Dewey’s Political Philosophy

First published Wed Feb 9, 2005; substantive revision Thu Jul 26, 2018

John Dewey (1859-1952) was an American philosopher, associated with pragmatism. His immense philosophical and other written output encompasses most areas of philosophy as well as a host of other educational, social and political concerns. Although much of Dewey’s political writing is prompted by specific issues, his overall orientation is deeply shaped by his pragmatism or (as he preferred) “experimentalism”. At the core of his political thinking are the beliefs that science and democracy are mutually supportive and interdependent enterprises, that they are egalitarian, progressive and rest on habits of open social communication, and that powerful interpretations of liberal individualism and democracy have become ossified and self-defeating.

Dewey’s earliest philosophical work was deeply influenced by the Idealism imbibed from his teacher and colleague George S. Morris. Through the 1890s, and particularly after a move to the newly founded University of Chicago in 1894, Dewey began a steady drift away from Idealist metaphysics, a process that he describes in an autobiographical essay “From Absolutism to Experimentalism”. Influenced notably by William James’s Principles of Psychology (1890), Dewey came to repudiate both the Idealist’s claim that the study of empirical phenomena leads to the conclusion that the world is mind, and the belief that the only alternative to this is an atomistic empiricism. Yet he retained the Idealist ambition of articulating a unified account of human progress. While at Chicago Dewey’s interest in educational theory and conception of the school as a central institution for a democratic society came to fruition, in the foundation of the University Elementary School (the “Lab School”), and in books such as The School and Society (1899), The Child and the Curriculum (1902), and later in the culminating statement Democracy and Education (1916). After a dispute with the university president, Dewey left Chicago in 1904 for Columbia University, where he remained until his retirement.

The period between the wars also saw an imposing series of books articulating and developing his philosophical beliefs. This includes Reconstruction in Philosophy (1920), Human Nature and Conduct (1922), Experience and Nature (1925), The Quest for Certainty (1929), Art as Experience (1934), A Common Faith (1934), Logic: The Theory of Inquiry (1938), and Theory of Valuation (1939). The Public and Its Problems (1927) contained a defence of participatory democratic ideals against sceptics such as Walter Lippmann, who argued that there was only space for a minimally democratic politics in complex modern societies. Dewey was a critic of laissez-faire liberalism and its accompanying individualistic view of society from his early writings. This criticism was amplified during the Depression, where he expressed a form of liberal and democratic socialism in writings such as Individualism, Old and New (1930), Liberalism and Social Action (1935), and Freedom and Culture (1939).

As a public intellectual, Dewey was a supporter of such causes as women’s suffrage and the Settlement House movement (he was a frequent visitor to the philosopher Jane Addams’s and Ellen Gates Starr’s famous Hull House in Chicago). He lectured to international audiences and his educational writing in particular was influential in a wide range of settings, including notably China. His immense range of public and political activities included presidency of the teachers’ union, sponsorship of the American Civil Liberties Union and NAACP, support for the Outlawry of War movement in the interwar years, chairing the People’s Lobby, and (persuaded by his student Sidney Hook) participation in the “trial” of Leon Trotsky in Mexico in 1938. After his move to New York, and particularly after the onset of the First World War, a substantial part of his published output consisted of commentary on current domestic and international politics, and public statements on behalf of many causes, both domestic and international. (He is probably the only philosopher in this Encyclopaedia to have published both on the Treaty of Versailles and on the value of displaying art in post offices.) He was a prominent critic from the left of Roosevelt’s New Deal while at the same time opposing Soviet communism and its western apologists. By the time of his death he was lionized as a national sage (as with Bertrand Russell, this status was compatible with his promotion of controversial and often radical public positions). Both his philosophical reputation and public status dimmed somewhat in subsequent years. However, his work has remained an important reference point and resource for democratic theory.

