Richard Rorty

First published Sat Feb 3, 2001; substantive revision Thu Jun 22, 2023

Richard Rorty (1931–2007) developed a distinctive and controversial brand of pragmatism that expressed itself along two main axes. One is negative – a critical diagnosis of what Rorty takes to be defining projects of modern philosophy. The other is positive – an attempt to show what intellectual culture might look like, once we free ourselves from the governing metaphors of mind and knowledge in which the traditional problems of epistemology and metaphysics (and indeed, in Rorty’s view, the self-conception of modern philosophy) are rooted. The centerpiece of Rorty’s critique is the provocative account offered in Philosophy and the Mirror of Nature (1979, hereafter PMN). In this book, and in the closely related essays collected in Consequences of Pragmatism (1982, hereafter CP), Rorty’s principal target is the philosophical idea of knowledge as representation, as a mental mirroring of a mind-external world. Providing a contrasting image of philosophy, Rorty has sought to integrate and apply the milestone achievements of Dewey, Hegel and Darwin in a pragmatist synthesis of historicism and naturalism. Characterizations and illustrations of a post-epistemological intellectual culture, present in both PMN (part III) and CP (xxxvii–xliv), are more richly developed in later works, such as Contingency, Irony, and Solidarity (1989, hereafter CIS), in the popular essays and articles collected in Philosophy and Social Hope (1999, hereafter PSH), and in the four volumes of philosophical papers, Objectivity, Relativism, and Truth (1991, hereafter ORT); Essays on Heidegger and Others (1991, hereafter EHO); Truth and Progress (1998, hereafter TP); and Philosophy as Cultural Politics (2007, hereafter PCP). In these writings, ranging over an unusually wide intellectual territory, Rorty offers a highly integrated, multifaceted view of thought, culture, and politics, a view that has made him one of the most widely discussed philosophers in our time.

1. Biographical Sketch

Richard McKay Rorty was born on October 4th, 1931, in New York City. He grew up, as he recounts in Achieving Our Country (1998, hereafter AOC), “on the anti-communist reformist Left in mid-century” (AOC, 59), within a circle combining anti-Stalinism with leftist social activism. “In that circle,” Rorty tells us, “American patriotism, redistributionist economics, anticommunism, and Deweyan pragmatism went together easily and naturally” (AOC, 61). In 1946, Rorty went to the University of Chicago, to a philosophy department which at that time included Rudolph Carnap, Charles Hartshorne, and Richard McKeon, all of whom were Rorty’s teachers. After receiving his BA in 1949, Rorty stayed on at Chicago to complete an M.A. (1952) with a thesis on Whitehead supervised by Hartshorne. From 1952 to 1956 Rorty was at Yale, where he wrote a dissertation entitled “The Concept of Potentiality.” His supervisor was Paul Weiss. After the completion of his Ph.D., followed by two years in the army, Rorty received his first academic appointment, at Wellesley College. In 1961, after three years at Wellesley, Rorty moved to Princeton University where he stayed until he went to the University of Virginia, in 1982, as Kenan Professor of the Humanities. Rorty left the University of Virginia in 1998, accepting an appointment in the Department of Comparative Literature at Stanford University. In the course of his career, Rorty received several academic awards and honours, including a Guggenheim Fellowship (1973–74) and a MacArthur Fellowship (1981–1986). He held a number of prestigious lectureships, giving, among others, the Northcliffe Lectures at University College, London (1986), the Clark Lectures at Trinity College, Cambridge (1987), and the Massey Lectures at Harvard (1997). Rorty died on June 8th, 2007.

2. Against Epistemology

On Rorty’s account, modern epistemology is not only an attempt to legitimate our claim to knowledge of what is real, but also an attempt to legitimate philosophical reflection itself – a pressing task, on many accounts, once the advent of the so-called new science of the sixteenth and seventeenth century gradually gave content to a notion of knowledge obtained by the methodological interrogation of nature itself. Because the result of this kind of interrogation, theoretical empirical knowledge, is so obviously fruitful, and also carries with it seemingly uncontentious norms of progress, its mere presence poses a legitimation challenge to a form of thought, and claim to knowledge, that is distinct from it. Cartesian epistemology, in Rorty’s picture, is designed to meet this challenge. It is sceptical in a fundamental way; sceptical doubts of a Cartesian sort, that is, doubts that can be raised about any set of empirical claims whatever, and so cannot be alleviated by experience, are tailor-made to preserve at once a domain and a job for philosophical reflection. Rorty’s aim in PMN is to undermine the assumptions in light of which this double legitimation project makes sense.

2.1 Epistemological Behaviorism

That any vocabulary is optional and mutable is the basic conviction behind Rorty’s attack on representationalist epistemology carried out in PMN. It informs, for instance, the genealogy (chapter one) and deconstruction (chapter two) of the concept of mind offered in the book’s first part, “Our Glassy Essence.” This historicist conviction, however, is not itself a central theme of PMN, and it emerges for explicit discussion only in the final section of the book, “Philosophy,” which is the shortest and in some ways least developed of its three parts. The argumentative core of PMN is found in its second part, “Mirroring.” Here Rorty develops and extends a diverse lot of arguments – notably from Wilfrid Sellars, Willard van Orman Quine, Thomas Kuhn, Ludwig Wittgenstein, and Donald Davidson – into a general critique of the defining project of modern epistemology, viz., the conceptions of mind, of knowledge and of philosophy bequeathed by the 17th and 18th centuries. Rorty’s key claim is that “the Kantian picture of concepts and intuitions getting together to produce knowledge is needed to give sense to the idea of ‘theory of knowledge’ as a specifically philosophical discipline, distinct from psychology” (PMN, 168). According to Rorty,

This is equivalent to saying that if we do not have the distinction between what is “given” and what is “added by the mind,” or that between the “contingent” (because influenced by what is given) and the necessary (because entirely “within” the mind and under its control), then we will not know what would count as a “rational reconstruction” of our knowledge. We will not know what epistemology’s goal or method could be. (PMN, 168–9)

Epistemology, in Rorty’s account, is wedded to a picture of mind’s structure working on empirical content to produce in itself items – thoughts, representations – which, when things go well, correctly mirror reality. To loosen the grip of this picture on our thinking is to challenge the idea that epistemology – whether traditional Cartesian or 20th century linguistic – is the essence of philosophy. To this end, Rorty combines a reading of Quine’s attack on a version of the structure-content distinction in “Two Dogmas of Empiricism” (1951) with a reading of Sellars’ attack on the idea of givenness in “Empiricism and the Philosophy of Mind” (1956/1997). On Rorty’s reading, though neither Sellars nor Quine is able fully to take in the liberating influence of the other, they are really attacking the same distinction, or set of distinctions. While Quine casts doubt on the notion of structure or meaning which linguistically-turned epistemology had instated in place of mental entities, Sellars, questioning the very idea of givenness, came at the distinction from the other side:

…Sellars and Quine invoke the same argument, one which bears equally against the given-versus-nongiven and the necessary-versus-contingent distinctions. The crucial premise of this argument is that we understand knowledge when we understand the social justification of belief, and thus have no need to view it as accuracy of representation. (PMN, 170)

The upshot of Quine’s and Sellars’ criticisms of the myths and dogmas of epistemology is, Rorty suggests, that “we see knowledge as a matter of conversation and of social practice, rather than as an attempt to mirror nature” (PMN, 171). Rorty provides this view with a label: “Explaining rationality and epistemic authority by reference to what society lets us say, rather than the latter by the former, is the essence of what I shall call ‘epistemological behaviorism,’ an attitude common to Dewey and Wittgenstein” (PMN, 174).

