Descartes' Theory of Ideas

First published Wed Mar 14, 2007; substantive revision Wed Jun 14, 2017

Ideas are among the most important items in Descartes’ philosophy. They serve to unify his ontology and epistemology. As he says in a letter to Guillaume Gibieuf (1583–1650), dated 19 January 1642, “I am certain that I can have no knowledge of what is outside me except by means of the ideas I have within me.”[1] Descartes never published anything that specifically worked out a theory of ideas. Even so, he said enough in published and unpublished work, as well as in correspondence, that allows for a basic reconstruction of a theory. This entry will focus principally on the theory of ideas and how it relates to Descartes’ ontology, though in Section 6 of this entry, which includes discussion of simple natures and Descartes’ concepts of clarity and distinctness, certain components of his epistemology are briefly considered. For more on the epistemology, see the related entry Descartes, René: epistemology.

1. Ideas Understood as Modes of Thinking

According to Descartes’ ontology there are substances, attributes, and modes. These are understood relative to one another, in terms of ontological dependence. Modes depend on attributes, and attributes depend on substances. The dependence relation is transitive; thus, modes depend ultimately on substances. No substances, no modes. In Principles, Part I, Article 53, Descartes says that a mode “presupposes” an attribute (AT VIIIA 25; CSM I 210), and in Article 52 he says that an attribute “presupposes” an existing substance. A mode of some thing was understood by Descartes as a a way of being that thing. So, where X is some substance, a mode M is a way of being X. That said, in Article 52 he also says that a substance minus its attributes cannot be known to the human mind. Attributes are in fact what make existing substances intelligible to the human mind. He reaffirms this in Article 62, where he says that there is only a distinction in reason between an attribute and an existing substance. (AT VIIIA 30; CSM I 214) This strongly suggests that although one may draw a conceptual distinction between an attribute and existing substance, the two are not distinct in reality. They are really one and the same thing. (Nolan 1997, Hoffman 2002) Subsequently, if mode M is a way of being X, where X is the substance, the intelligibility of X requires that we conceive some attribute A. And so, strictly speaking, mode M is understood as a mode of attribute A, where A is the attribute through which the existing substance X is conceived (where in reality A and X are presumably identical).

The nature of a mind, Descartes says, is to think. If a thing does not think, it is not a mind. In terms of his ontology, the mind is an existing (finite) substance, and thought or thinking is its attribute. Insofar as the nature of a mind is to think, where thought is the mind’s defining feature, Descartes calls it the mind’s principal attribute (AT VIIIA 25; CSM I 210–11). An idea is a mode of thinking. In being a mode of thinking, an idea is understood as a way of being (an instance of) thinking, or an idea is way in which an instance of thinking is manifested. This is similar to what Descartes says about a body, its principal attribute, and its modes. The nature of a body is to be extended (in length, breadth, and depth). A body is a (finite) substance, and extension is its attribute. Since extension is the defining feature of a body, Descartes refers to it as a body’s principal attribute. Shape is a mode of extension. What this means is that shape is a way of being extended, or a way in which an instance of extension is manifested. Thus, shape is to extension as idea is to thought. Thus a shape presupposes extension and an idea presupposes thinking, where each principal attribute presupposes an existing substance.

Insofar as ideas are modes, they occupy the lowest rung on Descartes’ ontological ladder. This can be contrasted to Plato’s theory, for example, which casts ideas as substances, occupying the upper-most rung of the ontological ladder. So, whereas for Plato ideas are the most real things in the cosmos, for Descartes ideas are among the least real. Another departure from Plato’s view was Descartes’ taking ideas as the vehicles of representation, as the items doing the representing. By contrast, Plato took ideas to be the things represented. Socrates, for instance, was taken by Plato to be a representation of the form or idea of man. These differences are certainly enough to suggest that ideas are playing significantly different roles in their respective systems. So, it would not be reasonable to think that Descartes’ view was simply an extension of Plato’s, despite the fact that Descartes had adopted some of Plato’s terminology.

Ideas are not the only modes of thinking. Doubting and judging, for example, are also modes of thinking. Early in the Third Meditation, Descartes works out a basic division of the various modes of thinking. He sorts them into two kinds: simple and complex. Ideas are included in the category of simple modes. Doubting, judging, and the like, are included in the category of complex modes. Even so, all complex modes include ideas as constituents. A complex mode of thought includes at least two basic mental components: an idea and some “additional” mental feature. He writes:

…[C]onsiderations of order appear to dictate that I now classify my thoughts into definite kinds, and ask which of them can properly be said to be the bearers of truth and falsity. Some of my thoughts are as it were the images of things, and it is only in these cases that the term “idea” is strictly appropriate — for example, when I think of a man, or a chimera, or the sky, or an angel, or God. Other thoughts have various additional forms: thus when I will, or am afraid, or affirm, or deny, there is always a particular thing which I take as the object of my thought, but my thought includes something more than the likeness of that thing. Some thoughts in this category are called volitions or emotions, while others are called judgements. (AT VII 36–7; CSM II 25–6)

