Kant’s Philosophy of Religion
Throughout his career, Immanuel Kant engaged many of the major issues that contemporary philosophy groups together under the heading “philosophy of religion.” These include arguments for the existence of God, the attributes of God, the immortality of the soul, the problem of evil, and the relationship of moral principles to religious belief and practice. In the writings from his so-called “pre-critical” period, i.e., before the publication of the Critique of Pure Reason in 1781, Kant was interested principally in the theoretical status and function of the concept of God. He thus sought to locate the concept of God within a systematically ordered set of basic philosophical principles that account for the order and structure of world. In developing his critical philosophy he proposed a new role for philosophical principles in understanding the order and structure of the world. As a result, the critical project had a significant impact upon his treatment of the status and the role of the concept of God within the theoretical enterprise of metaphysics. In addition, the critical philosophy provided a locus from which Kant could address other important dimensions of the concepts of God and religion more explicitly than he had done in his earlier writings. Chief among these are the moral and the religious import that human beings attribute to the concept of God. In view of these developments in Kant's thinking this entry thus will locate his earlier discussions of these topics within the general philosophical context of his pre-critical period; it will then reference his treatment of these topics after 1781 to key elements of his critical project. It will also highlight issues that remain important for philosophical inquiry into religion. These are the philosophical function of the concept of God, arguments for the existence of God, the relationship between morality and religion (including the notions of “moral faith” and “radical evil”), and the role of religion in the dynamics of human culture and history. A supplementary section, “The Influence of Kant's Philosophy of Religion,” discusses the impact of Kant's account of religion upon subsequent philosophical and theological inquiry.
- 1. Overview and background
- 2. Kant's pre-critical discussions of God
- 3. Kant's Philosophy of Religion during the Critical Period
- 3.1 The Received View: its Background and its Present Form
- 3.2 God in the Critique of Pure Reason's Transcendental Dialectic
- 3.3 On The Very Possibility of a Positive Kantian Philosophy of Religion
- 3.4 Moral/Pure Rational Faith
- 3.5 The Highest Good
- 3.6 The Practical Postulates
- 3.7 Pure Rational Faith vs. Historical Faith
- 3.8 The Church
- 3.9 Miracles, Providence and Eschatology
- 4. God in the Opus Postumum
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
Among the important early works of Kant that touched upon the topic of God are A New Exposition of the First Principles of Metaphysical Knowledge (1755), Universal Natural History and Theory of the Heavens (1755), and The One Possible Basis for a Demonstration of the Existence of God (1763). These writings were shaped by his interest in problems in the natural sciences (or, in the terminology of his era, “natural philosophy”) and by an intellectual context in which rationalist philosophies stemming from the work of Leibniz and Wolff held general sway. His treatment of topics such as the relationship of the power of God to the order of the universe was thus primarily aimed in these and other early writings to situate an understanding of the concept of God within those fields of philosophical inquiry called “metaphysics” and “cosmology.” The former was concerned with articulating the general principles of all that is, while the latter focused on the physical principles governing the workings of the natural universe.
At this early stage, Kant's discussions of the concept of God do not focus primarily upon on what religious content and function this concept may have for humans and their activity — e.g., how God may be an object of worship. Their focus is more upon properly locating the concept of God within a systematically ordered set of basic philosophical principles that account for the order and structure of world. This interest in the theoretical status and function of the concept of God continues throughout Kant's entire career. One result is that even in much later writings his treatment of issues of interest to philosophers of religion will be found not only in treatises that focus on religion as a specific form of human activity (e.g., Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason) or in the courses on “philosophical theology” that he occasionally gave in the University of Königsberg (published after his death as Lectures on the Philosophical Doctrine of Religion). Some of Kant's important analyses and arguments that bear on questions of religious concepts, beliefs and practices are found instead in the works written primarily to advance the agenda of the critical philosophy he inaugurated with the 1781 publication of the Critique of Pure Reason.
That project, inasmuch as it proposed a new role for philosophical principles in understanding the order and structure of the world, had a significant impact upon Kant's treatment of the status and the role of the concept of God within the theoretical enterprise of metaphysics. It also provided a locus in which Kant would address more explicitly a number of important issues connected with the religious import that human beings attribute to the concept of God. In consequence, Kant's critical philosophy developed, on the one hand, a more fundamental line of argument than he had previously deployed against standard rationalist accounts of God's relationship to the ordering of the world. In those accounts, the concept of God stood as the supreme constitutive element in such ordering, i.e., as the fundamental explanatory principle as well as the ultimate and absolute causal ground of the world. Against this view, Kant will argue that the concept of God properly functions only as a “regulative” — i.e., limiting — principle in causal accounts of the spatio-temporal order of the world. Kant's critical philosophy thus undercuts what rationalist metaphysics had offered as proofs for the existence of God. On the other hand, the critical philosophy does more than simply dismantle the conceptual scaffolding on which previous philosophical accounts of the concept of God had been constructed. In a positive vein, it more fully articulates an account of the function that an affirmation of God, made on the basis of what Kant terms “moral faith,” plays in human efforts to sustain conscientious moral endeavor throughout the course of life.
While Kant's scientific interests and the traditions of philosophical rationalism influenced the initial trajectory of his treatment of God as a key concept for metaphysics, other aspects of his historical and social context also played a role in setting the stage for his treatment of religion — particularly in the mature stages of his critical philosophy — as a feature of human life and culture. Among the most important was his upbringing in the milieu of Pietism, a reform movement within German Lutheranism that stressed inner religious conversion and upright conduct over doctrinal exactness. Kant's parents were Pietists and his early education took place in the Collegium Fridericianum, a school established by the Pietist pastor, F. A. Schultz. Kant retained an appreciation for the inner moral conscientiousness that Pietism sought to foster as fundamental to religion even as he reacted strongly against the external ritual and devotional practices of Christian public worship and prayer that Pietism continued to promote. A second important factor in the development of his philosophical approach to understanding religion was his long-standing interest in the variety of human cultures and the dynamics of human social interaction. This provided Kant with a perspective from which to view religion as principally a human phenomenon in which the various aspects of our human make-up — the sensible, the intellectual, the historical and the social — interact in ways that are significant for understanding humanity's role in the cosmos.
One consequence of the interplay of these multiple elements in shaping Kant's thinking is that no single work of his on religion — even his most extensive treatment in Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason — provides a comprehensive overview of his analyses and reflections on religion. No one work brings them together into a systematically organized “philosophy of religion.” Any account of Kant's philosophical treatment of religious concepts and of the human phenomenon of religion, moreover, must attend not only to the context in which his own thinking on these matters took shape but also to developments and changes in his views that occur in the course of five decades of philosophical reflection. The rest of this entry thus will locate the more important works in which Kant's discussion of these topics takes place, first, within the general philosophical context of his so-called “pre-critical” period; it will then reference his treatment of these topics after 1781 to key points on the philosophical agenda of his critical project. As part of this chronologically ordered overview, it will highlight issues that Kant addresses which remain important for philosophical inquiry into religion. These are the philosophical function of the concept of God, arguments for the existence of God, the relationship between morality and religion (including his notion of “moral faith” and his treatment of “radical evil”), and the role of religion in the dynamics of human culture and history. A supplementary section will note a number of ways in which Kant's account of religion has influenced the subsequent course of philosophical and theological inquiry. Kant's treatment of these issues has been such that he can be considered one of the thinkers whose work helped to establish philosophy of religion as a distinct field for specialized philosophical inquiry. At the same time, his work on religion also placed important items on the agenda for subsequent theological discussions. A brief consideration will also be given to these theological consequences of his work, since they are sometimes overlooked in accounts of his philosophy of religion.
Kant's early writings such as A New Exposition of the First Principles of Metaphysical Knowledge (1755), Universal Natural History and Theory of the Heavens (1755), and The One Possible Basis for a Demonstration of the Existence of God (1763), engage the concept of God in terms of principles and arguments that had been framed by the metaphysical systems of Leibniz and Wolff as well as by the theoretical structure of Newtonian physics. Kant had not yet articulated a definitive break with the approach of the rationalist metaphysics of his predecessors, so his discussions presuppose the validity of the enterprise of constructing an adequate theoretical argument for the existence of God. Even so, he makes a number of points in these works that prefigure key arguments that his mature critical philosophy will later raise against the way rationalist metaphysics had traditionally treated the status and function of the concept of God. In particular, these works show that Kant was already concerned to address the three main lines of argument that he took these traditions characteristically to employ for demonstrating the existence of God: the ontological argument, the cosmological argument, and the physico-theological argument (Dell'Oro, 1994).
Among the three early works noted above, Kant's most focused treatment of these arguments for the existence of God can be found in The One Possible Basis for a Demonstration of the Existence of God. He classifies arguments for God under just two headings, one that moves to the affirmation of God from a rational concept of the possible, the second that moves from experiential concepts of existent things. The ontological argument, as well as the argument Kant himself poses in this work as the only valid one, fall under the first heading. The cosmological and the physico-theological arguments fall under the second heading.
With respect to the positions about the validity and value of theoretical arguments for the existence of God that Kant later espouses and which are considered his definitive views, there are three features worth noting from this earlier work:
First, he has already formulated a central feature of the main objection that he will raise against the ontological argument in the Critique of Pure Reason, namely, that existence is not a predicate. Kant's objection is directed against rationalist accounts that took the judgment “Something exists” to predicate a property — i.e., “existence” — that is included in the concept of that thing. (An example of a property so predicated would be “extension” as a property of the concept “physical object.”) Fundamental to the ontological argument is the view that “existence” is necessarily a property of the concept of God. This then functions as the decisive consideration for the conclusion that God must exist. Against this, Kant argues that in no case — even that of God — can we predicate “existence” to be a property that is included in the concept of any object. He illustrates this by pointing out that the difference between the one-hundred dollars in my pocket and the one hundred dollars I imagine to be in my pocket is not a difference in the concept of “one hundred dollars.” To say that something “exists” — even in the case of God — is not to predicate a property that its concept lacks if the thing did not exist.
Second, at this earlier stage of his philosophical development he holds, in contrast to the position he takes in his critical philosophy, that there can be a theoretical argument that validly leads to the conclusion that God exists; of note about the argument he proposes, moreover, is that it falls under the same heading under which he has classified the ontological argument, namely an argument that starts from a concept of the possible.
Third, he groups the cosmological and physico-theological arguments under a single heading as “cosmological,” inasmuch as he sees each making an inference to God from our experience of things as they exist in the world, but he already differentiates them from one another in terms of their relative cogency and persuasive power. One line of argument — which he will designate in his later terminology as the “cosmological argument” — moves in terms of a concept of causality to its conclusion that there must be a first necessary being. He does not consider this line of argument, which he sees as characteristic of metaphysics in the tradition of Wolff, to be valid. As in his later criticism of this argument in the first Critique, he sees it ultimately resting upon the same conceptual considerations that function within the ontological argument, most notably the claim that existence is a predicate. The other — which he will designate in his later terminology as the “physico-theological” argument — moves from observations of order and harmony in the world to its conclusion that there must be a wise creator of that order. This argument he also finds lacking in strict probative force; he nonetheless considers it an important marker of the dynamics of human reason to seek an explanatory totality, even though it does not thereby provide a sure demonstrative route to an affirmation of God.
Kant has long been seen as hostile to faith. Many of his contemporaries, ranging from his students to the Prussian authorities, saw his Critical project as inimical to traditional Christianity. The impression of Kant as fundamentally a secular philosopher became even more deeply entrenched through the Twentieth Century, due in part to various interpretative conventions (such P.F. Strawson's “principle of significance”) whereby the meaningfulness and/or thinkability of the supersensible is denied, as well as through an artifact of how Kant's philosophy religion is introduced to most, namely through the widespread anthologization of his objections to the traditional proofs for God's existence.
Although the secular interpretation of Kant is widespread, it is belied by a significant share of the Critical corpus. Not only do we find powerful defenses of religious belief in all three Critiques, but a considerable share of Kant's work in the 1790s is devoted to the positive side of his philosophy of religion. This includes his 1791 “Theodicy” essay, Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason, “The End of All Things,” “Real Progress,” and the Conflict of the Faculties. Moreover, his lectures on logic, Reflexionen, and the Jäsche Logic present a robust account of the nature of religious belief/faith [Glaube]. So, while Kant does deny the possibility of religious knowledge (as well as opinion), he considers this denial necessary to safeguard faith, as the proper mode of religious assent. One must, therefore, understand the negative elements in his philosophy of religion, such as his infamous objections to the traditional proofs for God's existence, in this context. As stated in the B-Preface to the Critique of Pure Reason, a central goal of the Critical project is to establish the limits to knowledge “in order to make room for faith” (Bxxx).
