Ralph Cudworth

First published Fri May 7, 2021

The English philosopher, Ralph Cudworth (1618–1688) defies classification within customary categories of the history of philosophy. At a time when mainstream philosophers announced their modernity by breaking with the past, Cudworth is a figure of continuity, steeped in ancient philosophy, yet abreast of contemporary philosophy and science. He shared the anti-scholastic agenda of self-styled modernisers like Bacon, Hobbes and Descartes, with whose philosophy he engaged, but framed his most original ideas by recourse to antiquity. Cudworth is usually regarded as a Cambridge Platonist, though he himself would not have recognised the label. Although he is normally classified as a rationalist, it has become increasingly apparent that this designation is based on too limited a view of his philosophical writings.

Cudworth’s written output was substantial, but much of it was never published and his philosophical system is incomplete. Broadly, his philosophy combines Platonist ethics and metaphysics with an atomist natural philosophy. He is chiefly remembered for his epistemological nativism, and his ethical idealism. Distinctive elements of his philosophy include his theory of consciousness and unconsciousness, his conception of freewill as a power of self-determination, and his causal hypothesis of what he called the “plastic power of nature”. The immense humanist learning which fills his published writings has tended to obscure his achievements as a philosopher in post-humanist times, but it did not prevent him from having a considerable legacy in eighteenth and nineteenth-century philosophy.

1. Life and Works

Born in Aller, Somerset, Cudworth was educated at Emmanuel College, Cambridge, where he was elected to a fellowship in 1639. His academic career at the University of Cambridge advanced during the upheavals of the English Civil War: he was appointed as Master of Clare College (1645), Regius Professor of Hebrew (1645), and Master of Christ’s College (1654). Although associated with the interregnum regime, he retained both his college and university appointments at the restoration of the monarchy in 1660, remaining in post in Cambridge until his death in 1688 (Pailin 2020). His daughter, Damaris, Lady Masham, who became a close friend of John Locke, was the only one of his children to follow in his footsteps as a philosopher.

The only philosophical work which Cudworth published in his lifetime was The True Intellectual System of the Universe (1678) (hereafter TISU). Two works were published posthumously: A Treatise Concerning Eternal and Immutable Morality (hereafter TEIM) in 1731 and Of Freewill (hereafter FW) in 1838. A substantial body of manuscripts on “Liberty and Necessity”, remain unpublished to this day, though these may have circulated in the seventeenth century. Prior to the publication of TISU, Cudworth’s philosophical ideas were known primarily through a handful of sermons, the most notable of which was the sermon preached before Parliament in 1647, which anticipates the Platonising outlook of his philosophical writings, and has come to be considered a classic for its message of peace and reconciliation.

Cudworth’s philosophical project was planned to be a tripartite work entitled The True Intellectual System of the Universe, of which only the first part was published. The constituent books of this never-completed project were to be

  1. “Against Atheism”,
  2. “Natural Justice and Morality founded in the Deity” and
  3. “Liberty from Necessity and a Distributive Justice of Rewards and Punishments” (TISU, Sig A34)

This division of the subject-matter corresponds to what he regarded as the essentials of both true philosophy and true religion, namely, the existence of God (that there is “an omnipotent, understanding being presiding over all…[which is] essentially good and just”), the real existence of the principles of morality which are grounded in divine goodness rather than divine will (that there is, “something in its own nature, immutably and eternally just, and unjust; and not by arbitrary will, law, and command only”), and the moral autonomy of human beings (“that we are so far forth principles or masters of our own actions, as to be accountable to justice for them”) (TISU A45). Cudworth explains the term “intellectual” in the title of this system as being intended distinguish it from astronomical theories or systems of the world. The term also indicates that his “system” is conceived along Platonist lines as the eternal, unchanging model or paradigm, of all things, the “intellectual system” being the intelligible realm which reveals the metaphysical framework of all existence. (In all likelihood Plato’s Timaeus, was the inspiration here). For Cudworth the system of nature is the intelligible product of divine intellect. His system is true both in the sense that it is philosophically true, and also because its philosophical principles are compatible with religious truth.

