Normative democratic theory deals with the moral foundations of democracy and democratic institutions, as well as the moral duties of democratic representatives and citizens. It is distinct from descriptive and explanatory democratic theory, which aim to describe and explain how democracy and democratic institutions function. Normative democracy theory aims to provide an account of when and why democracy is morally desirable as well as moral principles for guiding the design of democratic institutions and the actions of citizens and representatives. Of course, normative democratic theory is inherently interdisciplinary and must draw on the results of political science, sociology, psychology, and economics in order to give concrete moral guidance.
This brief outline of normative democratic theory focuses attention on seven related issues. First, it proposes a definition of democracy. Second, it outlines different approaches to the question of why democracy is morally valuable at all. Third, it discusses the issue of whether and when democratic institutions have authority and different conceptions of the limits of democratic authority. Fourth, it explores the question of what it is reasonable to demand of citizens in large democratic societies. This issue is central to the evaluation of normative democratic theories. A large body of opinion has it that most classical normative democratic theory is incompatible with what we can reasonably expect from citizens. Fifth, it surveys different accounts of the proper characterization of equality in the processes of representation and the moral norms of representation. Sixth, it discusses the relationship between central findings in social choice theory and democracy. Seventh, it discusses the question of who should be included in the group that makes democratic decisions.
- 1. Democracy Defined
- 2. The Justification of Democracy
- 2.1 Instrumentalism
- 2.1.1 Instrumental arguments in favor of democracy
- 2.1.2 Instrumental arguments against democracy
- 2.1.3 Grounds for instrumentalism
- 2.2 Non-instrumentalism
- 2.1 Instrumentalism
- 3. The Authority of Democracy
- 3.1 Instrumentalist Conceptions of Democratic Authority
- 3.2 Intrinsic Conceptions of Democratic Authority
- 3.3 Limits to the Authority of Democracy
- 4. The Demands of Democratic Participation
- 4.1 The Problem of Democratic Participation
- 4.2 Proposed Solutions to the Problem of Democratic Participation
- 4.3 The Moral Duties of Democratic Citizens
- 5. Democratic Representation
- 6. Social Choice and Democracy
- 7. The Boundary Problem: Constituting the Demos
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. Democracy Defined
The term “democracy”, as we will use it in this entry, refers very generally to a method of collective decision making characterized by a kind of equality among the participants at an essential stage of the decision-making process. Four aspects of this definition should be noted. First, democracy concerns collective decision making, by which we mean decisions that are made for groups and are meant to be binding on all the members of the group. Second, we intend for this definition to cover many different kinds of groups and decision-making procedures that may be called democratic. So there can be democracy in families, voluntary organizations, economic firms, as well as states and transnational and global organizations. The definition is also consistent with different electoral systems, for example first-past-the-post voting and proportional representation. Third, the definition is not intended to carry any normative weight. It is compatible with this definition of democracy that it is not desirable to have democracy in some particular context. So the definition of democracy does not settle any normative questions. Fourth, the equality required by the definition of democracy may be more or less deep. It may be the mere formal equality of one-person one-vote in an election for representatives to a parliament where there is competition among candidates for the position. Or it may be more robust, including substantive equality in the processes of deliberation and coalition building leading up to the vote. “Democracy” may refer to any of these political arrangements. It may involve direct referenda of the members of a society in deciding on the laws and policies of the society or it may involve the participation of those members in selecting representatives to make the decisions.
The function of normative democratic theory is not to settle questions of definition but to determine which, if any, of the forms democracy may take are morally desirable and when and how. To evaluate different moral justifications of democracy, we must decide on the merits of the different principles and conceptions of human beings and society from which they proceed.
2. The Justification of Democracy
In this section, we examine different views concerning the justification of democracy. Proposed justifications of democracy identify values or reasons that support democracy over alternative forms of decision-making, such as oligarchy or dictatorship. It is important to distinguish views concerning the justification of democracy from views concerning the authority of democracy, which we examine in section 3. Attempts to establish democratic authority identify values or reasons in virtue of which subjects have a duty to obey democratic decisions. Justification and authority can come apart (Simmons 2001: ch. 7)—it is possible to hold that the balance of values or reasons supports democracy over alternative forms of decision-making while denying that subjects have a duty to obey democratic decisions.
We can evaluate the justification of democracy along at least two different dimensions: instrumentally, by reference to the outcomes of using it compared with other methods of political decision; or intrinsically, by reference to values that are inherent in the method.
2.1.1 Instrumental arguments in favor of democracy
Two kinds of in instrumental benefits are commonly attributed to democracy: (1) the production of relatively good laws and policies and (2) improvements in the characters of the participants.
220.127.116.11 The production of relatively good laws and policies: responsiveness theories
It is often argued that democratic decision-making best protects subjects’ rights or interests because it is more responsive to their judgments or preferences than competing forms of government. John Stuart Mill, for example, argues that since democracy gives each subject a share of political power, democracy forces decision-makers to take into account the rights and interests of a wider range of subjects than are taken into account under aristocracy or monarchy (Mill 1861: ch. 3). There is some evidence that as groups are included in the democratic process, their interests are better advanced by the political system. For example, when African Americans regained the right to vote in the United States in 1965, they were able to secure many more benefits from the state than previously (Wright 2013). Economists argue that democracy promotes economic growth (Acemoglu et al. 2019). Several contemporary authors defend versions of this instrumental argument by pointing to the robust empirical correlation between well-functioning democratic institutions and the strong protection of core liberal rights, such as rights to a fair trial, bodily integrity, freedom of association, and freedom of expression (Gaus 1996: ch. 13; Christiano 2011; Gaus 2011: ch. 22).
A related instrumental argument for democracy is provided by Amartya Sen, who argues that
no substantial famine has ever occurred in any independent country with a democratic form of government and a relatively free press. (Sen 1999: 152)
The basis of this argument is that politicians in a multiparty democracy with free elections and a free press have incentives to respond to the expressions of needs of the poor.
18.104.22.168 The production of relatively good laws and policies: epistemic theories
Epistemic justifications of democracy argue that, under the right conditions, democracy is generally more reliable than alternative methods at producing political decisions that are correct according to procedure-independent standards. While there are many different explanations for the reliability of democratic decision-making, we outline three of the most prominent explanations here: (1) Condorcet’s Jury Theorem, (2) the effects of cognitive diversity, and (3) information gathering and sharing.
The most prominent explanation for democracy’s epistemic reliability rests on Condorcet’s Jury Theorem (CJT), a mathematical theorem developed by eighteenth-century mathematician the Marquis de Condorcet that builds on the so-called “law of large numbers”. CJT states that, when certain assumptions hold, the probability that a majority of voters support the correct decision increases and approaches one as the number of voters increases. The assumptions are (Condorcet 1785):
- each voter is more likely than not to identify the correct decision (the competence assumption);
- voters vote for what they believe is the correct decision (the sincerity assumption);
- votes are statistically independent of one another (the independence assumption).
While Condorcet’s original proof was restricted to decisions with only two choices, more recent work argues that CJT can be extended to decisions with three or more choices (List & Goodin 2001). The use of CJT to explain democracy’s reliability is often thought to originate with Jean-Jacques Rousseau’s claim that
[i]f, when a sufficiently informed populace deliberates, the citizens were to have no communication among themselves, the general will would always result from the large number of small differences, and the deliberation would always be good. (Rousseau 1762: Book III, ch. IV)
Contemporary theorists continue to rely on CJT, or variants of it, to justify democracy (Barry 1965; Cohen 1986; Grofman and Feld 1988; Goodin & Spiekermann 2019).
The appeal of CJT for epistemic democrats derives from the fact that, if its underlying assumptions are satisfied, decisions produced by even moderately-sized electorates are almost certain to be correct. For example, if the assumptions of CJT hold for an electorate of 10,000 voters, and if each voter is 51 percent likely to identify the correct decision of two options, then the probability that a majority will select the correct decision is 99.97 percent. The formal mathematics of CJT are not subject to dispute. However, critics of CJT-based arguments for democracy argue that the assumptions underlying CJT are rarely, if ever, satisfied in actual democracies (see Black 1963: 159–65; Ladha 1992; Estlund 1997b; 2008: ch. XII; Anderson 2006). First, many have remarked that voters’ opinions are not independent of each other. Indeed, the democratic process seems to emphasize persuasion and coalition building. Second, the theorem does not seem to apply to cases in which the information that voters have access to, and on the basis of which they make their judgments, is segmented in various ways. Segmentation occurs when some sectors of the society do not have the relevant information while others do have it. Modern societies and politics seem to instantiate this kind of segmentation in terms of class, race, ethnic groupings, religion, occupational position, geographical place and so on. Finally, all voters approach issues they have to make decisions on with strong ideological biases that undermine the claim that each voter is bringing a kind of independent observation on the nature of the common good to the vote.
Advocates of CJT-based justifications of democracy generally respond to these sorts of criticisms by attempting to develop variations of CJT with weaker assumptions. These assumptions are more easily satisfied in democracies and so the revised theorems may show that even moderately-sized electorates are almost certain to produce correct decisions (Grofman & Feld 1988; Austen-Smith 1992; Austen-Smith & Banks 1996).
