Double-consciousness is a concept in social philosophy referring, originally, to a source of inward “twoness” putatively experienced by African-Americans because of their racialized oppression and disvaluation in a white-dominated society. The concept is often associated with William Edward Burghardt Du Bois, who introduced the term into social and political thought, famously, in his groundbreaking The Souls of Black Folk (1903). Its source has been traced back from there, by recent writers, to the development of clinical psychology in the nineteenth-century North Atlantic, and to trends in idealist philosophies of self—to the transcendentalism of Ralph Waldo Emerson and G.W.F. Hegel’s Phenomenology of Spirit. It is thus indirectly related to other nineteenth- and twentieth-century riffs on Hegelian themes, such as false consciousness and bad faith. In our day it continues to be used and discussed by numerous commentators—philosophical and otherwise—on racialized cultures, societies, and literatures, by cultural and literary theorists, and by students and investigators of Africana Philosophy. Recent philosophical debates center on the significance of the concept for Du Bois’s thought overall, its theoretical coherence, and its relevance for current social conditions.
- 1. The Trajectory of the Concept
- 2. Double-Consciousness in The Souls of Black Folk
- 3. Double-Consciousness in Souls of Black Folk: Problems
- 4. Du Boisian Double-Consciousness after Souls?
- 5. Conclusion
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. The Trajectory of the Concept
In an 1897 magazine article and again in his 1903 Souls of Black Folk, Du Bois innovated by using a term already in currency—and with multiple associations in a variety of literary, philosophical, and scientific discourses—in a distinctive and original way to name a theretofore largely unremarked phenomenon. The innovation was part of an account of a form of life-experience that he ascribed to “black folk” in America generally in then-current social circumstances—Jim Crow in the south, de facto segregation in the North, and the threat and actuality of racist violence throughout the country.
The term he used—“double-consciousness”—dropped entirely, after just these two uses, from his published writing. Those uses nonetheless struck a chord, and use of the term, interpreted in a number of distinct ways, has become more frequent as the century since its appearance has passed. While the disappearance of the term from Du Bois’s writing after 1903 has fueled questions about the significance of the concept in the overall assessment of his work, some commentators continue to insist on the centrality of the concept for an appreciation of Du Bois’s legacy.
Du Bois was engaged throughout his long career in the attempt to understand both the socio-historic conditions facing “Black folk” in the American twentieth century, and the impacts of those conditions on the consciousness and “inner world” of the human beings subject to them. In Souls of Black Folk that second concern was with capturing in words “the strange meaning of being black”, with describing the “spiritual world” and the “spiritual strivings” of “the American Negro”. Du Bois continued to articulate responses to these concerns in his later works: one finds formulations addressing them even in his posthumously published Autobiography (1968). As the contexts of Du Bois’s writing, research, and activism changed, these responses shifted in focus, emphasis, and perspective. Broadly speaking, as his reflections on what he initially termed the “spiritual world” of Black folk came to be more richly filled out in the variety and extent of its details, Du Bois’s account of the phenomena he originally identified with the term “double-consciousness” both overflowed the initial associations of that term and became stratified under pressure from his shifts in perspective. In what follows, we trace the fate of Du Bois’s 1903 account in his later work and then try to assess the reconstructed account on its own terms.
This article will, first, briefly survey some of the attempts to explicate and contextualize the use of the concept by Du Bois in The Souls of Black Folk of 1903 (hereafter Souls), present a brief overview of controversies concerning the viability of the concept and its significance for contemporary Africana thought, and then present some suggestions concerning the development of Du Bois’s understanding of the phenomenon after Souls. (The term Du Bois used was “double-consciousness”, with the hyphen intact; more recent writers have generally abandoned the hyphen. In this article the hyphen is retained in discussing Du Bois’s 1903 term and concept, and interpretive attempts to get at it. But “double consciousness” simpliciter is used when discussing the term more generally, and in relation to current debates about its import for Africana thought.)
2. Double-Consciousness in The Souls of Black Folk
The locus classicus for the Du Boisian conception occurs in the third paragraph of “Of our Spiritual Strivings”, the first chapter of Du Bois’s 1903 Souls (this chapter is a very slightly modified version of the earlier “The Strivings of the Negro People”, an article Du Bois published in The Atlantic magazine in August, 1897, where he first uses the term):
After the Egyptian and Indian, the Greek and Roman, the Teuton and Mongolian, the Negro is a sort of seventh son, born with a veil, and gifted with second-sight in this American world,—a world which yields him no true self-consciousness, but only lets him see himself through the revelation of the other world. It is a peculiar sensation, this double-consciousness, this sense of always looking at one’s self through the eyes of others, of measuring one’s soul by the tape of a world that looks on in amused contempt and pity. One ever feels his two-ness,—an American, a Negro; two souls, two thoughts, two unreconciled strivings; two warring ideals in one dark body, whose dogged strength alone keeps it from being torn asunder. (1997 : 38) [This passage henceforth referred to as the “Strivings” text.]
An inspection of the passage reveals the complexity of its object. Double-consciousness is identified here as a “sensation”, one which falls short of “true” self-consciousness, but is a consciousness of one’s self, nonetheless. It is also part of a more complex feeling of “two-ness”, of disparate and competing “thoughts”, “strivings”, and “ideals”. This is not an episodic or occasional sensation, but a fixed and persistent form of consciousness. It is ascribed to “the Negro … in this American world”, that is, it seems to be a socio-cultural construct rather than a baldly bio-racial given, and it is particularly attributed to people of African descent in America. The “two-ness” of which it is a consciousness thus is not inherent, accidental, nor benign: the condition is both imposed and fraught with psychic danger. It is presented as arising in conjunction with two other phenomena, related to two other figures—the “veil”, and the “gift” of “second-sight”. Of these, “the veil” is the more insistent motif, recurring regularly throughout Souls as well as other of Du Bois’s writings. By contrast, the terms “double-consciousness” and “second-sight” seem not to have been used in print by Du Bois after 1903. Still, this passage has come to have a singular significance in the philosophical interpretation of Du Bois’s thought as well as for the influence of his views.
The paragraph immediately following makes clear that, for Du Bois, this is not only a “sensation” but constitutes a crucial object of “striving” and political struggle for black folk in the United States:
The history of the American Negro is the history of this strife,—this longing to attain self-conscious manhood, to merge his double self into a better and truer self. In this merging he wishes neither of the older selves to be lost.
The phenomenon is identified again—but without being so named again—in the tenth chapter of Souls, “Of the Faith of the Fathers”, an essay on “Negro religious life”. In a passage devoted to “the current critical phase of Negro religion”, Du Bois sets down these words:
From the double life every American Negro must live, as a Negro and as an American, as swept on by the current of the nineteenth while yet struggling in the eddies of the fifteenth century,—from this must arise a painful self-consciousness, an almost morbid sense of personality, and a moral hesitancy which is fatal to self-confidence. The worlds within and without the Veil of Color are changing, and changing rapidly, but not at the same rate, not in the same way; and this must produce a peculiar wrenching of the soul, a peculiar sense of doubt and bewilderment. Such a double life, with double thoughts, double duties, and double social classes, must give rise to double words and double ideals, and tempt the mind to pretence or revolt, to hypocrisy or radicalism. (1997 : 155–6) [This passage henceforth referred to as the “Faith” text.]
Here double-consciousness, unnamed, is set in a more dynamic context than in the earlier, “Strivings” text. The two passages, parallel in form, are subtly different in tone. Here Du Bois clearly distinguishes two social “worlds” and the “double lives” that result. This text sweeps us along, showing a causality, a coming-into-being of consciousness. And this second, “Faith” text, concludes by noting, in a matter of words, the social and political consequences of this “painful” double-consciousness. Yet, oddly, the “Faith” text is largely neglected in discussions of the concept.
