Constructivism in Political Philosophy

First published Tue Feb 6, 2024

Political constructivism is a metaphorical term implying some resemblance between political morality and artificial, “constructed”, objects. To elaborate the resemblance, constructivists might suggest that political morality is an actual artifact, akin to a purposely designed set of legal and social norms. This suggestion, however, sits uneasily with the naive conviction that sound moral principles are discovered rather than merely invented. Constructivists might instead suggest that various political principles have features that some designer would select and apply the analogy only to some rather than the whole of political morality. This entry focuses on the views of John Rawls, which favor this more complex hypothetical and restrictive interpretation.

The doctrine of political constructivism is present in John Rawls’s A Theory of Justice (1971, 1999a) and developed more explicitly in Rawls’s later work, including his Dewey Lectures (Rawls 1980, 1999b: ch. 16; James 2014; Krasnoff 2014; Laden 2014) and second book, Political Liberalism (Rawls 1993, 1996, 2005: Lecture III). There are non-Rawlsian forms of political constructivism (Barry 1995; Forst 2011) and constructivism is also used to designate positions in philosophy of mathematics (Bridges & Palmgren 2013) and meta-ethics (Bagnoli 2013 & 2022; Enoch 2009; Fitzpatrick 2005; Korsgaard 1996, 2003 [2008]; Hussain & Shah 2006; Lenman & Shemmer 2012; Scanlon 2012; Street 2008, 2010; Wedgwood 2002). Largely setting aside these alternatives, here the term constructivism will refer to one “view about the structure and content of a political conception” (Rawls 1993: 89) present within Rawls’s thought.

Rawls’s political constructivism claims that various sound action-guiding political principles resemble artifacts insofar as they can be “represented” as if they were produced by some imaginary agents who undertake a “procedure of construction” that validates those principles (Rawls 1993: 93, and cp. Rawls 1999a: 40). Furthermore, Rawls affirms a restrictive rather than inclusive form of constructivism, which claims that the artificial element within political morality does not exhaust its content let alone the entire moral, evaluative, or normative domain. As he puts it,

not everything…is constructed; we must have some material, as it were, from which to begin. In a more literal sense, only the substantive principles specifying the content of political right and justice are constructed. The procedure itself is simply laid out using as starting points the basic conceptions of society and person, the principles of practical reason, and the public role of a political conception of justice. (Rawls 1993: 104; italics added)

(See also Scanlon 2014: 90–104 for a contractualist version of constructivism that is less restrictive insofar as it extends beyond political morality but still non-inclusive because in doing so it relies on prior non-constructed claims about sound normative reasons.)

The following sections attempt to explain and assess these statements, and other core constructivist claims. The former explanatory task is particularly urgent. In 1980, referring to a main forerunner to political constructivism, and comparing it to intuitionism and utilitarianism, Rawls observed that a

proper understanding of Kantian constructivism, on a par with our grasp of these views, is still to be achieved. (Rawls 1980 [1999]: 556 [343])

Many years later, the same is true of political constructivism: the proposal that political principles are in some sense artificial and Rawls’s more specific claims about constructed principles, constructive procedures, and non-constructed material all remain elusive ideas, and there is no clear and shared characterization of the doctrine.

Sections 1 and 2 outline Rawls’s analogy regarding the artificial character of political morality. They do so by describing two characteristic features of constructivism, namely (i) the role the doctrine attaches to procedurally grounded principles in determining some of our reasons for action, and (ii) its reliance on certain types of non-constructed foundational ideal. Turning to the implications Rawls draws from his view of the public role of political principles, Sections 3 and 4 then examine a third important characteristic, namely (iii) the “political” dimension of constructivism and in particular (iv) the doctrine’s restricted scope and ambition to be consistent with several rival meta-ethical positions. Sections 5, 6, and 7 conclude by outlining the appeal of constructivism, one of its puzzling features, and various criticisms advanced by its leading opponent, G. A. Cohen, and others.

1. Reasons, Principles, and Procedures

The aim of political constructivism is to explain why particular empirical facts are “right-and-wrong-making characteristics” that determine whether “an action or institution is…right or wrong, or just or unjust” (Rawls 1993: 121) and provide sound reasons for political action. The doctrine’s primary purpose, then, is to identify what makes it the case that objects possess certain moral and normative properties rather than what justifies belief in their possession of those properties. Thus construed, constructivism is a distinctive general position within one branch of normative ethics, normative political theory. When it comes to epistemology, Rawls takes for granted that constructivists assume justification involves coherence between considered convictions at various levels of generality, a commitment to the doctrine of reflective equilibrium he regards as common ground between exponents of many moral and non-moral theories (Rawls 1993: 95; Scanlon 2003: 140–53; Kelly & McGrath 2010; Daniels 2013; McGrath 2019: Ch. 2)

Various rival political theories, ranging from Hobbesian contractarianism to agent-neutral consequentialism, all share the same explanatory ambition as constructivism. What distinguishes constructivism is the explanation it gives for the structure and content of political morality. More specifically, constructivism involves a “conjecture” (Rawls 1993: 96; Rawls 1999a: 305) that certain principles are sound because they can be represented as the outcome of the relevant construction procedure; for example, the original position, in Rawls’s favored version of constructivism, justice as fairness.

Before analyzing the constructivist conjecture in more detail, note first that in Rawls’s initial discussion of constructivism he states the conjecture in a way that implies the normative status of certain facts derives solely from prior principles and yet more fundamental procedures. Thus, the 1980 Dewey Lectures on “Kantian Constructivism in Moral Theory” contain the striking claim that an

essential feature of a constructivist view…is that its first principles single out what facts…citizens are to count as reasons of justice. Apart from the procedure of constructing these principles, there are no reasons of justice and what their relative force is can be ascertained only on the basis of principles that result from the construction. (Rawls 1999a: 351, italics added, and cp. 307 and 354)

Here the italicized phrase suggests that some basis in constructed principles is not merely sufficient for facts to constitute reasons of justice but essential since that basis provides the only plausible account of what makes facts into such reasons. (See also Rawls 2000: 246, where Rawls states that the “idea of constructivism is that, apart from a reasonable constructivist conception, facts are simply facts”.)

In his later chapter on “Political Constructivism”, however, Rawls expresses a less ambitious version of the conjecture and suggests merely that derivation from principles validated by a constructive procedure is sufficient. As he explains,

the political constructivist regards a judgment as correct because it issues from the reasonable and rational procedure of construction when correctly formulated and correctly followed (assuming, as always, that the judgment relies on true information. (Rawls 1993: 96)

Rawls leaves unanswered, however, the question of whether what makes the relevant judgments sound is exhausted by procedural grounds, and explicitly avoids reliance on the Kantian view of “constitutive autonomy”, which claims

the order of moral and political values must be made, or itself constituted, by the principles and conceptions of practical reason. (Rawls 1993: 99)

For reasons related to the “political” character of constructivism, discussed in Section 3, I shall assume that the less ambitious version represents Rawls’s considered construal of the constructivist conjecture.

Regardless of whether it takes a more or a less ambitious form, we can analyze the constructivist conjecture as affirming at least the following two core claims.

  1. Some facts provide sound reasons for action because justified moral principles confer that positive normative status on those facts.
  2. Some sound moral principles can confer positive normative status on facts because those principles are validated by an appropriate procedural test.

Of course, many non-constructivists recognize some relationship between principles and agents’ reasons for action. They claim, for instance, that principles summarize our reasons or perform useful heuristic or strategic functions by enabling us to better identify or conform to our reasons. As a result, it is possible to assume that the first core claim is commonplace. The same risk applies to the second core claim unless the distinction between procedural and non-procedural tests is stated more clearly. To address these problems, and more fully understand the notions of status-conferral and procedural validation, it is worth noting some contrasts between constructivism and two further doctrines about what makes certain facts provide sound moral reasons and what justifies procedural tests, namely rational intuitionism and consequentialism.

Drawing the first contrast, Rawls writes that

the intuitionist regards a procedure as correct because following it correctly usually gives the correct independently given judgment, whereas the political constructivist regards a judgment as correct because it issues from the reasonable and rational procedure of construction…. (Rawls 1993: 96, italics added)

Rawls’s remark brings out the non-derivative importance that constructivism characteristically attaches to more general procedures and principles in relation to propositions about specific reasons. The doctrine does not claim that principles merely have instrumental value in relation to facts that constitute sound reasons prior to procedures and principles. It claims instead that for some of the normative domain they play a non-instrumental role by in part making it the case that certain facts constitute reasons for action (cp. McKeever & Ridge 2006: 12–14).

