Double Consciousness

First published Mon Mar 21, 2016; substantive revision Thu Feb 16, 2023

Double-consciousness is a concept in social philosophy referring, originally, to a source of inward “twoness” putatively experienced by African-Americans because of their racialized oppression and disvaluation in a white-dominated society. The concept is associated with William Edward Burghardt Du Bois, who introduced the term into social thought in his groundbreaking The Souls of Black Folk (1903). Its source has been traced back from there, by recent commentators, to the development of clinical psychology in the nineteenth-century North Atlantic, and to trends in idealist philosophies of self – the transcendentalism of Ralph Waldo Emerson and G.W.F. Hegel’s Phenomenology of Spirit. It is thus indirectly related to other nineteenth- and twentieth-century riffs on Hegelian themes, such as false consciousness and bad faith. In our day it continues to be used by numerous commentators on racialized cultures, societies, and literatures; by cultural and literary theorists; and by students and researchers of Africana Philosophy. Recent philosophical debates center on the significance of the concept for Du Bois’s thought overall, its theoretical coherence, and its relevance given current social conditions.

1. The Trajectory of the Concept

In an 1897 Atlantic Monthly article and again in his 1903 Souls of Black Folk, Du Bois innovated by using a term already in currency – and with multiple associations in a variety of literary, philosophical, and scientific discourses – in a distinctive and original way to name a theretofore largely unremarked phenomenon. The innovation was part of an account of the life-experience he ascribed to “black folk” in America generally in then-current social circumstances – Jim Crow in the south, de facto segregation in the North, and the threat and actuality of racist violence throughout the nation.

The term he used – “double-consciousness” – dropped entirely, after just these two uses, from his published writing. Those uses nonetheless struck a chord; use of the term, interpreted in a number of ways, has frequently recurred as the century since its appearance has passed. While the disappearance of the term from Du Bois’s writing after 1903 has fueled questions about the significance of the concept in the overall assessment of his work, some commentators insist nonetheless on the centrality of the concept for Du Bois’s legacy.

Du Bois was engaged throughout his long career in the attempt to understand both the socio-historic conditions facing “Black folk” in the American twentieth century, and the impacts of those conditions on the consciousness and “inner world” of the human beings subject to them. In Souls of Black Folk that second concern was with capturing in words “the strange meaning of being black”, with describing the “spiritual world” and the “spiritual strivings” of “the American Negro”. Du Bois continued to articulate responses to these concerns in his later works: one finds formulations addressing them even in his posthumously published Autobiography (1968). As the contexts of Du Bois’s writing, research, and activism changed, these responses shifted in focus, emphasis, and perspective. Broadly speaking, as his reflections on what he initially termed the “spiritual world” of Black folk came to be more richly filled out in the variety and extent of its details, Du Bois’s account of the phenomena he originally identified with the term “double-consciousness” both overflowed the initial associations of that term and became stratified under pressure from his shifts in perspective. In what follows, we trace the fate of Du Bois’s 1903 account in his later work and then assess the reconstructed account on its own terms.

This article will, first, briefly survey some of the attempts to explicate and contextualize the use of the concept by Du Bois in The Souls of Black Folk of 1903 (hereafter Souls), and give a brief overview of controversies regarding the viability of the concept and its significance for contemporary Africana thought. After presenting suggestions concerning the development of Du Bois’s understanding of the phenomenon after Souls, we’ll look briefly at three recent distinctive uses of it ‘beyond the black/white binary’. (The term Du Bois used was “double-consciousness”, with the hyphen intact; more recent writers have generally abandoned the hyphen. In this article the hyphen is retained in discussing Du Bois’s 1903 term and concept, and interpretive attempts to get at it. But “double consciousness” simpliciter is used when discussing the term more generally in relation to current debates.)

2. Double-Consciousness in The Souls of Black Folk

The locus classicus for the Du Boisian conception occurs in the third paragraph of “Of our Spiritual Strivings”, the first chapter of Du Bois’s 1903 Souls (a slightly modified version of “The Strivings of the Negro People”, published in The Atlantic Monthly in August, 1897, where he first uses the term):

After the Egyptian and Indian, the Greek and Roman, the Teuton and Mongolian, the Negro is a sort of seventh son, born with a veil, and gifted with second-sight in this American world, – a world which yields him no true self-consciousness, but only lets him see himself through the revelation of the other world. It is a peculiar sensation, this double-consciousness, this sense of always looking at one’s self through the eyes of others, of measuring one’s soul by the tape of a world that looks on in amused contempt and pity. One ever feels his two-ness, – an American, a Negro; two souls, two thoughts, two unreconciled strivings; two warring ideals in one dark body, whose dogged strength alone keeps it from being torn asunder. (1997 [1903]: 38) [This passage henceforth referred to as the “Strivings” text.]

An inspection of the passage reveals the complexity of its object. Double-consciousness is identified as a “sensation”, a consciousness of one’s self, but which falls short of a unified, “true” self-consciousness. It is part of a more complex feeling of “two-ness”, of disparate and competing “thoughts”, “strivings”, and “ideals”. This is not an episodic or occasional sensation, but a persistent form of consciousness. Ascribed to “the Negro … in this American world”, it is a socio-cultural construct rather than a baldly bio-racial given, attributed specifically to people of African descent in America. The “two-ness” of which it is a consciousness thus is not inherent, accidental, nor benign: the condition is presented here as both imposed and fraught with psychic danger.

Double-consciousness is presented in conjunction with two other phenomena, related to two other figures – the “veil”, and the “gift” of “second-sight”. Of these, “the veil” is the more insistent motif, recurring regularly throughout Souls as well as other of Du Bois’s writings. By contrast, the terms “double-consciousness” and “second-sight” seem not to have been used in print by Du Bois after 1903. Still, this passage has come to have a singular significance in the philosophical interpretation of Du Bois’s thought as well as for the influence of his views. Only his oft-repeated claim at the very beginning of Souls, that “the problem of the Twentieth Century is the problem of the color line,” may be more widely known. The paragraph immediately following makes clear that, for Du Bois, this is not only a “sensation” but constitutes a crucial object of “striving” and political struggle for black folk in the United States:

The history of the American Negro is the history of this strife, – this longing to attain self-conscious manhood, to merge his double self into a better and truer self. In this merging he wishes neither of the older selves to be lost.

The phenomenon is identified again – but without being so named again – in the tenth chapter of Souls, “Of the Faith of the Fathers”, an essay on “Negro religious life”. Du Bois writes:

From the double life every American Negro must live, as a Negro and as an American, as swept on by the current of the nineteenth while yet struggling in the eddies of the fifteenth century, – from this must arise a painful self-consciousness, an almost morbid sense of personality, and a moral hesitancy which is fatal to self-confidence. The worlds within and without the Veil of Color are changing, and changing rapidly, but not at the same rate, not in the same way; and this must produce a peculiar wrenching of the soul, a peculiar sense of doubt and bewilderment. Such a double life, with double thoughts, double duties, and double social classes, must give rise to double words and double ideals, and tempt the mind to pretence or revolt, to hypocrisy or radicalism. (1997 [1903]: 155–6) [This passage henceforth referred to as the “Faith” text.]

Here double-consciousness, unnamed, is set in a more dynamic context than in the earlier, “Strivings” text. The two passages, parallel in form, are subtly different in tone. Here Du Bois clearly distinguishes two social “worlds” and the “double lives” that result. This text sweeps us along, showing a causality, a coming-into-being of consciousness. And it concludes by noting, in its final twenty words, the social and political consequences of this “painful” double-consciousness. Yet, oddly, the “Faith” text is largely neglected in critical discussions.

The current relevance of double consciousness to an understanding of Black lives, and of contemporary American reality, is debated in recent commentary and scholarship. In an interview, the late Toni Morrison recalled the Du Boisian motif in characterizing the literary work of Black men:

… African American male writers justifiably write books about their oppression,

she says.

Confronting the oppressor who is white male or white woman. It’s race. And the person who defines you under those circumstances is a white mind – tells you whether you’re worthy or what have you. And as long as that’s your preoccupation, you’re defending yourself against that. Reacting to it. Reacting to the definition – saying it’s not true.

Morrison contrasts this to her own approach, which is to “take away the gaze of the white male. Once you take that out, the whole world opens up”. (Morrison 2012)

Also, the New York Times columnist Charles M. Blow has more than once cited the “Strivings” text in commenting on the contemporary paradoxes of black life brought into the open by some of President Obama’s public statements in the wake of recent criminal justice controversies (Blow 2013).

A number of academic writers have worked to contextualize and interpret Du Bois’s notion of double-consciousness – most often focusing on the “Strivings” text, and neglecting the “Faith” text – to identify sources and antecedents that influenced his conception, and to clarify the concerns he was addressing and his intentions in putting it forward. A brief resume of that interpretive record follows.

2.1 Americanist Romantic Longing

In his 1992 article “W.E.B. Du Bois and the Idea of Double Consciousness”, Dickson D. Bruce Jr. suggests a variety of sources of the complex of meanings marshaled at the time by Du Bois’s use of the term. The “double consciousness” figure stems from the European romantic opposition between an innate human affinity for the transcendent and a pragmatic “materialism” grounded in a utilitarian attitude, oriented to mundane need and commercial enterprise. Tracing this understanding of double consciousness back to the American philosopher Ralph Waldo Emerson (and before him to Goethe), who used the term in his essay, “The Transcendentalist” (1842), Bruce maintains that this anti-bourgeois romanticism is a “figurative background” of Du Bois’s use of the term, to which Du Bois brought the idea that

the essence of a distinctive African consciousness was its spirituality… revealed among African Americans in their folklore, their history of patient suffering, and their faith. (Bruce 1999 [1992]: 238)

Bruce also briefly traces the trajectory of “double-consciousness” in the medical and psychological literature of the nineteenth century. An early appearance of the term in the Medical Repository in 1817 (Mitchill 1817: 185) used it to name the condition of one Mary Reynolds, who, for a period of about fifteen years beginning in her nineteenth, alternately lived two distinct lives, with wholly different personalities, ‘uncognizant of’ and inaccessible to each other. This use of the term had some currency throughout the nineteenth century; William James, one of Du Bois’s Harvard philosophy professors, described such cases as alternating between “primary and secondary consciousnesses” in his considerable discussion of them in the Principles of Psychology (1890: see esp. Vol. I, 379–393), published while Du Bois was at Harvard (although James does not seem to have used the term “double-consciousness”) (Bruce 1999 [1992]: 240–1). Bruce comments that

…based on Du Bois’s use of “double-consciousness” in his Atlantic essay he certainly seems to have known the term’s psychological background, because he used it in ways quite consistent with that background. (1999: 242)

[Bruce does not note the appearance of the term, in French – “double conscience” – in Josef Breuer and Sigmund Freud’s “On the Psychical Mechanism of Hysterical Phenomena” published in 1893 in Neurologisches Centralblatt, Nos. 1 and 2. This paper was later reprinted as the first chapter of Studies on Hysteria, published in 1895. Breuer and Freud appear to use the French term in responding to and developing its earlier use by Pierre Janet, relating it to “splitting of consciousness” and psychic “dissociation”. (For a discussion of the Breuer-Freud-Janet connection, see James Strachey’s introduction to Studies on Hysteria.)]