TISU as published in 1678 is only the first of three volumes which Cudworth had planned to write with the same over-all title, but he defends it as a self-standing work. In it he seeks to provide an anti-determinist defence of theism against scepticism, atheism and materialism, and to demonstrate the compatibility of true philosophy with true religion. In so arguing, he probably had in mind the anti-atheist arguments of book X of Plato’s Laws. The last chapter, in particular, contains many, often extensive, arguments with his philosophical contemporaries (Descartes, Hobbes and Spinoza). TISU also broaches a number of epistemological and ethical themes which are more fully treated in the manuscript writings unpublished at the time of his death.

TEIM (1731) was the first of Cudworth’s works to be published posthumously. It was probably originally intended as a propaedeutic to his unpublished writings on ethics. Although its title suggests otherwise, it is in large part a work of epistemology, containing the fullest treatment of nativist epistemology by any British philosopher of the seventeenth century. Following Plato, Cudworth argues that ideas and moral principles “are eternal and self-subsistent things”, pitching his arguments against the moral relativism and sense-based epistemology of Protagoras and Hobbes. Cudworth's enduring legacy in moral philosophy, and as a moral rationalist derives from this work (Raphael 1969, Schneewind 2003).

FW (1838) is the only one of the three manuscripts on the subject of “Of Liberty and Necessity”, which were unpublished when Cudworth died. These are drafts for the planned third part of his system. Although these are by no means a complete draft of this, they show that Cudworth was attempting something new, by developing an anti-determinist moral psychology, the key features of which are his conception of free will as self-determination, his idea of the hegemonikon or ruling principle of the soul, and his conception of consciousness.

2. Cudworth and the Philosophers

Cudworth’s legacy of bulky and incomplete writings, testifies to his comprehensive knowledge of both ancient, and contemporary philosophy. He subscribed to the Renaissance view of philosophy as philosophia perennis (perennial philosophy), which presupposes a single timeless core of philosophical truth, which is the shared goal of both ancient and modern philosophical enquiry. Heir to the Renaissance Humanist recovery of almost the entire corpus of ancient philosophy known today, his recourse to antique learning, especially the philosophy of Plato and Plotinus, but also Stoicism, is in many ways a typically Humanist move to ground authority in the tried and tested wisdom of ancient philosophers (Aspelin 1942, Sellars 2011). However, he turned to ancient philosophy, especially Greek philosophy, as a fund of pre-scholastic philosophical ideas and the source for a new conceptual vocabulary. As one of the first to write philosophy entirely in English, he coined many new terms, many of them adapted from Greek. Some (e.g., autexousion, antitypous) have not stood the test of time, while others (e.g., “Cartesianism”, “self-determinism”, “consciousness”) are common currency in English philosophy to this today. At the same time, his philosophy was deeply influenced by contemporary philosophy, especially Cartesianism (Passmore 1951, Sailor 1962). He had high regard for Descartes as “an acute philosopher” and his philosophy registers the impact of Descartes in multifarious ways. He admired Cartesianism as system of philosophy combining physics with metaphysics, which posited both corporeal and incorporeal substance. He accepted clear and distinct perception as the criterion of epistemological certainty, and the Cartesian account of sense perception. Sensation, for Cudworth, as for Descartes, is a “passion” of the soul, at best a confused perception (TEIM, 85). He embraced both the idea of consciousness and the idea of God as a fully perfect, self-existing being, and adopted Descartes’s conception of body as inert extension. However, he was highly critical of Descartes on many counts. He denied that mechanical rules of impact were sufficient to explain natural causality and criticised Descartes’ repudiation of final causes. He critiques Descartes’s proof of the existence God “from his idea” as circular (TISU, 717) and his voluntarist conception of God as conducive to scepticism. He rejected Descartes’ machine-model of animals and denied that conscious cogitation exhausted the properties of immaterial substance.

