Mencius (fourth century BCE) was a Confucian philosopher. Often referred to as the "Second Sage" of Confucianism (meaning second in importance only to Confucius himself), Mencius is best known for his claim that “human nature is good.” He has attracted interest in recent Western philosophy because his views on the virtues, ethical cultivation, and human nature have intriguing similarities with but also provocative differences from familiar Humean and Aristotelian formulations.
- 1. Life and Confucian Background
- 2. The Virtues and Their Cultivation
- 3. The Goodness of Human Nature
- 4. Mencius and His Philosophical Opponents
- 5. Later Influence and Interpretations
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“Mencius” is a Latinization (coined by Jesuit missionaries in the 17th century) of the Chinese “Mengzi,” meaning Master Meng. His full name was “Meng Ke.” Our main access to Mencius's thinking is through the eponymous collection of his dialogues, debates, and sayings, the Mengzi (Mencius). This work was probably compiled by his disciples or disciples of his disciples. It was subsequently edited and shortened by Zhao Qi in the second century C.E., who also wrote a commentary on the text. This version of the text was used by subsequent scholars and is the version available to us nowadays. The received text of the Mengzi is divided into seven “books,” each of which is subdivided into two parts (labeled “A” and “B” in English), and then further subdivided into “chapters.” As a result, a passage can be uniquely identified in any translation; for example, 1A1 is the first passage in any edition or translation of the text and 7B38 is the last.
Mencius lived in the second half of the Zhou dynasty (c. 1040–221 BCE), a period of great social and intellectual ferment. The founders of the Zhou dynasty had justified their rule by claiming that it was mandated by Heaven (tiān). Heaven is a higher power that is responsible for the general course of history, and that favors those with Virtue (dé). However, during the Eastern Zhou period (770–221 BCE), it seemed increasingly clear that the Zhou dynasty had lost Heaven's favor. The Zhou king had become merely a figurehead, and real power lay in the hands of the rulers (typically dukes) of the different states into which the realm was divided. These rulers increasingly usurped the power and prerogatives of the Zhou king, and also waged war against each other. Those in positions of power lived in fear of execution or assassination, while peasants suffered under the burden of heavy taxation, the depredations of bandits, and the devastation of invading armies. During this period, “masters” articulated various accounts of the Way (dào, the right way to live and to organize society) that would rescue people from the contemporary chaos and suffering. One of these thinkers was Mencius, who self–identified as a follower of Confucius: “Ever since man came into this world, there has never been one greater than Confucius” (2A2; Lau 2003, 67). Consequently, it is helpful in understanding Mencius to know something about the basic themes of Confucianism. Confucius is the first individual thinker we know of to advocate a systematic vision of the Way. The Analects is traditionally viewed as a reliable source of his sayings, but in contemporary scholarship there is considerable controversy over its historical accuracy. Nonetheless, we clearly find in the Analects expressions of all the major themes that would be characteristic of Confucianism for the next two and a half millennia. In particular, the Confucius of the Analects emphasizes the importance of (1) revivalistic traditionalism; (2) rule through Virtue rather than brute force; (3) ritual as a model for ethical behavior; (4) the family; and (5) ethical cultivation.
Confucius saw himself as merely explicating and defending the teachings of the wise sage kings of the past: “I transmit rather than innovate. I trust in and love the ancient ways” (Analects 7.1; Slingerland 2003, 64). However, Confucius himself called for changes, sometimes radical ones, to contemporary practice. Like revivalists of modern times (such as Martin Luther King, Jr., Gandhi, or William Sloane Coffin), Confucius sought to bring about positive change in the present by reviving ideals from his own tradition that were treated by his contemporaries as stagnant platitudes. Mencius similarly took inspiration from the ancient sages. However, Mencius also stressed the need to read the classics creatively and critically. Speaking of one of the Confucian classics, he stated, “It would be better not to have the Documents than to believe everything in it” (7B3; Van Norden 2008, 185).
One of the lessons Confucius learned from the ancient texts was the importance of ruling the people through ethical inspiration rather than coercion. Many rulers and government ministers in Confucius's era advocated the use of military power to address external threats and strict punishments to deal with internal disorder. Confucius did not completely dismiss the use of force, but he regarded it as a last resort, and as ultimately ineffective when used as the primary method of governing. “If you try to guide the common people with coercive regulations and keep them in line with punishments, the common people will become evasive and will have no sense of shame” (Analects 2.3; Slingerland 2003, 8). (We see a similar denigration of the use of brute force in Mencius. In a memorable turn of phrase, Mencius warned one ruler that to attempt to conquer the world through warfare is as hopeless as “climbing a tree in search of a fish” [1A7].) In place of penal sanctions, Confucius advocated leading the people by moral inspiration and by the subtle but ubiquitous effect of social mores: “If, however, you guide them with Virtue, and keep them in line by means of ritual, the people will have a sense of shame and will rectify themselves” (ibid.). Confucius's reference to Virtue here reflects the concept's political origins. The word we render “Virtue” is “de.” It originally referred to a sort of political charisma a king accumulated through his good character and acts of kindness and generosity. Subjects would willingly follow a ruler with Virtue, without the need for coercion. Although Virtue was orginally something only a true king could possess, it came to be thought of as an attribute of any person with good character (i.e., a “virtuous” person), regardless of social status. By the end of the Zhou dynasty, it had come to be used as a countable noun referring to specific virtues, such as benevolence, courage, and wisdom. Although de is thus very close to our concept of virtue, its associations with royal charisma are distinctive. Consequently, it has become conventional to use “Virtue” (with a capital “V”) when translating the specific term “de,” and to use “virtue” (with a lower case “v”) when one needs a generic term for referring to traits of good character, such as righteousness and loyalty.