Epistemological behaviorism leaves no room for the kind of practice-transcending legitimation that Rorty identifies as the defining aspiration of modern epistemology. Assuming that epistemic practices do, or at least can, diverge, it is not surprising that Rorty’s commitment to epistemological behaviorism should lead to charges of relativism or subjectivism. Indeed, many who share Rorty’s historicist scepticism toward the transcending ambitions of epistemology – friendly critics like Hilary Putnam, John McDowell and Daniel Dennett – balk at the idea that there are no constraints on knowledge save conversational ones. Yet this is a central part of Rorty’s position, repeated and elaborated as late as in TP and PCP. Indeed, in TP he invokes it precisely in order to deflect this sort of criticism. In “Hilary Putnam and the Relativist Menace,” Rorty says:

In short, my strategy for escaping the self-referential difficulties into which “the Relativist” keeps getting himself is to move everything over from epistemology and metaphysics into cultural politics, from claims to knowledge and appeals to self-evidence to suggestions about what we should try. (TP, 57)

That epistemological behaviorism differs from traditional forms of relativism and subjectivism is easier to see in light of Rorty’s criticism of the notion of representation, and the cluster of philosophical images which surround it.

2.2 Antirepresentationalism

Rorty’s enduring attitude to relativism and subjectivism is that both are products of the representationalist paradigm. Though the theme is explicit in PMN and CP (“Pragmatism, Relativism, Irrationalism”), it is with Rorty’s later and further appropriation of Davidson that his criticism of the idea of knowledge as representation becomes fully elaborated (ORT, “Introduction” and Part II). Drawing on Davidson’s criticism of the scheme-content distinction (“On the Very Idea of a Conceptual Scheme”) and of the correspondence theory of truth (“The Structure and Content of Truth”), Rorty is able to back up his rejection of any philosophical position or project which attempts to draw a general line between what is made and what is found, what is subjective and what is objective, what is mere appearance and what is real. Rorty’s position is not that these conceptual contrasts never have application, but that such application is always context and interest bound and that there is, as in the case of the related notion of truth, nothing to be said about them in general. Rorty’s commitment to the conversationalist view of knowledge must therefore be distinguished from subjectivism or relativism, which, Rorty argues, presuppose the very distinctions he seeks to reject. Equally, Rorty’s epistemological behaviorism must not be confused with an idealism that asserts a primacy of thought or language with respect to the unmediated world, since this, too, is a position that is undercut by Rorty’s Davidsonian position. In light of the view of truth and of meaning that Rorty appropriates from Davidson, his conversationalism is not a matter of giving priority to the subjective over the objective, or to mind’s power over world’s constraint. Rather it is the other side of his anti-representationalism, which denies that we are related to the world in anything other than causal terms. Differently put, Rorty argues that we can give no useful content to the notion that the world, by its very nature, rationally constrains choices of vocabulary with which to cope with it (TP, “The Very Idea of Human Answerability to the World: John McDowell’s Version of Empiricism”). This has implications for Rorty’s view of the contribution of philosophy to intellectual progress: “what matters in the end are changes in the vocabulary rather than changes in belief, changes in truth-value candidates rather than assignments of truth-value” (CIS, 47–48). As Rorty reads philosophy, its significant achievements are not discoveries of the truth or falsehood of certain propositions, but innovations in our descriptive capacities – changes in what we are able to say and think.

2.3 Rationality, Science, and Truth

Attacking the idea that we must acknowledge the world’s normative constraint on our belief-systems if we are to be rational subjects, Rorty has drawn a great deal of criticism that takes science, particularly natural science, as its chief reference point. Two general kinds of criticisms are often raised. The first insists that science consists precisely in the effort to learn the truth about how things are by methodically allowing us to be constrained in our beliefs by the world. On this view, Rorty is simply denying the very idea of science. The other kind of criticism seeks to be internal: if Rorty’s view of science were to prevail, scientists would no longer be motivated to carry on as they are; science would cease to be the useful sort of thing that Rorty also thinks it is (see, e.g., Bernard Williams, “Auto da Fe” in Malachowski, 1990). However, Rorty’s view of science is more complicated than he himself sometimes implies. He says: “I tend to view natural science as in the business of controlling and predicting things, and as largely useless for philosophical purposes” (“Reply to Hartshorne,” Saatkamp, 32). Yet he spends a good deal of time drawing an alternative picture of the intellectual virtues that good science embodies (ORT, Part I). This is a picture which eschews the notion that science succeeds, when it does, in virtue of being in touch with reality in a special way, the sort of way that epistemologists, when successful, can clarify. It is in this sense specifically that Rorty disavows science as philosophically significant. Good science may nevertheless be a model of rationality, in Rorty’s view, exactly in so far as scientific practice has succeeded in establishing institutions conducive to the democratic exchange of views.

The provocative and counterintuitive force of Rorty’s treatment of rationality and science in terms of conversational ethics is undeniable. It is important to realize, though, that Rorty is not denying that there is any bona fide use of notions like truth, knowledge, or objectivity. Rather his point is that our ordinary uses of these notions always trade for their content and point on particular features of their varying contexts of application. His further point is that when we abstract away from these different contexts and practices, in search of general notions, we are left with pure abstract hypostatizations incapable of providing us with any guide to action at all. The upshot, Rorty holds, is that we simply do not have a concept of objective reality which can be invoked either to explain the success of some set of norms of warrant, or to justify some set of standards over against others. This is perhaps clearest in Rorty’s treatment of the concept of truth. With regard to truth, Rorty’s rhetoric and philosophical strategy has indeed shifted over the last three decades. As late as in 1982 (in CP) he still attempts to articulate his view of truth by drawing on William James’s famous definition in terms of what is good in the way of belief. Soon after this, however, Rorty comes to doubt the point of any theory of truth, and, following Davidson’s lead, explicitly rejects all attempts to explicate the notion of truth in terms of other concepts. Rorty’s mature view of the point and significance of the concept of truth is first elaborated in “Davidson, Pragmatism and Truth” (in ORT). Recent expressions are found in the first of the two Spinoza Lectures given at the University of Amsterdam in 1997, “Is it Desirable to Love truth?”, in the paper, “Is Truth a Goal of Inquiry? Donald Davidson versus Crispin Wright” (TP), as well as in the introductions to, respectively, TP and PSH. In these writings, Rorty argues that while “truth” has various important uses, it does not itself name a goal towards which we can strive, over and above warrant or justification. His argument is not that truth is reducible to warrant, but that the concept has no deep or substantive criterial content at all. That is, there are only semantic explanations to be offered for why it is the case that a given sentence is true just when its truth conditions are satisfied. So aiming for truth, as opposed to warrant, does not point to a possible line of action, just as we have no measure of our approximation to truth other than increasing warrant. Indeed, for Rorty, this is part of what makes the concept so useful, in a manner not coincidentally analogous with goodness; it ensures that no sentence can ever be analytically certified as true by virtue of its possession of some other property. Rorty’s attitude to the concept of truth has been much criticized, often on the grounds that the very notion of warrant, indeed the concept of belief in general, presupposes the notion of truth. However, it may be that we can do justice to these connections without supposing that the notion of truth thus involved backs up the notions of belief and warrant with any substantive normative content of its own. Indeed, that neither the concept of truth, nor those of objectivity and of reality, can be invoked to explain or legitimate our inferential practices and our standards of warrant, is the essence of Rorty’s conversationalism, or epistemological behaviorism.

3. Cultural Politics

Taking epistemological behaviorism to heart, Rorty urges, means that we can no longer construe the authority of science in terms of ontological claims. Though many disagree, this is not, for Rorty, to denigrate or weaken the authority of science. Indeed, a prominent feature of Rorty’s post-metaphysical, post-epistemological culture, is a thoroughgoing Darwinian naturalism.