The current relevance of double consciousness to an understanding of Black lives, and of contemporary American reality, is evidenced by recent commentary and scholarship. In a recent interview, Toni Morrison recalls the Du Boisian motif in characterizing the literary work of Black men:
… African American male writers justifiably write books about their oppression,
Confronting the oppressor who is white male or white woman. It’s race. And the person who defines you under those circumstances is a white mind—tells you whether you’re worthy or what have you. And as long as that’s your preoccupation, you’re defending yourself against that. Reacting to it. Reacting to the definition—saying it’s not true.
Morrison contrasts this to her own approach, which is to
take away the gaze of the white male. Once you take that out, the whole world opens up. (Morrison 2012)
Lawrie Balfour, in discussing what she calls James Baldwin’s “race conscious” approach to American race relations (1998), measures its similarities to and differences from Du Boisian double consciousness. Balfour argues that Baldwin’s approach “goes to the core of the post-civil rights predicament” (1998: 246) since the basic reality of the color line has not been decisively effaced. Most recently, the New York Times columnist Charles M. Blow has more than once cited the “Strivings” text in commenting on the contemporary paradoxes of black life brought into the open by some of President Obama’s public statements in the wake of recent criminal justice controversies (Blow 2013).
A number of academic writers have been concerned in the last twenty years to contextualize and interpret Du Bois’s notion of double-consciousness—most often focusing on the “Strivings” text, and ignoring the “Faith” text—to identify sources and antecedents that influenced his conception, and to clarify the concerns he was addressing and his intentions in putting it forward. A brief resume of that interpretive record follows.
2.1 Americanist Romantic Longing
In his 1992 article “W.E.B. Du Bois and the Idea of Double Consciousness”, Dickson D. Bruce Jr. suggests a variety of sources of the complex of meanings marshaled at the time by Du Bois’s use of the term. The “double consciousness” figure precedes Du Bois, coming out of the European romantic opposition between an innate human affinity for the transcendent and a pragmatic “materialism” grounded in a utilitarian attitude to life, to mundane needs and commercial enterprise. Tracing this understanding of double consciousness back to the American philosopher Ralph Waldo Emerson (and beyond him to Goethe), who used the term in his essay, “The Transcendentalist” (1842), Bruce maintains that this anti-bourgeois romanticism is a “figurative background” of Du Bois’s use of the term, to which Du Bois brought his idea that
the essence of a distinctive African consciousness was its spirituality… revealed among African Americans in their folklore, their history of patient suffering, and their faith. (Bruce 1999 : 238)
Bruce also briefly traces the trajectory of “double-consciousness” in the medical and psychological literature of the nineteenth century. An early appearance of the term in the Medical Repository in 1817 (Mitchill 1817: 185) named the condition of a Mary Reynolds, who, for a period of about fifteen years beginning in her nineteenth, alternately lived two distinct lives, with wholly different personalities, uncognizant of and inaccessible to each other. This use of the term had some currency throughout the nineteenth century; William James, one of Du Bois’s Harvard philosophy professors, described such cases as alternating between “primary and secondary consciousnesses” in his considerable discussion of them in the Principles of Psychology (1890: see esp. Vol. I, 379-393), published while Du Bois was at Harvard (although James does not seem to have used the term “double-consciousness”) (Bruce 1999 : 240–1). Bruce comments that
…based on Du Bois’s use of “double-consciousness” in his Atlantic essay he certainly seems to have known the term’s psychological background, because he used it in ways quite consistent with that background. (1999: 242)
[Bruce does not note the appearance of the term, in French—“double conscience”—in Josef Breuer and Sigmund Freud’s “On the Psychical Mechanism of Hysterical Phenomena” published in 1893 in Neurologisches Centralblatt, Nos. 1 and 2. This paper was later reprinted as the first chapter of Studies on Hysteria, published in 1895. Breuer and Freud appear to use the French term in responding to and developing its earlier use by Pierre Janet, relating it to “splitting of consciousness” and psychic “dissociation”. (For a discussion of the Breuer-Freud-Janet connection, see James Strachey’s introduction to Studies on Hysteria.)]
The diverse associations of the different senses of the term were crucial, Bruce argues, to the resonance and suggestiveness of Du Bois’s distinctive use of the term: the romantic-transcendental connotations of spiritual longing and unbridgeable opposition between two viewpoints combined with the psychological sense of not only the real distinctiveness and moral parity of the two personae but also the possibility that they could merge in a new synthetic unity signifying a cure, a fact reported in a number of cases of the psychological malady.
2.2 Color-Line Hegelianianism
The first book-length study thematizing Du Boisian double-consciousness was Sandra Adell’s Double-Consciousness/ Double Bind: Theoretical Issues in Twentieth-Century Black Literature (1994). The book engaged critical debates over theoretical approaches to Black literature; Adell argues for an intertextualism inspired by Derridean deconstruction, and aimed at transcending the “Afrocentric/ Eurocentric” divide. The book begins with a chapter on Du Bois’s “Strivings” text and Souls. Adell, following the lead of Joel Williamson’s earlier article, “W.E.B. Du Bois as a Hegelian” (1978), presents Du Bois’s text as a “reading” and use of crucial passages in Hegel: Du Boisian double-consciousness, she claims, “emerges from the philosophy of Hegel as it is articulated in the Phenomenology of Spirit” (1994: 8). She adduces as evidence for the Hegelian reading of Souls Du Bois’s studies with William James and Josiah Royce, references to Hegel in Du Bois’s Philosophy IV notebook from his time at Harvard, as well as his studies with von Trietschke in Berlin “(in the midst of a ‘Hegelian revival’ when he arrived)” (1994: 12).
Adell identifies three “instances” of the “doubling of consciousness” in Hegel’s text (in the section on “Self-Consciousness”; in “Lordship and Bondage”; and in “The Unhappy Consciousness”); it is the third of these that, Adell argues, forms the basic pattern for the “Strivings” text:
Du Bois’s “double-consciousness” decontextualizes Hegel’s “Unhappy Consciousness” … and opens it up to other contexts. In this case, the new context is one upon which is inscribed the problem of the twentieth century: the problem of the color line. (1994: 19)
Adell sketches a reading of the entire text of Souls as a detailed “sociological, psychological, and philosophical” account of “the Negro’s being-in-the-world” (1994: 19). Her reading identifies other borrowings from German Idealism, noting along the way that
the title of Du Bois’s text itself, The Souls of Black Folk, remarks and reiterates the two concepts—soul and folk—(Volk) that are central, not only to [Johann Gottfried von] Herder’s aesthetics, but to that of Hegel as well. (1994: 23)
2.3 A Deflationist Reading
What might be called a “deflationist” approach to the interpretation of Du Bois’s conception of double-consciousness is pursued by Adolph Reed, Jr., in his 1997 book on Du Bois’s political philosophy, W.E.B. Du Bois and American Political Thought: Fabianism and the Color Line. Reed’s book offers a critique of what he dubs “vindicationist” approaches to Afro-American political thought—approaches attempting to show the significance of the work of African-American theorists by tracing analogies and lines of influence between them and the “greats” of the European tradition (1997: 12). The double polemical thrust of Reed’s text, with respect to double-consciousness, is to question the alleged sources of influence on Du Bois’s thinking, and to refute the claim that Du Bois’s formulation refers to a transhistorical feature of black life in America. He points to the
fact that, for all its prominence in The Souls of Black Folk, the double-consciousness notion by and large disappears from Du Bois’s writing after 1903,
to undercut the claims that it “was a definitive element, a key organizing principle of his thought” or “a moment in a distinctively black social-theoretical discourse or tradition” (1997: 124). He concludes that
[a]s a proposition alleging a generic racial condition—that millions of individuals experience a peculiar form of bifurcated identity, simply by virtue of common racial status—the notion seems preposterous on its face. (1997: 125)
Reed, setting out an extensive contextualizing account, shows the considerable cachet of ideas of duality current when Du Bois wrote, and argues that the claims of a lineage connecting Du Bois’s use of double-consciousness to Emerson’s and James’s writings fail. He rejects any Hegelian source of influence on Du Bois, aligning Du Bois’s concept with evolutionary and Lamarckian social-scientific views instead. Reed argues that an emphasis on double-consciousness comes to the fore in Du Bois interpretation only after the 1960s, when it supplants critical attention to the critique of Booker T. Washington’s strategy of “accommodation” in the third essay of the book. Reed attributes this shift in focus to “an ideological current within the post-segregation-era black petite bourgeoisie” (1997: 130) “centered on assertion of black presence within hermetically constituted communities of academic discourse” (1997: 94–5).
