Medieval Theories of Conscience

First published Tue Jan 19, 2021

The question of what role the human mind plays in moral behaviour—or the study of moral psychology—has been a fruitful area of research in medieval philosophy since at least the early to mid-1990s. Since then scholars have done much to illuminate medieval contributions to such perennial topics as the freedom of the will, the problem of moral weakness, and what role, if any, the emotions and the moral virtues play in the achievement of happiness (e.g., Kent 1995, Saarinen 1994, Dumont 2000, Eardley 2006, Hoffmann 2007, and Osborne 2014). Similarly, metaethical theories about the foundations of morality that were prominent during the medieval period such as natural law theory—particularly in its Thomistic and Scotistic variants—continue to receive robust scholarly attention (e.g., Porter 2005, Möhle 2003, Lisska 2012, Sweeney 2012, and Cross 2012). Comparatively less consideration, however, has been devoted to what was believed to link the psychological to the metaethical: the mental habit or act of conscience (and its sister-concept of synderesis), though interest in the subject has recently seen a modest resurgence (e.g., Hoffmann 2012, Eardley 2013, and Dougherty 2018).

What is the scope and nature of this apparent ability to intuitively grasp right from wrong? Can conscience err and, if so, do its dictates still bind? The best way to address these and other questions is to employ a developmental approach. The term conscience is still generally used to refer to an innate moral sense, but it has slightly different connotations today than it did in the medieval period, which in turn had different connotations from what preceded it in pagan antiquity and in Scripture. Still, medieval theories of conscience drew extensively on these earlier sources. Since the concepts of conscience and synderesis evolved over time, then, it will be necessary to take a linear approach to the topic and begin with some background.

1. Background: The Pagan and Early-Christian Context

1.1 The Ancient Context: Judicial Conscience

To understand the medieval theory of conscience, it is essential to examine its etymology. Unlike most philosophical categories that are central to medieval thought, the concept of conscience did not have its origins in Plato or Aristotle (Potts 1982: 687). Rather, most scholars agree, it originated in the Greek playwrights of the fifth century BCE (Sorabji 2014: 12, 15–18). It is also possible to find its use elsewhere in Greek literature, such as in the fragments of Democritus (D’Arcy 1961: 5).

The English word “conscience” is derived from the Latin conscientia. Its Greek equivalent is syneidesis. Both terms connote a state or act of “sharing knowledge with oneself” (Sorabji 2014: 12). This knowledge is privileged and involves awareness of a personal moral defect. The notion that “I” can judge “myself” naturally suggests, as Sorabji puts it, a sort of “split personality”. That is, it suggests that I can at once be both the judge and the one being judged, particularly with respect to specific, past actions which ordinarily elicit remorse. This suggestion is rooted in the quite intuitive idea that human beings are reflexive animals: beings who are not only capable of turning their attention to objects in the outside world but can also “turn back on” (reflectere) or become an object to themselves. As C. S. Lewis put it in his study of the concept of concept of conscience in the Western tradition:

Man might be defined as a reflexive animal. A person cannot help thinking and speaking of himself as, and even feeling himself to be (for certain purposes), two people, one of whom can act upon and observe the other. Thus, he pities, loves, admires, hates, despises, rebukes, comforts, examines, masters or is mastered by, “himself” […] He is privy to his own acts, is his own conscius or accomplice. And of course, this shadowy inner accomplice has all the same properties as an external one; he too is a witness against you, a potential blackmailer, one who inflicts shame and fear. (Lewis 1960: 187; see also Sorabji 2014: 12)

Lewis refers to this primarily pagan understanding of conscience as an “inner witness”. It does not judge our actions as right or wrong, but merely testifies to their existence:

It bears witness to the facts, say, that we committed a murder. It does not tell us that murder is wrong; we are supposed to know that in some other way. (Lewis 1960: 190)

Others, however, regard the sort of conscience that Lewis describes here as a type of internal judge, and therefore refer to it as “judicial conscience” (D’Arcy 1961: 8). While this property of the mind does not necessarily issue binding rules, it does pass moral judgements on our deeds. It would, however, eventually take on the role of issuing moral dictates for future acts as well. Eric D’Arcy refers to this later form of syneidesis or conscientia as the “legislative conscience” whose innovator, he argues, was the Apostle Paul (ca. 5 CE–ca. 64/67 CE), the most important founder of the Christian faith after Jesus of Nazareth (D’Arcy 1961: 8).

1.2 St. Paul: Legislative Conscience

The judicial understanding of conscience continued well into the first century of the Common Era. To be sure, Paul himself continued to employ it. At the same time, D’Arcy credited Paul with introducing, in addition to the “judicial conscience”, a novel conception he termed the “legislative conscience”. It is not difficult to see why the earlier judicial conception would later take on legislative features. This is because the ability to judge past actions as either right or wrong—and to issue exhortations on that basis—would, once this property came to be associated with the moral law, take on the legislative role of issuing commands. Indeed, it is in St. Paul that we find this very association between syneidesis and the moral law:

[W]hen Gentiles, who do not have the law, do by nature things required by the law, they are a law for themselves, even though they do not have the law. They show that the requirements of the law are written on their hearts, their consciences also bearing witness, and their thoughts sometimes accusing them and at other times even defending them. (Romans 2:14–15; NIV)

Judging by this passage, there are evidently two expressions of the moral law according to Paul: The Mosaic Law, explicitly handed down to the Jews, and another law that is “written on [men’s] hearts”. This latter was later glossed as a reference to the natural law, which is accessible to all people, non-Jews included, and is consistent with the Mosaic Law. Notice that, according to the foregoing passage, conscience (syneidesis) is not the ultimate source of right and wrong. Rather, the foundation of right and wrong is the objective moral law, which is both “written on [men’s] hearts” and borne witness to by conscience.

One might say, then, that the objective norm of morality on Paul’s account is the moral law (or natural law). Conscience, however, might be termed morality’s subjective norm. This is made clear in another passage from St. Paul, where he is addressing the question of whether it is permissible for Christians to eat meat that was previously sacrificed to idols. Some, Paul says, erroneously think that to eat such food defiles them. In fact, since the pagan idols do not exist, eating food sacrificed to them, or indeed to God himself, is morally irrelevant, since “food does not bring us near to God—we are no worse if we do not eat, and no better if we do” (1 Corinthians 8:8; NIV). Still, even though the consciences of such Christians are erroneous, they must follow them since conscience, Paul suggests, is a rule of conduct (Romans 14:13–23). Eric D’Arcy sums up these two important contributions of St. Paul as follows:

St. Paul, then, introduces an entirely new phase in the history of the term “conscience” in moral theory, and two new features characterize his use of it. First, it is to play a directive role before action takes place. In the pagan writers, conscience did not appear on the scene until after the action was performed, and its role was purely judicial; but in St. Paul, conscience is credited with a legislative function, and it induces an obligation in the proper sense. Second, conscience is fallible: the directions it issues may be mistaken; but whether it be mistaken or not, it seems that we are bound to follow its rulings. (D’Arcy 1961: 11–12)

In sum, we might follow Sorabji’s suggestion that this phase in the development of the concept of conscience—that is, from its origins in fifth-century BCE Greek literature to the first-century CE—has eight features (Sorabji 2014: 36).