Cudworth’s critique of Hobbes is the most extensive and philosophical of contemporary responses to Hobbes, whom he attacks as an atheist materialist (Mintz 1962, Zarka 1997). He accuses Hobbes of “villanizing of human nature”, and treating morality is a matter of convention. He attacks his natural law theory as merely “artificiall justice” without foundation in natural goodness, charging that Hobbes’s negative conception of human nature renders civil government a necessary evil, void of true justice. He regarded Hobbes’s natural philosophy as a paradigm case of deterministic materialism. And he attacked Hobbes’s mechanistic account of mental operations, arguing that if all mental activity reduces to matter in motion, we could never stop the flow of thoughts, focus our minds on anything, or direct our attention. The fact that we can do so tells against Hobbesian psychology and confirms the agency non-material powers.

3. Atheism & Materialism

Cudworth’s main published work, TISU, consists in large part of a critical survey of philosophy, in which the philosophers of antiquity and some moderns (principally Descartes and Hobbes), are classified according to the degree to which their philosophy correlates with theism or atheism. As such it constitutes a consensus gentium defence of the naturality of the idea of God to all mankind, in which pagan polytheism is presented as corrupt forms of monotheism, and atheism explained as a failure in philosophical reason. Cudworth identifies four categories of atheist: Hylopathian (materialism), “Atomical or Democritical” atheism, Cosmo-plastic atheism (according to which the world-soul is the highest power), and Hylozoist atheism (which attributes life to matter) (TISU, 165). These have their latter-day manifestations in philosophers such as Hobbes (an example of a Hylopathian atheist) and Spinoza (a latter-day Hylozoist). The final chapter of TISU, which takes up a third of its almost 900 pages, attempts a comprehensive survey and refutation of atheistic arguments, which are grouped under fifteen subsections. Cudworth also targets what he sees erroneous forms of monotheism which misconceive the deity by emphasising divine power and will at the expense of divine goodness and justice. Such voluntaristic conceptions of God have far-reaching and destructive implications for both philosophy and religion, since such a God could, by arbitrary fiat, decree falsity to be true, and wrong to be right, resulting in false philosophy with atheistic implications.

4. Metaphysics—Platonism

The taxonomical structure of TISU, is such that it may be regarded as a history of philosophy, or compendium of the arguments of the philosophers of antiquity—which is one reason why Locke recommended it (Locke 1693 [1989: 247]). But to interpret the book merely as a compendium of the arguments of other philosophers is to miss the essentials of Cudworth’s metaphysics and natural philosophy embedded in its heavily annotated pages, which reveal the Platonist core of his philosophy. Central to Cudworth’s metaphysics is the Platonist principle that mind is “first in the order of nature”. Thus mind precedes the world and stands in causal relation to it: “knowledge is older than all sensible things; mind senior to the world, and the architect thereof” (TISU, 847–8). The mind in question is the mind of God, which “containeth its immediate intelligibles within it self” as “the paradigm or platform according to which this sensible world was made” (TISU, 734). The intellectual is ontologically prior to the physical, as form to copy, “archetype” to “ectype”. The sensible world, or nature, is therefore “a living stamp or signature of the divine wisdom” (TISU, 155). The ontological relation of intellectual to physical structures his dualistic view of all being as a descending hierarchy of entities, from angels and human beings, to animals, plants and plastic nature.

The operative principles which distinguish immaterial from material substances are activity and passivity (Passmore 1951, Lähteenmäki 2010). The active principle is energeia or energy, which is the principle of life (Hutton 2017). This is an internal principle, or “self activity”, capable of initiating movement or thought. Minds, souls and mental powers are all forms of energy, as is Plastic Nature (see below). All energies are in some sense cogitative, but different energies have different the powers such as “the power of moving matter”. Life may be either conscious or unconscious (“Life or internal self-activity, is to be subdivided into such as either acts with express consciousness and synaesthesis, or such as is without it”, TISU, 159). Energy is furthermore necessarily incorporeal and non-extended, since body, as inert extension, is by definition incapable of originating movement, life or thought.