Accordingly, throughout Kant's writings, we find ample discussions of religious issues. These are, in many instances, clearly affirmative, though they are often framed within objections to theoretical reason's enchroachments into the domain that is instead proper to faith. Although his discussions of God and immortality are familiar to most Kantians, the Critical corpus moves well beyond just these. Especially in the 1790s, we find detailed studies of the nature of faith, biblical hermeneutics, miracles, revelation, as well as many distinctively Christian doctrines such as Original Sin, Vicarious Atonement, the Trinity, and the Virgin Birth.
Unfortunately, however, the many positive elements of Kant's philosophy of religion have been eclipsed by its initial negative moments, moments not meant to oppose religion, but rather reflective of Kant's continuing commitment to the Lutheranism (or more precisely, the anti-liturgical Lutheran Pietism) of his youth. Just as with Luther's own negative polemics against religious despotism and scholastic arcana, we see in Kant a parallel dialectic, where he, rather than opposing religion, sought to free it from the “monopoly of the schools” and set it on a footing suitable to “the common human understanding” (Bxxxii). Hence, as we will discuss through this entry, the aforementioned passage, that he sought out the limits to knowledge [Wissen] in order to “make room for faith [Glaube]” (Bxxx), is not an empty bromide, but is rather the key anthem for his overall philosophy of religion.
The dominant interpretative tendency can be traced back to various figures of the late Eighteenth Century who spoke out against the threat they perceived in Kant's work. This includes, most notoriously, members of the Ältere Tübinger Schule as well as the Prussian Censors installed under the reign of Frederick William II. Kant's work on religion, nevertheless, did inspire many, including the young Fichte as well as many theologians within the compass of the Liberal Christian movement such as Schleiermacher and Ritschl. Many prominent Neo-Kantians have likewise recognized the duality of Kant's approach to the philosophy of religion, and thus we see, particularly in the works of Hermann Cohen and Bruno Bauch, explorations of Kant's Lutheran roots as well as the ecumenical implications of Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason's “Pure Rational System of Religion.”
By the mid-Twentieth Century, however, Kant's attempts to “make room for faith” were being ignored or dismissed as incompatible with the broader Critical Project. Through various early Anglophone interpreters, most notably through P. F. Strawson and his “principle of significance,” the image of Kant as a proto-positivist gained dominance, and the epistemic strictures of Transcendental Idealism came to be seen as barriers not just to religious assent but even to the meaningfulness of any propositions regarding the supersensible. Reinforced by Norman Kemp Smith's maladroit translation of both Wissen and Erkenntnis as “knowledge,” important distinctions were blurred and the affirmative religious elements found throughout the corpus came to be seen as unfortunate “wobbles” that detracted from what should have been a more thoroughgoingly secular philosophy.
As a result, Religion, despite its daring and original philosophical theology, has been given only a small fraction of the attention that his other books have received. With the exception of Part One's account of moral evil, the remainder of the text has been dismissed as a marginal work, maligned as a capitulation to the Christian powers of Kant's day, or just a garrulous account of our moral ideals symbolically portrayed in an “imaginatively enhanced or pictorial form.” So, despite all that Religion contains, philosophers and theologians have instead assumed that the negative elements of the Critique of Pure Reason adequately capture Kant's views on religion.
3.2.1 The Ens Realissimum
The Transcendental Dialectic's “Ideal of Reason” contains the best known and most frequently anthologized components of Kant's philosophy of religion. In addition to its portrayal of the ens realissimum, one finds within it Kant's objections to the Ontological, Cosmological and Physico-theological (Design) arguments for God's existence. It is thus the text most central to the negative elements of Kant's philosophy of religion and is integral to the widely held view that Kant is deeply hostile to faith.
The general aim of the Transcendental Dialectic is to expose reason's excesses, its drive to move beyond the limits of possible experience, and to bring all concepts into a systematic unity under an “unconditioned condition.” The Transcendental Dialectic begins with a critique of reason's illusions and errors within the sphere of Rational Psychology. It then moves on to a critique of cosmological metaphysics, and then to the “Ideal of Reason” where Kant turns to Rational Theology and its pursuit of religious knowledge.
As Kant explains, underlying all the traditional proofs for God's existence is the concept of the ens realissimum, the most real being. Reason comes to the idea of this being through the principle that every individuated object is subject to the “principle of complete determination.” While the generality of concepts allow them to be less than fully determined (e.g. our concept of a horse extends over horses that are different colors, heights, etc.), individuated objects must be completely determined (e.g. an individual horse must have specific colors, a specific height, etc.).
Hence, where the particular determinations of actual objects are discovered through experience, our concepts, which in themselves are not objects of experience, necessarily remain partly indeterminate. Nevertheless, reason can construct for itself what is on the one hand still an abstraction but yet also an individuated entity. Kant refers to such entities as “ideals” and in most instances they are used by us regulatively as archetypes for reflection. For example, when considering whether or not to get a pet, one might envision an ideal pet, a pet with the optimal set of desirable attributes. Such an archetype for thought, however, is still not completely determined, for the ideal can still be neutral between various attributes that are not regarded as relevant to one's interests (for example, one may not consider any specific nostril width salient to one's choice of pet).
By contrast, the ens realissimum is the concept of an individual object that is completely determined, and is such through reason alone. In the case of most ideals, their determinations are the result of various empirical concepts as well as various subjective interests (such as what one believes a pet would bring to one's daily life). However, in the ens realissimum, all its determinations are set solely through reason's formal application of the principle of complete determination, aggregating together all possible predicates and selecting from these predicates all those which have a fully positive reality (no negative predicates, no derivative predicates). That is, following the concept of “the most real being,” reason brings together all possible predicates and eliminates those which involve some limitation or deficiency.
In doing this, the faculty does not violate any of the standards Kant sets out within Transcendental Idealism, for reason is merely applying the formal principle of complete determination to all possible predicates and constructing an idea (or more precisely, an ideal) thereby. This construction can then be entertained by the intellect, or perhaps, used as a regulative principle, as one does with other less grand ideals.
Transcendental error comes in, however, if reason also then tenders the ens realissimum as not merely a formal construct but as the metaphysical ground of all that is: since it (in principle) contains all determinations, and these determinations are of actual entities, a “transcendental subreption” may occur that transforms the ens realissimum from just an intellectual construct into a metaphysical reality as the sum total of all actuality.
As with other transcendental errors, we can subreptively conflate a subjective principle, generated by our intellects and of only regulative use, to one that is objective – a real being not constructed in thought, but discovered through thought. Such, we may say, is the source of error in Spinoza's use of substance and in other monistic metaphysics. Our construction of the ens realissimum has the appearance of an actual unity since it is the concept of the sum total of all positive predicates. This appearance then casts an illusion unrecognized by the metaphysicians, leading them into the subreptive error.
3.2.2 Kant's Critique of the Traditional Arguments for God's Existence
According to the Ontological Argument, it is self-evident from the idea of the most real being that that being exists. Whatever it is that is this most real being, it must include all predicates that contribute to its greatness or reality; and given that actual existence is (allegedly) one such predicate, whatever it is that is the most real being is therefore a being who by definition must exist. Hence, if one were to compare two beings, both equally great in all respects except that one exists and one does not, the one that does not exist, by virtue of its non-existence, is lacking a predicate that contributes to the greatness of the other. The correct conception of that than which nothing greater can be conceived must, therefore, include existence.
Kant's famous objection to this argument is that “existence is not a predicate.” This is explained through appeal to the distinction between an actual and non-actual unit of currency, say one hundred dollars. Between the two, there is no difference in the concepts of each: existence adds nothing to the concept of one hundred dollars. So, when one claims that “one hundred dollars exist,” one is not picking out one of its predicates, part of the nature of a hundred dollars, but rather is just “positing” that one has this hundred dollars. Likewise, to claim that “the most real being exists” is merely to posit its existence. It is not a statement about a property essential to this being, for existence, as it is not a predicate or property, cannot be a property of an essence.
Kant's further contends that the Cosmological Argument is parasitic on the Ontological. He demonstrates this by taking Leibniz's Modal Argument as emblematic of all other Cosmological Arguments and then contends that a being posited as necessary in order to explain the contingency of creation has built into it the same error as discussed above. According to Leibniz's Modal Argument, the existence of a contingent reality can only be ultimately explained through a cause whose existence is in itself necessary. However, something whose existence is in itself necessary is something whose existence cannot depend upon anything else but itself, its own nature. This returns us to the Ontological Argument, or at least the objectionable idea at its heart, for the necessary being that the Cosmological Argument proposes is also the idea of a being whose essence involves existence. So, as before, since existence is not a predicate, Kant rejects the coherence of the idea of a being whose existence depends upon nothing but its own nature.
Kant's treatment of the Physico-Theological (Design) Argument is, however, substantially different from the other two classic proofs. While he still contends that it remains ultimately grounded upon the Ontological Argument's assumption that existence is a predicate, this objection does not cut to the argument's core. Surprisingly, Kant expresses considerable sympathy for the Physico-Theological Argument, and claims, for instance, that it “always deserves to be mentioned with respect” (A623/B651). He describes it as “the oldest, the clearest, and the most accordant with the common reason of mankind” (A623/B651). He further regards it as having considerable utility for the Natural Sciences, a point he repeats in both the Appendix to the Transcendental Dialectic and in the Canon of Pure Reason.
In fact, Kant claims that the argument succeeds in at least establishing “an architect of the world” and a cause “proportioned” to the order of nature. So, up to this point in the argument, he writes, “we have nothing to bring against the rationality and utility of this procedure, but have rather to commend it further” (A624/B652). What Kant cannot accept, however, is its advance from a “Wise Author of Nature” to an infinite creator. When it moves from architect to creator, it proposes an “original” and “supreme” cause, and in so doing, it calls for a being whose existence depends upon nothing but itself. This returns us to the Cosmological/Modal argument, and thus to its dependency on the Ontological.
Despite Kant's explicit claim that one of the underlying drivers of Transcendental Idealism is to defend faith against theoretical reason, it is widely believed that his philosophical system powerfully challenges, if not outright bars, religious belief. His criticisms of the traditional arguments for God's existence are taken as illustrative of his opposition to religion, and the so-called “Restriction Thesis” of Transcendental Idealism is regarded as a barrier against all legitimate religious assent.
According to Kant, we can have no knowledge of anything outside of experience, outside the scope of the spatio-temporal-causal order. Hence, there can be no knowledge of God, of the soul, of the afterlife, or anything else beyond that order. To compound this restriction, Kant also asserts that we also can have no “cognition” [Erkenntnis] of objects outside the scope of experience. While the former is less ambiguous, the latter has generated more debate, hanging very much on what it is to have a “cognition.”
Many have taken “cognition” to be a semantic notion, and so have taken Kant's denial of the cognizability of the supersensible as a denial of even the intelligibility of religious concepts. Thus, it is not merely that we cannot prove whether or not God exists, but the concept of God itself, like all other concepts of supersensible entities and properties, (allegedly) cannot even have meaning for us.
The former position, that we can have no knowledge of the supersensible, is textually well supported. Knowledge [Wissen], for Kant, follows its traditional tripartite model as justified-true-belief, and if there is neither experience nor rational proof of any supersensible claim, no such claim can meet with suitable justification.
The latter position, that we can have no cognition of supersensible objects, is likewise correct. However, the alleged implication that this makes meaningful thought about them impossible is false. Kant does not reject the thinkability of the supersensible, and, in fact, the body of arguments in the Transcendental Dialectic shows this to be clearly the case. If, for example, propositions about the supersensible were incoherent according to Kant, then he would not need his Antinomies or Paralogisms. Rather, he could sweep them all away quite simply through the charge that they fall short of the conditions for meaning.