In this passage, ideas are cast as modes of thinking that represent (or present or exhibit) objects to the mind—objects such as a man, or Pegasus, or the sky, or an angel, or God (and given what Descartes says in the First Meditation, among the list of things exhibited to the mind by way of its ideas, one could add colors, sounds, feels, and so on (AT VII 20; CSM II 13-14)). On Descartes’ view, an idea is the only kind of (simple) mode that does this. When considering one of the more complex modes of thought—for instance, fearing a lion or affirming the Pythagorean Theorem, where the lion and the theorem are the objects presented—it is the idea that is doing the presenting; it is the vehicle of representation. As Descartes will note in the Fourth Meditation, he takes there to be two basic faculties (capacities or abilities) of the mind: the intellect (or understanding) and the will. Ideas are “produced” by the intellect. So, the idea of the Pythagorean Theorem has its origin in the faculty of the intellect or understanding. The act of affirming, the other component of the more complex thought of affirming this theorem, has its origin in the faculty of the will. Contributions from both faculties, then, give rise to the more complex kinds of thought.

Descartes is careful to not identify ideas as pictures or as visual images, but instead says that they are as it were [tanquam] images of things. This is a long-standing theme, for we find it expressed as early as The World (AT XI 3–6; CSM I 81–2) and the Optics (AT VI 112–13; CSM I 165), and as late as the Principles (AT VIIIA 32–3; CSM I 216–17) and Description of the Human Body (AT XI 255–257; CSM I 322–23), where in these contexts ideas are cast as representing their objects without necessarily resembling them. This is important to the theory, since the idea of cold or the idea of sweet, for example, insofar as they are ideas, represent something to the mind, but they are not visual images. The point holds for other ideas, such as the idea of God, which Descartes explicitly lists in the above passage. The idea of God represents something to the mind (it represents an infinite substance), and in line with traditional theological doctrine, supposing that God is non-spatial and non-temporal, the idea cannot be understood as being a visual image of God.

Consistent with what he says in the above Third Meditation passage, Descartes says in other places that an idea is “the form of any given thought, immediate perception of which makes me aware of the thought” (AT VII 160; CSM II 113). In his reply to Thomas Hobbes (1588–1679), author of the Third Set of Objections, Descartes says that an idea is “whatever is immediately perceived by the mind” (AT VII 181; CSM II 127). In his reply to Pierre Gassendi (1592–1655), author of the Fifth Set of Objections, he says that the term “idea” is extended “to cover any object of thought” (AT VII 366; CSM II 253). In a letter to Marin Mersenne (1588–1648), dated July 1641, he says that “idea” denotes “in general everything which is in our mind when we conceive something, no matter how we conceive it” (AT III 393; CSMK III 185). Long-standing interpretations take such passages as telling us that ideas have the special feature of intentionality—they are directed at their respective objects. It is in terms of this directedness that the mind is said to be aware of an object.

One long-standing interpretation, the Representationalist interpretation, says that for Descartes the objects immediately presented to the mind (by way of an idea) are purely mental objects. This interpretation emphasizes Descartes’ saying that such objects are solely in the intellect, as when he says to Caterus that the object of which the mind is immediately or directly aware when having the idea of the Sun “…is not an actual entity, that is, it is not a being located outside the intellect…” (AT VII 103; CSM II 75) The object at which the mind is directed, the immediate object of awareness, is not the Sun itself, but is instead a purely mental object, which represents (or stands for) the Sun in the heavens. This purely mental object is said to constitute the content of the idea. On this view, an idea is sometimes referred to as a tertium quid, a third thing, which “stands between” the mind’s eye, so to speak, and the object that the idea represents.

Another long-standing interpretation, the Direct Realist interpretation, says that for Descartes the objects immediately represented or presented to the mind (by way of an idea) are not always mental objects. (Nadler 1989) The idea of the Sun is understood as being a mental operation (a mode of the mind) directed at the Sun itself. In fact, on this interpretation, all ideas are, properly speaking, to be understood as operations or acts of the mind. This holds even for the idea of Pegasus. The idea is a mental operation and in this case is directed at the mentally fabricated object, Pegasus. Here, Pegasus is a purely mental object. By contrast, the (sensory) idea of the Sun is directed at the Sun itself, the Sun in the heavens. Thus, this interpretation allows ideas to be directed at mental and extra-mental objects. The import of this interpretation is that the immediate objects of awareness need not be purely mental—so, no tertium quid—which differs dramatically from the Representationalist interpretation. Although both readings have their merits, the remainder of this entry will work within the framework of the Representationalist reading.