Cudworth’s conception of body as passive extension differentiated only by size, shape, position and motion, is drawn largely from the new mechanical physics of Descartes. Cudworth also attributes solidity or resistance to body, modifying the definition to “resisting or antitypous extension”, TISU, 159). The attraction of this new philosophy according to Cudworth is its intelligibility, its explanatory simplicity, and the fact that it presupposes the existence of an active, immaterial agency, since body cannot initiate movement. He regarded it as a revival of ancient atomist matter theory which he believed derived ultimately from Pythagoras and Moses. Further attractions of the new physics for Cudworth were that it dispensed with what he regarded as the nonsensical clutter of Scholastic forms and qualities, and was consistent with the observable phenomena of the physical universe.

5. Plastic Nature

A signature feature of Cudworth’s system is his hypothesis of “Plastic Nature”, which he posits as an intermediary causal entity between God and the natural world (Lähteenmäki 2010, Allen 2014). This is contained in a long section of TISU entitled “Digression concerning the Plastick Life of Nature”. Cudworth formulated his hypothesis in the light of the inadequacies, as he saw them, of the mechanical philosophy, which, he thought, could not explain movement and change, the union of soul and body or life itself or the order and harmony of nature. Against the Cartesian view that the essence of the soul is cogitation, Cudworth objects that the operations of the soul include life-processes which cannot be accounted for in terms of cogitation, or referred to corporeal explanation. He argues that Descartes’ equation of cogitation with consciousness, is absurd since on such a view we would be permanently conscious, even when asleep.

Accordingly, Cudworth posits Plastic Nature as the instrument of God for maintaining the mundane operations of the physical universe in an orderly fashion, regulating the processes of life, in order to sustain a conception of the natural world as an harmonious, unified and purposive system which reflects the goodness and wisdom of the architect. Plastic Nature is a kind of force or energy which infuses material things, and combines efficient, final and formal causality, while, at the same time allowing for contingency and the possibility of error. By virtue of its imperfections Plastic Nature is liable to error (“bungles”): although it is a copy of the divine mind, it is only a faint one (“the mere umbrage of intellectuality, a faint and shadowy imitation of mind and understanding”, TISU, 172), and it operates without awareness of its actions. (A major difference between the human mind and Plastic Nature is that Plastic Nature operates unconsciously). In this way Cudworth attempted to navigate a course between occasionalism (which requires the direct intervention of God in the minutiae of day-to-day operations of nature), determinism and chance.

Cudworth invokes other philosophers in support of his hypothesis, including Aristotle whose conception of nature as art (technePhysics, 2.8) he interpreted as a version of it. But his most important debt is to Plotinus, especially for his idea of unconscious living nature, and his conception of sympathy as a kind of bonding agent in the universe (see Enneads 4.4)(Hutton 2021). The notion of an intermediary causal agency in nature was not unprecedented in the seventeenth century, especially in medical thought. There are strong affinities between Plastic Nature and Henry More’s concept of the Spirit of Nature. However, a main difference from More is that Plastic Nature is not extended—for Cudworth extension is a property of body, not immaterial entities

6. Epistemology

For Cudworth, the mind is active, and “formative of its own cogitations”. The mind is not the passive recipient of knowledge from outside itself, but actively engaged in cognition:

knowledge is not a passion from anything without [i.e. outside] the mind, but an active exertion of the inward strength, vigour, and power of the mind, displaying itself from within. (TEIM, 74)

He posits two kinds of cognition: sense perception and intellection. Sense perception receives corporeal impressions passively, yielding only a confused kind of knowledge. Intellection is a higher “energy” of “noetical” part of the soul which is independent of the body and yields true knowledge.