1. Situating Dewey’s Political Philosophy

We can see some of Dewey’s abiding concerns in political philosophy sketched in some of his early, overtly Idealist work. In texts such as “The Ethics of Democracy” (EW1) and “Christianity and Democracy” (EW4), Dewey elaborates a version of the Idealist criticisms of classical liberal individualism. For this line of criticism, classical liberalism envisages the individual as an independent entity in competition with other individuals, and takes social and political life as a sphere in which this competitive pursuit of self-interest is coordinated. By contrast, the Idealists rejected this view of social and political life as the aggregation of inherently conflicting private interests. Instead, they sought to view individuals relationally: individuality could be sustained only where social life was understood as an organism in which the well-being of each part was tied to the well-being of the whole. Freedom in a positive sense consisted not merely in the absence of external constraints but the positive fact of participation in such an ethically desirable social order. On this foundation, Dewey rebuts Henry Maine’s bleak assessment in Popular Government that democracy is the rule of the ignorant majority. While it is important that voters can reject their rulers and so control them to some extent, democracy is not simply a form of government defined by the distribution of the franchise or majority rule. Rather what matters, as Dewey puts it, is the way that the majority is formed. To understand that requires grasping what Maine misses, in Dewey’s view: that “men are not isolated non-social atoms, but are men only when in intrinsic relations” to one another, and the state in turn only represents them “so far as they have become organically related to one another, or are possessed of unity of purpose and interest” (“The Ethics of Democracy”, EW1, 231-2). Democracy is a form of moral and spiritual association that recognizes the contribution that each member can make in his or her particular way to this ethical community. And each of us can contribute to this community since we each only become the individuals we are through our engagement in the institutions and practices of our society.

Other important themes also appear in these early statements. Democracy is not “simply and solely a form of government”, but a social and personal ideal; in other words, it is not only a property of political institutions but of a wide range of social relationships. This ideal is common to a range of social spheres, and should take [“industrial, as well as civil and political” forms (“The Ethics of Democracy”, EW1, 246). Through democracy in this expansive and ideal sense,

the incarnation of God in man … becomes a living, present thing … The truth is brought down to life, its segregation removed; it is made a common trust enacted in all departments of action, not in one isolated sphere called religious. (“Christianity and Democracy”, EW4, 9)

While the Christian conception of democracy recedes (but does not entirely disappear) in Dewey’s later work, the idea that democracy should be viewed as a form of relationship that encompasses and unifies different spheres of social life remains important. Dewey’s later work is more questioning of the traditional ethical standards and ideals that he appeals to in an essay like “The Ethics of Democracy”, and he is sharply critical of what he sees as the residual Kantianism in Green’s idealism, although the general orientation remains: individuals are not presocial atoms, and democracy is more than a method of majority rule through voting; it is also a social and ethical ideal.

At the core of Dewey’s later work is his pragmatist or “experimentalist” notion of what he calls intelligence or inquiry as problem-solving. This has reached its apogee in the successes of modern science, medicine, and engineering, but in Dewey’s naturalistic and historical view is continuous with, and arises from, mundane processes of inquiry and problem-solving or, as he put it in a text for educationalists, with How We Think (MW6, LW8). The goal of an inquiry is not to arrive at a certain picture of the nature of things, but to come up with an inevitably provisional solution to the practical and intellectual problem that sparked it – to resolve problematic situations. Inquiry should be understood as part of our struggle with an objectively precarious but improvable environment. Inquiry is demanded by what he calls an “incomplete” or “problematic” situation, that is, one in which our inherited habits and standard ways of doing things run into trouble, perhaps through our actions’ having unexpected consequences, through new needs and desires, or through conflict with others. These challenges prompt us to step back, identify the problem we are confronted with, and reflect on what to do next. Modern societies have an awesome exemplar of successful inquiry, in the natural sciences which, Dewey argues, have been progressive and cumulative, giving us greater and greater understanding and control of the natural world. This has above all been the result of their experimental character, in which no intellectual element is taken to be beyond rational scrutiny. Theories and hypotheses are invented, used, tested, revised, and so on. At the same time, new methods for the invention, use, testing and revision of theories and hypotheses are developed and refined, and so are new standards for evaluating theories and hypotheses. What counts as success in inquiry is some practice’s meeting these standards, but these standards themselves may be judged in the light of how they square with ongoing practices of inquiry. In this way, the methods used by science are not fixed but themselves have a history and develop progressively and sometimes in unexpected ways. A crucial dimension of the experience that has established these standards and practices is social or communal, as we must look to the community of our fellow inquirers for testing and confirmation of our findings.