In affirming the generative role of procedurally-based principles in constituting part of the normative domain the constructivist makes a claim which is far from commonplace. As a result, some critics might regard constructivism as implausibly inverting the appropriate order of explanation between truths about reasons and principles. To express their puzzlement, they might ask “How can a principle ever make a fact into a reason?”

On reflection, however, the constructivist’s distinctive explanatory strategy is less puzzling than might first appear to be the case. To understand why, note that if legal institutions can possess legitimate political authority, then legislated principles may confer normative status on facts that otherwise might not constitute reasons for action. Furthermore, legislation performs this role in virtue of its procedural pedigree rather than its content alone (Raz 1986: Part I). For example, many, if not all, motorists accept that local speed regulations should make a difference to the reasons that bear on their driving decisions, and they do so because of the source of regulations rather than because of their non-procedural virtues. Endorsing a structurally similar view, constructivists claim that some political reasons are also artifacts in the sense that their validity derives from prior principles which, in turn, derive their validity from yet more basic constructive procedures.

Although the comparison with legal reasons is instructive, it is nevertheless worth bearing in mind that there are limits on the extent to which constructivism claims that political reasons resemble legal reasons. As we have noted, the constructivist does not claim that political reasons are as heavily dependent as legal reasons on actual legislative activity and other types of contingent social facts.

The first core claim that certain principles can make facts constitute sound reasons for action does not uniquely differentiate constructivism since various non-constructivist views claim that principles can confer normative status. For example, various indirect forms of consequentialism (Johnson 1991; Hooker 2000) also assume that certain types of moral principle, usually including the prohibitions present in common-sense morality, play an indispensable role in determining our reasons for action. To explain what makes specific principles play this role, indirect consequentialists appeal ultimately to their tendency to promote valuable outcomes when internalized by relevant individuals or groups. We can further differentiate constructivism by noting that its second core claim assumes that the value of outcomes is not what ultimately matters when explaining the status-conferring power of the specific principles it focusses on. Constructivists instead appeal to validity conferring constructive procedures rather than value-promotion to explain why some specific principles are better grounded than others.

Unfortunately, Rawls does not state any general criterion to differentiate constructive procedures from non-procedural tests for the soundness of principles. It is not completely clear, for example, whether the very general process involved in human beings making their evaluative and normative attitudes coherent by securing reflective equilibrium might qualify as a constructive procedure in his view. This unclarity may be part of the explanation of why the label “constructivism” is now used in several very different ways within practical philosophy and encompasses prominent Kantian and Humean variants (Korsgaard 2003 [2008]; Street 2010 & 2012). Rawls does, however, make relevant remarks that restrict the types of constructive procedure characteristic of his own political constructivism, and in particular the types of consideration from which their capacity to validate principles derives. He also remarks on how his own theory of justice as fairness is one version of constructivism. We now examine how these remarks illuminate constructivism.

2. Political Constructivism and Justice as Fairness

Recall that Rawls emphasizes that only some of the elements within a constructivist view resemble artifacts, namely various principles of political morality, including ones stating what social justice requires. As Rawls explains, contrasting such principles with certain ideals and other types of practical principle,

not everything, then, is constructed; we must have some material, as it were, from which to begin. In a more literal sense, only the substantive principles specifying [the] content of political right and justice are constructed. The procedure itself is simply laid out using as starting points the basic conceptions of society and person, the principles of practical reason, and the public role of a political conception of justice. (Rawls 1993: 104, cp. 108)

Rawls’s remark highlights the second characteristic feature of constructivism, which concerns the substantive content of the doctrine rather than its structure. Here the main notable feature is the fundamental role that constructivism affords to specific non-constructed considerations in determining which constructive procedure is suitable. According to Rawls’s explicit definition (Rawls 1993: 93–94), these include underlying ideals of the citizen, society, and practical reasonableness and rationality.

For illustration, consider how Rawls’s own theory of justice as fairness assumes citizens have the twin moral powers involved in having a sense of justice and a capacity rationally to form, revise, and pursue a conception of the good as well as associated interests in developing and exercising those powers (Rawls 1993: 103–4). In addition to this conception of the individual, the theory relies upon an associational ideal of well-ordered social cooperation according to widely shared public rules. These non-constructed assumptions lend support to Rawls’s favored procedural test on principles of social justice, which famously appeals to hypothetical agreement in a so-called original position (Hinton 2015).

Employing the test, Rawls asks how mutually disinterested rational representatives of prospective citizens would rank competing principles of justice when fairly situated behind a veil of ignorance that robs them of any knowledge about the personal characteristics of the specific individuals they are assumed to represent, as well as the concrete conceptions of the good that are affirmed by those individuals. Rawls’s answer proceeds via two stages as each representative initially assesses principles by reference to the interests of the individual she represents and then subsequently focuses on the more general issue of a principle’s capacity, once instituted, to facilitate well-ordered social cooperation by shaping individuals so they share, and are normally moved by, the same sense of justice (Rawls 2001: Part III).

While Rawls’s own favored procedure involves citizens’ representatives who are fairly situated behind the veil of ignorance, it is worth noting that Rawls allows that constructivists might appeal to quite different procedures to explain how principles are constructed on the basis of non-constructed assumptions. Referring to various authors including T. M. Scanlon, Ronald Dworkin, Onora O’Neill, Brian Barry, and David Brink, Rawls writes that

only Scanlon and Barry understand constructivism as I do, although their constructivisms are different. (Rawls 1993: 91, n. 1)[1]

Here Rawls alludes to the fact that the reasonable rejection test central to Scanlon’s contractualism (Scanlon 1982, 1999), and later adopted by Barry (1995), also qualifies as a constructive procedure. The reasonable rejection test states that

an act is wrong if its performance under the circumstances would be disallowed by any set of principles for the general regulation of behaviour that no one could reasonably reject as a basis for informed, unforced, general agreement. (Scanlon 1999: 153)

Unlike Rawls’s original position test, Scanlon’s test involves no assumption of partial motivation or any use of a veil of ignorance to avert unfair effects. Instead, Scanlon’s test assumes each agent shares the same concern to identify principles immune to reasonable rejection. Moreover, Scanlon applies his test to principles of interpersonal obligation in general whereas Rawls does not assume his original position test applies beyond political morality. The differences between Rawls’s and Scanlon’s tests are therefore readily apparent. It is less apparent, however, what features such tests must possess for them to qualify as the types of procedure characteristic of a constructivist view in Rawls’s sense of this expression. One possibility is that the tests assume that principles have a social role, and so their validity derives in part from their functional properties when put into practice. We later return to this possibility and the criticisms it provokes but now turn to the non-comprehensive character of constructivism.

3. Why Constructivism Became “Political”

Many find it natural to assume that “in principle all moral reasons are fair game for governmental action” (Raz 1989: 1230). Those tempted to assume that politics may legitimately be based on the whole truth face an interesting problem if they are also drawn to Rawls’s ideals of free and equal citizenship and well-ordered social cooperation, and his account of their implications.

To understand the structure of the problem bear in mind that Rawls’s conception of citizens’ needs supports the conclusion that any fully just society will attach great weight to protecting the expressive and associative liberties we need to develop and exercise our moral powers. In addition, recall that Rawls’s ideal of the well-ordered society depends upon its members achieving social unity through regulating their more fundamental political decisions by a family of values that are widely accepted in the societies they regulate.

A notable conflict now arises if, as Rawls plausibly assumes, the protection of civil liberties within modern societies is inevitably accompanied by the fact of reasonable pluralism (Rawls 1993: 36–39), and thus many people of good will nevertheless fail to recognize which reasons apply across many areas of ethics, and religious and philosophical discourse. For under these conditions of persistent disagreement, it is impossible jointly to realize three aspirations each of which has some genuine appeal: we cannot simultaneously protect civil liberties, enjoy social unity through our political activities, and govern those activities by the whole truth.