3.1 Naturalism

To be a naturalist in Rorty’s sense,

is to be the kind of antiessentialist who, like Dewey, sees no breaks in the hierarchy of increasingly complex adjustments to novel stimulation – the hierarchy which has amoeba adjusting themselves to changed water temperature at the bottom, bees dancing and chess players check-mating in the middle, and people fomenting scientific, artistic, and political revolutions at the top. (ORT, 109)

In Rorty’s view, both Dewey’s pragmatism and Darwinism encourage us to see vocabularies as tools to be assessed in terms of the particular purposes they may serve. Our vocabularies, Rorty suggests, “have no more of a representational relation to an intrinsic nature of things than does the anteater’s snout or the bowerbird’s skill at weaving” (TP, 48). Pragmatic evaluation of various linguistically infused practices requires a degree of specificity. From Rorty’s perspective, to suggest that we might evaluate vocabularies with respect to their ability to uncover the truth would be like claiming to evaluate tools for their ability to help us get what we want – full stop. Is the hammer or the saw or the scissors better – in general? Questions about usefulness can only be answered, Rorty points out, once we give substance to our purposes.

Rorty’s pragmatist appropriation of Darwin also defuses the significance of reduction. He rejects as representationalist the sort of naturalism that implies a program of nomological or conceptual reduction to terms at home in a basic science. Rorty’s naturalism echoes Nietzsche’s perspectivism; a descriptive vocabulary is valuable insofar as the patterns it highlights are usefully attended to by creatures with needs and interests like ours. Darwinian naturalism, for Rorty, implies that there is no one privileged vocabulary whose purpose it is to serve as a critical touchstone for our various descriptive practices.

For Rorty, then, any vocabulary, even that of evolutionary explanation, is a tool for a purpose, and therefore subject to teleological assessment. Typically, Rorty justifies his own commitment to Darwinian naturalism by suggesting that this vocabulary is suited to further the secularization and democratization of society that Rorty thinks we should aim for. Accordingly, there is a close tie between Rorty’s construal of the naturalism he endorses and his most basic political convictions.

3.2 Ethnocentrism and Relativism

One result of Rorty’s naturalism is that he is an avowed ethnocentrist. If vocabularies are tools, then they are tools with a particular history, having been developed in and by particular cultures. In using the vocabulary one has inherited, one is participating in and contributing to the history of that vocabulary and so cannot help but take up a position within the particular culture that has created it. As he puts it,

…one consequence of antirepresentationalism is the recognition that no description of how things are from a God’s-eye point of view, no skyhook provided by some contemporary or yet-to-be-developed science, is going to free us from the contingency of having been acculturated as we were. Our acculturation is what makes certain options live, or momentous, or forced, while leaving others dead, or trivial, or optional. (ORT, 13)

This view looks to many readers like a version of cultural relativism. Granted, Rorty does not say that what is true, what is good, and what is right is relative to some particular ethnos, and so in that sense he is no relativist. But the worry about relativism – that it leaves us with no rational way to adjudicate conflict – seems to apply equally to Rorty’s ethnocentric view. Rorty’s answer is to say that in one sense of “rational” that is true, but that in another sense it is not, and to recommend that we drop the former (TP, 186–201). Rorty’s position is that we have no notion of rational warrant that exceeds, or transcends, or grounds, the norms that liberal intellectuals take to define thorough, open-minded, reflective discussion. It is chimerical, Rorty holds, to think that the force or attractiveness of these norms can be enhanced by argument that does not presuppose them. It is pointless, equally, to look for ways of convicting those who pay them no heed of irrationality. Persuasion across such fundamental differences is achieved, if at all, by concrete comparisons of particular alternatives, by elaborate description and redescription of the kinds of life to which different practices conduce. In his own work, Rorty’s offers such comparisons, descriptions, and redescriptions, with the goal of making liberalism the most attractive alternative.

3.3 Liberalism and Irony

Rorty is a self-proclaimed postmodernist bourgeois liberal (“Postmodernist Bourgeois Liberalism,” ORT). His liberalism is postmodernist because it does not depend on a metanarrative according to which liberalism is the realization and embodiment of transcultural and ahistorical conceptions of rationality and morality. Rather, its institutions and practices are the lucky result of a contingent history. His liberalism is bourgeois because this contingent history includes economic conditions that make these institutions and practices possible (see section 3.7).

Thus, his liberalism is a pragmatic liberalism. He is skeptical of political thought purporting to uncover hidden, systematic causes for injustice and exploitation, and on that basis proposing sweeping changes to set things right. (ORT Part III; EHO; CIS Part II; AOC). Rather, liberalism involves piecemeal reforms advancing economic justice and increasing the freedoms that citizens are able to enjoy. It is also a romantic liberalism. He follows Judith Shklar in identifying liberals by their belief that “cruelty is the worst thing we do,” and contends it is our ability to imagine the ways we can be cruel to others, and how we could be different, that enables us to gradually expand the community with which we feel solidarity (CIS, 146).

It is possible, Rorty thinks, to be both a liberal and an ironist. The ironist, a figure Rorty contrasts with “the metaphysician,” is a central character in CIS. The metaphysician is someone who adheres to the “common sense” view that it is possible to discover the true nature of reality or the true nature of the self, whereas the ironist is someone who understands that any particular description of reality or of the self that she might adopt will be adopted only for contingent reasons, often having to do with her culture and upbringing. Because she recognizes that the descriptions she uses are optional, she is often on the lookout for new ways of describing things, particularly when she “has radical and continuing doubts about the final vocabulary she currently uses” (CIS, 73). Because she believes “there is nothing beyond vocabularies which serves as a criterion of choice between them” (CIS, 80), these doubts can only be resolved by comparing alternative possible vocabularies. Thus, she seeks out different and compelling descriptions that she can adopt or incorporate into her own final vocabulary.

Rorty’s liberal ironist, recognizing – indeed, affirming – the contingency of her own commitments, is explicitly ethnocentric (ORT, “Solidarity or Objectivity”). She accepts that bourgeois liberalism has no universality other than the transient and unstable one which time, luck, and discursive effort might win for it. Recognizing the contingency of these values and the vocabulary in which they are expressed, while retaining the commitments, is the attitude of the liberal ironist (CIS, essays 3,4). Liberal ironists have the ability to combine consciousness of the contingency of their own evaluative vocabulary with a commitment to reducing suffering – in particular, with a commitment to combatting cruelty (CIS, essay 4, ORT, Part III).

3.4 Public and Private

Rorty’s version of liberalism is expressed also in the distinction he draws between the private and the public (CIS). This distinction is often misinterpreted to imply that certain domains of interaction or behavior should be exempted from evaluation in moral or political or social terms. The distinction Rorty draws, however, has little to do with traditional attempts to draw lines of demarcation of this sort between a private and a public domain – to determine which aspects of our lives we do and which we don’t have to answer for publicly. Rorty’s distinction, rather, goes to the purposes of theoretical vocabularies. We should, Rorty urges, be “content to treat the demands of self-creation and of human solidarity as equally valid, yet forever incommensurable” (CIS, xv). Rorty’s view is that we should treat vocabularies for deliberation about public goods and social and political arrangements, on the one hand, and vocabularies developed or created in pursuit of personal fulfilment, self-creation, and self-realization, on the other, as distinct tools. The attempt to bring them together, in an overarching theory, is part of what has led philosophy to pursue projects that have exceeded their usefulness.