The diverse associations of these senses of the term were crucial, Bruce argues, to the resonance and suggestiveness of Du Bois’s distinctive use of the term: connotations of spiritual longing and unbridgeable opposition between two viewpoints, of the real distinctiveness and moral parity of the two personae and the possibility of their merging in a new synthetic unity signifying a cure, a fact reported in a number of cases of the psychological malady.

2.2 Color-Line Hegelianism

The first book-length study thematizing Du Boisian double-consciousness was Sandra Adell’s Double-Consciousness/ Double Bind: Theoretical Issues in Twentieth-Century Black Literature (1994). Engaging debates over theoretical approaches to Black literature, Adell argues for an intertextualism inspired by Derridean deconstruction, and aimed at transcending the “Afrocentric/ Eurocentric” divide. The book begins with a chapter on Du Bois’s “Strivings” text; Adell, following the lead of Joel Williamson’s earlier article, “W.E.B. Du Bois as a Hegelian” (1978), presents Du Bois’s text as a reading and use of crucial passages in Hegel. Du Boisian double-consciousness, she claims, “emerges from the philosophy of Hegel as it is articulated in the Phenomenology of Spirit” (1994: 8). She adduces as evidence for the Hegelian reading of Souls Du Bois’s studies with William James and Josiah Royce, references to Hegel in Du Bois’s Philosophy IV notebook from his time at Harvard, as well as his studies with von Trietschke in Berlin “(in the midst of a ‘Hegelian revival’ when he arrived)” (1994: 12).

Adell identifies three “instances” of the “doubling of consciousness” in Hegel’s text (in the section on “Self-Consciousness”; in “Lordship and Bondage”; and in “The Unhappy Consciousness”); it is the third of these that, she claims, forms the basic pattern for the “Strivings” text:

Du Bois’s “double-consciousness” decontextualizes Hegel’s “Unhappy Consciousness” … and opens it up to other contexts. In this case, the new context is one upon which is inscribed the problem of the twentieth century: the problem of the color line. (1994: 19)

Adell then sketches a reading of the entire text of Souls as a detailed “sociological, psychological, and philosophical” account of “the Negro’s being-in-the-world” (1994: 19). Her reading identifies other borrowings from German Idealism, noting along the way that

the title of Du Bois’s text itself, The Souls of Black Folk, remarks and reiterates the two concepts – soul and folk (Volk) – that are central, not only to Herder’s aesthetics, but to that of Hegel as well. (1994: 23)

2.3 A Deflationist Reading

What I’ll call a “deflationist” interpretation of Du Bois’s conception is pursued by Adolph Reed, Jr., in his 1997 book on Du Bois’s political philosophy, W.E.B. Du Bois and American Political Thought: Fabianism and the Color Line. Reed’s book offers a critique of what he dubs “vindicationist” approaches to Afro-American political thought – approaches attempting to show the significance of African-American theorists by tracing analogies and connections between their work and the “greats” of the (white) European tradition (1997: 12). The double polemical thrust of Reed’s text questions the alleged sources of influence on Du Bois’s thinking, and rejects the claim that Du Boisian double-consciousness refers to a transhistorical feature of black life in America. He points to the disappearance of the term from Du Bois’s texts after 1903 to undercut the claims that it “was a definitive element, a key organizing principle of his thought” or “a moment in a distinctively black social-theoretical discourse or tradition” (1997: 124). Reed concludes that the claim

that millions of individuals experience a peculiar form of bifurcated identity, simply by virtue of common racial status… seems preposterous on its face. (1997: 125)

Setting out a contextualizing account, Reed shows the considerable cachet of ideas of duality current when Du Bois wrote, and argues that the claims connecting Du Bois’s use of double-consciousness to Emerson, James or Hegel fail. Reed aligns Du Bois’s concept with evolutionary and Lamarckian social-scientific views instead. He argues that an emphasis on double-consciousness emerges in Du Bois interpretation only after the 1960s, when it supplants critical attention to the critique of Booker T. Washington’s strategy of “accommodation” in the third essay of the book. Reed attributes this shift in focus to “an ideological current within the post-segregation-era black petite bourgeoisie” (1997: 130) “centered on assertion of black presence within hermetically constituted communities of academic discourse” (1997: 94–5).

Ernest Allen Jr. presents a similarly deflationist case in his article, “Du Boisian Double Consciousness: The Unsustainable Argument” (2002), arguing that the Du Boisian conception of double-consciousness was a “tactical, political” attempt to gain support among sympathetic white philanthropists for the efforts of cultural uplift and organization on the part of a “Talented Tenth”, an “educated black elite”. The rhetorical construction of a model of double-consciousness in Souls involves for Allen a “double sleight of hand” (2002: 25), requiring a slippage between a putative conflict of ideals within the minds of the black elite and a more general problem for African Americans “who could not help but have internalized some of the negative sentiments that white society held towards them” (2002: 29).

The attribution of distinctive “American” and “Negro” ideals is empty, Allen argues: there are no clear examples of “Negro” ideals in the offing in Du Bois’s text. Though there is no conflict between “warring” ideals as claimed by Du Bois, there is a conflict between white racial prejudice, intransigent hostility and exclusion of blacks, on the one hand, and the ideal of civic equality for all emblazoned on the ideological banners of the American republic, on the other. This – what Allen calls “the institutionalized as well as everyday double consciousness and double dealings of white Americans” – is, he claims, “the social foundation” of the “African American ideological ambivalence” (2002: 38) that Du Boisian double-consciousness expresses.

2.4 An Analytic Politico-Philosophic Reconstruction

Robert Gooding-Williams develops a tripartite account of the concept of double-consciousness as a keystone in Du Bois’s political-philosophical project in his In the Shadow of Du Bois: Afro-Modern Political Thought in America (2009). Double-consciousness functions as part of an account of the subjective experience of African-Americans in conditions dominated by Jim Crow and the “color line”; it serves as an essential component of Du Bois’s critique of certain forms of black political leadership under those conditions; and it underwrites Du Bois’s own positive theory of “political expressivism”. Gooding-Williams, like Allen, distinguishes double-consciousness from the more general idea of “two-ness” that Du Bois connects it to, arguing also that “second sight” is a distinctive feature of Du Bois’s conception.

Gooding-Williams emphasizes that Du Bois presents the concept in Souls in a passage that begins with the question, “How does it feel to be a problem?” – a question which references the so-called “Negro problem”. This indicates an inward approach to the “subjective” felt experience of “the Negro”, an approach relating double-consciousness to “second sight”, which Du Bois characterizes as a “gift” in this American world. Gooding-Williams finds two sources for the idea of second sight – one in African-American folklore, and one in the nineteenth-century literature on animal magnetism. Both these present it as a capacity for a sort of extra-sensory perception (e.g., of ghosts) or a kind of vision into the future – a capacity to see what is not generally visible. Gooding-Williams argues that Du Bois uses “second sight” to identify “the Negro’s” capacity to see himself through the eyes of white Americans. Because white Americans constitute what Du Bois refers to as “the other world”, a social group distinct from that of black folk, whites’ perceptions of and views about blacks would not “normally” be available to blacks, for Gooding-Williams; it is second sight that gives such access. In “this American world”, however, whites’ perspectives on blacks are deeply distorted by racial prejudice. It is the “gift” of second sight, then, that makes blacks’ self-consciousness into a “false self-consciousness”, Gooding-Williams claims, by fostering in them a self-concept molded by contempt and a presumption of inferiority.

Thus, Gooding-Williams presents double-consciousness as a “false self-consciousness” arising through second sight exercised in conditions of a racially prejudiced dominant culture. This false consciousness can make way for a “true self-consciousness” only when those conditions have been transformed and whites no longer perceive blacks as “contemptible” or “inferior” (for only then will the Negro’s “second sight” reflect a perception of himself undistorted by prejudice). This eventuality, neither inevitable nor unattainable, requires the achievement of reciprocal recognition that has been denied the Negro by the white “other world” throughout American history, and is a prime object of the Du Boisian political project. That project’s broader object – indeed, the goal of the history of African-American striving – is for black Americans to be recognized as “co-workers in the kingdom of culture”. Gooding-Williams concludes that the overcoming of double-consciousness is a necessary and sufficient condition for the achievement of full equality: equality grounded in reciprocal recognition cannot be won without eradicating the basis for double-consciousness.

Gooding-Williams argues that Du Bois was concerned with double-consciousness not only as a correlate of the disenfranchised condition that constitutes the so-called Negro problem, but also as a crucial test of the effectiveness of those leading the struggle to overcome that condition. In his discussions of Booker T. Washington and Alexander Crummell (in chapters III and XII of Souls), Du Bois makes a case that both fell victim to double-consciousness, vitiating their effectiveness as leaders of the freedom struggle. Specifically, Washington’s “Atlanta Compromise” was a strategy that undermined the struggle for recognition, reinforcing double-consciousness by failing to challenge the white perception of Negro “inferiority”.

2.5 Rousseauian Self-Estrangement

Frank Kirkland notes Du Bois’s description of double-consciousness as a “feeling”, and articulates that feeling through Rousseau’s notion of amour-propre, the form of “civilized” self-love that is reflective, contrastive, and radically corrosive of social solidarity. (Rousseau’s account distinguishes amour-propre from amour de soi, an instinctual urge to self-preservation; amour-propre is a purely social feeling.)