Rawls’s own response to what might be called the liberal trilemma is to insist upon the priority of liberty and then to hope that the value of social unity, even if only pro tanto rather than absolute (Rawls 2005: 386), is normally of sufficient importance to defeat any conflicting values realized by acting from the whole truth. It is against this background that the third major characteristic of Rawls’s favored political form of constructivism, namely its non-comprehensive nature, is best understood (Clayton 1999; Freeman 2007; Lister 2013; Quong 2010a; Quong 2014; Weithman 2010).

Explaining the source of the doctrine’s “political” character, Rawls writes that

it is only by affirming a constructivist conception—one which is political not metaphysical—that citizens can generally expect to find principles that all can accept. This they can do without denying the deeper aspects of their reasonable comprehensive doctrines. Given their differences, citizens cannot fulfill in any other way their…desire to have a shared political life acceptable to others as free and equal. (Rawls 1993: 98, italics added; Rawls 2000: 329)

As Rawls explains here, in pursuit of a valuable form of normative consensus, political constructivists try to duck many important philosophical questions. Thus, Rawls adds that

This idea of a shared political life does not invoke Kant’s idea of autonomy, or Mill’s idea of individuality, as moral values belonging to a comprehensive doctrine. The appeal is rather to the political value of public life conducted on terms that all reasonable citizens can accept as fair. (Rawls 1993: 98)

The use of the “method of avoidance” is most apparent in Rawls’s conception of citizens deliberating on the basis of a subset of reasons, which govern certain political decisions but are not claimed to extend more comprehensively. It is also apparent in the constructivist’s attempt to make only minimal claims about the respects in which their political judgments are successful or have what Rawls terms an “objective” status, to which the next section now turns.

4. Rational Intuitionism, Moral Constructivism, and Political Constructivism

In addressing the issue of the objectivity of judgments about political morality, Rawls first outlines several “widely recognized essentials” (Rawls 1993: 110 n. 16, and 110–112) which he implies any adequate conception of an objectively successful moral judgment must affirm. Roughly stated, these essentials include recognizing that genuinely objective judgments do not merely voice psychological states but are

  1. supported by reasons and warrant inferences, and
  2. aspire to satisfy some standard of correctness.

In addition, Rawls claims that any adequate conception of objectively successful judgments must

  1. assign reasons to agents and provide some ordering when reasons conflict,
  2. acknowledge a distinction between judgments being correct and merely appearing correct, and
  3. provide an account of how agents might arrive at the same or similar judgments.

Discussing (ii) and (iv) respectively, for example, Rawls writes that it

is definitive of judgment (moral or otherwise) that it aims at being reasonable, or true, as the case may be

and that it is

part of understanding the concept of objectivity that we never suppose that our thinking something is just or reasonable, or a group’s thinking it so, makes it so. (Rawls 1993: 111)

Rawls’s strategy in explaining the political constructivist conception of objectivity is to claim that it satisfies these minimal conditions (Rawls 1993: 114–116) and, in addition, does not affirm or contradict two mutually opposed and more comprehensive conceptions of objective success.

One such comprehensive conception is the form of moral realism that Rawls labels rational intuitionism, and attributes to Samuel Clarke, Richard Price, Henry Sidgwick, and W. D. Ross (Rawls 1993: 91; Rawls 2000: 72, 235–237). According to Rawls, rational intuitionism claims that

moral principles and judgments, when correct, are true statements about an independent order of moral values…[that] does not depend on, nor is it to be explained by, the activity of any (human) minds…. (Rawls 1993: 91)

The other conception is moral constructivism, a comprehensive doctrine Rawls attributes to Kant (Rawls 2000: 235–252). On Rawls’s reading, Kant’s moral constructivism claims that

a correct moral judgment is one that meets all the relevant criteria of reasonableness and rationality incorporated into the categorical imperative procedure for testing maxims. (Rawls 1993: 114)

Insofar as they both assume that procedures play a validating role, moral constructivism and political constructivism are structurally similar.

There are, however, at least two respects in which moral constructivists make far more ambitious claims than political constructivists. They claim that the alleged priority of procedures applies to all moral judgments rather than relying only on a claim about judgments within political morality. Furthermore, they oppose intuitionist accounts of what makes moral judgments correct because such accounts appeal to normative facts that are prior to and independent of our self-conception.

Here it is worth noting that, as Rawls reads Kant’s moral constructivism, Kant does not merely deny the existence of such prior and independent facts. In addition, Kant regards them as inconsistent with our “autonomy” since he assumes that

it suffices for heteronomy that first principles are founded on relations among objects the nature of which is not affected or determined by our conception of ourselves as reasonable and rational persons…and by our conception of the public role of moral principles in a possible realm of ends. (Rawls 2000: 236)

Thus, Rawls concludes that

Kant’s idea of autonomy requires that there exists no moral order prior to and independent of those conceptions that determine the form of the procedure that specifies the content of the duties of justice and of virtue. (Rawls 2000: 236–37)

Rejecting the heteronomous grounding for our judgments assumed by intuitionists, moral constructivists instead endorse what, as noted earlier, Rawls calls the doctrine of “constitutive autonomy”. For them

constructivism is deeper and goes to the very existence and constitution of the order of values


the so-called independent order of values does not constitute itself but is constituted by the activity, actual or ideal, of practical (human) reason itself. (Rawls 1993: 99)

The notions of truth and independence that Rawls employs to characterize rational intuitionism and, by contrast, moral constructivism are suggestive and influential within recent meta-ethics (Lenman & Shemmer, 2012) but, as noted initially, they are also elusive. It is unfortunate, for example, that although Rawls often refers to the idea of an “independent order of values” he fails to explain the idea in much detail. As a result, the degree to which intuitionists are supposed by Rawls to treat reasons as completely mind-independent is not entirely clear. For example, do intuitionists allow that in order to be capable of guiding our actions and attitudes they must be dependent to some degree on psychological facts?

It is also unclear to which degree moral constructivists are assumed to treat reasons as mind-dependent. Do they claim merely that reasons are mind-dependent insofar as they are determined by prior norms that govern judgements and mental processes? Or do they go even further and claim that our attitude to those governing norms is what ultimately makes them valid or invalid? If so, are those norms and attitudes variable (Street 2010), or invariable (Korsgaard 1996) across individuals? And how can attaching such a fundamental role to our attitudes be reconciled with Rawls’s insistence, noted earlier, that objectivity rules out supposing that “our thinking something is just or reasonable, or a group’s thinking it so, makes it so” (Rawls 1993: 111)?

It is less difficult to understand the “method of avoidance” Rawls employs in his attempt to show that political constructivism attempts to minimize disagreement with either rational intuitionism or Kant’s moral constructivism.

On the issue of whether the moral judgments political constructivism supports are advanced as true, Rawls accepts that it is “definitive of judgment (moral or otherwise) that it aims at being reasonable, or true, as the case may be” (Rawls 1996: 111). Employing the distinction between true and reasonable judgments, Rawls grants that a political constructivist regards the social scientific judgments she relies upon as true. (In that respect, even a political conception is at least partially comprehensive insofar as it relies upon empirical judgments applicable beyond political morality.) When it comes to judgments about political morality, however, the situation is more complex.

Here the political constructivist is not indifferent to whether the political judgments she affirms are true or false and is committed at least to denying that they are false (Rawls 1999a). But constructivism remains uncommitted to truth as the standard of correctness appropriate to political judgments, and so declines to insist that those judgments are true. It is also worth noting that as well as avoiding commitment to a substantive conception of truth, like those embraced by correspondence or coherence theories, constructivism avoids commitment to even the minimalist conception of truth, according to which its nature can be captured entirely via disquotation (Horwich 1998; J. Cohen 2009). Instead, the constructivist claims only that the political judgments she affirms are better, or at least as well, supported by reasons than the alternatives, and takes no position regarding the possibility of defending a more elaborate view of what it is for her political judgments to be correct. Thus, as Rawls often states, he regards justice as fairness as the most reasonable available political conception.