Dewey’s conception of inquiry is intended as a general model of reflective intelligence: we struggle with problems in all sorts of areas of human experience, including art and ethics. Accordingly he rejects non-cognitivism about values and holds that values can be true or false in his pragmatic sense, responsive to reasons and corrigible in the light of experience. He argues that we should generally think of values as reflective responses to problematic situations, with the aim of providing means for what Dewey calls their “directed resolution” (most fully in these terms in the late work, Theory of Valuation (LW13)). As his treatment of art within this framework suggests, Dewey’s view of problem-solving is far from being only narrowly “practical”. Practical inquiry encompasses instrumental reasoning about means: so if we our path to the beach is blocked by a giant rock (the problematic situation) we can reflect on what it would involve to take another route, to climb the rock, to dynamite it, etc., (and can imaginatively rehearse the options). But it also includes reflective criticism of ends: if the journey now has to include arduous rock-climbing, we may reconsider how important our end of getting to the beach is. Inquiry as practical judgment involves reflecting on, and revising our ends, in the light of what is involved for us in achieving them, and this often leads us creatively to transform our values and to develop new ends.

In keeping with this pragmatic naturalism, Dewey’s ethical writings approach moral theory in a distinctive way. Moral theories are generated in contingent historical circumstances, are responsive to the particular needs and conflicts of those circumstances, and reflect their prejudices and assumption. Ideas that were functional for a particular social order can cease to make sense or become dysfunctional as that order changes. Mistaking contingent social products for unchangeable features of human nature or psychology is one of the core occupational hazards of moral philosophers. Famously, for example, he thinks that the philosophical preference for “intrinsic” goods of contemplation and related values such as aesthetic purity originally reflect a form of Greek society structured around a slave class and a leisured class but is reproduced (with increasing difficulty) in other class-divided societies.

Dewey isn’t a sceptic about inherited moral theory. Rather, he sees it as as a repertoire of conceptual resources and tools that we have for dealing with the problems of value judgement in a world of plural and changing values. In Ethics, Dewey and James H. Tufts offer an interpretation of different canonical value theories, teleology, deontology and virtue ethics as providing contrasting methodological orientations for identifying, describing and solving problems. Instead of asking which of these approaches best captures “our intuitions” and so should be used as an unvarying standard to guide decision-making in concrete situations, Dewey argues that no one approach constitutes a theoretically adequate guide to how to act in particular situations. Instead, these provide standpoints from which agents can identify and analyze problems, sift important from unimportant considerations, and appraise our raw preferences and alternative plans of action. Conflict among these approaches cannot be resolved in theory, only in practice, if at all, where an agent must make “the best adjustment he can among forces which are genuinely disparate” (“Three Independent Factors in Morals”, MW5, 288). This rejection of fixed moral standard should also not be confused with ethical “neutrality” on Dewey’s part, as we’ll see when we turn to his political theory.

2. Reconstructing Liberalism

Values, Dewey suggests, can be viewed as constructs to solve practical problems. Like an outmoded piece of technology, a past value which was once constructed to address a problem in one set of circumstances can outlive its usefulness, and become a hindrance to the capacity of those in the present to deal with their practical needs and worries. This, Dewey believes, is the case with values of classical liberalism. These have come to block the capacity to resolve social problems in a way compatible with what he takes to be liberalism’s core commitment to individual liberty. It is in this way that “the slogans of liberalism in one period can become the bulwarks of reaction” in the next (“Logical Method and Law”, MW15, 76). He develops this thought in discussing the relation of individual and society, the character and value of freedom, and the scope of legitimate social and political action.