2. Ideas and The Formal-Objective Reality Distinction

When speaking of an existent mode—in this case, an actually occurring idea—Descartes will say that it possesses formal reality. The formal reality of a thing is the kind of reality the thing possesses in virtue of its being an actual or an existent thing (AT VII 41–42, 102–4; CSM II 28–29, 74–5). For example, given that the Sun is an actual or existent thing, it possesses formal reality. By contrast, given that Pegasus is not an actual or existent thing, he does not possess formal reality. Given that the idea of the Sun or the idea of Pegasus are actual or existent ideas, where an idea is actual or existent when it is being actively thought by a mind, each would possess formal reality.

Descartes took there to be three “levels” of formal reality: the level of infinite substance, the level of finite substance (as defined by its principal attribute), and the level of mode. The level of formal reality of an infinite substance is greater than that of a finite substance, and the level of formal reality of a finite substance is greater than that of a mode. This is understood in terms of ontological dependence. A mode depends for its formal reality on the formal reality of a finite substance, and a finite substance depends for its formal reality on the formal reality of an infinite substance. An existent idea, in possessing the level of formal reality of a mode, is less “real” than a finite substance, which is in line with what was said in the previous section of this entry.

When speaking of ideas as representing things to the mind, Descartes will refer to an idea’s objective reality. The objective reality of a thing is the kind of reality a thing possesses in virtue of its being a representation of something (ibid.). Given that the idea of the Sun and the idea of Pegasus represent things to the mind (they represent or exhibit the Sun and Pegasus respectively), each possesses objective reality. Descartes says that ideas possess objective reality by their very nature. Equally importantly, ideas are the only items in his ontology that possess both formal and objective reality. (AT VII 42; CSM II 29)

As with formal reality, there are three “levels” of objective reality. Descartes says, “Undoubtedly, the ideas which represent substances to me amount to something more and, so to speak, contain within themselves more objective reality than the ideas which merely represent modes or accidents” (AT VII 40; CSM II 28). And, Descartes’ Third Meditation examination of his idea of God reveals that the objective reality that it contains or possesses is that associated with an infinite substance. At the very least, the view is that the idea of God contains a level of objective reality that is greater than that contained in an idea representing a finite substance. Thus, the levels of objective reality possessed by ideas, the reality they possess in virtue of their representing things to the mind, are (nominally) three: infinite substance, finite substance, and mode. The categories of the objective-reality hierarchy, then, correspond to those of the formal-reality hierarchy.

“The nature of an idea,” Descartes says, “is such that of itself it requires no formal reality except what it derives from my thought, of which it is a mode” (AT VII 41; CSM II 28). In fact, “In so far as the ideas are (considered) simply (as) modes of thought, there is no recognizable inequality among them: they all appear to come from within me in the same fashion” (AT VII 40; CSM II 27–8). Each idea is simply a mode of thought, and insofar as an idea is an existent (or actual) mode, it possesses a level of formal reality of that of a mode. He continues: “But in so far as different ideas (are considered as images which) represent different things, it is clear that they differ widely” (AT VII 40; CSM II 28). The differences will not only be in terms of the “objects” represented, but, as noted above, ideas will differ with respect to the levels of objective reality they contain (AT VII 40; CSM II 28).

To see the formal-objective reality distinction at work within the context of Descartes’ theory, consider an idea that has been mentioned several times already—the idea of God as introduced in the Third Meditation. Descartes’ analysis of this idea begins with his focusing on the fact that the idea represents to him an infinite substance (AT VII 45; CSM II 31). The formal-objective reality distinction suggests the following. When considered simply as an existent mode of Descartes’ mind, which is to consider it in terms of its formal reality, Descartes sees no trouble in accounting for the origin of the formal reality of this idea: the formal reality possessed by this idea is derived from the formal reality of his mind. But when considered in terms of what this idea represents or presents to the mind, which is to consider the idea in terms of its objective reality, Descartes discovers a problem: what is the origin of the idea’s objective reality? This challenge arises in light of Descartes’ saying:

Now it is manifest by the natural light that there must be at least as much (reality) in the efficient and total cause as in the effect of that cause. For where, I ask, could the effect get its reality from, if not from the cause? And how could the cause give it to the effect unless it possessed it? It follows from this both that something cannot arise from nothing, and also that what is more perfect — that is, contains in itself more reality — cannot arise from what is less perfect. And this is transparently true not only in the case of effects which possess (what the philosophers call) actual or formal reality, but also in the case of ideas, where one is considering only (what they call) objective reality. A stone, for example, which previously did not exist, cannot begin to exist unless it is produced by something which contains, either formally or eminently everything to be found in the stone; similarly, heat cannot be produced in an object which was not previously hot, except by something of at least the same order (degree or kind) of perfection as heat, and so on. But it is also true that the idea of heat, or of a stone, cannot exist in me unless it is put there by some cause which contains at least as much reality as I conceive to be in the heat or in the stone. For although this cause does not transfer any of its actual or formal reality to my idea, it should not on that account be supposed that it must be less real. The nature of an idea is such that of itself it requires no formal reality except what it derives from my thought, of which it is a mode. But in order for a given idea to contain such and such objective reality, it must surely derive it from some cause which contains at least as much formal reality as there is objective reality in the idea. For if we suppose that an idea contains something which was not in its cause, it must have got this from nothing; yet the mode of being by which a thing exists objectively (or representatively) in the intellect by way of an idea, imperfect though it may be, is certainly not nothing, and so it cannot come from nothing. (AT VII 40–1; CSM II 28–9)

