Modern Confucianism

First published Mon Dec 11, 2023

Modern or contemporary Confucianism refers to developments in Confucian thought from the early twentieth century to the present. It is frequently referred to as New Confucianism, though this term is sometimes used more narrowly (for more, see below). It can also create some confusion with the term Neo-Confucianism, which typically means Song-Ming Confucianism. All these terms—modern Confucianism, contemporary Confucianism, and New Confucianism—are used to translate the common Chinese terms for this period, dangdai xin ruxue 當代新儒學 or xiandai xin rujia 現代新儒家. A growing number of scholars use “Ruism” instead of “Confucianism”, as it is closer to the Chinese terms. However, Confucianism remains the more familiar English term.

Modern Confucianism is often called the third major era of Confucian thought (MZCW 9a: 1–17; Tu 1993: 141–59). The first classical period was from around 500 BCE to the first or second century CE, and the second wave was the Song-Ming period. The defining characteristics of modern Confucianism are, as the name implies, a concern with modernity and what that should mean for Chinese culture, and significant engagement with Western philosophy, primarily European Enlightenment and post-Enlightenment thought (Rošker 2016; Tan 2009; Van den Stock 2016). Modern Confucian thinkers merged historical analysis with novel interpretations and theories for adapting Confucian thought to a vastly different world. This entry will sketch the historical background of modern Confucianism and introduce the major figures included, then go on to examine their views on modernity and tradition, knowledge, human nature, and politics.

1. Background and Scope

The Opium Wars (1839–1842 and 1856–1860), in which China suffered defeat at the hands of Britain and France, marked the beginning of greater interest in Western knowledge, initially to catch up to their superior military technology. Toward the latter part of the nineteenth century, Chinese reformers began to look deeper into the scientific and technological advantages of the Western countries, becoming convinced that their political and economic systems laid the groundwork for them. Yan Fu was influential in translating scientific, economic, and philosophical works into Chinese. Interest in Western knowledge led to sending students overseas to study, and eventually the establishment of universities in China. The major figures of contemporary Confucianism were part of this educational reform, either teaching or studying at universities established on the European model, which no Confucian philosopher had before. Modern Confucianism is characterized in part by this transformation into an academic field.

In the early twentieth century, Chinese scholars began to publish their own histories of Chinese philosophy and analyses of Chinese culture, which may be considered the initial works of contemporary Confucianism. Some of the significant milestones were Liang Shuming’s Eastern and Western Cultures and Their Philosophies (1921) and Feng Youlan’s History of Chinese Philosophy (1931 and 1934). Xiong Shili’s New Treatise on the Uniqueness of Consciousness (1932) is sometimes considered the first work of modern Confucianism proper.

The great interest in Western knowledge in China was often accompanied by a degree of disdain for tradition, and there was a camp that felt that all of traditional Chinese culture was an impediment to modernization and should be discarded. Modern Confucianism developed in response to this, defending the value of Chinese tradition, Confucianism especially, and arguing that it can support modernization rather than obstruct it (Van den Stock 2016: 143; Yao 2000: 268–73). In particular, it can accommodate science and democracy, which many in China had latched onto as the roots of Western dominance. Modern Confucianism is thus somewhat conservative, as it is inherently a defense of aspects of Chinese tradition, but also recognizes the need for adaptation and evolution.

This entry focuses on a group of scholars who exemplify these features and developed the most influential Confucian philosophies of the twentieth century: Xiong Shili 熊十力 (1885–1968) and his followers Mou Zongsan 牟宗三 (1909–1995), Tang Junyi 唐君毅 (1909–1978), and Xu Fuguan 徐復觀 (1903–1982). The latter three (along with Zhang Junmai) were involved in writing what has become known as the New Confucian Manifesto. Originally drafted by Tang with comments from the others, this document is retrospectively identified as a watershed in modern Confucian thought (Makeham 2003a: 27–29; Solé-Farràs 2014). They are often called disciples of Xiong (Ng Yu-kwan 2003: 219), but that is a little misleading. Mou and Tang attended classes with Xiong while students, and Mou does call Xiong his teacher while also not shying from critical judgment of Xiong’s philosophy (Mou 1991 [2014: 47–48]). Tang admitted he didn’t understand Xiong very well and chose not to follow him closely (TJCW 26: 2.363; Fröhlich 2017: 36–37). At one point, he said his teacher was Fang Dongmei, not Xiong (Chiu 2016: 5, 15). Xu met Xiong much later in life during WWII when he was an army officer. None followed Xiong very precisely in their scholarship, as Xiong himself said (TJCW 26: 2.362). They were inspired by his character and sense of cultural mission more than they adhered to his ideas or methods.

What they did share with Xiong is a strong preference for the Wang Yangming wing of Confucian thought, a focus on intuitive and experiential moral knowledge, and the belief that firm moral values are critical for the health of a culture (N. S. Chan 2011: 25–64). New Confucianism specifically usually refers to this group and their followers. They identify as defenders of Chinese thought and culture, especially as Confucians. They are concerned with the relevance of Chinese thought when the institutions and cultural circumstances that supported it no longer existed. While differing in numerous respects that will become clear throughout the entry, they had enough in common to constitute an identifiable group. Their historical work on Chinese philosophy, significant as it is, will not be a major focus. Rather, this entry will emphasize their distinct projects relating to the ideas of Confucian and Chinese modernity, and what they believed Chinese philosophy could contribute to world philosophy.

Xiong Shili was born into a poor family in rural Hubei. His parents died when he was young, leaving little opportunity for formal schooling. He joined in various revolutionary activities in his twenties, but in the years after the 1911 Revolution, abandoned political action and turned to study. In 1920 Xiong went to study Yogacara Buddhism at the China Institute for Inner Learning. Two years later, he was invited by Cai Yuanpei to teach at Beijing University. There he initially taught Yogacara thought, but gradually became dissatisfied with aspects of it. He began to make a critique of traditional Yogacara, moving toward a form blended with more Confucian elements that he published in 1932 as New Treatise on the Uniqueness of Consciousness. This was a seminal event and made Xiong’s reputation. While he published other works, it remains what he is best known for. Xiong suffered from poor health for much of his life, often taking extended leaves from teaching. Already in his sixties at the time of the Communist revolution in 1949, he chose to remain in China. He suffered from attacks during the Cultural Revolution and died in Shanghai in 1968 at the age of 84.

Mou Zongsan was born in rural Shandong province in 1909. In 1927, he moved to Beijing, enrolling at Beijing University. After finishing his degree in philosophy, he moved around China, struggling to support himself and his family in a series of editing and teaching posts. In 1949, Mou fled to Taiwan, where he began to reflect on how the history of China had led to the failure of democracy and subsequent Communist takeover, and articulating a Confucian theory of democracy. He later had to move to Hong Kong, where he produced one of his major works, the three-volume Heart-mind and Human Nature as Reality (1968–69). His last philosophical phase was a sustained engagement with Kant in which he attempts to show that Kant’s philosophical project was doomed and could only be reconstructed and realized through Chinese philosophy (Mou 1991 [2014: 56]). His goal was to give morality a stable foundation by demonstrating the reality of the free autonomous will. In addition to translating Kant’s three Critiques, he wrote Intellectual Intuition and Chinese Philosophy (1971), Appearances and Things in Themselves (1975), and On the Highest Good (1985). These made him widely acclaimed as the greatest Chinese philosopher of the twentieth century. Mou died in Taiwan in 1995.

Tang Junyi was born in Sichuan province in 1909. He studied philosophy initially at Beijing University, then National Southeast University (subsequently National Central University), graduating in 1932. Like Mou Zongsan, he moved around frequently during the war with Japan and subsequent Chinese civil war, also choosing to leave in 1949 when he went to Hong Kong, where he remained until the end of his life in 1978. He became one of the founders of New Asia College, one of the first Chinese-language institutes of higher education in the British colony. Tang was also extraordinarily prolific, writing extensively on the moral self, Chinese and Western cultures, the history of Chinese philosophy, knowledge, ethics, metaphysics, and political thought. His regular themes were articulating the essential connections between individuals and between the mind and world that are the basis for existence, human nature and morality, and knowledge. Among his most frequently cited works are Cultural Consciousness and Moral Reason (1958), his multi-volume Origins of Chinese Philosophy (1966–1973), and his last book, the two-volume Life Existence and the Horizons of Mind (1977).

Also born into a rural family, in Hubei province (the native place of Xiong Shili) in 1903, Xu Fuguan followed a very different path than his slightly younger contemporaries Mou and Tang. After finishing school in China, he joined the Nationalist army for a stable income. He went to Japan in 1928 to study economics, but had to return to China after a year due to financial difficulties. He went back to Japan in 1930 to attend army officers’ school, leaving in 1931 after the Japanese invasion of Manchuria. He spent the next fifteen years as an army officer, rising to the rank of general and for a time serving as the personal aide to President Jiang Jieshi (Chiang Kai-shek), retiring in 1946. He too fled China in 1949 and settled in Taiwan to pursue a second career as a teacher. Xu eventually took a position in the Chinese department at the newly established Donghai (Tunghai) University, and wrote extensively on Chinese intellectual history, culture, literature, and art. He is perhaps best known for A History of Chinese Theories of Human Nature (1963), its sequel Intellectual History of the Two Han Dynasties (1975–76), and The Spirit of Chinese Art (1966), along with several collections of essays on intellectual history, culture, and politics. He was forced out of his teaching job in 1969 due to criticisms of the government and had to move to Hong Kong. Although he did not reside in Taiwan again, he died there in 1982.

2. Modernity and Tradition

The questions of how China should approach modernization and what remains valuable in Chinese tradition were crucial ones for modern Confucian philosophers. All of them lived through massive upheavals in their world: the fall of the imperial government, the failure of the first Republican government, the Japanese invasion, and the Communist takeover of China. The worlds of their formative and later years were wildly different. Attacks on traditional culture increased over the early twentieth century, spearheaded by intellectuals such as Chen Duxiu (a founder of the Chinese Communist Party) and Hu Shi (Republic of China ambassador to the US and an influential figure in Chinese liberalism). All of these four figures address to some extent the question of how to modernize while preserving the valuable features of Chinese traditions, and further, to justify the positive aspects of modernity through autochthonic values (Marchal 2016: 221; Schmidt 2011: 275–83). They were also strongly critical of aspects of Western culture, which they tended to identify with modernity.