A second common epistemic justification for democracy—which is often traced to Aristotle (Politics, Book II, Ch. 11; see Waldron 1995)—argues that democratic procedures are best able to exploit the underlying cognitive diversity of large groups of citizens to solve collective problems. Since democracy brings a lot of people into the process of decision making, it can take advantage of many sources of information and perspectives in assessing proposed laws and policies. More recently, Hélène Landemore (2013) has drawn on the “diversity-trumps-ability” theorem of Scott Page and Lu Hong (Hong & Page 2004; Page 2007)—which states that a random collection of agents drawn from a large set of limited-ability agents typically outperforms a collection of the very best agents from that same set—to argue that democracy can be expected to produce better decisions than rule by experts. Both Page and Hong’s original theorem and Landemore’s use of it to justify democracy are subject to dispute (see Quirk 2014; Brennan 2014; Thompson 2014; Bajaj 2014).
A third common epistemic justification for democracy relies on the idea that democratic decision-making tends to be more informed than other forms of decision-making about the interests of citizens and the causal mechanisms necessary to advance those interests. John Dewey argues that democracy involves “a consultation and a discussion which uncovers social needs and troubles”. Even if experts know how best to solve collective problems, they need input from the masses to correct their biases tell them where the problems lie (Dewey 1927 [2012: 154–155]; see also Anderson 2006; Knight & Johnson 2011).
22.214.171.124 Character-based arguments
Many have endorsed democracy on the grounds that democracy has beneficial effects on the characters of subjects. Many agree with Mill and Rousseau that democracy tends to make people stand up for themselves more than other forms of rule do because it makes collective decisions depend on their input more than monarchy or aristocracy do. Hence, in democratic societies individuals are encouraged to be more autonomous. Relatedly, by giving citizens a share of control over political-decision-making, democracy cultivates citizens with active and productive characters rather than passive characters. In addition, it has been argued that democracy tends to get people to think carefully and rationally more than other forms of rule because it makes a difference to political outcomes whether they do or not. Finally, some argue that democracy tends to enhance the moral qualities of citizens. When they participate in making decisions, they have to listen to others, they are called upon to justify themselves to others and they are forced to think in part in terms of the interests of others. Some have argued that when people find themselves in this kind of circumstance, they can be expected genuinely to think in terms of the common good and justice. Hence, some have argued that democratic processes tend to enhance the autonomy, rationality, activity, and morality of participants. Since these beneficial effects are thought to be worthwhile in themselves, they count in favor of democracy and against other forms of rule (Mill 1861 [1991: 74]; Elster 1986 [2003: 152]; Hannon 2020).
Some argue in addition that the above effects on character tend to enhance the quality of legislation as well. A society of autonomous, rational, active, and moral decision-makers is more likely to produce good legislation than a society ruled by a self-centered person or a small group of persons who rule over slavish and unreflective subjects. Of course, the soundness of any of the above arguments depends on the truth of the causal theories of the consequences of different institutions.
2.1.2 Instrumental arguments against democracy
Not all instrumental arguments favor democracy. Plato argues that democracy is inferior to various forms of monarchy, aristocracy and even oligarchy on the grounds that democracy tends to undermine the expertise necessary to the proper governance of societies (Plato 1974, Book VI). Most people do not have the kinds of intellectual talents that enable them to think well about the difficult issues that politics involves. But in order to win office or get a piece of legislation passed, politicians must appeal to these people’s sense of what is right or not right. Hence, the state will be guided by very poorly worked out ideas that experts in manipulation and mass appeal use to help themselves win office. Plato argues instead that the state should be ruled by philosopher-kings who have the wisdom and moral character required for good rule. He thus defends a version of what David Estlund calls “epistocracy”, a form of oligarchy that involves rule by experts (Estlund 2003).
Mill defends a form of epistocracy that is sometimes referred to as the “plural voting” scheme (1861: ch. 4). While all rational adults get at least one vote under this scheme, some citizens get a greater number of votes based on satisfying some measure of political expertise. While Mill identifies the relevant measure of expertise in terms of formal education, the plural voting scheme is consistent with other measures. This scheme might be thought to combine the instrumental value of political expertise with the intrinsic value of broad inclusion.
One objection to any form of epistocracy—the demographic objection—holds that any criterion of expertise is likely to select demographically homogeneous individuals who are be biased in ways that undermine their ability to produce political outcomes that promote the general welfare (Estlund 2003).
Hobbes argues that democracy is inferior to monarchy because democracy fosters destabilizing dissension among subjects (Hobbes 1651: chap. XIX). On his view, individual citizens and even politicians are apt not to have a sense of responsibility for the quality of legislation because no one makes a significant difference to the outcomes of decision making. As a consequence, citizens’ concerns are not focused on politics and politicians succeed only by making loud and manipulative appeals to citizens in order to gain more power, but all lack incentives to consider views that are genuinely for the common good. Hence the sense of lack of responsibility for outcomes undermines politicians’ concern for the common good and inclines them to make sectarian and divisive appeals to citizens.
Many contemporary theorists expand on these Platonic and Hobbesian criticisms. A good deal of empirical data shows that citizens of large-scale democracies are ill-informed and apathetic about politics. This makes room for special interests to control the behavior of politicians and use the state for their own limited purposes all the while spreading the costs to everyone. Moreover, there is empirical evidence that democratic citizens often engage in motivated reasoning that unconsciously aims to affirm their existing political identities rather than arrive at correct judgments (Lord, Ross, & Lepper 1979; Bartels 2002; Kahan 2013; Achen & Bartels 2016). Some theorists argue that these considerations justify abandoning democracy altogether, while modest versions of these arguments have been used to justify modification of democratic institutions (Caplan 2007; Somin 2013; Brennan 2016). Relatedly, some theorists argue that rather than having beneficial effects on the characters of subjects as Mill and others argue, democracy actually has deleterious effects on the subjects’ characters and relationships (Brennan 2016: ch. 3).
2.1.3 Grounds for instrumentalism
Pure instrumentalists argue that these instrumental arguments for and against the democratic process are the only bases on which to evaluate the justification of democracy or compare it with other forms of political decision-making. There are a number of different kinds of argument for pure instrumentalism. One kind of argument proceeds from a more general moral theory. For example, classical utilitarianism has no room in its monistic axiology for the intrinsic values of fairness and liberty or the intrinsic importance of an egalitarian distribution of political power. Its sole concern with maximizing utility—understood as pleasure or desire satisfaction—guarantees that it can provide only instrumental arguments for and against democracy.
But one need not be a thoroughgoing utilitarian to argue for instrumentalism in democratic theory. There are arguments in favor of instrumentalism that pertain directly to the question of democracy and collective decision making generally. One argument states that political power involves the exercise of power of some over others. And it argues that the exercise of power of one person over another can only be justified by reference to the protection of the interests or rights of the person over whom power is exercised. Thus no distribution of political power could ever be justified except by reference to the quality of outcomes of the decision making process (Arneson 1993 [2002: 96–97]; 2003; 2004; 2009). Another sort of argument for instrumentalism proceeds negatively, attempting to show that the non-instrumental values most commonly used in attempted justifications for democracy do not actually justify democracy, and that an instrumental justification for democracy is therefore the only available sort of justification (Wall 2007).
Other arguments question the coherence of the idea of intrinsically fair collective decision making processes. For instance, social choice theory questions the idea that there can be a fair decision making function that transforms a set of individual preferences into a rational collective preference. The core objection is that no general rule satisfying reasonable constraints can be devised that can transform any set of individual preferences into a rational social preference. And this is taken to show that democratic procedures cannot be intrinsically fair (Riker 1982: 116). Ronald Dworkin argues that the idea of equality, which is for him at the root of social justice, cannot be given a coherent and plausible interpretation when it comes to the distribution of political power among members of the society. The relation of politicians to citizens inevitably gives rise to inequality; the process of democratic deliberation inevitably gives those with superior argument making abilities and greater willingness to participate more influence and therefore more power, than others, so equality of political power cannot be intrinsically fair or just (Dworkin 2000). In later work, Dworkin has pulled back from this originally thoroughgoing instrumentalism (Dworkin 1996).
Few theorists deny that political institutions must be at least in part evaluated in terms of the outcomes of having those institutions. Some argue in addition, that some forms of decision making are morally desirable independent of the consequences of having them. A variety of different approaches have been used to show that democracy has this kind of intrinsic value.
One prominent justification for democracy appeals to the value of liberty. According to one version of the view, democracy is grounded in the idea that each ought to be master of his or her life. Each person’s life is deeply affected by the larger social, legal and cultural environment in which he or she lives. Only when each person has an equal voice and vote in the process of collective decision-making will each have equal control over this larger environment. Thinkers such as Carol Gould conclude that only when some kind of democracy is implemented, will individuals have a chance at self-government (Gould 1988: 45–85). Since individuals have a right of self-government, they have a right to democratic participation. The idea is that the right of self-government gives one a right, within limits, to do wrong. Just as an individual has a right to make some bad decisions for himself or herself, so a group of individuals have a right to make bad or unjust decisions for themselves regarding those activities they share.
One major difficulty with this line of argument is that it appears to require that the basic rule of decision-making be consensus or unanimity. If each person must freely choose the outcomes that bind him or her then those who oppose the decision are not self-governing. They live in an environment imposed on them by others. So only when all agree to a decision are they freely adopting the decision (Wolff 1970: ch. 2). The trouble is that there is rarely agreement on major issues in politics. Indeed, it appears that one of the main reasons for having political decision making procedures is that they can settle matters despite disagreement.