Ernest Allen Jr. presents a similarly deflationist case in his article, “Du Boisian Double Consciousness: The Unsustainable Argument” (2002), arguing that the Du Boisian conception of double-consciousness was a “tactical, political” attempt to gain support among sympathetic white philanthropists for the efforts of cultural uplift and organization on the part of a “Talented Tenth”, an “educated black elite”. The rhetorical construction of a model of double-consciousness in Souls involves for Allen a “double sleight of hand” (2002: 25), requiring a slippage between a putative conflict of ideals within the minds of the black elite and a more general problem for African Americans “who could not help but have internalized some of the negative sentiments that white society held towards them” (2002: 29).
The attribution of distinctive “American” and “Negro” ideals is empty, Allen argues: there are no clear examples of “Negro” ideals in the offing in Du Bois’s text. Though there is no conflict between “warring” ideals as claimed by Du Bois—ideals equally attractive, between which Negroes had to choose but couldn’t—there is a conflict between white racial prejudice and intransigent hostility and exclusion of blacks, on the one hand, and the ideal of civic equality for all emblazoned on the ideological banners of the American republic, on the other. This—what Allen calls “the institutionalized as well as everyday double consciousness and double dealings of white Americans”—is, he claims, “the social foundation” of the “African American ideological ambivalence” (2002: 38) that Du Boisian double-consciousness expresses.
2.4 An Analytic Decomposition
Robert Gooding-Williams develops an elaborate analysis of double-consciousness in his In the Shadow of Du Bois: Afro-Modern Political Thought in America (2009). Gooding-Williams presents a tripartite account of the concept as a keystone in Du Bois’s political-philosophical project. Double-consciousness functions as part of an account of the subjective experience of African-Americans in conditions dominated by Jim Crow and the “color line”; it serves as an essential component of Du Bois’s critique of certain forms of black political leadership under those conditions; and it underwrites Du Bois’s own positive theory of “political expressivism”. Gooding-Williams, like Allen, distinguishes double-consciousness from the more general idea of “two-ness” that Du Bois connects it to, arguing also that “second sight” is a distinctive feature of Du Boisian double-consciousness.
Gooding-Williams’ account of double-consciousness emphasizes that Du Bois presents the concept in Souls in a passage that begins with the question, “How does it feel to be a problem?”—a question which references the so-called “Negro problem”. This positioning indicates an inward approach to the “subjective” felt experience of “the Negro”. Double-consciousness is related in this passage to “second sight”, which Du Bois characterizes as a “gift” in this American world. Gooding-Williams finds two sources for the idea of second sight—one in African-American folklore, and one in the nineteenth-century literature on animal magnetism. Both these present it as a capacity for a sort of extra-sensory perception (e.g., of ghosts) or a kind of vision into the future—a capacity to see what is not generally visible. Gooding-Williams argues that Du Bois uses “second sight” to identify “the Negro’s” capacity to see himself through the eyes of white Americans. Because white Americans constitute what Du Bois refers to as “the other world”, a social group distinct from that of black folk, whites’ perceptions of and views about blacks would not “normally” be available to blacks, for Gooding-Williams; it is second sight that gives such access. In “this American world”, however, whites’ perspectives on blacks are deeply distorted by racial prejudice. It is the “gift” of second sight, then, that makes blacks’ self-consciousness into a “false self-consciousness”, Gooding-Williams claims, by fostering in them a self-concept molded by contempt and a presumption of inferiority.
Gooding-Williams agrees with Reed in rejecting readings of double-consciousness as a timeless condition, and in seeing the centrality of an emancipatory political project for Du Bois’s understanding of the Negro’s social condition. On Gooding-Williams’ reconstruction, double-consciousness, as a form of false self-consciousness, is a causally necessary condition of the sense of two-ness Du Bois describes. That sense is of a conflict between two sets of ideals and strivings, so Gooding-Williams dubs it “conflictual two-ness”. For Du Bois, the “merging” of the two selves can only take place if white prejudice and, in a word, racism, has been eliminated from the environing culture and the “other world’s” perspective on the Negro, and, consequently, from “the Negro’s” second sight. Gooding-Williams identifies this with the achievement of reciprocal recognition that has been denied the Negro by the white “other world” throughout American history.
Thus, Gooding-Williams presents double-consciousness as a “false self-consciousness” arising through second sight exercised in conditions of a racially prejudiced dominant culture. This false consciousness can make way for a “true self-consciousness” only when those conditions have been transformed and whites no longer perceive blacks as “contemptible” or “inferior” (for only then will the Negro’s “second sight” reflect a perception of himself undistorted by prejudice). This eventuality, neither inevitable nor unattainable, is consequently a prime object of the Du Boisian political project. That project’s broader object—indeed, the goal of the history of African-American striving—is for African-Americans to be recognized as “co-workers in the kingdom of culture”. Gooding-Williams concludes that the overcoming of double-consciousness is a necessary and sufficient condition for the achievement of reciprocal recognition and full equality, since the struggle for full equality grounded in reciprocal recognition cannot be won without eradicating the basis for double-consciousness.
Gooding-Williams argues finally that Du Bois was concerned with double-consciousness not only as a correlate of the disenfranchised condition that constitutes the so-called Negro problem, but also as a crucial test of the effectiveness of the struggle for the overcoming of that condition itself. In his discussions of Booker T. Washington and Alexander Crummell (in chapters III and XII of Souls), Du Bois makes a case that both these leaders fell victim to a double-consciousness, vitiating their effectiveness as leaders of the emancipation struggle. The “Atlanta Compromise” Washington proposed in 1895, for example, was a strategy that, by giving up the demand for black citizenship rights, compromised the struggle for recognition and effectively reinforced double-consciousness by failing to challenge the white perception of Negro “inferiority”.
2.5 Rousseauian Self-Estrangement
Frank Kirkland proposes, following Gooding-Williams, to take Du Bois at his word in describing double-consciousness as a “feeling”; Kirkland articulates that feeling through the Rousseauian notion of amour-propre, the form of “civilized” self-love that is reflective, contrastive, and, in Rousseau’s account, radically corrosive of social solidarity. (Rousseau’s account distinguishes amour-propre from amour de soi, a “natural” instinctual urge to self-preservation. Amour-propre is a purely social sort of anti-solidarity, pitting one against another on grounds of comparative measures of worth.)
Du Bois’ “double consciousness” refers to a black person’s felt awareness of the harmfully comparative measures of others on her character and self-esteem, by which s⁄he takes herself to be a problem in and of a social arrangement permitting such measures or obliging them. (2013: 144)
For Kirkland, Du Bois’ conception of double-consciousness is inherently comparative, the consequence of the operation of amour-propre in conditions of the color line. Du Bois, according to Kirkland, began from the “inflamed amour-propre of others”:
those (of the darker races) have their own respect and esteem … denied or underestimated by others (of the lighter races), thereby agitating and worsening the color line. (2013: 140)
For Kirkland amour-propre is not the cause of the color-line, but
once the color line is on the scene, amour-propre provides it with the stimulus to spread widely and intensely forms of inequality. (2013: 146 n19)
Kirkland also stresses the element of “sentience” within double-consciousness, of the black person’s awareness, even if unreflective and rudimentary, of the comparative form of his/her disvaluation.
[F]or Du Bois, this comparison gone awry is a matter about which black people are, at least, sentient, awake to, even if they have not grasped it conceptually,
writes Kirkland, adding that this is “their sentience to the comparison by which they are made a problem” (2013: 140).