  1. It involves a consciousness of the self rather than of others.
  2. It draws on values to which one feels personally committed or that are “not necessarily shared by others”.
  3. It is self-reflexive insofar as it suggests a “split person”: an “I” that has secret knowledge which it shares with itself.
  4. Its original purpose was “retrospective” or judicial, although it later incorporated into its definition a “prospective” or legislative function.
  5. Although it draws on general moral principles, it is chiefly concerned with their application to the specific circumstances in which the agent finds him or herself.
  6. It began as a secular concept.
  7. In the Christian tradition it is regarded as susceptible to error, and
  8. although cognitive in character, it possesses motivating or affective power.

1.3 St. Jerome: The Invention of Synderesis

That conscience was so central a concept in St. Paul’s writings guaranteed it an important place in the moral theology of the Greek and Latin Fathers, especially St. Basil, John Damascene and St. Ambrose. Amongst these early writers, however, it was a text from St. Jerome that was particularly consequential since it introduced into the debate a neologism that would have an important impact in the later Middle Ages: the concept of synderesis.

In the course of commenting on Ezekiel, Jerome had tied a prophecy mentioned in its first book to Plato’s moral psychology (commentary on Ezekiel 1.7). The prophecy in question consisted of a vision of four creatures emerging from the heavens, each with four faces: those of a man, a lion, an ox and an eagle (Ezekiel 1: 4–14). In his gloss, Jerome noted that “most people” (plerique) interpreted this vision with reference to Plato’s tripartite division of the soul in the Republic: the human face representing reason, the lion’s face the spirited part, and the ox’s face the appetitive part (cf. Plato, Republic, 436b–441b). What did the eagle represent? According to Jerome, it represented that “spark of conscience” (scintilla conscientiae) which makes us aware of our sinfulness when reason, spirit or desire become disordered. Medieval manuscripts refer to this psychological property as synderesis (or sometimes synteresis):

Now above these three was the eagle; so in the soul, they say, above the other three elements and beyond them is a fourth, which the Greeks call synderesis. This is that spark of conscience which was not quenched even in the heart of Cain, when he was driven out of paradise. This it is that which makes us, too, feel our sinfulness when we are overcome by evil Desire or unbridled Spirit, or deceived by sham Reason. It is natural to identify synderesis with the eagle, since it is distinct from the other three elements and corrects them when they err […] However, we also see that this conscience (conscientia) is cast down in some people, who have neither shame nor insight regarding their offences, and loses its place […]. (commentary on Ezekiel 1.7; D’Arcy trans. 1961: 16–17)

Most scholars now agree that the neologism “synderesis” introduced in Jerome’s commentary is simply a corruption of the Greek syneidesis (Kries 2002: 67). Since syneidesis is simply the Greek equivalent of the Latin term conscientia—a fact of which Jerome would certainly have been aware—one might have expected Jerome to use them interchangeably. Surprisingly, however, Jerome suggests that the Latin term means something different from the Greek term. In the text cited above, he quite explicitly states that regardless of how morally corrupt its possessor becomes, synderesis can never be lost. A few lines later, however, he does admit the existence of those who are shameless and lacking in moral insight. Such people are oblivious to their offenses because, according to Jerome, their conscience (conscientia) ceases to be present in them (“looses its place”). If synderesis cannot be lost, but conscience can, then it seems to follow that they are separate properties of the soul. In any case, whatever Jerome’s intention, this curious passage was indirectly handed down to the Middle Ages via the Sentences of Peter Lombard (1095–1160).

2. The Early-Scholastic Tradition

2.1 Peter Lombard: The Scholastic Origins of the Debate

Peter Lombard’s role in the evolution of the concept of conscience is both surprising and unsurprising. It is—at first sight, anyway—surprising because Lombard does not discuss conscience or synderesis in any actual detail. Indeed, he does not, strictly speaking, mention the terms “synderesis” or “conscience” at all. What he does is merely to allude to Jerome’s commentary on Ezekiel in the context of discussing the will’s role in how rational agents can naturally want what is good while simultaneously being slaves to sin (Peter Lombard, Sententiae in IV libros distinctae, 2.39; Potts 1980: 92). In St. Paul’s reference to moral weakness in Romans 7:15, he famously says: “For I do not do what I want but do what I do not want”. Is Paul suggesting, asks Lombard, that we have two separate wills: one naturally oriented towards the good and another oriented towards sin? Or is it rather the case that we have a single will that, although naturally inclined to the good, contains a defect which also “takes pleasure in what is evil” (Sententiae in IV libros distinctae, 2.39; Potts 1980: 93)? Amongst those who hold the first view, the motivating power that orients us towards the good is called the “natural” will, while the inclination towards sin resulting from the Fall is called “free will” (or “free choice”). With respect to the former, Peter writes:

For some say that there are two motivations, one by which a man naturally wants what is good. Why naturally? And why is it called “natural”? Because such was the motivation of human nature in its original state, in which we were created without any defect, and this is properly called “nature”. For man was created with a righteous will […] Man is therefore rightly said naturally to want what is good, because he was constructed with a good and righteous will. For the higher spark of reason (superior enim scintilla rationis) which, as Jerome says, “could not even be extinguished in Cain”, always wants what is good and hates what is bad. (Peter Lombard, Sententiae in IV libros distinctae, 2.39; Potts trans. 1980: 92–93)

Lombard’s brief mention of Jerome’s “spark of reason” (sic) in the aforementioned passage is the full extent of his treatment of conscience and synderesis. Still, that was sufficient to ensure that it would receive robust attention by later scholastics, who would track down the original text from Jerome in order to comment on it. A compilation of theological writings taken mainly from Scripture and the Fathers and arranged in systematic fashion, the Sentences had an enormous impact on later theological enquiry since much it, after the 1220s, was carried out within the taxonomy that Lombard had laid out in his work. Indeed, after Alexander of Hales (1185–1245) adopted the Sentences as the main source for his ordinary lectures at Paris in 1222, and Richard Fischacre (1206–1248) did the same at Oxford in 1245, lecturing on the Sentences became a requirement for every aspiring master of theology. Thus did such major scholastics of the thirteenth and fourteenth centuries as Bonaventure (1221–1274), Thomas Aquinas (1224/25–1274), John Duns Scotus (1265–1308) and William of Ockham (1287–1347) come to write their important commentaries on the work. This tradition would continue well into the sixteenth century.