One liberty-based argument that might seem to escape this worry appeals to an irreducibly collective right to self-determination. It is often argued that political communities have a right as a community to organize themselves politically in accordance with their values, principles, or commitments. Some argue that the right to collective self-determination requires democratic institutions that give citizens collective control over their political and legal structure (Cassese 1995). However, many argue democratic institutions are sufficient but not necessary to realize the right to collective self-determination because political communities might exercise this right to implement non-democratic institutions (Altman & Wellman 2009; Stilz 2016).
2.2.2 Democracy as public justification
Another non-instrumental justification of democracy appeals to the ideal of public justification. The idea behind this approach is that laws and policies are legitimate to the extent that they are publicly justified to the citizens of the community. Public justification is justification to each citizen as a result of free and reasoned debate among equals.
Jürgen Habermas’s discourse theory of deliberative democracy has been highly influential in the development of this approach. Habermas analyses the form and function of modern legal systems through the lens of his theory of communicative action. This analysis yields the Democratic Principle:
[O]nly those statutes may claim legitimacy that can meet with the assent of all citizens in a discursive process of legislation that in turn has been legally constituted. (Habermas 1992 [1996: 110])
Habermas advances a conception of democratic legitimacy according to which law is legitimate only if it results from a free and inclusive democratic process of “opinion and will-formation”. What might such a process look like in a complex and differentiated society? Habermas answers by advancing a “two-track” model that understands democratic legitimation in terms of the relationship between institutionalized deliberative bodies (e.g legislatures, agencies, courts) and informal communication in the public sphere, which is “wild”, and not centrally coordinated.
One possible objection to this view is that free and inclusive democratic procedures are insufficient to satisfy the demand for deliberative consensus embodied in the Democratic Principle. This demand is unlikely to be satisfied in diverse societies, since deep disagreements about which laws ought to be enacted is likely to remain after the relevant process of opinion and will-formation. The Democratic Principle might thus be thought to embody an overly idealistic conception of democratic legitimacy (Estlund 2008: ch.10). Another possible worry is that the Discourse Principle is not a genuine moral principle, but a principle that embodies the felicity conditions of practical discourse. As such, the Discourse Principle cannot ground a conception of democratic legitimacy that yields robust moral prescriptions (Forst 2016).
Drawing on Habermas and John Rawls, among others, Joshua Cohen (1996 ) develops a conception of democracy in which citizens justify laws and policies on the basis of mutually acceptable reasons. Democracy, properly understood, is the context in which individuals freely engage in a process of reasoned discussion and deliberation on an equal footing. The ideas of freedom and equality provide guidelines for structuring democratic institutions.
The aim of Cohen’s conception of democracy as public justification is reasoned consensus among citizens. But a serious problem arises when we ask about what happens when disagreement remains. Two possible replies have been suggested. It has been urged that forms of consensus weaker than full consensus are sufficient for public justification and that the weaker varieties are achievable in many societies. For instance, there may be consensus on the list of reasons that are acceptable publicly but disagreement on the weight of the different reasons. Or there may be agreement on general reasons abstractly understood but disagreement about particular interpretations of those reasons. What would have to be shown here is that such weak consensus is achievable in many societies and that the disagreements that remain are not incompatible with the ideal of public justification.
The basic principle seems to be the principle of reasonableness according to which reasonable persons will only offer principles for the regulation of their society that other reasonable persons can reasonably accept. One only offers principles that others, who restrain themselves in the same way, can accept. Such a principle implies a kind of principle of restraint which requires that reasonable persons avoid proposing laws and policies on the basis of controversial moral or philosophical principles. When individuals offer proposals for the regulation of their society, they ought not to appeal to the whole truth as they see it but only to that part of the whole truth that others can reasonably accept. To put the matter in the way Rawls puts it: political society must be regulated by principles on which there is an overlapping consensus (Rawls 2005: Lecture IV). This is meant to obviate the need for a complete consensus on the principles that regulate society.
However, it is hard to see how this approach avoids the need for a complete consensus, which is highly unlikely to occur in any even moderately diverse society. The reason for this is that it is not clear why it is any less of an imposition on me when I propose legislation or policies for the society that I must restrain myself to considerations that other reasonable people accept than it is an imposition on others when I attempt to pass legislation on the basis of reasons they reasonably reject. For if I do restrain myself in this way, then the society I live in will not live up to the standards that I believe are essential to evaluating the society. I must then live in and support a society that does not accord with my conception of how it ought to be organized. It is not clear why this is any less of a loss of control over society than for those who must live in a society that is partly regulated by principles they do not accept. If one is a problem, then so is the other, and complete consensus is the only solution (Christiano 2009).
Many democratic theorists have argued that democracy is a way of treating persons as equals when there is good reason to impose some kind of organization on their shared lives but they disagree about how best to do it. Peter Singer argues that when people insist on different ways of arranging matters properly, each person in a sense claims a right to be dictator over their shared lives (Singer 1973: 30–41). But these claims to dictatorship cannot all hold up. Democracy embodies a kind of peaceful and fair compromise among these conflicting claims to rule. Each compromises equally on what he claims as long as the others do, resulting in each having an equal say over decision making. In effect, democratic decision making respects each person’s point of view on matters of common concern by giving each an equal say about what to do in cases of disagreement (Singer 1973; Waldron 1999: chap. 5).
What if people disagree on the democratic method or on the particular form democracy is to take? Are we to decide these latter questions by means of a higher order procedure? And if there is disagreement on the higher order procedure, must we also democratically decide that question? The view seems to lead to an infinite regress.
An alternative way of justifying democracy on the basis of equality is to ground democracy in public equality. Public equality is a principle of equality which ensures that people can see that they are being treated as equals. This view arises from three ideas. First, there is the basic egalitarian idea that people’s interests ought to be equally advanced, or at least that they ought to have equal opportunities to advance them. Second, human beings generally have highly fallible and biased understandings of their own and other people’s interests. Third, persons have fundamental interests in being able to see that they are being treated as equals. Public equality is an egalitarian principle that can be seen to be realized among persons despite the dramatically incomplete forms of knowledge people have. It is not all of justice, but it is essential that the principle be realized in a pluralistic society.
Democracy is a uniquely publicly egalitarian way to make collective decisions when there is substantial disagreement and conflict of interest among persons about how to shape the society they share. Each can see that the only plausible way of overcoming persistent disagreement over how to shape the society they all live in, while still publicly treating all persons as equals in the face of bias and fallibility, is to give each person an equal say in the process of shaping that society. Thus, democracy is necessary to the realization of public equality in a political society. Within the framework determined by this publicly realized equality, persons are permitted to attempt to bring about their more particular ideas about justice and the common good that they think are right.
The idea of public equality also grounds limits to democratic decision making. The thought is that a society cannot democratically decide to abolish the democratic rights of some of its members. Public equality also requires that basic liberal and civil rights be respected as well, by the democratic process and so serves as a limit to democratic decision making (Christiano 2008; Valentini 2013).
A number of worries attend this kind of view. First, it is generally thought that majority rule is required for treating persons as equals in collective decision making. This is because only majority rule is neutral towards alternatives in decision making. Unanimity tends to favor the status quo as do various forms of supermajority rule. But if this is so, the above view raises the twin dangers of majority tyranny and of persistent minorities, i.e., groups of persons who find themselves always losing in majority decisions. Surely these latter phenomena must be incompatible with public equality. Second, the kind of view defended above is susceptible to the worry that political equality is not a coherent ideal in any modern state with a complex division of labor and the need for representation. This last worry will be discussed in more detail in the next sections on democratic citizenship and legislative representation. The first worry will be discussed more in the discussion on the limits to democratic authority.
A related approach grounds democracy in the ideal of relational equality. A concern with relational equality is a concern for
human relationships that are, in certain crucial respects at least, unstructured by differences of rank, power, or status. (Scheffler 2010: 225)
Niko Kolodny argues that democratic institutions are an essential component of relational equality (Kolodny 2014a,b). One line of Kolodny’s argument holds that political decisions involve the use of coercive force. Inequalities in the power to use force undermine equal social status at least in part because the power to use force is “the power that usually determines the distribution of other powers” (Kolodny 2014b: 307). Individuals who have superior power to use force on others have a superior social status. An egalitarian distribution of political power is thus essential for realizing social equality. And only democratic institutions provide an egalitarian distribution of political power. We will discuss the relationship between relational equality and democracy further when we discuss the authority of democracy in Part 3 below.
3. The Authority of Democracy
Since democracy is a collective decision process, the question naturally arises about whether there is any duty of citizens to obey democratic decisions when they disagree with it.
There are three main concepts of the legitimate authority of the state. First, a state has legitimate authority to the extent that it is morally justified in coercively imposing its rule on the members. Legitimate authority on this account has no direct implications concerning the obligations or duties that citizens may hold toward that state. It simply says that if the state is morally justified in doing what it does, then it has legitimate authority. Second, a state has legitimate authority to the extent that its directives generate duties in citizens to obey. The duties of the citizens need not be owed to the state but they are real duties to obey. The third is that the state has a right to rule that is correlated with the citizens’ duty to it to obey it. This is the strongest notion of authority and it seems to be the core idea behind the legitimacy of the state. The idea is that when citizens disagree about law and policy it is important to be able to answer the question, who has the right to choose?
3.1 Instrumentalist Conceptions of Democratic Authority
Instrumental arguments for democracy give some reason for why one ought to respect the democracy when one disagrees with its decisions. There may be many instrumental considerations that play a role in deciding on the question of whether one ought to obey. And these instrumental considerations are pretty much the same whether one is considering obedience to democracy or some other form of rule.