The relatively greater success of Japan to modernize while the Chinese revolution failed to produce a stable government or a strong state led to serious reflection. Mou, Tang, and Xu all wrote on where things went wrong, and why Chinese culture had failed to develop some of the key features of modernity such as science and democracy. They were great admirers of these achievements, as well as other aspects of modern life such as specialized academic fields, equality and human rights, and greater individual freedoms. At the same time, they did not endorse all of Western modernity. They understandably condemned imperialism and colonialism (even as all three resided at times in the British colony of Hong Kong), and they found modern Western culture spiritually and morally lacking. While attempting to understand where Chinese culture had gone wrong, they also diagnosed what they saw as the ills of Western culture (which they often discussed without much regard to the distinctions between different nations or cultures).

2.1 Cultural Differences

The common analysis was that Western culture excelled in knowledge, analysis, and the employment of reason, tendencies inherited from ancient Greek philosophy. Mou Zongsan put it this way: Western culture was defined by the “analytic spirit of the fulfillment of reason”, by which he meant the tendency toward abstraction, the search for underlying concepts and general laws, and separating the subject and object of investigation (MZCW 9b: 194–96). He also calls the Western mode of thought “the constructive presentation of reason”, because of its focus on constructing consistent practices, institutions, and structures (democratic bodies, scientific institutes) which are assessed on procedural grounds (following democratic practice or adhering to the scientific method and standards of evidence) rather than directly on whether their results are good for the society (MZCW 10: 54–61). Chinese culture lacked this focus on objectivity and structures, which impeded developing these modern institutions.

Xu Fuguan analyzed Chinese and Western cultures in very similar ways. Although recognizing the vast gulf between ancient Greece and modern Europe and America, he saw the Greek focus on knowledge as the key feature of the modern Western mind. Greek investigation took nature as its primary object, and in ancient Greek society,

they still felt the most capable, most useful, and most successful person was the “knower”…. For the Greeks, knowledge was beauty and truth. (Xu 1952 [2022: 99])

The major difference between the ancients and moderns was that in Greece, the ancients pursued knowledge simply for education, while

moderns use it to pursue power. Francis Bacon said, “Knowledge is power”. This one sentence lays bare the spiritual core of modern Western culture. (Xu 1952 [2022: 100])

In China, learning was not fundamentally about knowledge, but for the purpose of improving moral practice. Even moral philosophy was not about perfecting moral theory, but realizing morality in one’s actions (Xu 1952 [2022: 104]). With its focus on improving moral life, knowledge that did not have an obvious relation to moral practice was slighted and so the kind of value-neutral, disinterested investigation of nature that led to science did not develop in China.

2.2 Chinese Humanistic Culture and Western Materialist Culture

Tang Junyi was the most preoccupied with cultural questions and carried out the most thorough analysis of the cultural differences between China and the West, though even he was not immune from simplifying “the West” into one. His views on the starting points of Chinese and Greek philosophy are very similar, but he was more thoughtful about what constitutes culture and why an understanding of culture is important. Culture is what separate humans from other animals. He writes,

Culture is the manifestation or creation of human spiritual activity…. By spiritual activity, I mean activity which is led by a self-conscious ideal or purpose, and which self-consciously seeks to realize this ideal or purpose. (TJCW 12: 1)

Animals have awareness and perhaps form concepts, but do not self-consciously guide their behavior in order to realize particular ideals in the world: this is uniquely human (TJCW 12: 379). This is precisely what Tang means by spirit and spiritual activity:

What makes spirit become spirit is that the mind must self-consciously affirm or uphold an ideal, and make realizing this ideal and value its aspiration. (TJCW 12: 3)

Various cultural practices and institutions, which for Tang encompasses everything from the family to the economy, art, the sciences, and more, are products of action to realize some ideal (Tan 2009: 548). Chinese culture is the result of attempts to realize Chinese ideals.

A conclusion he draws from this, that he never makes fully explicit, is that we can use this concept as a standard to evaluate at least certain aspects of a culture. A culture may fail to realize its ideals or pursue them through inefficient means. It might have conflicting ideals which cannot be simultaneously realized. More controversially, Tang believes we can evaluate the ideals themselves according to whether they are reasonable or not. One aspect of this is logical consistency, but it also includes cohering with human nature and the judgments of moral intuition (liangzhi 良知) (Fröhlich 2017: 143). Ideals that are not reflective of human nature will not lead to a good culture even if realized fully. Mou and Xu would certainly agree. While all found much to admire in modern Western culture, they were also strongly critical of excessive individualism, social alienation, undue focus on satisfying desires, and attenuated moral and spiritual life. While others in China at the time favored complete Westernization to sweep away the old culture, they were convinced that this would be a mistake (Rošker 2016: 110). What they wanted were the aspects of modernity that would better realize traditional Chinese ideals.

Tang Junyi’s examination of Western culture illustrates these criticisms in more detail. Since culture is a human creation, the spirit underlying all culture (wenhua 文化) is the humanistic (renwen 人文) spirit (TJCW 11: 1). True humanism for Tang affirms and respects the existence and value of human nature, personality, human relationships, culture, and history (TJCW 11: 2). Western culture excelled at non-humanism (science and mathematics) and trans-humanism (religion), but not humanism (TJCW 11: 25). Western humanism ended up turning to either God or nature and failed to affirm properly the existence of the virtuous person. It either treated people as objects to be investigated like other parts of nature (as in science) or as essentially flawed products of original sin. It was always caught between science and religion (TJCW 11: 63). It failed to put the person as subject first. The basis of humanism has to be the value of the individual, and the unlimited value of the individual and basis for the ultimate dignity of individual is the moral mind inherent in everyone (TJCW 11: 185). This is precisely the strength of Chinese humanism, and why Chinese culture must be the basis of a healthy humanistic tradition.

Tang was critical of monotheistic religions (Christianity in particular) for being overly focused on the transcendent and not enough on this world, but the modern world is even worse because it disregards the transcendent aspect of humanity entirely. Tang credited Christianity with recognizing the absolute significance and highest dignity of the person, which made it the origin of modern Western humanism (TJCW 11: 34–35). However, religion centered on a transcendent god cannot be a stable foundation for humanism. Christianity does not affirm the ultimate value of the person. What has ultimate value is God, the creator of the person, not the person, and the person can never become God (TJCW 26: 2.201, 265). As a result Christianity did not sufficiently affirm the value of the person or action in this world, instead seeking transcendence. Still, it affirmed the importance of morality and spirituality in a way that was lost in the transition to modernity.

Modern Western culture has the opposite problem, treating people as objects of study and losing the importance of the subject and spiritual aspect of humanity. In Tang’s scheme, a life that recognizes the moral and spiritual qualities of human beings and the world, recognizing that these have a transcendent aspect beyond the material, is on a higher level than one that focuses only on the material world (Chiu 2016: 133).[1] And that turn away from the higher level of transcendence toward the sensible is precisely what happened during the modern period, in his view (Metzger 2005: 248–51; Van den Stock 2021: 233). Enlightenment developments in mathematics and science treated the world as an object for study and increasingly such study was abstracted in general laws and mathematical formulas. The British empirical tradition strongly emphasized that sensory experience is the foundation of all knowledge. Art and literature turned from spiritual to worldly themes as well. This focus on the sensible led to utilitarianism, which focused on satisfying felt desires, and the development of modern economics which treats people as independent individuals pursuing their personal preferences (TJCW 26: 2.345–46). Individualism emphasized uniqueness of personality, not common humanity (Metzger 1977: 42–45). This reduced people to animals who just follow their desires (TJCW 9: 328–29; Fröhlich 2017: 83–84). The dignity of being human was lost, and that is the fundamental cause of cultural problems. Morality needs to be built on spiritual value, not instrumental or utilitarian value (Chiu 2023: 4–5; Van den Stock 2016: 253). This is why preserving Chinese culture is critical, because it properly recognizes the inner spiritual value of humanity.

The distaste for utilitarianism and treating desires as central is common in modern Confucianism, as is the belief that the strength of Chinese culture is that it recognizes that people have values beyond desire satisfaction. Xu Fuguan said that Western utilitarian individualism has nothing to do with Chinese culture (Xu 1952 [2022: 133]). The distinctive feature of Chinese culture is valuing the heart-mind which is distinct from and above desires (Xu 1953 [2022: 174–76]). Mou Zongsan similarly distinguished moral values from desires based on biology, which are fundamentally different categories (MZCW 22: 5–6). Xiong Shili did not discuss utilitarianism in any detail, but like Tang, condemned treating people as objects for study and making objective analysis the basis for all knowledge (Xiong 1932 [2015: 181–82]). Chinese culture correctly emphasized seeking wisdom in oneself and one’s fundamental nature. This is the wisdom worth having (Xiong 1932 [2015: 298–99]). The common thread is that while modern Western culture (“modern” and “Western” are virtually synonyms in this discourse) (Rošker 2016: 16) has great achievements worth learning from, morally it is completely deficient. They have been aptly called cultural nationalists because of their commitment to certain Chinese cultural values, inspired by Xiong Shili (N. S. Chan 2011: 65–94; Fröhlich 2017: 85–86; Xu 1980b). The strength of Chinese culture, and why it must be preserved and indeed spread, is that it values the person correctly, as a subject with ultimate value. Modernity can help realize this value by improving people’s material lives, but the humanistic values must be preserved.

3. Knowledge

Modern Confucian epistemic thought typically divides knowledge into two broad kinds: knowledge of the world or things and knowledge of morality or the person. This is often discussed in terms from Song-Ming Confucianism, knowledge from seeing and hearing (jianwen zhi zhi 見聞之知) and knowledge of the virtuous nature (dexing zhi zhi 德性之知). Each of the philosophers examined here approaches this distinction in a slightly different way, while sharing the insistence that morality and values cannot be approached objectively and empirically, but are still realities that can be known. They admired the achievements of science in increasing knowledge about the world, but held that science could not be the route to understand morality (Rošker 2016: 101). However, this does not mean there are no moral truths or that human beings cannot grasp them: relativism or skepticism were never seriously entertained. It means that moral knowledge has to be understood in a different way. A common philosophical problem is interpreting and defending the Confucian way of acquiring moral knowledge, especially the intuitive approach of Wang Yangming.