The problem, thus, is not that we cannot coherently think the supersensible. It is, rather, that we can think about it in too many ways. Absent experience, reason is without a touchstone through which hypotheses can be refuted. Instead, so long as the ideas of reason are internally consistent, the faculty can construct a multitude of theses and antitheses about the supersensible. It can, moreover, argue quite robustly in favor of each, something we see both in the Antinomies and all the more grandly in the great tomes of the metaphysicians. The problem, for Kant, is thus not about meaning, but rather it is epistemic: having no possible experience of the supersensible, we lack the theoretical resources to adjudicate between competing claims. So, instead, to cognize, for Kant, is to think an object or proposition in relation to the order of nature and the material conditions that govern whether or not it obtains – what Kant calls the cognition's “Real Possibility.” The conditions for Real Possibility, in turn, provide the investigational framework through which we can verify or falsify what is being cognized.
“Cognition,” thus, is not a semantic notion, but epistemic. It is a mode of thinking that is not just fanciful imagining but is directed to objects whose reality can be determined. Thinking requires merely the logical possibility of what is being entertained. So long as it is not self-contradictory, it can be thought. Cognition, by contrast, embeds the thought in the material conditions for, or the Real Possibility of, the object of thought, something that is not possible once one steps beyond the scope of possible experience.
Hence, we cannot have a cognition of God because, as Kant argues in the Transcendental Dialectic's Ideal of Reason, there is no viable argument for God's existence. Likewise, we cannot prove or disprove a miracle, for its alleged supersensible cause is not something whose conditions are determinable for us. Even if we experience some event whose cause is supersensible, we have no way whatsoever to establish that this is so, and have nothing to guide our hypotheses about how to test for miracles or how they come to be.
None of this challenges the intelligibility of religious doctrines. So long as they are not self-contradictory, they are thinkable. It is just that their truth or falsehood cannot possibly be known. Moreover, since they are not within the spectrum of epistemic evaluation, we cannot opine regarding them, for opinion [Meinung], as Kant understands the term, is a mode of assent based upon the weighing of theoretical grounds (evidence and argument) for and against truth.
Yet, this does not leave us with agnosticism either. Along with knowledge and opinion, Kant identifies faith as our third legitimate mode of holding-to-be-true [Fürwahrhalten]. Faith is, for Kant, a mode of justified assent, though the nature of its justification is quite different from opinion and knowledge. It is not rooted in experience or argument, but rather in what he characterizes as the “needs of practical reason.” Hence, for Kant, religious belief finds its proper seat not in intellectual reflection but in our practical lives. Issuing from his Lutheran heritage, Kant regards the former, theoretical reason's attempt to have knowledge, as a serious threat to authentic religion. When religion is intellectualized, it alienates religion from the laity, makes them dependent upon a special class of theological experts, and, further, casts the appearance that it is through what one believes vs. how one lives that one finds salvation (cf Bxxx-xxxii, 6:180-190, 7:36-69).
Moreover, Kant sees faith, unlike knowledge, as engaging with our will, calling it a “free assent.” This is important for the practical function of faith, since our commitment to morality does not so simply depend on our affirmation of the postulates, but in our free act of faith through which we more completely bind ourselves to morality. Morality, thus “inevitably leads to religion” (6:6), since we need the latter in order to sustain or fully realize our commitment to the former. This, however, must not be interpreted as “theological ethics,” as if the authority of the moral law depended upon God. It is not its authority that is in question (perhaps with the exception of the argument at 5:114 in the Critique of Practical Reason). Rather, this advance from morality to religion concerns how we bind ourselves to the former (cf. A632/B660, 5:481, 6:3).
Thus, from Kant's objections to the traditional proofs for God's existence through to his rejection of supersensible knowledge, the negative elements of his philosophy of religion are not to be understood as denials of or even challenges to faith. They exist, rather, in order to make sure that the true worth of religion is not lost as a consequence of reason's excesses. Hence, despite more than two centuries of interpreters who have regarded Kant's criticisms as expressions of hostility, the barriers he establishes are not meant to abolish faith but to save it. It is, thus, a profound irony that Kant is so commonly portrayed in theological circles as the greatest enemy to faith that has ever emerged out of the history of philosophy. Not only is this incorrect, but it is an error that has deprived theologians (perhaps Lutheran Theologians in particular) of an important ally. Kant is not faith's enemy, but rather, one might say, its champion in exile.
According to Kant, there are three fundamental modes of (legitimate) “holding-to-be-true” [Fürwahrhalten]: knowledge, opinion, and faith. Whereas “persuasion” [Überredung] arises out of psychological biases or personal desires, knowledge, opinion and faith have grounds that are objectively valid. In the case of knowledge and opinion, these grounds are either experiential or theoretical proofs, while in the case of faith, its grounds are in the “needs of practical reason.” These needs, Kant maintains, are common to all, and thus in contrast to the subjective and idiosyncratic bases of “persuasion,” the grounds of faith, just like knowledge and opinion, are such that they ought to bring all to the same assent. Hence, quite in contrast to the popular conception of faith as a private mode of assent, with some sort of personal grounding unique to each person, faith is elevated above persuasion and made, like knowledge, a mode of legitimate “conviction” [Überzeugung] because its grounds, though still practical rather than theoretical/epistemic, are nevertheless, objective and universal.
The objective nature of faith is implicit in many of discussions, but is articulated most directly in a footnote found within the Critique of Practical Reason's section “On Assent from a Need of Pure Reason.” In this footnote, Kant responds to a criticism advanced by Thomas Wizenmann, who accuses him of advancing a form of religious assent that is ultimately just wishful thinking and self-deception. As Wizenmann claims, just as a man in love may delude himself about the putative beauty of his beloved, so likewise Kant has us subreptively transfer our personal wants into objective claims.
Kant's response is that a “need of practical reason” is not a matter of inclination or mere psychological bent. It is not, like desire, something idiosyncratic, contingent, or variable from one person to the next. He asserts instead that this need arises “from an objective determining ground of the will” (5:143n) and, at least as argued in the Critique of Practical Reason, the Highest Good is an object of faith for us, because it is “an a priori necessary object of our will and inseparably bound up with the moral law” (5:114). As such, he contends that “the impossibility of the first must also prove the falsity of the second” (5:114), and thus, our practical conviction or faith is secured by something that necessarily pertains to us all, via the authority and bindingness of the moral law.
Nevertheless, there are some important ways in which practical assent is distinct from its theoretical counterpart. As noted above, it is a “free assent,” rather than a movement of the intellect, as knowledge is often portrayed. In addition, Kant distinguishes between the certainty of faith vs. that of knowledge, noting that “I must not even say ‘It is morally certain that there is a God,’ but rather ‘I am morally certain’ (A829/B857). Hence, even though both faith and knowledge are considered certain for us, and even though faith, like knowledge, is a form of conviction rather than persuasion, the nature of the commitment still does have, in its own way, a subjective quality.
This quality may be understood through an analogy to Descartes' Cogito. Like this famous argument, there is a first-person privileged stance through which the certainty of faith arises. We see this most clearly in the Second Critique's Fact of Reason. Although it is “apodictically certain” it, nevertheless, “cannot be proved by any deduction, by any efforts of the theoretical reason, speculative or empirically supported” (5:47). It is, rather, through the first-person awareness of one's own deliberative activity that the bindingness of the moral law upon our own selves is recognized (5:32). Hence, there is no argument we can communicate and share to prove that we are all bound by the moral law. The certainty instead is only available to each of us with regards to the bindingness of the moral law for our own selves. Like the Cogito, we can communicate to others what they must reflect upon in order to become certain, but we cannot claim certainty about the bindingness of the moral law upon them. The Fact of Reason has, rather, a first-person character such that we can only be certain about the bindingness of the moral law upon ourselves.
This is why Kant claims that “Belief yields a conviction that is not communicable (because of its subjective ground)” (Ref. 2489). It further explains what he means here and elsewhere (e.g. A829/B857) by the “subjective ground” of faith. As should be apparent through his response to Wizenmann, the subjective character of faith is quite distinct from the subjective-psychological inclinations of persuasion. The causes for assent in the case of the latter are common to all. By contrast, all (finite) agents bound by the moral law encounter this law in accordance with the Fact of Reason, and will all, likewise, face the “needs of practical reason” that lead to the Highest Good and its postulates.
As previously mentioned, another important feature of faith for Kant is that it allows us to extend cognition into the supersensible. This does not mean that we gain through it some mystical intuition. Rather, his claim is merely that unlike other thoughts about things-in-themselves, we have some guidance through which we can adjudicate between different possibilities. As is illustrated by the Antinomies, Kant does not deny the thinkability of things-in-themselves, but rather once concepts are extended beyond the realm of experience, we are without a basis to justifiably endorse one theoretical construction over another. By contrast, because the needs of practical reason gives us direction, we can have a determinate cognition of God. We do not merely muse about possibilities here, but instead postulate an objective reality, one that is shaped and justified by the needs of practical reason.
It is, however, important to note that the above description pertains to just “moral faith” or “pure rational faith,” for Kant also uses Glaube quite expansively through the corpus. This breadth is due in part to the simple fact that Glaube has both a mundane and religious use, corresponding to the English “belief” and “faith” respectively. Second, it is important to note that many of Kant's discussions of faith, especially those prior to 1790, are co-mingled with the analyses found in Georg Friedrich Meier's Auszug aus der Vernunftlehre, the textbook from which Kant lectured on logic for forty years. Hence, it is important to recognize that Kant's own understanding of faith developed over time, shifting away from Meier's treatment, to one that became more tightly connected to Kant's own practical philosophy.
Lastly, we find in Religion and the Conflict of the Faculties an array of new technical distinctions, including “saving faith,” “servile faith,” and, most importantly, “ecclesiastical faith” and “historical faith.” Although the last of these terms is also used by Meier, in Religion, Kant appropriates it for a different purpose. In Meier, the term has to do with a belief based on testimony, such as we find in Kant's Lectures on Logic as well as in his 1786 “What does it Mean to Orient Oneself in Thinking.” However, in Religion (and in the Conflict of the Faculties), Kant uses it to refer to actual religious traditions and their doctrines. So, Christianity, Islam, Buddhism, etc. are referred to as “historical faiths” and their doctrines are objects of “historical faith” or “ecclesiastical faith.” We will return to Kant's distinction between pure rational faith and historical faith below.
Kant's doctrine of the Highest Good is essential to his positive philosophy of religion. With the exception of some musings (esp. in the Critique of Pure Reason) about an assent driven by our regulative employment of purposiveness (cf. B426, A670/B698 and A826/B854), the proper path to religion is through the Highest Good, for it is through this doctrine that he endorses God's existence as well as the immortality of the soul. However, there are considerable interpretative difficulties here, due in part to various artifacts of the secondary literature, and due as well to the significant differences in how Kant argues for the Highest Good in each of the three Critiques and in Religion. We will consider each of these arguments in turn, but before doing so, let us first explore the doctrine itself, what Kant takes to be the Highest Good.
3.5.1 What is the Highest Good?
In the Critique of Practical Reason, Kant distinguishes between the “supreme,” the “complete,” and “highest” good. By “supreme good,” he means the good that is “not subordinate to any other” (5:110). That is, if there are a plurality of values, the supreme good is the one that overrides the rest. Hence, if pleasure were taken as a value, its value would be subordinate to morality, and thus its value would be defeated or overridden if the pleasure comes through a violation of the moral law.
The “complete good” is one that “is not part of a still greater whole of the same kind” (5:110). Kant then explains that while morality is the supreme good, it is not the complete good “as the object of the faculty of desire of rational finite beings” (5:110). This is because in addition to morality, finite rational beings also desire happiness. So, although happiness is subordinate to morality, morality is not the “complete good” because it does not encompass all that we desire.
Kant then presents the Highest Good as a synthesis of morality and happiness in order to meet the axiological principles of supremacy and completeness. As such, this synthetic principle fulfils a need of practical reason parallel to theoretical reason's need for the unconditioned condition. Like its theoretical counterpart, practical reason demands “the absolute totality of conditions for a given conditioned” (5:107), and because of our dual interest in both morality and happiness, this totality requires the synthesis of these two interests.
Kant further argues against both the Stoic and Epicurean models of how happiness and morality are related. In the case of the latter, they take there to be an analytic relationship between the two, for the moral good, as seen by the Epicurean, is nothing but happiness. In the case of the former, Kant writes that according to the Stoics, “the feeling of happiness was already contained in consciousness of one's virtue” (5:112). He then maintains that the relation here is also analytic, though it is less clear how this is so, for it seems rather that the Stoics are advancing the synthetic causal claim that the cultivation of virtue yields happiness.