Rorty’s distinction between public and private is personified in the figure of the liberal ironist (CIS, chapter 4). She is a person who recognizes that her final vocabulary can be split into two parts, where the public part of her final vocabulary has to do with her responsibilities to others (justice), and the private part of her final vocabulary has to do with her responsibilities to herself (self-creation). Arguably, the liberal ironist is the type of person Rorty himself aspired to be, as evidenced by his autobiographical essay, “Trotsky and the Wild Orchids” (in PSH). There, he admits that much of his early philosophical career had been an attempt to reconcile public and private, but he “gradually decided that the whole idea of holding reality and justice in a single vision had been a mistake” (PSH, 12).

Critics have often worried that Rorty’s line between public and private simply reinscribes one of the most problematic features of liberalism. However, the line Rorty draws between public and private is necessarily porous; it is in part because of the move of private vocabularies to the public realm that social progress occurs.

3.5 Redescription and Social Progress

The key imperative in Rorty’s ethico-political agenda is the deepening and widening of solidarity. Consistent with his ethnocentrism, he distinguishes between “us” and “them,” arguing that thinking of more and diverse people as “one of us” is the hallmark of social progress (CIS, 191). Solidarity is brought about by gradual and contingent expansions of the scope of “we;” it is created through the hard work of training our sympathies rather than through the recognition of antecedent criteria that stipulate what we have in common. We train our sympathies, Rorty thinks, by exposing ourselves to forms of suffering we had previously overlooked. Thus, the task of the intellectual, with respect to social progress, is not to provide refinements of social theory, but to sensitize us to the suffering of others, and refine, deepen and expand our ability to identify with others, to think of others as like ourselves in morally relevant ways. (EHO, Part III; CIS, Part III). The liberal ironist, in particular, sees “enlarging our acquaintance” (CIS, 80) as the only way to assuage the doubts she has about herself and her culture.

The task of achieving solidarity is, for Rorty, divided up between agents of love (or guardians of diversity) and agents of justice (or guardians of universality). Rorty writes,

The moral tasks of a liberal democracy are divided between the agents of love and the agents of justice. In other words, such a democracy employs and empowers both connoisseurs of diversity and guardians of universality. The former insist that there are people out there whom society has failed to notice. They make these candidates for admission visible by showing how to explain their odd behavior in terms of a coherent, if unfamiliar, set of beliefs and desires – as opposed to explaining this behavior with terms like stupidity, madness, baseness or sin. The latter, the guardians of universality, make sure that once these people are admitted as citizens, once they have been shepherded into the light by the connoisseurs of diversity, they are treated just like all the rest of us. (ORT, “On Ethnocentrism: A Reply to Clifford Geertz” 206)

This distinction between guardians of universality and guardians of diversity corresponds to Rorty’s distinction between propositions and vocabularies (see section 2.2). A change in our beliefs may result from convincing argument that occurs at the intra-vocabulary level, within what Rorty earlier refers to as “normal discourse” (PMN, 320). A change in what we perceive as interesting truth-value candidates occurs at the inter-vocabulary level, within “abnormal discourse.” Abnormal discourse, Rorty contends, can produce “anything from nonsense to intellectual revolution” (PMN, 320). Which of these it will produce depends on whether the new descriptions offered up catch on more broadly. Rorty identifies romanticism as the view that the latter sort of change is the more significant one (CIS “Introduction,” essay 1).

The guardians of diversity contribute to social progress by offering new descriptions that the liberal ironist might find in her search for new and compelling descriptions to adopt or incorporate into her own final vocabulary. In CIS, this role is attributed to strong poets and ironist theorists on the one hand, and novelists and journalists, on the other. Strong poets and ironist theorists, like Marcel Proust, Friedrich Nietzsche, Martin Heidegger, and Jacques Derrida, offer new descriptions in their private attempts to achieve autonomy by getting out from under the final vocabularies they have inherited. Novelists, like Vladimir Nabokov, George Orwell, Charles Dickens, Harriet Beecher Stowe, and Radclyffe Hall, offer new descriptions that draw our attention to the suffering of previously-overlooked people and groups. They contribute to social progress by pointing out “concrete cases of particular people ignoring the suffering of other particular people” (ORT, 79). Because reading novels is one of the best ways to sensitize ourselves to the suffering experienced by others – to see that they have “the same tendency to bleed when pricked” (RR, 465) – Rorty thinks a liberal arts education is key to maintaining liberal democracy, and for strengthening a global human rights culture (“Human Rights, Rationality, and Sentimentality” in TP). In other essays, like “Feminism and Pragmatism,” the role of guardian of diversity is expanded to include prophetic thinkers, like Catharine A. MacKinnon and Marilyn Frye, who offer new descriptions in their public efforts to reduce suffering.

Rorty ultimately refers to these methods for securing social progress as “cultural politics.” Cultural politics includes both negative projects – abandoning words and descriptions that block our ability to sympathize with others – and positive projects – new ways of speaking that help us see that “others” are “just like us,” and therefore deserve to be part of our moral community (“Cultural Politics and the Question of the Existence of God” in PCP). Cultural politics thus involves imagining and articulating utopian visions, a task he contends falls naturally to the Left, which is, “by definition, the party of hope. It insists that our nation remains unachieved” (AOC, 14).

3.6 Rorty’s America

Rorty’s utopian yearnings describe an America that has taken up his proposal to replace theory with metaphor and universal moral principles with feelings of solidarity (“Looking Backwards from the Year 2096” in PSH). He also argues that achieving solidarity requires economic security; when our economic circumstances are such that we are forced to choose between feeding our families and feeding strangers, the community to which one is loyal will contract. In his words,

Our loyalty to … larger groups will, however, weaken, or even vanish altogether, when things get really tough. Then people whom we once thought of as like ourselves will be excluded. Sharing food with impoverished people down the street is natural and right in normal times, but perhaps not in a famine, when doing so amounts to disloyalty to one’s family. The tougher things get, the more ties of loyalty to those near at hand tighten, and the more those to everyone else slacken. (PCP, 42)

Following the pragmatist insight that beliefs are habits of action, Rorty contends that to hold a belief simply means that one is inclined to act in certain ways and not in others. Thus, “to believe that someone is ‘one of us,’ a member of our moral community, is to exhibit readiness to come to their assistance when they are in need” (Rorty 1996, 13). Thus “an answer to the question ‘who are we?’ which is to have any moral significance, has to be one which takes money into account” (Rorty 1996, 14).

This helps to explain why Rorty calls for a return to the reformist Left of the 1960s in America, when universities and unions found common cause. What Rorty calls the “cultural Left” – the contemporary, academic left – is plagued by two related problems. First, it has ignored economic inequality (Rorty’s shorthand for which is “selfishness”) and focused on other, identity-based forms of inequality (Rorty’s shorthand for which is “sadism”). While Rorty thinks attempting to ameliorate racial and gender inequality is a laudable goal, he laments the fact that this focus has displaced the focus on economic inequality. Second, Rorty worries that the cultural left tries to theorize its way “into political relevance,” and thereby adopts a “spectatorial approach” (AOC, 94). In so doing, it prioritizes knowledge over hope. Thus, Rorty enjoins the cultural Left to abandon its spectatorial approach by abandoning theory and reviving its hope in the promise of America.

A reinvigorated Left would have to reclaim the sort of pride in America that animated the work of the reformist Left. Rorty opens Achieving Our Country (1998) by writing,

National pride is to countries what self-respect is to individuals: a necessary condition for self-improvement. Too much national pride can produce bellicosity and imperialism, just as excessive self-respect can produce arrogance. But just as too little self-respect makes it difficult for a person to display moral courage, so insufficient national pride makes energetic and effective debate about national policy unlikely. (AOC, 3)

While philosophical theorizing about America is a symptom of hopelessness, engaging in debates about what America can do and become represents a hopeful attitude that he thinks is required for social progress.