Xiong Shili established the basic distinction which Mou, Tang, and Xu followed. In Xiong’s thought, wisdom (zhi 智) is the cognition of fundamental reality, which he also identifies as the true mind. Discernment (hui 慧) is cognition of mundane things and what is ordinarily called knowledge. Wisdom is non-dual, without separation of self and other (Xiong 1932 [2015: 21–22]). He also employed the terms “derivative knowledge” and “direct knowledge” (Guo 2021: 100–103). Throughout the New Treatise, Xiong emphasizes the interdependence and unity of the mind and cognitive objects, and the importance of wisdom over discernment. Knowledge (discernment) is useful for navigating the world of phenomena, but useless for understanding fundamental reality, which has to be sought within one’s own mind (Xiong 1932 [2015: 25–26]; Ng Yu-kwan 2003: 231; Tan 2009: 544). Treating it as an object will get nowhere:

The absolute [quality] of principle does not belong to the realm of the conceivable. It can be known only through internal self-realization. (Xiong 1932 [2015: 159])

This focus on the internal and knowing in a non-conceptual manner was picked up by each of his followers.

3.1 Moral Knowing and Cognitive Knowing

Xu Fuguan called this direct awareness embodied recognition (tiren 體認), a term employed by Xiong that goes back to Wang Yangming. It is a direct, irrefutable feeling, which Xu identifies with the basic moral feelings described by Mengzi. It has nothing to do with science:

The development of contemporary science is unable to deny the Chinese culture of the heart-mind. This is because the question is not whether this function is located in the heart[2] or the brain, but rather whether the function described in Chinese culture exists in the physiology of humanity. That is, whether there are the functions described by Mengzi: the feelings of alarm and compassion, shame and dislike, approval and disapproval, declining and yielding, and so on. If this kind of function does not exist in life, then there is nothing more to say. If, on the other hand, we can have embodied recognition of the feelings of alarm and compassion, shame and dislike, approval and disapproval, declining and yielding, then this proves that there is some part of our body that possesses this function.

It is just like how some people believe contemporary psychology cannot confirm the activity of the soul described in literature. But if the activity of the soul cannot be confirmed by doing psychology experiments, then this is a problem with psychology itself. The key is whether there is this activity of the soul in people’s lives. (Xu 1953 [2022: 168])

The reality of the experienced feeling is enough for Xu. If science cannot confirm it or explain it, that is a problem with science, not evidence that the feelings are not real.

Xu distinguishes the moral nature and the cognitive nature of the heart-mind. The moral nature (dexing 德性) is constituted by the four basic moral responses described by Mengzi. The cognitive nature (zhixing 知性) of the heart-mind is important, but it belongs to a fundamentally distinct category and cannot generate moral responses. The cognitive nature generates knowledge of the external world, but accumulating facts cannot by itself elicit a moral response (Xu 1963 [1990, 240]). While Xu remains a realist about value, he agrees that values are a different sort of thing than facts about the world. Which is not to say that knowledge is not important or should be neglected. Knowledge plays two critical roles in Xu’s thought. The first is to “clarify the object of morality”; the second is to “provide rational means for [realizing] morality” (Xu 1963 [1990: 287]). The second role is the function of instrumental reason. Greater knowledge of the world means a better chance of selecting the right means that will lead to successful action and not violating one’s good intentions inadvertently. The first function is a little murkier as Xu did not give a clear example of what he meant. An illustration might be Mengzi 1A7, where King Xuan is humane to the ox that he saves from being sacrificed, but not to his people. The king’s humaneness is misplaced: he is concerned about the ox’s suffering but not about his people’s. It is not that he used the wrong means, but that he is mistaken about what merits his compassion. Knowledge can rectify this type of misconception. Knowledge is still instrumental, as what has intrinsic value is moral practice, not knowledge in itself.

3.2 Knowledge through Affective Connection

Tang Junyi’s views on knowledge and cognition are complex. His last book, Life Existence and the Horizons of Mind, is an attempt to classify all possible ways of cognizing the world into nine broad horizons (on “horizon” see Wu 2002). A full examination of these is not possible here (see Van den Stock 2021), but we can identify some key themes. Like Xiong and Xu, Tang distinguished different kinds of knowledge. Moral knowledge, knowledge of the virtuous nature in Confucianism, is self-awareness of the humane (ren 仁) heart-mind and nature, which must spontaneously come from oneself. Empirical knowledge, knowledge from seeing and hearing, is knowledge of the phenomenal world learned from external study. This empirical knowledge is useful, and its development is where Western culture excelled, but it must be controlled by moral knowledge, not the other way around.

This knowledge of the virtuous nature, which illuminates the internal, is knowledge of persons’ existence in themselves. People absolutely cannot have knowledge of the virtuous nature through knowledge of society or nature, which illuminates the external. (TJCW 11: 65–66)

In his schema of nine horizons, science for the most part is placed in the third horizon of functioning in order, which cognizes cause-effect relations (TJCW 25: 1.29). Broadly construed, it could also include logic and mathematics, which Tang places in the fifth horizon of detached observation because they focus on pure connections of thought (TJCW 25: 1.30–31). Both are lower than the horizon of moral practice (the sixth). Detached observation is about observing and understanding, not changing things, and remaining here is morally repugnant for Tang: we must go onto the horizon of morality which attempts to realize ideals in the world to improve it (TJCW 25: 1.445–46). This is another way of expressing that morality is on a higher level than scientific knowledge.

The concept of affective connection (gantong 感通) occupies a central role in Tang’s thought. The Chinese term combines the words for “to stimulate or affect” (gan) and “to connect or be connected”, with the further sense of lacking impediment or obstruction (tong). “Affective” must be understood in this sense: not necessarily related to feelings, but more simply one thing affecting another. Tang defines it thusly:

This affective connection itself is [the heart-mind] directly meeting with the objects of a cognitive horizon, and directly being aware of and observing them. (TJCW 26: 2.235)

Critically, this is connection to a wider objective reality, not merely a subjective awareness (Metzger 1977: 35). Affective connection is, among other things, the essential capacity of the heart-mind to cognize and interact with any other existent. One implication Tang wants to draw from this is that that mind and world are essentially connected and interdependent (TJCW 25: 1.3–4; Tan 2009: 547). Human life is constituted by connecting with and cognizing other existents, including other people (further discussed in the section on human nature). Through cognizing other objects, we also become aware of the subject, and eventually to what Tang calls the trans-subjective/objective horizons (the last three). Understanding the subject cannot be done objectively: it must be approached through personal experience and realization of the lived existence of the subject (TJCW 26: 2.318).

3.3 The Reality of Intellectual Intuition and Free Will

Mou Zongsan held similar views on the limits of science (MZCW 22: 50), but as that topic was covered already, here the focus is Mou’s justification of knowledge of the free will. His later philosophy focused on demonstrating the reality of autonomy and morality, which he felt Kant failed to do (Schmidt 2011). For Kant, because knowledge is limited to the world of appearances, free will remains something beyond the bounds of human knowledge. Freedom remains a postulate, or a mere idea, but can never be known (Kant 1785 [1997: 63], 4:459). Mou criticized Kant for precisely this point and argued that Chinese philosophy could provide what Kant could not: knowledge of free will.

According to Mou, Confucian philosophers also wanted to establish the a priori conditions of morality. As in Kant, this a priori condition is freedom or autonomy (MZCW 5: 1.11; Lee 2017: 15). Mou concedes that theoretical knowledge of the free will is not possible; however, he criticizes Kant for not understanding that the truth of the free will has to be grasped and known practically rather than theoretically. This is what Confucianism achieved, and how it confirms that the free, autonomous will is a reality and not merely a postulate: it is realized and verified through moral activity in the world.

Autonomy for Mou requires independence from interests, inclinations, and external control. Morality has to be founded on a principle that the will gives to itself. A will that is decided or controlled by anything external is not a free, autonomous will (MZCW 5: 1.136). Free will cannot be an effect brought about by something else; it can only be a cause (MZCW 20: 247). In addition, he writes,

If it requires a lower interest from something external to stimulate it, then it is not the fundamental heart-mind; it is not the true, autonomous will that gives the law to itself. (MZCW 5: 1.171)

Morality requires the will to determine itself, free from the influence, control, or stimulation of an external object.

This describes autonomy, but is not an argument for it; for that, we have to look elsewhere. One way Mou argues for the reality of autonomy can be sketched out like this:

  1. Autonomy is necessary for morality to be possible.
  2. Morality is a reality
  3. Therefore, autonomy is a reality

Mou turns around Kant’s argument that because we cannot know that we are free, we cannot know that morality is real. We know that morality is real, and therefore we know that autonomy is real (see Fung 2021: 617–18; Schmidt 2011: 265). After discussing why the fundamental heart-mind has to be unlimited in order for morality to be possible, Mou gives a theoretical account of intellectual intuition (non-sensible intuition of the autonomous self) and says,

Intellectual intuition must not only be affirmed theoretically, it must emerge in reality…. When we speak of the fundamental heart-mind, it is as a concrete presence, such as the feelings of alarm and compassion or shame and disgust that emerge at any time as Mengzi spoke about. When it sees one’s father it naturally knows filiality; when it sees one’s older brother it naturally knows brotherly respect (these are not biological instincts, but the fundamental heart-mind). When it should feel alarm and compassion, it feels alarm and compassion. When it should feel shame and dislike, it feels shame and dislike, and so on. (MZCW 20: 249)

These moral responses are real presences, and they require the fundamental heart-mind (one of the terms Mou uses for self as a thing in itself, not appearance) to be possible. Kant only approached morality theoretically, but Chinese philosophy makes practical knowledge of morality possible (Billioud 2012: 79–81; Tan 2009: 559). Morality is a fact because we feel it: the moral responses are a definite presence which cannot be denied.

As knowledge through understanding requires sensible intuition, intellectual knowledge requires intellectual intuition: intuition of things in themselves and not mere appearances. Kant attributed intellectual intuition only to God, denying that humans had that capacity (Bunnin 2008; N. S. Chan 2011: 142). For Mou, humans have intellectual intuition of a limited sort, and that is how knowledge of the true self (also called fundamental heart-mind or nature in itself, not different from the creative power of the universe) is possible (Billioud 2012: 75–76). Intellectual intuition is non-discursive, direct knowledge of the self unmediated by the categories of the understanding (MZCW 10: 204). Thus, the content of the intuition itself cannot be put into words, but he does say it is intuition of the fundamental heart-mind and humaneness in itself (MZCW 10: 249–50). A moment of awareness of what is morally right is an instance of intellectual intuition. It is in the process of moral response that the fundamental mind intuits itself, and the mind becomes aware of its own infinite moral responsiveness.