Dewey criticises classical liberalism for conceiving of the individual as “something given, something already there”, prior to society and for viewing social institutions merely as instruments for coordinating the interests of pre-social individuals. Instead, he argues, social institutions are “means for creating individuals” (Reconstruction in Philosophy, MW12, 190-192). In this way, classical liberalism exemplifies what Dewey describes as “the most pervasive fallacy of philosophical thinking” (“Context and Thought”, LW5, 5). This is the tendency to divide up experienced phenomena, and to take the distinct analysed elements to be separate existences, independent both of the analysis and of each other. That this abstraction is in particular circumstances essential for inquiry is an important theme in Dewey’s philosophy. But this abstraction goes wrong “whenever the distinctions or elements that are discriminated are treated as if they were final and self-sufficient” (“Context and Thought”, LW5, 7), as when classical liberalism treats the individual as “something given”. Instead, he argues, a genuine:

liberalism knows that an individual is nothing fixed, given ready-made. It is something achieved, and achieved not in isolation but with the aid and support of conditions, cultural and physical: — including in ‘cultural’, economic, legal and political institutions as well as science and art. (“The Future of Liberalism”, LW11: 291)

The abstraction of the individual from social context in classical liberalism shapes its ethics. If the individual is thought of as existing prior to social institutions, then it is easier to envisage securing freedom for the individual in purely negative terms as solely consisting in the removal of external impediments on individual action, such as legal restrictions on freedom of speech. By contrast, Dewey argues that, while removal of external constraints may often be important for supplying the conditions of liberty, liberty in the sense in which it is a value for liberals does not consist in the mere absence of external constraint. For classical liberalism or “old individualism”, the individual is viewed as surrounded by a protective cordon of rights, which define his or her freedom. Freedom is taken to consist in the absence of some intentional constraint on the individual’s ability to pursue his or her chosen goals. For Dewey, this negative view of freedom is at the root of the wider social, ethical and political defects of this form of individualism (“Religion and Morality in a Free Society”, LW15, 181). What is valuable about freedom is not the negative absence of interference but the positive “power to be an individualized self” (The Public and Its Problems, LW2, 329).

Three features of Dewey’s view of individuality in this sense are most prominent: individuality is reflective, it is social, and it must be exercised in order to be enjoyed. The first point is that freedom is held to consist in the capacity and willingness on the part of a person to reflect on her or his own goals, aims and projects, and to revise them as a result of this reflection. Individuality in what we may call a weak sense is universally possessed and consists in the distinctive patterns of response to the environment that each person displays, “a distinctive way of feeling the impacts of the world and of showing a preferential bias in response to these impacts” (Individualism Old and New, LW5, 121). In the stronger sense in which it is a value for liberals, according to Dewey, individuality consists in the personal capacity for choice, “the most characteristic activity of a self” (Ethics, 2nd edition, LW7, 285). This is not a matter of arbitrarily or whimsically plumping for one option rather than another, for Dewey. Rather, choice that is expressive of individuality in the strong sense involves intelligent criticism of options. Accordingly, we can understand why Dewey claims that “to foresee future objective alternatives and to be able by deliberation to choose one of them and thereby weigh its chances in the struggle for future existence, measures our freedom” (Human Nature and Conduct, MW14, 210). Second, freedom as individuality is social: it is thought to involve participation in shaping the social conditions that bear on individuality. As Dewey puts it in The Public and Its Problems, liberty “is that secure release and fulfilment of personal potentialities which take place only in rich and manifold association with others: the power to be an individualized self making a distinctive contribution and enjoying in its own way the fruits of association” (The Public and Its Problems, LW2, 329). Freedom in its fullest sense, then, is only possible in a canonical form of social order, in which all take part in shaping the conditions of common life. Third, this is what has been called an exercise rather than an opportunity concept of freedom. For some positive theories of liberty, including Dewey’s, it is a necessary condition of an agent’s being free that he or she should actually pursue those ends outlined by that theory as constitutive of the good – that is, he or she should exercise the opportunity: I am in possession of my liberty in this valuable sense for Dewey only if I actually act in these ways.