Kirkland identifies two forms of the “hazard” consequent on double-consciousness for African-Americans: it can induce a “dual/duelist” hazard of internally conflicted aspirations and expectations, and a related “duplicitous” stance of hypocrisy. Both these arise from the felt need to
compromis[e] one’s ideals to maintain one’s esteem…. Being of two conflicting minds or being two-faced are the outcomes of the compromise to the hazards accompanying their aspirations for esteem. (2013: 145)
Kirkland also identifies a third, “dyadic” form of double-consciousness which
would reflect, via education, the result of an individual coming to a true, non-estranged comprehension of the position s⁄he deserves in comparison to others as both a citizen and a person of color with certain talents and competences. (2013: 142)
This “non-estranged” mode of double-consciousness is a “solution to the hazards” of the other two forms, according to Kirkland.
2.6 Uses and Extensions of the Concept
Cornel West extends the analytic grasp of the concept as part of a critical discussion of double-consciousness in his first book, Prophecy Deliverance! (1982). In the first chapter, West suggests an ingredient missing from Du Bois’s analysis of the self-consciousness of Africans in America, claiming that
Du Bois overlooked the broader dialectic of being American yet feeling European, of being provincial but yearning for British cosmopolitanism, of being at once incompletely civilized and materially prosperous, a genteel Brahmin amid uncouth conditions. Black Americans labored rather under the burden of a triple crisis of self-consciousness. Their cultural predicament was comprised of African appearance and unconscious cultural mores, involuntary displacement to America without American status, and American alienation from the European ethos complicated through domination by incompletely European Americans. (1982: 30–1)
West further complicates his enumeration of the tangled elements of the African-American cultural dialectic, referring to the “anxiety-ridden provinciality” of Protestant-American self-identity, and the “distinctly antimodern values and sensibilities” dominant in the southern states, the “geographic cradle of black America” (1982: 31).
West’s formulations do not unmake the basic claim of Du Bois’s text, but embed its core insight in a richer vision. The “triple crisis of self-consciousness” West attributes to black Americans seems to add “American alienation from the European ethos” to the two “sides” of Du Boisian double-consciousness. It’s worth noting that, near the end of West’s discussion, he acknowledges that, in the first attempts to shape their own self-identity, “Black people were relatively uninformed about British culture…”. This seems to minimize the significance of “British cosmopolitanism” and “alienation from the European ethos” as issues for black folk in America generally. It would follow that, as Africans in America became educated in the European-American cultural milieu, their awareness and sensitivity to the anxieties of generic American self-awareness might be more fully reflected in their own self-understandings.
In The Black Atlantic: Modernity and Double Consciousness (1993) Paul Gilroy attempts to “muddle” the boundaries—both disciplinary and geographical—of the political and cultural analysis in/of black studies. Gilroy argues, against essentialist and nationalist trends in black political discourse, for an “intercultural and anti-ethnocentric account of black history and political culture” (1993: 115). Du Bois figures prominently in that argument, and Gilroy extends Du Boisian double-consciousness both beyond the American context and at odds with an essentialist understanding of race.
Gilroy claims double consciousness as an overriding thematic element in Du Bois’s thought and writing, both in and beyond Souls, part of Du Bois’s attempt to subvert rigidly fixed racial identities as imposed categories keyed to the oppressive social structures of white supremacy. The “Strivings” text is taken as one early explicit expression of Du Bois’s own ambivalence toward modernity, prefiguring as well the increasingly transnational and pan-racial scope of Du Bois’s evolving concerns as the twentieth century unrolls. Gilroy also identifies that ambivalence as a stable and pronounced tendency in diasporic black cultures and political debates generally.
In a reading of Souls that is central to his book, Gilroy highlights the
nagging anxiety over the inner contradictions of modernity and a radical scepticism towards the ideology of progress with which it is associated (1993: 117)
that he finds there in germ form. Gilroy further finds elements of an implicit global-diasporic—hence “Black Atlantic”—perspective on “the meaning of being black” that is in tension with, and submerged somewhat under the “smooth flow of African-American exceptionalisms” (1993: 120). This element within the discourse of Souls points to the wider significance of double consciousness, according to Gilroy, who argues that the theme would, subsequent to Souls, come “to illuminate the experience of post-slave populations in general” and to “animate a dream of global co-operation among people of color which came to full fruition only in [Du Bois’] later work” (1993: 126).
Paget Henry’s phenomenological treatment of Du Bois’s double-consciousness conception in his “Africana Phenomenology: Its Philosophical Implications” (2005) identifies a “theory” of double consciousness as part of a “comprehensive phenomenology of Africana self-consciousness” (2005: 85). Henry distinguishes Du Boisian double-consciousness from the double consciousness found in Hegel’s discussion of lordship and bondage in the Phenomenology of Spirit: Du Boisian double-consciousness
is the theorizing of a period of racial/imperial domination in the self-consciousness of the Africana subject that is absent from the life of Hegel’s European subject. (2005: 94)
Henry offers further an explication of Du Boisian “second sight”: on his view, it is
the ability of the racialized Africana subject to see him/herself as “a negro”, that is, through the eyes of the white other. (2005: 89)
Henry characterizes this as a “categoric form of self-blindness … a classic case of false consciousness” (2005: 90). But Henry claims a further, ethically propitious form of second sight is possible—what he calls “potentiated second sight”. This is a “very special access and insight into the dehumanizing ‘will to power’ of the European imperial subject”. This “potentiating” of second sight can occur, according to Henry, when an Africana subject is able to uproot the “blackface” stereotype from his/her consciousness and reconceive him/herself as “an African” by operating “within the creative codes of African discourses and symbols” (2005: 91). Henry cites the Rastafarians as an example of this route to potentiated second sight. An alternate route to potentiated second sight is through an individually acquired independent standpoint on the world of the agents of white supremacy, and here Henry cites Du Bois himself as an exemplar.
Henry’s account of double consciousness identifies Du Boisian double-consciousness with the object of Frantz Fanon’s existential-psychoanalytic account of black self-consciousness, relying primarily on Fanon’s Black Skin, White Masks (1967). While clearly specifying the Freudian and Sartrian idiom in which Fanon carries through his analyses in that text, Henry writes that “there is no finer or more detailed account of the state of racial double consciousness” (2005: 95). In the very first pages of that text, Fanon makes clear his psychoanalytic orientation, writing of the black’s “inferiority complex”—a term whose first appearance in the book is in an epigraph, a quotation from Aime Cesaire’s Discourse on Colonialism. Several pages later, Fanon observes that
The effective disalienation of the black man entails an immediate recognition of social and economic realities. If there is an inferiority complex, it is the outcome of a double process: primarily, economic; subsequently, the internalization—or better, the epidermalization—of this inferiority. (1967: 10–11)
Henry details a process he dubs “negrification”, to which, on his reading of Fanon, the black is subject in the confines of the West. In that process, “colonized Africana people lost their earlier cultural identities and became identified by the color of their skin” (2005: 96). In this process, the white colonizer projects the most reprehensible and forbidden aspects of himself onto the black man, thereby bringing about the stereotype of “the Negro”. Fanon also borrows Jungian formulations for his account, writing of the “collective unconscious of homo occidentalis”, in which the black man “symbolizes evil, sin, wretchedness, death, war, famine”. Referring to his native land, Fanon writes
[i]n Martinique, whose collective unconscious makes it a European country, when a “blue” Negro—a coal-black one—comes to visit, one reacts at once: “What bad luck is he bringing?” (1967: 191)
In an earlier text, Caliban’s Reason (2000), Henry uses the Shakespearean motif, from The Tempest, of the clash of the European colonizer Prospero with the native Caliban. There he writes of the “Calibanization” of the Africans imported by European slavers to the Caribbean:
[C]olor eclipsed culture. The latter became more invisible as Africans were transformed into negroes and niggers in the minds of Europeans. This racial violence shattered the cultural foundations of the African self…. Race became the primary signifier of Europeans and Africans and of the differences between them. Consequently, the identities of these two groups were rigidly inscribed in a set of binary oppositions that linked the binary black/white to other binaries such as primitive/civilized, irrational/rational, body/mind, prelogical/logical, flesh/spirit. (2000: 11–2)
Henry takes this process of “Calibanization”—the substitution of a racialized identity based on a set of insidiously contrastive binaries for an original and native cultural identity grounded in African ways of life—as the production of a form of double consciousness.