Although Rawls often invokes the distinction between the standards of truth and of reasonableness, he does little to explain what makes the two aims of judgment distinct. At one point he does claim that “there can be but one true comprehensive doctrine, though…many reasonable ones” (Rawls 1993: 129). This statement, however, does not employ the idea of being fully reasonable that Rawls elsewhere uses to characterize correctness in judgment. Instead, it mentions a satiable form of reasonableness that depends on a view being sufficiently well-supported by the appropriate kinds of reasons that it can contribute to a political decision’s legitimacy (i.e., its permissible enforceability and its capacity to provide reasons for obedience) even if the decision itself is unjustified insofar as there are conclusive reasons favoring a conflicting decision. Presumably, however, if reasonableness is the standard of success, then there could also be several successful conflicting conceptions each of which is no better supported by reasons than any alternative conception (Raz 1999). In contrast, if truth is the standard of success, then no similar form of pluralism is conceivable, at least assuming the standard of truth does not admit the possibility of a set of conflicting judgments all being successful. There is, then, some difference between treating political judgments as truth-apt and reason-apt. It is striking, however, that Rawls does so little to explain why it is so much more philosophically contentious to claim that moral judgements can be truth-apt than that they can be more or less reasonable, or to claim that a particular political morality, such as justice as fairness, is true than that it is either true or the most reasonable.

In addition, Rawls claims that

a variant of rational intuitionism and political constructivism…could agree on the very same principles of practical reason and conceptions of the person and society.

Those views would differ only insofar as the intuitionist view also affirms the claim that

a reasonable judgment is true, or probably true (depending on the strength of the reasons), of an independent order of values. (Rawls 1993: 113)

Rawls insists that this additional claim is neither affirmed nor denied by political constructivism. For this reason, and because of its similar structure, political constructivism is also consistent with, but not committed to, moral constructivism.

Having sketched the third characteristic feature of political constructivism, namely its non-comprehensive content, it is worth finally noting some limits to the doctrine’s meta-ethical modesty.

To understand one of those limits, consider Rawls’s response in Political Liberalism to those who affirm the causal requirement that

a judgment (or belief) is objective just in case the content of our judgment is (in part) the outcome of an appropriate kind of causal process affecting our sense experience, say, on which the judgment is based. (Rawls 1993: 116; cp. Harman 1977: chs. 1 and 2)

The causal requirement confronts constructivists with a dilemma. To maintain their commitment to the objectivity of their substantive judgements they must claim that the causal requirement is unsound or that there exist causal relations between moral reasons and our moral experience. Since affirming each claim, or affirming the disjunction, involves endorsing controversial meta-ethical theses Rawls’s method of avoidance can be pursued only so far.

It is noteworthy that Rawls appears to concede as much when he states that

Political constructivism accepts Kant’s view this far: it holds that there are different conceptions of objectivity appropriate for theoretical and practical reason. (Rawls 1993: 117)

Elaborating his view, Rawls grants for the sake of argument that a

causal requirement is part of an appropriate conception of objectivity for judgments of theoretical reason, or at least in much of natural science, and likewise for perceptual judgments,

and proceeds to insist that the requirement

is not essential for all conceptions of objectivity, and not for a conception suitable for moral and political reasoning. (Rawls 1993: 117)

He goes on to defend the latter claim by appealing to

the fact that we do not require of a moral and political judgment that the reasons for it show it to be related to an appropriate causal process, or require an explanation of it within cognitive psychology…it is enough that the reasons offered are sufficiently strong. (Rawls 1993: 117)

As Rawls’s remarks indicate, then, political constructivism involves at least some meta-ethical commitments insofar as it embraces one component of Kant’s moral constructivism, namely its denial that objectively sound moral judgments necessarily satisfy a causal requirement.

Note too that Rawls sometimes appears to characterize rational intuitionism as a doctrine that affirms the causal requirement and assumes it can be satisfied because some of our moral judgments are explicable as the effects of an independent evaluative order. Attributing the view to Sidgwick, Moore and Ross, Rawls writes that a

basic psychological assumption of rational intuitionism is that people can recognize first principles and that the recognition of those principles as true of a prior order of moral values gives rise to a desire to act from them for their own sake. Moral motivation is defined by reference to desires that have a special kind of causal origin, namely, the reasoned grasp of first principles. (Rawls 2000: 237–38, italics added)

On this characterization, it follows that political constructivism is not merely uncommitted to the intuitionist doctrine; instead, the two positions are inconsistent because of their opposing treatment of the causal requirement. If so, once again, political constructivism occupies a more partisan position than some of Rawls’s statements suggest.

It would be mistaken, however, to infer that constructivism’s opposition to rational intuitionism provides much support to critics of moral realism, who are thereby able to claim Rawls qua political constructivist as a philosophical ally. The inference is invalid because rational intuitionism is just one version of moral realism. Like other versions of moral realism, rational intuitionism is a cognitivist objectivist success theory (Sayre-McCord 1988). Thus, it claims that some moral statements express truth-apt judgments that succeed in being true but are not made true merely by some subjects’ attitudes. But rational intuitionists go further and affirm a specific ontological thesis about what does make moral judgments true, namely facts about an evaluative order that is in some sense independent of rational beings and capable of entering causal relations with their psychology.

Other forms of moral realism, however, eschew the ontological commitments of rational intuitionism, as construed by Rawls. The most prominent recent example is supplied by Derek Parfit, who defends a version of what he terms Non-Metaphysical Non-Naturalist Normative Cognitivism, according to which

There are some claims that are irreducibly normative in the reason-involving sense, and are in the strongest sense true. But these truths have no ontological implications. For such claims to be true, these reason-involving properties need not exist either as natural properties in the spatio-temporal world, or in some non-spatio-temporal part of reality. (Parfit 2011: vol. 2, 486)

Taking a similar position over many years, Ronald Dworkin also defended a form of realism that affirms the existence of moral facts capable of justifying our attitudes but incapable of explaining them (Dworkin 1996 and 2011). Arguably, political constructivism anticipates these views in some respects.

5. The Appeal of Political Constructivism

Having outlined various features of political constructivism, this section examines its distinctive appeal, and asks why adopting the doctrine might help secure reflective equilibrium in our considered judgments about political morality. To do so we examine the relationship between constructivism’s non-manufactured substance and its form. More specifically, I shall argue that if we affirm the associational ideal of well-ordered cooperation, and draw on it to interpret our other ideals, then the use of a constructivist procedure to explain why various facts provide reasons for political action makes sense.

To understand the proposal, recall that if a particular society is well-ordered then its governing principles fulfill a concrete function. Describing how that function is understood in theories like his own, Rawls writes the

social role of a conception of justice is to enable all members of society to make mutually acceptable to one another their shared institutions and basic arrangements, by citing what are publicly recognized as sufficient reasons, as identified by that conception. (Rawls 1999a: 305)

Rawls’s defense of justice as fairness in A Theory of Justice often attempts to show that its principles can perform the relevant function or, more accurately, can do so better than, or as well as, rival principles.

As noted in Section 2, a concern that reasons for political action are publicly recognized explains why the parties in the original position choose principles via a two-stage procedure that latterly considers the degree to which individuals who grow up under candidate principles will acquire, and normally be moved by, a sense of justice with a content corresponding to those principles. The same concern for public justification also explains why Rawls insists the parties to the original position choose amongst principles on the (unrealistic) assumption that common knowledge of their application exists, so rendering ineligible esoteric political principles, like “government house utilitarianism” (B. Williams 1985; 108–110). In addition, the concern explains why one of the main ambitions ofA Theory of Justice is to provide “constructive criteria” for political decisions that economize on intuitive appeals to judgment, thereby providing a “workable and systematic” alternative to the pluralist intuitionism, an approach which affirms a variety of principles but offers no explicit method to order their demands if they conflict (Rawls 1999a: 35 and xvii).

As well as drawing on the assumption that public justification matters, Rawls also suggests various explanations of why it is desirable that individuals who conceive of themselves as free and equal deliberate about their fundamental political institutions and decisions by appeal to a widely endorsed family of procedural and substantive values. One explanation treats citizens’ joint pursuit of shared final ends as a valuable form of civic friendship, and the best attainable in societies that treat their members as free and equal, and so recognize basic civil liberties and face permanent disagreement over comprehensive doctrines (Ebels-Duggan 2010; Leland 2019; Lister 2013; Rawls 1996: li and 202–4). Another explanation treats a citizen’s affirmation of the institutions and decisions that constrain her as a valuable form of self-governance, and is suggested by Rawls’s remark that his conception of justification through mutually recognized principles is present in Rousseau’s Social Contract (Rawls 1999a: 426; see too Mandle 1997; and J. Cohen 2010: 14–16, 84–96; and especially p. 86 where Cohen writes that a “vision of self-governance achieved through political community is Rousseau’s distinctive contribution to political theory”).