4. Rorty in the Conversations of Philosophy

The wide scope of Rorty’s metaphilosophical deconstruction of representationalism in PMN, together with a penchant for uncashed metaphor and swift, broad-stroke historical narrative of the sort displayed in CP, earned Rorty a sturdy reputation as an anti-philosopher’s philosopher. At the same time, however, as his reputation within the dominant cultures of analytic philosophy was waning in the wake of PMN, his writings from the 1980s in particular gained a significant readership beyond the confines of the profession. Still, while his academic engagement certainly ranged far beyond the confines of analytic philosophy, it would be wrong to say that Rorty turned his back on that enterprise. The relationship, as we shall see – though both complicated and shifting over the decades – has continued to develop as Rorty’s work is appropriated by new generations of readers.

4.1 Critical Responses

By 1970, the year Rorty was promoted to full professor at Princeton, he had made a name for himself in analytic philosophy. He had written a series of original and often prescient essays (MLM) on issues then at the of center of professional attention, notably in philosophy of mind and metaphilosophy, and he had also edited the volume, The Linguistic Turn: Essays in Philosophical Method (1992). This collection of papers by prominent contributors, framed by Rorty’s extensive introduction, received a great deal of attention and acclaim. It did much to cement the idea of a linguistic turn (Rorty attributes the notion to Gustav Bergman (Rorty 1992, xx)) as a sea change in the history of philosophy.

Throughout the 1970s Rorty’s metaphilosophical papers prodded the self-understanding of contemporary analytical philosophy, advocating the relevance of American pragmatism, Wittgenstein, and thinkers in the European Continental tradition to the self-conception of post-positivist analytic philosophy. It is well documented that Rorty became increasingly disenchanted with the practice of philosophy as it was conducted by the dominant figures in the Princeton department during this period, and no doubt the feeling was reciprocated (Gross, 2008).

Nevertheless, within the philosophical community at large, Rorty’s standing was such that he was elected President of the Eastern Division of the American Philosophical Association for the academic year 1979–1980. Just weeks before he gave the Presidential Address (“Pragmatism, Relativism, and Irrationalism,” see RR), however, PMN was published by Princeton University Press. To Rorty’s surprise (Rorty in Lewis-Kraus, 2003), this monograph was read as an attack on the basic creed of analytic philosophy as such, rather than as an attempt at benevolent reform. Most reviews were hostile to what was regarded as Rorty’s end-of-philosophy message, and in the years that followed, Rorty’s challenge to representationalist epistemology was in many influential quarters studiously ignored.

In retrospect, the hostility may appear excessive, but understandable. As we have seen in connection with Rorty’s attitude to science, it is particularly Rorty’s treatment of truth and knowledge that drew fire from philosophers. While a great variety of philosophers have criticized Rorty on this general score in a great variety of ways, a common concern stands out; Rorty’s conversationalist view of truth and knowledge leaves us entirely unable to account for the notion that a reasonable view of how things are is a view suitably constrained by how the world actually is. This criticism is levelled against Rorty not only from the standpoint of metaphysical and scientific realist views of the sort that Rorty hoped would soon be extinct. It is expressed also by thinkers who respect Rorty’s dialectical acumen, who have some sympathy with Rorty’s historicist view of intellectual progress, and who find persuasive his critique of Kantian and Platonist features of modern philosophy. John McDowell (McDowell, 1994), for instance, claims that Rorty’s view of the relation between agent and world as merely causal runs afoul of the notion that our very concept of a creature with beliefs involves the idea of a rational constraint of the world on our epistemic states. Pascal Engel, in his exchange with Rorty on the notion of truth (Rorty and Engel, 2007), takes Rorty to task for giving up the very notion that undergirds rational argument and conviction, without which it is hard to see what the remit of philosophy might possibly be.

However, critics are not concerned only with what they see as a misguided view of belief, truth, and knowledge, whether relativist, subjectivist, or idealist in nature. An important reason for the high temperature of much of the debate that Rorty has inspired is that he appears to some to reject the very values that are the basis for any articulation of a philosophical view of truth and knowledge at all. As Engel emphasizes, Rorty is indeed critical of the role of argument in intellectual progress, and he is dismissive of the very idea of theories of truth, of knowledge, of rationality, and the like. Philosophers such as Hilary Putnam and Susan Haack, who shared Rorty’s view that analytic philosophy would do well to incorporate the lessons of American pragmatism, focused their criticisms on exactly this aspect of Rorty’s views. Haack, in particular, frames her attacks on Rorty along these lines in moral terms; to her mind, Rorty’s efforts to abandon the basic concepts of traditional epistemology are symptoms of a vulgar cynicism, which contributes to the decline of reason and intellectual integrity that Haack and others find to be characteristic of much contemporary thought. The charge of intellectual irresponsibility is sometimes raised, or at last implied, in connection with Rorty’s use of historical figures. Rorty’s reading of Descartes and of Kant in PMN have often been challenged, as has his more constructive uses of Hegel, Nietzsche, Heidegger, and Wittgenstein. The kind of appropriation of other writers and thinkers that Rorty performs will at times seem to do violence to the views and intentions of the protagonists. Rorty, however, is quite clear about the rhetorical point and scholarly limitations of these kinds of redescriptions, as he explains in “The Historiography of Philosophy: Four Genres” (Rorty, 1984).

4.2 Claim to Pragmatism

Rorty’s reading of earlier philosophers has always been unabashedly appropriative, and hence often controversial. His heterodox reading of Dewey and his generally dismissive attitude toward Peirce has also meant that Rorty found few friends among the keepers of the pragmatist tradition in the American academy. Prominent readers of the classical American pragmatists have expressed deep reservations about Rorty’s interpretation of Dewey and Peirce, in particular, and of his construal of the pragmatist movement in general (see, for instance, Misak, 2013.) Consequently, Rorty’s entitlement to the label “pragmatist” has been challenged. Haack’s strong claims on this score are notable, but there are many others. (See the discussions of Rorty in Alexander, 1987; Brodsky, 1982; Campbell, 1984; Edel, 1985; Gouinlock, 1995; Lavine 1995; R.W: Sleeper, 1986; as well as the essays in Langsdorf and Smith, 1995.) For Rorty, the key figure in the American pragmatist movement is John Dewey, to whom he attributes many of his own central doctrines. In particular, Rorty finds in Dewey an anticipation of his own view of philosophy as the facilitator of a humanist politics, of a non-ontological view of the virtues of inquiry, of a holistic conception of human intellectual life, and of an anti-essentialist, historicist conception of philosophical thought. To read Dewey his way, however, Rorty explicitly sets about separating the “good” from the “bad” Dewey (see “Dewey’s Metaphysics” in CP, and “Dewey between Hegel and Darwin” in TP). He is critical of what he takes to be Dewey’s backsliding into metaphysics in Experience and Nature, and has no patience for the constructive attempt of Logic: The Theory of Inquiry. Rorty thus imposes a scheme of evaluation on Dewey’s works which many scholars object to. Lavine, for one, claims that “scientific method” is Dewey’s central concept (Lavine 1995, 44). Sleeper holds that reform rather than elimination of metaphysics and epistemology is Dewey’s aim (Sleeper 1986, 2, chapter 6).