Kant nevertheless rejects both under the contention that morality and happiness are conceptually distinct irreducible values; and even if one were to resist his claim that the Stoic conception of the Highest Good is analytic, there is still a suitable Kantian objection that can be made against it, for he repeatedly denies the possibility of a causal link between morality and happiness. As stated in the Critique of Practical Reason, “no necessary connection of happiness with virtue in the world, adequate to the highest good, can be expected from the most meticulous observance of the moral laws.” (See also: A810/B838, 5:452). Thus, even if one were to disagree with Kant about the analyticity of the Stoic position, the Kantian can still reject the Stoic rendering of the Highest Good for it assumes something that Kant clearly opposes: that a life of virtue can on its own secure happiness.
When Kant then turns to his own position, positing a synthetic relationship between morality and happiness, he argues that if practical reason's need for a total object is to be met, morality and happiness can only be brought together through not merely a synthetic law, but more precisely, through a normative (rather than causal) synthetic law. That law is given to us through morality, proffering that happiness ought to be proportionate to moral worth. Thus, Kant sees the Highest Good as an ideal state of affairs, one in which there is a distribution of happiness “in exact proportion to morality,” but one that cannot be expected from our efforts, even “from the most meticulous observance of the moral laws.”
Let us refer to the Highest Good rendered in this way as HGi (the Highest Good as ideal). However, this is just one aspect of his doctrine. In addition to this ideal, Kant also presents the Highest Good as a duty for us, a duty to for us to promote the realization of HGi. Let us refer to this duty as HGd. Divisions of this sort, between two distinct aspects of the Highest Good are common in the literature. Unfortunately, however, there is considerable controversy about the specifics.
While most agree that Kant does imagine for HGi a state of affairs in which morality and happiness are somehow made proportionate, the duty to promote this state of affairs has significantly different renderings. Those who prefer to read HGi as a human, this-worldly achievement, consider HGd to be akin to a social obligation to promote a just society. By contrast, those who point to Kant's appeal to the Postulates of God and immortality, consider HGi to obtain in a “future life,” one governed by God's will. According to this position, Kant turns to the Postulates because we lack both the capacity to judge one another's moral worth as well as the capacity to secure the distribution of happiness in proportion to moral worth. Our duty, thus, is not to bring this distribution into existence. It is, rather, to become worthy of the happiness it affords. More precisely, as presented in Religion, HGd is a corporate duty, a “duty sui generis…. of the human race toward itself” (6:97) to become collectively worthy of the happiness promised in HGi.
3.5.2 Kant's Arguments for the Highest Good
Although the Critique of Practical Reason is often seen as the locus classicus for Kant's doctrine of the Highest Good, it may rather be best to take it as a transitional text, since its argument for the Highest Good is quite different from those that come after. Moreover, its characterization of the postulate of immortality deviates from what is found through Kant's other published discussions of the topic. Hence, rather than using it as the template for a singular argument for the Highest Good, one that forces together its very different treatments through the Critical Period, it is best to see this fundamental doctrine of Kant's philosophy of religion as evolving through the 1780s and 1790s. Accordingly, we shall consider four distinct arguments for the Highest Good, one from each of the three Critiques and a fourth, which is found in the First Preface to Religion.
3.5.3 Kant's Argument for the Highest Good in the Critique of Pure Reason
In the Critique of Pure Reason's “Canon of Pure Reason,” Kant's argument for the Highest Good rests upon a hold-over from his pre-Critical philosophy. Even though 1781 is usually taken to demarcate the point of transition to his mature philosophical period, it still takes a few more years before it fully comes into being, or at least before Kant fully articulates the conception of moral motivation that has us capable of acting from pure practical reason. Thus, the vision of moral agency in the First Critique, the vision that there draws him to the Highest Good, is not that of the Groundwork or his subsequent works.
Through his Pre-Critical years, and lingering still in the First Critique, Kant's conception of morality was split between Rationalist and Sentimentalist theses. He subscribed to the former's claim that morality must be law-like, its “principle of appraisal of obligation” needs to be universal and necessary. But he followed the latter's view that “the principle of performance or execution” is driven by affective desire. We find this schism in his 1764 “Inquiry Concerning the Distinctness of the Principles of Natural Theology and Morality” (the so-called Prize essay of 1764) as well as through many of his lectures and Reflexionen of the 1760's and 1770's. For instance, we find in Collins 2 lectures: “the supreme principle of all moral judgment lies in the understanding; the supreme principle of the moral impulse to do this thing lies in the heart” (27:274); and in the Mrongovius notes, Kant discusses what he sees as a fundamental disconnect between the understanding and feeling: “When a man has learned to appraise all actions, he still lacks the motive to perform them….the understanding has no elateres animi… man has no such secret organization, that he can be moved by objective grounds” (27:1429).
Similarly, in the Canon of the First Critique, Kant writes that “the majestic ideas of morality are, to be sure, objects of approbation and admiration but not incentives for resolve and realization” (A813/B841). Thus, in order for us to move from our awareness of a moral principle to an action that (at least) conforms to it, we still need something that can bring us to act on “the majestic ideas of morality”, to turn them into “incentives for resolve and realization”. By the time of the Groundwork, Kant comes, of course, to see pure practical reason as itself able to motivate us. But in the First Critique, while still at the cusp of the Critical Period, he continues to follow Sentimentalism's view that reason is motivationally impotent: “man has no such secret organization, that he can be moved by objective grounds” (27:1429).
Accordingly, the Canon proposes that we “connect appropriate consequences with their rule a priori, and thus carry with them promises and threats” (A811/B839). Without these incentives, the “majestic ideas” of morality would have no connection with our practical lives. They could be “objects of approbation and admiration” (A813/B841) but would be impotent and “empty figments of the brain” (A811/B839). This is where the hope for happiness gains its justification. The stature of morality depends upon its having some way to connect with our wills, and the connection is here established by the hope to be rewarded if one obeys and the fear of punishment if one does not. Through this connection “the system of morality is therefore inseparably combined with the system of happiness” (A809/B837).
It is in relation to the connection between happiness and morality that Kant introduces the doctrine of the Highest Good: “I call the idea of such an intelligence, in which the morally most perfect will, combined with the highest blessedness, is the cause of all happiness in the world, insofar as it stands in exact relation with morality (as the worthiness to be happy), the ideal of the highest good” (A810/B839). HGi is here introduced as the object of hope, one that is rationally justified in order that morality's “majestic ideas” can be accepted as commands for us, which they “could not be if they did not connect appropriate consequences with their rule a priori, and thus carry with them promises and threats” (A811/B840).
3.5.4 Kant's Argument for the Highest Good in the Critique of Practical Reason
With the advances to his theory of agency found in the Groundwork and thereafter, the First Critique's argument for the Highest Good becomes nugatory. We no longer need the hope for happiness to move us to act morally, and in fact, such a motivation comes to be considered inadequate to our true moral vocation. Duties do not merely have to be enacted, but must be adopted for their own sake. Hence, with the motivational power of pure practical reason itself, the “majestic ideas of morality” themselves can and ought to serve as “incentives for [their own] resolve and realization”.
Yet, Kant did not abandon his commitment to the Highest Good. Instead he cast for it a new role, announced in the Critique of Practical Reason's “Dialectic of Pure Practical Reason.” Just as the First Critique contains a Transcendental Dialectic devoted to the faculty of reason in its theoretical employment, so we have in the Second Critique, an inquiry into practical reason's quest for “the absolute totality of conditions for a given conditioned” (5:107). But there is a profound difference between the two dialectics.
In the First Critique, Kant takes great pains to expose the errors that may arise from theoretical reason's quest for the unconditioned condition. It generates various illusions, focii imaginarii (A644/B672), that on the one hand, can help direct our intellectual practices, but on the other hand, lead us into error. The latter can be avoided so long as these focii imaginarii are used merely regulatively, such as by facilitating scientific inquiry through their setting out various desiderata. However, Kant claims that reason's quest for the unconditioned condition, leads us to latch on to what should be merely regulative principles and treat them instead as transcendentally real principles or entities.
Accordingly, the primary aim of the First Critique's Dialectic is to prevent our slide from illusion into error. It begins by identifying the cause of this slide, illustrates what philosophy has become as a result, and thereby seeks to disabuse us of such enduring errors. From its opening paragraphs, it seems at first as if the Second Critique's Dialectic is going to offer us a similar exposé of reason in its practical employment. It begins by comparing its mission with its predecessor, stating that “reason in its practical use is no better off. That is, as pure practical reason, it likewise seeks the unconditioned for the practically conditioned (which rests on inclinations and natural needs)” (5:108). Yet, as we move forward, we discover that the fate of practical reason's quest for the unconditioned condition is quite different from what Kant presents in the Dialectic of the First Critique. Shortly after the above quote, Kant identifies the Highest Good as the object that fulfils pure practical reason's quest; but rather than declaring it to be an illusion and cautioning us against affirming it, he instead launches into a defense of it and of the Postulates necessary for its realization.
As discussed in the previous section, Kant had a reason to affirm the Highest Good in the Canon of the First Critique. At the cusp of the Critical Period, he still needed some affective principle through which “the majestic ideas of morality” could become “incentives for resolve and realization” (A813/B841). He thus turned to the hope for happiness offered by the Highest Good as the motivational ground for moral action. But after the developments first seen in the Groundwork, this strategy could no longer be used. We are now past Kant's introduction of the possibility of acting from duty, and thus the Highest Good cannot be justified as it was in the First Critique. This is something that Kant does seem to recognize, as he states that “though the highest good may be the whole object of pure practical reason, that is, of a pure will, it is not on that account to be taken as its determining ground” (5:109).
This quote further illustrates the shift in how he employs the Highest Good, rejecting its earlier motivational role, and repositioning it as, rather, an architectonic principle for practical reason. It is now cast as the “whole object” or “unconditioned totality of the object of pure practical reason” (5:108). Put succinctly, this object functions as the unconditioned condition for pure practical reason. It is the object that the faculty seeks to bring its principles into systematic unity. But this should be an arresting claim for astute readers, for in it we see a very different attitude towards the quest for the unconditioned in theoretical versus practical reason. We are taught in the Dialectic of the First Critique that we should guard against such objects and regard them as illusions cast by the pathologies of reason. Yet, in the Second Critique's Dialectic, Kant celebrates practical reason's quest for an object that can serve as its unconditioned condition.
It would be far too question-begging to explain this difference simply as a result of the former's Dialectic having to do with theoretical reason, while the latter concerns practical reason. Merely appealing to these two modalities or applications of reason does not explain why the latter is justified in its pursuit and adoption of what is taken as illusion and error in the former. Hence, we need to face the question as to why we are justified in affirming the unconditioned condition of practical but not theoretical reason.
There must be some warrant that permits our assent, though one that has its basis in the needs of practical reason, since the assent is a matter of faith rather than knowledge or opinion. Of course, it would be just as bromidic to settle the issue by stating that as faith, rather than knowledge or opinion, it is perfectly fine to just affirm it. If faith were so open, so blind, then presumably we could also affirm the various illusions of theoretical reason as well. So, although the distinction between theoretical and practical reason is germane to the question of what warrants our assent to the Highest Good, a more precise account of how it is germane is still needed. The Second Critique, must therefore provide some argument, rooted in the needs of practical reason, in order to explain why in its Dialectic, versus that of the First Critique, we may accept its pursuit of the unconditioned condition and the object it identifies with this condition as meriting legitimate, intersubjectively valid assent.
As we have discussed, the First Critique's argument for the Highest Good is rooted in our need to find some motivation to act morally. But this is not how Kant argues for the Highest Good in the Second Critique. It is not about our human motivational needs. It is rather, so Kant at least for the moment argues, that the authority of the moral law itself depends upon the Highest Good:
Now, since the promotion of the highest good, which contains this connection [between morality and happiness] in its concept, is an a priori necessary object of our will and inseparably bound up with the moral law, the impossibility of the first must also prove the falsity of the second. If, therefore, the highest good is impossible in accordance with practical rules, then the moral law, which commands us to promote it, must be fantastic and directed to empty imaginary ends and must therefore in itself be false. (5:114).