Lewis Gordon touches on double consciousness in his account of Du Bois’s significance to the tradition of Africana philosophy in his Introduction to Africana Philosophy (2008). Gordon notes that in the very first paragraphs of the “Strivings” chapter, Du Bois refers to the “unasked question” at the root of his personal interactions with white interlocutors: “How does it feel to be a problem?” For Gordon, this question presupposes the subjectivity, and, hence, the humanity, of the black person being addressed. And yet, the ascription of the status of a “problem” to that person involves at the same time a denial of the humanity of that black addressee. Gordon notes that “[t]he appeal to blacks as problem-people is an assertion of their ultimate location outside the system of order and rationality” (2008: 76). This outsider status, Gordon suggests, is crucial to the formation of double consciousness, leading as it does to “the splitting of worlds and consciousness itself according to the norms of U.S. society and its contradictions”. Gordon claims the ascription of problematic status to blacks itself is necessitated by the fact that “‘American’ was persistently defined as ‘white’ in North America and the rest of the Americas” (2008: 77).
Gordon specifies the “negative version” of double consciousness as when the self-image of the black person is wholly determined by how the racial others view her—her view of herself becomes a “white point of view” (2008: 78). Closely related to this is an exclusionary account of citizenship, relegating the black person to the status of noncitizen or a lesser, second class citizen. For Gordon, the epistemological significance of double consciousness is that one of the two perspectives implicit in it—that of the white world—is necessarily partial, yet positions itself as universal, and so, is “a form of consciousness that hides itself” (2008: 79). This only comes to light because this dominant self-conception brings into being a “subaltern” consciousness, which is a consciousness of the contradictions in that dominant self-conception. This, Gordon writes, is the second, doubling consciousness in its affirmative, fully realized manifestation.
3. Double-Consciousness in Souls of Black Folk: Problems
The preceding resume of the interpretive literature on Du Bois’s conception yields several points of contention, among them issues concerning the source(s) of Du Bois’s conception and terminology, and especially the possible Rousseauian, Hegelian and/or American philosophical connections; the scope of the conception, that is, how widely and to whom Du Bois thought it applied; the relation between double-consciousness and the psychic duality he associated it with; the nature of “second sight”, and its relation to double-consciousness; double-consciousness’s connection to what might be called pathology, on the one hand, and to critical social awareness or critique, on the other; the validity and usefulness of the conception to an understanding of the situation of black folk specifically, both at the turn of the twentieth century when Du Bois put it forward, and today, in the century plus since. Here we briefly recapitulate several of those questions.
The first question, one Gooding-Williams identifies as a paradox, concerns Du Bois’s apparent invulnerability to double-consciousness. If double-consciousness is indeed endemic to “Negroes”—if it was, in a sense, a structural problem for any Negro consciousness under conditions of Jim Crow—then how exactly could Du Bois himself write as though he has transcended or surmounted it, and achieved himself the “true self-conscious manhood”? And if not, how can the account he presents be taken as veridical? Although Du Bois never explicitly makes the claim that he himself is free from double-consciousness, he does seem to have written as though his theoretical vision was relatively unclouded by an internal soul-struggle. And yet Du Bois also clearly introduces his conception of double-consciousness in the context of an account of his own personal experience and as, in part, based on that experience.
Gooding-Williams argues that this paradox can be overcome by distinguishing the narrative authority of Souls from the historical author of the text. It is the narrator of Souls, and not Du Bois himself, who has escaped double-consciousness. This may work for Souls as a literary text, but it doesn’t help make a consistent theory of black political leadership plausible, suggesting as it does that no actual black political leader is immune from double-consciousness. Another possible resolution to the paradox, one not readily available to Gooding-Williams given his interpretation, involves the liberatory potential of a second sight that penetrates to the contradictions of the dominant white cultural milieu, and so opens up the possibility for undermining and subsequently rejecting its biased assumption about black folk (what Henry calls “potentiated second sight”).
Du Bois often insisted that his accounting of “the Negro problem”—or, alternatively, of “the race concept”—involves leading his readers “within the Veil”—making it possible for his (presumably mostly white) readers to gain some sense of the experience of “being black”. This involves, as he puts it in Dusk of Dawn (1940), “elucidating the inner meaning and significance of that race problem by explaining it in terms of the one human life that I know best” (1968 : viii). But that life, by any measure, was one lived at the top of “the upper layers of educated and ambitious Negroes” (1968 : 185). This returns us to the question of the scope of double-consciousness, a question raised most insistently by Allen.
While Du Bois presents double-consciousness in the 1903 texts as a problem for black folks generally given conditions of segregation and historically persisting inequality, a closer inspection shows that he also suggests that the phenomenon is specific to black leadership or those who are most fully caught between the white world and the world of color—those who have deliberately taken on the project of “the moral uplift” of the “backward” black masses, and who stand as “representatives” of these two “worlds” one to another. Much of what he says in illustration of his original claim about double-consciousness in the “Strivings” passage features educated, “better” Negroes: illustrative examples cited in the subsequent paragraphs include that of the black artisan, the Negro minister or doctor, the “would be black savant” and the black artist. Du Bois also devotes several chapters in Souls to detailed characterizations of the inner soul struggles of those, both actual and fictional, who would be or were in fact leaders of their people—Washington, Crummell, and the fictional John Jones. Yet much of the force of the initial claim for double-consciousness in the “Strivings” text is the universality of its attribution there to “the Negro in this American world”.
Some recent commentators have rejected the claim that double-consciousness, in the sense of internalized disparagement or a self-perception of inferiority, has been a universal feature of black life in America. Molefi Kete Asante, discussing his own experience growing up in and around the small town of Valdosta, Georgia, in the 1950s, writes that
[t]he tightly knit community of Africans who lived on the dirt roads of Valdosta never saw themselves as intellectually or physically inferior to whites. There existed no reference points outside of ourselves despite the economic and psychological poverty of our situation. (1993: 133)
Several pages later Asante states flat-out, “I was never affected by the Du Boisian double-consciousness” (1993: 136). He does go on to acknowledge the special circumstances of his experience:
It might have been another matter if I had gone to school and to church with whites when I was younger. I might have suffered confusion, double-consciousness, but I did not. (1993: 137)
A third issue for Du Bois’s conception of double-consciousness concerns its putative relation to the “two-ness” of the Negro psyche. Du Bois never explicitly clarifies the relation between double-consciousness and two-ness in his texts. Du Bois was concerned early on to establish a distinct contribution of “the Negro” to world culture and civilization, since lynch law and the backlash against Reconstruction in the last decades of the nineteenth and early twentieth century raised the specter of a genocidal extermination of black folk in America. The claim of a distinctly “Negro” contribution to world culture seems to require, indeed, some distinctive Negro “ideals”. But the reconstruction presented by Gooding-Williams, who makes the best detailed case so far for the coherence and viability of Du Bois’s conception, depends on the claim that the two-ness is conflictual, and hence a “problem”, only because double-consciousness incorporates white prejudices into the Negro’s own self-consciousness. As Allen and others have pointed out (and Gooding-Williams acknowledges) Du Bois presents vague, seemingly empty, or competing accounts of just what the conflicting American and Negro “ideals” are. The question, then, is whether Du Bois’s reference to distinctly “Negro” or black “ideals” can be sustained as a source of the “two-ness” to which Du Bois connects double-consciousness. If there are indeed such (non-empty) ideals, and they are an independent source of conflictual two-ness, then double-consciousness might turn out to be a more complex phenomenon than Gooding-Williams’ account suggests.