Rorty’s least favourite pragmatist is Peirce, whom he regards as subject to both scheme-content dualism and to a degree of scientism. So it is not surprising that Haack, whose own pragmatism draws inspiration from Peirce, finds Rorty’s recasting of pragmatism literally unworthy of the name. From Haack’s perspective, Rorty’s opposition to the epistemological orientation of modern philosophy breaks fundamentally with the American pragmatists, in so far as he dismisses the very project that gave direction to their work. While classical pragmatism is an attempt to understand and work out a novel legitimating framework for scientific inquiry, Haack maintains, Rorty’s “pragmatism” (Haack consistently uses quotes) is simply an abandonment of the very attempt to learn more about the nature and adequacy conditions of inquiry. Instead of aiding us in our aspiration to govern ourselves through rational thought, Rorty weakens our intellectual resilience and leaves us even more vulnerable to rhetorical seduction. To Haack and her sympathisers, Rorty’s pragmatism is dangerous, performing an end-run on reason, and therefore on philosophy. Cheryl Misak, who is one of the most influential voices among contemporary pragmatists, and who also shares Haack’s enthusiasm for Peirce, criticizes Rorty along similar lines. When Rorty abandons the notion of objectivity, Misak argues, he also dispenses with the capacity for normative critique (Misak, 2013). Rorty, from this perspective, ends up with a pragmatism of subjectivity in the tradition of William James.

4.3 Analytic Philosophy

Rorty is sometimes portrayed as a renegade, as someone who went through a transformation from bona fide analytical philosopher to something else, and then lived to tell a tale of liberation from youthful enchantment. This portrayal, however, distorts both Rorty’s view of analytical philosophy and the trajectory of his thinking. Indeed, Rorty’s relationship to the traditions of Western philosophy is more nuanced than his reputation might suggest. So, too, is his relation to analytical philosophy in particular.

Though the introduction to the 1967 volume on the linguistic turn (Rorty, 1992) and the early papers in philosophy of mind from the 1960s do show Rorty adopting frameworks for philosophical problems that he later dispenses with, these writings at the same time very clearly bear the mark of the fundamental metaphilosophical attitude which becomes increasingly explicit in the next decade (see Stephen Leach and James Tartaglia, “Introduction,” MLM 1–15). In the Preface to PMN, referring to Hartshorne, McKeon, Carnap, Robert Brumbaugh, Carl Hempel, and Paul Weiss, Rorty says,

I was very fortunate in having these men as my teachers, but, for better or worse, I treated them all as saying the same thing: that a “philosophical problem” was a product of the unconscious adoption of a set of assumptions built into the vocabulary in which the problem was stated – assumptions which were to be questioned before the problem itself was taken seriously. (PMN, xiii)

This way of stating the lesson, however, appears to leave open the possibility that certain philosophical problems eventually may legitimately be taken seriously – that is, at face value in the sense that they require constructive solutions – provided the assumptions which sustain their formulation stand up to proper critical scrutiny. Taken this way, the attitude Rorty here expresses would be more or less the same as that of all those philosophers who have diagnosed their predecessors’ work as mixtures of pseudo-questions and genuine problems dimly glimpsed, problems which now, with the proper frame of questioning fully clarified, may be productively addressed. But the full force of the lesson Rorty learned emerges only with the view that this notion of proper critical scrutiny is questionable. For Rorty, to legitimate the assumptions on which a philosophical problem is based would be to establish that the terms we require to pose that problem are really mandatory, that the vocabulary in which we encounter the problem is in principle inescapable. But Rorty’s construal of the linguistic turn, as well as his proposals for eliminating the vocabulary of the mental, are really at odds with the idea that we might hope to construct a definitive vocabulary for philosophy. Even in his early days, Rorty’s approach to philosophy is shaped by the historicist conviction that no vocabulary is inescapable in principle. This means that progress in philosophy is gained less from constructive solutions to problems than through therapeutic dissolution of their causes, that is, through the invention of new vocabularies achieved by the launch of new and fruitful metaphors (“Introduction” in PMN; “Unfamiliar Noises: Hesse and Davidson on Metaphor” in ORT).

To hold that no vocabulary is final is also to hold that no vocabulary can be free of unthematized yet optional assumptions. Hence any effort to circumvent a philosophical problem by making such assumptions visible is subject to its own circumvention. Accordingly, the fact that Rorty often distances himself from the terms in which he earlier framed arguments and made diagnoses is in itself no reason to impose on him, as some have done, a temporal dichotomy. It may be that Rorty’s early work, inspired by a less critical, less dialectical reading of Quine and Sellars than that offered in PMN, is more constructive than therapeutic in tone and jargon, and therefore from Rorty’s later perspective in an important sense misguided. However, what ties together all Rorty’s work, over time and across themes, is his complete lack of faith in the idea that there is an ideal vocabulary, one which contains all genuine discursive options. Rorty designates this faith Platonism (an important theme in CIS). That there are no inescapable forms of description is a thought which permeates Rorty’s work from the 1960s through his later therapeutic articulations of pragmatism right up until his characterization of philosophy as cultural politics (PCP). Characterizations of pragmatism in terms of anti-foundationalism (PMN), of anti-representationalism (ORT), and of anti-essentialism (TP) are all explicitly parasitic on constructive efforts in epistemology and metaphysics, and are intended to highlight the various ways these efforts remain under the spell of a Platonic faith in ideal concepts and mandatory forms of descriptions.

Rorty’s use of Quine and Sellars to make his fundamental points against the idea of philosophy as a knowledge legitimation project, as well as his articulation of his critique in terms of typically “analytical” philosophical problems, has contributed to an impression of PMN as an internal indictment of analytic philosophy as such. Many – some gleeful, some chagrined – have read PMN as a purported demonstration of the bankruptcy of one of the two contemporary main streams of Western philosophy. Such readers draw support for this view also from the fact that much of Rorty’s writings since PMN have been concerned to show the virtues in thinkers like Heidegger and Derrida (EHO). Forty years later, however, it seems unwise to superimpose the analytic-continental divide onto the message of PMN, or onto Rorty. In PMN, his central point is that philosophy needs to break free from the metaphor of mind as a medium of appearances, appearances that philosophy must help us sort into the mere and the reality-corresponding ones. Rorty made this point in a vocabulary that was developed by Anglo-American (whether by birth, naturalization, or late adoption) philosophers in the course of the preceding half-century. It is not necessary, and probably misleading, to see Rorty’s criticism of epistemology and the assumptions that make it appear worthwhile as a criticism of a particular philosophical style of philosophy or set of methodological habits. Reading PMN in conjunction with the essays in CP (see particularly essay 4, “Professionalized Philosophy and Transcendentalist Culture”, essay 12, “Philosophy in America Today”, and also “Introduction”), one quickly sees that the target of PMN cannot be a putative school or branch of the subject called “Analytic Philosophy.” Because Rorty thinks philosophy has no essence, has no defining historical task, fails to mark out a special domain of knowledge, and is not, in short, a natural kind (CP, 226), he leaves no ground from which to level that sort of critique. Nor is it his intention to do so. Around the time of the publication of PMN, Rorty’s view of the matter was “that ‘analytic philosophy’ now has only a stylistic and sociological unity” (CP, 217). He then qualifies this point as follows: “In saying [this], I am not suggesting that analytic philosophy is a bad thing, or is in bad shape. The analytic style is, I think, a good style. The esprit de corps among analytic philosophers is healthy and useful” (CP, 217). However, while Rorty apparently bears no prejudice against analytic philosophy in particular, the very reason for his tolerance – his antiessentialist, historicist view of philosophy and its problems – has for many critics been a point of objection. After his faint praise, Rorty goes on:

All I am saying is that analytic philosophy has become, whether it likes it or not, the same sort of discipline as we find in the other “humanities” departments – departments where pretensions to “rigor” and to “scientific” status are less evident. The normal form of life in the humanities is the same as that in the arts and in belles-lettres; a genius does something new and interesting and persuasive, and his or her admirers begin to form a school or movement. (CP, 217–218)

This is perfectly consonant with the attitude to the notion of philosophical method Rorty expresses 20 years later: “So-called methods are simply descriptions of the activities engaged in by the enthusiastic imitators of one or another original mind – what Kuhn would call the ”research programs“ to which their works gave rise” (TP, 10). Rorty’s metaphilosophical critique, then, is directed not at particular techniques or styles or vocabularies, but toward the idea that philosophical problems are anything other than transient tensions in the dynamics of evolving, contingent vocabularies. If his critique has bite specifically against analytic philosophy, this may be because of a lingering faith in philosophical problems as lasting intellectual challenges that any honest thinker has to acknowledge, and which may be met by making progress in methodology. Rorty himself, however, nowhere says that this faith is part of the essence of analytical philosophy. On the contrary, it is clear that pioneering analytical philosophers, people like Sellars, Quine, and Davidson, provided Rorty with indispensable critical tools in his attack on the epistemological legitimation-project that has been a central concern in philosophy since Descartes.