As the ectype of God’s wisdom, the human mind is an intellectual microcosm,

a kind of notional or representative world, as it were a diaphanous and crystalline sphere, in which the ideas and images of all things existing in the real universe may be reflected or represented. (TEIM, 77)

These “ideas and images” are not “the actual ideas of all things”, but are contained “virtually and potentially” by the mind, from which it is able to frame “intelligible ideas or conceptions within itself of whatsoever hath any entity or cogitability” (TEIM, 77). For Cudworth ideas of things pre-exist their objects. These pre-existing ideas of things are “anticipations” (for which Cudworth uses the Stoic term prolepsis). Knowledge “descends” from intellect to object, from universals to particulars, and not the reverse, “as it were looking downward” (TEIM, 58, 114).

Although knowledge can be generated by the intellect without reference to the world outside, sense perception does have a role in cognition. But it is only a secondary one, since, without the input of mind, sense perceptions are unintelligible, rather as the shape of writing on a page make no sense except to someone who knows how to read. Cudworth explains our capacity to understand the external world by means of correspondence, between the mind and nature, since both bear the imprint (ectype) of God’s wisdom. It is this “stamp of intellectuality”, manifest in the order and relations of its constituent parts, which renders the external world intelligible. Cognition is therefore is an act of recognition akin to the process by which we recognise the portrait of a friend because we have a prior idea of what he looks like (TEIM 106–7). Thus recollection and reflection are also elements in the process of cognition. In comprehending the external world, the mind focuses not on the external appearance of things but the relational constants which reveal their immutable essences. Cudworth illustrates this with the example of a watch held up to a mirror (TEIM 85–6). The difference between an observing eye and the mirror is that the former is conscious of what is reflected in it. To the human mind, however, the watch is not simply an assemblage of discrete metal shapes (“different colours, figures, protuberencies, cavities, sculptures, local motions”), but a unified whole, the constituent parts of which these are designed and arranged for a particular purpose. By comparing these elements in relation to each other and in the light of the ideas it raises from within itself (e.g., ideas of cause and effect), the mind is able to understand how it works, and to recognise that the object is a time-piece (Passmore 1951, Hutton 2019b).

7. Free will

Cudworth’s moral philosophy reflects his concerns about the moral implications of theological voluntarism, the doctrine of liberty of indifference, Hobbesian command morality, and scholastic faculty psychology. He repudiates moral conventionalism and denies that the principles of morality can be deduced from sense knowledge, arguing that moral principles are modifications of mind and therefore more “real and substantial things than the modifications of mere senseless matter” (TISU, 248. Cudworth grounds the eternal unchanging nature of moral principles in the goodness and justice in God. As “a being absolutely perfect”, God is “the very idea or essence of good” (TISU, 204), whose essential goodness is manifest in all things. Like Socrates in Plato’s Euthyphro (10a) he argues that things are not good because God wills them, but God wills them because they are good. So “the goodness, or justice, or righteousness is intrinsecall to the thing itself” (TISU, 897). Moral principles are discernible by reason and available to all by virtue of the mind’s “participation” in God. However, he recognises that mere knowledge of the good is insufficient to guarantee virtuous behaviour, and that account must be taken of moral fallibility. Cudworth also argues that we are motivated by desire for the good (“that which first moveth in us, and is the spring and principle of all deliberative action, can be no other than a constant, restless, uninterrupted desire, or love of good as such, and happiness”, FW, 173). And we apprehend the good by sensing it, that it is something which “touches and is felt in us” (Cudworth MS, 4979, fol. 243). Of key importance in his moral philosophy is the attention he gives to moral psychology, in particular, his theory of moral autonomy grounded in his conception of free will (Darwall 1995, Irwin 2008, Leisinger 2019).

