues that both evil actions and evil feelings are evil making properties (Russell 2014, 292), while Daniel Haybron argues that evil feelings and evil motivations are evil-making properties (Haybron 2002b, 269).
Most theorists writing about evil personhood hold action-based accounts (See, e.g., Barry 2013, 87; Kekes 2005, 2; Thomas 1993, 82; Russell 2014, 180). According to action-based accounts, evil persons perform evil actions often enough, or are disposed to perform evil actions. For example, Laurence Thomas argues that “a person with an evil character is one who is often enough prone to do evil acts” (Thomas 1993, 82).
Critics argue that the problem with action-based accounts is that it seems sufficient for evil personhood to have evil feelings or motivations, and thus, evil persons need not perform, or be disposed to perform, evil actions. For instance, it seems that a harmless sadist who relishes in the suffering of others but who is not disposed to perform evil actions, could still be an evil person. Similarly, a cowardly or incompetent sadist who strongly desires to cause others suffering but who is not disposed to perform evil actions, is still an evil person (Calder 2009, 23; Haybron 2002b, 264).
According to affect-based accounts, evil people have certain sorts of feelings or emotions. For instance, Colin McGinn argues that “an evil character is one that derives pleasure from pain and pain from pleasure” (McGinn 1997, 62). There is some initial plausibility to this view since sadism and malicious envy are paradigms of evil. However, while it is undoubtedly true that some evil people are sadistic or maliciously envious, there is reason to believe that feelings of pleasure in pain or pain in pleasure, or any other sorts of feelings, are neither necessary nor sufficient for evil character. The problem with thinking that certain sorts of feelings are necessary for evil character is that an evil person might routinely cause serious harm to her victims without any accompanying feelings. For instance, someone who routinely runs down pedestrians out of indifference for their well-being, and without any accompanying feelings, seems to qualify as an evil person (Calder 2003, 368).
The problem with thinking that certain sorts of feelings, such as feelings of pleasure in another person’s pain, are sufficient for evil character is that these sorts of feelings might be involuntary and not endorsed by the person who has them. For instance, John might be just so constituted to experience pleasure in the face of another person’s pain. If John does not desire to take pleasure in other people’s pain, and is horrified by his sadistic feelings, it seems too harsh to call him evil. He should be pitied rather than condemned. Calling someone like John ‘evil’ would be like blaming someone for her patellar reflex (Calder 2003, 368–369).
According to motivation-based accounts, to be an evil person is to be motivated in a certain sort of way. For instance, Todd Calder argues that to be an evil person it is sufficient to have a regular propensity for e-desires. An e-desire is a motivational state that consists in a desire for what is correctly believed to be someone else’s significant harm for an unworthy goal or for what would correctly be believed to be someone else’s significant harm for an unworthy goal in the absence of self-deception (see Section 3.5.3 for more on self-deceptive evil). According to Calder, significant harm is desired for an unworthy goal if a state of affairs consisting of the achievement of the goal together with the harm would be less valuable than if the goal was not achieved and the harm was avoided (Calder 2003 and 2009. See also Card, 2002, 21 for a similar view).
A problem for motivation-based accounts is to explain why we should judge someone as evil based solely on her motivations. In other words, why judge someone as the morally worst sort of person for having certain desires if these desires do not result in significant harm? Why not judge people as evil only if they actually cause significant harm? One way to respond to this objection is to point out that even if e-desires do not result in significant harm on some particular occasion or for some particular person, e-desires do, for most people most of the time, lead to significant harm (Julia Driver’s consequentialist theory of virtue and vice (2001) uses a similar line of thought). Or else, a proponent of a motivation-based account could insist that judgments of evil character look inward to an agent’s psychology and not to the effects (or likely effects) of her actions (See Calder 2007b for a similar view about virtue and vice).
