Constructivism in Metaethics
Metaethical constructivism is the view that insofar as there are normative truths, they are not fixed by normative facts that are independent of what rational agents would agree to under some specified conditions of choice. The appeal of this view lies in the promise to explain how normative truths are objective and independent of our actual judgments, while also binding and authoritative for us.
Constructivism comes in several varieties, some of which claim a place within metaethics while others claim no place within it at all. In fact, constructivism is sometimes defended as a normative theory about the justification of moral principles. Normative constructivism is the view that the moral principles we ought to accept are the ones that agents would agree to or endorse were they to engage in a hypothetical or idealized process of rational deliberation.
Metaethical constructivist theories aim to account for the nature of normative truths and practical reasons. They bear a problematic relation to traditional classifications of metaethical theories. In particular, there are disagreements about how to situate constructivism in the realism/antirealism debate. These disagreements are rooted in further differences about the definition of metaethics, the relation between normative and metaethical claims, and the purported methods pertinent and specific to metaethical inquiry. The question of how to classify metaethical constructivism will be addressed in what follows by focusing on the distinctive questions that constructivist theories have been designed to answer. Section 1 explains the origin and motivation of constructivism. Sections 2–4 examine the main varieties of metaethical constructivism. Section 5 illustrates related constructivist views, some of which are not proposed as metaethical accounts of all normative truths, but only of moral truths. Sections 6 and 7 review several debates about the problems, promise and prospects of metaethical constructivism.
- 1. What is Constructivism?
- 2. Varieties of Kantian Constructivism
- 3. Humean Constructivism
- 4. Aristotelian Constructivism
- 5. Constructivism About Moral Principles
- 6. Constructivism’s Place in Metaethics
- 7. The Euthyphro Question
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1. What is Constructivism?
The term ‘constructivism’ entered debates in moral theory with John Rawls’ seminal Dewey Lectures “Kantian Constructivism in Moral Theory” (Rawls 1980), wherein Rawls offered a reinterpretation of the philosopher Immanuel Kant’s ethics and of its relevance for political debates.
According to Rawls, these debates fail to effectively address the political problem of ethical disagreements because they adopt metaphysical standards of objectivity, which appeal to the independent reality and truth of values. In his view, such standards are inadequate to address disagreement in a political debate in which all the parties in the dispute claim to be defending the only true view, because they lead to a stalemate in the discussion, with each party accusing its opponent of being ‘blind’ to the moral truth.
Rawls is especially concerned with coordination problems that arise in pluralistic contexts, wherein citizens hold different and to some extent incommensurable moral views. The need for objectivity, according to Rawls, is practical: it arises in contexts in which people disagree about what to value and need to reach an agreement about what to do. He attributes to Kant the idea that we ought to approach objectivity as a practical problem and that we can fruitfully address moral disputes by reasoning about them (Rawls 1971: 34, 39–40, 49–52). Rawls thus turns to Kant in order to argue for a conception of objectivity that is not metaphysical, that is, a conception of objectivity that avoids claims to universal and fundamental moral truths that are independent of our fully rational judgments. On this conception, nobody is assumed to have a privileged access to moral truth, but all have equal standing in reasoning about what to do. To this extent, Kant’s theory is regarded as providing a metaethical alternative both to realism and skepticism about the existence and nature of moral truths.
Rawls’ account of Kantian constructivism in moral theory (1980) generated a large literature, and produced several varieties of constructivism. Some of these views depart from Rawls’ conception of constructivism.
2. Varieties of Kantian Constructivism
Kantian constructivism is defended in a variety of ways, but its distinguishing feature is that it understands the nature of moral and normative truths based on considerations about the basic features of rational agency. On this view, reasons for being moral do not spring from our interests or desires; instead, they are rooted in our nature as rational agents. Insofar as moral obligations are justified in terms of rational requirements, they are universally and necessarily binding for all rational beings. Because of its claim about the universal authority of reason and obligations, Kantian Constructivism is regarded as the most ambitious form of metaethical constructivism. In this section, we will consider three main varieties, starting with the constructivist interpretation of Kant’s ethics.
2.1 Kant’s Constructivism
John Rawls first proposed a constructivist interpretation of Kant’s account of moral obligation and practical reason (Rawls 1980, 2000). On Rawls’ reading, Kant’s analysis of obligation commits him to a kind of constructivism, which is best understood in contrast to competing views of moral obligation (Rawls 1980, 1989, 2000). Kant holds that all previous ethical theories have failed to account for moral obligation because they have failed as theories of practical reason (Kant G 4: 441–444; C2 5: 35–41, 153, 157). They fail to explain how reason plays a role in our life because they misunderstand its practical function and mischaracterize its relation with the ends of choice. Kant’s charge is directed against all previous moral doctrines, but his arguments specifically address sentimentalism and ‘dogmatic rationalism’. Sentimentalism, championed by Francis Hutcheson, David Hume, and Adam Smith, holds that ethical judgments stem from sentiments and regards reason as incapable of moving us to action on its own. According to the sentimentalist, the role of reason is solely instrumental. That is, reason merely finds the means to satisfy an agent’s ends, and it is not capable of indicating which ends are worth pursuing. This claim exposes sentimentalism as a “heteronomous” doctrine, which fails to establish the objectivity of moral obligations. This is because sentimentalism treats moral obligations as conditional upon our interests, and thus as having limited authority.
Kant raises the same objection against dogmatic rationalism, championed by Christian Wolff and Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz, which holds that there are real moral truths that we apprehend by rational insight (Kant G 4: 443; Rawls 2000: 50, 228). This view appears to be an intuitionist form of moral realism according to which reason recognizes objective values or moral ends that exist prior to and independently of our reasoning and of the kinds of agents that we are. In discovering such ends, moral agents do not actively exercise reasoning; they are as passive as in sensory perception. For Kant, dogmatic rationalism fails to secure the conclusion that moral obligations have unconditional authority over us (Kant G, 4: 441). This is because, for dogmatic rationalism, moral truths guide us only on the condition that we have a corresponding desire to be guided by what is rational (Rawls 1980: 343–46; Rawls 1989: 510–13).
Kant’s diagnosis is that all such doctrines fail to capture the practical function of reason because they are heteronomous. They deny the authority and efficacy of reason, either holding that reason can only recognize objective ends that exist independently of its operations, or claiming that reason can bind agents only with the help of inclination or interest. For Kant heteronomy is a form of moral skepticism, understood as skepticism about the power of reason to establish moral truths and their authority. On this reading, then, constructivism is part of Kant’s overall argument for grounding ethics in reason, against the skeptical view that there are no normative truths (Korsgaard 1996a; Stern 2013; Wallace 2012). Skepticism is avoided only if reason is accounted as autonomous, and its authority does not derive from anything outside it. Reason is autonomous if its authority rests on its proper activity, rather than being derived from elements of the world outside of reason. Thus, the norm governing the activity of reason must be internal to reason, rather than dependent on any given value, interest, or desire. That is to say that reason is a “self-legislative activity” (Kant G 4: §2), and its legislative activity is governed by a norm, which Kant calls the ‘Categorical Imperative.’ The Categorical Imperative expresses the autonomy of reason and is its governing principle. It is not a mere decision-procedure to determine what to do, but the ‘constitutive norm’ of reason, that is, the basic standard of rationality in thinking and acting (Rawls 1989: 498–506; Rawls 2000: 166, 240–244; Korsgaard 1996a: 36–37; O’Neill 1989b: 18–19, 59n, 128, 180; Bagnoli 2013b; Reath 2006: 221–222; Reath & Timmermann 2010; Engstrom 2009: Chapter 5).