Du Bois’ “double consciousness” refers to a black person’s felt awareness of the harmfully comparative measures of others on her character and self-esteem, by which s⁄he takes herself to be a problem in and of a social arrangement permitting such measures or obliging them. (2013: 144)

For Kirkland, Du Bois’ conception of double-consciousness is inherently comparative, the consequence of amour-propre in conditions of the color line. Du Bois, according to Kirkland, began from the “inflamed amour-propre of others”:

those (of the darker races) have their own respect and esteem … denied or underestimated by others (of the lighter races), thereby agitating and worsening the color line. (2013: 140)

For Kirkland amour-propre is not the cause of the color-line, but it does spread its reach and intensify its effects. Kirkland also stresses the element of awareness within double-consciousness, in keeping with the Rousseauian analogy:

[F]or Du Bois, this comparison gone awry is a matter about which black people are, at least, sentient, awake to, even if they have not grasped it conceptually,

writes Kirkland, adding that this is “their sentience to the comparison by which they are made a problem” (2013: 140).

Kirkland follows the “Faith” text in identifying two forms of the danger double-consciousness poses for African-Americans: a “dual/duelist” threat of internally conflicted aspirations and expectations, and a “duplicitous” hypocritical stance. Both these arise from the felt need to maintain self-esteem given hostility to one’s ideals. Notably, Kirkland also identifies a third, “dyadic” form of double-consciousness which

would reflect, via education, the result of an individual coming to a true, non-estranged comprehension of the position s⁄he deserves in comparison to others as both a citizen and a person of color with certain talents and competences. (2013: 142)

This “non-estranged” mode of double-consciousness is a “solution to the hazards” of the other two forms, according to Kirkland.

2.6 Uses and Extensions of the Concept

Cornel West extends the analytic grasp of the concept as part of a critical discussion of double-consciousness in his first book, Prophecy Deliverance! (1982). In the first chapter, West suggests an ingredient missing from Du Bois’s analysis of the self-consciousness of Africans in America, claiming that

Du Bois overlooked the broader dialectic of being American yet feeling European, of being provincial but yearning for British cosmopolitanism, of being at once incompletely civilized and materially prosperous, a genteel Brahmin amid uncouth conditions. Black Americans labored rather under the burden of a triple crisis of self-consciousness. Their cultural predicament was comprised of African appearance and unconscious cultural mores, involuntary displacement to America without American status, and American alienation from the European ethos complicated through domination by incompletely European Americans. (1982: 30–1)

West further complicates his own enumeration of the tangled elements of the African-American cultural dialectic, referring to the “anxiety-ridden provinciality” of Protestant-American self-identity, and the “distinctly antimodern values and sensibilities” dominant in the southern states, the “geographic cradle of black America” (1982: 31).

West’s formulations do not unmake but add refinements on Du Bois’s basic claim. It’s worth noting that, near the end of West’s discussion, he acknowledges that, in the first attempts to shape their own self-identity, “Black people were relatively uninformed about British culture…”. This seems to minimize the significance of “British cosmopolitanism” and “alienation from the European ethos” as issues for black folk in America generally.

In The Black Atlantic: Modernity and Double Consciousness (1993) Paul Gilroy extends Du Boisian double-consciousness both beyond the American context and at odds with an essentialist understanding of race. Gilroy claims double consciousness as an overriding thematic element in Du Bois’s thought and writing, both in and beyond Souls, part of Du Bois’s attempt to subvert rigidly fixed racial identities as imposed categories keyed to the oppressive social structures of white supremacy. The “Strivings” text is taken as one early expression of Du Bois’s own ambivalence toward modernity – an ambivalence shared widely in diasporic black cultures and political debates – and as prefiguring the increasingly transnational and pan-racial scope of Du Bois’s evolving concerns.

In a reading of Souls that is central to his book, Gilroy highlights the

nagging anxiety over the inner contradictions of modernity and a radical scepticism towards the ideology of progress with which it is associated (1993: 117)

he finds there in germ form. Elements of an implicit global-diasporic – hence “Black Atlantic” – perspective on “the meaning of being black” in that text are in tension with, and textually submerged under, the “smooth flow of African-American exceptionalisms” (1993: 120). These elements within the discourse of Souls point to the wider significance of double consciousness, according to Gilroy. He claims this global-diasporic theme would, subsequent to Souls, come “to illuminate the experience of post-slave populations in general” and to “animate a dream of global co-operation among people of color which came to full fruition only in [Du Bois’] later work” (1993: 126).

Paget Henry’s phenomenological treatment of Du Bois’s conception in his “Africana Phenomenology: Its Philosophical Implications” (2005) identifies a “theory” of double consciousness as part of a “comprehensive phenomenology of Africana self-consciousness” (2005: 85). Henry distinguishes Du Boisian double-consciousness from the double consciousness found in Hegel’s discussion of lordship and bondage in the Phenomenology by its focus on ‘the Africana subject’ Hegel neglected entirely. Henry offers further an explication of Du Boisian “second sight”: on his view, it is

the ability of the racialized Africana subject to see him/herself as “a negro”, that is, through the eyes of the white other. (2005: 89)

Henry characterizes this as a “categoric form of self-blindness … a classic case of false consciousness” (2005: 90). But Henry claims a further, ethically propitious form of second sight is possible – what he calls “potentiated second sight”. This is a “very special access and insight into the dehumanizing ‘will to power’ of the European imperial subject”. This “potentiating” of second sight can occur, according to Henry, when an Africana subject is able to uproot the “blackface” stereotype from her consciousness and reconceive herself as “an African” by operating “within the creative codes of African discourses and symbols” (2005: 91). Henry cites the Rastafarians as an example of this route to potentiated second sight. An alternate route is through an individually acquired standpoint on the world, independent of white supremacy: Du Bois himself is an exemplar.

Henry sees a close relation between Du Boisian double-consciousness and Frantz Fanon’s existential-psychoanalytic account of black self-consciousness, found in Fanon’s Black Skin, White Masks (1967). Noting the Freudian and Sartrean idiom in which Fanon carries through his analyses in that text, Henry writes that “there is no finer or more detailed account of the state of racial double consciousness” (2005: 95). In the very first pages of that text, Fanon makes clear his psychoanalytic orientation, writing of the black’s “inferiority complex” – a term first appearing in the book in an epigraph from Aimé Césaire’s Discourse on Colonialism. Fanon observes that

The effective disalienation of the black man entails an immediate recognition of social and economic realities. If there is an inferiority complex, it is the outcome of a double process: primarily, economic; subsequently, the internalization – or better, the epidermalization – of this inferiority. (1967: 10–11)

Henry details a process he dubs “negrification”, to which the black is subject in the confines of the West. In that process, “colonized Africana people lost their earlier cultural identities and became identified by the color of their skin” (2005: 96). The white colonizer projects the most reprehensible and forbidden aspects of himself onto the black man, thereby bringing about the stereotype of “the Negro”. Fanon also borrows Jungian formulations for his account, writing of the “collective unconscious of homo occidentalis”, in which the black man “symbolizes evil, sin, wretchedness, death, war, famine”. Referring to his native land, Fanon writes

[i]n Martinique, whose collective unconscious makes it a European country, when a “blue” Negro – a coal-black one – comes to visit, one reacts at once: “What bad luck is he bringing?” (1967: 191)

In an earlier text, Caliban’s Reason (2000), Henry uses the Shakespearean motif, from The Tempest, of the clash of the European colonizer Prospero with the native Caliban. He cites the “Calibanization” of the Africans imported by European slavers to the Caribbean:

[C]olor eclipsed culture. … Africans were transformed into negroes and niggers in the minds of Europeans. This racial violence shattered the cultural foundations of the African self…. Race became the primary signifier of Europeans and Africans and of the differences between them. Consequently, the identities of these two groups were rigidly inscribed in a set of binary oppositions that linked the binary black/white to other binaries such as primitive/civilized, irrational/rational, body/mind, prelogical/logical, flesh/spirit. (2000: 11–2)

Henry sees Calibanization – the imposition of a racialized identity based on a set of insidiously contrastive binaries on top of an original and native cultural identity grounded in African ways of life – as the production of a form of double consciousness.

Lewis Gordon touches on double consciousness in his Introduction to Africana Philosophy (2008). Gordon starts from Du Bois’s ‘unasked’ question, “How does it feel to be a problem?” For Gordon, this question presupposes the subjectivity, and the humanity, of the black person being addressed. And yet, the ascription of the status of a “problem” to that person involves at the same time a denial of the humanity of that black addressee. Gordon notes that “[t]he appeal to blacks as problem-people is an assertion of their ultimate location outside the system of order and rationality” (2008: 76). This outsider status, Gordon suggests, is crucial to the formation of double consciousness, leading as it does to “the splitting of worlds and consciousness itself according to the norms of U.S. society and its contradictions”. Those norms instantiate the fact that “‘American’ was persistently defined as ‘white’ in North America and the rest of the Americas” (2008: 77).

Gordon takes the “negative version” of double consciousness to result when the self-image of the black person is wholly determined by how racial others view her – her view of herself is a “white point of view” (2008: 78), relegating her to the status of noncitizen or second class citizen. Its epistemological significance is that one of the two perspectives implicit in it – that of the white world – is necessarily partial, yet positions itself as universal, and so, is “a form of consciousness that hides itself” (2008: 79). But this dominant white self-concept brings into being a “subaltern” consciousness, a consciousness of the contradictions of that dominant self-concept. This, Gordon claims, is the second, doubling consciousness in its affirmative, fully realized manifestation.

3. Double-Consciousness in Souls of Black Folk: Problems

The preceding survey yields several points of contention: issues concerning the source(s) of Du Bois’s conception and terminology, of its putative Rousseauian, Hegelian and/or American philosophical connections; the scope of the conception, that is, how widely and to whom Du Bois thought it applied; the relation between double-consciousness and the psychic duality he associated it with; the nature of “second sight”, and its relation to double-consciousness; double-consciousness’s relation to alleged “pathology,” and to critical awareness or critique; the conception’s usefulness for an understanding of the situation of black folk, both at the turn of the twentieth century when Du Bois put it forward, and today. Here we briefly recapitulate several of these.