Let us assume that Rawls’s ideal of social unity is plausible: it is desirable that individuals who are all sufficiently politically reasonable and conceive of each other as free and equal can justify to one another their most important political decisions by appealing to public principles or a family of political values that are mutually recognized. The case for constructivism derives in part from our initial substantive assumption, but the use of a procedural test to validate action-guiding principles also depends on a second assumption. In addition, constructivism relies on a more holistic assumption (cp. Dworkin 2011), namely that its conception of social unity is not merely one discrete political value amongst others but instead an ideal in light of which other action-guiding political principles should be understood and assessed. In justice as fairness this assumption is illustrated by the so-called two-stage argument mentioned above in Sec. 2, according to which the case for Rawls’s principles of justice is provisional until their stability relative to other principles is established.

For those who accept both the substantive and holistic assumption, then it becomes attractive to assess the relative plausibility of principles of justice by examining their likely concrete realization and the degree to which they can play the social role of facilitating well-ordered cooperation. One very natural way to engage in such assessment is to describe a procedural test in which imaginary agents akin to legislators select standards to govern fundamental political decisions partly by drawing on empirical information about the likely operation of those standards. Thus, given our two assumptions about the importance of social unity and its interdependence with other ideals, the constructivist proposal that political principles are comparable to artefacts and the accompanying idea that political reasons are in a one (meta-ethically uncommitted) sense manufactured become more appealing.

6. The Practical Conception of Justification

Opponents of constructivism are free to recognize the values realized when citizens enjoy civic friendship and political autonomy by acting on shared political principles that perform a unity-generating social role. Nevertheless, they might still regard those goods merely as a desirable byproduct of agents acting on principles made sound by completely distinct considerations. On this view, “practical” constructivist justifications for desiring to act on certain political principles resemble “pragmatic” justifications for believing, as Pascal’s Wager recommends, in a divine being: both fail because the facts to which they appeal, whilst valuable, fall outside the types of considerations that can rationalize the attitudes they aim to support. More specifically, the epistemic reasons for our beliefs are given by the evidence for those beliefs rather than any accompanying advantages, and the practical reasons for our desires are given by the value of their objects regardless of whether affirming principles favoring those desires would place us in valuable states, like being able to justify our decisions to one another in ways mutually recognized to be adequate (Parfit 2011a: 50–51, 420–432).

For illustration of this type of critical reaction to constructivism, consider a similar attitude to various principles of structural rationality that are often claimed to govern the combination of preferences, such as transitivity (Hansson & Grüne-Yanoff 2006 [2012: §1.3; Temkin 2012: chs. 6–7) and dominance (Weirich 2008 [2020]: 2.1). Suppose initially that agents with preferences that conform to sound rational requirements consequently often do better than they would if they violated them; for example, those agents are less liable to “money pumps” (Gustafsson 2013) if they have transitive preferences. One standard view of rational action, however, insists that even when these effects are valuable, they still play no role in making the relevant requirements sound; instead, the effects, at most, bear on whether agents should cause themselves to conform to the requirements.

The standard view makes the same claim about less familiar cases where conforming to rational requirements is disadvantageous and treats this as further evidence for its own plausibility. For example, it grants that agents facing Newcomb’s Problem (Weirich 2008 [2020]) fare less well if they satisfy rather than violate a dominance principle, and so intend to take two boxes rather than just one (Nozick 1969). Similarly, the standard view grants that agents facing the Toxin Puzzle fare less well if they ground their intentions on the value of options rather than the consequences of possessing certain intentions, and so currently lack any intention to consume some poison in the future even if possessing the intention today would immediately secure some greater reward (Kavka 1983). The standard view insists, however, that these discrepancies between what is advantageous and rational do not count against the relevant requirements. Instead, they show merely that less rational agents sometimes fare better than more rational agents and that agents may sometimes have reasons to regret being fully rational.

Constructivism’s critics might adopt a similar skeptical attitude to the positive social role of political principles. Thus, they could grant that social unity, civic friendship and political autonomy are all desirable consequences that arise when some relevant agents affirm and conform to certain shared principles. The critics might also accept that if those principles really did resemble artifacts in the way constructivism assumes then such desirable functional properties would play some role in determining their validity. Nevertheless, the critics might still counter-argue that in the case of at least some fundamental political principles those desirable properties possess no validity-making role, and so conclude that constructivist accounts of them are doomed to failure. If this counter-argument succeeds, then just as Pascal’s wager leads us astray in explaining the reasons for and against belief in a divine being, so constructivism’s explicitly practical conception of what justifies our political actions is misguided: both are practical in a way that makes them unfit to provide an adequate account of our reasons in the respective domains.

Note that these preliminary remarks have not yet stated any actual grounds to question the practical conception of political justification favored by constructivism. The point of the comparison between constructivism and approaches to justification that involve “pragmatic encroachment” (Kim 2017; Roeber 2018) in other domains was only to raise the possibility that constructivism faces a type of objection familiar elsewhere, and to suggest it merits attention since in the case of principles of epistemic or structural rationality it is common to deny the effects of affirming a principle have any bearing on its validity. If they are right to do so, then why not think the social role of political principles, or their affirmation’s functional properties more generally, are similarly irrelevant?

To examine some reasons to take this question seriously, we now outline the response to constructivism by its most systematic recent opponent, G. A. Cohen, as stated in his book Rescuing Justice and Equality (2008). Like opponents of pragmatic accounts of our reasons for belief and intention, Cohen insists that in some domains certain types of consideration can play no validity-making role:

we do not decide what to believe, whether about fact or about value and principle, in the light of what we expect the effects of believing it to be. (2008: 207)

More specifically, appealing to what he regards as a conceptual truth, and referring to rules grounded on empirical facts and a plurality of distinct evaluative factors, Cohen insists that constructivist theories of justice are doomed to fail:

we know from the sort of concept that justice is, that a correct conception of it excludes the view that its content is the set of optimal rules of regulation. (2008: 292)

To understand Cohen’s critique and its importance, we begin by describing its emergence and then some of his more specific arguments.

7. Against Political Constructivism

G. A. Cohen’s anti-constructivism emerged from his earlier critique of Rawls’s treatment of inequality-generating economic incentives (Cohen 1992). Central to the critique is a distinction between two interpretations of the subject matter of Rawls’s well-known difference principle, which requires that economic inequalities should be arranged to maximize the expectations of the least advantaged. (For non-maximinimizing readings of the difference principle, see Martin 1985: ch. 6; Pogge 1989: 197; and Rawls 2001: 63–64.) On the lax interpretation of the principle favored by Rawls, the difference principle applies only to the institutional background conditions against which workers make productive decisions, and so allows workers’ diverse personal aims to influence their wage negotiations and occupational choices. Given that such decisions are unlikely to deliver efficient outcomes if jobs are equally rewarded, the lax principle permits a political community to use inequality-generating incentives as instruments to secure Pareto efficiency. In contrast, Cohen defended a strict interpretation of the difference principle, which extends a concern for the least advantaged beyond institutional design to also encompass everyday productive decisions. According to that interpretation, workers must abide by an egalitarian ethos that renders a much smaller range of inequality-generating incentives necessary for efficiency. Cohen concluded that many of the inequalities compatible with the lax principle are in fact comparable to ransom payments insofar as they provide agents with rewards for making choices that they should have made regardless of those rewards.

Cohen’s defense of the strict principle provoked several widely discussed criticisms, including the basic structure objection, which claims that the difference principle is restricted in the range of decisions it governs, and does not require obedience to an egalitarian ethos (G. A. Cohen 1997; Melenovsky 2016). One version of that objection opposes the strict difference principle by arguing that satisfying the egalitarian ethos is so difficult to verify that it fails to provide a suitably public standard for individuals to justify their conduct to one another (A. Williams 1998). Recognizing the constructivist pedigree of this appeal to a distributive principle’s social role, Cohen mounted a full scale attack on constructivism in the second half of his book Rescuing Justice and Equality (G. A. Cohen 2008).

Cohen’s rescue mission focuses on three main features of constructivist principles of justice (G. A. Cohen 2008: 337):

  1. their grounding in empirical facts,
  2. their sensitivity to a plurality of evaluative grounds, like publicity and stability as well as equality, and
  3. their insensitivity to the possibility of injustice being genuine without being to anyone’s detriment.