Kant gives several formulations of the Categorical Imperative, which he regards as equivalent (G 4: 421, 429, 431, 433); but ultimately, it is the requirement that in deliberating, we test our motives by considering whether the principle they express can be endorsed as a universal law, a principle that applies to and binds all agents endowed with rational capacities. Kant is committed to the “constitutivist view” that the source of the categorical force of moral obligations lies in the constitutive features of rational agency (Rawls 2000: 263–265; O’Neill 1989a, Korsgaard 1996a: 236ff). We will return to this point in section 7.
Scholars are divided about the significance of the arguments in support of a constructivist interpretation of Kant’s theory of practical reason, even though nobody denies that, for Kant, the laws of the mind are laws of reason (compare Guyer 2013 and Engstrom 2013; Bagnoli 2013b). The most general source of reservations about the constructivist interpretation is that constructivism builds upon the critique of realism, but Kant’s claims about objective moral knowledge seem best vindicated by moral realism. In this dispute, constructivism is generally taken to be a form of antirealism (Ameriks 2003: 268, 274; Wood 2008: 108, 337, 374–375). It should be noted, however, that Rawls introduced Kant’s constructivism as a novel alternative to both realism and antirealism, where the latter includes subjectivism and relativism (Rawls 1980; O’Neill 1989a: 1; Engstrom 2013: 138ff).
According to some interpreters, Kant’s defense of the autonomy of reason takes place within a project of identifying the foundation of morality, which is realist in spirit because it appeals to the absolute value of humanity (Wood 1999: 157, 114; Rauscher 2002; Langton 2007; Johnson 2007; Hills 2008; Krasnoff 1999; Kain 2006a,b; Irwin 2009; Galvin 2011). There are different ways to argue for this point. First, critics point out that Kant’s defense provides a transcendental argument, an argument that highlights the conditions under which it is possible for something to be the case. The value of humanity is the condition of the possibility of all valuing. To such critics, the appeal to a transcendental argument for the value of humanity already counts as a markedly realist move (Larmore 2008: 121; Watkins & Fitzpatrick 2002; Fitzpatrick 2005; Tiffany 2006). The issue revolves around the nature of transcendental arguments, and whether they commit us to moral realism, something that constructivists deny.
Second, critics hold that the constructivist interpretation of Kant heavily rests its case on a text that contains seemingly realist arguments. In the Critique of Practical Reason, Kant refers to our consciousness of the moral law as “the fact of reason” (Kant C2 5: 46–48). We know the moral law as a “fact”, and we feel its pull in the guise of reverence for the law. This immediate consciousness of the moral law also shows that we have an interest in morality, which arises independently of self-interested motives (Kant C2 5: 42–43). Realist interpreters take the argument from the fact of reason to show that Kant’s claim about the objectivity of moral obligations ultimately relies on perception of some moral facts (the fact of reason), hence on a realist foundation (Ameriks 2003: 263–282; Kleingeld 2010: 55–72). By contrast, constructivist interpreters tend to downplay the role of the fact of reason in Kant’s general argument for the objectivity of moral obligations (O’Neill 2002: 81–97; Łuków 1993: 204–221). Rawls takes the fact of reason to show that Kant develops “not only a constructivist conception of practical reason, but a coherentist account of its authentication” (Rawls 1999: 524; Rawls 2000: 268–273). In his view, the fact of reason indicates that the deliverances of practical reason cohere with our moral experience. This congruence is an integral part of Kant’s vindication of ethical objectivity, but it is no commitment to realism. Rather, it simply confirms that there is no discrepancy between the requirements of practical reason (which are expressed by the Categorical Imperative) and our ordinary experience of morality (Rawls 1980: 340; Rawls 1989: 523–524; Rawls 2000: 253–272, 268, 273; Kant C2, 5: 15). Rawls thinks that the realist notion of objectivity is “unnecessary for objectivity” (1980: 570). But Rawls’ argument in support of a coherentist conception of practical reason may seem too weak to capture Kant’s view of moral obligations as objective rational requirements (Larmore 2008: 83–84; Stern 2012a: 7–40). For this reason, some interpreters argue that Kant is constructivist about the authority of moral obligations and practical laws for finite agents, but not about the contents of such laws, which apply to all rational agents as such (Engstrom 2009, 2013; Bagnoli 2009; Sensen 2013).
This scholarly debate is important to assess the prospects of constructivism, especially as a metaethical view distinct from realism (Bagnoli forthcoming: §1). First, critics dispute the force and the target of the objection of heteronomy. Some doubt that ‘moral realism’ is Kant’s own intended target, hence suggesting that Kant’s constructivism does not build upon a critique of moral realism (Stern 2012a: 7– 68, 2012b). Relatedly, they deny that claims about the autonomy of reason or its practical function commit one to constructivism.
The constructivist interpretation is meant to capture Kant’s distinctive insights about practical reason and the self-authenticating nature of reason as a self-legislative activity. The distinctive character of this conception resides in the idea that reason itself should be scrutinized by reason in order for its verdicts to be justified. Constructivists hold that practical reason itself is constructed in the sense that its legitimacy and authority are established by reasoning, rather than by appeal to some facts about the way the world is (O’Neill 1989b; Rawls 2000: 238; O’Neill 2015; Bagnoli 2013b).
Contemporary constructivists have largely emphasized the antimetaphysical implications of Kant’s views. Kant embarks on the project of vindicating reasoning, starting from very modest considerations about rational agency. Such starting points are not sufficient “to sustain or revive classical philosophical ambitions to build vast metaphysical structures on reason alone” (O’Neill 2015: 3; C1: A xiii). The constructivist interpretation of Kant’s ethics emphasizes the cooperative nature of the standards of reasoning:
Kant’s repeated use of metaphors of construction and collaboration in his discussion of reasoning make it natural to speak of his approach and method as constructivist, and of his aim as the construction of reason’s authority, and thereby of a basis for offering others reasons for truth claims and moral claims, reasons for favouring some rather than other practical and political aims. (O’Neill 2015: 4)
Basically, the standards of reasoning are justified by their function: they must ensure that reasoning is followable by others, “it must exhibit patterns that others could discern, and thus it must be law-like” (O’Neill 2015: 4).
2.2 Constructivism as Procedural Realism
The anti-metaphysical orientation of constructivism is apparent in early defenses of metaethical constructivism. For instance, Christine Korsgaard characterizes Kantian constructivism as a form of “procedural realism” – the view that “there are answers to moral questions because there are correct procedures for arriving at them”; and she contrasts procedural realism with “substantive realism” – the view that
there are correct procedures for answering moral questions because there are moral truths or facts, which exist independently of those procedures, and which those procedures track. (Korsgaard 1996a: 36–37, see also Korsgaard 1983: 183)
Substantive realism holds that there are objective criteria of correctness for moral judgments only if such judgments represent matters of fact about the way the world is. By contrast, the constructivist view is that there are objective criteria of moral judgment insofar as there are objective criteria about how to reason about practical matters. There are objective reasons that prohibit deceiving and manipulating others, but such reasons are the result of practical reasoning, rather than discovered by empirical investigation, grasped by the intellect, or revealed by some god. What makes this view “Kantian” is that there is ultimately one criterion for reasoning on practical matters, which is the Categorical Imperative. By reasoning according to this criterion, we objectively ground moral obligations, which are requirements of practical reason.