Consisting of four books, each subdivided into chapters, the Sentences follows the distinction that Saint Augustine had drawn in the De doctrina Christiana between the things that are real and the signs that lead us back to the former. Book one treats of God, who is really real, and his triune nature. Book two deals with creation and the fall, including human nature, treating these as signs that point back to God. Book three treats of Christ, who is the antidote to the fall, and who, as God incarnate, is both thing and sign. Finally, book four treats of the sacraments, which are signs that assist the fallen in their return to God: the ultimate reality. Since book two deals with human moral psychology in the context of creation and the fall, it is here, in distinction 39, that Peter Lombard’s mention of Jerome’s commentary on Ezekiel is found.

Since Lombard’s treatment of Jerome was partial and elliptical, later thinkers, in composing their commentaries on the Sentences, naturally turned to Jerome’s text in order to scrutinize the original passage. There, they discovered his apparent distinction between synderesis and conscience, which in turn would come to frame the parameters of the later medieval debate. If synderesis and conscience are in fact two separate parts of the soul, for instance, what is their relationship to one another? What, come to that, are their respective natures and, rather importantly, can they become disordered? Such questions would preoccupy the theologians of the later Middle Ages.

2.2 Stephen Langton: Synderesis and its Properties

Stephen Langton (1155–1228), regent master of theology at Paris and later Archbishop of Canterbury, is important in the present context less for any systematic treatment of conscience—indeed Stephen scarcely touches on the issue at all—than for his somewhat scattered views on synderesis. The relevant treatment comes in Stephen’s Quaestiones disputatae of 1203–1205 in the context of his discussion on free decision (liberum arbitrium).

For Stephen, there are three powers (vires) of the soul that are relevant to the moral life: the concupiscible appetite, reason and synderesis. The concupiscible appetite draws reason towards what is bad—specifically towards the sin of sensuality—while synderesis attempts to sway it towards the good. It is reason’s job to adjudicate between these two impulses. Freedom of decision (libertas arbitrii) is the outcome of reason directing the will to choose in accordance with either the promptings of sensuality, or the promptings of synderesis (Stephen Langton, Quaestiones disputatae; Lottin ed. Psychologie et morale I, 1942: 61).

The purpose of synderesis, then, is to direct reason away from vice for it is the faculty “by which a person naturally detests what is evil and is a part of the rational power” (Quaestiones disputatae; Lottin ed. Psychology et morale II.1, 1948: 112). Can such a power be extinguished? Yes and no. In its capacity as an inclination towards the good, which is accidental to it, synderesis can indeed be lost in the damned. Essentially speaking, however, the purpose of synderesis is to repudiate what is wicked. In this sense, it is never lost, even in the damned (Quaestiones disputatae; Lottin ed. 1948: 111).

Stephen Langton’s most important contribution to the development of the concept of synderesis occurs in his discussion of whether synderesis can merit or demerit. In the process of discussing this issue Stephen links synderesis to the practical syllogism, specifically associating it with the grasp of general principles (Quaestiones disputatae; Lottin ed. 1948: 113). D’Arcy sums up Langton’s position as follows:

Remorse of conscience is the work, not of synderesis, but of reason, for synderesis remains at the level of general principles, whereas reason descends to the concrete case; but it is precisely over the concrete case that remorse of conscience is felt; hence it is by reason, and not by synderesis, that we sin. (D’Arcy 1961: 23–24)

Langton’s association of synderesis with general moral principles would, as we will see, influence later thinkers such as Aquinas.

2.3 Philip the Chancellor: The First Systematic Treatment of Synderesis and Conscience

Although Stephen Langton was the first scholastic to touch on the issue of synderesis in any depth, it was Philip the Chancellor (ca. 1170–1237) who wrote the first treatise devoted to exploring the relationship between synderesis and conscience (Lottin 1948: 139–157). As chancellor of Notre Dame, Philip had the right to grant the license to teach in the theology faculty at Paris, and it was under his tenure that the Dominicans and the Franciscans acquired their chairs in theology: two for the former, and one for the latter. Although primarily an administrator, Philip was also a trained theologian. His most important work is the Summa de bono, which includes the treatise on conscience.

In his treatise Philip sets out to answer several questions related to the ontological status of synderesis, to the question of whether anyone can sin if they follow synderesis, and to whether it can ever be extinguished. As to the ontological status of synderesis, Philip cites Jerome’s authoritative suggestion that synderesis is a faculty or power of the soul. Recall that Jerome had posited a quadripartite soul: one that is composed of reason, spirit, desire and synderesis. Since the first three parts of the soul are potentialities and synderesis is classified alongside these, it seems to follow that it too must be a faculty or power of the soul, distinct from the faculty of reason. Philip cites St. Paul and John of Damascus as corroborating authorities who apparently share the view that synderesis is a faculty of the soul independent of the others (Philip the Chancellor, Summa de bono: Treatise on Conscience; Potts trans. 1980: 95–96).

Against the claim that synderesis is a power of the soul, Philip presents arguments for the view that it is, on the contrary, a moral habit. On this view, synderesis is to the natural will what choice is to the deliberative will: a disposition that regulates the rationally appetitive powers. But while choice simply regulates the deliberative will with respect to the contingent good, or means towards happiness, synderesis

is a disposition arising naturally in conjunction with that potentiality by which the natural will is directed to what is good without qualification. (Summa de bono: Treatise on Conscience; Potts trans. 1980: 96)

Moreover, just as the impulse to sin is distinct from the soul, so too is synderesis. But whereas the former inclines the agent towards evil, the latter inclines him towards goodness.

Is synderesis, then, a power of the soul or a habit? This distinction goes back to Aristotle, for whom powers are innate and associated with specific capacities, while habits are acquired and associated, by contrast, with tendencies to behave in certain ways. Habits, moreover, inhere in powers. Although both of these properties dispose the agent to act in particular ways, powers, in contrast to habits, are linked to the ability to do so contingently. If I am in the habit of speaking Russian, for instance, then I will have the tendency to do so on a regular basis. It is my preferred mode of communication, and I will take every opportunity to express myself in that language. That I may have the mere capacity—or power—to speak Russian, on the other hand, having studied it in school, say, in no way ensures that I will do so even in situations where I probably should. I might, for example, hate and resent speaking Russian for various reasons, and therefore freely refuse to do so under any circumstances (see, e.g., Aristotle, Metaphysics 9.2, and Potts 1980: 20–22).