There is one instrumentalist approach which is quite unique to democracy and that seems to ground a strong conception of democratic authority. That is the epistemic approach inspired by the Condorcet Jury Theorem, which we discussed in section 126.96.36.199 above. There, we discussed a number of difficulties with the application of the Condorcet Jury Theorem to the case of voting in elections and referenda in large-scale democracies, including lack of independence, informational segmentation, and the existence of ideological biases.
One further worry about the Jury Theorem’s epistemic conceptions of authority is that it would prove too much since it undermines the common practice of the loyal opposition in democracies. If the background conditions of the Jury Theorem are met, a large-scale democracy majority is practically certain to produce the right decisions. On what basis can citizens in a political minority rationally hold on to their competing views? The members of the minority have a powerful reason for shifting their allegiance to the majority position, since each has very good reason to think that the majority is right. The epistemic conception of authority based on the Jury Theorem thus threatens to be objectionably authoritarian, since it looks like it demands not only obedience of action but obedience of thought as well. Even in scientific communities the fact that a majority of scientists favor a particular view does not make the minority scientists think that they are wrong, though it does perhaps give them pause (Goodin 2003: ch. 7).
Some theories of democratic authority combine instrumental and non-instrumental considerations. David Estlund argues that democratic procedures have legitimate authority because they are better than random and epistemically the best of the political systems that are acceptable to all reasonable citizens (Estlund 2008). They must be better than random because, otherwise, why wouldn’t we use a fair random procedure like a lottery or coin flip? Democratic authority must have an epistemic element. And the justification of democratic procedure must be acceptable to all reasonable citizens in order to respect their freedom and equality. Estlund’s conception of democratic authority—which he calls “epistemic proceduralism”— thus combines the ideal of public justification with a concern for the tendency of democracies to produce good decisions.
3.2 Intrinsic Conceptions of Democratic Authority
3.2.1 Democracy as collective self-rule
Some theorists argue that there is a special relation between democracy and legitimate authority grounded in the value of collective self-rule. John Locke argues that when a person consents to the creation of a political society, they necessarily consent to the use of majority rule in deciding how the political society is to be organized (Locke 1690: sec. 96). Locke thinks that majority rule is the natural decision rule when there is disagreement. He argues that a society is a kind of collective body that must move in the direction of the greater force. One way to understand this argument is as follows. If we think of each member of society as an equal and if we think that there is likely to be disagreement beyond the question of whether to join society or not, then we must accept majority rule as the appropriate decision rule. This interpretation of the greater force argument assumes that the expression “greater force” is to be understood in terms of the equal worth of each person’s interests and rights, so the society must go in the direction in which the greater number of persons wants it to go.
Locke thinks that a people, which is formed by individuals who consent to be members, could choose a monarchy by means of majority rule and so this argument by itself does not give us an argument for democracy. But Locke refers back to this argument when he defends the requirement of representative institutions for deciding when property may be regulated and taxes levied. He argues that a person must consent to the regulation or taxation of his property by the state. But he says that this requirement of consent is satisfied when a majority of the representatives of property holders consent to the regulation and taxation of property (Locke, 1690: sec. 140). This does seem to be moving towards a genuinely democratic conception of legitimate authority.
Rousseau argues that when individuals consent to form a political community, they agree to put themselves under the direction of the “general will” (Rousseau 1762). The general will is not a mere aggregation of individuals’ private wills. It is, rather, the will of the political community as a whole. And since the general will can only emerge as the product of a properly organized democratic procedure, individuals consent to put themselves under the direction of a properly organized democratic procedure. On one interpretation of Rousseau, democratic procedures are properly organized only when they (1) define rights that apply equally to all, (2) via a procedure that considers everyone’s interests equally, and (3) everyone who is coerced to obey the laws has a voice in that procedure.
There are at least two ways of understanding the idea of the general will. On what might be called the constitutive interpretation, the general will is constituted by the results of a properly organized democratic procedure. That is, the results of a properly organized democratic procedure are the general will in virtue of the fact that they emerge from a properly organized democratic procedure, and not because they reflect some procedure-independent truth about the common good. On what might be called the epistemic interpretation, the results of a properly organized democratic procedure are the way of tracking the procedure-independent truth about the common good. As we discussed in section 3.1, Rousseau is often interpreted as appealing to Condorcet’s Jury Theorem to support the epistemic credentials of a properly organized democratic procedure.
3.2.2 Freedom and democratic authority
Anna Stilz develops an account of democratic authority that appeals to the value of “freedom as independence” (Stilz 2009). Freedom as independence is freedom from being subject to the will of another. In order not to be subject to the will of others, individuals need property rights and a protected sphere of autonomy to pursue one’s plans. Drawing on Kant, Stilz argues that attempts by particular individuals, no matter how conscientious, to define and secure rights to property and autonomy in a state of nature will be inconsistent with freedom as independence. Such attempts unilaterally impose new obligations on others through acts of private will in the face of competing claims. But even if individuals in a state of nature do agree to a resolution of their competing claims, they are dependent on the will of others to honor this agreement. Stilz thus argues that justice must be administered by an authoritative legal system which can coercively impose one set of objective rules—rules we must respect even when we disagree—to adjudicate our conflicting claims. But if such a system is to be consistent with the freedom of subjects, it cannot be imposed by the private wills of rulers. The solution, Stilz argues, lies in Rousseau’s idea of the general will. When subjects obey the general will, they are not obeying the private will of any individual; they are obeying a will that arises from all and applies to all.
One worry with this account is that those who oppose democratically-enacted laws or policies can complain that those laws or policies are imposed against their will. Perhaps they are not subject to the will of a particular individual, but they are subject to the will of a majority. This might be thought to constitute a significant threat to individuals’ freedom as independence. Another worry, which Stilz’s view arguably inherits from Rousseau, is that the conditions for the general will to emerge are so demanding that the view implies that no state that exists or has existed has legitimate political authority. Stilz’s view might thus be thought to entail what A.J. Simmons calls “a posteriori anarchism” (Simmons 2001).
3.2.3 Equality and authority
Another approach to democratic authority asserts that failing to obey the decisions of a democratic assembly amounts to treating one’s fellow citizens as inferiors (Christiano 2008: ch. 6). In the face of disagreement about substantive law and policy, democracy realizes a kind of public equality by giving each individual an equal say in determining which laws or policies will be enacted. Citizens who skirt laws made by suitably egalitarian procedures act contrary to the equal right of all citizens to have a say in making laws. Those who refuse to pay taxes or respect property laws on the grounds that they are unjust are affirming a superior right to that of others in determining how the shared aspects of social life ought to be arranged. Thus, they violate the duty to treat others publicly as equals. And there is reason to think this duty must normally have some pre-eminence. Public equality is the most important form of equality and democracy is required by public equality. The other forms of equality in play in substantive disputes about law and policy are ones about which people can have reasonable disagreements (within limits specified by the principle of public equality). Citizens thus have obligations to abide by the democratic process even if their favored conceptions of justice or equality are passed by in the decision making process.
Daniel Viehoff develops an egalitarian conception of democratic authority based on the ideal of relational equality (Viehoff 2014; see section 2.2.3 above for more on relational equality). Viehoff argues that relational equality is threatened by “subjection” in a relationship, which occurs when individuals have significantly different power over how they interact with and relate to one another. According to Viehoff, obeying the outcomes of egalitarian democratic procedures is necessary and sufficient for citizens to achieve coordination on common rules without subjection. It is sufficient because democratic procedures distribute decision-making power equally, which ensures that coordination is not determined by unequal power advantages. It is necessary because parties must set aside the considerations of greater and lesser power to realize non-subjection in their relationship.
Fabienne Peter develops a fairness-based conception of democratic authority that incorporates epistemic considerations (Peter 2008; 2009). Drawing on insights from proceduralist epistemology, Peter’s “pure epistemic proceduralism” holds that suitably egalitarian democratic decisions are binding at least in part because they result from a fair procedure of knowledge-production. This account differs from Estlund’s epistemic proceduralism (see section 5.1 above) because it does not condition the authority of democratic procedures on their ability to produce decisions that track the procedure-independent truth. Rather, the authority of democratic procedures is grounded in their fairness. And it differs from pure procedural accounts because the relevant notion of fairness is fairness in knowledge-production.
3.3 Limits to the Authority of Democracy
What are the limits to democratic authority? A limit to democratic authority is a principle violation of which defeats democratic authority. When the principle is violated by the democratic assembly, the assembly loses its authority in that instance or the moral weight of the authority is overridden. A number of different views have been offered on this issue. We can distinguish between internal and external limits to democratic authority. An internal limit arises from the constitutive requirements of the democratic process or from the principles that ground democracy. An external limit arises from principles that are independent of the values or requirements that ground democracy.
External limits to democratic authority are rebutting limits, which are principles that weigh against—and may sometimes outweigh the principles that ground democracy. So in a particular case, an individual may see that there are reasons to obey the assembly and some reasons against obeying the assembly and in the case at hand the reasons against obedience outweigh the reasons in favor of obedience. Internal limits to democratic authority are undercutting limits. These limits function not by weighing against the considerations in favor of authority, they undercut the considerations in favor of authority altogether; they simply short circuit the authority. When an undercutting limit is in play, it is not as if the principles which ground the limit outweigh the reasons for obeying the democratic assembly, it is rather that the reasons for obeying the democratic assembly are undermined altogether; they cease to exist or at least they are severely weakened.