The main discussion of Cudworth’s conception of free will is contained in FW and the unpublished manuscripts on “Liberty and Necessity”. A central the concern for Cudworth is that to act morally, we must be accountable for our actions. This would not be possible if we were not free to act, since we are not accountable for actions determined by factors outside our control—such as divine decrees, the dictates of tyrants, or physical circumstances like illness or imprisonment. For Cudworth, an essential pre-condition for moral accountability, and therefore for virtuous behaviour, is the freedom to choose between one course of action rather than another. At a minimum that means not being constrained by external impediments from pursuing a particular course of action. However, freedom of action requires more than absence of constraint, and mere knowledge of the good is no guarantee of the pursuit of virtue. To act virtuously requires that we are able to pursue the course of action which we choose to follow. Accordingly, Cudworth re-conceives the idea of freedom of the will as a power of self-determination (Chappell, 2005). This “self-power” is a ruling principle of the soul for which he adopts such Greek terms as the autexousion or the eph hemin or the hegemonikon. This ruling principle is self-power both in the sense that it is a principle of action internal to the soul which governs the whole composite of body and soul (“the whole man”), and in the sense that it is the individual human being who determines how it is exercised.

Cudworth’s conception of free will is an essential element of the new moral psychology adumbrated in his unpublished manuscripts. Dispensing with the traditional scholastic faculties of the mind, he proposes a unitary conception of the soul, the operations of which involve a complex interplay of active and passive powers associated with. This conglomerate of powers or energies includes both rational powers (intellection, deliberation and practical reason) along with sense perception, desires, and appetites (FW, 193–4) (Hutton 2017). Like Plato’s Phaedran charioteer (Phaedrus 246a–254e) the hegemonikon acts to co-ordinate these various powers to make them work together. As the unifying power of the soul (“the soul as comprehending itself, all its concerns and interests, its abilities and capacities”), the hegemonikon is the whole person—“that which is properly we ourselves” (FW, 178). However, given the complex interplay of active and passive powers, the scope free will as self-determination is markedly circumscribed. It is therefore wrong to consider Cudworth a libertarian. And the combination of both reason and emotion in Cudworth’s account of moral action means that he can’t be unproblematically classified as an ethical rationalist.

8. Consciousness

Crucially, the exercise of freewill requires that the hegemonikon has cognisance of the various powers of the soul and awareness of its own operations, “comprehending all the other powers, energies, and capacities of our soul”—in other words, consciousness (see especially Thiel 2011, Lähteenmäki 2010, Pécharman 2014, Leisinger forthcoming). Cudworth conceives consciousness to be a state of inner awareness, or inward sense whereby the soul is

present with itself, attentive to its own actions, or animadversive of them, to perceive itself to do or suffer, and to have a fruition or enjoyment of itself. (TISU, 159)

He agrees with Descartes, that when we think we are conscious of our thoughts, and like Descartes, he construes cogitation broadly to include all the operations of sense, imagination, intellect, and the will (TISU, 831). Unlike Descartes, he does not accept that the soul or mind is always conscious—as already noted, he argues that many activities of the soul (e.g., those performed by Plastic Nature) are performed unconsciously. Furthermore, even when conscious, the soul does not always have clear and distinct awareness of its thoughts. For Cudworth, there are different grades of consciousness, appropriate to the different types of cogitative activity, from the clear perception of “express consciousness” involved in intellection, to the “drowsy and somnolent perception” of the senses (TEIM, 56), to states of semi-consciousness (“half asleep and half-awake”), or when we do things without concentrating (“non-attendingly” or “by Half a Cogitation”) (TISU, 160). Cudworth’s theory of consciousness in fact owes more to Plotinus than Descartes (Enneads 4.4). It is Plotinus who is the source of his view of consciousness as inner perception or inward sense—for which he adopts Plotinus’ term synaesthesis or “con-sense” (as he translates it). Synaesthesis is the highest form of consciousness, which involves what Cudworth calls “duplication” or doubling—a term which derives from his conception of the soul as having “duplicity”, that is having upper and lower regions corresponding respectively to its intellectual and sensible or plastic powers. Synaesthesis is the act of self-reflection, in which the hegemonikon overlooks the whole soul, by as it were, bending the higher powers of the soul over the lower. The soul “redoubled upon itself” in this way is “the soul as comprehending itself, all its concerns and interests”, exercising deliberation, “self-recollection and attention” (FW, 178). In fact, Cudworth holds that only “freewilled-beings” have this kind of consciousness, because it is only the hegemonikon which is able to direct attention and have a comprehensive over-view of the capacities of the soul. Appropriately Cudworth describes the hegemonikon as the “watchman” of the soul. The hegemonikon’s awareness of its own operations which makes it “present with itself” and able “to perceive itself” may reasonably be called self-consciousness because the object of its awareness are the powers that constitute it as the “whole person”. By contrast, the powers and capacities of the lower soul are simple energies with a correspondingly lower level of awareness.