The above quotation captures the core argument for the Highest Good in the Second Critique. It presents the elusive warrant that justifies our assent to the doctrine, and thereby, also what justifies the Dialectic of Pure Practical Reason's having a more positive outcome than its theoretical counterpart. In contrast to the First Critique's focus on HGi, we see in the Second Critique, an argument that is instead grounded on HGd. At least as presented in the above passage, our duty to promote the Highest Good is “inseparably bound up with the moral law” and as such, following the logic of ought implies can, the ought of HGd requires that HGi must be possible.
3.5.5 Kant's Argument for the Highest Good in the Critique of Judgment
While the Second Critique treats the doctrine of the Highest Good as built into the justificatory structure of pure practical reason, the Third Critique assigns to the Highest Good a far more modest function. In fact, in at least two passages, Kant explicitly renounces the Second Critique's contention that the authority of the moral law depends upon the Highest Good. The first of these passages is as follows: “This proof…is not meant to say that it is just as necessary to assume the existence of God as it is to acknowledge the validity of the moral law, hence that whoever cannot convince himself of the former can judge himself to be free from the obligation of the latter. No!… Every rational being would still have to recognize himself as forever strictly bound to the precepts of morals; for its laws are formal and command unconditionally without regard to ends” (5:451).
Then, a few paragraphs later, he adds that even if one were to become persuaded that there is no God and that there will not be an ultimate distribution of rewards and punishments, it would be a mistake “on that account…to hold the laws of duty to be merely imaginary, invalid, and nonobligatory” (5:451).
The Third Critique does perpetuate the distinction between Highest Good as an ideal state of affairs and as a duty “to strive after” (5:450). It also continues to endorse the Postulates of God and Immortality as necessary for the realization of the former (5:452, 5:469, 5:471). But its argument is more akin to the Critique of Pure Reason's far simpler appeal to our motivational needs. As in the First Critique, so in the Third as well, Kant argues that our motivation to follow the moral law depends upon the happiness that it promises to those who are worthy of it. But in its revised form, the motivation that the Highest Good offers is merely a buttress that helps maintain our commitment to morality.
This return to a motivation argument does not, however, imply an abandonment of the motivational power of pure practical reason. Rather, as imperfect agents, influenced by inclination, Kant acknowledges that our commitment to morality is fragile. Whereas he elsewhere characterizes our moral commitment as vulnerable to self-interested desires, here he adds as well that our confrontation with “all the evils of poverty, illness, and untimely death” (5:452), could lead to moral despair. So, while the moral law's authority is not here made contingent on the possibility of HGi, our commitment to the law is. We thus need to believe in the Highest Good, and with it, the Postulates of God and Immortality.
Although Kant does not withdraw his view that pure practical reason can itself move us to action, he does qualify its motivational force and presents us as morally frail, lacking adequate fortitude to rebuff the psychological threats arising from the “purposeless chaos of matter” (5:452). Despite his claim that we (generally) have sufficient self-control to not give in to our desires, it does appear that fear and despair seem now able to condition our autonomy; and when they take hold, they must be fought back with a different affective motivation, viz., hope. Interestingly, this gives the Highest Good a role that will seem quite appropriate to many religious believers, for it presents our need for religion as one that is drawn from an inward, subjective struggle over the meaningfulness of our existence.
3.5.6 Kant's Argument for the Highest Good in Religion
It is not uncommon to fold Kant's argument for the Highest Good in the First Preface of Religion into the Third Critique's argument. While they both present the Highest Good in relation to the needs of our human condition, rather than grounded, as we saw in the Second Critique, in the architectonic of practical reason itself, a shortcoming of the argument of the Third Critique is that it places the Highest Good too far into the margins of our practical lives. That is, its argument implies that an agent could possibly sustain his commitment to the Moral Law if through good fortune he were sheltered from life's harsher truths. For it is through the impact that tragedies have on our moral resolve that we need the motivational supplement offered by the Highest Good.
By contrast, the argument of Religion's First Preface links the Highest Good with a ubiquitous element of our practical lives. As described in the text, Kant claims that we are inevitably concerned with the “whither” of our actions. Although “morality can perfectly well abstract from ends altogether” (6:4), it is “natural to the human being, of having to consider in every action, besides the law, also an end” (6:7n). This, he further describes as “one of the inescapable limitations of human beings” (6:7n) and when we choose, we inevitably have some expectation, some intended results towards which the choice is oriented.
Whereas the rightness of an action remains grounded on the moral law itself, Kant's claim here is that given what we are like as human beings, interested in the outcomes of our actions, our commitment to the moral law also has us commit to an outcome that “we simply cannot do without” (6:5). The Highest Good is thus the outcome that moral agents take on as the “special point of reference for the unification of all ends” (6:5). It reflects the morally proper relationship between the competing interests of morality and self-interest, and thus at least for those agents who give priority to morality over happiness, regarding the former as the proper condition for the latter, HGi will be the “whither” intended by their actions.
In other words, those who commit to the priority of morality over self-interest will likewise, due to their “natural need” to direct their actions towards an end, commit to an end that reflects this prioritization. HGi will be that end, since it sets morality as the condition for happiness, and thus brings together these two ends into one, synthethizing them under a rule set by morality, namely that happiness ought to be distributed in accordance with moral worth.
However, as in other texts, Kant states ones again that this is not an end we can ourselves bring about. It is the end that moral agents will want to obtain, and will want likewise to see their actions as somehow directed towards it. So, on the one hand, we must postulate God and immortality as conditions necessary for the just distribution of happiness; but on the other, what we contribute to the realization of HGi is our moral worthiness. Accordingly, Parts One and Two of Religion articulate our moral circumstances, what it means to be morally unworthy, and what we must do to become worthy. Part Three of Religion then turns from the individual moral dynamic to the corporate, for Kant there explains that HGd is a “duty sui generis, not of human beings towards human beings, but of the human race towards itself” (6:97). Although God is still given charge over the distribution of happiness, it is up to us to populate HGi and towards this end, “[e]ach must …. conduct himself as if everything depended on him” (6:101). So, if a day of judgment were to come and no one was yet worthy of God's blessings, then that judgment would bring with it a justice that offers only punishment. Happiness would still be proportioned to moral worth, but with no one deserving of happiness, no happiness would be conferred. Hence, without our efforts, HGi would be just an empty shell.
Although Kant enumerates three postulates, freedom, God, and immortality, their etiologies differ. In contrast to the latter two, the postulate of freedom is more directly tied to the Fact of Reason, taken as a necessary condition for the bindingness of the moral law upon us. By contrast, the postulates of God and Immortality are rooted in the Highest Good. As such we will here only be concerned with the latter two “religious” postulates.
An interesting tension in Kant's conception of faith is that while he distinguishes its ground from those of opinion and knowledge, the two clearest objects of faith are still partly dependent upon theoretical inference. That is, our faith in God and immortality are justified on the grounds that they are necessary conditions for the realization of HGi. As such, at least within the conditional if HGi obtains, then there must be a God and an afterlife, there is a dependency relation that is not clearly different from the sort of inferences common to theoretical demonstration. Hence, if Kant is correct that these postulates are in fact necessary for HGi, one might think it best to consider them instead as objects of knowledge.
However, as the antecedent (or perhaps its ultimate ground in the Fact of Reason) is not a matter of knowledge but faith, one may regard its propositional attitude as transitive to how one holds the consequent to be true. This is how we can understand Kant's claim that the postulates remain objects of faith rather than knowledge, despite their status as necessary conditions for the antecedent(s). In other words, if one were to take either one's commitment to the Highest Good or the Fact of Reason as instances of faith, then their necessary conditions as well would be held as instances of faith (even though mediated by a theoretical claim about necessary conditions).
3.6.1 The Postulate of God
Although some interpreters prefer a secular rendering of the Highest Good, this is not reflected in the actual corpus. All three Critiques, Religion, and many essays of the 1790s continue to maintain both postulates and continue to present the possibility of HGi as dependent upon an omnipotent, omniscient and just divinity.
While the Critique of Pure Reason shows some sympathy for the argument from Design, Kant remarks that it can only get us to a “Wise Author of Nature,” a being who is responsible for the order of nature, rather than a creator, a being with infinite capacities, or a moral being. By contrast, the Canon of the First Critique advances a conception of God as omnipotent, omniscient, and omnibenevolent. Hence, as argued, in order for HGi to obtain, there must be a being capable of arranging the world such that happiness is exactly proportioned to moral worth. This being must further have the cognitive powers necessary to judge or moral worth, and, presumably, a will aligned with morality.
Similar reasoning can be found in the Second and Third Critiques, in Religion, and in various essays of the 1790s. Furthermore, we also find this appeal to God within Kant's discussion of the Ethical Community in Part Three of Religion. Some secondary literature does not differentiate between the Ethical Community and the secular order discussed in the “Idea for a Universal History with a Cosmopolitan Aim” and “Perpetual Peace.” However, the passages in Religion where the Ethical Community is discussed makes it clear that it, like HGi, demands a “supreme lawgiver…who knows the heart” and can “penetrate to the most intimate parts of the disposition” (6:99). Hence, the Ethical Community is, for Kant, a religious ideal and could be taken as just another term for HGi. As depicted in Religion, the Ethical Community is “a work whose execution cannot be hoped for from human beings but only from God himself” (6:100).
3.6.2 The Postulate of Immortality
The postulate of immortality is typically found alongside Kant's discussions of the postulate of God. He regards both as necessary conditions for the realization of HGi, though the function of this postulate undergoes far more radical revisions through the Critical Period.
In the Critique of Pure Reason, Kant presents two distinct arguments for it. The first is a non-moral argument and is found in the B-Paralogism, after his rejection of Mendelssohn's argument for the same. Mendelssohn's argument builds off the thesis that the soul is a simple entity and cessation of existence involves a disillusion of one part and then another. He thus concludes that since the soul is simple, it is impossible for it to cease to exist. Kant rejects this argument on the grounds that even simple beings can have a degree of reality (an intensive magnitude) that can diminish to zero, he shortly thereafter presents his own argument for the soul's immortality, one that has a similar metaphysical bent: (a) since throughout nature there is a proportionality between purposes and the conditions for the realization of those purposes, there should be a similar proportionality between our capacities and the conditions for their realization, and (b) since the grandeur of our capacities, including both our natural talents and moral vocation, exceeds what can be realized in this life, it follows (c) that we are justified in affirming a “future life.” This argument, or one very similar to it, is also present in the Canon's discussion of “doctrinal belief” [doctrinale Glaube]. However, this is not an argument that endures beyond the 1780s. It is absent in later works, and in the Critique of Judgment, Kant explicitly dismisses it along with all other non-moral arguments for the afterlife (cf. 5:460 and 5:468).
The other and better known argument for this postulate is first found in the Critique of Pure Reason's Canon. Like his argument for the Postulate of God, Kant also argues that we must postulate the immortality of the soul as a necessary condition for the distribution of happiness in HGi. Given the exigencies of the natural order, this distribution cannot be secured within this order. We must therefore posit a “future life,” a “Kingdom of Grace” where “every happiness awaits us as long as we do not ourselves limit our share of it through the unworthiness to be happy” (A812/B840). Hence, in the First Critique, the purpose of the afterlife is to provide a domain for HGi's distribution of happiness.
However, in the Second Critique, the postulate undergoes a significant revision. As Kant no longer needs the Highest Good as the motivational basis for our observance of morality, it is recast as part of the architectonic of pure practical reason; and, likewise, the postulate of immortality gains a new function. Whereas Kant formerly turned to immortality as part of his account of how the happiness of HGi is to be distributed, he now presents it as necessary for our becoming worthy of that happiness.
In the section of the Second Critique devoted to this postulate (5:122 - 5:124), Kant presents a dilemma regarding what is required of us to become worthy of the happiness offered in the Highest Good. As he explains, we do not want to make this requirement too meager, thereby degrading our moral vocation, “making it out to be lenient (indulgent)” (5:122). Yet, on the other hand, we must also reject as an “unattainable vocation” the “hoped-for full acquisition of holiness of will.” Such, he writes, is an “enthusiastic theosophical dream” (5:122).