The challenge in the examination of the idea of God is to account for the origin of the idea’s level of objective reality. He determines that the formal reality possessed by his own mind cannot be its origin. He concludes that there must be some being that in fact possesses the requisite level of formal reality, which in this case will be greater than that of a finite substance. (For more, see the SEP entry on Descartes’ epistemology.) Notice how this differs from what he says about the formal reality of an idea, namely, that his mind is the cause or origin of an idea’s formal reality.

The examination of the idea of God follows almost directly upon the introduction of the possible connection between the objective reality of some of his ideas and the formal reality of extra-ideational or extra-mental objects. Descartes’ analysis of the idea of God suggests a principle of representation, which is discussed in Section 4 of this entry.

There is a second distinction that Descartes introduces worth noting, the material-objective distinction. Some scholars believe that it is simply an alternate way of expressing the formal-objective reality distinction. The material-objective distinction is never clearly formulated in the body of the Meditations, though Descartes employs it in his reply to Antione Arnauld (1612–1694), in the Fourth Set of Replies.

Descartes introduces the material-objective distinction in the Preface To the Reader of the Meditations (which was very likely written after the Meditations and the Objections and Replies). He says that the word “idea” is philosophically ambiguous:

“Idea” can be taken materially, as an operation of the intellect, in which case it cannot be said to be more perfect than me. Alternatively, it can be taken objectively, as the thing represented by that operation; and this thing, even if it is not regarded as existing outside the intellect, can still, in virtue of its essence, be more perfect than myself. (AT VII 8; CSM II 7)

The term “idea” can be used to refer to a specific kind of act or operation of the mind—here, it is the act of representing. In this sense, the idea is simply an existent mode of the mind. In light of the formal-objective reality distinction, since the formal reality of an idea (a mode) is derived from the formal reality of the mind (its substance), it follows that its level of formal reality cannot be greater than that of the mind. This is what Descartes means when claiming that his ideas, understood as operations of his mind, cannot be “more perfect” than his mind. When using “idea” to refer to an operation of the mind, “idea” is expressing what he calls the material sense. Sometimes he will say, as he does in the above quoted passage, that when understanding an idea to be an operation of the mind that it is taken materially.

Alternatively, the term “idea” can be used to refer to that which is presented or exhibited directly to the mind by way of the mental operation. When using “idea” to refer the object exhibited directly to the mind, “idea” is expressing what he calls the objective sense. Sometimes he will say, as he does in the above quoted passage, that when understanding an idea as the object immediately presented to the mind (by way of a mental operation), the idea is taken objectively.

Consider again the idea of God. When taking this idea materially, the idea is understood as an operation of the mind. When taking this very same idea objectively, the idea is understood as that which is presented directly to the mind by way of this operation. The nature of the object presented, Descartes says, can be more perfect than his mind. So, even though he is not an infinite being, an idea can nevertheless present to him a being that is infinite, a being that possesses a greater level of reality than that possessed by a finite substance.

Where the two distinctions may differ is with respect to how Descartes employs them. When tracing out the origins of the formal and objective reality possessed by an idea, Descartes employs the formal-objective reality distinction. In some cases, as in the case of the idea of God, the origin of the formal reality of the idea is his own mind, whereas the origin of the objective reality is God (something that exists independently of his mind). However, when Descartes is speaking about the relation between an idea understood as a mental operation, and this very same idea now understood as the object presented by way of this operation, Descartes employs the material-objective distinction. The difference is with respect to the number of relations in play in the analysis. Consider again the idea of God. Concerning the formal-objective reality distinction, the number of relations is two: the relation between the idea as mode and the mind, and the relation between the object presented in or by the idea and God. Concerning the material-objective distinction, there is only one relation being considered: the relation between the idea as mental operation and this idea as object presented (via this operation).