As Analects 2.3 (quoted above) suggests, ritual plays an important role in Confucius's social and ethical philosophy. “Ritual (lĭ)” originally referred to formal ceremonies, such as burnt offerings of food and wine to the spirits of one's ancestors. However, its meaning gradually expanded over time to include etiquette (e.g., the proper way to greet or say farewell to a guest) and ethics in general. Confucius stressed that appropriate emotions are essential to correct performance of rituals: “Someone who lacks magnanimity when occupying high office, who is not respectful when performing ritual, and who remains unmoved by sorrow when overseeing mourning rites—how could I bear to look upon such a person?” (Analects 3.26; Slingerland 2003, 18) Mencius also stressed the importance of ritual. However, he emphasized that ritual cannot be followed inflexibly (see Section 2, below, and Mengzi 4A17, 5A2, 6B2, and Analects 9.3).
The family is central to Confucian ethics in at least two ways. First, Confucius advocates agent–relative constraints on action that are based on familial relationships. When the ruler of a state brags to Confucius that his subjects are so “upright” that a son turned in his father for stealing a sheep, Confucius responds, “Among my people, those who we consider ‘upright’ are different from this: fathers cover up for their sons, and sons cover up for their fathers. ‘Uprightness’ is to be found in this” (Analects 13.18; Slingerland 2003, 147). Second, the family is a crucial environment for nurturing virtue. Confucius's disciple Youzi sketched an influential account of the role of filial piety in the development of complete virtue: “A young person who is filial and respectful of his elders rarely becomes the kind of person who is inclined to defy his superiors, and there has never been a case of one who is disinclined to defy his superiors stirring up rebellion. The gentleman applies himself to the roots. ‘Once the roots are firmly established, the Way will grow.’ Might we not say that filial piety and respect for elders constitute the root of Goodness?” (Analects 1.2; Slingerland 2003, 1) We see here the beginning of what became one of Mencius's most influential doctrines: that benevolence and righteousness are achieved though “extension” of the love and respect first manifested in the family.
Confucius was painfully aware that virtue and the proper performance of the rituals are not common in his society:
I have yet to meet a man who loves Virtue as much as he loves sex (Analects 9.18; cf. Slingerland 2003, 92).
Nowadays “filial” means simply being able to provide one's parents with nourishment. But even dogs and horses are provided with nourishment. If you are not respectful, wherein lies the difference? (Analects 2.7; Slingerland 2003, 10)
Consequently, one of the central issues in Confucianism is how to cultivate virtues such as benevolence, loyalty, and filial piety. Confucius stresses the importance of both learning (by studying classic texts and following the rituals) and reflecting: “If you learn without reflecting, you will be lost. If you reflect without learning, you will be in danger” (Analects 2.15; cf. Slingerland 2003, 13). However, many of the debates among Confucians of the following two and a half millennia are about the precise form that learning and reflecting take, and their relative importance (see Ivanhoe 2000). Xunzi (discussed in Section 5, below) emphasized study of the classics and performance of rituals, as did Dong Zhongshu, whose formulation of Confucianism was deeply influential in the Han dynasty (202 BCE-220 CE). In contrast, Mencius, while not denying the value of the classics and ritual, stressed reflection based upon one's own innate dispositions toward virtue.
Mencius was born about a century after the death of Confucius. Details of Mencius's early life are sketchy and uncertain, but he is said to have been born in the state of Zou, in what is now Shandong Province. His father supposedly died when Mencius was young, leaving him and his mother in poverty, and there are several famous stories of the determination of Mencius's mother to provide a good education for her son. Mencius is said to have studied under Confucius's grandson Zisi, and then as an adult he traveled to different states in an attempt to convince their rulers to govern through benevolence and moral suasion rather than brute force. Like the majority of later Confucians, Mencius was what we would describe as a “public intellectual.” He offered advice on everything from foreign policy to the minutiae of public works. One passage from the Mengzi is a detailed treatise on tax policy (3A3), which includes Mencius's famous proposal to adopt the “well–field system” of taxation: a village's fields would be divided into nine equal sections, so that the borders between them looked like what we would recognize as a tic–tac–toe grid. (This shape happens to resemble the character for “well,” hence the name “well–field.”) One family would be assigned to each of the eight outer squares, and would keep the produce from that field. Caring for the inner field would be the joint responsibility of all the families, and the produce from that field would belong to the government as its tax.
Mencius held office in the state of Qi (2B6–7). During this period, he was involved in Qi's invasion of Yan, although the precise nature of his role was disputed. The state of Yan was in turmoil due to a succession crisis. Mencius was asked, unofficially, whether it might be legitimate to invade Yan to restore order. He replied that it was. However, after Qi successfully invaded and annexed Yan, Mencius complained that he had not encouraged the specific actions that Qi took, which apparently included widespread killing of noncombatants and taking spoils of war (see 2B8, 1B10, 1B11, and 2B9, in that order). Mencius eventually resigned his position, when it became clear to him that the ruler was unwilling to enact any of the reforms that he proposed (2B10–13).
After years of traveling from state to state, trying to advise rulers, Mencius retired from public life. Mencius advocated acceptance of the will of Heaven (2B13); however, he must have been disappointed with his inability to improve government during his lifetime, and this is reflected in the plaintive tone of the closing passage of the Mengzi: “From Confucius to the present time is a little more than one hundred years. It is not long from the era of a sage, and we are close to the home of a sage. Yet where is he? Where is he?” (7B38; Van Norden 2008, 197).
One of Mencius's most influential views was his list of four innate ethical dispositions, which he treats as what Western ethicists would call cardinal virtues: benevolence (rén), righteousness (yì), wisdom (zhì), and propriety (lĭ). Each of the four virtues is associated with a characteristic emotion or motivational attitude: “The feeling of compassion is benevolence. The feeling of disdain is righteousness. The feeling of respect is propriety. The feeling of approval and disapproval is wisdom” (Mengzi 6A6; Van Norden 2008, 149). Among these four, Mencius devotes the most discussion to benevolence and righteousness. Benevolence is manifested in the affection one has for his or her own kin, as well as compassion for the suffering of other humans, and even concern for non–human animals. However, according to Confucians, one should always have greater concern for, and has greater obligations toward, relatives, teachers, and friends than one does for strangers and animals (7A45). Benevolence is not simply a matter of feeling a certain way: it also has cognitive and behavioral aspects. A fully benevolent person will be disposed to recognize the suffering of others and to act appropriately. Thus, a genuinely benevolent ruler will notice how his policies will affect his subjects, and will only pursue policies consistent with their well being (1B5). Righteousness is a disposition to disdain or regard as shameful dishonorable behavior or demeaning treatment. As is the case with benevolence, righteousness has cognitive and behavioral aspects. Thus, a righteous person would object to being addressed disrespectfully (7B31), and would not engage in an illicit sexual relationship (3B3). A fully righteous person would also recognize that it is just as shameful to accept a large bribe as it is to accept a small bribe (6A10), and so would refuse to accept either.