Through the remainder of the section, Kant then develops his solution, one that actually puts him quite in line with the dominant Christian view of Justifying Grace (something from which Kant departs in Religion). Most Christians would maintain that neither can we become fully adequate to God's call through our own efforts, nor even through Divine aid can we achieve this. Rather, just as Kant proposes, our efforts are instead recognized by God who then through an act of forgiveness takes our “progress which, though it has to do with a goal endlessly postponed…as possession” (5:123n)… or as more incisively stated in Lewis White Beck's translation, this progress “in God's sight is regarded as equivalent to possession” (5:123n).
In other words, the argument of the Second Critique assumes: (a) that the realization of the Highest Good involves not just the formality of the distribution of happiness in accordance with moral worth (for that could be satisfied if no one gains such worthiness and correspondingly, there is no happiness); and (b) the happiness to be distributed is taken as an absolute, rather than degreed, thus requiring “the complete conformity of our dispositions to the moral law” (5:122). However: (c) as this conformity is not possible in this life, Kant posits one yet to come; and (d) since even in the life to come we still cannot achieve moral perfection, God then accepts this infinite striving as sufficient, taking it, through an act of grace, “as equivalent to possession.”
By the 1790's however, Kant returns to a view closer to that of the First Critique. In the Third Critique, in Religion, in “The End of All Things,” “Real Progress” as well as in various other texts of that decade, Kant reprises the significance of our hope for the happiness contained in the Highest Good; and so, as in the First Critique's Canon, he argues for the postulate as required for this distribution.
Before moving forward, there are two further issues that ought to be discussed. The first is the belief found in some quarters of Kant scholarship that he abandoned the postulate of immortality in the 1790s, and the second concerns Kant's conception of the afterlife and its relationship to his Pietist upbringing.
3.6.3 The Postulate of Immortality in the 1790s
Beginning with the first, the thesis that Kant abandoned the postulate can easily be rebutted by reading his works of the 1790s. In fact, we actually find this postulate discussed far more often during the 1790s than in the 1780s. Moreover, whereas Kant seemed to vacillate as to its function from the First to the Second Critique, from the Third Critique onwards, he consistently appeals to it as necessary for the distribution of happiness. Thus, in §91 of the Critique of Judgment, in Religion, the “End of All Things,” “Real Progress” and elsewhere, the 1790s is replete with discussions of the immortality of the soul.
By contrast, those who prefer to see the Highest Good as this-worldly, and presume that Kant came to reject the postulate of immortality, frequently point to 5:450 in the Critique of Judgment, where Kant uses the phrase “the highest good in the world.” This, however, is scant evidence since the phrase also appears well before the putative shift to a secular model of the Highest Good. It occurs, for instance, in the First Critique (e.g. A814/B842) and quite abundantly in the Second Critique (5:122, 5:125, 5:126, 5:134, 5:141, etc..).
Second, “in the world” is used in contexts where one could not plausibly take it to have a secular meaning. The most glaring example of this is at 5:122 in the Critique of Practical Reason, right in the opening line of the section “The Immortality of the Soul as a Postulate of Pure Practical Reason” – that is, right where Kant argues for the postulate of immortality. Similarly, “in the world” can be found in the Second Critique's section that discusses how we are justified through the “extension of pure reason for practical purposes” (5:134) to affirm freedom, immortality and God. Kant there reminds us that by “the theoretical path,” the postulates cannot be established; yet “by the practical law that commands the existence of the highest good possible in a world, the possibility of those objects of pure speculative reason…is postulated” (5:134). Thus, it hardly seems reasonable to assume that “in the world” should be read as referring to just the natural causal order of this life, for there are many passages where Kant uses the phrase to indicate something more broad, akin to “all that is” or “all of creation”.
Thirdly, Kant in fact explicitly discusses the meaning of Welt in the Critique of Pure Reason, noting that “We have two expressions, world and nature, which are sometimes run together.” (A418/B446). But, he continues, they can also differ in meaning. When dealing with cosmology, for instance, Kant assigns to “world” a “transcendental sense,” namely, “the absolute totality of the sum total of existing things” (A419/B447). Therefore, given that he does use “in the world” in contexts that clearly include the afterlife, it is appropriate to understand the phrase in this way.
3.6.4 Immortality and “The World to Come”
Turning to our next interpretative issue, let us consider Kant's conception of the afterlife. The contemporary vision of the afterlife, with its harps and halos, is not how it was depicted within his Pietistic upbringing. Their vision, rather, conformed more to the World To Come, this world in “glorified form.” In contrast to the more Hellenistic imagery found in contemporary culture, many early Christians anticipated something far more akin to Judaism's Olam Ha-Ba, a “New Earth” or “New Jerusalem” brought about through the messiah. The dead would be then be resurrected and live in a Kingdom of God on Earth. Although the more Hellenistic vision of the afterlife has become more dominant over the past few centuries, the more Judaic vision was very much present through most of Christian history, including early Lutheran thought and its Pietistic offshoot.
Kant was, nevertheless, not of a single mind regarding the details of this future life. He was, for example, conflicted as to whether or not one should regard the afterlife as corporeal. The body “glorified” or “purified” was part of Pietist teachings, and was promoted by Franz Albert Schulz, who was an important figure in the religious life of Kant's family. But the mature Kant was conflicted. On the one hand, since he saw happiness as intimately tied to the physical, there are times where he seems to lean toward the corporeal account. However, he also writes that “pleasure and pain (since they belong to the senses) are both included in the temporal series, and disappear with it” (6:70n). Moreover, he repeatedly expresses distaste for the idea of “dragging along, through eternity, a body” (6:129n), even if it is in some “purified” form (6:129n).
More generally, Kant pressed that there is no theoretical basis for any knowledge or opinion about the afterlife. While doctrines may be proffered on practical grounds, even then, he remained unsure as to which doctrines will yield the best practical benefits. For example, in Religion, he seems to oppose the thesis that some will suffer eternal damnation (6:69n), whereas in the “End of All Things” he recognizes the merits of a “dualism” of eternal reward and punishment (8:328-8:330).
Ultimately, however, Kant recommends not only theoretical neutrality but also practical caution regarding most doctrines about the afterlife. Aside from the details dictated by the needs of pure practical reason, we should not put much weight on any further claims about the hereafter. So, if he does nevertheless prefer the Judaic conception over the Hellenistic, little is offered as to what our “glorified” or “purified” state would be like. It is something that we simply cannot resolve and for “practical purposes we can be quite indifferent as to whether we shall live merely as souls after death or whether our personal identity in the next world requires the same matter that now forms our body” (7:40).
In Religion, Kant distinguishes between two concentric spheres of religious doctrine. The innermost sphere contains those principles that constitute what he calls the “pure rational system of religion.” These are principles that can be derived from reason alone and are considered by Kant to be essential to our becoming “well pleasing to God.” They include not only the Highest Good and its postulates, but also, as we see through Religion's first two parts, an account of our moral corruption (radical evil) and redemption (change of heart).
Since the two spheres of religion are concentric, the wider sphere contains the smaller. Thus, the doctrines that constitute the pure rational system of religion are also to be found in (most) actual historical religions. Although Kant focuses on Christianity, he does affirm that other religions, Islam, Buddhism, Hinduism, etc. also contain the pure rational system, using, however, their own distinctive symbols and rituals.
Each of these religions thus serve as “vehicles” for the pure rational system of religion, providing their own “mystical cover” (6:83) and “vivid mode of representing” (6:83) what is essential to our salvation. This does not, however, mean that there are substantially different paths to salvation, for as Kant so ardently protests through Part Four of Religion, it is not ritual observance or doctrinal profession that makes us well pleasing to God. Rather, our standing before God depends on the moral status of our Gesinnung, i.e., whether we give priority to self-interest over morality or undergo a “change of heart” whereby morality is given priority over self-interest. Hence, there is only one true path, but it can be packaged in different forms.
This packaging is also of particular importance to those lacking philosophical training. While those with greater sophistication may be able to understand the pure rational system of religion absent its “mystical cover,” most of humanity will need rituals and symbols to grapple with “the highest concepts of reason” (6:109). The vehicles of historical faith, accordingly, satisfy a “natural need,” giving people “something that the senses can hold on to” (6:109).
In themselves, these symbols and rituals are “intrinsically contingent” (6:105) and “arbitrary precepts” (6:106), for it is not the symbols that matter to Kant, but the principles that they represent. Ecclesiastical practices, festivals, claims about miracles and revelations, are thus inessential to our salvation, not part of what we must do in order to become “well pleasing to God.” Moreover, because the outer sphere expands beyond the inner, not all that is contained within historical faith will directly correlate with the principles of pure rational faith. Some doctrines (Kant mentions the Virgin Birth and Trinity) are without any obvious tie to the inner principles of faith.
Nevertheless, Kant does not dismiss the whole of the outer sphere. While its contents are likewise “contingent” and “arbitrary” from the standpoint of what is necessary for our moral vocation, he still grants that within this domain there still may be genuine revelation and miracles. While theoretical reason must keep “a respectful distance” (6:191) with regards to their truth, Kant recognizes that it would be “arrogant peremptorily to deny that the way a church is organized may perhaps also be a special divine dispensation” (6:105); and also accepts as possible that “the historical introduction of the latter [a new religion] be accompanied and as it were adorned by miracles” (6:84).
So, even though we are to remain agnostic regarding the truth of any particular claim about a miracle or revelation, for there is nothing in experience that can tell us whether or not some event has a supernatural cause, Kant nevertheless endorses an openness to these possibilities. Such an openness may help sustain us morally and may help infuse the practices of historical faith with a vitality that promotes its institutions.
Kant, however, does at times seem conflicted as to whether or not some form of historical faith is necessary (even though each particular form is in itself contingent). On the one hand, there is, as noted above, a “natural need” for symbols and rituals. Moreover, he also recognizes that the advance of the species towards the Ethical Community needs a universal church. Yet, he also hopes for a time when religion can “be freed of all empirical grounds of determination, of all statutes that rest on history” (6:121). So, while historical faith has served as a vehicle for pure rational faith, it seems that he still holds out hope for a time when “finally we can dispense of that vehicle” (6:115). If humanity eventually matures to this state (perhaps part of the state we will be in once the species as a whole is worthy of membership in HGi), it may be that the external trappings of religion can finally be shed. In the meantime, however, there will be organizational structures, customs and traditions, with their distinctive histories, including claims of divine involvement in their founding and growth.
Kant was not interested in participating in the public religious life of Königsburg. Even when he served as Rector of the University and was in that capacity expected to attend campus services, he was routinely “indisposed.” One might speculate that this reticence was due to his upbringing in the Pietist tradition, with its emphasis on quiet, personal devotion rather than public worship; or, it may be that he did not want to participate in the specific churches and chapels of his community, finding them too distant from the ideal religious institutions envisioned in Religion's Third and Fourth Parts.
What, however, is clear is that Kant did see the church as an important element in the moral development of humanity. Although in Part Three of Religion, he pines for a time when “religion will gradually be freed of all empirical grounds of determination, of all statutes that rest on history” (6:121), and “the pure faith of religion will rule over all” (6:121), he nevertheless recognizes that that time has not yet come. So, at least for now, the church is needed.
Moreover, the church plays a further role for Kant, for it offers a partial response to the problem of moral recidivism. As Kant explains at the opening of Part Three of Religion, even those who have gone through a “change of heart,” still carry their propensity to evil, which can be reactivated through the corrupting influence of other people. Reprising the unsocial sociability of his 1784 “Idea for a Universal History with a Cosmopolitan Aim,” Kant maintains that “human beings…mutually corrupt each other's moral disposition and make one another evil” (6:94).
Most of our social institutions promote competition and fuel our self-oriented interests. By contrast, the proper function of the church is to promote the “duty sui generis, not of human beings towards human beings, but of the human race towards itself” (6:97). It thus offers a counterpoint to our more worldly institutions and their promotion of our unsocial sociability. Through the church, individuals can mutually cooperate in a mutual end, and thus, ideally at least, can help bring people together in a way that does not activate the “malignant inclinations” of jealousy, schadenfreude, addiction to power, or greed.