The first question, one Gooding-Williams identifies as a paradox, concerns Du Bois’s own invulnerability to double-consciousness. If double-consciousness is indeed endemic to “Negroes” – if it was, in a sense, a structural problem for any Negro consciousness under conditions of Jim Crow – then how could Du Bois himself write as if transcending it, as having “true self-conscious manhood”? Although Du Bois never explicitly makes the claim that he himself is free from double-consciousness, his text hints at no such internal soul-struggle. And yet, his conception of double-consciousness is introduced as part of an account of his own personal experience and as based on that experience.

Gooding-Williams tries to overcome this paradox by distinguishing the narrative authority of Souls from the historical author of the text. It is the narrator of Souls, and not Du Bois himself, who has escaped double-consciousness. This may save Souls as a literary text, but it doesn’t rescue the idea of black political leadership, implying that no actual black political leader is immune from double-consciousness. Another possible resolution to the paradox involves the notion of a second sight awake to the contradictions of the dominant white cultural milieu, allowing a rejection of its biased assumption about black folk (what Henry calls “potentiated second sight”).

Du Bois often insisted that his accounting of “the Negro problem” – or, alternatively, of “the race concept” – involves leading his readers “within the Veil” – making it possible for his (presumably mostly white) readers to gain some sense of the experience of “being black”. This involves, as he puts it in Dusk of Dawn (1940), “elucidating the inner meaning and significance of that race problem by explaining it in terms of the one human life that I know best” (1968 [1940]: viii). But that one life was one lived at the top of “the upper layers of educated and ambitious Negroes” (1968 [1940]: 185), and so, it was exceptional. This returns us to the question of the scope of double-consciousness.

While Du Bois presents double-consciousness in the 1903 texts as a problem for black folks generally given conditions of segregation and historically persisting inequality, a closer inspection of the text suggests that the phenomenon might be specific to black leadership or those who are most fully caught between the white world and the world of color, who have deliberately undertaken the “the moral uplift” of the “backward” black masses, and who stand as “representatives” of these “worlds” to each other. The “Strivings” passage cites as illustrative examples only educated, “better” Negroes: the ‘black artisan’, the Negro minister or doctor, the “would be black savant” and the black artist. Du Bois also devotes several further chapters in Souls to detailed characterizations of the inner struggles of actual or fictional leaders – Washington, Crummell, and the fictional John Jones. Yet much of the force of the claim for double-consciousness in the “Strivings” text is its universal attribution to “the Negro in this American world”.

Some recent commentators have rejected the claim that double-consciousness, in the sense of a self-perception of inferiority, has been a universal feature of black life. Molefi Kete Asante, discussing his own experience growing up in Valdosta, Georgia, in the 1950s, writes that

[t]he tightly knit community of Africans who lived on the dirt roads of Valdosta never saw themselves as intellectually or physically inferior to whites. There existed no reference points outside of ourselves despite the economic and psychological poverty of our situation. (1993: 133)

Several pages later Asante states flat-out, “I was never affected by the Du Boisian double-consciousness” (1993: 136). He does go on to acknowledge his distinct circumstances

It might have been another matter if I had gone to school and to church with whites when I was younger. I might have suffered confusion, double-consciousness, but I did not. (1993: 137)

A third issue for Du Bois’s conception of double-consciousness concerns its putative relation to the “two-ness” of the Negro psyche, which he never clarifies. Du Bois was concerned early on to establish a distinct contribution of “the Negro” to world culture and civilization, since lynch law and the backlash against Reconstruction raised the specter of genocidal extermination of black folk in America. A distinctly “Negro” cultural contribution seems to require distinctive Negro “ideals”. Allen and others have argued that Du Bois presents vague, seemingly empty, or contradictory accounts of just what the conflicting American and Negro “ideals” are. The question, then, is whether Du Bois’s reference to such ideals can be sustained as an independent source of the “two-ness” which Du Bois connects to double-consciousness. If there are indeed such (non-empty) ideals, and they are an independent source of conflictual two-ness, then double-consciousness might turn out to be a more complex phenomenon yet.

The Du Boisian conception has been criticized as well for oversimplifying the complex multidimensionality of contemporary selves, harboring a nostalgia for a unitary, integral self that never existed, an unachievable ideal. Thus Darlene Clark Hine asserts:

had Du Bois specifically included the experiences and lives of black women in his lament, … instead of writing, “One ever feels his twoness”, he would have mused about how one ever feels her “fiveness”: Negro, American, woman, poor, black woman. (Hines 1993: 338)

Critiques of Du Bois’s conception along these lines have become widespread, but, it might be argued, they are in one sense beside the point. That the 1903 text is masculinist seems undeniable. But it’s also true that Du Bois’s “double-consciousness” was not proposed as a comprehensive account of the reality of human being, was not addressed to the variety of sources of human social identity per se. His conception was an attempt to capture the lived experience of black folk as black folk in the United States under conditions of Jim Crow. So it would be wholly consistent with his conception if, added to the doubling of consciousness due to racial oppression, other forms of psychic doubling or fragmentation, responses to other forms of inequality, might exist.

Henry Louis Gates Jr. addresses the normative thrust of Du Bois’s conception in noting that

cultural multiplicity is no longer seen as the problem, but as a solution – a solution to the confines of identity itself. Double consciousness, once a disorder, is now the cure. (2006: xv)

This remark depends on confusing a general duality or psychic “two-ness” with Du Bois’s double-consciousness conception itself. Surely even if “cultural multiplicity” has come to be valuable in itself, as Gates has it, the “amused contempt and pity” directed against oneself, crucial to Du Bois’s formulation, cannot be part of any “cure”.

Finally, a question might be raised about the relation of Du Bois’s double-consciousness conception and the sorts of self-doubts, troubled feelings, and “identity issues” that have been linked to biracial or mixed-race appearance or identity in our persisting, harshly racialized American social world. White supremacy has presented particular difficulties for persons of ambivalent racial descent, visibly marked as brought into being by “race mixing”. Mixed-race persons have encountered hostility from “both sides”, and are often deemed weak or inferior just because they are mixed, as Naomi Zack documents in her Race and Mixed-Race (1993: chapters 11, 12). Indeed, Du Bois was personally familiar with this issue. His “most interesting” professor during his university days in Berlin was Heinrich von Trietschke;

[o]ne day he startled me by suddenly declaring during a lecture on America: “Die Mulattin sind niedrig! Sie fuhlen sich niedrig!” [Mulattoes are inferior; they feel themselves inferior.] I felt as if he were pointing me out; but I presume he was quite unaware of my presence. However my presence or absence would have made no difference to him. … My fellow students gave no evidence of connecting what he said with me. (Du Bois 1968: 165)

Yet when Du Bois formulated “double-consciousness” in Souls, mixed-race and skin-color discriminations within the black racial designation were not topics he addressed in print. The duality posited in the texts of 1903 is one between “Negro” – an identity then typically keyed to a metaphysically conceived racial designation – and “American” – one based on a putative citizenship status. Racial designation at that time was determined primarily through hypodescent, and the citizenship status of black folk had recently been impugned by Plessy v. Ferguson (1896).

4. Du Boisian Double-Consciousness after Souls?

Commentators are agreed that while Du Bois names “double-consciousness” and uses the concept in his own way in that 1903 text, the term does not reappear in any of his subsequent texts. That does not mean he abandons the concept, of course, yet most of the commentary on the concept focuses on the “Strivings” text in Souls. There have been some attempts to interpret various of his other works in terms of the conception, but these tend to focus on his fictional writings, and the use made of these is not primarily to develop the conception but rather to show its uses by Du Bois in other contexts. This is undoubtedly due both to the canonical status of that 1903 text in African-American literature and social criticism and to the fact of its very singular use there. More than one writer has asserted that the passage in which Du Bois presents the term is the most-referenced text in all African-American letters.

It seems problematic, however, to pin a full-blown account of and theoretical reconstruction on one passage in one work, however seminal or influential it may have been. So it may be useful to examine several later texts of Du Bois’s to see if the claim some commentators have made that Du Bois abandons the conception after 1903 can be substantiated or rejected. There are discussions in later texts that seem to involve aspects, at least, of the 1903 conception.

4.1 “The Souls of White Folks” in Darkwater (1920)

While Du Bois does not present the “double-consciousness” concept in so many words in Darkwater, published in 1920, the second chapter of that text, “The Souls of White Folks”, seems to invoke it. There, Du Bois characterizes the development of what he calls “the religion of whiteness” and discusses its impact on social relations in the nineteenth and the early twentieth centuries. Du Bois makes a claim for a special kind of knowledge of the psychology of white people. He writes of himself that, about them, “I am singularly clairvoyant”. After specifying that his knowledge is not that of the foreigner, nor of the servant or the worker, he writes:

I see these souls undressed and from the back and sides. I see the working of their entrails. I know their thoughts and they know that I know. (Du Bois 1920: 17)

Du Bois here claims an insight into the psyches of whites that depends in part on an awareness of their beliefs and attitudes concerning race, of their falseness. This insight is of the kind that double-consciousness makes possible. But what Du Bois claims here also seems to go beyond the 1903 conception, since that conception did not specifically and explicitly refer to knowledge of the souls of white folks. Several pages into the “Souls of White Folks” chapter, after identifying the “discovery of personal whiteness” as an historically recent phenomenon associated with “this new religion of whiteness”, Du Bois indicates that it is black folk generally – “we” – who have such powers of “clairvoyance”:

We whose shame, humiliation and deep insult [the white man’s] aggrandizement so often involved were never deceived. We looked at him clearly, with world-old eyes, and saw simply a human being, weak and pitiable and cruel, even as we are and were. (1920: 20)

Here is a condition of consciousness that allows “the humiliated” to see more clearly the reality of the lives of those who humiliate than the humiliators themselves do. While such knowledge does not involve “know[ing] the thoughts” of the humiliators in detail, it does require that one know some patterns of what and how they think and feel. Du Bois is here considering the ideology of white supremacy, tracing out the historical conditions of its development and some of the psychological consequences it has for whites who accept it and live in and on the basis of it. To the extent that whites accept the premises of white supremacy, and live and act upon them, they are deceived about themselves and act out a deception that the blacks who are subject to the consequences of those premises are in a position to see through. This is not the core of double-consciousness, though it seems to be the sort of thing Du Bois had in mind when he referred in 1903 to “second sight”, a key adjunct to double-consciousness, in the “Strivings” passage. This matches the reading found in Henry, Gordon, and Kirkland as well.