Mencius suggests that wisdom and propriety are secondary in importance to benevolence and righteousness: “The core of benevolence is serving one's parents. The core of righteousness is obeying one's elder brother. The core of wisdom is knowing these two and not abandoning them. The core of ritual propriety is the adornment of these two” (4A27; Van Norden 2008, 101). As the preceding passage suggests, wisdom involves an understanding of and commitment to the other virtues, especially benevolence and righteousness. Other passages indicate that a wise person has the ability to properly assess individuals and has skill at means–end deliberation (5A9). Mencian wisdom (somewhat like Aristotelian phronēsis) seems to be only partially constrained by rules. He notes that no sage would kill an innocent person, even if it meant obtaining control of (and being able to benefit) the whole world (2A2). However, he also stresses that sages often act very differently from one another, but if they “had exchanged places, each would have done as the other” (Mengzi 4B31; Van Norden 2008, 114; cf. 4B29). The ultimate standard for any action is “timeliness” (5B1), which seems to mean performing the right action out of the appropriate motivation for this particular situation.
Propriety is manifested in respect (6A6) or deference (2A6) toward elders and legitimate authority figures, especially as manifested in ceremonies and etiquette. The character for the virtue of propriety is identical with the one for ritual, reflecting the close connection between this virtue and such practices. Mencius thinks that matters of ritual place legitimate ethical demands on us, but he stresses that they are not categorical, and can be overridden by more exigent obligations. For example, he notes that rescuing one's sister–in–law if she were drowning would justify violation of the ritual prohibition on physical contact between unmarried men and women (4A17; cf. 5A2, 6B2). Knowing when to violate ritual is a matter of wisdom.
Mencius discusses other virtues in addition to benevolence, righteousness, wisdom, and propriety, but it seems that they are ultimately manifestations of the preceding virtues. For example, in a nuanced account of courage, Mencius distinguishes between courage as exemplified in stereotypically daring behavior (assaulting anyone who insults you), in fearlessness, and in a commitment to righteousness. Mencius suggests that the last kind of courage is the highest form. Courage based on righteousness will lead to fearless opposition to wrongdoing, but also humble submission when one finds oneself in the wrong.
Mencius holds that all humans have innate but incipient tendencies toward benevolence, righteousness, wisdom, and propriety. Employing an agricultural metaphor, he refers to these tendencies as “sprouts” (2A6). The sprouts are manifested in cognitive and emotional reactions characteristic of the virtues. For example, all humans feel compassion for the suffering of other humans and animals, at least on some occasions, and this is a manifestation of benevolence. Similarly, every person has some things that he or she would be ashamed to do, or some forms of treatment he or she would disdain to accept, and these are expressions of righteousness. However, as Mencius's carefully chosen sprout metaphor suggests, humans are not born with fully formed virtuous dispositions. Our nascent virtues are sporadic and inconsistent in their manifestations. Consequently, a ruler who manifests genuine benevolence when he spares an ox being led to slaughter may nonetheless ignore the suffering of his own subjects. Likewise, someone who would disdain to be addressed disrespectfully may feel no compunction in acting against his convictions in the face of a large bribe. In order to become genuinely virtuous, a person must “extend” or “fill out” his or her nascent virtuous inclinations. As Mencius puts it: “People all have things that they will not bear. To extend this reaction to that which they will bear is benevolence. People all have things that they will not do. To extend this reaction to that which they will do is righteousness. If people can fill out the heart that does not desire to harm others, their benevolence will be inexhaustible. If people can fill out the heart that will not trespass, their righteousness will be inexhaustible” (Mengzi 7B31; Van Norden 2008, 192). One of the most intriguing issues in Mencius's philosophy is the proper way to understand his claim that we must “extend” (tui, ji, da) or “fill out” (kuo, chong) our innate but incipient virtuous reactions (1A7, 2A6, 7A15, 7B31).
The discussion of this issue has a long history, but was revived in Western scholarship by Nivison (1980). In a much–discussed example (1A7), Mencius draws a ruler's attention to the fact that he had shown compassion for an ox being led to slaughter by sparing it. Mencius then encourages the king to “extend” his compassion to his own subjects, who suffer due to the ruler's wars of conquest and exorbitant taxation. The basic structure of Mencian extension is clear from this example. There is a paradigm case, C1, in which an individual's sprout of compassion is manifested in cognition, emotion, and behavior. (In 1A7, C1 is the ox being led to slaughter. The king perceives that the ox is suffering, feels compassion for its suffering, and acts to spare it.) There is also a case that is relevantly similar to the paradigm case, C2, but in which the individual does not currently have the same cognitive, emotional, and behavioral reactions. (In 1A7, C2 is the king's subjects. Although his subjects suffer, the king ignores their suffering, has no compassion for it, and does not act to alleviate it. The relevant similarity between C1 and C2 in the case of 1A7 is suggested by the fact that the king describes the ox as having a “frightened appearance, like an innocent going to the execution ground.”) Extension is the mental process by which one comes to recognize the ethically relevant similarity of C1 to C2, have the same emotional reaction to C2 as to C1, and behave the same toward C2 as to C1. (Were the king to extend from the ox to his subjects, he would notice their suffering, feel compassion for them, and change his current military and civil policies. Later in 1A7, Mencius provides concrete advice about which policies to enact.) Nivison's work raises the issue of how the cognitive, motivational, and behavioral aspects of Mencian extension are related. What is the connection between the king perceiving the logical similarity of the suffering of the ox to the suffering of his own people and the king actually being motivated to act to help his people?