Korsgaard’s case for constructivism parallels Kant’s argument for the autonomy of practical reason, as Rawls reconstructs it. It starts by objecting that substantive realism fails to respond to the skeptical challenge that there really are no reasons to be moral. This is because realism simply assumes the existence of objective standards for morality without offering a rational basis for them; hence the realist affirms what the skeptic denies. As a consequence, the realist also fails to show why we really ought to do as morality says, and thus fails as an account of the authority of moral obligations (Korsgaard 1996a; Korsgaard 2008: 30–31, 55–57, 67–68; Stern 2012a; Brady 2002). Realists presume that, in order to fend off skepticism, one has to anchor practical reasons in facts that are in themselves normative. But no appeal to such ‘normative facts’ can explain how they count as reasons and motivate rational agents. Suppose we agree that it is a normative fact that deception is morally wrong. How does awareness of this fact rationally compel us to refrain from deceiving? This is not only a psychological question about the impact that such a fact might have on our minds, but also, and most importantly, a normative question that concerns its authority.
According to Korsgaard, humans are self-reflective agents, capable of reflecting on themselves and considering their thoughts and desires from a detached perspective. Reflection makes room for raising questions about what there is reason to do or to believe (1996a: 10–11, 17, 93). That is, in reflection, rational agents call into question the legitimacy of particular thoughts and desires and suspend their pull. Because they are reflective, rational agents have ideals about the sort of persons they want to be, and they can guide their minds and actions accordingly. They are capable of self-governance because they are capable of governing themselves by endorsing universal standards. The appropriate form of self-governance is thus self-legislation (Korsgaard 1996a: 36, 91, 231–232; Korsgaard 2008: 3).
Rational agents are guided by universal principles that they have legislated. However, this is not to say that particular agents arbitrarily determine the moral law; otherwise, evil people would not be bound by the moral law (Korsgaard 1996a: 234–235; O’Neill 2003c; Reath 2006: 112–113, 92–170; Korsgaard 2008: 207–229). On the contrary, the claim is that rational agents are guided by universal principles (Korsgaard 1996a: 36, 234–236; Korsgaard 2008: 207–229; Reath 2006: 112–113, 92–170). But the moral law obliges us only insofar as it is self-legislated. That is, one can autonomously act on the moral requirements only if one legislates them. Furthermore, universal principles guarantee that action is expressive of an agent’s integrity, rather than driven by unreflective preferences or desires. This is because universal principles are the constitutive principles of rational actions, on the Kantian view. Correspondingly, an agent that acts mindlessly or compulsively lacks the sort of integrity that is characteristic of rational agents. That said, it is possible for rational agents to act in the pursuit of desires, when they have survived due reflection.
A canonical objection to the attempt to ground morality on rationality alone is that it fails to account for the special bonds and ties we have with our loved ones and thus fails to capture the nature of integrity and morality (Williams 1981: chapters 1–2). To address these worries, Korsgaard introduces the notion of “practical identities”, which specify roles as sources of special obligations (Korsgaard 1996a: 101, §3.3.1; Korsgaard 2009: 20). For instance, Guy values himself and finds his life worth living and his actions worth undertaking under the description of being a teacher of music, an American citizen, and Robert’s best friend. These practical identities govern Guy’s choices, sustain his integrity, and are sources of specific obligations to his pupils, fellows, and friends. However, we do not have obligations just because we occupy certain roles as teachers, citizens, or friends. Rather, such roles become practical identities, and sources of reasons, insofar as we reflectively endorse them (Korsgaard 1996a: §3.3.1; Korsgaard 2009: 22). Reflective endorsement, in turn, requires that we test our loyalties and allegiances according to the principle of universality, which commits us to morality. In order to value ourselves under these specific descriptions, we must value humanity in ourselves and in others (Korsgaard 2008: Lecture 6, 25–26).
Korsgaard (1996a) offers a transcendental argument for the conclusion that what we ought to do is justified by the norms that govern and constitute our rational agency. She argues that valuing humanity, where humanity is understood as the capacity for rationality, is the condition of the possibility of valuing anything at all (Korsgaard 1996a: 121–123; Korsgaard 1998: 60–62). In deliberating, we attribute to ourselves the power to confer value on our ends by rationally choosing them. According to Korsgaard, in valuing we are also, at the same time, attributing a fundamental kind of value to ourselves. The conclusion is that the value of any objects thus ultimately depends on the rational capacity of evaluators. ‘Humanity’ is the name of a distinctive value, which is unconditional and counts as the condition of the possibility of valuing anything at all. Since humanity is embodied in all rational beings, we should value humanity in ourselves as well as in others, on pain of incoherence. Special obligations and bonds that derive from our practical identities are insufficient to sustain our integrity when they are inconsistent with valuing humanity. For instance, the conduct of a Mafioso cannot be coherently justified on the basis of a universal principle. The Mafioso thus fails as a rational agent and leads a life that is not autonomous, because his life is not the product of reflective self-government. A systematic failure to be guided by universal principles of self-government amounts to a loss of agency. Insofar as agency is inescapable, we are necessarily bound by the norms of rationality and morality. Korsgaard argues that some kind of integrity is necessary to be an agent and cannot be achieved without a commitment to morality, which is founded on reason.
Some critics argue that Korsgaard’s argument rests on realist premises, and thus it is not a complete alternative to moral realism (Watkins & Fitzpatrick 2002; Fitzpatrick 2005; Ridge 2005; Stieb 2006; Kain 2006a,b; Papish 2011; O’Shea 2015; Schafer 2015a. To this extent, her defense of Kantian constructivism does not offer a distinctive reply to skeptical challenges to ethical objectivity. According to others, Korsgaard’s argument is vulnerable to the objection of ‘regress on conditions’, which says that it is not logically necessary that the condition of a thing’s value be valuable itself (Rabinowicz & Rønnow-Rasmussen 2000; Kerstein 2001; Ridge 2005; Coleman 2006). That is to say that humanity may be the condition of the possibility of value and yet lack value itself.
However, according to Korsgaard “there need be no such regress if there are principles that are constitutive of the very rational activities that we trying to perform” (2008: 5, 1996b: 164–67, 2009) In this formulation, the principles of practical rationality are constitutive of rational agency, in the sense that they are standards arising from and justified by the nature of the object in question (i.e., the rational agent). More specifically, unless the object conforms to the standard, it ceases to be the kind of object that it is. This is called the ‘constitution requirement.’ If the function of the house is to serve as a habitable shelter, then it must conform to the standard of being a habitable shelter. A thing that does not serve this purpose is not a house. Secondly, some objects make themselves into the kind of objects that they are by conforming to their constitutive standards. This is called the ‘self-constitution requirement.’ Rational agents make things happen, that is, they are efficacious. They exert their efficacy in a specific way, i.e., autonomously. Autonomous agents must conform to the categorical imperative, and in order to be efficacious, they must conform to the hypothetical imperative. It is by conforming to these principles, Korsgaard argues, that one makes oneself into an agent.
Korsgaard’s constitutivist strategy of accounting normativity on the constitutive features of agency raises worries that will be discussed in section 7. Her more recent works point toward a new direction in the debate about constructivism, which combines Aristotelian and Kantian features (Korsgaard 2009). Korsgaard argues that an Aristotelian account of the virtues as excellences of character should play an important role in a complete account of what makes a good moral agent. However, she remains convinced that the Kantian idea of self-constitution is indispensable for giving an account of agency, and therefore of moral agency, itself.