We now outline each objection, and some possible replies that a constructivist might employ.

7.1 The Fact-Dependency Objection

The fact-dependency objection (G. A. Cohen 2003; 2008: Ch. 6) focusses on the constructivist claim (Rawls 2000: 346–353) that contingent empirical truths ground even the “first principles” (Rawls 2000: 341 and 343) of justice and not merely the “precepts and secondary rules” that enable agents to better conform to those principles (Rawls 2000: 349). Illustrating the claim via his own theory, Rawls writes that

in justice as fairness the first principles of justice depend in part upon those general beliefs about human nature and how society works which are allowed to the parties in the original position. First principles are not, in a constructivist view, independent of such beliefs, nor, as some forms of rational intuitionism hold, true in all possible worlds. (2000: 351)

As Cohen notes, the constructivist claim is polemically important since arguments designed to show that justice permits certain inequalities often turn on contingent empirical assumptions (G. A. Cohen 2008: 300). As just noted, for example, the constructivist version of the basic structure objection appeals to contingent facts about limited information to argue that there are reasons to favor the lax over the strict difference principle because it is better suited to perform the public role appropriate for principles of justice.

To refute the claim that first principles of justice are all fact-sensitive (G. A. Cohen 2008: 336), Cohen advances a “purely logical argument” based on “what utterances of principle commit one to” (2008: 247) for the conclusion that believing that an action-guiding principle is empirically grounded involves a further commitment to some fact-insensitive principle. As he puts it,

this is my thesis—a principle can reflect a fact only because it is also a response to a principle that is not a response to a fact. (2008: 232)

The argument for Cohen’s thesis starts from the intuitively plausible idea that affirming a normative principle, P, on some factual ground, F, commits one to a deeper conditional principle that involves F as an antecedent but does not entail that F obtains. Cohen then extends the idea by arguing that its repeated application to deeper principles will eventually deliver fact-insensitive conditional principles that are sound regardless of any empirical facts obtaining. To elaborate his argument, he appeals to three plausible premises:

  1. whenever some facts ground a principle there is an explanation that states how those facts provide some reason to affirm the principle;
  2. such an explanation involves or implies a deeper principle that is valid even in the absence of those facts; and
  3. either the deeper principle is itself fact-insensitive or it is grounded in facts in a way that is ultimately explained by a principle that is not grounded in any facts (G. A. Cohen 2008: 236–244).

Cohen’s conclusion is that if, as constructivism claims, we should affirm sound fact-sensitive principles then we must also affirm some fact-insensitive principles.

Cohen’s argument about the relationship between the affirmation of fact-sensitive and fact-insensitive principles has provoked various criticisms (e.g., Estlund 2020: ch. 9; de Maagt 2014; Kurtulmus 2009; Miller 2012: chs. 1 and 10; Pogge 2008; Quong 2010b; Ronzoni & Valentini 2008). As Cohen anticipates, some critics might question his premises, and in particular his premise (iii), and he devotes some attention to defending them (2008: 236–247). Most critics, however, argue that constructivists either do not deny there are fact-insensitive first principles of the sort that Cohen identifies or can grant their existence whilst maintaining their other key claims.

To understand one defense of the latter conciliatory response, it is useful to return to the distinction between first principles and secondary rules and precepts. One way to interpret the distinction when applied to the value of justice construes sound first principles as stating the properties that make objects just or unjust, and provide sound reasons for action (Rawls 1993: 121). In contrast, secondary norms are standards that guide deliberation in ways that enhance conformity with the reasons stated by those primary principles. Rawls is not entirely explicit about the distinction, but this is one natural way to interpret the role first principles play in a constructivist theory. Treating first principles as statements about justice-making facts that provide reasons for action also fits with some of Rawls’s remarks about Henry Sidgwick. For example, Rawls ascribes to Sidgwick, and other English ethicists, the rational intuitionist thesis that

first principles of morals … are self-evident propositions about … good grounds for … asserting that something is (intrinsically) good, or that a certain action is the right thing to do, or that a certain trait of character has moral worth. (Rawls 1999a: 343)

In addition, Rawls claims that Sidgwick assumes a “method of ethics” is

specified by certain first principles, principles by which we are to arrive at a judgment about what we ought to do. (Rawls 1999a: 341)

Suppose, then, that Rawls uses the term “first principles”, like Sidgwick, to identify reason-giving facts that render sound various moral judgments, including ones about what justice requires and prohibits. If so, when pointing out that first principles of justice always depend on truths about human nature, etc, Rawls is claiming that whenever statements identifying our reasons of justice are sound the case for those principles includes some empirical facts. Now grant too that Cohen is correct to insist that Rawls is also committed to affirming some conditional principles that are sound regardless of the truth of any specific empirical statements. Does it follow that Rawls’s view is therefore inconsistent since the former claim about first principles being fact-dependent rules out affirming the latter claim about fact-insensitive conditional principles?

If we adopt the view of first principles just described, then no inconsistency arises since the two claims mention very different types of principle. The former claim concerns first principles, like Rawls’s difference principle, that state justice-making characteristics and reasons for action. The latter claim concerns meta-principles, like the principle that we should reason from the perspective of the original position, that relate first principles to the empirical facts that in part ground them but for various reasons do not themselves constitute first principles. They fail, for example, to state that certain characteristics are justice-making and reason-giving but merely imply such statements in conjunction with further propositions asserting that their empirical antecedents obtain. Moreover, there are no limits on the complexity on the second type of principle, but it is plausible to assume that sound first principles identify a limited range of facts. They do so because first principles state reasons, as already explained, and reason-giving facts have a dual role: they must be capable not only of favoring certain responses by just agents but also of explaining those responses when they occur because demanded by justice (Raz 2011; B. Williams 1995: 38–39). Even if actual agents fail to respond appropriately to sound normative reasons, those reasons must at least be capable of serving as explanatory reasons. The fact-insensitive principles that Cohen argues are implied by Rawls’s constructivism, however, are not limited in their complexity, and are not necessarily capable of serving as explanatory reasons.

As a result of these differences between the two types of principle, a constructivist can consistently claim that first principles are fact-dependent whilst conceding the existence of fact-insensitive principles. If so, Cohen’s first logical argument against constructivism is unsuccessful because misdirected. Cohen overlooks this possibility because he assumes that first principles of justice are ultimate principles that are related to but do not necessarily state reasons for action. Rawls understands first principles differently, and consequently the fact-dependency objection fails to hit its intended target, or so constructivists can argue.

7.2 The Alien Factors Objection

Cohen provides a second and related conceptual objection to constructivism, which claims it cannot provide a sound theory of justice (G. A. Cohen 2008: 274–302). According to the objection, constructivist theories of justice are irredeemably flawed because “non-justice considerations”, such as empirical facts, and concerns like stability and publicity, “affect the outcome of typically favored constructivist procedures.” Referring to such considerations, Cohen sums up his criticism as follows:

My complaint is not at all that constructivism fails to take them into account, but precisely that it does take them into account, inappropriately, when purporting to identify what justice it. For the influence of alien factors on the output of the constructivist procedure means that what it produces is not fundamental justice, and is sometimes, moreover…not justice at all. Given its aspiration to produce fundamental principles of justice, constructivism sets its legislators the wrong task…. (G. A. Cohen 2008: 283–284)

To assess the Alien Factors Objection, we need to understand a distinction Cohen draws, along two dimensions, between “rules of regulation” and “fundamental principles of justice” (G. A. Cohen 2008: 253–254, 263–272, 274–279). First, a rule of regulation is a fact-dependent, instrumentally justified norm that should be chosen on the basis of its adoption’s likely effects; consequently, following Nozick, Cohen describes such a norm as “a device for having certain effects” (Nozick 1993: 38, cited in G. A. Cohen 2008: 265). In contrast, a fundamental principle is an unchosen fact-independent norm that is not justified by its effects. Second, a rule of regulation can be justified by various types of different distributive and non-distributive effect that need to be evaluated by appealing to more ultimate fact-independent principles. In contrast, a fundamental principle of justice serves only the value of justice.