The Du Boisian conception has been criticized as well for oversimplifying the complexity and multidimensionality of contemporary selves, for expressing a nostalgia for a unitary and integral self that may never have existed, is an illusion, an unachievable ideal. Thus Darlene Clark Hine suggests that
had Du Bois specifically included the experiences and lives of black women in his lament, … instead of writing, “One ever feels his twoness”, he would have mused about how one ever feels her “fiveness”: Negro, American, woman, poor, black woman. (Hines 1993: 338)
Critiques of Du Bois’s conception along these lines have become widespread since the last decades of the twentieth century, but, it might be argued, they are in one sense beside the point. That the 1903 text is masculinist seems undeniable. But it’s also true that Du Bois’s “double-consciousness” was not proposed as a comprehensive account of the reality of human being, was not addressed to the variety of sources of human social identity per se. His conception was an attempt to capture something about the lived experience of black folk as black folk in the United States under conditions of Jim Crow and white supremacy. It would be wholly consistent with the point of his conception if, added to the doubling of consciousness consequent upon racially oppressive social conditions, other forms of psychic doubling or fragmentation, responses to other forms of inequality, might arise.
Henry Louis Gates Jr. addresses not the descriptive adequacy but the normative thrust of Du Bois’s conception when he observes that
cultural multiplicity is no longer seen as the problem, but as a solution—a solution to the confines of identity itself. Double consciousness, once a disorder, is now the cure. (2006: xv)
This remark is best read as a contextualizing point about Du Bois’s conception, yet it trades upon the common confusion of the duality or “two-ness” Du Bois wraps around his double-consciousness conception with that conception itself. Surely even if “cultural multiplicity” has come to be valuable in itself, as Gates has it, the “amused contempt and pity” crucial to Du Bois’s double-consciousness, directed against oneself, is an unlikely part of any “cure”.
Finally, a question might be raised about the relation of Du Bois’s double-consciousness conception and the sorts of self-doubts, troubled feelings, and “identity issues” that have been linked to biracial or mixed-race appearance or identity in our persisting, harshly racialized American social world. The racist ideologies accompanying and justifying white supremacy, and the mores and systems of “etiquette” governing “race relations” in racially hierarchical social conditions, have presented particular difficulties for persons of ambiguous racial descent, visibly marked as brought into being by “race mixing”. Often mixed-race persons have encountered hostility and suspicion from “both sides”, from each of the distinct races of which they are mixed. Sometimes they are deemed weak or inferior just because they are mixed, as Naomi Zack documents in her Race and Mixed-Race (1993: chapters 11, 12). Indeed, Du Bois was himself personally deeply familiar with this issue, as he relates, for instance, from his university days in Berlin. His “most interesting” professor there was Heinrich von Trietschke;
[o]ne day he startled me by suddenly declaring during a lecture on America: “Die Mulattin sind niedrig! Sie fuhlen sich niedrig!” [Mulattoes are inferior; they feel themselves inferior.] I felt as if he were pointing me out; but I presume he was quite unaware of my presence. However my presence or absence would have made no difference to him. He was given to making extraordinary assertions out of a clear sky and evidently believing just what he said. My fellow students gave no evidence of connecting what he said with me. (Du Bois 1968: 165)
In the further course of his life, skin color—Du Bois’s own skin color—would be made an issue of by some who wanted to challenge his positions and leadership or with whom he had ideological disagreements—Marcus Garvey being a notable case in point (on the Du Bois – Garvey contretemps, see Lewis 2000).
Yet when Du Bois formulated “double-consciousness” at the turn of the century, mixed-race and issues of what might be called “skin color anxiety” among black folk were not topics he addressed in print. There is virtually no consideration of such issues in Souls. The duality posited in the texts of 1903 is one between “Negro”—an identity keyed to a metaphysically conceived racial designation—and “American”—one based on a putative citizenship status. Racial designation at that time was determined primarily through hypodescent, and the citizenship status of black folk was impugned by Plessy v. Ferguson (1896) and Jim Crow. But Du Bois’s conception did not reference skin color discriminations within black racial designation.
4. Du Boisian Double-Consciousness after Souls?
Commentators are agreed that while Du Bois names “double-consciousness” and uses the concept in his own way in that 1903 text, the term does not reappear in any of his subsequent texts. That does not mean he abandons the concept, of course, but most of the commentary on his employment of the concept focuses on the treatment of the issues it names in Souls. There have been some attempts to interpret various of his other works in terms of the conception, but these tend to focus on his fictional writings, and the use made of these is not primarily to develop the conception but rather to show its uses by Du Bois in other contexts. Throughout, the focus is always on the conception as it is presented in the “Strivings” text. This fact is due undoubtedly both to the canonical status of that 1903 text in African-American literature and social criticism—and in Africana philosophy—and to the fact noted above that the term “double-consciousness” is used there alone. More than one writer has asserted that the passage in which Du Bois presents the term is the most-referenced text in all African-American letters.
It seems problematic, however, to pin a full-blown account of and theoretical reconstruction on one passage in one work, however seminal or influential it may have been. So it may be useful to examine several later texts of Du Bois’s to see if the claim some commentators have made that Du Bois abandons the conception after 1903 can be substantiated or if it can be challenged and the conception given further legs. There are discussions in later texts that seem to involve aspects, at least, of the 1903 conception.
4.1 “The Souls of White Folks” in Darkwater (1920)
While Du Bois does not present the “double-consciousness” concept in so many words in Darkwater, published in 1920, the second chapter of that text, “The Souls of White Folks”, seems to involve something like the “second sight” of the “Strivings” text. In that chapter, Du Bois characterizes the development of what he calls “the religion of whiteness” and discusses its impact on social relations in the nineteenth and the early twentieth centuries. Du Bois seems to make a claim for a special kind of knowledge of the psychology of white people. He writes of himself that, about them, “I am singularly clairvoyant”. After specifying that his knowledge is not that of the foreigner, nor of the servant or the worker, he writes:
I see these souls undressed and from the back and sides. I see the working of their entrails. I know their thoughts and they know that I know. (Du Bois 1920: 17)
Du Bois here claims a “singular” insight into the psyches of white folk, one that depends in part on an awareness of the beliefs and attitudes of white folks of the kind that double-consciousness involves. But what Du Bois claims here also seems to go beyond the 1903 conception, since that conception did not specifically and explicitly refer to knowledge of the souls of white folks. Several pages into the “Souls of White Folks” chapter, after identifying the “discovery of personal whiteness” as an historically recent phenomenon associated with “this new religion of whiteness”, Du Bois indicates that it is black folk generally—“we”—who have such powers of “clairvoyance”:
We whose shame, humiliation and deep insult [the white man’s] aggrandizement so often involved were never deceived. We looked at him clearly, with world-old eyes, and saw simply a human being, weak and pitiable and cruel, even as we are and were. (1920: 20)
Here is a condition of consciousness that allows “the humiliated” to see more clearly the reality of the lives of those who humiliate them than the humiliators themselves can. This condition of consciousness is a kind of “clairvoyance”—a capacity for knowledge that escapes those who initiate the humiliation, who do not—and, perhaps, cannot—see themselves as clearly. While such knowledge does not involve “knowing the thoughts” of the humiliators in detail, it does require that one know some patterns of what and how they think and feel. Du Bois is here considering the ideology of white supremacy, tracing out the historical conditions of its development and some of the psychological consequences it has for whites who accept it and live in and on the basis of it. To the extent that whites accept the premises of white supremacy, and live and act upon them, they are deceived about themselves and act out a deception that the blacks who are subject to them are in a position to see through. This is not the core of double-consciousness, though it seems to be the sort of thing Du Bois had in mind when he referred in 1903 to “second sight”, a key adjunct to double-consciousness, in the “Strivings” passage. This interpretation is brought out in Henry, Gordon, and Kirkland as well.