But there is a bit more here, and other than, “second sight”. For what Du Bois presents in this chapter is a critical analysis of the American ideology of white supremacy that is informed by sociological analysis and backed up by historical and social-scientific understanding. Du Bois both begins and ends the chapter by noting his own position “high in the tower”. This presumably refers both to his distanced, observer status, and, relatedly, to his own achieved position as an academically trained social scientist – indeed, one of the most highly trained minds in America at the time – bringing his powers of analysis to bear on the “souls of white folk”. Du Bois gives a scientifically-informed, nuanced historical analysis built on a “clairvoyant” insight into the psyche of the white person “under the influence” of white supremacist ideology, one predicated on both the second sight and a kind of ideology-critique.

4.2 “On Being Ashamed of Oneself: An Essay on Race Pride” (1933)

Du Bois begins the essay, published in Crisis in September, 1933, with a story about his grandfather, who indignantly rejected an invitation to a “Negro” picnic:

[i]t meant close association with poverty, ignorance and suppressed and disadvantaged people, dirty and with bad manners. (Du Bois 1933: 199)

He then succinctly captures the whole dilemma of those in the Negro ‘upper crust’:

because the upper colored group is desperately afraid of being represented before American whites by this lower group, or being mistaken for them, or being treated as though they were part of it, they are pushed to the extreme of effort to avoid contact with the poorest classes of Negroes. This exaggerates, at once, the secret shame of being identified with such people and the anomaly of insisting that the physical characteristics of these folk which the upper class shares, are not the stigmata of degradation. (1933: 199)

Here Du Bois draws out the intra-racial implications and grounds of this aspect of double consciousness – what he identifies as “being ashamed” of members of one’s group, and, so, indirectly and implicitly, of oneself. He also reiterates a theme arising from the first in his thinking about double-consciousness – its close connection to divergent personal and political strategies for managing, and working to transform, its social conditions. He identified these especially in the 1903 “Faith” text, where he speaks both of “double classes” and of “pretense or revolt”, “hypocrisy or radicalism”. In the 1920 text, Du Bois notes that such feelings of shame can motivate the strategy of “race suicide” – “the attempt to escape from ourselves”, as he describes assimilation. This attempt involves – and also is grounded in – “a drawing of class lines inside the Negro race” and “the emergence of a certain social aristocracy” defined by “looks” – by which Du Bois presumably means complexion – as well as education, income, cultivation, and aspiration.

But this sense of shame is both impediment and adjunct of any strategy based on race pride and solidarity, as well, since it can undermine any concerted political action, which demands racial unity in common cause, and under the leadership of the “talented tenth” of race aristocrats, to be successful. While calling for efforts “to build up a racial ethos”, Du Bois thus warns against too extreme a version of such “propaganda for race pride”, counseling Blacks to avoid reproducing what he describes as a “superiority complex among the white and the yellow race”.

4.3 Dusk of Dawn (1940)

There is a discussion of something like double-consciousness in Du Bois’s book Dusk of Dawn, published in 1940, two years after Du Bois turned seventy. Indeed, since Dusk of Dawn is more nearly autobiographical in design than Souls (its subtitle is An Essay Toward an Autobiography of a Race Concept) it’s not surprising that Du Bois writes more expansively there of black life in conditions of segregation and white supremacy, even though he doesn’t use the term employed in Souls. But also, by this time, his conception of race itself has opened up even further beyond that of any linear historical development. As he writes at the end of the central chapter of that book, “The Concept of Race”,

It had as I have tried to show all kinds of illogical trends and irreconcilable tendencies. Perhaps it is wrong to speak of it at all as “a concept” rather than as a group of contradictory forces, facts, and tendencies. (1940: 133)

A number of things change in the account given by Du Bois in Dusk of Dawn of the phenomena that, in Souls, are brought under the sign of double-consciousness.

The first is that the Dusk of Dawn treatment of the issues is subsumed much more fully under a thematics of “environment”, articulated as socio-political, geographical, and cultural in its dimensions, and both dynamic and relatively stable in historical terms. Writing about “the facts of the Negro’s double environment”, Du Bois explains:

The Negro American has for his environment not only the white surrounding world, but also, and touching him usually much more nearly and compellingly, is the environment furnished by his own colored group. There are exceptions, of course, but this is the rule. The American Negro, therefore, is surrounded and conditioned by the concept which he has of white people and he is treated in accordance with the concept they have of him. On the other hand, so far as his own people are concerned, he is in direct contact with individuals and facts. (1940: 173)

This way of putting it is prefigured in the “Faith” text of Souls, in which Du Bois writes of the “double life” of Black folk and of the “worlds within and without the Veil of Color”. Note also the claim that, while the inhabitants of the “white world” and the “colored world” look at one other each through “the concept” they have of one another, individuals within the “colored world” know each other through “direct contact”. This is the impact of the veil, the color line. Writing of his own personal experience, Du Bois details the effect of this environing white world on him:

I was by long education and continual compulsion and daily reminder, a colored man in a white world; and that white world often existed primarily, so far as I was concerned, to see with sleepless vigilance that I was kept within bounds. All this made me limited in physical movement and provincial in thought and dream. I could not stir, I could not act, I could not live, without taking into careful daily account the reaction of my white environing world. (1940: 135–6)

There is in this account, in addition to the definite limitation of possibilities imposed by the veil – and consequent to it – an active appropriation, and employment in strategic thinking by Du Bois, of the understanding he has of the white world. This suggests another, practical mode in which double consciousness – which is what we are dealing with here – can operate. If double consciousness also is practical consciousness, “taking into careful daily account” whites’ reactions – tinged as they are by prejudice, by expectations grounded in that prejudice – in one’s plans, one’s own expectations, that would not necessarily involve internalizing the prejudicial racist viewpoint itself, though it might nonetheless produce profound disturbance of the soul. Double consciousness would then also yield a practical, and affective, rather than a strictly cognitive, impact of the environing conditions on the black soul.

There is also, on the Dusk of Dawn account, a further, more telling and insidious effect of the white world on the black soul, here exemplified by Du Bois:

… this fact of racial distinction based on color was the greatest thing in my life and absolutely determined it, because this surrounding group, in alliance and agreement with the white European world, was settled and determined upon the fact that I was and must be a thing apart. It was impossible to gainsay this. It was impossible for any time and to any distance to withdraw myself and look down upon these absurd assumptions with philosophical calm and humorous self-control. (1940: 136)

The “absurd assumptions” can and do infiltrate the Negro’s psyche, affecting how she thinks and feels about herself in ways that stubbornly resist her own efforts to override or ignore them. More rarely, perhaps, they elicit fierce and abiding anger, even rage. Writing in a less autobiographical vein, Du Bois notes that despair of racial progress “too often” results from the Negro’s “lack of faith in essential Negro possibilities parallel to similar attitudes on the part of the whites”. This attitude itself is, he continues, “a natural phenomenon”, since Negroes share “average American culture and current American prejudices”. Because of this, it is

almost impossible for a Negro boy trained in a white Northern high school and a white college to come out with any high idea of his own people or any abiding faith in what they can do. (1940: 191)

This, arguably, is Du Boisian double-consciousness as set out in Souls.

But the 1940 text never asserts a basic inner duality within the Negro: missing entirely from the Dusk of Dawn account is any mention of inward two-ness, of the psychic splitting that was so crucial to the account given in Souls. In the 1940 text the issue is characterized in the terminology of “Negro self-criticism” (1940: 179), a “lack of faith in essential Negro possibilities” (1940: 191), and the “inner contradiction and frustration which [segregation and white racist intransigence] involves” (1940: 187) – a terminology that conveys the ambivalence and complexity of the earlier text, but falls far short of asserting an overriding psychic duality. And this is not because the text does not address the “felt experience” of being black in America: the central, longest, chapter in Dusk of Dawn is “The Colored World Within”.

There are, ‘naturally’, problems with the unitary consciousness of a soul within the double environment Du Bois depicts, but these fall short of causing a split in the psyche itself. There is resentment, frustration, and anger; there is a faithlessness, and, often, consequent despair; there are the temptations to turning one’s back on ‘the folk’; and also temptations to reject absolutely anything the “environing” white world offers or proposes. And there is what Du Bois calls

that bitter inner criticism of Negroes directed in upon themselves, which is widespread. It tends often to fierce, angry, contemptuous judgment of nearly all that Negroes do, say, and believe…. (1940: 179)

What two-ness there is in the Dusk of Dawn account has been relocated from the inwardness of souls to the “environing” world.

There are two other ways the Dusk of Dawn account diverges significantly from that of Souls. First, the brute facticity of what Du Bois calls the “inferiority” of the colored world is asserted in this text explicitly, and its effect upon the attitudes of Negroes described tellingly. Du Bois presents this stark reality as undeniable, while at the same time rejecting the related claims made by racist prejudice:

It is true, as I have argued, that Negroes are not inherently ugly nor congenitally stupid. They are not naturally criminal and their poverty and ignorance today have clear and well-known and remediable causes. All this is true: and yet what every colored man living today knows is that by practical present measurements Negroes today are inferior to whites. The white folk of the world are richer and more intelligent; they live better; have better government; have better legal systems; have built more impressive cities; larger systems of communication and they control a larger part of the earth than all the colored peoples together. (1940: 173–4)

By invoking these facts, Du Bois is citing historically contingent yet palpably certain realities that, he claims, “every colored man living today knows”. Consequently, “Negro self-criticism” is, in part, grounded in “a perfectly obvious fact” (1940: 179), “that most Negroes in the United States today occupy a low cultural status” and a “low social condition” (1940: 180). Among these, he discusses “Negro ignorance”, death rate, “criminal tendencies”, poverty, and “social degradation”. Du Bois lists these not as representations of white prejudice but in acknowledgment of patent observable realities. Though their causes, present and past, count against the prejudiced conclusions often drawn in the white world, these causes are less visible, less obvious.