Although Philip seems to favour the belief that synderesis is a habit, the claim that it is a power of the soul has the rather weighty authority of St. Paul and St. Jerome. Philip therefore splits the difference, as it were, and argues that it is a “habit-like power” or “dispositional potentiality” (habitualis potentiae)—a faculty of the soul that disposes its possessor towards choosing the unqualified good—though one that is innate rather than acquired through habituation:

Synderesis, although the morphology of its name makes it sound more like a disposition than a potentiality, is nevertheless the name of a dispositional potentiality: I do not say of an acquired disposition, but of an innate one. And thus, qua disposition it can be applied to what is related to it as a disposition, qua potentiality to what is related to it as a potentiality. From this it follows that it has a certain opposition to free choice, a certain opposition to the impulse [to sin] and sensuality, and a certain opposition to proheresis, which is part of free choice: qua potentiality, it is disparate from free choice and from sensuality, qua disposition it is disparate from proheresis and the impulse [to sin]…So, if anyone asks whether it is a potentiality or a disposition, the right answer lies in taking something in between: a dispositional potentiality. (Summa de bono: Treatise on Conscience; Potts trans. 1980: 97)

It would seem, then, that synderesis is a potentiality, albeit an unusual one. Is it connected to the cognitive side of the soul or to the appetitive? According to Philip, it is related to the appetitive, and specifically to the rational appetite, that is, to the will, rather than to the sense appetite. However, as we saw, Philip divides the rational appetite into what he calls “natural will” and “deliberative will”. The natural will signifies the general inclination that humans have to the good or happiness as such. Such an object is beyond the scope of choice. Having said that, happiness can be achieved in any number of ways and by the acquisition of any number of legitimate, though contingent goods. Indeed, it is fair to say that rational agents never choose happiness as such, given that it is a mere abstraction. Rather, what they choose are particular goods which, taken together, comprise the good life if pursued in an orderly way. Such contingent goods are the means to happiness and are the objects of the deliberative will, and therefore choice. Synderesis, according to Philip, pertains to the natural will. It is the remnant of original rectitude or justice which, although damaged during the fall, remains in the soul in diminished form. As Philip puts it, synderesis is that which “murmurs back against sin and correctly contemplates and wants what is good without qualification” (Summa de bono: Treatise on Conscience; Potts trans. 1980: 100).

On the matter of conscience and how it is related to synderesis, Philip distinguishes them. For one thing, conscience can be mistaken while synderesis cannot. Specifically, conscience is the result of a concurrence of synderesis with free decision (liberum arbitrium). Put otherwise, it is the specific application of a general moral principle that is the outcome of deliberation. When correctly applied, conscience is correct. When incorrectly applied, it errs. In either case, the judgement of conscience generates a moral obligation to act. Philip uses the following example of how synderesis, which is always right, can nonetheless conjoin with an erring conscience (Potts 1980: 104):

  1. Unerring universal premise of synderesis: “Everyone who falsely claims to be the Son of God should be put to death”.
  2. Erring minor premise of reason: “This Christ fellow is falsely claiming to be the Son of God”.
  3. Erring judgement of conscience: “Therefore this Christ fellow should be put to death”

From the foregoing example, it is clear that synderesis delivers a general, non-deliberative proposition, while conscience yields what Potts calls a particular, “deontic proposition”:

Philip’s argument is […] that we need to distinguish between general and particular propositions which are of the form: “A ought to φ” where the proper name of any person may be substituted for “A” and any verb-phrase containing a verb of action for “φ” (I shall henceforth call these “deontic propositions”). (Potts 1982: 690–692)

In the example given above, then, the first, universal premise is correct (by definition), while the conclusion, as mediated by erring reason, generates an incorrect deontic proposition, which is to say, an obligation to act, albeit a mistaken one.

3. The Later-Scholastic Tradition

3.1 St. Bonaventure: Conscience as Cognitive/Synderesis as Affective

One of the most prominent representatives of the Franciscan intellectual tradition, Bonaventure (1217–1274) lectured on the Sentences at Paris from 1250 until 1252, when he became regent master in the theology faculty, a position he held until 1257. His commentary on the Sentences is the fruit of these lectures, and it is in this work that he discusses the topics of conscience and synderesis. For Bonaventure we not only possess innate moral knowledge, but we also have an inextinguishable inclination towards achieving the good. Our inborn knowledge of the former, that is, of the natural law, is associated with conscience, which resides in the intellect, while our inclination towards desiring the good is associated with synderesis, which inheres in the will.

What is the ontological status of conscience? According to Bonaventure, just as theologians have disagreed over the nature of “thought”, defining it variously as the power of thinking, a habit or an apprehended principle of knowledge, so too have they differed over how to define “conscience” (conscientia). Most commonly, however, the term has been used to refer to a cognitive habit or disposition that relates to the practical as opposed to the theoretical intellect. Indeed, it is the disposition that perfects the practical intellect. How so? Through its consciousness of the principles that comprise the natural law—such as that “God is to be honoured”—and through the issuing of such injunctions to the will. As Bonaventure puts it:

theoretical knowledge perfects our thought to the extent that the latter is theoretical, whereas conscience is a disposition perfecting our thought to the extent that it is practical, or to the extent that it directs us towards deeds. (Bonaventure, commentary on the Sentences, 2.39: a. 1, q. 1; Potts trans. 1980: 111)

Is such a disposition innate or acquired? It is possible, according to Bonaventure, to find authorities on both sides of the debate. For the opinion that conscience is innate, Bonaventure cites, among other authorities, St. Paul’s famous reference to a moral law that is “written on [men’s] hearts” in Romans 1:14–15. He also appeals to a “natural instinct to seek blessedness and [to] honor [one’s] parents” (commentary on the Sentences, 2.39: a. 1, q. 2; McGrade trans. 2001: 175–176). For the opinion that conscience is not innate, on the other hand, Bonaventure cites Aristotle’s claim that the soul is a blank slate. Bonaventure’s solution is to find a middle position between St. Paul, on the one hand, and Aristotle, on the other. His conclusion: conscience is part innate, part acquired.

In what sense is it innate? Just as rational creatures have a natural capacity to judge the veracity of first principles in the realm of speculative reason, so we have an innate capacity to judge the first principles of practical reason. This innate capacity to immediately grasp such principles as true or not in the realm of practical reason is called conscience. It is associated, for Bonaventure, with the Augustinian “natural light”—or “natural tribunal”—that is built into the structure of the mind and which permits rational agents to intuitively grasp the basic principles of the natural law (see, e.g., Augustine, City of God, 11.27, Bettenson trans. 1972: 461–462). Just as the mind is disposed to grasp, in the realm of theoretical reason, the axiomatic nature of such propositions as that “all bachelors are unmarried males”, so too it has a innate disposition to grasp as self-evidently true such basic principles in the domain of practical reason as “Honour thy father and mother” and “Do not harm thy neighbour”.