2.3 Constructivism for Finite Rational Agents
Onora O’Neill defines metaethical constructivism as a third alternative between realism and subjectivism (O’Neill 1989b: 279). She departs from the versions of Kantian constructivism discussed above because she makes no appeal to transcendental arguments and rejects the idealized conceptions of rational agency that are at play in other versions of Kantian constructivism. In her view, “finite rational beings” should not be construed as “beings whose rationality is finite”, but as “finite beings who are rational”. Finitude does not entail any limitation on strategic reasoning, even though there is no way to establish that finite rational agents have access to all sorts of reasoning that infinite or disembodied rational agents may have. The key thesis is that instrumental principles are not the only principles of rationality, and more importantly, they never operate in isolation (O’Neill 1989b: 74).
According to O’Neill, this more austere constructivism is closer to Kant’s own theory than other varieties (O’Neill 1989a; O’Neill 2015). In her view, Kant’s constructivism is motivated by the vivid awareness of interdependency, finitude, and mutual vulnerability. Humans are prone to mistakenly rely on claims that are not warranted, and thus they need to check and criticize the unjustified and arbitrary assumptions they make in reasoning (O’Neill 1989b). O’Neill shares Kant’s claim that
reasoning is fundamentally practical: it aims to provide standards or norms that thought, action and communication can (but often fail) to meet. (O’Neill 2015: 2)
Second, she shares Kant’s claim that reasoning is necessary because humans are finite and interdependent beings. Third, she agrees with Kant that the principles of reason are not revealed to us by intuition or introspection: We must use our rational powers to figure out what these principles are. Finally, she adopts Kant’s claim that to fulfill its distinctive function, norms of reasoning must be universal. The differences between Kant’s and O’Neill’s views concern the justification of the claim about universality. According to O’Neill, universality is a requirement of reasoning because reasoning is to be used by a plurality of finite, inter-dependent agents whose action and communication are not antecedently coordinated (e.g., by instinct, divine providence, or law).
The requirement of universality or followability sets minimal constraints on processes that count as reasoning (O’Neill 2015: 3). By following this reasoning, we find out that no plurality of agents can choose to live by principles that aim to destroy or undermine the agency (of whatever determinate shape) of some of its members (O’Neill 1989a: 10; see also O’Neill 1989b, 2015). As a result, practical reasoning justifies the prohibition to harm, coerce, and deceive others. This is not to say that by appealing to the requirement of followability we can solve all problems and fully determine the content of all duties. On the contrary, O’Neill thinks that there are large varieties of moral issues for which we need to offer more substantive arguments. However, her account promises to vindicate reason’s ability (and right) to distinguish sound justifications from mere rationalizations.
O’Neill agrees with Kant that only reason itself can verify the credentials of its own claims. The process of figuring out what the principles of reason are is avowedly circular. This circularity is not worrisome because the process of verification is reflexive, as it involves reason critiquing the claims of reason itself. More specifically, the critique of reason uncovers a basic principle of reasoning: we should rely only on those principles that other rational agents can share. The authority of reason is thus conferred by public communication among free, rational agents, and consists in the fact that the principles that govern our thoughts are neither self-serving nor self-defeating. We find out what these principles say by submitting our claims to free and critical debates, which constitute “the public use of reason” (O’Neill 1989b: 70–71, 206).
Since the critique of reason is a continuous, progressive, and reflexive process, reason exhibits a history, which coincides with the development of practices of tolerance and mutual recognition (O’Neill 1999: 174, 2002). Such practices establish the authority of reason. This ‘developmental’ view of practical reason and of its autonomy accounts for change and progress. Arguably, this is a significant explanatory advantage over competing views, which do not fully appreciate the historical and dialectical dimension of truth and reason (O’Neill 1989b: 70–71; Arruda 2016). As we shall see in section 6, it requires the constructivist to provide an account of truth and objective knowledge as altering in time.
O’Neill’s defense of the virtuous circularity of constructivism identifies a solution to a problem that affects constructivism in general, which we shall consider in section 7.
3. Humean Constructivism
The case for Humean constructivism rests on the alleged inadequacy of competing views: “it is what we are forced to by the untenability of realism plus the failure of Kantian versions of metaethical constructivism” (Street 2010: 371). Humean constructivism denies that normative truths are independent of the deliverances of practical reasoning (Bagnoli 2002: 131; Street 2008a, 2010, 2012; Velleman 2009; Lenman 2010, 2012). To this extent, Humean constructivism builds on the Kantian insight that normative truths are not simply “out there”, as realists suppose. In contrast to Kantian constructivism, however, Humean constructivists abandon the claim that moral obligations are requirements of practical reason. The constitutive norms of practical reason may favor morality, but do not require it (Street 2012; Velleman 2009: 150–154; Lenman 2010: 192). Thus, Humeans maintain that an ideally coherent Caligula who values torturing people for fun is conceivable. Such a person would have reasons for torturing people, which is just to say that the value of humanity is not a constitutive norm of reasoning (Street 2010: 371; Street 2009, 2012). Humean constructivism also rejects the Kantian claim that there are universal rational norms that bind all rational agents. For instance, Street argues that “the substantive content of a given agent’s reasons is a function of his or her particular, contingently given, evaluative starting points” (Street 2010, see also Lenman 2010: 180–181). Consequently, “truth and falsity in the normative domain must always be relativized to a particular practical point of view” (Street 2008a: 224). Agreement among various practical standpoints is possible but it is not guaranteed by facts about the nature of reason or the principles of reason that are authoritative for all rational agents. Humeans hold that there is nothing alarming about the sort of relativism that their position implies (Street 2008a: 245). Even though moral norms are not necessary requirements of reason, there is a sense in which they are not contingent because they play a large role in our lives. Furthermore, by analogy with attitudes such as love, which is both contingent and compelling, Street argues that the fact that moral commitments are contingent does not weaken their normative force. The latter claim has been disputed on the ground that the driving force of love should be distinguished from its normative authority (Bratman 2012).
Humean constructivism has established itself as a prominent variety of metaethics, which avoids any commitment to moral realism. In section 6 we will consider how this form of constructivism relates to anti-realism and expressivism.
4. Aristotelian Constructivism
Aristotelian constructivism is a metaethical view about the nature of normative truths, according to which our true normative judgments represent a normative reality, but this reality is not independent of the exercise of moral and practical judgment (LeBar 2008: 182; 2013a,b). Like the Kantian varieties of constructivism, Aristotelian constructivism appeals to constitutive features of practical reason:
practical truth is constructed, not discovered, because it is activity in accordance with the norms of practical rationality, which are themselves constitutive of agency. (LeBar 2008: 191)
To this extent, this metaethical view shares the ambitions of Kantian constructivism to ground normative truths in features of rational agency. In contrast to Kantian models, however, Aristotelians hold that the principles of sound practical reason are neither formal nor procedural. Rather, they are grounded in a substantive account of the good life, which is inspired by ancient eudaimonism. The wise and virtuous agents form the standard of practical rationality through the exercise of their virtues of intellect and character (Aristotle Nicomachean Ethics, II.6.
The negative case for Aristotelian constructivism consists in the critique of the Kantian account of practical reasoning, its form, reach, and powers. Under attack is the claim that practical reasoning is law-like, i.e., governed by the requirement of universality. According to some critics, Kantians have a difficult to explain how to apply universal rational principles to concrete cases (Höffe 1993; LeBar 2013b; Millgram 2005: chapter 6). In this respect, the Aristotelians claim to have a significant advantage because Aristotelian constructivism allows practical reasoning to adapt to particular cases. Aristotelian constructivism works out a story about the norms for success in judgment, which is considered a problem for Kant and an unrecognized lacuna in contemporary Kantian ethics (Millgram 2005: chapter 6). Because of their appeal to moral laws, Kantians are often criticized for a rigor or for empty formalism. In either case, Kantian ethics seems incapable to account for the relevance of circumstances for ethical judgments. This is a problem that Kantian constructivists address (O’Neill 1975; Herman 1993), but inadequately, according to the Aristotelians (LeBar 2013b.