Drawing on these ideas, the Objection starts from the plausible observation that constructivist distributive principles are fact-dependent standards that are grounded, in part, on the likely effects of their acceptance (G. A. Cohen 2008: 282). These include not only the effects on the absolute and relative size of individual’s shares of benefits and but also the ways individuals’ attitudes and relations with one another are shaped. As we have seen, according to political constructivism the latter effects matter because, amongst other things, the relative plausibility of certain political principles depends on their capacity to play a specific social role. On this basis, the Objection then concludes that constructivist procedures justify only fact-dependent principles that are grounded on a plurality of distinct considerations, and so necessarily are incapable of justifying fundamental principles of justice. As well as this main conclusion, Cohen additionally concludes that constructivist principles should instead be described as rules of regulation (G. A. Cohen 2008: 283).

Turning to the main conclusion of the Objection, one obvious constructivist response rejects its underlying assumption, quoted earlier, that constructivists have the “aspiration to produce fundamental principles of justice” (G. A. Cohen 2008: 282) in the sense Cohen has mind. According to the response, which builds on some remarks by Scanlon (Scanlon 2006: 85), Rawls and Cohen associate the term “justice” with two different concepts. Those concepts overlap insofar as they both accept what Cohen terms “the ancient dictum that justice is giving each person her due” (Cohen 2008: 7 and see also 252–253) but nevertheless also diverge in various ways. As a result, constructivists can accept their doctrine is ill-suited to identify the demands of justice in Cohen’s sense but deny that this amounts to a criticism of their view since it was never their ambition to do so.

To question the underlying assumption, consider how Rawls elucidates the concept of justice employed in A Theory of Justice (Rawls 1971 [1999a]). In the opening sections of his book, Rawls make two definitional claims regarding the action-guiding implications and the special stringency of principles of justice in the sense he focusses on.

First, principles of justice are defined by Rawls as action-guiding standards applicable to a specific type of decision about interpersonal relations (Rawls 1999a: 9; Anderson 2010). In the sense that concerns him, justice is ultimately a property of how agents govern their interaction with one another and is only derivatively a property of how benefits and burdens are distributed. Rawls’s familiar remark that the

natural distribution [of talents] is neither just nor unjust … What is just and unjust is the way that institutions deal with these facts (Rawls 1999a: 87)

confirms this interpretation of justice as a property of social relations.

Second, Rawls makes an additional definitional claim via his well-known remark “Justice is the first virtue of social institutions, as truth is of systems of thought” (Rawls 1999a: 3). The comparison with the conceptual relationship between belief and truth suggests that principles of justice necessarily express especially stringent standards that defeat at least some range of weighty countervailing considerations.

Rawls’s view about what might ground principles of justice, so defined, provides further relevant information about his specific concept of justice. According to Rawls, what makes a conception of justice sound depends not only on how it solves distributive problems but also on its capacity to solve other “fundamental social problems, in particular those of coordination, efficiency, and stability” (Rawls 1999a: 5, italics added). As he explains,

We cannot, in general, assess a conception of justice by its distributive role alone, however useful this role may be in identifying the concept of justice. We must take into account its wider connections … other things equal, one conception of justice is preferable to another when its broader consequences are more desirable. (Rawls 1999a: 6, italics added)

Rawls’s remark clearly indicates that his concept allows judgements about justice to be grounded in a plurality of considerations, including one which constructivism explicitly invokes.

A constructivist can appeal to the claims just mentioned to counter-argue that because Rawls and Cohen associate the term “justice” with distinct concepts it is less straightforward than Cohen supposes to show that the Alien Factors Objection involves a genuine disagreement with constructivism.

To understand the counterargument, it is important to note that for Cohen, unlike Rawls, “principles of justice” are not necessarily decisive or purely action-guiding standards (G. A. Cohen 2008: 302–307). Instead, distributive justice in Cohen’s sense is ultimately a valuable feature of states of affairs rather than social relations: whether we live in a just world depends not merely on agents giving each person their due but on everyone getting their due, and that may lie beyond what any agent is required to achieve or even can achieve (Cohen 2008: cp. 7 and 253, respectively, for the active and passive statements of the Justinian platitude, and 126). As a result, in Cohen’s sense the presence of unjust inequality does not depend on any agents having failed to conduct themselves according to the appropriate principles (Cohen 2008: 153–154). Finally, as we have seen, principles of justice in Cohen’s sense can be justified only on a more limited range of grounds than Rawls assumes.

Given this variation in the concepts Rawls and Cohen employ, a constructivist can argue that even if Cohen is correct to conclude constructivism cannot provide a sound theory of “justice” in his own sense, this limitation does not necessarily undermine the doctrine since its subject matter is justice in a different sense. If the argument succeeds, then the Alien Factors Objection involves a verbal dispute that is likely to dissolve when the parties’ views are re-expressed more clearly, or in a way that eliminates the term “justice” (cp. Arneson 2008: 12–14; Chalmers 2011). Indeed, there is evidence to suggest that Rawls himself viewed his defining remarks about “justice” not as attempts to capture all the features of the term’s ordinary use but as providing a relatively satisfactory substitute. As Rawls writes, expressing his indebtedness to Quine,

…there is no necessity to say that sameness of meaning holds between the word “right” (and its relatives) in its ordinary use and the more elaborate locutions needed to express this ideal contractarian concept of right. For our purposes here I accept the view that a sound analysis is best understood as providing a satisfactory substitute, one that meets certain desiderata while avoiding certain obscurities and confusions. In other words, explication is elimination: we start with a concept the expression for which is somehow troublesome; but it serves certain ends that cannot be given up. An explication achieves these ends in other ways that are relatively free of difficulty. (Rawls 1999a: 95)

Even if the Objection does not refute constructivism, a critic might still insist it shows the doctrine isincomplete insofar as there are some sound judgements about justice in Cohen’s sense, and constructivism cannot explain what makes them plausible.

In response to this charge, a conciliatory constructivist might argue such incompleteness need not contradict constructivism since the doctrine is ecumenical: it explicitly allows that recourse to a non-constructivist theory may be necessary in order to assess some types of moral judgment (James 2018; A. Williams 2008: 492). As Rawls explains in his Dewey Lectures,

…the exclusion of…facts as reasons of social justice does not alone entail that they are not reasons in other kinds of situation where different moral notions apply. Indeed, it is not even ruled out that the account of some notions should be constructivist, whereas the account of others is not (Rawls 1999a: 348)

Elaborating on Rawls’s ecumenical statement, a constructivist might reply to Cohen by emphasizing that constructivism does not deny the possibility that outcomes permitted by Rawls’s principles of justice, including the lax difference principle, can also be judged defective from the perspective of a sound comprehensive doctrine.

For example, suppose any sound fully comprehensive doctrine implies there are non-instrumental reasons to regret the fact that theistic religions survive, and sometimes even flourish, in societies governed by liberal political conceptions. It does not follow that political communities should be guided by those reasons, or that their existence contradicts political liberalism. Similarly, even if Cohen is correct to judge that there is some sense in which inequalities permitted by the lax difference principle are regrettable because unjust in his sense it need not follow that the judgment should guide any political community or contradicts political constructivism, given its distinctive and restricted domain.

Cohen was aware that his dispute with constructivism might strike some critics as verbal and so anticipated them asking

if Rawls hadn’t called his principles “principles of justice”, would you have no quarrel with him? (G. A. Cohen 2008: 304)

Cohen’s immediate answer was to insist that constructivists pay a high price if they eschew any ambition to identify fact-independent pure principles of justice: they are, allegedly, no longer examining an “an elusive virtue discussed for a few thousand years by philosophers” (2008: 304), and they relinquish an ambition upon which “a great deal of the interest of Rawlsianism” depends (2008: 304). The first appeal to history, however, has met with well-supported resistance (Ripstein 2010, sec. II, esp. 691–92), and the second response also seems questionable: judgments about justice in the stringent, action-guiding sense specified by Rawls’s remarks about the subject matter of his theory seem at least as interesting as judgments about justice in Cohen’s sense.