In what sense, though, is conscience acquired? Although the ability to judge the deontic propositions of the natural law as self-evidently true is innate, it does not follow that the contents of such propositions are innate. It does not follow, that is, that the concepts “father” and “mother” in the precept to honor one’s parents are in the mind from birth. And indeed, so Bonaventure thinks, they are not. Rather, they are species or likenesses acquired through sense experience which, once acquired, form the terms of the universal propositions of the natural law that are intuitively grasped. In this sense, Bonaventure is true to Aristotle:

For everyone agrees that there is an imparted light of the apprehensory potentiality which is called a natural tribunal, but we acquire forms and likenesses of things by means of the senses, as Aristotle says explicitly in many places, and as experience also teaches us. (commentary on the Sentences 2.39: a. 1, q. 2; Potts trans. 1980: 113)

Conscience, then, is partly innate and partly acquired with respect to the content of the natural law. But what is the relationship of such universal premises to the conclusions of practical reason? How does the agent proceed from a general knowledge of right and wrong to the application of this knowledge to concrete situations? After all, such universal premises are only useful to the extent that they can be applied. For Bonaventure, the habit of directing the agent toward applying the general principles of the natural law to specific actions, like the habit of immediately grasping deontic principles, is innate. But in order to apply this self-evident knowledge we must acquire further knowledge. For example, although we grasp a priori the truth that one should honor one’s father and mother, we have no innate knowledge that John and Mary are our parents and that it is they specifically who must be honoured as opposed to, say, Michael and Jane. Rather, this type of knowledge is derived from experience and instruction.

Note that conscience does not simply move from the general to the particular with respect to concrete actions. It also moves from the general to the specific with respect to propositions themselves. As Potts points out, there are in fact two classes of deontic propositions: basic and derived (Potts 1982: 698). Consider the deontic proposition to obey God, which is basic, or maximally evident. Obviously, other more specific precepts can be derived from this very general one. Historically, for instance, from the basic deontic proposition to obey God the Jews derived the further, less evident but more specific deontic propositions to refrain from eating pork and to circumcise their sons. How did they come to know these more specific propositions? By means of a revealed commandment—via (divine) instruction, in other words (commentary on the Sentences 2.39: a. 2, q. 3, ad 4; Potts trans. 1980: 120). Although the distinction between basic and derived deontic propositions is Potts’, and although the case cited is an example of an erroneous conscience (Bonaventure argues that male circumcision and the prohibition on eating pork are no longer applicable), it accurately sums up Bonaventure’s distinction between propositions that are “very clearly evident” versus those that are “less evident”:

Just as some things that are cognizable are very clearly evident, such as axioms and first principles, while some are less evident, such as particular conclusions, so also in things that can be done, some are evident in the highest degree, for example, “Do not do to another what you do not want done to you” and that one should submit to God and suchlike. In the same way, then, as the cognition of first principles is said to be innate in us by reason of that light, because (due to their self-evidence) that light suffices for cognizing them (after the reception of species) without any additional persuasion, so also the cognition of moral first principles is innate in us, in that that judicatory suffices for cognizing them. Again, in the same way as cognition of the particular conclusions of the sciences is acquired, because the light innate in us does not fully suffice for knowing them, but some persuasion and fuller acquaintance are needed, so on the side of things that can be done we must understand, similarly, that we are bound to do some things which we know only through additional instruction. (commentary on the Sentences 2.39: a. 1, q. 2; McGrade trans 2001: 179)

This distinction between basic, or very general principles, and specific or derived precepts is germane to the question of whether conscience can ever be mistaken and, if so, whether in such cases it continues to bind. Bonaventure’s response is that we can never be mistaken about basic deontic propositions. Rather, it is with respect to derived ones that we sometimes err since

although conscience is always right so long as it sticks to the general and is moved by simple inspection, it can become mistaken when it descends to particulars and brings things together, because the actualisation of deliberative reason is mixed with it. (commentary on the Sentences 2.39: a. 2, q. 3, ad 4; Potts trans. 1980: 120)

Is one obliged to always follow one’s conscience? It depends, since conscience is fallible. If what it dictates is in accordance with God’s will, then one is obliged to follow it on pain of eternal damnation. If erroneous—if what it dictates is contrary to the divine will—as is sometimes the case when applying basic deontological principles, then conscience does not bind. Rather, the agent has an obligation to correct the error in order to bring his conscience into line with the natural law. If he does not, and follows his erroneous conscience, he commits a mortal sin. “It is clear that conscientia always either binds us to do what it tells us, or binds us to change it” (commentary on the Sentences 2.39: a. 1, q. 3; Potts trans. 1980: 114–115). Obviously, then, the intellect plays an important role in achieving happiness given its possession of conscience. But what of the will? Does it not have an equally important role to play in the moral life? Yes: in its possession of synderesis. In line with tradition, Bonaventure calls synderesis the “spark of conscience” (commentary on the Sentences 2.39: a. 2; McGrade trans. 2001: 186). He breaks with tradition, however, in arguing that it inheres in the will rather than in the intellect. Indeed synderesis, for Bonaventure, is precisely the counterpart of conscience insofar as the will, like the intellect, has an innate inclination towards the moral (as opposed to the useful) good. In the case of the intellect this disposition takes the form of the “natural light” of conscience that apprehends the first principles of the natural law; in the case of the will, it takes the form of synderesis: a “natural bias” towards desiring the moral good. There is one sense, however, in which synderesis is not exactly analogous to conscience. While it looks very much like a habit, synderesis is rather, according to Bonaventure (presumably following Philip the Chancellor), a habit-like power of the soul (commentary on the Sentences 2.39: a. 2, q. 1; Potts trans. 1980: 116–117).

Can synderesis ever be extinguished? No: it is an innate orientation towards goodness that cannot be completely eradicated, ontologically speaking, even in the most vicious of people. In its exercise, however, it can become impeded “either by the darkness of blindness, or by the wantonness of pleasure, or by the hardness of obstinacy” (commentary on the Sentences 2.39: a. 2, q. 2; Potts trans. 1980: 117). In such cases, synderesis ceases to “murmur” against evil or “goad” towards the good, either because the agent is blinded by ignorance, distracted by physical pleasure or is so stubbornly persistent in their depravity that they cannot reorient themselves towards the good. Still, when synderesis follows the innate judgement of conscience with respect to basic deontic principles, which can never err, then it too functions correctly because that is its natural state. It has the potential to go wrong and fall into sin only during the exercise of deliberation with respect to particular truths since it is here that reason can become faulty and the will, which is free, disordered. When reason and will malfunction synderesis is “overthrown, in that its effect and its government over the other deliberative powers is repulsed and broken” (commentary on the Sentences 2.39: a. 2, q. 3; Potts trans. 1980: 119). When this happens, the agent sins.