However, if we insist that judgements of evil character look inward to an agent’s psychology and not to the effects of her actions, why judge evil character solely on the basis of her motives? Why not take into account the agent’s affective states as well? (Haybron 2002b, 267)
According to regularity accounts, evil persons have evil-making properties frequently, or on a regular basis (See, e.g., Card 2002, 21; Kekes 1990, 48; 1998, 217; 2005, 3; Stone 2009, 23). For instance, John Kekes writes that when “agents are regular sources of evil ... we can identify them, and not merely their actions and character traits, as evil” (Kekes 1990, 48). An advantage of regularity accounts is that they explain the intuition that evil persons deserve our strongest moral condemnation (Russell 2014, 135). For if evil persons have evil-making properties frequently, or on a regular basis, then it makes sense to say that they are the worst sorts of people and deserve our strongest moral condemnation.
However, one problem with regularity accounts is that they do not seem to be able to make sense of the fact that some evil persons only very rarely (if ever) have evil-making properties. For instance, Luke Russell argues that we should reject regularity accounts because they cannot accommodate the intuition that a brooding spree killer could be evil (Russell 2014, 139). The brooding spree killer does not perform evil actions frequently or regularly. She plans and fantasizes about her attack, and then performs evil actions sporadically or all at once. Thus, Russell argues, if brooding spree killers can be evil, as we think they can be, then we should reject regularity accounts.
Notice, however, that Russell’s counterexample only works against action-based regularity accounts, since proponents of affect or motivation based regularity accounts could argue that brooding spree killers do have evil-making properties, i.e. evil feelings or evil desires, habitually or regularly during the planning and/or fantasizing phase (even if they do not perform evil actions) and thus, count as evil persons on these sorts of regularity accounts. So the question becomes, are there persons who are comparable to brooding spree killers in that they have evil feelings or desires sporadically or infrequently rather than on a regular basis? It seems that there might be cases of this sort when opportunities for evil feelings and desires are scarce. For example, we can imagine that an evil person might fail to have evil feelings and desires because she has been stranded on a deserted island. After many years without potential victims and needing to focus all of her attention on survival, she might lack evil feelings and desires due to a poverty of stimulus. This would mean that she is no longer an evil person on affect and motivation based regularity accounts. However, it seems that we should say that she is still an evil person if she is still disposed to have evil feelings and desires in the sense that her evil feelings and desires would immediately return if she were presented with a victim. If so, we should reject affect and motivation based regularity accounts.
Most theorists writing about evil personhood adopt dispositional accounts (See, e.g., Barry 2013, 87; Haybron 2002a, 70; Russell 2010 and 2014, 154–195). Broadly speaking, dispositional accounts contend that someone is an evil person if, and only if, she is disposed to have evil-making properties.
A potential problem for dispositional accounts is that they seem to conflict with the intuition that evil persons are rare since most of us are disposed to have evil-making properties in certain sorts of situations (Russell 2014, 159). For example, assuming for the moment that evil actions are evil-making properties, Stanley Milgram has shown that most of us are disposed to perform evil actions (specifically, administering potentially lethal electric shocks to innocent people) when in certain experimental conditions (i.e. when asked to do so by a researcher working for a prestigious institution in the context of a study on punishment and learning) (Milgram 1974). Milgram’s experiments were designed to explain how thousands of ordinary people could have played a role in bringing about the Holocaust during the Nazi era. Milgram’s research suggests that most of us are disposed to perform evil actions when influenced, manipulated, or pressed to do so by authority figures, as many people were in Nazi Germany (Russell 2014, 170–173). But if most of us are disposed to perform evil actions in these situations then it seems that on the dispositional account of evil personhood, most of us are evil, and thus, evil is not rare.