Cohen also provided a later answer, which raises a more important normative rather than conceptual challenge for constructivist theories of justice. The challenge claims that constructivists cannot coherently eschew the ambition to identify fact-independent pure principles due to

the wholly unterminological point that rules of regulation require principles of justice, as such, as part of their justification. (G. A. Cohen 2008: 306)

Constructivists might reject this version of the challenge as marred by assuming that principles of justices in Rawls’s sense are rules of regulation, the additional conclusion of the Alien Factors Objection. There are grounds to question whether Rawls’s principles of justice can accurately be described as rules of regulation. To understand them, recall that rules of regulation are objects of choice for actual agents, and their selection is justified at least partly by their likely effects, including their tendency to produce more or less just distributions of benefits and burdens. In this respect, they resemble the social norms that certain indirect versions of distribution-sensitive forms of consequentialism recommend engineering. If so, there are two reasons to doubt that Rawls’s principles of justice are rules of regulation.

First, Rawls’s principles are not meant to be chosen by any actual agents; if constructivism is defensible, actual agents should instead recognize their validity, which derives from the fact they are the objects of hypothetical rather than actual choice. Second, Rawls’s principles of justice are not merely “devices for having certain effects.” As conceived by constructivism, justice, as noted, is a property of agents governing their interaction by appropriate principles, and them doing so realizes an ideal of well-ordered cooperation. As a result, acting on principle with others has non-instrumental as well as instrumental value (Ripstein 2010: sec. II). If the idea of rules of regulation plays some role in characterizing Rawls’s principles of justice, then, it seems more plausible to think of those principles not as equivalent to rules of regulation but rather as standards that determine which rules to institute.

However, the normative challenge raised by Cohen’s later answer can be restated in a way that avoids reliance on any such a questionable equivalence between Rawlsian principles of justice and rules of regulation. In its most general form, the challenge claims that constructivists must address questions about fundamental principles of distributive justice in order to defend their own favored principles of justice because fundamental justice is relevant to the distributive problem constructivism aims to solve.

To press this challenge, its proponents need to argue that there are some sound fundamental principles that evaluate states of affairs, and that there are valid reasons to promote valuable outcomes using political means. To do so they might start with retributive convictions. For example, even when there is full compliance with the best designed punitive institutions, the fact that innocent persons are sometimes punished is still, in some sense, an unjust outcome and its disvalue is relevant when deciding whether those institutions must be reformed (Gheaus 2013; Rawls 1999a: 75; A. Williams 2008: 492, n. 40). Similarly, Cohen might argue that, because there are some sound egalitarian principles of justice in his sense, the level of inequality generated by the lax difference principle is a defect that is relevant when deciding whether the institutions it favors really do satisfy the most stringent distributive standards. If so, a concern with injustice in the pure, fact-independent sense plays a role in answering the question constructivists themselves pose that is not eliminable, as Rawls himself sometimes appears to suggest (Rawls 2001: 68).

7.3 The Harmless Injustice Objection

Various kinds of example illustrate the final criticism of constructivism. Cohen himself discusses examples involving inequality-increasing Pareto improvements, where it is possible to benefit some individuals in a way that increases inequality but does not make any other individuals worse off in an absolute sense. Suppose, for instance, that an agent must choose between a distribution, DI, where both A and B have 5 units of benefit and another distribution, DII, in which A has 7 units and B has only 6 units (G. A. Cohen 2008: 317). Cohen assumes the greater level of inequality in DII can sometimes provide a sound but defeasible reason (of justice) to choose DI even though the choice would not be advantageous to anyone. According to Cohen, constructivism is incapable of explaining what makes this claim plausible since constructivist procedures, like Rawls’s original position argument, select reason-giving principles based on their capacity to benefit individuals by advancing certain of their interests (Cohen 2008: 318). Thus, constructivism is defective because it fails to account for what might be called harmless injustice of the sort allegedly present in cases like the one mentioned.

Cohen’s egalitarian version of the Harmless Injustice Objection depends heavily on the assumption that there is some reason to promote equality unconditional on doing so being advantageous to anyone. The assumption has been the subject of some debate amongst philosophers working on the ethics of distribution (Parfit 2000; Raz 1986, ch. 9; Raz 2009; Temkin 2003; Segall 2016) and the influential Levelling Down Objection to strict egalitarianism. Rejecting or dispensing with the assumption, some advance efficiency-friendly alternative principles that still favor redistributing benefits towards less advantaged individuals. These include partly comparative conditional egalitarian principles (Casal 2007; Temkin 2000; Tungodden 2005) and non-comparative prioritarian principles (Adler 2012; Parfit 2000). Thus, constructivists might respond to Cohen’s egalitarian version of the Harmless Injustice Objection by accepting his assumption that constructivist procedures select reason-giving principles based on their capacity to benefit individuals but rejecting its key strict egalitarian assumption that there are sometimes defeasible reasons to level down in order to reduce inequality.

Egalitarian critics of constructivism might respond by pointing out that Rawls himself frequently construes his own principle of fair equality of opportunity in strict egalitarian terms as requiring that

those who are at the same level of talent and ability, and the same willingness to use them, should have the same prospects of success regardless of their initial place in the social system. (Rawls 1999a: 63, italics added)

So construed, the principle implies that there are pro tanto reasons to oppose expanding class-based inequality in occupational opportunity in ways that enable individuals from more privileged starting points to enjoy greater occupational opportunities than their similarly able and motivated but less wealthy counterparts even if such expansion is mutually advantageous. The critics might insist that it is more plausible to recognize such reasons than affirm what appears to be Rawls’s considered view that class-based inequalities in occupational opportunity are in principle not unjust when they enhance the opportunities of those with fewest opportunities (Rawls 1999a: 266).

Rawls’s complex remarks about equality of opportunity suggest we face a choice. We can either accept that class-based inequalities in occupational opportunity are not unjust provided they increase the opportunities of the less advantaged, or we can reject constructivism because of its inability to oppose harmless injustice. Faced with the need to choose, some will reject constructivism, or at least favor some fundamental modification; for example, they might revise the motivational assumption that the agents of construction aim to advance the interests of the individuals they represent. If they are right to do so, then one version of Cohen’s final objection succeeds.

Others will remain reluctant to reject constructivism on strict egalitarian grounds. Even if their reluctance is defensible, it would still be mistaken to conclude that the Harmless Injustice Objection fails. The inference is invalid since the Objection can be restated in ways that focus on forms of harmless injustice, or wrongdoing, that non-egalitarians also oppose. Earlier critics than Cohen have devised non-egalitarian objections that are designed to show constructivism is incapable of explaining certain plausible non-egalitarian convictions or has other implications that are implausible for non-egalitarian reasons. These arguments apply across various scenarios, ranging from criminal law (Pogge 1995, esp. sec. V) to intergenerational ethics (Parfit 1984). The case for constructivism depends, to a considerable degree, on its capacity to deal with such older normative rather than conceptual problems (Kumar 2009).

8. Conclusion

The widespread assumption that recognizing what justice requires is likely to enhance our relations with one another has immediate intuitive appeal, and arguably leads to the conclusion that the plausibility of any particular conception of justice turns partly on the role it might play in generating social unity when embodied in our thought and conduct. Within Anglo-American philosophy, John Rawls has refined these ideas with unsurpassed depth and creativity, and the result is the doctrine of political constructivism. The immediate products of philosophical depth and creativity are usually not crystal clear, and so the previous sections have attempted primarily to clarify the doctrine’s key conjecture that a sound political morality resembles an artefact in certain respects, drawing on Rawls’s favored liberal egalitarian version of constructivism and work of one of his foremost critics, G. A. Cohen. Rawls writes about another of his similarly seminal and related ideas,

It is a great puzzle to me why political liberalism was not worked out much earlier: it seems such a natural way to present the idea of liberalism, given the fact of reasonable pluralism in political life. Does it have deep faults that preceding writers may have found in it that I have not seen and these led them to dismiss it? (Rawls 2005: 374, n. 1)

We need to ask similar questions about political constructivism. Given the centrality Rawls’s thought plays in contemporary political philosophy, it is reasonable to expect some progress in answering them.


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For helpful comments or discussions, I am grateful to Paula Casal, Tom Christiano, Matthew Clayton, Jerry Cohen, David Estlund, Nir Eyal, Brad Hooker, Tom Hurka, Jimmy Lenman, Tom Parr, Thomas Pogge, Miriam Ronzoni, Connie Rosati, Yonatan Shemmer, Victor Tadros, and Peter Vallentyne, as well as Laura Valentini, who also supplied excellent editorial advice. For research funding, I acknowledge the U.K. Arts and Humanities Research Council (ref. 112990) and an ICREA Research Professorship with the Catalan Institution for Research and Advanced Studies.

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