To identify the substantive standards of practical reasoning, Aristotelian constructivism starts with a study of the complexity of our rational animal nature, which excludes that the principles constitutive of human rationality can be merely formal. In contrast to Kantian self-legislation, Aristotelian constructivism emphasizes the interplay between rational and animal nature, focusing especially on training and shaping the affective and sensitive aspects of our nature. In particular, it emphasizes the transformative effects of reflection on passions and desires, and the possibility of developing a ‘second nature’, thanks to complex processes such as habituation, and education (LeBar 2008: 197). The key feature of this account is the claim that practical rationality does not merely direct our affective responses toward adequate objects but also structurally transforms our animal sensibility into character. The relevant norms and their applications to practical reasoning are the work of practical wisdom (phronesis), in conjunction with the excellences of character, as Aristotle suggests (LeBar 2013a).
5. Constructivism About Moral Principles
Some constructivist theories define their scope more narrowly than the theories discussed in sections 2–4. They seek to provide objectivist accounts of the basic principles of morality, rather than of all normative principles. Most constructivists about morality hold that the relevant sort of agreement of which moral reasons are the product is best captured in terms of a hypothetical contract (Scanlon 1998; Hill 1989, 2001; Milo 1995). ‘Contractualism’ is thus the normative theory that is typically associated with metaethical constructivism, even though it is not accepted by all Kantians (compare O’Neill 1989a: 10; O’Neill 2015). Hobbesian theories occupy a prominent place in the contractualism debate. To explain the nature of morality and of moral truths, Hobbesians do not use the term “construction”, but “hypothetical contract”. However, many think of construction as a form of hypothetical procedure akin to contract (Street 2010: 365; Darwall, Gibbard, & Railton 1997: 13, and see section 3. In 5.1 and 5.2, we shall discuss two prominent varieties of constructivism whose scope is restricted to moral judgment; in 5.3 other emerging varieties will be briefly presented.
5.1 Constructivism About Right and Wrong
Thomas Scanlon defends a restricted constructivist account of justification for a specific class of moral judgments of right and wrong (Scanlon 1998: 11–12, chapter 4, §7.2; 2008, 2014>: 94–98). In contrast to Korsgaard and O’Neill, Scanlon rejects Kantian constructivism as a broad metaethical view about all normative truths. Part of his argument is that moral matters cannot be resolved by appealing to the bare structure of rationality (the constitutive norm of practical reason) and instead, need to be addressed by engaging in substantive arguments (Scanlon 2003b: 14–15, Scanlon 2014: 90–104), although this is something that many Kantians would concede. His aim is to elucidate the truth of claims concerning right and wrong in terms of their being entailed from the point of view of a certain contractual situation.
Scanlon’s method of construction is the contractualist formula according to which an act is wrong if its performance under the circumstances would be prohibited by any set of principles that no one could reasonably reject as a basis for informed, unforced, general agreement. This test of rejectability specifies the content of moral principles, and tells us why it is rational for us to adopt them. The correctness of moral principles is explained in terms of a hypothetical agreement among the relevant set of individuals specified in terms of their motivation and the process of reasoning they employ. There are no correct moral principles independently of the rational agreement that the criterion of rejectability specifies. The property of being right is constituted by what a group of reasonable agents, under certain specified conditions, would find non-rejectable (Scanlon 1998: 380 n 48).
The test of rejectability is compatible with several kinds of disagreement about right and wrong, in particular, with disagreement about the standards for assessing conduct, and about the reasons for supporting these standards. To acknowledge the latter sorts of disagreement does not lead to relativism: it does not entail that there is no answer to the question of which side is correct about the reasons people have or that all answers are equally valid.
Scanlon argues that the constructivist account of general normativity is exposed to the objection of bootstrapping, because it tries to justify the normativity of reasons by a method that already assumes the normativity of reason (Scanlon 2014: 96–104). Thus, unlike Korsgaard and Street, Scanlon holds that truths about reasons for action are not true in virtue of being arrived at through some specified procedure of “construction”. We can arrive at conclusions about reasons by engaging in normative reasoning, (for example employing the method of reflective equilibrium.) But the steps in reasoning of this kind involve making substantive judgments about what reasons we have. Because it requires such judgments as inputs, reasoning of this kind is not a process through which all facts about reasons are constructed (Scanlon 2014: 102–103).
According to Scanlon, in order for there to be truths about reasons, it is not necessary for these normative facts to have a kind of metaphysical reality that good normative reasoning might not guarantee. There is no question “external” to ordinary first-order normative thinking about whether such facts really exist, just as there is no such “external” question about mathematical facts (Scanlon 2014: 16–26.) In this regard, Scanlon’s view bears some deep similarities with Rudolph Carnap’s theory (Carnap 1956). Scanlon’s normative realism is thus less “robust” than what some other realists such as David Enoch believe is required (Scanlon 2014: 14, compare Enoch 2011a: 112–113).
5.2 Society-Based Constructivism
Society-based constructivism – elaborated by David Copp, holds that there are true moral standards, which are the output of a decision procedure that takes into account the needs and values of the society and facts about the society’s circumstances (Copp 1995, 2007). Accordingly, the theory accounts for moral truth as depending on what would be rational for societies to choose. Copp’s view shares some important features with Kantian constructivism. First, society-based constructivism holds that societies need their members to endorse some suitable moral code in order to facilitate cooperation. It thus takes morality to be a cooperative enterprise, and implies that the need for objective moral standards is practical. Second, this view explains the nature of moral truth in procedural terms, and thus it implies that there are no moral facts independently of the procedure (Rawls 1980: 307). Third, it also shares the claim that to be adequate, any metaethics should make sense of the normativity of moral claims and their practical relevance (Copp 2007: 4–7, 2013). Like Kantian constructivism, it holds that we are bound by moral obligations independently of our actual motivational states. Finally, society-based constructivism also claims that any plausible metaethics should be at least compatible with naturalism.
However, society-based constructivism differs from the various Kantian constructivisms because of its account of the decision procedure from which moral standards are said to result, and its different explanation of normativity. While the procedure specifies a function of practical rationality, it does not commit to any specific view about autonomy.
In contrast to the antirealist varieties of metaethical constructivism, Copp defends society-based constructivism as both a decisively realist and naturalistic theory. It is realist insofar as it claims that moral propositions are truth-evaluable, and that some moral properties are instantiated; and it is naturalistic because it claims that such moral properties are natural properties (Copp 1995).
5.3 Other Varieties
It is worth mentioning that conventionalism, the view that moral claims are based on social convention, often uses the metaphor of construction: it is defended as the view that moral truths are constructed by the actual agreement of some groups within specific traditions (Wong 2008).
Other varieties of metaethical constructivism are emerging, building upon the insights of philosophers other than Kant: the Spinozian variety (Zuck 2015), the Smithian variety (Stueber 2016), the Hegelian variety (Westphal 2013; Rockmore 2016; Laitinen 2016, and the Nietzschean variety (Katsafanas 2013; Silk 2015). Not all of them claim a place in metaethics, independently of existing forms of realism and antirealism. But they all find that the notion of construction is a distinctive explanatory device for capturing the objectivity and normativity of ethical truths.