While the above captures Kant's positive ecclesiology, he also devotes most of Part Four of Religion to critique. He there explains that just as we as individuals invert the proper order of incentives, giving priority to self-interest over morality, a parallel inversion also takes place in religious institutions. Ultimately driven by the same corrupting influences, a church can “totally reverse” the proper moral order between means and ends, making the former “unconditionally commanded,” elevating it “to the rank of saving faith” (6:165). That is, where rituals and symbols are suppose to serve as instruments through which individuals can grasp “the highest concepts and grounds of reason,” they can be distorted, and taken as themselves what is required for us to become “well-pleasing to God.”
Although Kant maintains that theoretical reason must keep a “respectful distance” from all claims of miracles and revelation, he nevertheless recognizes that most historical faiths regard God as active in history. Of course, this is not something that can be proven true or false, nor is it even something suitable for opining, given his technical understanding of this mode of assent. Nevertheless, in many works of the 1790s, he acknowledges the possibility of miracles and revelation, and seems quite willing to have them as part of church doctrine, though suitably calibrated to his epistemic strictures.
He writes, for example, that it would be “arrogant peremptorily to deny that the way a church is organized may perhaps also be a special divine dispensation” (6:105) and acknowledges that revelation “at a given time and a given place might be wise and very advantageous to the human race” (6:155). As noted above, he even accepts the possibility that the founding of Christianity was accompanied by various miracles (6:84). Hence, once one gives Religion its due significance within the corpus, it should be recognized that Kant is not only not an atheist or agnostic, but he is not even a Deist. While theoretical reason is agnostic, and pure rational faith likewise is neutral with regards to any particular historical claim, Kant is clearly open to divine agency in the world.
Kant, further, considers Providence in Religion, and presents history as an advance towards the “Kingdom of God on earth” (6:132). While practically speaking, we should never expect or depend upon divine aid in this advance, for each person should act as if “everything depended on him” (6:101), Kant nevertheless represents the Highest Good and the Ethical Community eschatologically, as “a work whose execution cannot be hoped for from human beings but only from God himself” (6:100). So, while we must never relieve ourselves of our moral efforts, as we remain responsible for our own moral transformation, this does not exclude divine aid in other respects. Through miracles and revelation, the founding of the Christian church, and so forth, Kant is open to God's agency in this world, giving us the tools we need to facilitate our individual and corporate moral endeavors.
Of course, this remains still far removed from Kant affirming as true any particular claim of divine aid. He accepts Providence as a vital part of historical faith. He recognizes the value of an openness, an acceptance that God may be active in history. He even sees the idea of Providence as helpful to our understanding of the Highest Good as the telos of creation. Providence thus gives us a “representation in a historical narrative… a beautiful ideal of the moral world-epoch brought about by the introduction of the true universal religion” (6:135). However, he repudiates those who push farther, treating our belief in miracles and revelation as essential or necessary to our salvation. He likewise, particularly in the “End of All Things,” opposes Chiliasm, for that presumes a knowledge of when the end time will arrive. Beyond what is more strictly bound up with the practical function of the postulate of immortality, we have no theoretical grounds to positively affirm any model of the life to come, or a timetable for “the transition from time into eternity” (8:327).
During his final years, Kant worked on a manuscript, left incomplete at his death, that has become known as the Opus Postumum. The manuscript contains sections in which Kant continues to explore the relationship between the concept of God and our consciousness of being moral agents, i.e., our consciousness that we can subject ourselves freely, through our acknowledgment of the categorical imperative, to the requirement of rightness in the choice of our actions. These reflections suggest that Kant may have been trying to draw a connection between the idea of God and the acknowledgment of the categorical imperative that is even more direct than that found in the moral argument. Such a connection would make the idea of God totally immanent within human moral consciousness (Förster, 2000). Given the fragmentary nature of the manuscript, it is difficult to reach a conclusive judgment on the content and significance of Kant's last reflections on God and religion.
We cite the English translations only.
A. Pre-critical writings
- A New Exposition of the First Principles of Metaphysical Knowledge. 1755. John A. Reuscher (trans.) In Lewis White Beck (ed.) 1986. Kant's Latin Writings: Translations, Commentaries and Notes. New York: Peter Lang, 57–109.
- Universal Natural History and Theory of the Heavens. 1755. Stanley L. Jaki (trans.). 1981. Edinburgh: Scottish Academic Press.
- The One Possible Basis for a Demonstration of the Existence of God. 1763. Gordon Treash (trans.) New York: Abaris.
B. Critical writings
The following texts focus most directly on religion. They are all found in Religion and Rational Theology, Wood, Allen W. and George Di Giovanni (trans. and ed.), 1996, Cambridge, Cambridge University Press:
- What Does It Mean to Orient Oneself in Thinking? 1785. Allen W. Wood (trans.), 7–18.
- On the Miscarriage of All Philosophical Trials in Theodicy. 1791. George Di Giovanni (trans.), 24–37.
- Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason. 1793. George Di Giovanni (trans.), 57–215.
- The End of All Things. 1794. Allen W. Wood (trans.), 221–31.
- The Conflict of the Faculties. 1798. Mary J. Gregor and Robert Anchor (trans.), 239–327.
- Lectures on the Philosophical Doctrine of Religion. 1817. Allen W. Wood (trans.), 341–451.
Other writings from the critical period relevant to Kant's view of God and religion:
- Critique of Pure Reason. 1781; 2nd edition 1787. Paul Guyer and Allen W. Wood (trans.) 1998. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Prolegomena to any Future Metaphysics That Will Be Able to Come Foward as a Science. 1783. Gary Hatfield (trans.). In Henry Allison and Peter Heath (ed.). 2002. Theoretical Philosophy after 1781. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 51–169.
- An Answer to the Question: What Is Enlightenment? 1784. Mary J. Gregor (trans.). In Mary J. Gregor (ed.). 1996. Practical Philosophy. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 17–22.
- Idea for A Universal History from a Cosmopolitan Point of View. 1784. Lewis White Beck (trans.). 1963, In Kant: On History. Lewis White Beck (ed.). Indianapolis and New York: Bobbs-Merrill, 11-26.
- Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals. 1785. Mary J. Gregor (trans.). In Mary J. Gregor (ed.). 1996. Practical Philosophy. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 43–108.
- The Conjectural Beginning of Human History. 1786. Emil L. Fackenheim (trans.). 1963, InKant: On History. Lewis White Beck (ed.). Indianapolis and New York: Bobbs-Merrill, 53-68.
- Critique of Practical Reason. 1788. Mary J. Gregor (trans.). In Mary J. Gregor (ed.). 1996.Practical Philosophy. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 139–271.
- Critique of the Power of Judgment. 1790. Paul Guyer and Eric Matthews (trans.). 2000. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Toward Perpetual Peace. 1795. Mary J. Gregor (trans.). In Mary J. Gregor (ed.). 1996.Practical Philosophy. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 317–51.
- The Metaphysics of Morals. 1797. Mary J. Gregor (trans.). In Mary J. Gregor (ed.). 1996.Practical Philosophy. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 365–603.
- Opus Postumum. Ekart Föster (ed.). 1993. Ekart Föster and Michael Rosen (trans.) Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
Works on Kant's pre-critical treatments of the concept of God
- Dell'Oro, Regina. 1994. From Existence to the Ideal: Continuity and Development in Kant's Theology. New York: Peter Lang.
- England, Frederick Ernest. 1930. Kant's Conception of God. New York: Dial Press.
- Laberge, Pierre. 1973. La Théologie Kantienne précritique. Ottawa: Éditions de l'Université d'Ottawa.
- Lehner, Ulrich L. 2007. Kants Vorsehungskonzept auf dem Hintergund der deutschen Schulphilosophie und-theologie. Leiden: Brill.
Kant's treatment of religion in his critical philosophy
- Adams, R. M., 1999. “Original Sin: A Study in the Interaction of Philosophy and Theology,” in The Question of Christian Philosophy Today, Francis J. Ambrosio (ed.), New York: Fordham University Press.
- –––, 1998. “Introduction,” in Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason and Other Writings, Allen W. Wood and George di Giovanni (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, vii-xxxii.
- Allison, H.E., 1990. Kant's Theory of Freedom, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- –––, 2002. “On the Very Idea of a Propensity to Evil”, The Journal of Value Inquiry, 36: 337-348.
- Anderson-Gold, Sharon, 2001. Unnecessary Evil: History and Moral Progress in the Philosophy of Immanuel Kant, Albany: State University of New York Press.
- Bauch, B., 1904. Luther und Kant, Berlin: Verlag.
- Beiser, Frederick C., 1987. The Fate of Reason: German Philosophy from Kant to Fichte, Cambridge, MA and London: Harvard University Press, Chapters 2–4, pp. 44–126.
- –––, 2006. “Moral Faith and the Highest Good,” The Cambridge Companion to Kant and Modern Philosophy, Paul Guyer (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 588–629.
- Bernstein, R., 2002. Radical Evil: A Philosophical Interrogation, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Bunch, A., 2010. “The Resurrection of the Body as a ‘Practical Postulate’: Why Kant is Committed to Belief in an Embodied Afterlife,” Philosophia Christi, 12 (1): 46-60.
- Byrne, Peter, 2007. Kant on God, Aldershot: Ashgate.
- Collins, James, 1967. The Emergence of Philosophy of Religion, New Haven: Yale University Press. Chapters 3–5, pp. 89–211.
- Davidovich, A., 1993. “Kant's Theological Constructivism,” Harvard Theological Review, 86 (3): 323-351.
- –––, 1994. Religion as a Province of Meaning: The Kantian Foundations of Modern Theology, Minneapolis: Fortress Press.
- Denis, L., 2005. “Autonomy and the Highest Good,” Kantian Review, 10: 33-59.
- Despland, Michel, 1973. Kant on History and Religion, Montreal: McGill-Queen's University Press.
- DiCenso, J., 2011. Kant, Religion, and Politics, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- –––, 2012. Kant's Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason: a Commentary, Cambridge” Cambridge University Press.
- Di Giovanni, George, 1996. “Translator's Introduction,” Religion and Rational Theology, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 41–54.
- Di Giovanni, G. and A. Wood, 1996. “Translator's Introduction,” Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Fackenheim, Emil L., 1996. The God Within: Kant, Schelling and Historicity, John Burbidge, (ed.), Toronto: University of Toronto Press, Chapters 1–2, 3–33.
- Firestone, C.L., and N. Jacobs, 2008. In Defense of Kant's Religion, Bloomington: Indiana University Press.
- Fischer, Norbert (ed.), 2004. Kants Metaphysik und Religionsphilosophie, Hamburg: Felix Meiner Verlag.
- Förster, Eckart, 2000. Kant's Final Synthesis: An Essay on the Opus Postumum, Cambridge, MA and London: Harvard University Press, Chapter Five, “The Subject as Person and the Idea of God,” 117–47.
- Gerrish, B., 2006. “Natural and Revealed Religion,” The Cambridge History of Eighteenth-Century Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 641-665.
- Greene, T. H., 1960. “The Historical Context and Religious Significance of Kant'sReligion,” Religion within the Limits of Reason Alone, Theodore M. Green and Hoyt H. Hudson (eds.), with a new essay by John R. Silber. New York: Harper and Row, ix-lxxviii.
- Guyer, P., 2000. Kant on Freedom, Law and Happiness, Cambridge, Cambridge University Press.
- –––, 2005. Kant's System of Nature and Freedom, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Hare, J.E., 1996. The Moral Gap: Kantian Ethics, Human Limits, and God's Assistance, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
- Höffe, Otfried, 1994. Immanuel Kant, Marshall Farrier (trans.), Albany: State University of New York Press. Part Four, “What May I Hope? — The Philosophy of History and Religion,” 193–209.
- Hunter, I., 2005. “Kant's Religion and Prussian Religious Policy,” Modern Intellectual History, 2 (1): 1-27.
- Insole, C., 2008. “The Irreducible Importance of Religious Hope in Kant's Conception of the Highest Good,” Philosophy, 83 (3): 333-351.
- –––, 2013. Kant and the Creation of Freedom, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Kain, P., 2005. “Interpreting Kant's Theory of Divine Commands,” Kantian Review, 9: 128-149.
- Kleingeld, Pauline, 2001. “Nature or Providence? On the Theoretical and Moral Importance of Kant's Philosophy of History,” American Catholic Philosophical Quarterly, 75: 201–19.
- Lestition, Steven, 1993. “Kant and the End of the Enlightenment in Prussia,” Journal of Modern History, 65 (1): 57–112.