Mencius suggests that, for most people, there are three prerequisites for extension: an environment that meets people's basic physical needs, ethical education, and individual effort. (1) Only a handful of people, Mencius argues, have the strength of character to “have a constant heart” in the face of physical deprivation. Most people will resort to crime in the face of hunger and fear: “When they thereupon sink into crime, to go and punish the people is to trap them. When there are benevolent persons in positions of authority, how is it possible for them to trap the people?” (1A7; Van Norden 2008, 14) Consequently, Mencius stresses that it is the obligation of government to ensure that the people are well–fed and free from the fear of violence. (2) Nonetheless, the satisfaction of physical needs is insufficient to ensure the virtue of the common people. Socialization is also necessary: “The Way of the people is this: if they are full of food, have warm clothes, and live in comfort but are without instruction, then they come close to being animals” (3A4; Van Norden 2008, 71). This socialization includes learning the rituals (the etiquette and ceremony of social interactions) as well as instruction in the fundamental “human roles”: “between father and children there is affection; between ruler and ministers there is righteousness; between husband and wife there is distinction; between elder and younger there is precedence; and between friends there is faithfulness” (ibid.). (3) The first two factors are necessary and sufficient to ensure that most people will not become bestial. However, achieving the level of a “sage” or “worthy” requires considerable individual effort. Mencius illustrates this with an example of learning the board game of go:
Now, go is an insignificant craft. But if one does not focus one's heart and apply one's intention, then one won't get it. ‘Go Qiu’ was the best at go throughout the world. Suppose you told Go Qiu to teach two people go, and one focuses his heart and applies his intention to it, listening only to Go Qiu. The other, although he listens to him, with his whole heart thinks about hunting swans, reflecting [sī] only upon drawing his bow to shoot them. Although he learns together with the other person, he will not be as good as he. Will this be because his intelligence is not as great? I answer that it is not. (6A9; Van Norden 2008, 153)
Mencius refers to the mental activity required for full extension as “reflection (sī).” Whether someone engages in reflection is ultimately dependent upon the individual's commitment to doing so (see 6A6 and 6A15, discussed in Section 3 below). However, classic texts and teachers can assist by inducing or guiding these activities. Thus, Mencius is trying to induce reflection in the king in 1A7 by directing the king's attention to the similarities between the ox he felt compassion for and his own subjects. Mencius similarly tries to induce reflection in a government official who asks whether it is permissible to reduce the crushing tax burden on the peasants slightly this year, and wait until next year to lower it to a reasonable level. Mencius replies, “Suppose there is a person who every day appropriates one of his neighbor's chickens. Someone tells him, ‘This is not the Way of a gentleman.’ He says, ‘May I reduce it to appropriating one chicken every month and wait until next year to stop?’ If one knows that it is not righteous, then one should quickly stop” (3B8; Van Norden 2008, 83). Mencius also guides reflection through philosophical dialogue (7A40, literally, “question and answer”). This is illustrated in discussions with his disciples Wan Zhang (5A1–9) and Gongsun Chou (2A1–2). Stories from classic Confucian texts (particularly the Odes and Documents) are often a stimulus for these discussions, helping to illustrate the role such works play in Mencian ethical education.
One aspect of reflection is particularly salient: it is insufficient for successful extension that one merely recognize, in an abstract or theoretical manner, the similarity between two situations. One must come to be motivated and to act in relevantly similar ways. Because of the preceding requirement, an intense topic of discussion among later Confucians influenced by Mencius is the relationship between knowledge and action. For example, Wang Yangming (1472–1529) famously argued for the “unity of knowing and acting,” as the most plausible interpretation of Mencius's view: “There never have been people who know but do not act. Those who ‘know’ but do not act simply do not yet know” (Tiwald and Van Norden 2014, 267). From a Western perspective, one of the noteworthy aspects of Mencius's view of extension is that he regards emotions as a crucial part of ethical perception and evaluation. Although it would be anachronistic to saddle him with any specific contemporary account of the emotions, it seems clear that his underlying view is close to what Western psychologists and philosopher call an “appraisal theory” of emotions, according to which emotions are motivational states closely connected to evaluations of situations (de Sousa 2014, Section 4).
Mencius is perhaps best–known for his claim that “[human] nature is good” (xìng shàn). As A.C. Graham (1967) demonstrated in a classic essay, Mencius and his contemporaries regarded the nature of X as the characteristics that X will develop if given a healthy environment for the kind of thing X is. A characteristic, C, can be part of the nature of X even if there exists an X such that X does not have C. For example, language use is part of the nature of a human being, but there are cases of humans who, due to neurological damage or simply failure to be exposed to language prior to the onset of adolescence, fail to develop a capacity for language use. It is even possible for C to be part of the nature of X if most instances of X do not have C. For example, it is the nature of an orange tree to bear fruit, but the majority of orange seeds do not even germinate, much less grow to maturity. Consequently, an important aspect of Mencius's claim that human nature is good is that humans have a tendency to become good if raised in an environment that is healthy for them. This thesis runs the danger of becoming viciously circular: we might characterize goodness as the result of growing up in a healthy environment, and a healthy environment as one that results in humans being good. However, Mencius's claims about human nature, virtues, ethical cultivation, and political philosophy are nodes in a complex web of beliefs that appeals to our intuitions (e.g., it is normal for humans to show compassion for the suffering of others) as well as empirical claims (e.g., humans are less likely to manifest compassion when subject to physical deprivation). Mencius's views might be mistaken, but they cannot be casually dismissed as naively circular; rather, they must be evaluated as a complex and subtle account of ethics and philosophical psychology.