This account of the character and value of freedom was for Dewey, as for the Idealists and New Liberals that he drew on and for later writers on negative and positive liberty such as Isaiah Berlin, flowed into a debate about the proper scope of social and political action. The classical identification of liberty with negative liberty bolsters the identification of freedom with the sphere of life outside the scope of political action. By contrast, for Dewey the scope of legitimate social and political action had to be determined experimentally: laissez-faire should not be assumed to be the default position for a liberal, according to Dewey, since what he called intelligent social control or social action (rather, it should be noted, than state control) is often a requirement of positive liberty or individuality, in modern industrial conditions. Unsurprisingly, this drew a hostile reception from advocates of a negative concept of liberty such as F. A. Hayek. The identification of freedom with individuality in Dewey’s sense allows the necessary means for achieving individuality to be understood as necessary conditions of freedom. So, for example, throughout his life he argued that education to produce undocile, unservile citizens was essential, in the name of individuality. More pointedly, Dewey argued, particularly in the 1930s, that a socialized economy was necessary for individuality. Dewey drew on a wide range of sources to flesh out his conception of social action or social control, including the utopian Edward Bellamy and British guild socialist G. D. H. Cole. While much of his writing is unstructured and occasional – and spread across many different contexts over a long period – rather than systematic or prescriptive in a very specific way, Dewey supported social reforms that tended to strengthen workers’ rights, including rights to form and join unions, and to take strike action, and the extension of democratic control in the workplace, in the name of freedom as individuality.

Since both positive liberty and the idea of social control have been thought to have worrying authoritarian implications, and Dewey is sometimes thought of as a technocrat, it is worth emphasising the liberal and democratic character of Dewey’s conception of social action. Individuality as an ethical ideal requires that individuals find their own way, and not have particular doctrines or social roles imposed on them. Dewey doesn’t think that the liberal rights protected in the name of individual liberty (such as freedoms of speech, thought, movement, and so on) should be dispensed with. Furthermore, viewing liberty through the prism of individuality only opens up the possibility of political action in the name of liberty, but it does not itself require it. Finally, and in contrast to technocratic critics of laissez-faire such as Walter Lippmann, Dewey argues that an extensive form of democracy is essential for social action, and he vests little faith in experts.

3. Democratic Ideals and Realities

While democracy is the key organising concept of Dewey’s political philosophy, it is one that he thinks of in a very unusual way. As he puts it in Democracy and Education, it is “more than a form of government; it is primarily a mode of associated living, of conjoint communicated experience” (Democracy and Education, MW 9 p. 93). What does Dewey mean by this kind of claim?