6. Constructivism’s Place in Metaethics
Constructivism has become a major view in contemporary practical philosophy. However, scholars are divided about its place, promise and prospects as a metaethical theory. The appeal of constructivism as a metaethical theory is often thought to consist in its promise to offer a minimalist account of moral objectivity that retains the benefits of nonnaturalist realism, while avoiding its epistemological and ontological costs (Darwall, Gibbard, & Railton 1992; Shafer-Landau 2003: chapter 4). But this is hardly distinctive of constructivism just as such. Naturalist realism, an alternative to constructivism, also promises objectivity without the epistemological and ontological costs of nonnaturalist realism. And the defense of objectivity on non-ontological grounds has also been a preoccupation of antirealism (Hare 1952; Gibbard 1990; Wright 1992: 6 ff). A better way to present what constructivism purports to offer is to say that it claims to be the best candidate for reconciling various tensions among the apparent features of normative truths: their objectivity, our knowledge of them, and their practical significance for us, including the authority they have or claim (Scanlon 2014: 91). Constructivists think that traditional metaethical theories cannot account of these features because they misunderstand the nature of practical reason. Thus, their claim is that to solve metaethical problems about the nature of ethical judgments and normative truths, one should start with an account of practical reason, that which has been left out by standard metaethics. To this extent, constructivists regard standard metaethics as misguided.
6.1 The Constructivist Approach to Normative Discourse
Thus far, constructivists have not elaborated a distinctive account of the meaning and logical behavior of moral and normative terms and concepts. Absent a distinctively constructivist semantics, some think that constructivism is best understood as “a family of substantive moral theories” (Darwall et al. 1992: 140; Hussain & Shah 2006, 2013; Enoch 2009; Hussain 2012; Ridge 2012). For some this means that constructivism does not qualify as a metaethical theory: in seeking to understand normative concepts as referring to solutions to practical problems, constructivism does not move “up to metaethics”, insofar as this talk of problems and their solutions “is itself normative talk” (Ridge 2012).
This criticism rests on the assumption that there is a sharp division between normative ethics and metaethics. The constructivist project is to advance our understanding of moral principles and their limits by “clarifying our understanding of the reasons that make familiar moral principles ones that no one could reasonably reject” (Scanlon 1998: 246–247; 2003a: 429–435). The purpose of theorizing in ethics is partly interpretative and partly normative. Thus, there seems to be a disagreement between constructivists and their critics about what it takes to engage within a metaethical inquiry. For the constructivist, there is an interesting continuity between normative discourse and metaethics.
Furthermore, some constructivists account for their lack of interest in semantics with the conviction that the semantic task with which traditional metaethics is preoccupied is positively misguided (Korsgaard 1996a, 2003; Street 2008a: 239). The philosophical issue worth thinking about is normativity, and this is not something that we can explain solely via semantics. For Kantians, explaining normativity requires philosophers to engage in philosophical investigation into the ideas of autonomy, agency, and practical rationality (see section 7).
While also preoccupied with explaining normativity, other constructivists view the semantic task as worthwhile (Street 2010; Richardson 2013). In fact, they take themselves to discharge the semantic task with their account of what is constitutive of the attitude of valuing. By identifying the constitutive norms that one must be following in order to count as a rational valuer at all, some constructivists have sketched
a so-called inferentialist semantics for normative terms: the meaning of normative terms is explained by identifying the kinds of inferences (for example, about means and ends) one must be making in order to count as employing normative concepts at all. (Street 2010: 239–242)
This reply commits the constructivist to showing that her proposal has some advantages over its competitors.
6.2 A Constructivist Account of Truth?
Another question about constructivism is whether it is committed to any theory of truth. Constructivists must deny the correspondence theory of truth, the view that truth is correspondence to a fact. On the other hand, constructivism can take on board the idea that normative judgments are truth-apt. This view is hospitable to the constructivist claim that moral and normative truths may alter over time, as a result of ongoing rational deliberation and revision (Richardson 2013; LeBar 2013b; O’Neill 1992, 2015; Laitinen 2016). Some attempts to deal with semantic issues bring to light a resemblance between constructivism and pragmatism, which holds that a proposition is true if it works satisfactorily, and that the meaning of a proposition is to be found in the practical implications of accepting it (Misak 2000; Richardson 1998, 2013). Like pragmatism, constructivism appeals to the practical point of view to account for truth, in contrast to standard forms of realism about truth (Proulx 2016; Elgin 1997; Richardson 2013; Schwartz 2017). Some critics are skeptical about the possibility of developing a constructivist account of truth (Hussain 2012: 189ff; Dorsey 2012).
6.3 Constructivism and the Realism-Antirealism Debate
Both Rawls (1980) and O’Neill (1989a) present Kantian constructivism as a third option between realism and relativism (see also Korsgaard 1996a: 36). However, not all constructivists share this view. In fact, some place constructivism in the realist camp (Copp, LeBar), and others in the antirealist camp (Lenman). Scanlon sides with realism about reasons but defends a constructivist account of the nature and truth of moral judgments (Scanlon 1998, 2014, 2003b: 18). Street admits to some kind of relativism. This shows that it would be a mistake to judge constructivism’s impact in metaethics solely in terms of its contribution to the realism-antirealism debate (Korsgaard 2008: 312, 325 n. 49; Copp 2013; Engstrom 2013: 138ff).
Efforts to situate constructivism in relation to realism and antirealism are complicated by the fact that there are different definitions of ‘realism’ (e.g., Sayre-McCord 2015; Joyce 2015; Miller 2014). Realists agree that (a) moral discourse is cognitivist like non-moral discourse, (b) there are moral properties, such as rightness, (c) moral properties are sometimes instantiated, and (d) moral predicates express properties. But there is a disagreement as to whether in order to be a form of realism, a theory must hold a stronger claim that (e) moral properties are mind-independent. A further division, internal to realism, concerns the commitment to naturalism, which includes the claims that (f) moral properties are like any ordinary property and have the same metaphysical status as non-moral properties, whatever that is, and that (g) moral assertions express ordinary beliefs regarding the instantiation of these properties. All constructivists share a commitment to naturalism, but reject (e), holding that the instantiation of properties depend on features of our sensibility or rational agency, rather than being mind-independent. In general, constructivism shares with both realist naturalism and antirealism broadly defined the commitment to metaphysical parsimony. This is where it differs from classical and “robust” moral realism (Enoch 2011a).
Korsgaard points to an assumption she believes that realists and antirealists share and that constructivists reject, namely, that the primary function of concepts deployed in judgments that can be true or false is to represent things as they are, so if normative judgments are true, they must represent something real out there in the world. By contrast, constructivists think that normative concepts, which are deployed in judgments that can be true or false, have a practical function: they name solutions to practical problems, rather than represent features of reality (Korsgaard 2008: 302 ff.). For instance, the concept equity does not stand for a property; instead, it proposes a response to the practical problem of how to distribute goods. Korsgaard draws the contrast between constructivism and other metaethical theories as follows. Unlike substantive realism, which holds that moral judgments are true insofar as they represent a mind-independent normative reality, and antirealism, which denies that there are normative truths because it denies that there are normative properties, constructivists hold that practical judgments can be true or false without representing mind-independent normative facts about the world (Korsgaard 2003: 325 n 49).