3. Three Kinds of Idea

In the Meditations, after Descartes casts ideas as modes that represent or exhibit objects to the mind, he divides ideas into kinds. He says:

Among my ideas, some appear to be innate, some to be adventitious, and others to have been invented by me. My understanding of what a thing is, what truth is, and what thought is, seems to derive simply from my own nature. But my hearing a noise, as I do now, or seeing the sun, or feeling the fire, comes from things which are located outside me, or so I have hitherto judged. Lastly, sirens, hippogriffs and the like are my own invention. (AT VII 37–8; CSM II 26)

Here, Descartes considers three kinds of idea: innate ideas, adventitious ideas, and what are sometimes called factitious ideas. The categories are determined by considering the possible origins of the ideational contents presented or exhibited to the mind. The first category includes ideas whose contents have their origin in his nature (qua thinking thing). An example is his idea of what thought or thinking is. The third category includes ideas whose contents have their origin in the contents of other ideas. An example might be the idea of Pegasus. Adventitious ideas, however, appear at least at first glance to be importantly different, since Nature has always taught him, he says, to think that they are “derived from things existing outside me” (AT VII 38; CSM II 26). The category arises in part from ordinary (pre-philosophical) experience: “…I know by experience that these ideas do not depend on my will, and hence that they do not depend simply on me. Frequently I notice them even when I do not want to: now, for example, I feel the heat whether I want to or not, and this is why I think that this sensation or idea of heat comes to me from something other than myself, namely the heat of the fire by which I am sitting” (AT VII 38; CSM II 26). An account of their origin, he suggests, may require an appeal to things that exist external to, or independently of, his mind. Adventitious ideas include sensory ideas; ideas that originate in sensory experience—such as the ideas of the Sun or the Moon, but also the more simple ideas of colors, sounds, heat, cold, and the like.

In Descartes’ analysis of his idea of God, he discovers that it is innate, since it is neither adventitious nor factitious. It is not adventitious (or sensory), since he has had no sensory experiences of God (i.e., he has never seen, heard, felt, smelt, or tasted God). This would be in line with the theological demand that God is immaterial. It is not factitious, for its content is something that his mind cannot fabricate from other ideas (the idea represents an actual infinity, and at best his mind can only produce the factitious idea of a potential infinity). Even so, it becomes clear to him that the innate idea of God is like the adventitious idea of the Sun, but unlike the innate idea of what thought is (which has its origin in his own nature), since like the adventitious idea of the Sun, the objective reality possessed by the idea has its origin in the formal reality belonging to something other than his own mind. His analysis concludes that the origin of the objective reality must be in an existing God (an actual infinite substance, something possessing an infinite level of formal reality). In the Sixth Meditation, he will ultimately conclude that the objective reality of his idea of body, also innate, must have, like the innate idea of God, its origin in the formal reality belonging to something other than his own mind, namely, it will have its origin in an existing corporeal substance (an extended being that possesses a finite level of formal reality). Ultimately, the objective reality (i.e., contents) of his innate ideas and adventitious ideas must have their origin in the formal reality of things, some of the latter being things existing independently of his mind.

This is not the only place in Descartes’ work where innate and adventitious ideas are cast as sharing the trait of having their respective origins in things existing independently of his mind. For instance, in Comments on a Certain Broadsheet, published in 1648, Descartes casts innateness as a faculty (AT VIIIB 358; CSM I 304), which aligns with what he had said to Hobbes in the Third Set of Replies: “…when we say that an idea is innate in us, we do not mean that it is always there before us. This would mean that no idea was innate. We simply mean that we have within ourselves the faculty of summoning up the idea” (AT VII 189; CSM II 132). Scholars note that this may be different from the way in which innate ideas were cast in the Third Meditation. But with the sense of innate–as–faculty in mind, in Comments on a Certain Broadsheet, Descartes goes on to say that there is a sense in which even sensory ideas (ideas of qualities such as pains, colors, sounds, and so on), ideas arising via the senses, which are a species of adventitious idea, are nevertheless innate. The argument unfolds as follows: Given that the human (or embodied) mind has the faculty or capacity to have sensory ideas of pains, colors, sounds, and so on, where these are occasioned on the occurrence or presence of certain motions in the brain, and nothing of the motions in the brain is transferred to the mind, and nothing resembling the pains, colors, and sounds is present in bodies (including the brain), then the ideas of pains, colors, and sounds (i.e., the ideas of those qualities) “must be all the more innate.” (AT VIIIB 359; CSM I 304)