Mou here brings together these themes: distinguishing theoretical and practical knowledge, and insisting that practical (moral) knowledge has to be approached in an experiential, intuitive way that focuses on uncovering the true self. He calls these intensional truths, in that they are subject-dependent, unlike extensional truths (MZCW 29: 19–27; Rošker 2016: 118). This approach of course raises questions. One problem with this intuitive method is that it can hardly avoid reflecting culturally learned responses and may take them to be a priori and necessary, believing them to be representative of human nature as a whole. Tang Junyi, for example, insists,

Filiality should be constructed on moral reason, and this means that it has absolute significance. This is to say that I should be filial even if my parents do not love me. (TJCW 12: 43)

People from other cultures might dispute that strongly. Mou also does not explain how to distinguish true intellectual intuition from what may feel like intellectual intuition, but not intuit its object correctly (Fung 2021: 616). Furthermore, his argument relies on accepting the Kantian view of morality that requires autonomy. If one does not accept that premise, this argument does not persuade.

4. Human Nature and the Person

Modern Confucianism has been strongly influenced by Western philosophy. It is therefore not surprising that many modern Confucian philosophical problems can fit tidily in the typical Western philosophy categories. Their concept of the person, however, does not. Their discourses on the person range across metaphysics, philosophy of mind, epistemology, and metaethics. The previous section demonstrated how their views on knowledge center around defending knowledge of value. Here we get deeper into questions of what defines human beings, what reason means, the source of value, how we know ethical action is possible, and more.

Before looking at the modern Confucians themselves, a few words about why this issue is so central would be useful. The question of human nature has a long history in Chinese philosophy, and as self-conscious inheritors of this tradition, modern Confucians wanted to relate their views to major figures of the past, especially the classical thinkers Kongzi (Confucius) and Mengzi (Mencius), and the Ming Confucian Wang Yangming. They demoted Zhu Xi, the most influential Song Confucian, and had no tolerance for the evidential learning scholarship of the Qing period. The true Confucian tradition (in their minds) follows Mengzi in affirming that human nature is good, and Wang Yangming in asserting that moral values and motivation must be uncovered in oneself, not in phenomena. This wing of the Confucian tradition asserted that people have not just a potential but tendency toward moral action, and this tendency is definitive of being human. Anyone can become a sage, the paragon of moral excellence. It is what being fully human means. This is how these Confucians answer the questions of why and how to be moral: it is what is natural for us, and we have the knowledge and motivations in the mind already.

In the modern period, Confucians had two main concerns. One was the explicit attacks on Chinese culture as well as the general upheaval and sense of value instability brought about by the events of the time. What had been a reasonably stable (if inequitable) political and social structure had collapsed without a clear replacement. Many people were fascinated by novelty and turned away from traditional values. The other, not unrelated, concern was the reductionism and lack of true moral value that they found in Western culture. Xiong Shili never left China, but Mou, Tang, and Xu all spent time in Hong Kong and traveled to Europe and the US as well. They were not pleased with what they found. Utilitarianism and related reductionist approaches that did not distinguish moral value from happiness, desire satisfaction, survival, or any other non-moral value were entirely unacceptable to them. Tang Junyi wrote,

The most important point for our affirming the value of a kind of cultural activity is that it directly reveals the value of the human spirit itself, and not its instrumental or utilitarian value…. We must strictly adhere to the standpoint of the Chinese cultural tradition which emphasizes the distinction between human beings and animals and between right and utility, and apply this in cultural choices. Therefore, for decades we have needed to eliminate by their roots utilitarianism, materialism, and any form of naturalism that does not distinguish between human beings and animals. (TJCW 9: 328)

These naturalistic approaches are not only philosophically misguided, but extremely harmful to moral practice as well.

4.1 Rejection of Buddhist and Darwinian Views on Human Nature

Xiong Shili focused on reality and phenomena, but he does have a few remarks on human nature that leave some important clues. One reason Xiong began to criticize orthodox Yogacara is that he was dissatisfied with how they categorized cognitions, but he also wanted to assert the essential goodness of human nature. One of his criticisms of Buddhists is that they treated evil as an innate part of human nature, which would imply that it cannot (and perhaps should not) be eradicated.

[The Yogacara monk Dharmapāla] presumed that of the various productive powers, there are those that are contaminated and those that are uncontaminated, and hence he used “productive power” to refer to both. This is to hold living beings in disdain, and resolutely to uphold [the existence of] the root of evil. His stupidity and boorishness were great indeed. He agreed that there has always been contaminated productive power—that the root of evil in humans is innately endowed. (Xiong 1932 [2015: 141])

The correct view is that human nature is undefiled. Habituated tendencies can be good or bad, accord with human nature or not, but they are adventitious and do not affect the pure inherent nature (Xiong 1932 [2015: 144–46]). In short, evil is not part of human nature and the human task is to remove defiled habituated tendencies and return to that fundamental nature (Major 2021: 941–42). Xiong returned to the classic Song-Ming Confucian position on human nature.

Xiong simultaneously rejected Darwinism, partly on the grounds described by Tang Junyi above, failing to distinguish between human beings and animals, and partly because the picture of organisms competing for individual survival did not comport with his worldview. Evolutionary ideas had been introduced into China with Yan Fu’s heavily edited translation of Thomas Henry Huxley (1898), which could be better described as a reworking of the text than a translation as Yan freely rearranged it and added much of his own commentary (Sun 2022). The potential consequences of Darwin’s view of survival of the fittest are described precisely by a hypothetical interlocutor in Xiong’s text:

The myriad life forms are fond of antipathy and like to kill. World history reads largely as a book of mutual annihilation…. Someone asked, “It is certain that antipathy is something that appears late [among sentient beings.] This can be verified by Darwin’s theory of the survival of the fittest, according to which it should be that antipathy also arises from the need to survive. There is no need to deem it to be an affliction”. I replied, “The facts discovered by those who endorse the theory of mutualism are clearly at odds with Darwin’s thesis…. [Cheng] Yichuan also said: ‘It is only by closely helping one another that all living things between heaven and earth are able to live.’ Everything he said was verified. It is thus understood that living existence requires close help and not competition”. (Xiong 1932 [2015: 259–60])

The moral consequences of evolution (as he understood them) were unacceptable to Xiong. Although he of course knew the history of violence between human beings, this is not how life has to be or should be. Treating hate and competition as part of human nature implies accepting it. That would fundamentally contradict Xiong’s picture not just of human nature, but of how the world works. What Xiong did not do was expand much on what human nature is, or, aside from reliance on personal experience (Xiong 1932 [2015: 204–5]; Major 2021: 947–48), how we know it and realize it. Mou, Tang, and Xu all developed theories about this.

4.2 The Two-Tier Self: Transcendental and Empirical

The broad picture is shared by all three. As elucidated above, all accepted that knowledge of human nature and moral values has to be subjective and intuitive, not empirical. Following the Mengzi-Wang Yangming strand of Confucianism, the goodness of human nature consists of a set of basic moral responses which everyone feels and, when not obstructed by selfishness, do not err. The questions of what the goodness of human nature means, how we know it, and how we can realize it in life are fundamental to most of Mou Zongsan’s and Tang Junyi’s philosophical work, so their answers require some detail. These will be followed by some examination of Xu Fuguan’s less metaphysical approach.

The issue of desires had loomed large in Buddhist and Neo-Confucian thought, and one task for Mou and Tang was to distinguish self-centered desires from the moral responses. The feeling of wanting to eat a favorite food and the feeling of wanting to save a stranger from harm are not the same category of thing. The challenge for them is that both the former and latter seem to be part of human nature, if that means universal, unlearned feelings and behaviors. If anything, the self-centered desires seem more universal. And yet, for Tang, following Mengzi, it is important to distinguish human beings and animals. Mou put it slightly differently: “People have an animal nature and a human nature” (MZCW 9a: 71). The point is much the same: being human means controlling and overcoming desires. What they want to do is to demonstrate that everyone has the category of moral responses, even if they rarely act on them. That is human nature properly understood.

Mou and Tang both address this challenge by appealing to two levels of the person: an empirical self which experiences desires, and a true or transcendent self constituted by the moral responses. Since that true self belongs to a higher ontological level, it represents what the person truly is, and that is what we should follow. The model here is recognizably Kantian, distinguishing moral responses which proceed from free will and the true self from inclinations or desires which are part of appearances. It is not surprising that Kant made such an impact on modern Confucian philosophers, Mou and Tang especially. The experience of moral responses is also critical for both of them, as the reality of the true self has to be grasped practically rather than theoretically (Wong 2021).

We saw earlier how Mou argued that intellectual intuition is a reality for human beings and so knowledge of the free will is possible and morality is real. Mou develops this view into what he calls moral metaphysics (in contrast to Kant’s metaphysics of morals), because morality is the basis for metaphysical truths, namely the reality of the autonomous self (Billioud 2012: 49–50; Lee 2013: 24). The true self for Mou cannot be an appearance but must be a thing in itself, belonging to the intelligible world. Only then is free will possible. If it were part of the world of appearances, it would be subject to causal laws and be determined or affected by things external to it. Then morality would not exist. The source of morality—which Mou calls free will, the fundamental mind (benxin 本心), or human nature as reality (xingti 性體)—has to be absolute and unconditional, not an appearance (MZCW 20: 245–47). The primary difference between Mou and Kant concerns the nature and role of feelings (Lee 1990: 37–42). For Kant, feelings were appearances and could not be the basis of morality. For Mou, ordinary feelings (such as desires) belong to the world of appearances and are heteronomous motivations. But there is another category of moral feelings which are different.

Mou claims that there is another type of feeling entirely which belongs to (or is) the true self, the autonomous person as a thing in itself. These are rational feelings, not sensible (MZCW 22: 14). He created several terms for these feelings, such as “moral feelings of illuminating awareness” (mingjue jueqing 明覺覺情) or “ontological moral feelings” (bentilun de jueqing 本體論的覺情) (Billioud 2012: 170–76; Lee 2021: 259–60). The moral responses identified by Mengzi belong to this category. Mengzi illustrated these feelings by considering the situation of a person seeing a child about to fall into a well. In such a case, he claimed, anyone would have a feeling of alarm and compassion toward the child (Mengzi 2A6). For Mou, this sort of situation is the way we become aware of the true self through the moral reaction, a process that he calls reflective verification (one aspect of intellectual intuition [MZCW 20: 252]):

This awakening due to astonishment is like the red sun rising out of bottom of the sea; it is not at all sensible. Therefore, the reflective verification in question is the illuminating awareness of intellect itself reflecting its own light back onto itself and not a phenomenal mind different from itself sensibly and passively coming to cognize it, which could never reach it in itself. So this reflective understanding is purely intellectual and not the passivity of sensibility. (MZCW 21: 105)

One key point here is that this reflective verification has both epistemic and moral significance. It is a way we come to realize the true self, in both the senses of knowing it and making it real and active (Billioud 2012: 198–207; Shi & Lin 2015: 553). When we have such a response, we know the true self (the fundamental mind, nature in itself) and are prompted to act on it. Because the moral responses come from the true self as a thing in itself and are not part of the sensible world, they are not heteronomous and autonomous morality is possible. The important moral distinction for Mou is not between reason and inclination, as in Kant, but between two different kinds of feeling: intellectual or ontological feeling (from the true self) and sensible feeling (from the empirical self).