Shorn of the ambition to make progress on perpetual problems, philosophy in the analytic tradition remains a dynamic enterprise, as Rorty’s own work demonstrates. It is true that Rorty, as a professor of the humanities at the University of Virginia, found a larger intellectual audience outside philosophy departments, as he increasingly turned to literary theory and to political thought. However, while drawing on sources outside the analytic tradition and also outside the field of philosophy, Rorty never ceased to engage with analytic philosophy, and he retained a significant audience among Anglophone philosophers critical of the resurgence of metaphysics brought on by the seminal work of Saul Kripke. A slow but persistent resurgence and rearticulation of pragmatic naturalism beginning in the 1990s, gaining force after the turn of the millennium, provided new perspectives on Rorty and on the dialectical role of his metaphilosophical critique.

In the years since Rorty’s death, the publication of monographs and anthologies dedicated to his thought suggests that interest in Rorty’s contributions is on the rise in the world of Anglophone philosophy. The tone of these critical appraisals is generally different from the frequently harsh responses to the slayer of representationalist epistemology that appeared during the 1980s. Perceptions of Rorty’s critique have clearly softened; recent commentators appear less concerned to defend the epistemological enterprise, and more interested in coming to terms with Rorty’s critique and to understand it in historical perspective. Moreover, Rorty’s work is increasingly being addressed as a contribution to political thought, with attention shifting away from meta-epistemology and on to Rorty’s vision and defense of liberalism, his distinctive conception of social progress, and his assessments of the prospects of reform toward greater social justice. While his attack on representationalism gained Rorty notoriety as a metaphilosophical nihilist, the legacy that is now taking shape tends rather to highlight Rorty’s fundamental and enduring concern with the connection between philosophical thinking and the pursuit of human happiness, thus making a place for Rorty’s voice in a conversation that springs from the founding impulses of Western philosophy.


Works by Rorty

Cited by Abbreviation

1979, Philosophy and the Mirror of Nature, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
1982, Consequences of Pragmatism, Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press.
1989, Contingency, Irony, and Solidarity, New York: Cambridge University Press.
1991, Objectivity, Relativism, and Truth: Philosophical Papers, Volume 1, New York: Cambridge University Press.
1991, Essays on Heidegger and Others: Philosophical Papers, Volume 2, New York: Cambridge University Press.
1998, Truth and Progress: Philosophical Papers, Volume 3, New York: Cambridge University Press.
1998, Achieving Our Country: Leftist Thought in Twentieth Century America. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
2000, Philosophy and Social Hope. New York: Penguin Books.
2007, Philosophy as Cultural Politics, Philosophical Papers, Volume 4, New York: Cambridge University Press.
2010, The Rorty Reader. Voparil, C. J., and R. J. Bernstein (eds), Oxford: Wiley-Blackwell.
2014, Mind, Language, and Metaphilosophy: Early Philosophical Papers. Leach, S., and J. Tartaglia (eds.). New York: Cambridge University Press.
2020, On Philosophy and Philosophers: Unpublished Papers, 1960–2000. Małecki, W. P., and C. Voparil (eds.). New York: Cambridge University Press.

Other Works by Rorty

  • 1952, “Whitehead’s Use of the Concept of Potentiality,” MA thesis, University of Chicago.
  • 1956, “The Concept of Potentiality,” PhD dissertation, Yale University.
  • 1961, “Recent Metaphilosophy,” The Review of Metaphysics, 15(2): 299–318.
  • 1972, “Functionalism, Machines, and Incorrigibility,” Journal of Philosophy, 69: 203–220.
  • 1973, “Criteria and Necessity,” Noûs, 7(4): 313–329.
  • 1976, “Realism and Reference,” The Monist, 59(3): 321–340.
  • 1977, “Derrida on Language, Being, and Abnormal Philosophy,” Journal of Philosophy, 74(11): 673–681.
  • 1979, “Transcendental Arguments, Self-Reference and Pragmatism,” in P. Bieri, R. P. Hortsman, and L. Kruger (eds.), Transcendental Arguments and Science, Dordrecht: D. Reidel, pp. 77–103.
  • 1982, “Contemporary Philosophy of Mind,” Synthese, 53(2): 323–348.
  • 1984, “The Historiography of Philosophy: Four Genres,” in R. Rorty, J. B. Schneewind, and Q. Skinner (eds.), Philosophy in History, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 49–76.
  • 1986, “Beyond Realism and Anti-Realism,” in L. Nagl, and R. Heinrich (eds.), Wo steht die Analytische Philosophie heute? Vienna: R. Oldenbourg Verlag, Munich, pp. 103–115.
  • 1996, “Who Are We?: Moral Universalism and Economic Triage,” Diogenes, 44(173): 5–15.
  • 1997, “Introduction,” in W. Sellars, Empiricism and the Philosophy of Mind. Cambridge, Mass. and London: Harvard University Press, pp. 1–12.
  • 1997, Truth, Politics and ‘Post-Modernism.’ The 1997 Spinoza Lectures. Amsterdam: Van Gorcum.
  • 1999, “Pragmatism as Anti-Authoritarianism,” Revue Internationale de Philosophie, 53(207): 7–20.
  • 2007, “Dewey and Posner on Pragmatism and Moral Progress,” University of Chicago Law Review, 74(3): 915–927.

Edited Volumes, Collaborations, Exchanges, and Interviews

  • Auxier, R. E., and L. E. Hahn (eds.), 2010, The Philosophy of Richard Rorty, Chicago: Open Court.
  • Balslev, A. N., 1999, Cultural Otherness: Correspondence with Richard Rorty, Atlanta: Scholars Press.
  • Brandom, R. B., (ed.), 2000, Rorty and His Critics. Malden: Blackwell.
  • Collini, S. (ed.), 1992, Interpretation and Overinterpretation, New York: Cambridge University Press.
  • Festenstein, M., and S. Thompson (eds.), 2001, Richard Rorty: Critical Dialogues. Cambridge: Polity Press.
  • Huang, Y. (ed.), 2009, Rorty, Pragmatism, and Confucianism: With Responses by Richard Rorty, Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Kulp, C. B., (ed.), 1997, Realism/Antirealism and Epistemology. Lanham, MD: Rowman and Littlefield Publishers, Inc.
  • Lewis-Kraus, G., 2003, “An Interview with Richard Rorty,” The Believer 3. [Available online].
  • Mendieta, E. (ed.), 2006, Take Care of Freedom and Truth will Take Care of Itself: Interviews with Richard Rorty, Stanford: Stanford University Press.
  • Mouffe, C. (ed.), 1996, Deconstruction and Pragmatism, New York: Routledge.
  • Niznik, J and J. T. Sanders (eds.), 1996, Debating the State of Philosophy: Habermas, Rorty and Kołakowski. Westport: Praeger Publishers.
  • Nystrom, D., and K. Puckett (eds.), 1998, Against Bosses, Against Oligarchies: A Conversation with Richard Rorty. Charlottesville, VA: Prickly Pear Pamphlets.
  • Rorty, R., E. Lee, and A. Mourelatos, (eds.), 1973, Exegesis and Argument: Essays in Greek Philosophy presented to Gregory Vlastos. Amsterdam: Van Gorcum.
  • Rorty, R. (ed.), 1992, The Linguistic Turn: Essays in Philosophical Method with Two Retrospective Essays. Chicago and London: The University of Chicago Press.
  • Rorty, R., and G. Vattimo, 2005, The Future of Religion, S. Zabala (ed.), New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Rorty, R., and P. Engel, 2007, What’s the Use of Truth?, W. McCuaig (trans.), New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Rorty, R., 2011, An Ethics for Today: Finding Common ground between Philosophy and Religion. New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Saatkamp, H. J. Jr. (ed.), 1995, Rorty and Pragmatism: The Philosopher Responds to his Critics. Nashville and London: Vanderbilt University Press.