Probably the two most important passages for understanding Mencius's view of human nature are 6A6 and 6A15. In the former, Mencius's disciple Gongsun Chou asks him to explain how his position differs from those who say that “human nature is neither good nor not good,” those who claim that “human nature can become good, and it can become not good,” and those who state that “there are natures that are good, and there are natures that are not good.” Mencius replies,
As for what they are inherently [qíng], they can become good. This is what I mean by calling their natures [xìng] good. As for their becoming not good, this is not the fault of their potential. Humans all have the feeling [xīn] of compassion. Humans all have the feeling of disdain. Humans all have the feeling of respect. Humans all have the feeling of approval and disapproval. The feeling of compassion is benevolence. The feeling of disdain is righteousness. The feeling of respect is propriety. The feeling of approval and disapproval is wisdom. Benevolence, righteousness, propriety, and wisdom are not welded to us externally. We inherently have them. It is simply that we do not reflect upon [sī] them. (Van Norden 2008, 149)
Human nature is good, on this view, because becoming a good person is the result of developing our innate tendencies toward benevolence, righteousness, wisdom, and propriety. These tendencies are manifested in distinctively moral emotions, correlated with the virtues. Each human “inherently” has a heart with the capacity for these emotions. They will manifest themselves, at least sporadically, in each human. If we “reflect upon” these manifestations, we can develop our innate capacities into fully formed virtues.
If the human capacity for goodness is rooted in our nature, isn't our capacity for evil equally grounded in our nature? Mencius addresses the problem of human wrongdoing in 6A15, when his disciple Gongduzi asks, “We are the same in being humans. Yet some become great humans and some become petty humans. Why?” Mencius replies, “those who follow their greater part become great humans. Those who follow their petty part become petty humans.” Gongduzi persists, “We are the same in being humans. Why is it that some follow their greater part and some follow their petty part?” Mencius replies,
It is not the function of the ears and eyes to reflect, and they are misled by things. Things interact with things and lead them along. But the function of the heart is to reflect [si]. If it reflects, then it will get it. If it does not reflect, then it will not get it. This is what Heaven has given us. If one first takes one's stand on what is greater, then what is lesser will not be able to snatch it away. This is how to become a great person. (6A15; Van Norden 2008, 156)
In modern Western philosophy, we primarily think of “ears and eyes” as organs of sensory perception, whose characteristic errors are cognitive (e.g. Descartes' example of a square tower that appears round from far away). However, in ancient Chinese thought, eyes, ears, and the other sensory organs are primarily associated with sensual desires (e.g., lovely sights, beautiful music, fine foods, etc.). Physical desires are never treated as intrinsically problematic. However, they can “mislead” by leading us to focus on them to the exclusion of a more inclusive comprehension that includes our ethical motivations. Thus, according to the account Mencius sketches in 6A15, our sensual desires can lead us to wrongdoing if we pursue them without also engaging our ethical motivations. This is an especially acute danger because our sensory desires always respond automatically and effortlessly to their appropriate objects, while our moral motivations are more selective. Mencius suggests the mechanical responsiveness of our sense organs by describing them as simply “things”: “Things interact with things and lead them along.” In contrast, the full development of our ethical motivations requires that our heart engage in “reflection”: “If it reflects, then it will get it. If it does not reflect, then it will not get it.” The heart “gets it” in that it engages the appropriate ethical motivations.
Mencius provides a concrete illustration of moral failure and how to overcome it in a dialogue with a ruler who confesses, “I have a weakness. I am fond of wealth.” Mencius explains that a great ruler of ancient times was similarly fond of wealth, but he ensured that “those who stayed at home had loaded granaries, and those who marched had full provisions…. If Your Majesty is fond of wealth but treats the commoners the same, what difficulty is there in becoming [a great] King?” The ruler continues to temporize: “I have a weakness. I am fond of sex.” Mencius cites the example of an ancient ruler who was also fond of sex. However, he made sure (by not wasting male lives in needless warfare, or collecting an unusually large harem) that “there were no bitter women in private, or any unmarried men in public. If Your Majesty is fond of sex but treats the commoners the same, what difficulty is there in becoming [a great] King?” (1B5; translation slightly modified from Van Norden 2008, 23–24) The ruler's desires for wealth and sex are not problematic in themselves, but he has been pursuing them in a manner that ignores benevolence, which would direct him to share his joys with others.
The preceding discussion suggests that Kwong–loi Shun's summary is correct: in stating that human nature is good, “Mencius was saying that human beings have a constitution comprising certain emotional predispositions that already point in the direction of goodness and by virtue of which people are capable of becoming good…. One's becoming bad is not the fault of one's constitution, but a matter of one's injuring or not fully developing the constitution in the appropriate direction” (Shun 1997, 219–20).
The statement that “[human] nature is good [xìng shàn]” is often misquoted as “[human] nature is fundamentally good [xìng bĕn shàn].” The latter phrase actually derives from a gloss on Mencius's view popularized by the seminal commentator Zhu Xi (1130–1200). Zhu Xi held that Mencius was simply explicating what was implicit in the sayings of Confucius. Confucius stated that “natures are close to one another, but become far from one another by practice” (Analects 17.2). In order to explain why Confucius described human natures as merely "close to" one another, while Mencius referred to them as identically "good," Zhu Xi argued that Mencius was referring to the ultimate, underlying human nature in itself, whereas Confucius was referring to human nature as manifested in concrete embodiments. Zhu Xi's view became orthodoxy, and was even written into the opening lines of the Three Character Classic, a primer for learning to read Chinese that was memorized by schoolchildren for centuries:
At its beginning,
human nature is fundamentally good.
Human natures are close to one another,
but become far from one another by practice.
It is only when there is not education,
that their natures deviate.
While ingenious, this interpretation of Mencius is unmotivated without the assumption that the Analects and Mengzi must be expressing the same view.
The term “nature” occurs in only 17 passages in the Mengzi (3A1, 4B26, 6A1–4, 6A6, 6A8, 6B15, 7A1, 7A21, 7A30, 7A38, 7B24, 7B33), and the specific phrase “[human] nature is good” only occurs in two of these (3A1, 6A6). However, there is some plausibility to Zhu Xi's suggestion that the latter claim is operative in many passages where it is not mentioned explicitly, because of how intimately it is connected with other aspects of Mencius's view (Tiwald and Van Norden 2014, 213). This will become clearer as we consider Mencius's critiques of other philosophers in his era.