Another important departure of Dusk of Dawn from Souls is an explicit recognition in the later text that the psychic phenomena attributed to Negro Americans are not distinctive of their experience alone. Du Bois writes,

[s]imilar phenomena may be noticed always among undeveloped or suppressed peoples or groups undergoing extraordinary experience. None have more pitilessly castigated the Jews than the Jewish prophets, ancient and modern. (1940: 179)

He goes on to cite as further cases the Irish and the Germans of the Sturm und Drang period. In 1940 Du Bois makes a broader historical claim, that “the imprisoning of a human group with chains in the hands of an environing group” was not “a singularly unusual characteristic of the Negro in the United States in the nineteenth century”, but, rather, “the majority of mankind has struggled through this inner spiritual slavery…” (1940: 137).

5. Beyond the Black/White Binary, Beyond Double Consciousness

So far we have considered applications and extensions of the original double consciousness notion to encompass the experiences of persons of African heritage, within the United States, and more broadly in the African diaspora. There have been other recent deployments of the concept that extend its reach to the other side of, and then beyond, what’s been called the ‘black/white binary.’ We note three of them here.

One recent inquiry – Nelson Maldonado-Torres’s 2006 article, “Post-continental Philosophy: Its Definition, Contours, and Fundamental Sources” – explores a version of double consciousness of normative subjects of ‘dominant (white) European’ cultures, citing the oeuvre of J-P Sartre as a case study. The increasing diversity of evolving U.S. society, and the approaching ‘tipping point’ into a ‘majority-minority’ ‘non-white’ population, have shifted theoretical interest onto the decline of ‘whiteness’ and issues related to double consciousness but in a pluralist rather than a racial-binary context. Linda Alcoff, who has argued for the need to get beyond a binary conception of U.S. racial dynamics, considers the rise of ‘white double consciousness’. Finally, José Medina advocates for a related ‘kaleidoscopic consciousness’ as a personal tactic for resisting epistemic injustice in conditions of the fight for pluralist democracy.

5.1 A ‘Post-Continental’ Turn

A distinctive application of ‘double consciousness’ comes out of ‘decolonial’ theory. Of and from non-dominant cultures and social groupings, these theorists’ commitment to social struggles at the ‘borderlands,’ in geopolitically liminal spaces, yields arguments from doubled perspectives, both within and outside the dominant, ‘North Atlantic’ system. Thinkers like Gloria Anzaldúa, Sylvia Wynter, and Walter Mignolo, among others, came to constitute this movement, featuring distinctive styles of inquiry and writing, advocating a ’decolonial turn’ in humanistic research. A philosophical argument associated with this group, making explicit use of the notion of double consciousness, is Nelson Maldonado-Torres’s account of ‘Post-Continental Philosophy’.

One guiding purpose of the de-colonial project is simply to make the charge of Eurocentrism stick against the dominant modern ‘Western’ intellectual tradition initiated at the time of Descartes. Maldonado-Torres’ use of double consciousness takes it in its original bivalent Du Boisian form – as a source of both potentially deleterious illusion and of veridical insights; he employs it as an interpretive strategy for critiquing the 20th-century Continental tradition in philosophy, and through it the entire modern European tradition. He does so by situating that philosophical tradition in global anti-systemic struggles originating and developing in Western-hemispheric societies. In this connection the term ‘post-Continental’ alludes not only to the commonly accepted name of the primarily French- and German-speaking European phenomenological tradition. ‘Post-Continental’ also signifies its rejection of the prevailing ‘geography of power,’ the largely implicit notion that the (European) continent is the locus of all significant modern philosophical production.

Of the canonical figures in that continental tradition, it is Sartre who Maldonado-Torres sees as expressing the double consciousness of European modernity, its intellectual guilty conscience. Double consciousness serves as an interpretive schema for reevaluating the meaning of both Sartre’s overall intellectual activity as well as the Sartrean conception of bad faith. This is now read as an implicit critique of the complicity of the intellectual culture of modernity in domination, with particular reference to the colonialist entanglements of its dominant philosophical traditions. Developing the political argument and its philosophical critique involves arguing that for Sartre, bad faith should be understood not only in an individual, but also in a social, collective sense, cutting against its standard, individualist interpretation. “For Sartre, European modernity is a project of bad faith” (2006, 13).

Maldonado-Torres distinguishes the double consciousness of the ‘normative subject,’ privileged member of the dominant social order, from that of the ‘damned’ – a term taken from Fanon’s Les Damnés de la Terre (1961) (translated as The Wretched of the Earth, for which Sartre wrote a preface) referring to those peopling the ‘underworld’ at the bottom of the world-system. The double consciousness of the oppressed arises in their direct experience with the system in which their very being and daily existence confront them with the lies and willed ignorance – the falsehoods, the ‘looking away’ and complicity of those who benefit – on which that system depends for its reproduction. The contradiction between the purported ideals of the oppressive system and the reality of their lives is, for them, starkly apparent.

For the normative subjects, however, the lie is, in a sense, within them, insofar as they are complicit with the regime; their confrontation with that lie demands self-scrutiny and self-critique. This complicity with oppression and the lies it involves, and the self’s confrontation with its own duplicity, can be understood in terms of Sartre’s account of bad faith. As Maldonado-Torres puts it, there is within the normative subject a struggle whether to take on fully the dominant culture’s “demand … to occupy the center of the world.” This demand represents a requirement that the self, “with the help of an impressive cultural, symbolic, material, and epistemological arsenal, posits itself as normative,” and thereby accedes to playing a part in the “dehumanization of Europe’s racialized and colonized populations.” Bad faith, which, in Sartre’s terms, is the subject’s refusal of its own freedom, a flight from responsibility and into conformism, finds a political expression in the dominant culture’s demand for normative subjects’ conformity.

Bad faith is the conceptual hinge of Sartre’s entire critical response to the situation of European ‘civilization’ as he found it already at the inception of his philosophical career. The culmination of European anti-Semitism in the Holocaust and the war against fascism –Maldonado-Torres calls this the ‘crisis of genocidal Europe’ – fueled by the active participation or silent complacence of much of the intellectual middle classes, was the original condition for Sartre’s political-philosophical authorship. Sartre’s engagement with the global anti-colonial struggle that followed the allied victory, and particularly the Algerian revolution, confirmed and focused Sartre’s increasingly political opposition to the policies of the dominant European powers.

His engagement with the work of the Afro-Caribbean theorists Aimé Césaire and Frantz Fanon pushed him further, adding energy to his sometimes explicitly anti-racist critical reflection. Sartre’s engagement with their thought make him, for Maldonado-Torres, a ‘border subject’ as well, grounded in the split allegiances of a kind of ‘double life,’ itself a product of this basic rift at the heart of Europe’s empire. Maldonado-Torres quotes a passage from Sartre’s “Preface” to Fanon’s The Wretched of the Earth, in which Sartre addresses the book’s [presumably white] French reader. The quotation reads, in part:

This fat and pallid continent has ended up lapsing into what Fanon rightly calls ‘narcissism.’ Cocteau was irritated by Paris, ‘the city which is always thinking about itself.’ What else is Europe doing? Or that super-European monster, North America? What empty chatter: liberty, equality, fraternity, love, honour, country, and who knows what else? That did not prevent us from holding forth at the same time in racist language: filthy n***er, filthy Jew, filthy North Africans. Enlightened, liberal and sensitive souls – in short, neocolonialists – claimed to be shocked by this inconsistency; that is an error or bad faith. Nothing is more consistent, among us, than racist humanism, since Europeans have only been able to make themselves human beings by creating slaves and monsters.

Here, then, through Sartre, double consciousness takes the form of both a confession and a self-critique, an admission and a renunciation of duplicity. Maldonado-Torres’s use of double consciousness as a lens through which to read Sartre’s conception of bad faith sharpens Sartre’s account of European culture’s willing racial ignorance, its foundational self-deception, and shows his ambivalence toward Europe’s oppressive civilizational hierarchies. It is what Maldonado-Torres calls Sartre’s ‘potentiated’ double consciousness that, he claims, yields Sartre’s critical relation to the colonialist complicity of the continental tradition. Sartre’s focus on the self-deceptive aspects of the modern European tradition’s intellectual identity, taken as the historical work of double consciousness, both reveals and subverts the hypocritical complicity of the philosophical mainstream with the geopolitics of colonialism.

5.2 White Double Consciousness

A similar argument about the applicability of Du Bois’s notion to ‘white folk’, in the American vortex, is presented by Linda Alcoff. In The Future of Whiteness (2015), she claims that many white Americans are subject to ‘white double consciousness’ due in part to recent social changes. The book’s argument – part of an anti-racist ‘project to rearticulate whiteness’ – describes what she calls the ‘crisis of white hegemony’ and the pressure exerted by this crisis on white individuals’ racial identity and self-understanding. Her account specifically addresses the disaffection of many ‘progressive’ whites from the dominant, mainstream cultural form of whiteness, and from its justification by what she calls ‘white vanguardism,’ a false historical narrative of a decidedly racist cast. (Alcoff notes the existence, but foregoes the analysis, of a reactionary, right-wing white double consciousness, claiming it lacks any significant fact-based theoretical basis for critical argument.) White double consciousness is a specific kind of disaffection with whiteness, an alienation from whiteness as norm, “a turmoil in white subjectivity” (174).

The crisis of white hegemony results partly from demographic changes under way that will transform the U.S. into a ‘minority-majority’ society by mid-century, and an acknowledgment of these impending changes by white Americans still able and willing to face social reality. These demographic shifts portend a shifting spectrum of political contestation. Citing the work of historian Nell Irvin Painter charting the historic formation of whiteness, Alcoff’s argument identifies other broader social and political changes to U.S. society that track what might be called ‘the declining significance of whiteness’. These include a diminished capacity of white identity to secure for its possessors the differential advantages once available to them; an increasing contestation in the terms of public discourse on race, given changes in the federal government’s identification and counting of race categories, and recent theoretical uncertainties in academic and journalistic writing about race categories; a declining possibility of living in whites-only communities and for restricting one’s daily life to segregated spaces; the end of state-sanctioned racial hierarchy, enabling the increasing openness of new generations of whites to interracial contact, interaction, relationships, families, and multiracial community.

Alcoff’s focus on these and other actual social conditions forming the matrix for white double consciousness resembles Du Bois’s own increasing attention to the ‘environing conditions’ materially grounding changes in double consciousness in the developing century of his life. Whiteness is not an ideology for Alcoff, but an ‘organically emergent’ social reality. Alcoff takes as a given both the fluidity of all such racial determinations of identity and the relative stability of the lived, material reality of whiteness. Her broader account is aimed to counter recent arguments that whiteness is too closely tied to white supremacy in its origins and motivations to be freed from its racist past, on the one hand, and, on the other, that it is an ideological formation which can be simply given up and left behind as part of the struggle to overcome that historic legacy. Rejecting these claims, she argues whiteness may well be de-linked from racism and white supremacy, a possibility that white double consciousness prefigures in its specific, binary form.