- Mariña, Jacqueline, 1997. “Kant on Grace: A Reply to His Critics,” Religious Studies, 33: 379–400.
- Michalson, G. E., 1999. Kant and the Problem of God, Oxford: Blackwell.
- –––, 1990. Fallen Freedom: Kant on Evil and Moral Regeneration, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- –––, 1989. “Moral Regeneration and Divine Aid in Kant,” Religious Studies, 25 (3): 259-270.
- Morgan, S., 2005. “The Missing Formal Proof of Humanity's Radical Evil in Kant's Religion,” Philosophical Review, 114 (1): 63-114.
- Muchnik, P., 2009. Kant's Theory of Evil: An essay on the dangers of self-love and the aprioricity of history, Lanham: Lexington Books.
- Mulholland, Leslie A., 1991. “Freedom and Providence in Kant's Account of Religion: The Problem of Expiation,” In Rossi and Wreen, 1991, 77–102.
- Neiman, Susan, 1994. The Unity of Reason: Re-reading Kant, New York and Oxford: Oxford University Press. Chapter 4, “The Structure of Faith,” 145–184.
- –––, 2002. Evil in Modern Thought: An Alternative History of Philosophy, Princeton: Princeton University Press. Chapter 1,“Fire from Heaven,” 57–84; Chapter 4, “Homeless,” 314–328.
- O'Neill, Onora, 1997. Kant on Reason and Religion (The Tanner Lectures on Human Values, 1997), Grethe B. Patterson (ed.), Salt Lake City: University of Utah Press, 269–308.
- Palmquist, S., 2000. Kant's Critical Religion, Aldershot: Ashgate.
- –––, 2008. “Kant's Quasi-Transcendental Argument for a Necessary and Universal Evil Propensity in Human Nature,” The Southern Journal of Philosophy, 42 (2): 261-297.
- –––, 2009. “Does Kant Reduce Religion to Morality?,” Kant-Studien, 83 (2): 129-148.
- –––, 2010. “Kant's Ethics of Grace: Perspectival Solutions to the Moral Difficulties with Divine Assistance,” Journal of Region, 90 (4): 530-553.
- Pasternack, L., 2003. “The Ens Realissimum and Necessary Being in the Critique of Pure Reason,” Religious Studies, 38 (1): 467-474.
- –––, 2011. “The Development and Scope of Kantian Belief: The Highest Good, the Practical Postulates, and the Fact of Reason,” Kant-Studien, 102 (3): 290-315.
- –––, 2011. “Regulative Principles and the ‘Wise Author of Nature’,” Religious Studies, 47 (1): 411-429.
- –––, 2012. “Kant on the Debt of Sin,” Faith and Philosophy, 29 (1): 30-52.
- –––, 2014. Kant's Religion within the Boundaires of Mere Reason: an Interpretation and Defense, London: Routledge.
- Quinn, Philip L., 1986. “Christian Atonement and Kantian Justification,” Faith and Philosophy, 3 (4): 440–462.
- –––, 1990. “Saving Faith from Kant's Remarkable Antimony,” Faith and Philosophy, 7 (4): 418-433.
- Reath, A., 1988. “Two Conceptions of the Highest Good in Kant,” Journal of the History of Philosophy, 26 (4): 593-619.
- –––, 1989. “Kant's Theory of Moral Sensibility: Respect for the Moral Law and the Influence of Inclination,” Kant-Studien, 80: 284-302.
- Ricken, Friedo and François Marty (ed.), 1992. Kant über Religion, Stuttgart: Kohlhammer.
- Rossi, P. J., 2005. The Social Authority of Reason: Kant's Critique, Radical Evil, and the Destiny of Humankind, Albany: State University of New York Press.
- Rossi, Philip J. and Michael Wreen (ed.), 1991. Kant's Philosophy of Religion Reconsidered, Bloomington: Indiana University Press.
- Samet-Porat, I., 2007. “Satanic Motivations,” Journal of Value Inquiry, 41 (1): 77-94.
- Savage, Denis, 1991. “Kant's Rejection of Divine Revelation and His Theory of Radical Evil,” In Rossi and Wreen 1991, 54–76.
- Shade, P., 1995. “Does Kant's Ethics Imply Reincarnation?,” The Southern Journal of Philosophy, 33 (3): 347-360.
- Shell, S. M., 2007. “Kant and the Jewish Question,” Hebraic Political Studies, 2 (1): 101-136.
- Silber, John R., 1960. “The Ethical Significance of Kant's Religion,” Religion within the Limits of Reason Alone, Theodore M. Green and Hoyt H. Hudson (eds.), with a new essay by John R. Silber. New York: Harper and Row, lxxix-cxxxiv.
- –––, 1959. “The Contents of Kant's Ethical Thought,” Philosophical Quarterly, 9: 193-207.
- Sullivan, Roger J., 1989. Immanuel Kant's Moral Theory, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, Chapter 15, 212–229; Chapter 18, 261–75.
- Surprenant, C., 2008. “Kant's Postulate of the Immortality of the Soul,” International Philosophical Quarterly, 48 (1): 85-98.
- Sussman, D. G., 2001. The Idea of Humanity: Anthropology and Anthroponomy in Kant's Ethics, New York: Routledge.
- –––, 2009. “For Badness' Sake,” Journal of Philosophy, 106 (11): 613-628.
- Walsh, W. H., 1967. “Kant, Immanuel: Philosophy of Religion,” The Encyclopedia of Philosophy, Volume Four, Paul Edwards (ed.), New York: Macmillan Publishing Co. Inc. & The Free Press, 322.
- Wand, B., 1971. “Religious Concepts and Moral Theory: Luther and Kant,” Journal of the History of Philosophy, 9 (3): 329-348.
- Ward, Keith, 1972. The Development of Kant's View of Ethics, Oxford: Basil Blackwell, Chapters 5–6, 67–92, Chapters 9–10, 144–74.
- Wike, V. S., and R. L. Showler, 2010. “Kant's Concept of the Highest Good and the Archetype-Ectype Distinction,” Journal of Value Inquiry, 44: 521-533.
- Wolterstorff, N, 1991. “Conundrums in Kant's Rational Religion,” in Kant's Philosophy of Religion Reconsidered, P. J. Rossi and M. J. Wreen (eds.), Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 40–53.
- –––, 1998. “Is it Possible and Desirable for the Theologians to Recover from Kant?,” Modern Theology, 14 (1): 1-18.
- Wood, A. W., 2005. “Kant's History of Ethics,” Studies in the History of Ethics, [Available online http://www.historyofethics.org/062005/062005Wood.shtml].
- –––, 1999. Kant's Ethical Thought, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- –––, 1996a. “General Introduction,”Religion and Rational Theology, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, xi-xxiv.
- –––, 1996b. “Translator's Introduction” to What Does It Mean to Orient Oneself in Thinking, in Wood and Di Giovanni 1996, 3–6.
- –––, 1992. “Rational Theology, Moral Faith and Religion,” The Cambridge Companion to Kant, Paul Guyer (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 394–416.
- –––, 1991. “Kant's Deism,” in Kant's Philosophy of Religion Reconsidered, P. J. Rossi (ed.), Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1-21.
- –––, 1978. Kant's Rational Theology, Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
- –––, 1970. Kant's Moral Religion, Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
- Wood, Allen W. and George Di Giovanni (trans. and ed.), 1996. Religion and Rational Theology, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Yovel, Yirmiahu, 1989. Kant and the Philosophy of History, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
- Adams, Robert M., 1999. “Original Sin: A Study in the Interaction of Philosophy and Theology,” in The Question of Christian Philosophy Today, Frank J. Ambrosio (ed.), New York: Fordham University Press, 80–110.
- Barth, Karl, 1973. “Kant,” Chapter 11 in Protestant Theology in the Nineteenth Century: Its Background and History, Valley Forge: Judson Press, 266–312.
- Charlesworth, M. J., 1972. Philosophy of Religion: The Historic Approaches, New York: Herder and Herder, vii-xiv, 102-144.
- Collins, James, 1967. The Emergence of Philosophy of Religion, New Haven: Yale University Press, vii-xi, 350-422.
- Davidovich, Adina, 1993. Religion as a Province of Meaning. The Kantian Foundations of Modern Theology, Minneapolis: Augsburg Fortress.
- Di Giovanni, George, 2005. Freedom and Religion in Kant and his Immediate Successors: The Vocation of Humankind 1774–1800, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Dupré, Louis, 1977. A Dubious Heritage: Studies in the Philosophy of Religion After Kant, New York: Paulist, 1–5.
- –––, 2004. The Enlightenment and the Intellectual Culture of Modernity, New Haven and London: Yale University Press, 282–288.
- Firestone, Chris L. and Nathan Jacobs, 2008. In Defense of Kant's Religion, Bloomington: Indiana University Press.
- Firestone, Chris L. and Stephen Palmquist (ed.), 2006. Kant and the New Philosophy of Religion, Bloomington: Indiana University Press.
- Fischer, Norbert (ed.), 2005. Kant und der Katholizismus: Stationen einer wechselhaften Geschichte, Freiburg: Herder.
- Goldmann, Lucien, 1971. Immanuel Kant, London: NLB.
- Green, Ronald M., 1978. Religious Reason: The Rational and Moral Basis of Religious Belief, New York: Oxford.
- –––, 1988. Religion and Moral Reason: A New Method for Comparative Study, New York: Oxford.
- –––, 1992. Kierkegaard and Kant: The Hidden Debt, Albany: The State University of New York Press.
- Hare, John E., 1997. The Moral Gap: Kantian Ethics, Human Limits and God's Assistance, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- –––, 2001. God's Call: Moral Realism, God's Commands and Human Autonomy, Grand Rapids: Eerdmanns. Chapter 3, “Human Autonomy,” 87–119.
- Hartshorne, Charles, 1965. Anselm's Discovery: a Re-examination of the Ontological Proof for God's Existence, La Salle, IL: Open Court.
- –––, 1962. The Logic of Perfection, and Other Essays in Neoclassical Metaphysics, LaSalle, IL: Open Court.
- Hegel, Georg Wilhelm Friedrich, 1948. Early Theological Writings, T. M. Knox (trans.) Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 67–145.
- Hick, John and Arthur C. McGill (ed.), 1967. The Many-faced Argument; Recent Studies on the Ontological Argument for the Existence of God, New York: Macmillan.
- Malcolm, Norman, 1960. “Anselm's Ontological Arguments,” Philosophical Review, 69: 41–62.
- Maréchal, Joseph, 1944–1949. Le point de départ de la métaphysique: leçons sur le développement historique et théorique du problème de la connaissance, Bruxelles: L'Édition universelle; Paris: Desclée, De Brouwer.
- Mariña, Jacqueline, 1997. “Kant on Grace: A Reply to his Critics,” Religious Studies, 33: 379–400.
- Mercier, Désiré, 2002. “The Two Critiques of Kant,” in Cardinal Mercier's Philosophical Essays : a Study in Neo-thomism, David A. Boileau (ed.) Herent, Belgium: Peeters, 137–150.
- Murdoch, Iris, 1993. Metaphysics as a Guide to Morals, New York: Allen Lane/Penguin, pp. 391–449.
- Palmquist, Stephen, 2000. Kant's Critical Religion, Aldershot: Ashgate.
- Plantinga, Alvin, 1965. The Ontological Argument, from St. Anselm to Contemporary Philosophers, Garden City, NY: Anchor Books.
- Rossi, Philip J., 2005. “Reading Kant Through Theological Specatcles,” in Kant and the New Philosophy of Religion, Chris L. Firestone and Stephen Palmquist(ed.) Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 107–123.
- Schaeffler, Richard, 1979. Was dürfen wir hoffen?: die katholische Theologie der Hoffnung zwischen Blochs utopischem Denken und der reformatorischen Rechtfertigungslehre, Darmstadt: Wissenschaftliche Buchgesellschaft.
- Westphal, Merold, 1997. “The Emergence of Modern Philosophy of Religion,” in A Companion to Philosophy of Religion, Philip L. Quinn and Charles Taliferro (eds.), Malden, MA and Cambridge: Blackwell, 111–117.
- Yandell, Keith E., 2007. “Who Is the True Kant?” Philosophia Christi, 9: 81–97.
How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up this entry topic at the Indiana Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.