One interpretation that has relatively recently emerged addresses the concern over the alleged similarity between innate and adventitious ideas by emphasizing the role that innate ideas play (Nolan 1997, Lennon 2007, Nelson 2008, De Rosa 2010). Consider, for example, the adventitious or sensory idea of the Sun. This idea presents the Sun to the mind as a shaped thing. An analysis of this idea reveals that the innate idea of extension (body) is in play, for without it the human mind simply could not experience (or even conceive) the Sun as shaped. Shape presupposes extension. As Descartes puts it in the Principles, everything “which can be attributed to body presupposes extension, and is merely a mode of an extended thing,” which, according to Descartes, is aligned with the view that “…shape is unintelligible except in an extended thing…” (AT VIIIA 25; CSM I 210). In this sense, insofar as a shaped thing is made intelligible to a human mind, the innate idea of extension is involved. As some scholars have put it, the innate idea underlies or informs the occurring idea of the Sun (Nolan 1997, Nelson 2008, De Rosa 2010). This interpretation finds further support in what Descartes says in a letter to Princess Elisabeth, dated 21 May 1643, where Descartes introduces what he calls the “primitive notions.” These are what in other contexts he calls the innate ideas. In the letter, he claims that these ideas serve as “…the patterns on the basis of which we form all our other conceptions” (AT III 665; CSMK III 218). So, it is the unique role of the innate ideas that distinguishes them from adventitious ideas.

Scholars agree that Descartes recognizes at least three innate ideas: the idea of God, the idea of (finite) mind, and the idea of (indefinite) body. In the letter to Elisabeth, he includes a fourth: the idea of the union (of mind and body).

There is an alternate division of ideas worth noting. In the Third Meditation, after having introduced the tripartite division of innate, adventitious, and factitious ideas, Descartes continues to entertain the possible origins of the contents of his ideas. His analysis turns on the principle that an effect can never be greater than its cause, which is underwritten by the self-evident principle that something cannot come from nothing. He says: “And although one idea may perhaps originate from another, there cannot be an infinite regress here; eventually one must reach a primary idea, the cause of which will be like an archetype which contains formally (and in fact) all the reality (or perfection) which is present only objectively (or representatively) in the idea.” (AT VII 42; CSM II 29) Here, Descartes introduces the notion of a primary idea. The import of this notion is that the contents of some of his ideas may have their origin in things located “outside” his mind—that is, in things that exist independently of his mind.

Descartes’ analysis suggests that the contents of some of his innate ideas and all of his adventitious ideas have their origin in things existing independently of his mind. Such ideas are included in the category of Primary Idea. The innate idea of God is a primary idea, since the objective reality it possesses has its origin the the formal reality of God. Likewise, the adventitious idea of the Sun is a primary idea, since the objective reality it possesses has its origin the the formal reality of the Sun. Factitious ideas, whose contents have their origin in the contents of other ideas, no doubt fall into the category of Non-Primary idea. A non-primary idea is one whose objective reality has its origin in the objective reality of some other idea. The factitious idea of Pegasus is an example of a non-primary idea.

This alternate scheme (Primary and Non-Primary), although partitioning ideas differently than the initial scheme (Innate, Adventitious, and Factitious), appears to do no philosophical harm to Descartes’ view. Even so, it is interesting the extent to which Descartes’ category of primary idea is later echoed in the views of John Locke and David Hume, whose respective theories require a similar category.

4. Primary Ideas and a Principle of Representation

Some scholars believe that in Descartes’ brief discussion of primary ideas there is suggested a principle of representation (Wilson 1978, Clatterbaugh 1980, Chappell 1986, Smith 2005a, 2010a). The principle is notoriously difficult to formulate, and there is no consensus among scholars as to how it is best understood. However, a large number of scholars agree on one component of the principle, which can be expressed as a necessary (though not a sufficient) condition for representation. This principle of representation (PR) can be expressed as follows:

(PR) Primary idea A represents object B only if the objective reality of idea A has its origin in the formal reality of object B.

PR is at work in Descartes’ analyses of all primary ideas, which includes all innate and adventitious ideas. The innate idea of his (i.e., Descartes’) mind is said to be of or to represent his mind insofar as the idea’s objective reality has its origin in the formal reality of his mind. The innate idea of God is said to represent God insofar as the idea’s objective reality has its origin in the formal reality of God (an infinite substance). The innate idea of a body is said to represent a body insofar as the idea’s objective reality has its origin in the formal reality of a corporeal substance. The adventitious idea of the Sun is said to represent the Sun insofar as the idea’s objective reality has its origin in the formal reality of the Sun. And the list could go on.

The following analogy may be instructive. Suppose that Socrates stands before a mirror. Both Socrates and the mirror are actual things, so both, using Descartes’ terminology, would possess formal reality. Each can presumably exist independently of the other. The image of Socrates arises as a relation between Socrates and the mirror. It cannot exist independently of Socrates or the mirror. Destroy Socrates or the mirror, and this image of Socrates is destroyed. Using Descartes’ terminology, the image is an objective being insofar as it is a representation of Socrates. Although the image represents Socrates, it is nevertheless “located” on the mirror’s surface. And, since the surface is a mode of the mirror, there is a sense in which this image would be too. The mirror is the bearer of the image. This is a sense in which the image “belongs to” the mirror. The relationship to Socrates is different. The image is said to be an image of Socrates. The image is about him. He is not the bearer of the image, but is what this image represents. So, the relation that Socrates has to this image must be importantly different from the relation that the mirror has to this image. Employing Descartes’ terminology, and in light of RP, the image is of Socrates insofar as this objective being (the image) has its origin in the formal reality of Socrates. To be sure, the image derives its existence, or its formal reality, from the formal reality of the mirror, but its objective being has its origin not in the mirror but in Socrates.