Secondary Literature

Anthologies about Rorty

  • Auxier, R., E. Kramer, and K. P. Skowroński (eds.), 2020, Rorty and Beyond, Lanham, MD: Lexington Books.
  • Dieleman, S., D. E. McClean, and P. Showler (eds.), 2022, The Ethics of Richard Rorty: Moral Communities, Self-Transformation, and Imagination, New York and London: Routledge.
  • Goodson, J. L., 2020, The Dark Years? Philosophy, Politics, and the Problem of Predictions, Eugene, OR: Cascade Books.
  • Goodson, J. L., and B. E. Stone (eds.), 2012, Rorty and the Religious: Christian Engagements with a Secular Philosopher, Eugene, OR: Wipf and Stock Publishers.
  • Gröschner, A., C. Koopman, and M. Sandbothe (eds.), 2013, Richard Rorty: From Pragmatist Philosophy to Cultural Politics, London and New York: Bloomsbury.
  • Guignon, C., and D. R. Hiley (eds.), 2003, Richard Rorty, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Janack, M. (ed.), 2010, Feminist Interpretations of Richard Rorty, University Park: The Pennsylvania State Press.
  • Langsdorf, L., and A. R. Smith (eds.), 1995, Recovering Pragmatism’s Voice: The Classical Tradition, Rorty, and the Philosophy of Communication, Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Marchetti, G. (ed.), 2022, The Ethics, Epistemology, and Politics of Richard Rorty. New York and London: Routledge.
  • Malachowski, A. R. (ed.), 1990, Reading Rorty: Critical Responses to Philosophy and the Mirror of Nature and Beyond, Oxford and Cambridge, MA: Blackwell.
  • ––– (ed.), 2020, A Companion to Rortyk Hoboken, NJ: John Wiley and Sons Ltd.
  • Müller, M. (ed.), 2019, Handbuch Richard Rorty, Wiesbaden: Springer VS.
  • Peters, M. A., and P. Ghiraldelli, Jr. (eds.), 2002, Richard Rorty: Education, Philosophy, and Politics, Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield.
  • Pettegrew, J. (ed.), 2000, A Pragmatist’s Progress?: Richard Rorty and American Intellectual History, Lanham, MD: Roman & Littlefield.
  • Rondel, D. (ed.), 2021, The Cambridge Companion to Rorty. New York: Cambridge University Press.
  • Saatkamp, H. J. (ed.), 1995, Rorty and Pragmatism: The Philosopher Responds to His Critics, Nashville, TN: Vanderbilt University Press.

Monographs about Rorty

  • Arcilla, R. V., 1995, For the Love of Perfection: Richard Rorty and Liberal Education, New York and London: Routledge.
  • Bacon, M, 2007, Richard Rorty: Pragmatism and Political Liberalism, Lanham and Plymouth: Lexington Books.
  • Calcaterra, R. M., 2019, Contingency and Normativity: The Challenges of Richard Rorty, Boston: Brill-Rodopi.
  • Calder, G., 2007, Rorty’s Politics of Redescription, Cardiff: University of Wales Press.
  • Casey, M. A., 2002, Meaninglessness: The Solutions of Nietzsche, Freud, and Rorty, Lanham: Lexington Books.
  • Chin, C., 2018, The Practice of Political Theory: Rorty and Continental Thought, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Curtis, W. B., 2015, Defending Rorty: Pragmatism and Liberal Virtue, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Farrell, F. B., 1994, Subjectivity, Realism and Postmodernism: The Recovery of the World in Recent Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Gander, E. M., 1999, The Last Conceptual Revolution: A Critique of Richard Rorty’s Political Philosophy, Albany: State University of New York Press, 1999.
  • Gascoigne, N., 2008, Richard Rorty, Cambridge and Malden: Polity.
  • Geras, N., 1995, Solidarity in the Conversation of Humankind: The Ungroundable Liberalism of Richard Rorty, London and New York: Verso.
  • Gross, N., 2008, Richard Rorty: The Making of an American Philosopher, Chicago and London: The University of Chicago Press.
  • Hall, D. L., 1994, Richard Rorty: Poet and Prophet of the New Pragmatism, Albany, NY: State University of New York Press.
  • Kolenda, K., 1990, Rorty’s Humanistic Pragmatism: Philosophy Democratized, Tampa: University of South Florida Press.
  • Kuipers, R. A., 1997, Solidarity and the Stranger: Themes in the Social Philosophy of Richard Rorty, Lanham: University Press of America.
  • –––, 2013, Richard Rorty, London and New York: Bloomsbury.
  • Llanera, T., 2020, Richard Rorty: Outgrowing Modern Nihilism, Palgrave MacMillan.
  • Malachowski, A. R., 2002, Richard Rorty, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Voparil, C. J., 2006, Richard Rorty: Politics and Vision, Lanham: Rowman and Littlefield.
  • –––, 2022, Reconstructing Pragmatism: Richard Rorty and the Classical Pragmatists. New York: Oxford University Press.

Citations and Other Relevant Works

  • Alexander, T. M., 1987, John Dewey’s Theory of Art, Experience, and Nature: The Horizons of Feeling, Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Brodsky, G., 1982, “Rorty’s Interpretation of Pragmatism,” Transactions of the Charles S. Peirce Society, 18(4): 311–337.
  • Campbell, J., 1984, “Rorty’s Use of Dewey” Southern Journal of Philosophy, 22(2): 175–187.
  • Edel, A., 1985, “A Missing Dimension in Rorty’s Use of Pragmatism,” Transactions of the Charles S. Peirce Society, 21(1): 21–37.
  • Gouinlock, J., 1995, “What is the Legacy of Instrumentalism? Rorty’s Interpretation of Dewey” in H. J. Saatkamp (ed.), Rorty and Pragmatism, Nashville, TN: Vanderbilt University Press, pp. 72–90.
  • Haack, S., 1993, Evidence and Inquiry: Towards Reconstruction in Epistemology, Oxford and Cambridge, MA: Blackwell.
  • –––, 1998, Manifesto of a Passionate Moderate, Chicago and London: The University of Chicago Press.
  • Lavine, T. Z., 1995, “America & the Contestations of Modernity: Bentley, Dewey, Rorty,” in H. J. Saatkamp (ed.), Rorty and Pragmatism, Nashville, TN: Vanderbilt University Press, pp. 37–49.
  • McDowell, J., 1994, Mind and World, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Misak, C., 2013, The American Pragmatists, Oxford and New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Quine, W. V. O., 1951 [1953/1980], “Two Dogmas of Empiricism,” Philosophical Review, 60: 20–43; reprinted in From a Logical Point of View, 1953 (2nd Edition, 1980), Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, pp. 20–46.
  • Sleeper, R.W., 1986, The Necessity of Pragmatism, New Haven and London: Yale University Press.

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