9. Legacy/Influence

Assessing the full extent of Cudworth’s influence is problematic because very little of his epistemology and ethics was published in his lifetime, and it is difficult to be sure whether his unpublished writings circulated. Manuscript circulation of his philosophy would certainly explain the intriguing echoes of some of Cudworth’s ideas in both Locke and Shaftesbury—in particular Locke’s ideas on consciousness and power, and Shaftesbury’s moral sentimentalism.

Cudworth’s place in the history of philosophy is complicated by the fact that prior to the publication of A Treatise of Freewill in 1838, he was considered a rationalist in the manner of Samuel Clarke, largely on the basis of TEIM—this is how Hume viewed him, for instance. Since John Passmore’s seminal study of his unpublished manuscript writings (Passmore 1951), such a classification is no longer tenable. It is increasingly recognised that Cudworth anticipates later developments in moral philosophy, especially moral sentimentalism (Gill 2004, Hutton 2012). Nevertheless Passmore’s insights have still not fed through fully to assessments of Cudworth today, and he has also been mis-characterised as primarily a theologian, as a libertarian, and even as a mystic. Latterly Cudworth’s immense learning and baroque wordiness tend to be viewed as obstructive encumbrances, and modern readers are out of sympathy with the syncretic conception of a perennial philosophy which frames his thinking. Nevertheless, from the seventeenth through the nineteenth century, Cudworth’s philosophy has attracted a distinguished array of philosophical readers, among them Locke, Shaftesbury, Leibniz, Reid, Hume and other philosophers of the Scottish Enlightenment. Newton made extensive notes on Cudworth, preserved in his MS “Out of Cudworth” (Newton, q.v.). Richard Price’s Review of the Principal Questions and Difficulties in Morals (Price 1758) is indebted to Cudworth’s posthumous TEIM. Cudworth’s admirers also included Alexander Pope, Samuel Taylor Coleridge and the American Transcendentalists. He was held in high regard by the Scottish historian of philosophy, Dugald Stewart. His hypothesis of Plastic Nature had a lengthy afterlife: it was the subject of a dispute between Pierre Bayle and Jean Le Clerc (Rosa 1994, Simonutti 1993), who defended Cudworth at the instigation of his daughter, Damaris. It was taken up by the botanist, John Ray, included by Denis Diderot in the Encyclopédie and defended by Paul Janet in the mid nineteenth century.