Mencius was often an incisive critic of other philosophers. In response to a philosopher who advocated price fixing, Mencius asks, “If a fine shoe and a shoddy shoe are the same price, will anyone make the former?” (3A4; Van Norden 2008, 73) When the same philosopher suggests that rulers and government officials should farm the land, just like their subjects, Mencius draws an analogy with other crafts: just as the potter, blacksmith, and farmer each benefit by focusing on his craft and exchanging goods with the others, so does everyone benefit when good rulers and officials focus on their own activities in exchange for financial support from the other members of society (3A4). Another philosopher argues that human nature is identical with the characteristics a human has in virtue of being alive. Mencius performs a swift reductio ad absurdum, pointing out that—since dogs, oxen, and humans are the same in being alive—the proposed definition entails that dogs, oxen, and humans have the same nature (6A3).
Mencius viewed himself as a defender of the Confucian tradition, and saw the two major contemporary threats to that tradition as the doctrines of Mozi and Yang Zhu: “the doctrines of Yang Zhu and Mozi fill the world. If a doctrine does not lean toward Yang Zhu, then it leans toward Mozi. Yang Zhu is ‘for oneself.’ This is to not have a ruler. Mozi is ‘impartial caring.’ This is to not have a father. To not have a father and to not have a ruler is to be an animal” (Mengzi 3B9; Van Norden 2008, 85). Mozi (fifth century BCE) is the first systematic philosophical critic of Confucianism. He is generally interpreted as a sort of impartial consequentialist, who grounds ethics in maximizing overall benefit or profit, where this is defined in terms of material goods such as wealth, populousness, and social order. On this basis, Mozi criticizes the Confucian emphasis on ritual, regarding as wasteful such Confucian practices as elaborate funerals, lengthy mourning periods, and musical performances. In addition, Mozi advocated impartial caring (jiān ài, sometimes translated “universal love”), which he distinguished from the filial piety or differentiated caring of the Confucians. Mozi argued that caring more for oneself, one's family, or one's state was the cause of the warfare and cruelty of his era, and that impartial caring would lead to greater harmony and material satisfaction. Mozi certainly did not advocate eliminating the family as a social institution. However, he clearly rejected Confucian differentiated caring in favor of impartial caring: “I have heard that in order to be a superior person in the world, one must regard the well-being of one's friends as one regards one's own well being; one must regard the parents of one's friends as one regards one's own parents. Only in this way can one be a superior person” (Ivanhoe and Van Norden 2001, 70). Mozi presented a number of ingenious arguments in favor of his position, including a “state of nature” argument to justify government authority (Mozi 11; Ivanhoe and Van Norden 2005, 65), and a thought-experiment to justify impartial caring that seems almost game-theoretic in its precision (Mozi 16; Ivanhoe and Van Norden 2005, 69–70). In addition, to win over those attracted to Confucianism, Mozi argues that the goal of filial piety will in fact be best achieved by not favoring one's own parents over others: “Clearly one must first care for and benefit the parents of others in order to expect that they in turn will respond by caring for and benefitting one's own parents. And so for such mutually filial sons to realize unlimited good results, must they not first care for and benefit other people's parents?” (Ivanhoe and Van Norden, 75; emphasis mine) Mozi acknowledged that people do not seem to be predisposed to have impartial care for others. However, he argued that human motivations are highly malleable, and can be radically altered, so long as humans are given appropriate rewards for compliance and punishments for disobedience. As evidence for his claim, he cites the example of
King Ling of the state of Chu [who] was fond of slender waists. During his reign the people of Chu ate no more than one meal a day and became so weak that they could not raise themselves up without the support of a cane nor could they walk without leaning against a wall. Curtailing one's food is something very difficult to do, but masses of people did it in order to please King Ling. Within a single generation the people changed because they wanted to accord with the wishes of their superior. (Ivanhoe and Van Norden 2005, 75)
Mozi was not just an original philosophical thinker; he was also the founder of an organized movement, the Mohists, which survived his death and continued to be influential until the Qin dynasty (221 BCE–207 BCE) reunified China.
There is controversy about what the views of Yang Zhu (fifth to fourth century BCE) were. However, a plausible case can be made that he defended ethical egoism based on a particular conception of human nature. Yang Zhu's line of argument has considerable plausibility in his philosophical context. Although Mohists and Confucians disagreed about many things, they agreed on two key points: the proper Way to live and to organize society is dictated by Heaven, and this Way will sometimes demand extreme self–sacrifice of those who follow it. Yang Zhu invoked the notion of “human nature [rén xìng]” to drive a wedge between the former commitment and the latter. Yang Zhu appealed to the fact that nothing seems more natural for humans than self–preservation. But if there is a human nature, it must be dictated by Heaven, and therefore must be consistent with the Way. Consequently, following one's instinct for self–preservation is actually the highest expression of Heaven's will, and the self–sacrificing practices of the Confucians and Mohists are simply perversions of our Heaven–given nature. The Mohist response to this, as suggested by the example (cited above) of King Ling of Chu, was that there is no such thing as human nature; human motivations are highly malleable, and almost exclusively the products of environmental influences.
Mencius's doctrine that human nature is good was part of his strategy to present a Confucian response to both the Mohists and Yang Zhu. Mencius agreed with Yang Zhu that humans have a determinate nature. However, he presented arguments that there is more to human nature than the purely self–interested motivations identified by Yang Zhu. His most famous argument for this conclusion is the thought experiment of the child at the well:
The reason why I say that all humans have hearts that are not unfeeling toward others is this. Suppose someone suddenly saw a child about to fall into a well: anyone in such a situation would have a feeling of alarm and compassion—not because one sought to get in good with the child's parents, not because one wanted fame among one's neighbors and friends, and not because one would dislike the sound of the child's cries. From this we can see that if one is without the feeling of compassion, one is not human. (Mengzi 2A6; Van Norden 2008, 46)
Consequently, Mencius agreed with Yang Zhu that we are following the will of Heaven (and hence the Way) by following our nature. However, he argued that Yang Zhu had an implausibly impoverished conception of what human nature is like.