3.2 St Thomas Aquinas: Synderesis and Conscience as Cognitive

Thomas Aquinas (1224/25–1274) is, by any measure, one of the most important, if not the most important, scholastic theologian of the later Middle Ages. Although his views on conscience and synderesis have received less attention in recent years than his theory of natural law, this is unjustified. For the scholastics, a full account of morality includes not only an explanation of how practical norms are grounded, but also an understanding of how they are grasped and how it is that rational agents, despite possessing an infallible guide to such knowledge, often fail to apply it. One’s metaethics, in other words, is inextricably linked to one’s moral psychology, which is to say, to one’s understanding of how the will and the intellect interact with one’s knowledge of right and wrong.

Aquinas discussed the issues of synderesis and conscience in several of his major works, from his early commentary on the Sentences and the De veritate to his mature Summa theologica (see D’Arcy 1961: 36–47). As might be expected, his account is very different from that of his Franciscan contemporary Bonaventure. For one thing, Bonaventure assigns synderesis to the will. He also describes it, as we saw above, as a “habit-like faculty”. Aquinas, as might be expected, hews much closer to his Dominican mentor and teacher Albert the Great (ca. 1200–1280) for whom both synderesis and conscience belong to the intellect (see Dougherty 2018: 221).

For Aquinas, the rational part of the soul comprises the faculties or powers of intellect and will. The object of the will is the good, and the object of the intellect is the true. The latter potency is further divided into the speculative intellect (intellectus speculativus) and the practical intellect (intellectus practicus). How do these differ? The object of the speculative intellect is truth as such, while the object of the practical intellect is the good “under the aspect of truth” (Thomas Aquinas, Summa theologica I, q. 79, a. 11, ad. 2). Synderesis and conscience, for Aquinas, both belong to the practical intellect.

All reasoning must start from immediately evident principles if an infinite regress is to be avoided. This is as true in the realm of practical reason as it is in the realm of speculative reason. Once such principles have been grasped and assented to, more specific conclusions can be deduced. How are these principles grasped? In the domain of speculative reason, they are apprehended by the innate disposition that Aquinas calls intellectus—“intuitive reason” or “understanding”—and that Aristotle called nous. The objects of this habit are such self-evident propositions as that “every whole is greater than its part” and that “things equal to one and the same are equal to one another” (Summa theologica I-II, q 94, a. 2, corp.). Once their terms are known, the intellect immediately grasps the truth of such propositions since they are analytic in nature. The corresponding habit in the domain of practical reason, on the other hand, is synderesis: a property of the soul which can never be lost, which never errs, and whose objects are the first principles of the natural law (De veritate 16.1, corp.). A good description of how Aquinas understands synderesis is Hoffmann’s, who calls it an “infallible moral awareness” (Hoffmann 2012: 255). Like understanding, synderesis is innate:

Wherefore the first practical principles, bestowed on us by nature, do not belong to a special power, but to a special natural habit, which we call “synderesis”. Whence “synderesis” is said to incite to good, and to murmur at evil, inasmuch as through first principles we proceed to discover, and judge of what we have discovered. It is therefore clear that “synderesis” is not a power, but a natural habit. (Summa theologica I, q. 79, a. 12, corp.)

In broad terms, synderesis is a link between the human intellect and the divine wisdom. The universe is created and governed by a providential God and is therefore subject to the order of final causality. Accordingly, all things, rational and non-rational alike, seek their proper ends. Non-rational beings, since they lack will and intellect and are therefore incapable of prudential reasoning, achieve their ends through the natural inclinations that are implanted in them by God. In this sense, they participate in the providential plan for all creation that Aquinas calls the “eternal law”: the divine wisdom insofar as it directs all creatures towards their ends (Summa theologica I-II, q. 93, a. 1, corp.). They do so, however, in a diminished way. Rational beings, by contrast, participate in divine providence in a more excellent way. This participation in the eternal law is called the natural law, whose moral principles function to direct human beings toward their ultimate end: happiness (Summa theologica, I-II, q. 91, a. 2, corp.). These moral principles, which are grasped and accordingly possessed by synderesis, offer an insight into God’s intentions for human beings and therefore into the ultimate purpose of human life. As Baylor writes of Aquinas’s theory:

Moral principles are based upon and derived from a rationality that is present in reality; they are a human knowledge of the exemplary ideas in the divine mind according to which creation is imbued with a rational order. (Baylor 1977: 46)

Practical reasoning, then, plays a central role in the achievement of happiness, the final end for humans, and therefore in God’s plan for us. Like speculative reasoning, practical reasoning generally takes a deductive form. Just as science is the conclusion of the demonstrative syllogism, so conscience is the conclusion of a practical syllogism. The practical syllogism, like the demonstrative syllogism, contains a major premise, a minor premise and a conclusion. The major premise is drawn or deduced from synderesis. The minor premise, on the other hand, is drawn either from faith, natural reason or human positive law. From the major and minor premises, a conclusion is drawn that generates a moral obligation to act (Hoffmann 2012: 258). This inferential judgment is associated, for Aquinas, with conscience: an act—as opposed to a faculty or a habit—that includes a number of applications, such as “to witness, to bind, or incite, and also to accuse, torment, or rebuke” (Thomas Aquinas, Summa theologica I, q. 79, a. 13, corp.).

Conscience acts as a “witness” when it is consciously aware of some personal wrongdoing, whether of commission or omission. It “binds” or “incites” when it makes a judgement that some act should be performed. Finally, it “accuses”, “torments” or “rebukes” when it judges that some past action was either morally acceptable or it was not. Although it is difficult to see how conscience in the first sense—conscience as witness—can function as an application of knowledge to conduct, this seems less problematic in the second and third senses of the term, which harken back to the legislative and judicial senses of conscience found in St. Paul and pagan antiquity, respectively (D’Arcy 1961: 46). In any case, an example of the way in which conscience applies the natural law—whose principles are apprehended by synderesis— is articulated in Aquinas’s De veritate:

If the judgement of synderesis expresses the statement: “nothing prohibited by the law of God is to be done”, and if the knowledge of higher reason presents this minor premise “sexual intercourse with this woman is forbidden by the law of God”, the application of conscience will be made by concluding: “this sexual intercourse is to be avoided”. (De veritate, q. 17, a. 2, corp.; cited in Dougherty 2018: 222)

Now the dictates of conscience can either be right, if correctly deduced from the natural law, or wrong, if they are incorrectly deduced. The dictates of the former are the product of a “correct conscience” and the judgements of the latter are the result of an “erroneous conscience”. Since synderesis is infallible, the main source of an erroneous conscience, when it does occur, is the agent’s adoption of a faulty minor premise in the practical syllogism (De veritate q. 17, a. 2; Potts trans. 1980: 132–133).