To make sense of the rarity of evil personhood, Luke Russell proposes a restricted dispositional account according to which someone is an evil person if, and only if, she is strongly disposed to perform evil actions in only autonomy-favoring conditions (Russell 2014, 72–75. Peter Barry argues for a similar view [See Barry 2013, 82–90]).To be “strongly” disposed (as opposed to merely disposed) to have evil-making properties is to be very likely, as opposed to merely able, to have evil-making properties (Russell 2014, 156). Autonomy-favoring conditions are conditions in which an evildoer is not “deceived, threatened, coerced, or pressed” (Russell 2014, 173), and thus, able to do what she truly wants to do. According to Russell, although most of us are strongly disposed to perform evil actions in Milgram scenarios, since Milgram scenarios are not autonomy-favoring conditions, most of us are not evil persons.
Several objections have been raised against Russell’s autonomy-favoring dispositional account (Calder 2015b). One objection is that it isn’t clear that Russell’s restricted dispositional account is an improvement over a more basic dispositional account according to which evil persons are simply strongly disposed to perform evil actions (Calder 2015b, 356–357). For it might be argued that since most of the subjects of Milgram’s experiments were surprised and distressed by what they were asked to do, they would not have taken part in further iterations of the experiment. If so, the subjects of Milgram’s experiments were strongly disposed to perform evil actions only when surprised by the novel circumstances of Milgram’s experiment, and not on an on-going basis in those circumstances. But if we do not have a disposition to perform evil actions on an on-going basis, then we do not really have a strong disposition to perform evil actions, or at least, one could argue, not in the sense implicitly meant by the basic dispositional account. Furthermore, if some subjects of Milgram’s experiments would have willingly taken part in further iterations of the experiment, it isn’t clear that they wouldn’t have been evil persons, which runs counter to Russell’s autonomy-favoring dispositional account.
A second objection to Russell’s autonomy-favoring dispositional account is that it is tailor-made to capture an intuition that some of us do not share: that most people could not be evil persons in any environment, even hostile political ones. Russell’s theory is based on the idea that if most of us would be strongly disposed to perform evil actions in certain sorts of environments, such as in Nazi Germany, then we aren’t evil persons if we are disposed to perform evil actions in only those situations. But we might reject this reasoning and argue instead that most of us are susceptible to becoming evil persons in these environments, and so, need to be wary of these environments.
In addition to arguing for regularity or dispositional accounts on the one hand, and action-based, affect-based, or motivation-based accounts on the other, theorists have argued for several additional theses concerning evil personhood.
According to the fixity thesis, evil persons have particularly fixed, or durable, characters such that it is very difficult to go from evil to non-evil, and changes of this sort rarely occur. Theorists add fixity components to their theories of evil personhood to capture the intuition that evil persons are near moral write-offs, beyond “communication and negotiation, reform and redemption” (Russell 2014 169. See also, Barry 2013, 82–87).
Todd Calder has argued against the fixity thesis. Imagine that Darlene has a highly fixed disposition to perform evil actions that she does little to resist. Geoff also has a disposition to perform evil actions, but this disposition is not highly fixed because he is indifferent about whether he should be disposed to perform evil actions and is, in general, capricious and unprincipled. It isn’t clear that Darlene is an evil person while Geoff is not. If so, the characters of evil persons need not be highly fixed (Calder 2015b, 354).
According to the consistency thesis, evil persons have evil-making properties, or are disposed to have evil-making properties, consistently, or almost all of the time. For instance, Daniel Haybron argues that “To be evil is ... to be consistently vicious in the following sense: one is not aligned with the good to a morally significant extent” (Haybron 2002b, 269). By this he means that evil people almost always lack empathy and concern for others, and they are in no way motivated to help others or to do what is morally right.
Some theorists contrast the consistency thesis with the extremity thesis according to which evil persons have some set of character traits to an extreme degree, e.g. extreme callousness or extreme maliciousness (Haybron 2002a; Barry 2013, 56–71). The extremity thesis is consistent with most theories of evil personhood. The consistency thesis is more controversial.