One place to start is with Dewey’s most developed and distinctive work in political theory, The Public and Its Problems, which is in part a response to Walter Lippmann’s influential sceptical attack on democratic theory in books such as Public Opinion (1922) and The Phantom Public (1925). Lippmann (who like Dewey was influenced by William James and who shared many philosophical and political commitments with Dewey at an earlier stage of his career) agrees that contemporary moral and political thinking has not caught up with the modern world. Unlike Dewey, however, Lippmann thinks that understanding the complexity and opacity of modernity requires us to set aside the democratic illusion that citizens are “omnicompetent”, and instead embrace the legitimacy of decision-making by qualified experts. The force of this critique of democracy for Dewey in part derives from its deployment of his own intellectual strategy for ends with which he vehemently disagrees. Dewey’s response to this is to point out that experts have their own biases, and need correction from those who have to live with the consequences of their decisions. Although Dewey can sometimes appear to sound dismissive about what he calls the “political machinery” of democracy such as the vote and majority rule, he never regards this as inessential or disposable. At the minimum, for Dewey, this machinery helps to protect individuals from putative experts about where the interests of people lie. A class of experts will inevitably slide into a class whose interests diverge from those of the rest and becomes a committee of oligarchs. So “the strongest point to be made in behalf of even such rudimentary political forms as democracy has attained, popular voting, majority rule and so on, is that to some extent they involve a consultation and discussion which concerns social needs and troubles” (The Public and Its Problems, LW2, p. 364). Taken in isolation, this way of viewing the desirability of democratic political machinery seems instrumental and minimal; instrumental, in that the desirability of democracy derives from its protecting the interests of each individual against the depredations of an elite class, and minimal, in that the rationale for popular participation is limited to the need to keep the elite informed about where the shoe pinches, if its policies are not to be misguided. While Dewey sometimes refers rather scathingly to the “machinery” conception of democracy, he is committed to improving this machinery (by supporting the equal distribution of the franchise, for example) rather than merely dismissing it as unimportant. The real target of his ire is the exclusive identification of democracy with a particular current set of political institutions, particularly only with elections and majority rule. As in the case of the defunct idea of liberalism, Dewey thinks of this as a once liberating conception that now contains an inbuilt conservative bias that prevents more imaginative institutional thinking.

Democracy is more than merely a means to check on political leaders and administrators or call them to account. Dewey thinks that this misses out the importance of democracy for a much wider range of social institutions than this narrow view captures, including the workplace. It is “superficial” to think that “government is located in Washington and Albany. There is government in the family, in business, in the church, in every social group” which regulates the behaviour of its members (“Democracy and Educational Administration”, LW11, 221). The scope of democracy, in the sense of the range of institutions to which it applies, should not be construed narrowly. If our individuality is shaped by the wide range of institutions that make up our social habitat, as Dewey thinks, then the rules and norms governing these institutions are too important to us to be left to chance, dogma, tradition or inherited hierarchy. So restricting democratic scrutiny and control to a single sphere of social life would be a mistake.

Further, as Dewey says, “[d]emocracy is only estimable through the changed conception of intelligence that forms modern science” (“Intelligence and Morals”, MW4, 39); that is, through his conception of inquiry. Democracy is a method for identifying and solving the common problems confronted by communities. democracy is understood as consisting in and as providing the conditions for experimental inquiry. Robust inquiry requires that we must have access to all the available evidence and arguments. If we want our inquiry to be successful, we should not prejudge its outcomes, by excluding sources of experience that allow us to explore and correct our hypotheses. By contrast,

[e]very authoritarian scheme, ... assumes that its value may be assessed by some prior principle, if not of family and birth or race and color or possession of material wealth, then by the position and rank the person occupies in the existing social scheme. The democratic faith in equality is the faith that each individual shall have the chance and opportunity to contribute whatever he is capable of contributing, and that the value of his contribution be decided by its place and function in the organized total of similar contributions: – not on the basis of prior status of any kind whatever. (“Democracy and Educational Administration”, LW11, 220)

Although the “democratic faith” suggests that we are all capable of meaningfully contributing to critical inquiry, the development of habits of intelligent conduct isn’t taken for granted: they can be degraded by social disempowerment, propaganda and ideology. And, as we’ve seen, they are in any case viewed as hard-won achievements of schooling and a generally supportive society.