The ideology of ‘white vanguardism,’ which Alcoff characterizes as the “illusion … that has configured European whites as the scientific, technological, moral, artistic, and political leader of the human race” (24), has increasingly lost plausibility to significant numbers of whites themselves. This ‘illusion,’ which once supplied some sense of dignity and social standing to the many whites without other cultural or economic resources, has been increasingly contested both in the academy and the public forum, and is at odds with changing social realities. Thus, white double consciousness is a growing reflection in significant sections of the population of the deep crisis of whiteness. At the same time, Alcoff argues, whites affected with double consciousness are living out their disillusion with their own previous white vanguardist assumptions.

Alcoff relies on a variety of sources to support her account. These include, in addition to philosophical critiques of the racial formation and of whiteness, ethnographic studies of local white communities, narrative accounts of anti-racist and anti-klan activists in the South and episodes from her own life and experience. She presents as a paradigmatic case the ‘Beat’ writer Jack Kerouac – who exemplified the anxiety about whiteness in the form of a lived creative artistic rebellion, one nonetheless identified by the culture as racially white. Alcoff characterizes Kerouac as exhibiting such white double consciousness in his deportment and self-presentation, saying that his ‘alienated consciousness’ “manifested as discomfort with his embodied identity.” She adds that:

Jack Kerouac expressed a poignant alienation from his white identity and the general normative whiteness of heterosexual suburbia, and he emphatically identified with the more intense existential registers of nonwhite affect that he took to be common among African Americans and Mexicans. (169)

Another noteworthy example is the description by Simone de Beauvoir of her own experience, during a visit with Richard Wright in New York, as a white person walking through Harlem and experiencing a measure of discomfort on confronting the accusatory glances of the neighborhood’s residents. “Beauvoir notes the hostile glances and feels herself ‘stiffen with a bad conscience’” (139). This provides Alcoff with an example illustrating the role that reactive emotions such as guilt and shame can have in triggering the formation of white double consciousness. Such encounters with racialized others in conditions of daily life can prod whites into seeing the disparity between how they view themselves and how they are seen outside of their own segregated communities, as they begin to “intuit how they are viewed by nonwhite others” (170). For many whites, Alcoff argues, the guilt and discomfort with whiteness which results provokes a critical rethinking and attempt to reshape their identity even as, for others, it drives a desire to escape the attribution of racial whiteness altogether, an ultimately dead-end path.

A growing disaffection with the mainstream condition of whiteness – and with its dependence on the ideology of ‘white vanguardism’ – is the core of white double consciousness for Alcoff. It is linked, for many whites, with a close daily lived association with communities of brown and black people. Nonetheless, an honest, fact-based and realistic approach to their lives requires their acknowledging the actuality of whiteness as their own personal racial identity and their understanding it as an historically shifting social construct. Acknowledging whiteness as a social construct involves both accepting its connection with historical and ongoing brutal racial oppression and questioning its core ideology of white vanguardism. The double consciousness this acceptance/suspicion elicits involves, to some extent, a self-ascription of whiteness as identity, a critical distance from it as a form of life, and a rejection of its ‘white vanguardist’ ideology as false, and falsely justifying continued white supremacy.

White double consciousness can lead whites to a deeper understanding of the realities of U.S. social conditions and the history shaping them. It thus represents a resource and potentially a trigger for working through their false views about race and moving toward anti-racism. Unlike the case of black double consciousness – which is the native understanding of their own lives, achieved through intraracial communal cultural associations and solidarities, that makes possible blacks’ understanding of the lies upholding white domination – whites’ double consciousness “involves coming to see themselves through both the dominant and non-dominant lens and recognizing the latter as a critical corrective truth” (140).

5.3 Kaleidoscopic Consciousness

Alcoff’s reflections on whiteness and white double consciousness come in the wake of her arguments for transcending the black/white binary in Visible Identities. José Medina does Alcoff one better, in a sense, by opening up the possibility of a multiplicitous version of double consciousness as an epistemic tactic in the struggle for a more expansive democratic society.

Medina discusses double consciousness – and its hypothetical multiplicitous twin – in relation to his core argument, in Epistemic Resistance (2013), about the epistemic conditions of democratic citizenship and participation, that “a crucial part of th[e] perfectionist ongoing struggle toward democracy is the resistance against epistemic injustices” (4). ‘Epistemic injustice’ is the term Medina takes from Miranda Fricker’s naming and analysis of that phenomenon, referring most broadly to a ‘credibility deficit’ – the discrediting of the testimony or epistemic contributions of persons on the basis of their racial, gender, or other elements of ‘visible identity’. Medina’s project is to develop methods to resist the domination of such oppressive epistemic circumstances.

Addressing Du Bois’s 1903 formulation, Medina argues that double consciousness is inadequate for addressing the diverse forms of racialization of experience in the contemporary U.S., in which a multiplicity of racially oppressed groups exist, as well as other groups facing various other oppressions, on the basis of gender, sexuality, and other aspects of identity. The theory of democratic resistant consciousness Medina develops is also expansive in aiming to encompass the epistemic effects of not only racial but also gender, class, sexual, and other forms of oppression, and the forms of epistemic injustice related to these, and so it necessarily transcends Du Bois’ binary conception. Medina thus invokes a multiplicitous consciousness – he actually dubs it ‘kaleidoscopic’ – instead, but one that shares crucial similarities in profile with Du Bois’s original conception.

Medina’s conceptualizations emerge out of a pragmatist approach to democratic political theory. He assumes that the achievement of progressive democratic socio-political objectives involves prolonged periods of struggle, in which oppressive ideologies continue to exert their influence on social agents. Democratic activists – and, indeed, all moral agents in such circumstances – must therefore develop and use strategies of epistemic resistance to the deleterious effects of oppressive structures on their own internal patterns of response to racialized and ‘othered’ social actors generally. These forms of structural silencing and social ignorance foster internalized blockages impeding agents’ self-awareness, blockages which not only impair cognition but also impact the sensibilities, feelings, and imaginations of those agents as well. Because he, as theorist, pragmatically adopts as well an activist perspective, Medina’s concerns are not only diagnostic. He develops normative proposals for democratic forms of ‘resistant’ epistemic practices.

Medina interprets Du Bois’s account of double consciousness as an indication of how oppressed subjects can utilize their social position to achieve a kind of clarity about both their own position – as having internalized the false dominant viewpoint about them – as well as about the position of those beneficiaries of oppression – the ignorance and lack of self-knowledge of those in the dominant group itself. This is because those who are subject to oppression have, as a function of double consciousness, access to both social viewpoints, and also are compelled by their situation to question the basis of their social standing and their self-understanding in a way those in the dominant positions are not. Indeed, according to Medina, those situated in the position of oppressors, or who benefit from the oppressive regime, are often ‘actively ignorant’ – that is, ignorant in a way their own mode of life and activity helps to maintain and reproduce – of the basis and consequences of their standing and the social context of their own lives.

To bring about the epistemic resistance required, Medina argues for an epistemic stance he terms “kaleidoscopic consciousness”. This is Medina’s expanded version of Du Boisian double consciousness, now explicitly presented as a norm of epistemic practice rather than an account of a pre-given social reality. Kaleidoscopic consciousness involves an open, always anticipatory stance toward the possibility of new forms of oppressive social relations and their related modes of ‘active ignorance.’ Since forms of active ignorance as Medina calls them are in a sense self-fulfilling, blinding one to their own existence, and producing what he calls ‘meta-blindness’ – it is always possible – in some cases likely – that there are forms of blindness one suffers from without even knowing that fact.

This counter-hegemonic project is not confined to a reform of the individual’s consciousness alone: it involves a corresponding recognition of and commitment to open, exploratory, and conscious interactions with diverse social ‘others.’ Virtuous epistemic agents must be guided by what Medina calls an ‘imperative of epistemic interaction,’ of attunement to and reliance on regular encounters with those who are ‘othered,’ in various ways, by the system. This set of extended and socially distributed interactions is aimed at producing epistemic friction as a necessary condition for an adequate epistemic orientation to the diversity of agents’ viewpoints, and to resisting the diverse forms of socially functional blindness to the perspectives of socially ‘othered’ persons. Such understanding is a key component of a successful democratic political project, according to Medina, and can only be achieved through what is itself a form of socially transformative epistemic practice.

6. Conclusion

Any account of double consciousness rooted in the sweep of Du Bois’s writings must acknowledge his taking it as both a state of consciousness of individual African-Americans as members of an oppressed group and also as a form of social recognition of the status of that group in the wider culture. Such an account must also confront the glaringly peculiar fact of the singular use of the term by Du Bois despite his revisiting in his writing, on various occasions in different contexts of publication, what seems to be an increasingly expansive repertoire of similar or closely related phenomena.

Du Bois gave up the moniker “double-consciousness”, arguably, for a variety of reasons, but in part to resist the impression that this is simply and only a problem of consciousness, a problem only of and for black folk, unconnected with any palpable social facts. Also, as we have seen, the close association of some of the original senses of “double-consciousness” with pathological psychic states, may have given Du Bois pause after his initial use of the term. He also increasingly wanted to distance himself from the idea – explicitly rejected in Dusk of Dawn – that collectivities are entities with their own consciousnesses, reified in what he came to regard as mistaken idealist overreach. Finally, Du Bois seems to have opened up and expanded the range of phenomena related to double consciousness beyond the exemplar in the 1903 texts.

But Du Bois did not characterize the matter succinctly in one place so as to embrace both all its effects on consciousness and affect and the correlative reality of an ‘environing’ condition. Rather, he employs, alternately, two strategies of writing to capture its fullness. He presents first- and third-personal accounts of “what it is like”, “spiritually”, to live subject to double consciousness, through autobiographical writing or by personifying the feelings, attitudes, and thoughts associated with double consciousness in fictional or composite characters. And he describes social environments along with the “customs” and “irrational”, “subconscious” attitudes and modes of being typical of social groups living in those environments.