Granting Mou’s claim that the moral feelings belong to the true self and are categorically different from empirical feelings, what he does not explain is how an agent can reliably discern which is which. Morality is not a matter of acting on a rational, universalizable principle, which an agent could deliberate about, but acting on the prompting of the fundamental mind. It is not a biological instinct, but subjectively can feel similar as something the agent is compelled to do in a non-rational way (Shi & Lin 2015: 547–48). From the agent’s internal perspective then, it may be difficult or impossible to tell what is a moral response belonging to the fundamental mind and what is a desire or instinct from the empirical self (Suter 2018: 229). As there is no further objective criterion to judge what is right or wrong, whether Mou’s moral metaphysics can adequately guide action is a concern (Shi & Lin 2015: 559). This is not to deny that the true self may be a reality in the way that he describes, but to raise the question of whether we can reliably tell when we’re accessing the fundamental mind and when we’re not.

4.3 The Transcendental Self Manifested in Affective Connection

Although he is not typically considered a Kantian, Tang Junyi also distinguishes two selves. There is a true self, which he usually calls the transcendental self (chaoyue ziwo 超越自我) (or transcendent; Tang did not consistently distinguish “transcendent” and “transcendental”, using chaoyue 超越 for both) or moral self (daode ziwo 道德自我). Then there is an empirical self (jingyan ziwo 經驗自我 or xianshi ziwo 現實自我) (Pong 2008; Rošker 2016: 94). Human nature is to be identified with the transcendental self, not the empirical self of desires (S. Y. Chan 2002: 306–7). However, his route to demonstrating the reality of the moral self is very different.

The overarching theme of Tang’s philosophy is interdependence in the form of affective connection. The primary way he supports the existence of the transcendental self is the reality of affective connection with other existents, especially people. It is the basis of morality for Tang (Chiu 2016: 155; Van den Stock 2016: 250). The empirical self of desires is self-centered: it attempts to use the world to fulfill its desires. Insofar as our actions recognize the equal subjectivity of other people, we transcend the narrow self and realize the transcendental self (TJCW 9: 38). This is not a universal self (Metzger 2005: 220). Tang was clear that he departed from Fichte in not merging people into a great self (TJCW 25: 1.506). People have desires, but they have other sorts of feelings and motives, what Tang calls the feelings from human nature (xingqing 性情):[3]

People truly have a kind of feeling from human nature that surpasses individual life and finds completion in affective connection with people and things. (TJCW 9: 97)

This is what the goodness of human nature means.

One of the main ways that Tang illustrates the reality of the transcendental self that connects to others is through pointing out how human practice presupposes the reality and value of other people as subjects. Cultural activities—including economy, politics, science, philosophy, art, and much more—are all ways in which, usually unconsciously, the moral self manifests through affective connection which treats other people as subjects (Rošker 2016: 156; Van den Stock 2016: 339). Put somewhat differently, culture is about establishing the world of moral personality, which is Kant’s kingdom of ends (TJCW 12: Preface, 13). Here he was inspired by Fichte and British idealism (Metzger 2005: 215–16; Tseng 2019: 838). Culture is an attempt to realize certain ideals in the world in a conscious way, and Tang asserts that anyone who consciously holds and tries to realize an ideal reveals their transcendental self. Having an ideal involves a notion of how one wants oneself and the world to be, and assumes that one has the freedom and ability to try to bring this about. It means transcending existing reality and thinking about and working toward how to make it better, and this reveals the transcendental self mastering the empirical self (TJCW 12: 3–9). As Tang’s method for demonstrating this is the same for all cultural activities, one example will suffice to illustrate it, the example of science.

The usual belief in modern Confucianism is that science is instrumentally valuable, because scientific discoveries can lead to improvements in people’s lives (Xu 1952 [2022: 117–23]). Tang recognizes that science can be a moral good in this instrumental way, but insists that the practice of science itself manifests the transcendental self. The possibility of searching for truth cannot be separated from moral reason and embodies moral value. The common view is that science aims at truth, which is distinct from goodness, but for him science is not value-neutral (TJCW 12: 223–24). Scientific understanding involves grasping common properties or patterns in the world through formation of a concept connecting past and future events, which follow the same principle. To search for these principles requires transcending one’s natural instincts and desires for the sake of abstract truth which has no immediate relation to one’s desires. This ability to transcend these manifests moral goodness and the possibility of reason controlling desires (TJCW 12: 226–27). Furthermore, scientific laws are universal and objective. The possibility of shared understanding of them means minds have similar cognitive abilities. And as a matter of practice, scientists seek to have their findings published, recognized, and understood by other people. This is an implicit acknowledgment that being understood by other people is important, and that people have independent minds that can reach similar understanding (TJCW 12: 233–36). This shared understanding is a form of affective connection.

At this juncture we may ask what Tang has demonstrated: does this affective connection he describes constitute knowledge of other people’s subjectivity and shared moral reason? Or is it an assumption of cultural practices such as science, philosophy, and art, but remains short of knowledge? This is a complicated question on which Tang equivocated in his writings. In one related discussion, Tang examines the Confucian belief in the universal moral mind, and says that through reason one can universalize the humane nature and heart-mind and know that all people have them. Immediately following he calls this belief a kind of faith and says,

This faith that the humane nature and heart-mind must exist can likewise not be proved positively by the use of pure reason and argument. At most, we can use a negative argument that it is impossible to assert that it does not exist, and so show that it must exist. That it exists is revealed negatively in the fact that people feel uneasy about evil and suffering. If you feel uneasy about yours and others’ evil and suffering, this is negative proof that you have the humane nature and heart-mind of perfect goodness that [wants to] remove evil and suffering…. If you say that you have no uneasiness toward evil and suffering at all, then I do not believe you. How do I know that you feel uneasy? Because I do…. Even if you do not reveal this humane nature and heart-mind for now and yourself feel you don’t have it, I still affirm that you must have it. The reason is because in the end, I cannot accept that you do not have it, so I affirm that you do: there is no other reason. (TJCW 11: 247–49)

This evidently falls short of knowledge.

Even in his last work, it is difficult to pin down precisely what Tang thinks, whether affective connection with other minds is a known reality or whether it is a matter of faith or an assumption to make sense of our practices in life. Perhaps his final word on the subject is in the postscript to Life Existence and the Horizons of Mind, an extended discussion on faith, meaning, and the role of philosophy. People must have ideals, and he says the objective existence of a universal human way and universal human nature is a conviction based on the possibility of shared rational ideas (TJCW 26: 2.370). Ultimately, he seems to conclude that we need this sort of conviction for life to have meaning and to support moral practice.

A belief in the metaphysical origin of the light of perfect goodness as an absolute truth then makes possible the action of making the irrational into the rational. (TJCW 26: 2.381)

Here Tang’s deep interest in religion bears brief mention (for more see Tang 1955 [1981]; Fröhlich 2017: chap. 5; W. Ng 1998; Van den Stock 2021: 226–35). Religion is critical for Tang, meaning belief in an absolute spiritual reality (TJCW 9: 354). The fundamental demand of religion is to affirm a transcendent absolute that can preserve all values. In Confucianism, this is faith in the fundamental mind and nature themselves (TJCW 11: 319–20, 335). It might be best to conclude that for Tang, whether this was knowledge or not in a theoretical way was beside the point (Chiu 2016: 157–58; 2023: 296). It is a postulate, in Kant’s sense: an idea we must apply to ourselves (Schmidt 2011: 291 n31). We must have faith in the possibility of goodness in ourselves and others to go on living.

4.4 The Single Self Model

Xu Fuguan took a simpler approach to the question of knowing human nature and the source of values. He felt that the model of Western metaphysics should not be applied to Chinese philosophy, so he rejected the metaphysical orientation of Xiong, Mou, and Tang (Huang 2018 [2019: 56–57]; Ni 2002: 291). He did not distinguish two levels of self as Tang and Mou did. He refers to morality as supra-empirical (chao jingyan 超經驗) (Xu 1963 [1990: 86]), but not transcendental or metaphysical. He agreed that moral facts cannot be uncovered by investigation of the external world. However, Xu denies that Confucian is a form of idealism, or that the heart-mind is something beyond the physiology of the body (Ni 2002: 286–87). Xu refers to his view as “embodied learning” (xing er zhong xue 形而中學) rather than metaphysics (xing er shang xue 形而上學) (Xu 1953 [2022: 168]). He agrees with Tang and Mou that we have inherent moral responses, but they are not indications of a transcendental self. He does not seem very concerned with pinning down precisely where the moral responses come from; the reality of experiencing them is enough.

At the same time, Xu insists that morality cannot be known through investigation of world: science cannot confirm or disprove morality. Although he rarely mentioned Kant, he did apparently accept that morality could not be empirical if it were to be universal (Xu 1963 [1990: 86]). What defines human beings is that they can control their desires and they have the capacity for self-mastery (zizhu 自主) (Xu 1963 [1990: 161, 165–66]). He distinguishes two categories of motives. There are the physiological desires associated with the body, and there are the responses of the heart-mind (Elstein 2021a: 205). In Mengzi’s paradigm case of seeing a child about to fall into a well, the feeling of alarm and compassion is not a response of the desires, but the direct manifesting of the heart-mind (Xu 1963 [1990: 172]). Unfortunately, he never explained how we discern the difference between desires and the moral responses of the heart-mind, when it seems these can be easily confused.

Perhaps the most reliable guide is to look at what we prefer from others. Xu believes, following Mengzi, that people have a universal preference for virtue. But when we look at ourselves, we all too readily rationalize desires as moral responses or make excuses for our conduct. Xu instead looks at what people prefer in others, especially in rulers. This is what makes the Confucian ideal of rule by virtue possible: the fact that people respond to the virtue of rulers and prefer humane rule (Xu 1966 [2022: 244–45]). The suggestion is that we can avoid the complications of self-interest better by looking not at what people do or what they want to do, but what they expect and want from other people. Xu does not go as far as to suggest a universalizing test (as Tang Junyi did), but he did say, “The Way is what is accepted by each person, or slightly different, what everyone accepts from a position of equality” (Xu 1954 [2022: 181]). It is not a great leap from here to a universalizing test to distinguish moral and immoral (or amoral) motives.