This way of characterizing constructivism fails to neatly mark the contrast between constructivism and other metaethical views. First, Korsgaard’s characterization takes realism to be committed to claim (e) about mind-independence. But not all define realism in this restrictive way (Sayre-McCord 1988; Copp 2007: 7). When realism is defined more capaciously, it includes views according to which moral judgments are made true by facts that depend on some mental states. Second, Korsgaard’s way of drawing the contrast seems to overlook the fact that some contemporary versions of antirealism do not deny that moral judgments are truth-apt. Instead, they adopt a deflationary conception of truth as a semantic notion (Ridge 2012; Lenman & Shemmer 2012b). Constructivism stakes out a middle ground between forms of realism that are committed to mind-independent normative truths and forms of antirealism that deny that there are any normative truths. To this extent, it agrees with other kinds of metaethics, which are qualified forms of realism or ‘sophisticated forms of subjectivism’ (Wiggins 1993; McDowell 1985). However, sophisticated subjectivism importantly relies on sensibility, while Kantian constructivism requires that normative truths be dependent on features of rational agency. In this sense, there is an interesting contrast to be drawn between Kantian constructivism and reductivist versions of sophisticated subjectivism or response-dependent realism.
Some say that constructivism is best understood as a form ‘expressivism,’ which holds that normative terms function to guide action rather than represent matters of fact and are used to express states of mind that differ from belief (Chrisman 2010; Lenman 2012; Lenman & Shemmer 2012b; Meyers 2012). Furthermore, Lenman argues that embracing expressivism would promise to solve a basic problem for constructivism, specifically, the problem of identifying the kinds of mental state that normative judgments are (Lenman 2012). This suggestion is not shared. Humean constructivist Street has forcefully argued that expressivism fails to fully explain the normative function of normative discourse, which cannot be reduced to expressing normative states (Korsgaard 2003, 2008: 312, 325 n. 49, 2009: 309; Bagnoli 2002: 130–132; Magri 2002; Street 2010: 239–242).
7. The Euthyphro Question
Constructivism’s insight is that practical truths should be explained in terms of the constitutive features of practical reasoning, which the notion of ‘construction’ is supposed to capture. But critics argue that the constructivist conception of practical reasoning is either arbitrary or parasitic on independent moral values. The objection often takes the form of a metaethical dilemma similar to the dilemma discussed by Plato in the Euthyphro (10a). Either the practical standpoint is subject to moral constraints or it is not. If it is not, then
there is no reason to expect that the principles that emerge … will capture our deepest convictions, or respect various platitudes that fix our understanding of ethical concepts. (Shafer-Landau 2003: 42)
If it is, then the constraints are not themselves constructed and acceptance of them commits one to realism (Shafer-Landau 2003: 42). Constructivism thus either grounds moral truths on arbitrary standards or collapses into realism.
There are two ways of formulating and motivating this objection. First, the objection can be that constructivism relies on moral intuitions, which it never proves. Second, the objection can be that the appeal to unconstructed norms that govern and constitute the activity of rational choice commits one to realism.
7.1 Constructivism and Congruence with Intuitions
Consider the first objection that constructivism relies on an “unconstructed”, hence unjustified – set of normative constraints on theorizing (Hare 1983). For instance, Kantian constructivism appears to be grounded on the value of moral impartiality, which demands equal respect for persons (Scanlon 1998: 22–33; 287–290; Rawls 1993: 38–54). The worry is that, in the final analysis, constructivism is vacuous because “its test yields results only by presupposing moral views which can only be established independently of it” (Raz 2003: 358; Timmons 2003; Cohen 2003; Brink 1987, 1989; Hare 1983). Furthermore, there is
“no non-question-begging feature to which the constructivist can help herself in breaking symmetry among the various competing sets of constructed principles. (Timmons 2003: §3)
Kant is keenly aware of the air of paradox surrounding the claim that the moral concepts, such as good and evil, are not determined prior to engaging in practical reasoning, but only as a result of engaging in practical reasoning. This is known as the ‘paradox of the method’ (Kant C2, 5: 62 ff.) As Rawls explains it,
The difficulty is that Kant appears to know in advance of critical reflection how a constructivist doctrine might look, but this makes it impossible to undertake such reflection in good faith. In reply to this quite proper worry, we interpret constructivism as a view about how the structure and content of the soundest moral doctrine would look once it is laid out after due critical reflection. (Rawls 2000: 274)
Practical reasoning does not serve the purpose of discovering an order of values independent of its verdicts. Nonetheless, for Kantian constructivists there is some sort of practical knowledge, which displays a self-conscious character, can only be accommodated by accounts that represent the operation of the cognitive capacity as self-conscious activity (Rawls 2000: 148, see also 218; Engstrom 2013; Bagnoli 2013b; Jezzi 2016: §5). From this perspective, the novelty of constructivism consists in providing an account of objective practical knowledge that does not presuppose an independent moral reality to which the mind must conform, but accounts for such reality in terms of the cognitive activity of reason.
Constructivists and their critics disagree about the role to accord to intuitions in rational justification. According to Scanlon, a valid method of justification in ethics consists in testing the congruence between theoretical assumptions and intuitive moral judgments, that is, judgments to which we normally accord initial credence. It is doubtful that we could avoid all appeal to intuitions and unpromising (Scanlon 1998: 241–247). However, the intuitions on which constructivism relies are not independent moral truths and do not serve as an external foundation for morality (Rawls 2000: 178, 273). Not all constructivists view intuitions as playing a role in rational justification (O’Neill 1989b). But all agree that an adequate metaethics should not be totally revisionary; rather, it should be congruent with common understandings of rationality and morality (Smith 2013: 313). Arguably, this commitment sets constructivism apart from those kinds of projectivist and error theories (Blackburn 1993; Mackie 1977, which claim that evaluative discourse involves a systematic error (Bagnoli 2002; Street 2010; Lillehammer 2011.
7.2 Constitutivist Strategies
The second way to construe the objection that constructivism tacitly relies on or commits to realism focuses on the constitutivist strategy adopted by many constructivists involves. This strategy appeals to constitutive hence “unconstructed” features of agency to ground a set of normative constraints. Constructivists hold that the appeal to such constraints is neither arbitrary nor does it commit constructivism to moral realism. But how does constructivism justify the norms it claims to be constitutive of practical reason? Again, the objection says, either they are arbitrary or they are realist and depend on some normative features of reality, which are unconstructed (Fitzpatrick 2013; Stern 2013; Baiasu 2016; Bratu & Dittmeyer 2016).
While this criticism is addressed especially to Kantian constructivism, in some sense it threatens all views that appeal to constitutive norms of reasoning (Ripstein 1987; Enoch 2006, 2011b).
Is there anything ultimately at stake in whether we call the appeal to constitutive norms realist, rather than constructivist? In addressing the question “Why does x count as a reason for doing y?” both realists and constructivists deploy unconstructed or underived elements. Non-naturalist realists say: “It just does”, it is “simply true” that facts such as x count as a reason for doing y, and “there won’t be any illuminating explanation of what makes them true” (Shafer-Landau 2003: 47, 48). In other words, realists take the normativity of reasons as a primitive feature that does not require any explanation and for which no further explanation will be useful. By contrast, naturalist realists hold that normative facts are just natural facts, which can be investigated by ordinary empirical methods, for example, facts about the responses of agents under idealized (naturalistically described) circumstances (see Smith 2012, 2013).
Constructivists would disagree with both views. The aim of constructivism is not the reduction of moral properties to natural properties; rather, this theory proposes a self-authenticating account of the standards of practical reason (O’Neill 1989b; Korsgaard 2003, 2009; Street 2010; Velleman 2009, compare Smith 2012, 2013).