But there is a bit more here, and other than, “second sight”. For what Du Bois presents in this chapter is a critical analysis of the American ideology of white supremacy that is informed by historical understanding and backed up by social-scientific data. Du Bois both begins and ends the chapter by noting his own position “high in the tower”. This refers both to his distanced, observer status relative to those who he is discussing, and to his own achieved position as an academically trained social scientist—indeed, one of the most highly trained minds in America at the time—bringing his powers of analysis to bear on the “souls of white folk”. Du Bois presents, if we take him at his word, a case of scientifically-informed, nuanced historical analysis built on a “clairvoyant” insight into the psyche of the white person “under the influence” of white supremacist ideology, one predicated on both the second sight and ideology-critique.
There is another passage later in Darkwater that bears, if somewhat indirectly, on the notion of double-consciousness:
Pessimism is cowardice. The man who cannot frankly acknowledge the “Jim-Crow” car as a fact and yet live and hope is simply afraid either of himself or of the world. There is not in the world a more disgraceful denial of brotherhood than the “Jim-Crow” car of the Southern United States; but, too, just as true, there is nothing more beautiful in the universe than sunset and moonlight on Montego Bay in far Jamaica. And both things are true and both belong to this our world, and neither can be denied. (1920: 135)
This passage is surely aimed against the debilitating effects of the facts of life for Black folk in the Jim-Crow south. In it Du Bois urges the reader’s resistance against the submersion of her cherished ideal—equality qua “brotherhood”—by those brute facts of life. And that is resistance to the pernicious double consciousness that would bury our intimate self-understanding under a dominant white supremacist rationalization of racial inequality. Such resistance involves an expanded, and expansive, conception of “this our world”, one that owns the world in all its manifold, stunning, and appalling complexity.
4.2 “On Being Ashamed of Oneself: An Essay on Race Pride” (1933)
Du Bois begins the essay, published in Crisis in September, 1933, with a story about his grandfather, who indignantly rejected an invitation to a “Negro” picnic:
[i]t meant close association with poverty, ignorance and suppressed and disadvantaged people, dirty and with bad manners. (Du Bois 1933: 199)
He then succinctly captures the whole dilemma of this Negro upper crust:
because the upper colored group is desperately afraid of being represented before American whites by this lower group, or being mistaken for them, or being treated as though they were part of it, they are pushed to the extreme of effort to avoid contact with the poorest classes of Negroes. This exaggerates, at once, the secret shame of being identified with such people and the anomaly of insisting that the physical characteristics of these folk which the upper class shares, are not the stigmata of degradation. (1933: 199)
Here Du Bois explicitly draws out the intra-racial implications and grounds of this aspect of double consciousness—what he identifies as “being ashamed” of members of one’s group, and, thus, “indirectly”, of oneself. He also reiterates a theme that was apparent from the very beginning of his thinking about double-consciousness—its close connection to divergent personal as well as political strategies for managing, and working to transform, the conditions giving rise to it. He identified these especially in the 1903 “Faith” text, where he speaks both of “double classes” and of “pretense or revolt”, “hypocrisy or radicalism”. In the 1920 text, Du Bois notes that such feelings of shame can motivate the strategy of “race suicide”—“the attempt to escape from ourselves”, as he describes assimilation. This attempt involves—and also is grounded in—“a drawing of class lines inside the Negro race” and “the emergence of a certain social aristocracy” defined by “looks”—by which Du Bois presumably means complexion—as well as education, income, cultivation, and aspiration.
But this class-based sense of shame is both impediment and adjunct of any strategy based on race pride and solidarity, as well, since such shame and embarrassment can present an obstacle to any concerted political action, which demands racial unity in common cause, and under the leadership of the “talented tenth” of race aristocrats, to be successful. While calling for efforts to “to build up a racial ethos”, Du Bois thus warns against too extreme a version of such “propaganda for race pride”, counseling Blacks to avoid reproducing what he describes as a “superiority complex among the white and the yellow race”.
4.3 Dusk of Dawn (1940)
There is a discussion of what appears to be more or less the same phenomena in Du Bois’s book Dusk of Dawn, published in 1940, two years after Du Bois turned seventy. Indeed, since Dusk of Dawn is more nearly autobiographical in design than Souls—its subtitle is An Essay Toward an Autobiography of a Race Concept—it’s not surprising that Du Bois writes more expansively there of the experience of living in conditions of segregation and white supremacy, even though he doesn’t use the term employed in Souls. But also, by this time, his conception of race itself has opened up even further beyond that of any linear historical development. As he writes at the end of the central chapter of that book, “The Concept of Race”,
It had as I have tried to show all kinds of illogical trends and irreconcilable tendencies. Perhaps it is wrong to speak of it at all as “a concept” rather than as a group of contradictory forces, facts, and tendencies. (1940: 133)
A number of things change in the account given by Du Bois in Dusk of Dawn of the phenomena that, in Souls, are brought under the sign of double-consciousness.
The first is that the Dusk of Dawn treatment of the issues is subsumed much more fully under a thematics of “environment”, articulated as social, geographical, and cultural in its dimensions and both dynamic and relatively stable in historical terms. Writing about “the facts of the Negro’s double environment”, Du Bois, characterizes the situation thus:
The Negro American has for his environment not only the white surrounding world, but also, and touching him usually much more nearly and compellingly, is the environment furnished by his own colored group. There are exceptions, of course, but this is the rule. The American Negro, therefore, is surrounded and conditioned by the concept which he has of white people and he is treated in accordance with the concept they have of him. On the other hand, so far as his own people are concerned, he is in direct contact with individuals and facts. He fits into this environment more or less willingly. It gives him a social world and mental peace. (1940: 173)
Here the white world is “surrounding” the world of the colored group with which the Negro individual is, as a rule, “in direct contact”. This double environment is the basic reality, overwhelmingly, of the Negro in the 1940 text. This way of putting it is prefigured in the “Faith” text of Souls, in which Du Bois writes of the “double life” of Black folk and of the “worlds within and without the Veil of Color”. What is only once formulated explicitly in Souls is given extensive treatment in Dusk of Dawn.
This characterization of the situation also suggests that, while the inhabitants of the “white world” and the “colored world” look at one other each through “the concept” they have of one another, individuals within the “colored world” know each other directly, being aware of “individuals and facts”. This is the impact of the veil, the color line. Writing of his own personal experience, Du Bois details the effect of this environing white world on him:
I was by long education and continual compulsion and daily reminder, a colored man in a white world; and that white world often existed primarily, so far as I was concerned, to see with sleepless vigilance that I was kept within bounds. All this made me limited in physical movement and provincial in thought and dream. I could not stir, I could not act, I could not live, without taking into careful daily account the reaction of my white environing world. (1940: 135–6)
Note here that in addition to the definite limitation of possibilities by this white world, there is also an active appropriation, and employment in strategic thinking by Du Bois, of the understanding he has of the white world. This suggests another mode in which double consciousness—that seems to be what we are dealing with here—can operate. If double consciousness can also take the form of practical consciousness, one of “taking into careful daily account” whites’ reactions—tinged as they are by prejudice, by expectations grounded in that prejudice—in one’s plans, one’s own expectations, that would not necessarily involve internalizing the prejudiced viewpoint itself, though it might surely engender considerable disturbance of the soul. Double consciousness would then be a practical, and affective, rather than a strictly cognitive, impact of the environing conditions on the Negro soul.