Now it is clear that we have an obligation to follow a correct conscience since to do so contributes to achieving our final end. But what of an erroneous conscience? Does this have any authority? For Aquinas, an erring conscience also binds. It does not, however, necessarily excuse. As Hoffmann puts it,

regardless of whether my action is objectively good, evil or indifferent, conscience binds, for it is by means of conscience that an action is proposed to me as good, bad, or indifferent. (Hoffmann 2012: 260)

For example, it is objectively right—in accordance with the natural law—to refrain from sex outside of marriage. But suppose that an agent (mistakenly) believes that such abstinence is sinful, and yet still refrains. According to Aquinas, this agent, although he does what is objectively right, nonetheless sins. Why? Because in choosing the opposite of what his conscience dictated, he chose to do something he believed to be evil. And choosing what is (subjectively if not objectively) wrong, for Aquinas, is a sin: “[F] from the very fact that a thing is proposed by the reason as being evil, the will by tending thereto becomes evil” (Summa theologica, I-II, q. 19, a. 5, corp.).

What follows from this is that conscience, whether right or erroneous, always binds. As to the question of whether an erroneous conscience excuses, on the other hand, that depends on the type of ignorance that causes it. This is because some types of ignorance render an act involuntary and therefore excusable, and some do not. Ignorance that excuses is called invincible, and concerns ignorance about the facts of the situation (assuming, of course, there is no negligence involved). Such cases, that is, where an agent could not have known better under the circumstances and would not have thus acted had he known better, are excusable. Aquinas uses the example of fornication—voluntary, illicit sex—to illustrate his point. Although it is a sin to commit adultery, a man is excused if he has sexual relations with a woman who is not his wife, so long as he is genuinely, if improbably, mistakes the women for his wife. This is

because this error arises from ignorance of a circumstance, which ignorance excuses, and causes the act to be involuntary. (Summa theologica I-II, q. 19, a. 6, corp.)

Ignorance that contributes to an erroneous conscience that is in any way voluntary is vincible, or able to be corrected, and therefore culpable if followed. This generally happens where the agent’s ignorance of the particulars of the situation is either the result of negligence, or where there is ignorance of the relevant moral principles. The former cases are the result of the agent not taking appropriate care to find out about the facts of situation so that he or she can sin while feigning ignorance. In the case of one’s ignorance of universal premises, this too is culpable since it is one’s obligation to know the moral law. (Summa theologica I-II, q. 19, a. 6, corp.).

But one might be wondering how it is that culpable ignorance is even possible where it relates to general moral principles. How can one go wrong about the universal premises that form the major premise of the practical syllogism, which are drawn from the precepts which comprise the natural law, if synderesis, which grasps such premises, is infallible? Aquinas’s answer is that there are two types of natural law precepts: primary—or those which are “most general”—and secondary. Aquinas is less specific on this topic than is optimal, but in drawing this distinction he seems to mean something like the following. About the primary precepts of the natural law, no-one can go wrong. Unfortunately, as we have seen, such precepts are of a very general character, such as “do good and avoid evil”. For such general knowledge to be applicable by conscience, it must be further specified. This further specification comprises the secondary precepts of the natural law, which are closely drawn from the former precepts and from natural inclination. About such secondary, derived precepts of the natural law, such as “adultery is to be avoided”, humans are all too prone to become ignorant. For Aquinas such ignorance is the result either of vice or of having been socialized in a culture with “vicious customs”:

I answer that […] there belongs to the natural law, first, certain most general precepts, that are known to all; and secondly, certain secondary and more detailed precepts, which are, as it were, conclusions following closely from first principles. As to those general principles, the natural law, in the abstract, can nowise be blotted out from men’s hearts. […] But as to […] the secondary precepts, the natural law can be blotted out from the human heart, either by evil persuasions, just as in speculative matters errors occur in respect of necessary conclusions; or by vicious customs and corrupt habits […]. (Summa theologica I-II, q. 94, a. 6, corp.)

A final problem seems to emerge: are we not, according to Aquinas’s account of the erroneous conscience, left with the possibility of a moral dilemma? For if we have an obligation to always follow our consciences, but we sometimes sin when we do follow them, then it seems that we are sometimes put into a double bind. We seem, that is, to sometimes have conflicting obligations so that regardless of what we do, we sin. Aquinas’s solution is that it is only wrong to follow a conscience that is in a state of vincible ignorance. Since such ignorance is by definition correctable, we can always resolve the apparent dilemma by choosing to put aside our ignorance. As far as acting from invincible ignorance is concerned, we are pardoned.

3.3 William of Ockham: New Directions in the Understanding of Synderesis and Conscience

With the fourteenth-century theologian William of Ockham (1285–1347) we encounter some radically new developments on the topics of synderesis and conscience. While Ockham’s Franciscan predecessor John Duns Scotus had disagreements with Aquinas about the nature of the moral law, Scotus fundamentally agreed with the Dominican in viewing synderesis and conscience a habit and an act of the practical reason, respectively, whose jobs were to apprehend the basic principles of morality in the case of synderesis, and to apply them in the case of conscience (John Duns Scotus, Ordinatio 2, d. 39; Wolter trans. 1997: 162–163). Like Scotus, Ockham also agrees with Aquinas in several crucial respects. Where Ockham departs from Aquinas, and indeed with the entire scholastic tradition which preceded him, however, is in his abandonment of the concept of synderesis, and in his unique approach to the invincibly erroneous conscience.

It is difficult to know for certain why Ockham abandoned the concept of synderesis. Michael Baylor, however, has suggested two possibilities. The first is that, as we have seen, synderesis was regarded by Ockham’s predecessors, like Aquinas, as an inborn habit. But for Ockham, rational agents only come to possess habits by acquiring them, and they can only acquire them by doing the relevant acts repeatedly. The notion that a habit could be innate, then, would have seemed incoherent to Ockham (Baylor 1977: 78; Fuchs 1952: 5–6).