Democratic societies are thought of as both seeking to attain desirable goals, and arguing over how to do so, and also as arguing over what a desirable goal is. In other words, democratic politics is not simply a channel through which we can assert our interests (as it is for the first argument), but a forum or mode of activity in which we can arrive at a conception of what our interests are. Accordingly, like recent deliberative democrats, Dewey ascribes a central importance to discussion, consultation, persuasion and debate in democratic decision-making. As the experimentalist conception of inquiry insists, this does not imply that we need a priori criteria in order to establish if this process has been successful. Rather, criteria for what counts as a satisfactory solution may be hammered out in the process of searching for one. Democracy is experimental for Dewey in that it allows, or should allow, a profound questioning of the idées fixes of the established order, even if, of course, much democratic politics will not take the form of such questioning.

Dewey views democracy as an ideal of associated life in the sense that as an ideal it reconciles individual and collective interests. As he describes this ideal,

From the standpoint of the individual, it consists in having a responsible share according to capacity in forming and directing the activities of the groups in which one belongs and in participating according to need in the values which the groups sustain. From the standpoint of the groups, it demands liberation of the potentialities of members of a group in harmony with the interests and goods which are common. (The Public and Its Problems, LW2, 327-8)

We can understand Dewey this way. In working out what to do, individuals and groups are confronted by dilemmas about what to do. Some of us (such as a gang of thieves, in Dewey’s example) address these problems in ways that promote certain kinds of growth and development (you can flourish as a thief) but ultimately frustrate their members and their own goals, since these activities inherently generate conflict with other individuals and groups. It is only a democratic community, Dewey believes, which allows each member fully to realize her potentialities without conflict and coercion. For the individual, democracy means having a share in directing the activities of the group, while for the group it demands liberation of the potentialities of the individual members in harmony with their common interests. Yet even at his most optimistic, Dewey doesn’t imagine away differences of opinion, conflicts of interest and value pluralism as ineliminable features of social and political life. Even when his epistemological standards are adhered to, “[d]ifferences of opinion in the sense of differences of judgment as to the course which it is best to follow, the policy which it is best to try out, will still exist” (The Public and Its Problems, LW2, 362). Democracy as public discussion is viewed as the best way of dealing with the conflict of interests in a society:

The method of democracy – inasfar as it is that of organized intelligence – is to bring these conflicts out into the open where their special claims can be discussed and judged in the light of more inclusive interests than are represented by either of them separately. (Liberalism and Social Action, LW11, 56)

4. Legacies

On Dewey’s death, obituarists eulogized him as the authoritative American philosopher of democracy. Both during his life and subsequently, he has been a more controversial figure than this reputation would suggest. In part, this reflects his profile and fecundity. Precisely because he ranged so prominently across such a wide intellectual terrain, Dewey has been a point of reference and target for commentators in all the fields he explored: his educational writings in particular became a default fons et origo of the alleged ills ascribed to schemes of progressive education by their critics. Further, across a long and active career as a public intellectual, Dewey adopted bold and controversial political positions on deeply divisive issues, including (for example) robustly supporting US entry into the First World War and later opposing intervention in the Second World War, which also attracted fierce opprobrium as well as support.

Dewey’s pragmatism was always highly contentious and by the mid-twentieth century to some extent staled in the face of stimulating new research programmes, such as logical empiricism, the Frankfurt School, existentialism, and other approaches. To skeptics in democratic theory, following in the tracks of Lippmann and other of Dewey’s contemporaries such as Reinhold Niebuhr, Dewey’s radical and unconventional idea of democracy is extravagantly optimistic about the epistemic capacities of the individual citizen and of democratic institutions.