We find in these thinkers a characteristic not only of modern Confucianism, but most Confucianism. They are not very concerned with defining or determining what is good or right (which they believe is usually obvious) or with offering a decision procedure. Even Mou Zongsan, who said ethics must be based on a categorical imperative (MZCW 20: 447), did not discuss how to apply it in practice. Their main concern is to show that morality is part of human nature, and to demonstrate how we can know this. Humans are fundamentally moral beings for them, and so moral practice is a matter of accessing or developing what we already have in us. Ideally, skill in moral practice should get a point of being effortless. There is no necessary conflict between reason and inclination, between what one desires and what is right. The ideal of the sage, who knows and does what is right without thought or effort, remained real in modern Confucian thought, even if they also recognized that it was a distant goal (TJCW 26: 2.216–17). The goal is to reveal what persons are, such that moral practice is part of who we are and becoming a sage is at least a possibility.

5. Political Thought

Political thought was and remains a critical area in modern Confucianism. Mou, Tang, and Xu all responded to the failure of initial efforts toward democracy in China with arguments for why democracy was not only compatible with Confucianism, but a necessary evolution for it (Elstein 2014; Fröhlich 2017). (Xiong had less to say about politics (Van den Stock 2016: 222–25).) Strong opposition to Communism led them to leave China, but they were also disappointed by the Nationalist dictatorship on Taiwan.

Their support of a Confucian justification for democracy was a way of responding to three alternative views: two critical of Confucianism and one supportive of Confucianism but critical of democracy. The first two were Chinese Communism and liberalism. The Communist insistence on materialism and reduction of morality to class interest was unacceptable to all three as it amounted to a rejection of the moral self. Liberals in Taiwan supported democracy but insisted Chinese culture was an obstacle to it that had to be swept away. Modern Confucians agreed with democracy as an end, but the means could not be giving up Chinese culture. The last, anti-democratic group was the Nationalist government and its supporters in Taiwan. They supported traditional culture, including Confucianism, but used it, along with the need to fight Communism, to justify their one-party rule (Huang 2018 [2019: 94–95]). A fourth view opposed to democracy, Confucian meritocracy (Bai 2020; Bell 2015; Jiang 2012), did not exist at the time, but they would have rejected it, too. The modern Confucianism position contains these common elements: due to historical limitations earlier Confucian thinkers had not advocated democracy, Confucianism is not only not antithetical to democracy but in reality democracy is the way to realize Confucian ideals, and democracy in fact needs Confucianism or something like it to be stable.

5.1 Democracy through Self-Restriction of Morality

Mou Zongsan’s political thought features two important innovations. The first is his idea of an indirect or dialectical connection between Confucian ethical thought and democracy. The second, closely related, is the belief that objective, democratic institutions are necessary to make possible the Confucian ideal of sagely rulership. This is how Mou addresses the complete absence of democratic institutions in the history of Confucian thought while still arguing for their importance.

Mou argued that traditional Confucianism failed by assuming too tight a relationship between ethics and politics. He distinguishes two types of connections between them: direct (zhitong 直通) and indirect (qutong 曲通). Developing democracy requires an indirect connection (MZCW 10: 61–62). In politics, direct connection is between a virtuous leader and moral politics: the belief that a morally good ruler is necessary and sufficient for good government. Politics cannot be linked so closely to morality and needs to have some independence (Lee 2017: 85). The way Mou justifies this is through his famous concept of self-restriction (or self-negation) (ziwo kanxian 自我坎陷) (MZCW 10: 64). Morality has to limit itself to allow for the development of amoral political structures.

The moral reasoning at the foundation of Confucian thought must restrict itself to allow for the development of theoretical or constructive reason so politics can be partly separated from morality. Democracy is not a moral system. Elections are not limited to the virtuous. In the traditional ideal of sagely rulers and worthy ministers, government is not independent from morality, as the possibility of good government depends on moral rulers and officials. However, traditional Confucian thought had no system to transmit power reliably only to sages and worthies. That system was inherently unstable. In democracy, political virtue is embodied in objective structures, not individuals. Realizing morality in politics thus demands moral reason restrict itself so theoretical reason can develop, as only theoretical reason can produce value-neutral democratic institutions (MZCW 10: 65, 151–52). This indirect connection between morality and politics realizes moral goals better than a direct connection can.

The philosophical foundation for democracy is Mengzi’s doctrine that human nature is good. Mou argues that democracy is in fact necessary to realize the goal of Confucian morality, to allow each person to realize their good nature. However, we must be precise about the kind of necessity this is. It is not logical necessity. There is no logical contradiction in an autocratic government allowing people to realize the goodness of human nature. It simply does not often work out. The necessity Mou talks about is dialectical or practical. It is a question of what kind of government is most likely to make possible the goal of realizing Confucian morality.

5.2 Political Equality from Equal Subjectivity

Tang’s arguments for democracy proceed along similar lines, basing democracy on the equality of persons and the need for objective institutions. However, he employs his characteristic focus on affective connection and recognizing the subjectivity of other people to support democracy. It is critical for Tang that democracy is not just a modus vivendi that simply recognizes practically that people won’t accept giving up their rights. It must be based on equality of personality, exactly what Chinese culture puts at the foundation (TJCW 9: 325). The basis of this is the universal moral heart-mind:

We say that the infinite value of the individual and highest dignity of the person are founded on possession of the heart-mind of moral reason. (TJCW 11: 195)

As covered previously, Tang thinks this heart-mind (he also calls it the humane heart-mind) is minimally a presupposition of most activity in life. It is something we feel in ourselves and believe it is a universal characteristic of humanity.

One of Tang’s innovations is to illustrate how political activity is itself a way of experiencing affective connection with others. Tang starts with the bare desire for power, something humans share with animals. The difference is that people are necessarily self-aware, and so someone desiring power knows they cannot pursue it blindly without it being self-defeating. They will have to regulate this desire and consider how to realize it most effectively, and when they do so, they already begin to transcend the desire for power itself (TJCW 12: 123). The desire for power is a desire for other people to submit to me and follow my will, and that itself recognizes that other people have a will of their own (TJCW 12: 125). We do not seek submission from things, but simply use them. Going further, the way to get people to submit is provide something they value (such as their continued life). Then satisfying my desire for power depends on being able to provide something that other people value, and I tacitly recognize that they have their own values, which I must understand. Through this process, recognizing that others have values and seeking to persuade them to submit, the selfish heart-mind can transform into a public-spirited heart-mind, though Tang admits this won’t necessarily happen (TJCW 12: 132–35; Fröhlich 2017: 168–75). Still, even here affective connection has been established. Tang wants to show that even the bare desire of power must recognize the existence of other minds with wills and values of their own.

The route to democracy is based on recognition of others’ minds and applying moral reason which demands universality. As I wish for my own rights and the ability to participate in government, rational consistency requires that I respect others’ rights and desire to participate in government. I must begin to see my own political activity as something that could be approved by others. “Then on the basis of reason, we set up a form of participating in government that is publicly accepted and universally approved”. This is democracy (TJCW 11: 187). In contrast to Hobbes, Tang holds the belief that people are not absolutely selfish, though of course they act selfishly at times. The state is not formed by a social contract among individuals. Communities are an inherent part of human life even before there were states. (TJCW 12: 169–74). Communities are required by universal reason. Democracy is of course not perfect, but realizes the requirements of reason better than alternative forms of government. The flaws of democracy cannot be rectified by laws alone. Elevating people’s moral consciousness is necessary (TJCW 12: 200–205). This is why Tang thinks strictly political liberalism is fatally flawed. Democracy needs a vision of persons as moral beings.

5.3 Realizing Rule by Virtue in Democracy

According to Xu Fuguan, the highest value in Confucianism and the ultimate source of its democratic ideals is life (sheng 生). Valuing life above all is the true spirit of humanism, and it must come before all other political ideals (Xu 1953 [2022: 157]). Xu means a biological notion of life primarily, so caring for the physical self takes priority over caring for the moral self. Xu further emphasizes that respecting life means respecting individual persons. The primary duty of government is providing for people’s material needs; education and pursuit of the good come after that (Xu 1979 [1988]: 198), so a Confucian government can never justify harming individuals in the name of either their own good or the good of society as a whole.

Xu claims Confucianism is democratic in spirit. Ideas of human dignity and equality that are foundational for liberal democracy were part of Chinese culture, by which he means Confucian thought (Xu 1966 [2022: 235]). Universal human nature implies a certain kind of equality, and as Mengzi emphasizes it is the moral potential which makes people different from beasts, it is not a great leap to an idea of human dignity in virtue of this nature (Gao 2010). However, these ideals can be the basis for democracy, but ideals are not enough. What is necessary are objective institutions to guarantee the realization of these ideals (Xu 1953 [2022: 149–50]). What required a sage ruler in earlier Confucian political theory is routinized in democracy; the rulers respect the dignity of the people because they have no choice. Virtue is objectified so it no longer relies on caprice.

Xu considers rule by virtue and non-action the foundations of traditional Confucian political thought and still apply in a Confucian democracy. For Xu, non-action means “not using one’s personal preferences to rule the people, and not using coercive means to rule the people” (Xu 1966 [2022: 237]). Instead, virtue operates through rituals (Xu 1951 [2022: 72]). In his analysis, the sage rulers of the past reflected and implemented the people’s preferences; they did not impose their own ideas (Xu 1953 [2022: 143–44]). But getting rid of one’s own preferences is very difficult to do, and the value of democracy is putting structural limits on governors’ ability to rule according to their desires. Where traditional Confucian politics depended on the ruler being willing to set aside his own preferences, democracy removes the subjective element: the governors must follow the people’s preferences whether they want to or not. By removing the uncertainty of relying on individual virtue, democracy is actually the full realization of the ideal of rule by virtue (Xie 2008: 183–85). This is why Xu believes democracy is the natural path for Confucianism to take.

Where Xu is most Confucian is that he does not see law as sufficient for good government. Law is necessary, but so is virtue and providing a moral basis for government (Xu 1959 [2022: 229–30]). Xu believes the problem with Western democracy is it just treats people as physical beings acting to satisfy desires (what he sometimes criticizes as the utilitarian view) (Xu 1980a: 241; 2022: 96). Western politics is inadequate because it ignores the moral self, assuming people are merely self-interested. The common interest is just a result of individual interests limiting and controlling each other; it is not based on awareness of shared morality and respect for human dignity. What needs to be added is the concept of people as moral beings, the virtue dimension (Xu 1951 [2022: 73–74]). Xu makes a moral argument for democracy: it allows better realization of the potential of human nature than all other systems. His faith in human nature manifests in trusting people to allow them to develop their own moral selves.