Near the end of his life, in the posthumously published Autobiography, Du Bois revisited his original formulation of “two-ness”:

I began to feel that dichotomy which all my life has characterized my thought: how far can love for my oppressed race accord with love for the oppressing country? And when these loyalties diverge, where shall my soul find refuge? (1968: 169)

This passage relates the feelings triggered in young Du Bois while observing “the pageantry and patriotism of Germany in 1892”. This plainly autobiographical formulation in no way suggests anything like a basic psychic split; it reflects an ambivalence, a conflict of affections and loyalties within an integral self.

All previous critical attention has been fixed steadily on the spiritual aspect of the phenomena of double consciousness, virtually none on the environing conditions Du Bois saw as giving rise to it. Those environing conditions might be summed up thus:

a social and political regime grounded in oppression and the maintenance of vastly unequal and segregated living conditions of social groups ideologically and culturally identified as racially distinct and unequal, creating a “double environment” inimical to members of the subordinate racial group.

The spiritual correlate of these environing conditions would include some combination of at least some of these sorts of emergent aspects:

  • harboring a view of oneself premised on false, demeaning, or derogatory estimations of one’s capabilities, preferences, aptitudes and desires – estimations made primarily or exclusively due to one’s racial identity – and a consequent determination of a life course and practical orientation to one’s goals and to others based upon those estimations;
  • a tendency to confuse two distinct sets of attitudes, feelings, and beliefs about oneself and one’s disfavored racial group, to being “all mixed up” and/or in a state of double-mindedness, ambivalence, inner turmoil or indecision in relation to conflicting or opposed views and feelings about oneself and/or one’s social situation;
  • an awareness of oneself as characterized by others in an unfavorable or demeaning way in keeping with disparaging descriptors associated with one’s racial identity;
  • a reflective confrontation with a stable social situation characterized by consistent disparities in the life-prospects, achievements, social station, power, wealth, and cultural recognition typically available to members of one’s race relative to a dominant race;
  • a consciousness of and feelings related to a tension associated with being taken for, or acting as, a member or representative of a devalued race to members of the dominant race, in either a cultural, social, or a political capacity;
  • a practical attitude or orientation, for strategic purposes related to the pursuit of socially recognized goods or personal goals, involving the ascription to others of beliefs, intentions, expectations or reactions to one’s acts or words predicated on a falsely degrading, fearful, or dismissive judgment of who or what one is, on the basis of one’s race, and revision or adjustment of one’s plans on the basis of such ascriptions;
  • a pervasive sense of uncertainty regarding the reception of oneself, one’s activities and projects by others, under the weight of inappropriate, prejudicial, false and/or demeaning generalizations based on one’s race;
  • the experience of a feeling or feelings of despair, rage, anger, frustration, distress, or some combination of these, arising from and in keeping with recognition or awareness of any of the sorts of experiences listed above.

This list, while including the sense of “double-consciousness” as Du Bois develops the idea in Souls (particularly the first three items), also expands the sense of “double consciousness” to include more active, practical, and critical appropriations of the situation established by the color line. Finally, and in this practical spirit, Medina has put ‘kaleidoscopic consciousness’ forward as an activist, resistant form of epistemic sensitivity to the socially corrosive effects of the multiplicitous oppressive structures in modern societies.


Primary Literature: Works by W.E.B. Du Bois

These works cited in this article (listed chronologically by original publication date)

  • 1897, “The Strivings of the Negro People”, The Atlantic Monthly, August: 194–197. [Du Bois 1897 available online]
  • 1903, The Souls of Black Folk, Chicago: A.C. McClurg & Co., page numbers from the version edited by David W. Blight and Robert Gooding-Williams, Boston: Bedford Books, 1997.
  • 1920, “The Souls of White Folks”, in Darkwater: Voices from Within the Veil, New York: Harcourt, Brace & Co., page numbers from the Dover Thrift Edition, 1999.
  • 1933, “On Being Ashamed of Oneself: An Essay on Race Pride”, in Crisis, 40(9, Sept.): 199–200.
  • 1940, Dusk of Dawn: An Essay Toward an Autobiography of a Race Concept, New York: Harcourt, Brace, & Co., page numbers from the Schocken Books edition, New York, 1968.
  • 1968, The Autobiography of W.E.B. Du Bois: A Soliloquy on Viewing My Life from the Last Decade of Its First Century, H. Aptheker (ed.), New York: International Publishers.

Secondary Literature

  • Adell, Sandra, 1994, Double-Consciousness/ Double Bind: Theoretical Issues in Twentieth-Century Black Literature, Urbana: Illinois University Press.
  • Alcoff, Linda Martín, 2006, “Latinos, Asian Americans, and the Black-White Binary” in Visible Identities: Race, Gender, and the Self, Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2015, The Future of Whiteness, Malden MA: Polity Press.
  • Allen, Ernest Jr., 2002, “Du Boisian Double Consciousness: The Unsustainable Argument”, Massachusetts Review, 43(2, Summer): 217–253.
  • Asante, Molefi Kete, 1993, “Racism, Consciousness, and Afrocentricity”, in Early 1993: 127–143.
  • Blow, Charles M., 2013, “Barack and Trayvon”, New York Times, July 19, 2013. [Blow 2013 available online].
  • Breuer, Josef and Sigmund Freud, 1893, “On the Psychical Mechanism of Hysterical Phenomena”, Neurologisches Centralblatt, Nos. 1 and 2; reprinted as the first chapter of their Studien über Hysterie (Studies on Hysteria), 1895.
  • Bruce, Dickson D., Jr., 1992 [1999], “W.E.B. Du Bois and the Idea of Double Consciousness”, American Literature: A Journal of Literary History, Criticism, and Bibliography, 64(2): 299–309; page numbers as reprinted in The Souls of Black Folk (Norton Critical Edition), Henry Louis Gates, Jr. and Terri Hume Oliver (eds.), New York: W.W. Norton, 1999, pp. 236–244.
  • Early, Gerald (ed.), 1993, Lure and Loathing: Essays on Race, Identity, and the Ambivalence of Assimilation, New York: Penguin Books.
  • Emerson, Ralph Waldo, 1842, “The Transcedentalist”, A Lecture read at the Masonic Temple, Boston, January, 1842 printed in Nature; Addresses and Lectures, 1849, Boston and Cambridge: James Munroe and Company, pp. 316–348. [Emerson 1842 available online]
  • Fanon, Frantz, 1967, Black Skin, White Masks (French original Peau noire, masques blancs, 1952), New York: Grove Press.
  • Gates, Henry Louis Jr., 2006, “The Black Letters on the Sign: W E B Du Bois and the Canon”, Oxford University Press (this is the Series Editor’s introduction to the “Oxford W.E.B. Du Bois”, Oxford University Press’s uniform edition of the major works of Du Bois), page numbers from the version in Dusk of Dawn, Kwame Anthony Appiah (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2007, pp. xi–xxiv.
  • Gilroy, Paul, 1993, The Black Atlantic: Modernity and Double Consciousness, Harvard: Harvard University Press.
  • Gooding-Williams, Robert, 2009, In the Shadow of Du Bois: Afro-Modern Political Thought in America, Harvard University Press.
  • Gordon, Lewis, 2008, Introduction to Africana Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Henry, Paget, 2000, Caliban’s Reason: Introducing Afro-Caribbean Philosophy, (Africana Thought), New York: Routledge.
  • –––, 2005, “Africana Phenomenology: Its Philosophical Implications”, C.L.R. James Journal, 11(1): 79–112.
  • Hine, Darlene Clark, 1993, “‘In the Kingdom of Culture’: Black Women and the Intersection of Race, Gender, and Class”, in Early 1993: 337–351.
  • James, William, 1890, Principles of Psychology, New York: Henry Holt and Company.
  • Kirkland, Frank M., 2013, “On Du Bois’s Notion of Double Consciousness”, Philosophy Compass, 8(2): 137–148.
  • Lewis, David Levering, 2000, “Du Bois and Garvey: Two ‘Pan-Africas’”, in W.E.B. Du Bois, Vol. II, The Fight for Equality and the American Century, 1919–1963, New York: Henry Holt and Company, esp. pp 63–84.
  • Maldonado-Torres, Nelson, 2006, “Post-continental Philosophy: Its Definition, Contours, and Fundamental Sources,” Worlds and Knowledges Otherwise. [Maldonado-Torres 2006 available online (in PDF)]
  • Medina, José, 2013, The Epistemology of Resistance: Gender and Racial Oppression, Epistemic Injustice, and Resistant Imaginations, Oxford University Press.
  • Mitchill, [Samuel Latham], 1817, “A double consciousness, or a duality of person in the same individual: from a communication of Dr. Mitchill to the Reverend Dr. Nott, President of Union College, dated January 16, 1816”, The Medical Repository, (New York, new series), 3: 185–186. [Mitchill 1817 available online]
  • Morrison, Toni, 2012, [quoted in an article by Ariel Leve] “Toni Morrison on Love, Loss, and Modernity”, The Telegraph [UK], 17 July, 2012. [Morrison 2012 available online]
  • Reed, Adolph, Jr., 1997, W.E.B. Du Bois and American Political Thought: Fabianism and the Color Line, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Strachey, James, 1996, “Editor’s Introduction”, in Breuer, Josef and Sigmund Freud, Studies on Hysteria, James Strachey (trans. and ed.), New York: Basic Books, pp. ix–xxviii.
  • West, Cornel, 1982, Prophecy Deliverance! An Afro-American Revolutionary Christianity, Philadelphia, PA: The Westminster Press.
  • Williamson, Joel, 1978, “W.E.B. Du Bois as a Hegelian”, in David G. Sansing (ed.), What Was Freedom’s Price, Jackson, MS: University Press of Mississippi, pp. 21–50.
  • Zack, Naomi, 1993, Race and Mixed-Race, Philadelphia, PA: Temple University Press.

Other Internet Resources


Thanks to Tommie Shelby, who originally commissioned this article, discussed it with me, and steadily, patiently encouraged its production. Thanks also to Martha Bragin. Shout out to Jonathan Buchsbaum, whose ‘hard reading’ and suggestions made this version considerably more readable and coherent than it would have been. And thanks to Shelly Botuck, whose encouragement and support have been sustaining and indispensable throughout.

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John P. Pittman <>

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