Critics of the consistency thesis argue that it is too restrictive (Calder 2009, 22–27; Russell 2010, 241). Imagine that Bob loves to torture children and does so frequently, but that Bob also displays genuine compassion for the elderly, perhaps by volunteering at a long-term care facility on a regular basis. According to the consistency thesis, Bob is not an evil person because he does not have evil-making characteristics consistently. And yet most people would want to say that torturing children for fun on a regular basis is enough to make Bob an evil person (Calder 2009, 22–27).
According to the mirror thesis an evil person is the mirror-image of a moral saint. Several theorists who write about evil personhood endorse this thesis and use it to argue for their theories (Barry 2009; 2013; Haybron 2002b). For instance, Daniel Haybron argues that one reason to accept his contention that evil persons are wholly (or almost wholly) unaligned with the good is that it fits well with the intuition that moral saints are “perfectly, or near-perfectly, aligned with the good” (Haybron 2002b, 274. This argument makes an implicit appeal to the mirror thesis.
Luke Russell rejects the mirror thesis, arguing that while moral saints are morally admirable in all respects, some paradigmatic evil persons possess some morally admirable traits, such as courage, commitment, and loyalty, which help them achieve their immoral goals (Russell 2010, 241–242). Since evil persons need not be bad in every respect and moral saints must be good in every respect, we should reject the mirror thesis. In response, Peter Brian Barry argues that on plausible conceptions of moral sainthood, i.e. those that can make sense of actual moral saints such as Mahatma Gandhi, Martin Luther King Jr., and Mother Teresa, moral saints can have some moral flaws (Barry 2011). Thus, the fact that some evil persons have some admirable traits shouldn’t convince us to reject the mirror thesis.
While most theorists writing about evil focus on evil action and evil character, there has also been some discussion of evil institutions. When we speak of ‘evil institutions’ we might mean one of two things: (1) organizations that are evil or that perform evil actions, or (2) social practices that are evil, such as slavery and genocide. Since an organization can only be evil, or perform evil actions, if it is morally responsible for what it does, the debate concerning the concept of evil institutions in sense (1) is discussed under the heading of ‘collective responsibility.’ Evil institutions in this sense will not be discussed in this entry. (For a recent contribution to this literature which makes explicit reference to evil collectives, see Scarre 2012.)
According to Claudia Card, an institution, in sense (2), i.e., a social practice, is evil if it is reasonably foreseeable that intolerable harm will result from its normal or correct operation without justification or moral excuse (2002, 20; 2010, 18, 27–35). For instance, genocide is an evil institution since significant suffering and a loss of social vitality result from its normal and correct operation without moral justification (Card 2010, 237–293).
However, while Card’s account of evil institutions correctly identifies genocide and other paradigmatically evil institutions as evil, her account also classifies as evil some institutions which are less obviously evil such as capital punishment, marriage, and motherhood (Card 2002, 2010). Her classification of marriage and motherhood as evil has been particularly controversial.
According to Card, marriage and motherhood are evil institutions because it is reasonably foreseeable that their normal, or correct, operation will lead to intolerable harm in the form of domestic abuse without justification or excuse (Card 2002, 139–165). For instance, Card argues that the normal, or correct, operation of marriage leads to spousal abuse “because it provides incentives for partners to stay in broken relationships, places obstacles in the way of escaping from broken relationships, gives perpetrators of abuse virtually unlimited rights of access to their victims, and makes some forms of abuse difficult or impossible to detect or prove” (Calder 2009, 28). Card argues that there is no moral justification for the intolerable harm that results from the institution of marriage since nothing prevents us from abolishing marriage in favour of other less dangerous institutions.
Critics argue that even if Card is correct that it is reasonably foreseeable that the institution of marriage will lead to intolerable harms, it is too heavy-handed to call marriage an evil institution. For instance, Todd Calder has argued that an institution should be considered evil only if intolerable harm is an essential component of the institution. Since suffering and a loss of social vitality are essential components of genocide, genocide is an evil institution. But since spousal abuse is not an essential component of marriage, marriage is not an evil institution (Calder 2009, 27–30).
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Other Interesting But Uncited Works
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