6. Recent Developments

Modern Confucian philosophy is of course not limited to these four scholars, nor did its development stop with the twentieth century. Mou Zongsan and Tang Junyi in particular were instrumental in training the following generations of Chinese philosophers in Taiwan and Hong Kong, where their thought remains very influential. When mainland China began opening in the 1980s, scholars there initiated major projects on the study of modern Confucianism. New editions of their works were published, including those who had lived outside of China (usually excising their criticisms of the Communist Party). Scholarly exchanges between Hong Kong, Taiwan, and China also picked up, with the result that these once-separate scholarly communities are now intertwined, with some mainland scholars now developing their own modern Confucian philosophies (sometimes explicitly in opposition to Mou, Tang, and Xu) (Chen 2006 [2009]; Li Zehou 2015 [2018]; Y. Li 2021).

The fundamentals of modern Confucianism can be found in these other philosophers: interest in modernity and what it means for China, and influence from Western philosophy, in vocabulary or ideas or both. Any Chinese philosopher in East Asia now has to know Western philosophy as well as Chinese, and comparisons are everywhere. For the most part, the influence goes in one direction still. East Asian philosophers know Western philosophy much better than Western philosophers know any Asian philosophy. Fortunately, some translations have become available recently, and with luck this will continue. Modern Confucian philosophers believed they had something important to offer the world, and their views are beginning to get some interest outside of East Asia.