5. The Rules: Simple Natures and the Concepts of Clarity and Distinctness

It is in the Rules that Descartes introduces the simple natures. The simple natures are not only what our ideas are of—that is, they not only constitute the contents of our ideas, the “objects” immediately presented to the mind—but are also the natures possessed by things. (AT X 399; CSM I 32) Examples of simple natures are colors, sounds, smells, shapes, sizes, extension, and the like. He says, for example, in Rule Twelve, “if I judge that a certain shape is not moving, I shall say that my thought is in some way composed of shape and rest; and similarly in other cases.” (AT X 420; CSM I 45) In the First Meditation, Descartes mentions similar ideational elements “from which all the images of things” are formed. (AT VII 20; CSM II 13-14) In the Second Meditation, in his analysis of the adventitious idea of a piece of wax, Descartes again provides a list of such ideational elements. (AT VII 30-32; CSM II 20-21) In the Third Meditation, he refers to such items as “elements in my ideas.” (AT VII 44; CSM II 30) And, in the Sixth Meditation, when revisiting some of what he had established in the Second Meditation, talk of these qualities that are “the only immediate objects of my sensory awareness” is again introduced. (AT VII 75ff; CSM II 52ff) So, although Descartes does not employ the “simple natures” terminology in later work, the philosophical notion certainly looks to be present in his later work.

Simple natures form an ordered, hierarchical system. Upon analysis they appear to be sorted into two basic groups or classes, which not surprisingly corresponds to Descartes’ mind-body dualism. (AT X 399; CSM I 32) Descartes refers to this partition of simple natures as the enumeration. The basic classes of this enumeration will also be partitioned. In light of this, this ultimate enumeration—the partition of the simple natures into the classes of thinking and extended things—can be referred to as the master enumeration. As laid out in the Rules, the hierarchy is not understood in terms of the ontology, but in terms of what must be known in terms of what. (AT X 381; CSM I 21) These groups or classes are formed in light of epistemic priority. One group includes those simple natures that presuppose the simple nature thought or thinking, while the other group includes those simple natures that presuppose the simple nature extension. The view is that the simple nature shape, for instance, presupposes the simple nature extension in that the former is known (understood) on the basis of the latter. As Descartes puts it later in the Principles, “shape is unintelligible except in an extended thing.” (AT VIIIA 25; CSM I 210) No extension, no shape. The same holds for the other class. The simple nature hot, a sensible quality, presupposes the simple nature thought or thinking in that the former is known (or understood) on the basis of the latter. No thought or thinking, no (feeling of) hotness.

Descartes recognizes two forms of conjunction found among the simple natures: necessary and contingent conjunction. (AT X 421f; CSM I 45f) Two simple natures are said to be necessarily conjoined whenever one presupposes (entails) the other. (Ibid.) So, for instance, the simple nature shape is necessarily conjoined with the simple nature extension insofar as the former presupposes (or entails) the latter. An idea is said to be clear whenever the necessary conjunction between simple natures in the idea is exhibited or made explicit. Descartes’ procedure for making an idea “clearer” is to compare the simple natures in the idea. He writes that the procedure:

…is carried over from one subject to another solely by means of comparison, which enables us to state that the thing we are seeking is in this or that respect similar to, or identical with, or equal to, some given thing. Accordingly, in all reasoning it is only by means of comparison that we attain an exact knowledge of the truth. (AT X 439; CSM I 57)

He goes on to say that “Unity is the common nature which, we said above, all things which we are comparing must participate in equally.” (AT X 449; CSM I 63 See also AT X 440f; CSM I 57f) The simple natures shape and size share in common their presupposing the simple nature extension. Extension is the common nature; it unites such natures into a single thing (a body). Thought or thinking is the common nature that unites the other simple natures into a single thing (a mind). An idea is said to be obscure, then, whenever no necessary conjunction (the “presupposes” relation) is exhibited or made explicit in an idea.