Although never a best-seller, TISU was re-published periodically across the centuries. Thomas Birch’s edition of TISU in 1743, incorporated TEIM, and was reprinted in 1820 and 1829. An edition was published in New York 1837–8, and by John Harrison in 1845 (with Mosheim’s notes). Cudworth’s philosophy was translated into Latin, French, and Italian thereby ensuring his philosophy a European readership. The Latin translation by German scholar Johan Lorenz Mosheim published in Jena in 1733 (reprinted Leiden 1773) also included a translation of TEIM. (A possible link to Kant through the Jena connection remains to be explored). An abridged Italian translation of TISU appeared in 1823/4. Extracts of TISU were published in French by Jean Le Clerc in his Bibliothèque choisie (1703–6). (It was probably this version which Leibniz knew, although he also possessed a copy of the original given to him by Cudworth’s daughter, Damaris Masham). In the eighteenth-century Cudworth’s philosophy was also disseminated in shortened form. Thomas Wise’s abridged version, A Confutation of the Reason and Philosophy of Atheism was reprinted three times between 1706 and 1732. It was only in 1838 when FW was published that any of his unpublished manuscripts was printed.


Primary Sources

Manuscript sources

  • Cudworth, Ralph, Three Treatises on “Liberty and Necessity”, London, British Library, Additional MSS 4978–4982.
  • Newton, Isaac, “Out of Cudworth”, Los Angeles, CA, William Andrews Clark Memorial Library MS, fN563Z. [“Out of Cudworth” available online]

Printed sources

Works by Cudworth
  • [TISU], 1678, The True Intellectual System of the Universe, London: Richard Royston. All quotations are taken from this first edition, with spelling and punctuation modernised. [TISU 1678 available online]
    • 1706, A Confutation of the Reason and Philosophy of Atheism being an Abridgement or an Improvement of what Dr Cudworth Offered in his ‘True Intellectual System’, Thomas Wise (ed.), London, reprinted 1732.
    • 1733, Radulphi Cudworthi systema intellectualis hujus universi (Latin translation), Johan Lorenz Mosheim (trans.), Jena, 1733. Reprinted Leiden, 1773. [TISU 1733 available online]
    • 1743, The True Intellectual System of the Universe, Thomas Birch (ed.), reprinted 1820, 1839, American edition, Andover, Gould & Newman; New York, 1837–38).
    • 1823, 1824, Sistema intellettuale dell'universo di R. Cudwort [sic] (Italian translation), Marchese Luigi Benedetti (trans.), Pavia.
    • 1829, The Works of Ralph Cudworth … A new edition, with references to the several quotations in the Intellectual System, and a life of the author, Thomas Birch (ed.), Oxford: D. A. Talboys.
    • 1845, The True Intellectual System of the Universe, J. Harrison (ed.) (with notes from Mosheim’s translation), London: Thomas Tegg.
    • 1964, The True Intellectual System of the Universe, London; facsimile reprint Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt: Friedrich Frommann.
  • [TEIM], A Treatise Concerning Eternal and Immutable Morality. Quotations are from the 1996 edition.
    • 1731, A Treatise Concerning Eternal and Immutable Morality, Edward Chandler (ed.), London.
    • 1733, Latin translation included in TISU 1733.
    • 1743, included in TISU 1743.
    • 1995, Traité de morale et Traité du libre arbitre, introduction, traduction et notes par Jean-Louis Breteau, Paris.
    • 1996, A Treatise Concerning Eternal and Immutable Morality with A Treatise of Freewill, Sarah Hutton (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9781139166720
  • [FW], Of Freewill. Quotations are from the 1996 edition edition printed with TEIM 1996.
    • 1838, A Treatise of Freewill, J. Allen (ed.), London.
    • 1996, included in TEIM 1996.
  • Raphael, D. D. (ed.), 1969, British Moralists, 1650–1800. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 119–53.
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Works by Others
  • Diderot, Denis, Encyclopédie, Art. “Plastique”.
  • Le Clerc, Jean (ed.), 1703 and 1706, Bibliotheque choisie.
  • Locke, John, 1693 [1989], Some Thoughts Concerning Education, London: A. and J. Churchill. Modern edition, John W. Yolton and Jean S. Yolton (eds), Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1989.
  • Price, Richard, 1758, A Review of the Principal Questions and Difficulties in Morals, London: A. Millar.
  • Ray, John, 1691 The Wisdom of God in the Works of Creation, London.

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Other Internet Resources

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