3.3.1 Internal limits to democratic authority
Some have argued that the democratic process ought to be limited to decisions that are not incompatible with the proper functioning of the democratic process. So they argue that the democratic process may not legitimately take away the political rights of its citizens in good standing. It may not take away rights that are necessary to the democratic process such as freedom of association or freedom of speech. But these limits do not extend beyond the requirements for proper democratic functioning. They do not protect non political artistic speech or freedom of association in the case of non political activities (Ely 1980: chap. 4).
Another kind of internal limit is a limit that arises from the principles that underpin democracy. And the presence of this limit would seem to be necessary to making sense of the first limit because in order for the first limit to be morally important we need to know why a democracy ought to protect the democratic process.
Locke gives an account of the internal limits of democracy in his idea that there are certain things to which a citizen may not consent (Locke 1690: ch. XI). She may not consent to arbitrary rule or the violation of fundamental rights including democratic and liberal rights. Since consent is the basis of democratic authority for Locke, this account provides an explanation of the idea behind the first internal limit, that democracy may not be suspended by democratic means but it goes beyond that limit to suggest that rights that are not essentially connected with the exercise of the franchise may also not be violated because one may not consent to their violation.
More recently, Ronald Dworkin has defended an account of the limits of democratic authority (Dworkin 1996). He argues that democracy is justified by appeal to a principle of self-government. He argues that self-government cannot be realized unless all citizens are treated as full members of the political community, because, otherwise, they are not able to identify as members of the community. Among the conditions of full membership, he argues, are rights to be treated as equals and rights to have one’s moral independence respected. These principles support robust requirements of non-discrimination and of basic liberal rights.
The conception of democratic authority that grounds it in public equality also provides an account of the limits of that authority (Christiano 2008: ch. 6). Since democracy is founded in public equality, it may not violate public equality in any of its decisions. The basic idea is that overt violation of public equality by a democratic assembly undermines the claim that the democratic assembly embodies public equality. Democracy’s embodiment of public equality is conditional on its protecting public equality. To the extent that liberal rights are grounded in public equality and the provision of an economic minimum is also so grounded, this suggests that democratic rights and liberal rights and rights to an economic minimum create a limit to democratic authority. This account also provides a deep grounding for the kinds of limits to democratic authority defended in the first internal limit and it goes beyond these to the extent that protection of rights that are not connected with the exercise of the franchise is also necessary to public equality.
3.3.2 The problem of persistent minorities
This account of the authority of democracy also provides some help with a vexing problem of democratic theory. This problem is the difficulty of persistent minorities. There is a persistent minority in a democratic society when that minority always loses in the voting. This is always a possibility in democracies because of the use of majority rule. If the society is divided into two or more highly unified voting blocks in which the members of each group votes in the same ways as all the other members of that group, then the group in the minority will find itself always on the losing end of the votes. This problem has plagued some societies, particularly those with indigenous peoples who live within developed societies. Though this problem is often connected with majority tyranny it is distinct from the problem of majority tyranny because it may be the case that the majority attempts to treat the minority well, in accordance with its conception of good treatment. It is just that the minority never agrees with the majority on what constitutes proper treatment. Being a persistent minority can be highly oppressive even if the majority does not try to act oppressively. This can be understood with the help of the very ideas that underpin democracy. Persons have interests in being able to correct for the cognitive biases of others and to be able to make the world in such a way that it makes sense to them. These interests are set back for a persistent minority since they never get their way.
The conception of democracy as grounded in public equality can shed light on this problem. It can say that the existence of a persistent minority violates public equality (Christiano 2008: chap. 7). In effect, a society in which there is a persistent minority is one in which that minority is being treated publicly as an inferior because it is clear that its fundamental interests are being set back. Hence to the extent that violations of public equality undercut the authority of a democratic assembly, the existence of a persistent minority undermines the authority of the democracy at least with respect to the minority. This suggests that certain institutions ought to be constructed so that the minority is not persistent.
3.3.3 External limits to democratic authority
One natural kind of limit to democratic authority is the external kind of limit. Here the idea is that there are certain considerations that favor democratic decision making and there are certain values that are independent of democracy that may be at issue in democratic decisions. For example, many theories recognize core liberal rights—such as rights to property, bodily integrity, and freedom of thought and expression—as external limits to democratic authority. Locke is often interpreted as arguing that individuals have natural rights to property in themselves and the external world that democratic laws must respect in order to have legitimate authority (Locke 1690).
Some views may assert that there are only external limits to democratic authority. But it is possible to think that there are both internal and external limits. Such an issue may arise in decisions to go to war, for example. In such decisions, one may have a duty to obey the decision of the democratic assembly on the grounds that this is how one treats one’s fellow citizens as equals but one may also have a duty to oppose the war on the grounds that the war is an unjust aggression against other people. To the extent that this consideration is sufficiently serious it may outweigh the considerations of equality that underpin democratic authority. Thus one may have an overall duty not to obey in this context. Issues of foreign policy in general seem to give rise to possible external limits to democracy.
4. The Demands of Democratic Participation
In this section, we examine the demands of participation in large-scale democracies. We begin by examining a core challenge to the idea that democratic citizens are capable of governing a large and complex society. We then explore different proposed solutions to the core challenge. Finally, we examine the moral duties of democratic citizens in large-scale democracies in light of the core challenge.
4.1 The Problem of Democratic Participation
A vexing problem of democratic theory has been to determine whether ordinary citizens are up to the task of governing a large and complex society. There are three distinct problems here:
- 1. First, Plato argued that some people are more intelligent and informed about political matters than others and have a superior moral character, and that those persons ought to rule (The Republic, Book VI)
- 2. Second, others have argued that a society must have a division of labor. If everyone were engaged in the complex and difficult task of politics, little time or energy would be left for the other essential tasks of a society. Conversely, if we expect most people to engage in other difficult and complex tasks, how can we expect them to have the time and resources sufficient to devote themselves intelligently to politics?
- 3. Third, since individuals have so little impact on the outcomes of political decision making in large societies, they have little sense of responsibility for the outcomes. Some have argued that it is not rational to vote since the chances that an individual’s vote will a decide the outcome of an election (i.e., will determine whether a candidate gets elected or not) are nearly indistinguishable from zero. For example, one widely accepted estimate puts the odds of an individual casting the deciding vote in a United States presidential election at 1 in 100 million. Many estimates put the odds much lower. Worse still, Anthony Downs has argued that almost all of those who do vote have little reason to become informed about how best to vote (Downs 1957: ch.13). On the assumption that citizens reason and behave roughly according to the Downsian model, either the society must in fact be run by a relatively small group of people with minimal input from the rest or it will be very poorly run. As we can see these criticisms are echoes of the sorts of criticisms Plato and Hobbes made.
These observations pose challenges for any robustly egalitarian or deliberative conception of democracy. Without the ability to participate intelligently in politics one cannot use one’s votes to advance one’s aims nor can one be said to participate in a process of reasoned deliberation among equals. So, either equality of political power implies a kind of self-defeating equal participation of citizens in politics or a reasonable division of labor seems to undermine equality of power. And either substantial participation of citizens in public deliberation entails the relative neglect of other tasks or the proper functioning of the other sectors of the society requires that most people do not participate intelligently in public deliberation.
4.2 Proposed Solutions to the Problem of Democratic Participation
4.2.1 Elite theory of democracy
Some modern theorists of democracy, called elite theorists, have argued against any robustly egalitarian or deliberative forms of democracy in light of the problem of democratic participation. They argue that high levels of citizen participation tend to produce bad legislation designed by demagogues to appeal to poorly informed and overly emotional citizens. They look upon the alleged uninformedness of citizens evidenced in many empirical studies in the 1950s and 1960s as perfectly reasonable and predictable. Indeed they regard the alleged apathy of citizens in modern states as highly desirable social phenomena.
Political leaders are to avoid divisive and emotionally charged issues and make policy and law with little regard for the fickle and diffuse demands made by ordinary citizens. Citizens participate by voting but since they know very little they are not effectively the ruling part of the society. The process of election is usually just a fairly peaceful way of maintaining or changing those who rule (Schumpeter 1942 [1950: 269]).
On Schumpeter’s view, however, citizens do have a role to play in avoiding serious disasters. When politicians act in ways that nearly anyone can see is problematic, the citizens can throw the bums out.
So the elite theory of democracy does seem compatible with some of the instrumentalist arguments given above but it is strongly opposed to the intrinsic arguments from liberty, public justification and equality. To be sure, there can be an elite deliberative democracy wherein elites deliberate, perhaps even out of sight of the population at large, on how to run the society.
A view akin to the elite theory but less pessimistic about citizens’ political agency and competence argues that a well-functioning representative democracy can function as a kind of “defensible epistocracy” (Landa & Pevnick 2020). This view holds that, under the right conditions, elected officials can be expected to exercise political power more responsibly than citizens in a direct democracy because each official is far more likely to cast the deciding vote in legislative assemblies (the “pivotality effect”) and officials have more incentive to exercise power with due regard for the general welfare (the “accountability effect”). Moreover, under the right conditions, representative democracy allows individuals to assess the competence of candidates for office and to select candidates who are best able to help the community pursue its commitments.
4.2.2 Interest group pluralism
One approach that is in part motivated by the problem of democratic citizenship but which attempts to preserve some elements of equality against the elitist criticism is the interest group pluralist account of politics. Robert Dahl’s early statement of the view is very powerful.