Against the Mohists, Mencius argues that human nature places practical and ethical constraints on an ethical doctrine. These points are expressed in an argument Mencius has with the Mohist Yi Zhi. Mencius asks the rhetorical question, “Does Yi Zhi truly hold that one's affection for one's own nephew is like one's affection for a neighbor's baby?” (3A5; Van Norden 2008, 74) In other words, since humans naturally care more for relatives than for strangers, any ethical system that, like Mohism, demands impartiality will be impractical. Mencius also states, “Heaven, in giving birth to things, causes them to have one source, but Yi Zhi gives them two sources” (ibid.). In other words, the Mohists acknowledge the ethical authority of Heaven (the “source” of the Way), but their doctrine of impartial care is set up as a second “source,” and one that demands deviating from our Heaven–endowed nature. In summary, the impartial caring advocated by the Mohists is both perverse and impractical.
Mencius also presents an argument that the Mohist position is self–defeating in practice. When he is politely greeted by a ruler who suggests that Mencius had deigned to visit because he “must have a way of profiting my state,” Mencius rebukes him:
Why must Your Majesty speak of “profit”? Let there simply be benevolence and righteousness. If your majesty says, “How can I profit my state?” the Chief Counselors will say, “How can I profit my clan?” and the nobles and commoners will say, “How can I profit my self?” Superiors and subordinates will seize profit from each other, and the state will be endangered. … Never have the benevolent left their parents behind. Never have the righteous put their ruler last. Let Your Majesty speak only of benevolence and righteousness. Why must one speak of “profit”? (1A1; Van Norden 2008, 1)
Although the Mohists are not mentioned explicitly in this passage, the word “profit” is central to their formulation of impartial consequentialism, so it is likely that Mencius intended their views as part of his target. Cheng Yi (1033–1107) concisely summarized the argument here: “A gentleman never fails to desire profit, but if one is single–mindedly focused on profit, then it leads to harm. If there is only benevolence and righteousness, then one will not seek profit, but one will never fail to profit” (Van Norden 2008, 2).
In his own era, Mencius's views were criticized by the Daoist Zhuangzi and by his fellow Confucian Xunzi. Zhuangzi never refers to Mencius by name, but several passages seem to clearly be directed at him. In a passage that argues against the possibility of objective ethical knowledge, Zhuangzi states, “From where I see it, the sprouts of benevolence and righteousness and the pathways of right and wrong are all snarled and jumbled” (Zhuangzi 2; Ivanhoe and Van Norden 2005, 222). The phrase “sprouts of benevolence and righteousness” (rén yì zhī duān) is quite unusual, and many translators struggle to make sense of it. The key is to remember Mencius's phrases “sprout of benevolence” (rén zhī duān) and “sprout of righteousness” (yì zhī duān) from 2A6. While Mencius compares our innate but incipient dispositions toward virtue to the sprouts of plants, which must be cultivated in order to reach maturity, Zhuangzi suggests that there is no way to disentangle “sprouts” from weeds, if there even is any non–arbitrary distinction between them. Another implicit critique of Mencius is found in a fictional dialogue in which Zhuangzi uses “Confucius” as the spokesperson for his own views, and advises someone, “Do not listen with your heart but listen with your qì. … The heart stops with signs. Qi is empty and waits on external things. Only the Way gathers in emptiness. Emptiness is the fasting of the heart” (modified from Ivanhoe and Van Norden 2005, 228). So Zhuangzi prioritizes following the qi, the impersonal fluid that flows through all things and binds them together, over following the heart. This seems to be a deliberate inversion of Mencius's view in 2A2, where he advises, “What you do not get from your heart, do not seek for in the qi” (2A2; Van Norden 2008, 37). Notice also that, whereas Mencius encourages us to cultivate our heart, Zhuangzi encourages us to “fast” it.
Xunzi attacks Mencius by name in his essay, “Human Nature Is Bad”:
Mengzi says: When people engage in learning, this manifests the goodness of their nature. I say: This is not so. This is a case of not attaining knowledge of people's nature and of not inspecting clearly the division between people's nature and their deliberate efforts. ... Those things in people that cannot be learned and cannot be worked at are called their “nature.” Those things in people that they become capable of through learning and that they achieve through working at them are called their “deliberate efforts.” (Ivanhoe and Van Norden 2005, 299)
It is common to observe that Mencius and Xunzi are speaking at cross–purposes, because they assume different conceptions of the key term “nature” (Graham 1967). For Mencius, a paradigmatic example of something fulfilling its nature is a sprout maturing into a full–grown plant. This process requires a healthy environment and is assisted by active cultivation on the part of the farmer. In contrast, for Xunzi, only the characteristics that something has fully and innately are part of its nature: “Now people's nature is such that their eyes can see, and their ears can hear. ...it is clear that one does not learn these things” (Ivanhoe and Van Norden 2005, 299–300). However, it is possible that Mencius and Xunzi still have a substantive disagreement, even if Xunzi's way of framing that disagreement is misleading. As we have seen, Mencius thinks that all humans are born with innate but incipient dispositions toward virtue. Xunzi seems to explicitly deny this: “As for the way that the eyes like pretty colors, the ears like beautiful sounds, the mouth likes good flavors, the heart likes what is beneficial, and the bones and flesh like what is comfortable — these are produced from people's inborn dispositions and nature” (Ivanhoe and Van Norden 2005, 300). In contrast, “...ritual and the standards of righteousness are produced from the deliberate effort of the sage...” (ibid.). The fundamentally different views of Mencius and Xunzi on human nature are reflected in their different metaphors for ethical cultivation. For Mencius, ethically cultivating human nature is like encouraging the innate tendency of a sprout to grow to maturity; for Xunzi, humans require ethical cultivation just as “crooked wood must await steaming and straightening on the shaping frame, and only then does it become straight. Blunt metal must await honing and grinding, and only then does it become sharp” (Ivanhoe and Van Norden 2005, 298).