The second possible explanation—though Baylor thinks this implausible—has to do with the way that Ockham understands the foundations of morality as compared with Aquinas. For Ockham, there is no essential connection between the moral order as it currently exists and the divine wisdom. The highest norm of morality is the divine will. It just so happens that murder, for example, is wrong today. But there is no reason that God could not make murder right tomorrow if he so willed. The moral order, in short, is contingent. On the Thomistic view, however, the natural law is a participation in the eternal law. It is the point of contact between God’s plan for us as conceived in the divine mind, on the one hand, and the human intellect, on the other. Synderesis, as we saw above, plays a key role in this connection insofar as it grasps the moral principles that lead human beings to their final destiny. Moreover, the moral principles that guide us in how to achieve our final end are as true today as they were yesterday, and indeed will be for all time, owing to the natures that God has bestowed upon us. As Baylor writes:

As the element of man’s original nature which was substantially undamaged after Adam’s fall, the synteresis was the anthropological point of connection between an abiding moral order, which manifested ideas in the divine intellect according to which creation was necessarily ordered, and man’s certain knowledge of universal principles of that moral order. Ockham, however, stressed the absolute contingency of creation […] For Ockham, God’s will, as manifested in the moral precepts he has ordained, constitutes the ultimate and objective norm of morality. God is under no obligation; rather, it is divine will which determines moral obligation. This awesome conception of divine liberty and omnipotence, and the contingency of the created order has led many to the conclusion that the objective basis of Ockham’s ethics is authoritarian or positivistic and inherently unstable since it appears to depend only upon an alterable divine fiat. If this were so, then it would appear odd also to posit within man an inborn and inalienable knowledge of moral principles in the form of synteresis. (Baylor 1977: 79–80)

A distinguished proponent of the interpretation Baylor describes was Servais Pinckaers. Because the foundations of morality are rooted in the divine will, which can change, there was no need for Ockham to resort to a mechanism that discovers the eternal principles of morality as these emerge from human nature since, for Ockham, no such principles exist. Rather, according to Pinckaers’ interpretation of Ockham, moral principles are known through revelation. (Pinckaers 1993: 258). While Pinckaers was correct in his assessment of Ockham’s metaethics—which is fundamentally authoritarian despite elements of rationalism—he was wrong in his characterization of Ockham’s moral epistemology. This is because, while it is indeed possible to come to know the principles of morality via divine revelation, on Ockham’s account, it is also possible, despite their grounding in God’s will, to come to know them via natural reason and experience (see Eardley 2013: 82–87). Examples of the former, that is, of principles that are self-evidently true, are “every blameworthy evil is to be avoided” and “the will ought to conform itself to right reason”. An example of a moral proposition that is grounded in experience, on the other hand, is “an angry man should be calmed with soothing words” (Eardley 2013: 86–87). God obviously wills that we should follow such injunctions. But how can we know his will if not through revelation? Although the contemporary philosopher Peter Geach was not a particularly sympathetic reader of Ockham, he was willing to concede the possibility that a metaethics grounded in divine commands could nonetheless yield a naturalistic moral epistemology. As he put it:

the rational recognition that a practice is generally undesirable and that it is best for people on the whole not even to think of resorting to it is thus in fact a promulgation to a man of the Divine law forbidding the practice, even if he does not realise that this is a promulgation of the Divine law, even if he does not believe there is a God. (Geach 1981: 170)

Ockham would have agreed.

A second and related way in which Pinckaers misinterpreted Ockham’s moral epistemology was Pinckaers’ assumption that, because Ockham discarded the traditional notion of synderesis, he must have done the same for its twin concept of conscience. Pinckaers conceded that moral principles, even if rooted in the divine will, still need to be applied to particular situations on Ockham’s account. This role was, of course, reserved for conscience in the earlier tradition. In Ockham, according to Pinckaers, this role now became associated with practical reason and prudence (Pinckaers 1993: 259).

A closer reading of the textual evidence suggests that Ockham very much made use of the traditional concept of conscience. Indeed, much of how he employed the concept was consistent with the tradition, especially as articulated by Aquinas. Ockham associates the dictates of practical reason, for example, with judgements of conscience. He is also emphatic in his belief that rational agents have an absolute obligation to follow their consciences, which can be correct or erroneous (Quaestiones variae, q. 8, a. 1, OTh 8: 411). A conscience is correct when it is in accord with right reason; it is erroneous when it is not. Finally, an erroneous conscience, for Ockham, as with Aquinas, is either in a state of vincible—voluntary and therefore culpable—ignorance, or in a state of invincible—or involuntary—ignorance. Where conscience is in a state of vincible ignorance, we must do our best to set it aside. In all these cases Ockham follows the tradition, with one exception: that of the invincibly erroneous conscience (Eardley 2013: 94–98), the state in which the agent finds himself with the correct universal principles, but non-culpably errs with respect to his grasp of the circumstances in which he finds himself.

In what sense does Ockham depart from the tradition? For Ockham, the act of following an invincibly erroneous conscience is not merely excusable, as it was For Aquinas, but “virtuous and meritorious”. Consider the following example from Ockham. While walking down the street one day you pass a homeless person who asks you for money. He appears to have a moral claim on you since you assent to the moral principle that “help is to be given to every needy person in extreme need lest he die”. Does he appear needy, and indeed desperate to you? Yes. Sizing him up, you determine that, although it is theoretically possible that he could be fraud, this seems unlikely. For Ockham, you are obliged in this instance to follow your conscience, and indeed you do. It turns out, however, that this apparent homeless person is in fact a very wealthy person who is impersonating a beggar. For Ockham, in following your conscience, you are not merely excused or absolved of your error, but your (ignorant) act is virtuous and, indeed, regarded by God as meritorious (so long, that is, that your act of charity is done out of love for God). As Ockham puts it:

Consequently, [in the above case] a right act of the will and an error of the intellect remain at the same time with respect to the same object. And the whole reason is because that error is not in the power of the one who is mistaken, who took all due diligence to find out the truth, and therefore that error excuses from every sin. And consequently, the will that elicits the act in conformity to such [invincibly] erroneous reason acts virtuously and meritoriously. Indeed, had he not, while in such error, willed to help that person, he would have performed a vicious and demeritorious act because such an act would have been knowingly elicited against conscience and against non-culpable reason, because in the aforementioned case he does not know that he is in error but believes that he possesses right reason, and consequently by despising reason [in this way] he sins mortally. (Quaestiones varie q. 8, a. 2, Oth 8: 423–424)

What is motivating Ockham’s novel suggestion? Even Aquinas admitted that we have an obligation to follow our consciences, whether right or erroneous. When we do not do so, according to Aquinas, we sin. Of course, when our consciences are in a state of voluntary or vincible ignorance we also have a duty to put aside our error, otherwise we sin. It is obviously not possible, however, to put error aside in the case of invincible ignorance since such ignorance is by definition involuntary. Accordingly, for Aquinas, we are obliged to follow such a conscience. Although we act wrongly, in such cases, we are, for Aquinas, excused on the grounds that we could not have known better. To return to Aquinas’s example of inadvertently sleeping with someone who is not your spouse: this might be excusable, for Aquinas, but there is no possibility that such an act might be considered virtuous, much less meritorious. But for Ockham, if it is vicious and therefore punishable not to follow an invincibly erroneous conscience, then merely being excused for following it when we are under a moral obligation to do so would be an insufficient reward. Rather, it should logically follow that it is virtuous and therefore meritorious.


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