In a rough sense, the essence of all competitive politics is bribery of the electorate by politicians… The farmer… supports a candidate committed to high price supports, the businessman…supports an advocate of low corporation taxes… the consumer…votes for candidates opposed to a sales tax. (Dahl 1959: 69)
In this conception of the democratic process, each citizen is a member of an interest group with narrowly defined interests that are closely connected to their everyday lives. On these subjects citizens are supposed to be quite well informed and interested in having an influence. Or at least, elites from each of the interest groups that are relatively close in perspective to the ordinary members are the principal agents in the process. On this account, democracy is not rule by the majority but rather rule by coalitions of minorities. Policy and law in a democratic society are decided by means of bargaining among the different groups.
This approach is conceivably compatible with the more egalitarian approach to democracy. This is because it attempts to reconcile equality with collective decision making by limiting the tasks of citizens to ones which they are able to perform reasonably well. It is not particularly compatible with the deliberative public justification approach because it takes the democratic process to be concerned essentially with bargaining among the different interest groups where the preferences are not subject to further debate in the society as a whole.
A third approach inspired by the problem of participation may be called the neo-liberal approach to politics favored by public choice theorists such as James Buchanan & Gordon Tullock (1962). Against elite theories, they contend that elites and their allies will tend to expand the powers of government and bureaucracy for their own interests and that this expansion will occur at the expense of a largely inattentive public. For this reason, they argue for severe restrictions on the powers of elites. They argue against the interest group pluralist theorists that the problem of participation occurs within interest groups more or less as much as among the citizenry at large. Only powerful economic interests are likely to succeed in organizing to influence the government and they will do so largely for their own benefit. Since economic elites will advance their own interests in politics while spreading the costs to others, policies will tend to be more costly (because imposed on everyone in society) than they are beneficial (because they benefit only the elites in the interest group.)
Neo-liberals infer that one ought to transfer many of the current functions of the state to the market and limit the state to the enforcement of basic property rights and liberties. These can be more easily understood and brought under the control of ordinary citizens.
But the neo-liberal account of democracy must answer to two large worries. First, citizens in modern societies have more ambitious conceptions of social justice and the common good than are realizable by the minimal state. The neo-liberal account thus implies a very serious curtailment of democracy of its own. More evidence is needed to support the contention that these aspirations cannot be achieved by the modern state. Second, the neo-liberal approach ignores the problem of large private concentrations of wealth and power that are capable of pushing small states around for their own benefit and imposing their wills on populations without their consent.
Somin (2013) also argues that government be significantly reduced in size so that citizens have a lesser knowledge burden to carry. But he calls for government decentralization so that citizens can vote with their feet in favor of or against competing units of government, in effect creating a kind of market in governments among which citizens can choose.
4.2.4 The self-interest assumption
A considerable amount of the literature in political science and the economic theory of the state are grounded in the assumption that individuals act primarily and perhaps even exclusively in their self-interest narrowly construed. The problem of participation and the accounts of the democratic process described above are in large part dependent on this assumption. When the preferences of voters are not assumed to be self-interested the calculations of the value of participation change. For example, if a person is a motivated utilitarian, the small chance of making a difference is coupled with a huge accumulated return to many people if there is a significant difference between alternatives. It may be worth it in this case to become reasonably well informed (Parfit 1984: 74). Even more weakly altruistic moral preferences could make a big difference to the rationality of becoming informed, for example if one had a preference to comply with perceived civic duty to vote responsibly (see section 4.3.1 for discussion of the duty to vote). Any moral preference can be formulated in consistent utility functions.
Moreover, defenders of deliberative democracy often claim that concerns for the common good and justice are not merely given prior to politics but that they can evolve and improve through the process of discussion and debate in politics (Elster 1986 ; Gutmann & Thompson 2004; Cohen 1989 ). They assert that much debate and discussion in politics would not be intelligible were it not for the fact that citizens are willing to engage in open minded discussion with those who have distinct morally informed points of view. Empirical evidence suggests that individuals are motivated by moral considerations in politics in addition to their interests (Mansbridge 1990).
4.2.5 The Division of Democratic Labor
Public deliberation in any large-scale democracy will occur within a complex and differentiated “deliberative system”, a
wide variety of institutions, associations, and sites of contestation accomplish political work. (Mansbridge et. al. 2012)
Moreover, the deliberative system of a complex democracy will be characterized by a division of democratic labor, with different parts of the system making different contributions to the overall system. The question arises: what is the appropriate role for a citizen in this division of labor? Philosophically, we should ask two questions. What ought citizens have knowledge about in order to fulfill their role? What standards ought citizens’ beliefs live up to in order to be adequately supported? One promising view is that citizens must think about what ends the society ought to aim at and leave the question of how to achieve those aims to experts (Christiano 1996: ch 5). The rationale for this division of labor is that expertise is not as fundamental to the choice of aims as it is to the development of legislation and policy. Citizens are capable in their everyday lives of understanding and cultivating deep understandings of values and of their interests. And if citizens genuinely do choose the aims and others faithfully pursue the means to achieving those aims, then citizens are in the driver’s seat in society and they can play this role as equals.
To be sure, citizens need to know who to vote for and whether those they vote for are genuinely advancing their aims. This would appear to require some basic knowledge of about how best to achieve their political aims. How is this possible without extensive knowledge? In addition, there is empirical evidence that those who are better informed have more influence on representatives (Erikson 2015). So, if this task requires some kind of knowledge to do well, how can this be compatible with equality?
One promising response is that ordinary citizens do not need individually to have a lot of knowledge of social science and particular facts in order to make political decisions based on such knowledge. Recent research in cognitive science indicates the individuals use “cognitive shortcuts” to save on time in acquiring information about the world they live in (Lupia & McCubbins 1998). This use of shortcuts is common and essential throughout economic and political life. In political life, we see part of the rationale for the many intermediate institutions between government and citizens (Downs 1957: 221–229). Citizens save time by making use of institutions such as the press, unions and other interest group associations, political parties, and opinion leaders to get information about politics. They also rely on interactions in the workplace as well as conversations with friends and families. Political parties can connect ordinary citizens in various ways to expertise because each one contains a division of labor within them that mirrors that in the state. Experts in parties have incentives to make their expertise intelligible to other members (Christiano 2012). In addition, under favorable conditions, political parties stimulate the development of citizens’ normative perspectives and facilitate a healthy public competition of political justifications based on those perspectives (White & Ypi 2016).
People are dependent on social networks in other ways in a democracy. People receive “free” information (which they do not deliberately seek out) about politics and law in school, through their jobs, in discussion with friends, colleagues and family and incidentally through the media. And this can form a better or worse basis on which to pursue other information. Institutions can make a difference to the stream of free information individuals receive. Education can be distributed in a more or less egalitarian way. The circumstances of work can provide more or less free information about politics and law. People who have jobs with a significant amount of power such as lawyers, business persons, government officials will be beneficiaries of very high quality free information. They need to know about law and politics to do their jobs properly. Those who hold low skilled and non-unionized jobs will receive much less free information about politics at work. To the extent that we can alter the economic division of labor by for example giving more place to unions or having greater worker participation, we might be able to reduce inequalities of information among citizens.
4.3 The Moral Duties of Democratic Citizens
What are the moral duties of democratic citizens in complex democracies? In this section, we discuss three important democratic duties: (1) the duty to vote, (2) the duty to promote justice through principled disobedience of the law, and (3) duties to accommodate disagreement through compromise and consensus.
4.3.1 The Duty to Vote
It is often thought that democratic citizens have a moral duty to vote in elections. But this is not obvious. Individual votes are a causally insignificant contribution to the democratic process. In large-scale democracies, the chance that any particular citizen’s vote will decide the outcome of an election is minuscule. What moral reason do democratic citizens have to participate in politics even though they’re almost certain not to make the difference to who gets elected? Why shouldn’t they seek to promote the good or justice in other ways?
Parfit develops an act-utilitarian answer to this question (Parfit 1984: 73–75). Act-utilitarians hold that morally right actions maximize the total expected sum of the utilities of all persons in the society. Parfit argues that voting might nonetheless maximize expected utility if one candidate is significantly superior to the other(s). If we add the benefits to each member of the society of having the superior candidate win, we get a very large difference in value. So when we multiply that value by the probability of casting the deciding vote, which is often thought to be about 1/100,000,000 in a United States presidential election, we might still get a reasonably high expected value. When we subtract the cost to the voter and others of voting, which is often quite low, from this number, we may still have a good reason to vote.
One worry with Parfit’s view is that it faces a version of what Jason Brennan calls “the particularity problem” (Brennan 2011). This is the problem of explaining why citizens ought to promote value through political participation as opposed to through non-political acts. Voting is just one way of promoting overall utility; we need to know the expected utility of the different acts they might perform instead. Even if the argument above is correct, it might be the case that many individuals maximize expected utility by not voting and doing something even more beneficial with their time.
Alex Guerrero argues that citizens have moral reasons to vote because candidates who win by a larger proportion of votes can claim a greater “normative mandate” to govern (Guerrero 2010). Still each individual vote makes only a tiny contribution to the proportion of votes a candidate receives. So, we might doubt the strength of the reason to vote that Guerrero identifies.
Some theorists argue that individuals have a moral duty to vote in order to absolve themselves of complicity in state injustices (Beerbohm 2012; Zakaras 2018). All states commit injustices—they make and enforce unjust laws, wage unjust wars, and much else. And citizens of large-scale democracies have a kind of standing responsibility, by paying taxes and obeying laws, for their state’s injustices of which they must actively absolve themselves The complicity account argues that citizens avoid shared responsibility for their state’s injustices if they oppose those injustices through voting and of public advocacy (Beerbohm 2012).