The philosopher who probably did the most singlehandedly to promote the recrudescence of interest in Dewey’s thinking after this period of relative marginality, Richard Rorty, found in his work an historically-minded questioning of epistemological foundations and aspirations to a God’s-eye point of view that of course provided fodder for Rorty’s own project. Yet, in relation to political philosophy, Rorty’s skeptical postmodern liberal ironism glossed over the detailed architecture of Dewey’s ethical and political theory, and made very little both of Dewey’s own naturalistic confidence in the mutually supportive and progressive character of scientific method and democracy. Even among those philosophers who have been keen to draw on the pragmatist tradition as a resource for more positively elaborating a political theory than Rorty was inclined to there are important figures, such as Cheryl Misak, who seek foundations for their view elsewhere, notably in Peirce’s view of the precondition of belief, and express doubts about what they see as Dewey’s less clearly grounded ethical commitments. However, others such as Hilary and Ruth Anna Putnam and Philip Kitcher more wholeheartedly identify with, and try to develop, the commitments of Dewey’s pragmatic naturalism, in thinking through the relationship between scientific inquiry, ethics and democracy. In part, recent increased engagement with Dewey’s political philosophy from philosophers across a range of traditions, including epistemic democrats, such as Elizabeth Anderson, and Frankfurt School critical theorists, such as Axel Honneth, flows from an interest in developing a fuller understanding of democracy as a method of social learning. Dewey’s political philosophy remains an important reference point and source of inspiration for thinkers who seek to explore radical forms of democratic liberalism.


As well as identifying sources for Dewey’s primary texts and listing works referred here, this bibliography also contains some books, articles and chapters which can be studied to supplement the current article.

Works by Dewey

  • The Early Works, 1882-1898, 5 volumes, ed. by JoAnn Boydston, Carbondale: Southern Illinois University Press, 1969-1975 (abbreviated here EW, followed by volume number).
  • The Middle Works, 1899-1924, 15 volumes, ed. by JoAnn Boydston, Carbondale: Southern Illinois University Press, 1976-1983 (abbreviated here MW, followed by volume number).
  • The Later Works, 17 volumes, ed. by JoAnn Boydston, Carbondale: Southern Illinois University Press, 1981-1990 (abbreviated here as LW, followed by volume number).
  • Debra Morris and Ian Shapiro (eds.), John Dewey: The Political Writings, Indianapolis: Hackett, 1993.
  • Larry Hickman and Thomas Alexander (eds.), The Essential Dewey (two volumes), Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1999.

Secondary Literature

  • Anderson, Elizabeth, 2006, “The Epistemology of Democracy”, Episteme, 3: 8–22.
  • Bernstein, Richard J., 2010, The Pragmatic Turn, Cambridge: Polity Press.
  • Bohman, James, 1999, “Democracy as Inquiry, Inquiry as Democratic: Pragmatism, Social Science and the Democratic Division of Labor”, American Journal of Political Science, 43: 590–607.
  • Caspary, William R., 2000, Dewey on Democracy, Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • Cochran, Molly, 2010, The Cambridge Companion to Dewey, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Damico, Alfonso, 1978, Individuality and Community: The Social and Political Thought of John Dewey, Gainesville: University Presses of Florida.
  • Farr, James, 1999, “John Dewey and American Political Science”, American Journal of Political Science, 43: 520–541.
  • Fesmire, Steven, 2003, John Dewey and Moral Imagination, Bloomington: Indiana University Press.
  • –––, 2015, Dewey, Abingdon: Routledge.
  • Festenstein, Matthew, 1997, Pragmatism and Political Theory: From Dewey to Rorty, Chicago: Chicago University Press.
  • –––, 2001, “Inquiry as Critique: On the Legacy of Deweyan Pragmatism for Political Theory”, Political Studies, 49: 730–48.
  • –––, 2008, “John Dewey: Inquiry, Ethics and Democracy”, in Cheryl Misak (ed.), Political Studies, Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 87-109.
  • Fott, David, 1998, John Dewey: America’s Philosopher of Democracy, Lanham, Maryland: Rowman and Littlefield.
  • Hickman, Larry (ed.), 1998, John Dewey: Interpretations for a Postmodern Generation, Indianapolis: Indiana University Press.
  • Honneth, Axel, 1998, “Democracy as Reflexive Cooperation: John Dewey and the Theory of Democracy Today”, Political Theory, 26: 763–83.
  • Kadlec, Alison, 2007, Dewey’s Radical Pragmatism, Lanham: Lexington.
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