Confucianism became a state–sponsored ideology during the Han dynasty (202 BCE–220 C.E.), but it was a syncretic form of the philosophy that included elements of Daoism, Legalism, and the cosmological notions of yin–yang and the Five Phases. Mencius's writings were only one of many influences in this period. After the fall of the Han, Buddhism became increasingly influential socially and intellectually, reaching a peak in the Tang dynasty (618–907). This provoked a Confucian revivalist movement, the Learning of the Way (Dàoxué), conventionally referred to in English as Neo–Confucianism. The polemical anti–Buddhist writings of Han Yu (768–824) are often seen as the flashpoint for the Confucian revival. In addition to denouncing Buddhist practices as unnatural and antithetical to the well being of the state, Han Yu singles out Mencius as the “most pure” of the followers of Confucius. Neo–Confucianism only comes to philosophical maturity, though, during the Song and Southern Song dynasties (960–1279). The major intellectual competitors to Confucianism at this time were Buddhism and Daoism. Neo–Confucians compared Mozi's impartial caring to Buddhist universal compassion. Similarly, Yang Zhu's egoism was seen as anticipating the Daoist search for individual immortality. Consequently, Neo–Confucians availed themselves of Mencius's arguments against his contemporaries to combat their own intellectual rivals. As a result, Neo–Confucians came to regard Mencius as having a particularly profound grasp of the true meaning of the teachings of Confucius, elevating him to the status of the “Second Sage.” The most influential Neo–Confucian philosopher was Zhu Xi, who grouped the Mengzi along with three other Confucian classics (the Great Learning, Analects, and Mean) as the Four Books, and wrote clear, detailed commentaries on each. Zhu Xi's interpretations of the Four Books became orthodoxy, and generations of intellectuals literally memorized them in order to pass the civil service examinations. Although the traditional exams were abolished at the beginning of the twentieth century, Zhu Xi's commitment to reading the Four Books in the light of each other, and his interpretations of specific concepts and passages, continue to have an immense influence, even today.
Ironically, due to the pervasive influence of Buddhism, Neo–Confucian philosophers often reinterpreted Mencius's views in the light of Buddhist metaphysical and ethical concepts. Confucians adopted the view that ethical cultivation was a matter of becoming enlightened (wù) about the fundamental Pattern (lǐ, also translated principle) of the universe and thereby overcoming the selfishness (sī) of human desires (rén yù) and forming one body (yì tǐ) with everyone and everything else. However, these terms are either absent or used in different senses in the texts of Confucius and Mencius. This criticism was made within the Chinese tradition by later Confucians such as Dai Zhen (1724–1777), who argued that, due to Buddhist influence, the Neo–Confucians understood terms like “Pattern” in anachronistic ways, and were led to an ethics that unnaturally devalued physical human desires (see Dai 1777).
In the early 20th century, many Chinese intellectuals became part of the May 4th Movement, which called for China to rapidly Westernize and modernize. As a result, Mencius's intellectual reputation suffered along with the rest of Confucianism. This trend continued during the rule of Mao Zedong, when Confucianism was dismissed as a decadent part of China's “feudal past.” However, interest in Mencius continued in Hong Kong and Taiwan as part of the movement known as New Confucianism. New Confucianism is a diverse movement and it is difficult to find a commonly agreed–upon characterization of what is central to it. However, many New Confucians are influenced by the views of Mou Zongsan (1909–1995), who argued that Mencius and the Neo–Confucian Wang Yangming accurately explicated what is implicit in the views of Confucius. In addition, Mou saw Kant as providing a way of understanding what is distinctive about the Mencian conception of morality, but also thought that Confucian ethics transcends certain limitations of Kant's thought.
Since the death of Mao, there has been a resurgence of interest in Confucianism in mainland China. As a result, Mencius has become embroiled in contemporary debates over the role of Confucianism in Chinese ethics and political philosophy. In two much–debated passages, Mencius endorses the actions of a ruler who seems to put loyalty to his family over the welfare of the state (5A3, 7A35). Some argue that this illustrates that Mencius (and Confucianism in general) is committed to a form of nepotism that encourages corruption (see, e.g., Liu 2007). Others have argued for alternative interpretations of the significance of these passages (e.g., Guo 2007). Mencius is also at the center of the larger debate about whether Confucianism is consistent with democracy (see Chan 1999). Mencius has been invoked as providing a potential foundation for democracy (Bai 2008), but others have cautioned about overestimating the extent to which he champions the will of the people as the source of political authority (Tiwald 2008).
Another recent trend in the study of Mencius and other Confucian philosophers has been the application of the framework of virtue ethics, beginning with Yearley (1990). Mencius does seem similar to some major virtue ethicists such as Aristotle in emphasizing wisdom as a flexible responsiveness to complex situations, the cultivation of virtue over action–guiding rules, and nuanced discussions of the differences between genuine virtues and semblances or counterfeits of them (e.g., 7B37). However, as advocates of virtue ethics interpretations acknowledge, there are also substantial differences between Mencius and any Western virtue ethics. For example, Western virtue ethicists such as Aristotle place great value on purely theoretical contemplation, which Confucians typically regard as lacking intrinsic value. An additional contrast is that Confucians like Mencius see familial life as an important and intrinsic component of living well, whereas Aristotelians (arguably) see the family as, at best, a necessary means to supporting virtuous action.
New Confucian and virtue ethics interpreters of the Mengzi have both been criticized for projecting an alien vocabulary onto the text. Indeed, sometimes advocates of the two approaches make these objections against one another (see Yu 2008, and Angle and Slote 2013). However, any interpreter must bring to the text her own vocabulary for explicating what seems obscure. This is true whether the commentators are Song dynasty Confucians using Buddhist–influenced terms in Middle Chinese, New Confucians availing themselves of Kantian notions while writing in contemporary Mandarin, or English–language scholars employing the vocabulary of virtue ethics. Consequently, the only real issue is whether they have provided the most plausible explanation of what is implicit in the texts they interpret. The ongoing debates on these issues promise to be exciting and productive.
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- Shun, Kwong Loi, “Mencius”, Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Winter 2010 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <https://plato.stanford.edu/archives/win2010/entries/mencius/>. [This was the entry on Mencius by the previous author in the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy — see the version history.]
- Searchable Chinese text of the Mengzi (Book of Mencius) along with the English translation of James Legge
- Chinese text of the Mengzi (Book of Mencius) (Wesleyan University)
- English translation of the Mengzi by James Legge
- Wang Yinglin (1223-1296), “Sanzijing,” text of the Three Character Classic in Chinese with the English translation of Herbert Giles.
- Zhu Xi (1130-1200), “Zhongyong jizhu,” text of the Collected Commentaries on the Mean in Chinese.