Ideas are said to be confused whenever they include or contain simple natures belonging to the two mutually exclusive classes of simple nature (the two classes together forming the enumeration). Here, the Latin confusio means mixed together. The adventitious idea of the Sun is an example of a confused idea. In presenting the Sun as circular-shaped and hot, the idea includes simple natures that belong to the two mutually exclusive classes. Shape belongs to the class whose members presuppose the simple nature extension, whereas heat (a quality) belongs to the class whose members presupposes the simple nature thought or thinking. An idea is said to be distinct, then, whenever it includes or contains only simple natures belonging to one of the mutually exclusive classes. The astronomical idea of the Sun, as introduced in the Third Meditation, looks to be an example of a distinct idea. It includes only those simple natures belonging to the class whose members presuppose the simple nature extension. (Smith 2010, 2015)

In the Third Meditation, Descartes introduces what scholars refer to as “the truth rule”: Whatever one perceives clearly and distinctly is true. (AT VII 35; CSM II 24) In the Fifth Meditation, in his analysis of the clear and distinct idea of a triangle, Descartes argues that since “whatever is true is something (i.e., real)” (AT VII 65; CSM II 45), it follows that “everything which I clearly and distinctly perceive to belong to that thing (the triangle) really does belong to it…” (AT VII 65; CSM II 45) As others have argued (Lennon 2007, Smith 2010a, Smith 2015, Wahl 1995), for Descartes, to say that something was “real” was in part to say that it existed independently of a finite mind. This is the import of Descartes’ proving the existence of God and body. They are real things. In his analysis of the idea of the triangle, Descartes concludes that the natures that he clearly and distinctly perceives the triangle as possessing are in fact possessed by the triangle. These natures are real.

Russell Wahl has argued that for Descartes truth was related directly to natures. (Wahl 1995) What is true, he says, “is the object before the mind and not the idea—not the operation of the mind, but what is perceived.” (Wahl 1995, p. 188) In other words, truth is not related to the idea taken materially, but to the idea taken objectively. This, he says, is no doubt related to Descartes’ claim that whatever is true is something (real). (AT VII 65; CSM II 45) The import of this view is that the simple natures, which constitute the contents of ideas, are also the very same natures possessed by things—at least when the idea is clear and distinct. Here, the simple natures look to be serving as an ontological bridge, so to speak, between the mind and extra-mental reality. Wahl’s reading is controversial, but worth noting, since the potentiality lurks in its being able to bring closer together the Representationalist and Direct Realist readings.

A relatively recent suggestion, which emerged in part as a response to the conflict between the Representationalist and Direct-Realist interpretations, comes from Paul Hoffman. (Hoffman 2002) He bases his suggestion on a view held by Aquinas. Given that simple natures are the ontological elements of ideas and things, Hoffman in essence argues that it is the simple natures themselves that possess the two kinds of reality that Descartes had introduced in the Third Meditation, namely, formal and objective reality. (Hoffman 2002) Consider the adventitious idea of the Sun. As noted earlier, this idea is obscure and confused. Even so, it reportedly represents the Sun in the heavens. Descartes makes clear in the Third Meditation that the astronomical idea of the Sun better “resembles” the object reportedly in the heavens than does the adventitious idea. One way this may be the case is that the astronomical idea is clear and distinct in that it includes only those simple natures that presuppose extension, such as shape, size, motion, and so on. The Sun is a body whose nature is extension (in length, breadth, and depth).

“The sun as it exists objectively,” says Hoffman, “is able to represent the sun as it exists formally in the heavens precisely because it is the same thing that has these two modes of existence.” (Hoffman 2002, p. 168) That is, the Sun possesses both formal and objective reality, or rather, the simple natures that constitute the thing referred by the words “the Sun” possess both formal and objective reality. Hoffman’s suggestion is that it is the objective reality possessed by the simple natures that the mind “engages” when perceiving the Sun. It is via the Sun’s objective being that the mind has “access to” the Sun in the heavens. This suggestion would seem to straddle both the Representationalist and Direct-Realist interpretations, though, as Hoffman himself characterizes his view, his suggestion leans in the direction of the Direct-Realist interpretation.

That said, there is trouble lurking in Hoffman’s suggestion. Descartes very clearly says that ideas are the items in his ontology that possess objective reality, and they possess it by their very nature. (AT VII 42; CSM II 29) If the Sun, for instance, or any of the simple natures that constitute the Sun, are the items that possess objective reality, then the Sun or the simple natures that constitute it are ideas. But the Sun, or the simple natures that constitute it, also presumably possess formal reality, which is the kind of reality a thing possesses insofar as it is a real or actual thing. If by “real” Descartes in part means exists independently of a finite mind, as Wahl and Lennon contend, then the Sun, or the simple natures that constitute it, insofar as they possess formal reality, exist independently of the finite mind. This would entail that ideas can and do exist independently of the finite mind! But this runs counter to Descartes’ ontology. For further examination of the Representationalist and Direct Realist interpretations, which includes a critical look at Hoffman’s suggestion, see (Smith 2010a).

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Other Internet Resources

Acknowledgments

I thank Alan Nelson for helpful comments on earlier drafts of this entry, and I thank Andrew Pessin for his original entry on this material, which helped set the stage for this one.

Copyright © 2017 by
Kurt Smith <ksmit4@bloomu.edu>

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