One worry is that it is unclear why voting and publicly advocating against injustice should be thought to absolve responsibility that is established by paying taxes and obeying laws. Another worry is that one’s concern to oppose injustice should derive from a more direct concern for the wrongs suffered by victims of injustice rather than a concern with keeping one’s hands clean.
One sort of account that avoids this worry grounds the moral duty to vote in the importance of doing one’s fair share of the demands of political justice consistent with public equality. The demands of creating and sustaining just institutions distribute fairly among all citizens (Maskivker 2019). If one fails to do one’s fair share of these demands, then one fails to show due regard for the eventual victims of injustice. Furthermore, voting provides citizens with a mechanism for doing their fair shares of the demands of making their institutions just in a way that is consistent with respecting the public equality of fellow citizens. By showing up and casting a vote, citizens can contribute to the collective achievement of justice while maintaining equal decision-making power with fellow citizens.
4.3.2 Principled Disobedience of the Law
Civil disobedience has long been recognized as a central mechanism through which democratic citizens may legitimately promote political justice in their society. According to the standard view, civil disobedience is a public, non-violent and conscientious breach of law that aims to change laws or government policies. People who engage in civil disobedience are willing to accept the legal consequences of their actions in order to show fidelity to the law (Bedau 1961; Rawls 1971: ch. 55). The standard definition of civil disobedience has been subjected to challenge. For example, some argue that the private acts in which the disobedient seeks to evade legal consequences can count as instances of civil disobedience (Raz 1979; Brownlee 2004, 2007, 2012).
Perhaps the most common way of justifying civil disobedience argues that the same considerations that ground the pro tanto duty to obey the law sometimes make it appropriate to engage in civil disobedience of the law (see, e.g., Rawls 1971: ch. 57; Sabl 2001; Markovits 2005; Smith 2011). For example, Rawls argues that while citizens of a “nearly just” society have a pro tanto duty to obey its laws in virtue of it being nearly just, civil disobedience can be justified as a way of making the relevant society more just (Rawls 1971: ch. 57). Similarly, Daniel Markovits argues that members of a society with suitably egalitarian and inclusive democratic procedures have a general duty to obey its laws because they are produced by procedures that are suitably egalitarian and inclusive, but that civil disobedience can be justified as a way of making the relevant procedures more egalitarian or inclusive (Markovits 2005).
It is easy to see why this constitutes an attractive way of justifying civil disobedience, since it justifies it by appeal to the same values that ground the pro tanto duty to obey the law. On the other hand, as Simmons notes, if there is no general duty to obey the law, there would seem to be no presumption in favor of obedience and thus no special need for a justification of civil disobedience; obedience and disobedience would stand equally in need of justification (Simmons 2007: ch 4).
Advocates of the standard approach generally assume that only civil disobedience can be justified in this way. However, some argue civil disobedience does not enjoy a special normative presumption over uncivil disobedience. The core idea that insofar as the values that ground a pro tanto duty to obey the law—for example, justice or democratic equality—are sometimes best served by civil disobedience of the law, they are sometimes best served by covert, evasive, anonymous, or even violent disobedience of the law (Delmas 2018; Lai 2019; Pasternak 2018).
5. Democratic Representation
Representation is an essential part of the division of labor of large-scale democracies. In this section, we examine two moral questions concerning representation. First, what sort of representative system is best? Second, by what moral principles are representatives bound?
5.1 What Sort of Representative System is Best?
A number of debates have centered on the question of what kinds of representative systems are best for a democratic society. What choice we make here will depend heavily on our underlying moral justification of democracy, our conception of citizenship as well as on our empirical understanding of political institutions and how they function. The most basic types of formal political representation available are single member district representation, proportional representation and group representation. In addition, many societies have opted for multicameral legislative institutions. In some cases, combinations of the above forms have been tried.
Single member district representation returns single representatives of geographically defined areas containing roughly equal populations to the legislature and is prominent in the United States, the United Kingdom, and India, among other places. The most common form of proportional representation is party list proportional representation. In a simple form of such a scheme, a number of parties compete for election to a legislature that is not divided into geographical districts. Parties acquire seats in the legislature as a proportion of the total number of votes they receive in the voting population as a whole. Group representation occurs when the society is divided into non-geographically defined groups such as ethnic or linguistic groups or even functional groups such as workers, farmers and capitalists and returns representatives to a legislature from each of them.
Many have argued in favor of single member district legislation on the grounds that it has appeared to them to lead to more stable government than other forms of representation. The thought is that proportional representation tends to fragment the citizenry into opposing homogeneous camps that rigidly adhere to their party lines and that are continually vying for control over the government. Since there are many parties and they are unwilling to compromise with each other, governments formed from coalitions of parties tend to fall apart rather quickly. The post war experience of governments in Italy appears to confirm this hypothesis. Single member district representation, in contrast, is said to enhance the stability of governments by virtue of its favoring a two party system of government. Each election cycle then determines which party is to stay in power for some length of time.
Charles Beitz argues that single member district representation encourages moderation in party programs offered for citizens to consider (Beitz 1989: ch. 7). This results from the tendency of this kind of representation towards two party systems. In a two party system with majority rule, it is argued, each party must appeal to the median voter in the political spectrum. Hence, they must moderate their programs to appeal to the median voter. Furthermore, they encourage compromise among groups since they must try to appeal to a lot of other groups in order to become part of one of the two leading parties. These tendencies encourage moderation and compromise in citizens to the extent that political parties, and interest groups, hold these qualities up as necessary to functioning well in a democracy.
In criticism, advocates of proportional and group representation have argued that single member district representation tends to muffle the voices and ignore the interests of minority groups in the society (Mill 1861; Christiano 1996). Minority interests and views tend to be articulated in background negotiations and in ways that muffle their distinctiveness. Furthermore, representatives of minority interests and views often have a difficult time getting elected at all in single member district systems so it has been charged that minority views and interests are often systematically underrepresented. Sometimes these problems are dealt with by redrawing the boundaries of districts in a way that ensures greater minority representation. The efforts are invariably quite controversial since there is considerable disagreement about the criteria for apportionment.
In proportional representation, by contrast, representatives of different groups are seated in the legislature in proportion to citizens’ choices. Minorities need not make their demands conform to the basic dichotomy of views and interests that characterize single member district systems so their views are more articulated and distinctive as well as better represented.
Advocates of group representation, like Iris Marion Young, have argued that some historically disenfranchised groups may still not do very well under proportional representation (Young 1990: ch. 6). They may not be able to organize and articulate their views as easily as other groups. Also, minority groups can still be systematically defeated in the legislature and their interests may be consistently set back even if they do have some representation. For these groups, some have argued that the only way to protect their interests is legally to ensure that they have adequate and even disproportionate representation.
One worry about group representation is that it tends to freeze some aspects of the agenda that might be better left to the choice of citizens. For instance, consider a population that is divided into linguistic groups for a long time. And suppose that only some citizens continue to think of linguistic conflict as important. In the circumstances a group representation scheme may tend to be biased in an arbitrary way that favors the views or interests of those who do think of linguistic conflict as important.
5.2 The Ethics of Representation
What moral norms apply to representatives carrying out their official duties? We can get a better handle on possible answers by introducing Hannah Pitkin’s famous distinction between trustees and delegates (Pitkin 1967). Representatives who act as trustees rely on their own independent judgments in carrying out their duties. Norms of trusteeship are supported in recognition that, given a natural division of democratic labor, officials are in a much better position to make well-reasoned and well-informed political decisions than ordinary citizens.
Representatives who act as delegates defer to the judgments of their citizens. These norms might be thought to reflect the value of democratic accountability. Because the people authorize representatives to govern, it is natural to think that representatives are accountable to the people to enact their judgments. If representatives are not accountable in this way, citizens lose democratic control over their representatives’ actions.
Which norms should win out when they conflict? Pitkin argues that the answer varies by context. This seems plausible. For example, if we take the view that citizens primarily have the role of determining the aims of the society, we might think that representatives ought to be delegates with regard to the aims, but trustees with regard to the ways of realizing the aims (Christiano 1996). See Suzanne Dovi’s discussion of representation for a deeper and more nuanced discussion of these issues.
6. Social Choice and Democracy
Kenneth Arrow’s impossibility theorem is thought by some to provide a major set of difficulties for democratic theory (Arrow 1951). William Riker, Russell Hardin, and others have thought that the impossibility theorem shows that there are deep problems with democratic ideals (Riker 1982; Hardin 1999). Neither of these thinkers are opposed to democracy itself, they both think that there are good instrumental reasons for having democracy.
The basic results of social choice theory are laid out in detail elsewhere in the encyclopedia (List 2013). Here we will simply articulate the basic result and an illustration. The question of Arrowian social choice theory is: how do we determine a social preference for a society overall on the basis of the set of the individual preferences of the members? Arrow shows that a social choice function that satisfies a number of plausible constraints cannot be defined when there are three or more alternatives to be chosen by the group. He lays out a number of conditions to be imposed on a social choice function. Unlimited domain: The social choice function must be able to give us a social preference no matter what the preferences of the individuals over alternatives are. Non dictatorship: the social choice function must not select the preference of one particular member regardless of others’ preferences. Transitivity and completeness: The individual preferences orderings must be transitive and complete orderings and the social preference derived from them must be transitive and complete. Independence of irrelevant alternatives: the social preference between two alternatives must be the result only of the individual orderings between those two alternatives. Pareto condition: if all the members prefer an alternative x over y, then x must be ranked above y in the social preference. The theorem says that no social choice function over more than two alternatives can satisfy all of these conditions.