  • Bai, Tongdong, 2020, Against Political Equality: The Confucian Case, (The Princeton-China Series 2), Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press. doi:10.1515/9780691197463
  • Bell, Daniel, 2015, The China Model: Political Meritocracy and the Limits of Democracy, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press. doi:10.1515/9781400883486
  • Billioud, Sébastien, 2012, Thinking through Confucian Modernity: A Study of Mou Zongsan’s Moral Metaphysics, Leiden: Brill. doi:10.1163/9789004215542
  • Bunnin, Nicholas, 2008, “God’s Knowledge and Ours: Kant and Mou Zongsan on Intellectual Intuition”, Journal of Chinese Philosophy, 35(4): 613–624. doi:10.1111/j.1540-6253.2008.00507.x
  • Chan, N. Serina, 2011, The Thought of Mou Zongsan, (Modern Chinese Philosophy 4), Leiden/Boston: Brill. doi:10.1163/ej.9789004212114.i-340
  • Chan, Sin Yee, 2002, “Tang Junyi: Moral Idealism and Chinese Culture”, in Cheng and Bunnin 2002: 305–326 (ch. 15). doi:10.1002/9780470753491.ch16
  • Chen Lai 陈来, 2006 [2009], 传统与现代 : 人文主义的视界 , first edition, Beijing: Beijing University Press. Translated as Tradition and Modernity: A Humanist View, Edmund Ryden (trans.), (Brill’s Humanities in China Library 3), Leiden/Boston: Brill, 2009. doi:10.1163/ej.9789004165786.i-386
  • Cheng, Chung-ying and Nicholas Bunnin (eds), 2002, Contemporary Chinese Philosophy, Malden, MA: Blackwell Publishers. doi:10.1002/9780470753491
  • Chiu King Pong 趙敬邦, 2016, Thomé H. Fang, Tang Junyi and Huayan Thought: A Confucian Appropriation of Buddhist Ideas in Response to Scientism in Twentieth-Century China, (Modern Chinese Philosophy, 8), Leiden/Boston: Brill. doi:10.1163/9789004313880
  • –––, 2023, The Holiness in Ordinariness: On Tang Junyi’s Study of Human Being 即凡建聖: 唐君毅人學論, (History of Chinese Thought Series 27), Taibei: National Taiwan University Press.
  • Elstein, David, 2014, Democracy in Contemporary Confucian Philosophy, (Routledge Studies in Contemporary Philosophy 60), New York: Routledge. doi:10.4324/9780203495186
  • –––, 2021a, “Xu Fuguan: Realizing the Human Spirit”, in Elstein 2021b: 199–220. doi:10.1007/978-3-030-56475-9_10
  • ––– (ed.), 2021b, Dao Companion to Contemporary Confucian Philosophy, (Dao Companions to Chinese Philosophy 15), Cham: Springer. doi:10.1007/978-3-030-56475-9
  • Feng Youlan 馮友蘭, 1931, History of Chinese Philosophy 中國哲學史, vol. 1, Shanghai: Shenzhou guoguangshe.
  • –––, 1934, History of Chinese Philosophy 中國哲學史, vol. 2, Shanghai: Commercial Press.
  • Fröhlich, Thomas, 2017, Tang Junyi: Confucian Philosophy and the Challenge of Modernity, (Modern Chinese Philosophy, 13), Leiden/Boston: Brill. doi:10.1163/9789004330139
  • Fung, Yiu-ming, 2021, “Methods and Approaches in Contemporary Confucianism”, in Elstein 2021b: 609–626. doi:10.1007/978-3-030-56475-9_27
  • Gao Ruiquan, 2010, “Confucian Socialism or Confucian Liberalism? Looking at the Different Dimension of the Contemporary Confucian Concept of ‘Equality’ through the Work of Xu Fuguan 儒家社会主义,还是儒家自由主义?–从徐复观看现代儒家‘平等’观念的不同向度”, Academic Monthly 学术月刊, 42(6): 26–34.
  • Guo Qiyong, 2021, “Xiong Shili’s Ontology”, in Elstein 2021b: 89–104. doi:10.1007/978-3-030-56475-9_5
  • Huang Junjie (Huang Chun-chieh) 黃俊傑, 2018 [2019], 東亞儒學視域中的徐復觀及其思想 , (Dong Ya ruxue yanjiu congshu 4), Taibei: National Taiwan University Institute for Advanced Research in Humanities and Social Sciences Center for Research on East Asian Confucianisms. Translated as Xu Fuguan in the Context of East Asian Confucianisms, Diana Arghirescu (trans.), (Confucian Cultures), Honolulu: University of Hawaiʻi Press, East-West Center, 2019. doi:10.1515/9780824880521
  • Jiang Qing, 2012, A Confucian Constitutional Order: How China’s Ancient Past Can Shape Its Political Future, Daniel Bell and Ruiping Fan (eds), Edmund Ryden (trans.), (The Princeton-China Series), Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
  • Kant, Immanuel, 1785 [1997], Grundlegung zur Metaphysik der Sitten, Riga: Johann Friedrich Hartknoch; translated as Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals, Mary J. Gregor (trans.), Cambridge, New York: Cambridge University Press, 1997.
  • Lee Ming-huei [Li Minghui] 李明輝, 1990, Confucianism and Kant 儒家與康德, Taibei: Linking Press.
  • –––, 2013, The Self-Transformation of Contemporary Confucianism 當代儒學的自我轉化, Revised edition, Taibei: Academia Sinica Institute of Chinese Literature and Philosophy.
  • –––, 2017, Confucianism: Its Roots and Global Significance, David Edward Jones (ed.), (Confucian Cultures), Honolulu: University of Hawaiʻi Press, East-West Center.
  • –––, 2021, “Mou Zongsan: Between Confucianism and Kantianism”, in Elstein 2021b: 255–275. doi:10.1007/978-3-030-56475-9_12
  • Li, Yong, 2021, “Recent Developments in Confucianism in Mainland China”, in Elstein 2021b: 587–608. doi:10.1007/978-3-030-56475-9_26
  • Li Zehou 李泽厚, 2015 [2018], 由巫到礼 释礼归仁, first edition, Beijing: SDX Joint Publishing Company. Translated as The Origins of Chinese Thought: From Shamanism to Ritual Regulations and Humaneness, Robert A. Carleo (trans.), (Modern Chinese Philosophy 17), Leiden/Boston: Brill, 2018. doi:10.1163/9789004379626
  • Liang Shuming 梁漱溟, 1921, Eastern and Western Culture and Their Philosophies 東西文化及其哲學, Shanghai: Commercial Press.
  • Major, Philippe, 2021, “The Confucian Atomistic Individual? Selfhood in Xiong Shili’s New Treatise on the Uniqueness of Consciousness”, Philosophy East and West, 71(4): 938–958. doi:10.1353/pew.2021.0063
  • Makeham, John, 2003a, “The Retrospective Creation of New Confucianism”, in Makeham 2003b: 25–53. doi:10.1057/9781403982414_2
  • ––– (ed.), 2003b, New Confucianism: A Critical Examination, New York: Palgrave. doi:10.1057/9781403982414
  • Marchal, Kai, 2016, “Paradoxes and Possibilities of ‘Confucian Freedom’: From Yan Fu (1853–1921) to Mou Zongsan (1909–1995)”, Philosophy East and West, 66(1): 218–258. doi:10.1353/pew.2016.0001
  • Mengzi, 2008, Bryan W. Van Norden (trans.), Indianapolis: Hackett.
  • Metzger, Thomas A., 1977, Escape from Predicament: Neo-Confucianism and China’s Evolving Political Culture, (Studies of the East Asian Institute, Columbia University), New York: Columbia University Press.
  • –––, 2005, A Cloud across the Pacific: Essays on the Clash between Chinese and Western Political Theories Today, (Academic Monograph on Political Philosophy. China Studies), Hong Kong: Chinese University Press.
  • Mou Zongsan 牟宗三, 1955, Philosophy of History 歷史哲學, Gaoxiong: Qiangsheng Press; reprinted in [MZCW 9b], pp. 1–484.
  • –––, 1959, Moral Idealism 道德的理想主義, Taibei: Wenxing Books, Taizhong: Donghai University Press; reprinted in [MZCW 9a], pp. 1–353.
  • –––, 1961, Authority and Governance 政道與治道, Taibei: Guangwen Books, reprinted in [MZCW 10].
  • –––, 1968–69, Heart-Mind and Human Nature as Reality 心體與性體, 3 vols., Taibei: Zhengzhong Books; reprinted in [MZCW 5–7].
  • –––, 1971, Intellectual Intuition and Chinese Philosophy 智的直覺與中國哲學, Taibei: Commercial Press; reprinted in [MZCW 20].
  • –––, 1975, Appearances and Things-in-Themselves 現象與物自身, Taibei: Student Books; reprinted in [MZCW 21].
  • –––, 1983, Nineteen Lectures on Chinese Philosophy 中國哲學十九講, Taibei: Student Books; reprinted in [MZCW 29].
  • –––, 1985, On the Perfect Good 圓善論, Taibei: Student Books; reprinted in [MZCW 22]
  • –––, 1991, “Objective Understanding and the Remaking of Chinese Culture 客觀的瞭解與中國文化的再造,” Legein Monthly 鵝湖月刊 16(11): 2–10; reprinted in [MZCW 27], pp. 419–438; translated in Mou 2014, 31–60.
  • –––, 2003, Complete Works of Mou Zongsan 牟宗三先生全集, 32 volumes, Taibei: Linking Books.
    • [MZCW 5] Heart-Mind and Human Nature as Reality Book 1 心體與性體1冊, volume 1 of 3.
    • [MZCW 6] Heart-Mind and Human Nature as Reality Book 2 心體與性體2冊, volume 2 of 3.
    • [MZCW 5] Heart-Mind and Human Nature as Reality Book 3 心體與性體3冊, volume 3 of 3.
    • [MZCW 9a] Moral Idealism 道德的理想主義.
    • [MZCW 9b] Philosophy of History 歷史哲學.
    • [MZCW 10] Authority and Governance 政道與治道.
    • [MZCW 20] Intellectual Intuition and Chinese Philosophy 智的直覺與中國哲學.
    • [MZCW 21] Appearances and Things-in-Themselves 現象與物自身.
    • [MZCW 22] On the Perfect Good 圓善論.
    • [MZCW 27] Anthology of Late Writings of Mou Zongsan 牟宗三先生晚期文集.
    • [MZCW 29] Nineteen Lectures on Chinese Philosophy 中國哲學十九講.
  • –––, 2014, Late Works of Mou Zongsan: Selected Essays on Chinese Philosophy, Jason Clower (ed./trans.), (Modern Chinese Philosophy 7), Leiden/Boston: Brill. doi:10.1163/9789004278905
  • Ng, William (吳有能), 1998, “T’ang Chun-I on Transcendence: Foundations of a New-Confucian Religious Humanism”, Monumenta Serica, 46(1): 291–322. doi:10.1080/02549948.1998.11731320
  • Ng Yu-kwan, 2003, “Xiong Shili’s Metaphysical Theory about the Non-Separability of Substance and Function”, in Makeham 2003b: 219–251. doi:10.1057/9781403982414_9
  • Ni, Peimin, 2002, “Practical Humanism of Xu Fuguan”, in Cheng and Bunnin 2002: 281–304. doi:10.1002/9780470753491.ch15
  • Pong Wen-berng 彭文本, 2008, “Theory of Individuality of Tang Junyi 唐君毅論「個體的自我」,” Philosophy and Culture 哲學與文化, 36(8): 77–100.
  • Rošker, Jana, 2016, The Rebirth of the Moral Self: The Second Generation of Modern Confucians and Their Modernization Discourses, Hong Kong: The Chinese University Press.
  • Schmidt, Stephan, 2011, “Mou Zongsan, Hegel, and Kant: The Quest for Confucian Modernity”, Philosophy East and West, 61(2): 260–302. doi:10.1353/pew.2011.0029
  • Shi, Weimin and Chiulo Lin, 2015, “Confucian Moral Experience and Its Metaphysical Foundation: From the Point of View of Mou Zongsan”, Philosophy East and West, 65(2): 542–566. doi:10.1353/pew.2015.0027
  • Sun, Yifeng, 2022, “Yan Fu’s Translation ‘Principle(s)’ and Huxley’s Evolution and Ethics”, Perspectives: Studies in Translation Theory and Practice, 1–14. doi: 10.1080/0907676X.2022.2160264
  • Solé-Farràs, Jesús, 2014, New Confucianism in Twenty-First Century China: The Construction of a Discourse, (Routledge Contemporary China Series 108), Abingdon/New York: Routledge. doi:10.4324/9781315880457
  • Suter, Rafael, 2018, “Transmitting the Sage’s ‘Heart’ (I): Unsealing Moral Autonomy—Intellectual Intuition and Mou Zongsan’s Reconstruction of the ‘Continuity of the Way’ (Daotong)”, Philosophy East and West, 68(1): 223–241. doi:10.1353/pew.2018.0011
  • Tan, Sor-hoon, 2009, “Contemporary Neo-Confucian Philosophy”, in Routledge History of Chinese Philosophy, Bo Mou (ed.) (Routledge History of World Philosophies 3), London/New York: Routledge, chapter 17.
  • Tang Junyi 唐君毅, 1953, The Spiritual Value of Chinese Culture 中國文化之精神價值. Taibei: Zhengzhong Books; reprinted in [TJCW 9].
  • [T’ang Chün-i], 1955 [1981], “The Spirit of Religion and Modern Man: The Co-Operation of Man with Heaven for the Salvation of Mankind from Being Regarded as Purely Material”, in Chinese Essays on Religion and Faith, Douglas Lancanshire (ed.), San Francisco: Chinese Materials Center, 45–52.
  • –––, 1958, The Development of the Chinese Humanistic Spirit 中國人文精神之發展, Hong Kong: Rensheng Press; reprinted in [TJCW 11].
  • –––, 1958, Cultural Consciousness and Moral Reason 文化意識與道德理性, Hong Kong: Youlian Press; reprinted in [TJCW 12].
  • –––, 1966, Origins of Chinese Philosophy: Introduction 中國哲學原論: 導論, Hong Kong: Rensheng Press; reprinted in [TJCW 17].
  • –––, 1968, Origins of Chinese Philosophy: On Human Nature 中國哲學原論: 原性篇, Hong Kong: New Asia College; reprinted in [TJCW 18].
  • –––, 1973, Origins of Chinese Philosophy: On the Way 中國哲學原論: 原道篇, 3 vols., Hong Kong: New Asia College; reprinted in [TJCW 19–21].
  • –––, 1977, Life Existence and the Horizons of Mind 生命存在與心靈境界, 2 vols., Taibei: Student Books; [TJCW 25–26].
  • –––, 2016, Complete Works of Tang Junyi 唐君毅全集, Beijing: Jiuzhou chubanshe.
    • [TJCW 9] The Spiritual Value of Chinese Culture 中国文化之精神价值.
    • [TJCW 11] The Development of the Chinese Humanistic Spirit 中国人文精神之发展.
    • [TJCW 12] Cultural Consciousness and Moral Reason 文化意识与道德理性.
    • [TJCW 17] Origins of Chinese Philosophy: Introduction 中国哲学原论: 导论.
    • [TJCW 18] Origins of Chinese Philosophy: On Human Nature 中国哲学原论: 原性篇.
    • [TJCW 19] Origins of Chinese Philosophy: On the Way 中国哲学原论: 原道篇, volume 1 of 3.
    • [TJCW 20] Origins of Chinese Philosophy: On the Way 中国哲学原论: 原道篇, volume 2 of 3.
    • [TJCW 21] Origins of Chinese Philosophy: On the Way 中国哲学原论: 原道篇, volume 3 of 3.
    • [TJCW 25] Life Existence and the Horizons of Mind, Volume 1 生命存在与心灵境界, volume 1 of 2.
    • [TJCW 26] Life Existence and the Horizons of Mind, Volume 2 生命存在与心灵境界, volume 2 of 2.
  • Tseng, Roy, 2019, “The Endless Pursuit of Self-Perfection: A Hidden Dialogue between Mou Zongsan and F. H. Bradley”, Philosophy East and West, 69(3): 828–848. doi:10.1353/pew.2019.0065
  • Tu Wei-ming, 1993, Way, Learning, and Politics: Essays on the Confucian Intellectual (SUNY Series in Chinese Philosophy and Culture), Albany, NY: State University of New York Press.
  • Van den Stock, Ady, 2016, The Horizon of Modernity: Subjectivity and Social Structure in New Confucian Philosophy, (Modern Chinese Philosophy 11), Leiden/Boston: Brill. doi:10.1163/9789004301108
  • –––, 2021, “Beyond the Horizon: Philosophy and Religion in the Late Work of Tang Junyi (1909–1978)”, in Elstein 2021b: 221–253. doi:10.1007/978-3-030-56475-9_11
  • Wong, Wai-ying, 2021, “Discursive Understanding and Experiential Confirmation: Mou Zongsan and Tang Junyi on Human Nature”, in Elstein 2021b: 469–487. doi:10.1007/978-3-030-56475-9_21
  • Wu, Jiang, 2002, “What Is Jingjie? Defining Confucian Spirituality in the Modern Chinese Intellectual Context”, Monumenta Serica, 50: 441–462.
  • Xie Xiaodong 谢晓东, 2008. Contemporary New Confucianism and Liberalism: A Comparative Study of Xu Fuguan's and Yin Haiguang's Political Philosophy 现代新儒学与自由主义:徐复观殷海光政治哲学比较研究, Beijing: Dongfang.
  • Xiong Shili 熊十力, 1932 [2015], Xin weishi lun, Zhejiang Provincial Library. Translated as New Treatise on the Uniqueness of Consciousness, John Makeham (trans.), (World Thought in Translation), New Haven, CT: Yale University Press.
  • Xu Fuguan 徐復觀, 1963 [1990], A History of Chinese Theories of Human Nature: The Pre-Qin Period 中國人性論史: 先秦篇, Taibei: Commercial Press.
  • –––, 1966, The Spirit of Chinese Art 中國藝術精神, Taizhong: Donghai University Press.
  • –––, 1979 [1988], Confucian Political Thought and Democracy, Freedom and Human Rights 儒家政治思想與民主自由人權, Xiao Xinyi (ed.), Revised edition, Taibei: Student Books.
  • –––, 1980a, Miscellaneous Writings of Xu Fuguan: Reflections 徐復觀雜文: 記所思, Taibei: Times Publishing.
  • –––, 1980b, “Mourning Xiong Shili 悼念熊十力先生”, in The Finest Selected Writings of Xu Fuguan 徐復觀文錄選粹, Xiao Xinyi (ed.), Taibei: Student Books, 339–342.
  • –––, 2022, The Chinese Liberal Spirit: Selected Writings of Xu Fuguan, David Elstein (ed./trans.), Albany, NY: SUNY Press.
  • Yan Fu 嚴復, 1898, On Heavenly Evolution 天演論, 2 vols., Mianyang, China: Shenshi jizhai. (Based on Thomas Henry Huxley's Evolution and Ethics, this is a partial translation and rearrangement of the original with Yan's own commentary.)
  • Yao, Xinzhong, 2000, An Introduction to Confucianism, (Introduction to Religion), New York: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511800887

Other Internet Resources


This entry makes use of some of material previously published by the author (Elstein 2014 and 2021 in the bibliography). The authors and editors thank Kai Marchal and Ady van den Stock for their comments and suggestions on earlier drafts.

Copyright © 2023 by
David Elstein <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free