In contrast to some kinds of realism, constructivism does not seek axioms or first principles or objective values on which to ground moral truths (Bagnoli 2014, 2016). Rather than providing an external foundation for morality, it holds that in forming our intentions and beliefs, we are answerable to criteria of correctness that are internal to and constitutive of the very exercise of rationality (Korsgaard 2008: 13–15, 110–126, 207–229). “Constitutive standards are opposed to external standards, which mention desiderata for an object that are not essential to its being the kind of thing that it is” (Korsgaard 2008: 8). The constructivist conviction is that appeal to standards constitutive of agency explains with ease why such standards are normative (Korsgaard 2008: 8). They are normative because in the very activity of reasoning we are committing ourselves to being guided by them (Wallace 2012).
As O’Neill remarks, the constructivist vindication of reason is “avowedly circular”:
If the standards of practical reasoning are fundamental to all human reasoning, then any vindication of these standards is either circular (since it uses those very standards) or a failure (since it is not a vindication in terms of the standards that are said to be fundamental). (O’Neill 1989b: 29)
This kind of reply is shared by Kantians (Bagnoli 2016), Humeans (Velleman 2009: 138–141) and other constitutivists (Ferrero 2010a; Katsafanas 2013; Smith 2013; Arruda 2016).
The constitutivist strategy appears to be particularly problematic for the varieties of Kantian constructivism that derive moral obligations from structural features of rational agency. Many contend that understood as a constitutive standard the categorical imperative is not rich enough to identify moral obligations (Cohen 1996; Bratman 1998; Gibbard 1999: 149, 152–153; Fitzpatrick 2005). Some constructivists offer similar grounds for rejecting Kantian constructivism about reasons (see sections 3, 4, 5.1). In fact, most Kantian constructivists deny that moral obligations can be derived from universal features of bare rationality alone and also deny that appeal to constitutive norms of rationality is sufficient to provide a complete system of moral duties (Bagnoli forthcoming).
There is room for disagreement concerning the principles that are thought to be constitutive of rational agency. This is where the difference among the varieties of constructivism is acute. Arguably, the principle of logical consistency is one such principle but it is generally thought to be too thin to help in rational choice. By itself, consistency does not seem to account for the kind of constraints that rational agents need to impose on the dynamic process of goal management (Shemmer 2012; Gibbard 1999; Smith 1999). To account for these normative constraints, some add a broad principle of coherence, which demands a unified account of the agent’s goals, and thus goes beyond strict logical consistency (Shemmer 2012). Others argue for additional but related principles, which regulate attention and disregard (James 2007, 2012), respect for others having equal standing (Bagnoli 2013b), benevolence and non-interference (Smith 2013: 322, 328). Kantians hold that the normativity of instrumental principles of rationality rests on the normativity of non-instrumental principles (O’Neill 1989b: 73–74; Korsgaard 1997, 2008: esp. 67–69).
The differences among these views can be illustrated by comparing their respective diagnoses of a fictional Caligula whose state of mind is completely coherent but who values torturing people for fun (Street 2010: 371). For realists, he is in error about some true moral value. There are some reasons—for example, the reason not to torture others for fun—that we have quite independently of our evaluative attitudes and practical reasoning. Kantians agree with realists that fictional Caligula has no good reasons for torturing anyone, but differ in explaining why this is so. Some Kantians think that fictional Caligula is incoherent, even though not obviously so. His incoherence can be shown by spelling out the norms that are constitutive of valuing. Such constitutive norms entail valuing humanity, and this shows that fictional Caligula is making a mistake by his own lights, even though he may never fully realize this, due to poor reflection, ignorance of the non-normative facts or some other limitation (Korsgaard 1996a: 121–123). A different Kantian argument establishes that an internally coherent Caligula is conceivable, that is, he can be thought without contradiction, but his case is blocked by general facts about moral sensibility (Engstrom 2009: 243, § III.7, Bagnoli 2009). Such a Caligula would have no reason to torture others. By contrast, Humean constructivists hold that an internally coherent Caligula is possible and that such a person has reasons for torturing others (Street 2009).
7.3 Objections to Constitutivism
Constitutivism is the view that one can explain reasons or normativity in terms of what is constitutive of agency. Constitutive standards are supposed to be partly descriptive of the very activity that they have to assess (Korsgaard 2008: 9). Critics object that it is unclear whether and how they can be violated (Cohen 1996: 177; Lavin 2004; Kolodny 2005). For an agent to be correctly said to have norms, she must be able to break those norms. Suppose that there is a norm that prevents deception. To say that a rational agent is guided by such a norm is to say that she can violate it. But if the norm is constitutive of reasoning, how can she break the norm by reasoning? If constitutive norms cannot be violated, constitutivism implies that immoralism and irrationality are impossible.
In her more recent work, Korsgaard replies that to count as acting at all, we must at least be trying to follow the principles of practical reason, but she allows that we may fail to do so adequately or fully (Korsgaard 2009: 45–49, 159–176. For instance, while adopting the moral end of benevolence, we may lack grace and understanding, so as to provoke resentment, rather than elicit gratitude. Herman proposes that in the defective instances of acting, the constitutive norms are not misapplied but misrepresented (Herman 2007: 171–172, 245–246). For instance, by making a poor judgment about what to do in self-defense, one mischaracterizes and misunderstands what self-defense is and what it requires.
A second objection is that the constitutivist strategy partly depends on the claim that agency is inescapable, but critics think that agency is as optional as any other particular activity (Enoch 2006; O’Hagan 2014; Tiffany 2012). Constitutivists reply that agency is unlike any other particular activity. While it is possible to disengage from any particular ordinary activities, some sort of agency continues to operate (Ferrero 2010a, also Velleman 2009: 138–141; James 2012). In this sense, agency is not optional. Enoch has further objected that, even when some sort of activity is always in place, this is not enough to say that the norms constituting the activity produce normative reasons for action for any one agent (Enoch 2011b). But the constructivist point is that questions about reasons to be agents must be taken up within agency (Velleman 2009: 204–206). Thus, Enoch’s question is not a live question, so one does not need a reason to be agent rather than not (Rosati 2016: 201 n. 71; Silverstein 2015: 1136–1138).
A similar reply is produced from a non-Kantian perspective, on the basis of considerations about the desires that are appropriate to idealized agents (Smith 2012, 2013). Whether agents have conclusive reasons to be agents, however, might depend on the particular version of constitutivism.
A third worry is voiced by Bratman (2012). He criticizes constructivists for imposing excessive constraints on rational deliberation, which eventually put agents in tension with their own pre-reflective normative judgments. As a consequence, reflective agents may find themselves holding incompatible (prereflective and reflective) judgments. For instance, one might be required to reflectively give up one’s loyalties and attachments because they do not cohere with one’s impartial duties, even though such loyalties shape one’s life. This is a problem even when the constitutive norm is a formal requirement of consistency, as it is for Street. Furthermore, if the input judgments include attitudes such as love and caring, which are not necessarily responsive to intersubjective pressures, agents may end up endorsing reflective judgments that are not aligned with their unreflective judgments. This objection points to a difficulty for constructivism insofar as it adopts constitutive strategies, but it also indicates a new significant line of research, which concerns how rational agents develop and maintain integrity over time (James 2012; Ferrero 2009, 2010b; Smith 2013: 315ff).
In the last thirty years, constructivism emerged and established itself as one recognizable form of metaethics. As with other metaethical theories, it faces serious objections, but it also makes a significant contribution to many debates, some of which originated from constructivist challenges to traditional metaethics.
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I would like to thank Caroline Arruda, Robert Audi, Christine M. Korsgaard, Luca Ferrero, Mark LeBar, Elijah Millgram, Andrews Reath, Tim Scanlon, Robert Schwartz, Michael Smith, Robert Stern, Karsten Stueber and especially David Copp and Connie Rosati, the Editors and Referees of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy, for their invaluable comments on earlier drafts.