A useful illustration of this idea involves an extension of majority rule to cases of more than two alternatives. The Condorcet rule says that an alternative x wins when, for every other alternative, a majority prefers x over that alternative. For example, suppose we have three persons A, B and C and three alternatives x, y and z. A prefers x over y, y over z; B prefers y over z and z over x; C prefers x over z and z over y. In this case, x is the Condorcet winner since it beats y, and it beats z. The problem with this plausible sounding rule is the case of a majority cycle. Suppose you have three persons A, B and C, and three alternatives, x, y and z. In the case in which A prefers x over y and y over z, while B prefers y over z and z over x, and C prefers z over x and x over y, the Condorcet rule will yield a social preference of x over y, y over z and z over x. One can see here that the Condorcet rule satisfies all the conditions except transitivity of social preference. One way to avoid intransitivity is to restrict the domain of preferences from which the social preference arises. Another is to introduce cardinal information that compares the how much people prefer alternatives (violating independence). Another might be to make one person a dictator. So, this case nicely illustrates that one cannot satisfy all of the constraints simultaneously.
Riker argues that the theorem shows that the idea that the popular will can be the governing element in a society is false. If an existence condition for a popular will is a restricted set of preferences the question naturally arises as to whether such a condition is always or normally met in a moderately complex society. We might wonder whether a highly pluralistic society with a very complex division of labor is likely to satisfy the restricted preference set condition necessary to avoid cycles or other pathologies of social choice. Some have argued that we have empirical evidence to the effect that modern societies do normally satisfy such conditions (Mackie 2003). Others have argued that this seems unlikely (Riker 1982; Ingham 2019). This is not merely a defense of unlimited domain. It is a defense of the thesis that normally the collections of preferences in modern societies are not likely to have the properties that enable them to avoid cycles.
The fairness critique from social choice theory is based on the idea that when a voting process meets requirements of fairness, the fairness of the process and the preferences may not generate determinate outcomes. If cycles are pervasive, the outcomes of democratic processes may be determined by clever strategies and not by the fairness of the procedures (Riker 1982). Three remarks are in order here. First, it is compatible with the process being completely fair that the outcomes of the process are indeterminate. After all, coin flips are fair. Second, there is some question as to how prominent the cycles are. Third, one might think that if the conditions which enable opposing sides to strategize effectively are themselves roughly equal, then the concerns for fairness are fully met. If resources for persuasion and organization are distributed in an egalitarian way, perhaps the fairness account is vindicated after all. This point can be made more compelling when we consider Sean Ingham’s account of political equality. He includes intensity of preference in his account of fairness. This is a departure from the Arrowian approach, but it is in many ways a realistic one. The idea is that majorities have equal control over policy areas when they are able to get what they want with the same amount of intensity of preferences. And equality holds generally when all groups of the same size have the same control (Ingham 2019). There remains an extreme case in which all majorities have equal intensity of preference and are caught in a majority cycle. But the chances of this happening are very slim, even if the chances of majority cycles more generally are not as small. Even if there are a lot of majority cycles, if the issues are resolved in such a way that those majorities that have most at stake in the conflict are the ones that get their way, then we can have fairness in a quite robust sense even while having pervasive majority cycles.
7. The Boundary Problem: Constituting the Demos
If democratic societies allow members to participate as equals in collective decision making, a natural question arises: who has the right to participate in making collective decisions? We can ask this question within a particular jurisdiction (ought all adults have the right to participation? Ought children have the right to participation? Ought all residents have such rights?). But we can also ask what the extent of the jurisdiction ought to be. How many of the people in the world ought to be included in the collective decision-making? An easy, though slightly misleading, way of asking this question is, what ought the physical boundaries of a particular institution of collective decision-making be? We see partially democratic societies within the confines of the modern nation-state. But we might ask, why should we restrict the set of persons who participate in making decisions of the modern state just to those who happen to be the physical inhabitants of those states? Surely there are many other persons affected by decisions made by democratic states aside from those persons. For example, activities in one society A can pollute another society B. Why shouldn’t the members of B have a say in the decisions regarding the polluting activities in A? And there can be many other effects that activities in A can have on B.
Some have suggested that the boundaries of a state ought to be determined through a principle of national self-determination. We identify a nation as an ongoing group of persons who share certain cultural, historical and political norms and who identify with each other and with a piece of land. Then we determine the boundaries of the territory by appeal to the size of the group of people and the land they cherish (Miller 1995; Song 2012). This is an appealing idea in many ways: shared nationality breeds a willingness to share the sacrifices that arise from collective decision making; it generates a sense of at-homeness for people. But it is hard to use as a general principle for dividing land among persons when one of the central facts for many societies is that a diversity of nations, ethnic groups and cultures co-mingle on the very same land.
Is there a democratic solution to the boundary problem? A number of ideas have been suggested. The first idea is that the people ought to decide what the boundaries are. But this suggestion, while it may be a pragmatic resolution to the problem, seems to beg the question about who the members are and who are not (Whelan 1983).
A second theoretical solution that has some democratic credentials is to invoke the principle that all who are subjected to decision making, in the sense of who are coerced or have duties imposed upon them, ought to have a say in the decision making (Abizadeh 2008). This principle is plausible enough, but it doesn’t get at enough cases. The pollution case above is not a case of subjection.
A third proposed theoretical solution is the all-affected principle. One formulation is “all affected persons ought to have a say in the decisions that affect them”. This does suggest that when the activities in one state affect those of another state, the people of the other state ought to have a say in those activities. Some have thought that this principle tends to lead to a kind of politically cosmopolitan principle in support of world government (Goodin 2007).
But the all-affected principle is conceptually quite uncertain and morally deeply problematic, and it provides very little, if anything, in the way of a solution to the boundary problem.
First, “having a say” is not clear. Does it require having a vote in collective decision-making? Or is it also satisfied by a person’s being able to modify another’s action by negotiating with them, as we see when there is bargaining over an externality? This latter version would undermine the idea that the all-affected principle has direct implications for the boundary problem. When the United States permits activities that produce acid rain in Canada, Canada can negotiate with the United States to lessen the production of acid rain and/or to compensate Canada for the harm. As long as there is a fair and effective system of negotiation, this would seem to satisfy the all-affected principle without giving Canadians a vote in American politics or Americans a vote in Canadian politics.
Second, it is not clear what “being affected” means. One, does a person being affected just mean that there is a change in the person’s situation or must the effect involve the setting back of one’s preferences, or interests, or legitimate interests, or exercise of one’s capacities or one’s good? Two, are one’s interests affected by a decision only when they are advanced or set back relative to some baseline (either the present state of affairs or some morally defined baseline like what you have promised me), or am I affected by decisions that could be to my advantage or disadvantage but end up making no difference? For example, if I am drowning in a pool and you are deciding whether to save me or go buy yourself a candy bar, am I affected by your buying the candy bar? If I am not affected when no change occurs, then who is affected by a decision often depends on who participates in the decision and we have no solution to the problem of inclusion. If I am affected, then the principle has some quite extraordinary implications. Now it turns out that impoverished persons in South Asia are affected by my buying a candy bar, since I could have sent the money to them (Goodin 2007).
The all-affected principle is a merely suggestive and rhetorically effective phrase. It is a conversation starter and a list of topics to be discussed, not a genuine principle. For example, if I must include everyone possibly affected by my decision for every decision I make, I will not be able to make many decisions and my decision making will no longer enable me to give a shape to my own life and my relations with others. My life becomes fragmented and lacks integrity (Williams 1973). An analog of this problem would arise for political societies, presumably. Each society would have to include a variety of different persons in each decision. It is hard to see how any society could take on any particular character if this is the case.
A more plausible principle that encompasses some of the suggestions of the all-affected principle is that a framework of institutions should be set up so that people have power to advance and protect their legitimate interests in life.
But if we understand the principle in this way, it is not clear that it helps us much with the boundary problem. First of all, there are different ways in which people can be said to possess power over their lives. One kind of power is the power to participate as an equal in a collective decision-making process. Another kind is to be able to advance one’s interests in a decentralized process like a market or a system of agreement making like international law. Recalling our pollution problem above, we could give the state of which they are members power to negotiate with the polluting state terms that are mutually agreeable. Only the power to participate as an equal in collective decision-making involves the boundaries of collective decision-making.
Another solution to the boundary problem is a conservative one. The basic idea is to keep the boundaries of states roughly as they are except if there is a pressing need to change them. Trying to alter the boundaries of political societies is a recipe for serious conflict because there is no institution that has the legitimacy or power actually to resolve problems at an international level and there is likely to be a lot of disagreement on how to do it. States as we know them, are by far the most powerful political entities in the international system. They have developed more effective practices of accountability of power than any other entity in the system. They have created unified societies with highly interdependent populations. Finally, states and the individuals in them can be made accountable to some degree to other individuals and states through the process of negotiation and international law making. The origin of these boundaries may be arbitrary, but it is not, for all that, irrelevant. To be sure, there are clear cases where borders can be changed. One source of pressing need is serious injustice within a country. Another might be the existence of permanent minorities that are sectionally defined. Here, we ask only how to revise boundaries and the basis of such revision is that it is a remedy for serious injustice (Buchanan 1991).
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