There is also, indeed, according to the Dusk of Dawn account, a further, more telling and insidious effect of the white world on the Negro soul, here exemplified by Du Bois:
… this fact of racial distinction based on color was the greatest thing in my life and absolutely determined it, because this surrounding group, in alliance and agreement with the white European world, was settled and determined upon the fact that I was and must be a thing apart. It was impossible to gainsay this. It was impossible for any time and to any distance to withdraw myself and look down upon these absurd assumptions with philosophical calm and humorous self-control. (1940: 136)
The “absurd assumptions” can and often do infiltrate the Negro’s psyche, and affect how she thinks and feels about herself in ways that stubbornly resist her own efforts to override or undermine them. (Or else, perhaps, more rarely, they elicit fierce and abiding anger, even rage.) Writing in a less autobiographical vein, Du Bois notes that despair of racial progress “too often” results from the Negro’s “lack of faith in essential Negro possibilities parallel to similar attitudes on the part of the whites”. This attitude itself is, he continues, “a natural phenomenon”, since Negroes share “average American culture and current American prejudices”. Because of this, it is
almost impossible for a Negro boy trained in a white Northern high school and a white college to come out with any high idea of his own people or any abiding faith in what they can do. (1940: 191)
This is Du Boisian double-consciousness as Gooding-Williams interprets it in Souls.
But the 1940 text never asserts a basic inner duality within the Negro: missing entirely from the Dusk of Dawn account is any mention of inward two-ness, of the psychic splitting that was so crucial to the account given in Souls. In the later work the issue is characterized in the terminology of “Negro self-criticism” (1940: 179), a “lack of faith in essential Negro possibilities” (1940: 191), and the “inner contradiction and frustration which [segregation and white racist intransigence] involves” (1940: 187)—a terminology that, while conveying the ambivalence and complexity of the treatment in the earlier text, falls far short of an assertion of an overriding psychic duality. And this is not because the text does not address the “felt experience” of being a Negro in America: a central, and the longest, chapter in Dusk of Dawn is devoted to “The Colored World Within”.
There are, “naturally”, problems with the unitary consciousness of a soul within the double environment Du Bois depicts, but these fall short of causing a split in the psyche itself. There is resentment, frustration, and anger verging on madness; there is a faithlessness, and, often, consequent despair; there are the temptations to turning one’s back on the folk, and also temptations to reject absolutely anything the “environing” white world offers or proposes. And there is what Du Bois calls
that bitter inner criticism of Negroes directed in upon themselves, which is widespread. It tends often to fierce, angry, contemptuous judgment of nearly all that Negroes do, say, and believe…. (1940: 179)
But what two-ness there is in the Dusk of Dawn account has been removed from the inwardness of souls, and is located instead in the “environing” world.
There are two more important ways in which the Dusk of Dawn account diverges from that of Souls. The first is that the brute facticity of what Du Bois calls the “inferiority” of the colored world is asserted in this text quite explicitly, and its effect upon the attitudes of Negroes described tellingly. Du Bois presents this stark reality as undeniable, while at the same time as contrasted to the claims made by racist prejudice concerning black folk, claims he takes the trouble to explicitly reject:
It is true, as I have argued, that Negroes are not inherently ugly nor congenitally stupid. They are not naturally criminal and their poverty and ignorance today have clear and well-known and remediable causes. All this is true: and yet what every colored man living today knows is that by practical present measurements Negroes today are inferior to whites. The white folk of the world are richer and more intelligent; they live better; have better government; have better legal systems; have built more impressive cities; larger systems of communication and they control a larger part of the earth than all the colored peoples together. (1940: 173–4)
By invoking this set of what he regards as indubitable facts, Du Bois is naming historically contingent yet palpably certain realities that, he claims, “every colored man living today knows”. Consequently, “Negro self-criticism” is, in part, grounded in “a perfectly obvious fact” (1940: 179), namely, “that most Negroes in the United States today occupy a low cultural status” and a “low social condition” (1940: 180), which he specifies by immediately discussing “Negro ignorance”, the death rate, “criminal tendencies”, poverty, and “social degradation”. These facts, it is worth emphasizing, are listed by Du Bois not as representations of white prejudice but as an essential acknowledgment of patent observable realities. Though their causes, both present and past, count against the prejudiced conclusions often drawn, the causes are less visible, so less obvious. But the facts on the ground cannot be denied.
Another important departure of the 1940 text from Souls is an explicit recognition in the latter text that the psychic phenomena attributed to Negro Americans are not distinctive; as Du Bois writes,
[s]imilar phenomena may be noticed always among undeveloped or suppressed peoples or groups undergoing extraordinary experience. None have more pitilessly castigated the Jews than the Jewish prophets, ancient and modern. (1940: 179)
He goes on to cite as further cases the Irish and the Germans of the Sturm und Drang period. This is part of a broader recognition by Du Bois, one that he gives expression to explicitly only subsequent to Souls, that “the imprisoning of a human group with chains in the hands of an environing group” was not “a singularly unusual characteristic of the Negro in the United States in the nineteenth century”, but that “the majority of mankind has struggled through this inner spiritual slavery…” (1940: 137).
Any account of double consciousness rooted in the sweep of Du Bois’s writings must acknowledge his taking it as both a state of consciousness of individual African-Americans as members of an oppressed group and also as a form of social recognition of an entire social situation in which that group finds itself. Such an account must, of course, confront the glaringly peculiar fact of the singular use of the term by Du Bois despite his revisiting in his writing, on various occasions in different contexts of publication, what seems to be an increasingly expansive repertoire of closely related phenomena.
Du Bois gives up the moniker “double-consciousness” for a variety of reasons, but at least in part because he wants to resist the impression that this is simply and only a problem of consciousness, unconnected with any palpable social facts. Also, as we have seen, the close association of at least some of the original senses of “double-consciousness”—as the term was used just before the turn of the twentieth century—with pathological psychic states, may well have given Du Bois pause after his initial use of the term. Part of what he wants to distance himself from is the idea—explicitly rejected in Dusk of Dawn—that collectivities can be treated as entities with their own consciousnesses, reified in what he seems to have regarded as mistaken idealist theoretical overreach. Finally, Du Bois seems to have opened up and expanded the range of phenomena related to double consciousness beyond the exemplar in the 1903 texts.
But Du Bois did not characterize the matter succinctly in one place so as to embrace both all its effects on consciousness and affect and its reality as an “environing” condition. Rather, he employs, alternately, two strategies of writing in trying to capture its fullness. He presents first- and third-personal accounts of “what it is like”, “spiritually”, to live in conditions of double consciousness, either through autobiographical writing or by personifying the feelings, attitudes, and thoughts associated with double consciousness in fictional or composite characters. And he also describes social environments along with the “customs” and “irrational”, “subconscious” attitudes and modes of being characteristic of social groups living in those environments.
Near the end of his life, in the posthumously published Autobiography, Du Bois revisited his original formulation of “two-ness”:
I began to feel that dichotomy which all my life has characterized my thought: how far can love for my oppressed race accord with love for the oppressing country? And when these loyalties diverge, where shall my soul find refuge? (1968: 169)
This passage relates the young Du Bois’s feelings on observing “the pageantry and patriotism of Germany in 1892”. It is plainly autobiographical rather than programmatic, as are the Souls texts. This formulation in no way suggests anything like a basic psychic split, but rather reflects an ambivalence, a conflict of affections and loyalties—but within an integral self.
All previous critical attention has been fixed steadily on the spiritual aspect of the phenomena of double consciousness, virtually none on the environing conditions Du Bois saw as giving rise to it. The environing conditions might be summed up as
a social and political regime grounded in the maintenance of rigid segregation in vastly unequal living conditions of social groups ideologically identified as racially distinct and unequal, creating a “double environment” particularly for members of the subordinate racial group.
The spiritual correlate of these environing conditions would include some combination of at least some of these sorts of emergent aspects:
- the adoption of a view of oneself premised on false, demeaning, or derogatory estimations of one’s capabilities, preferences, aptitudes and desires—estimations made primarily or exclusively due to one’s racial identity—and a consequent determination of a life course and practical orientation to one’s goals and to others based upon those estimations;
- a tendency to a confuse two distinct sets of attitudes, feelings, and beliefs about oneself and one’s disfavored racial group, to being “all mixed up” and/or in a state of double-mindedness, ambivalence, inner turmoil or indecision in relation to conflicting or opposed views and feelings about oneself and/or one’s social situation;
- an awareness of oneself as characterized by others in an unfavorable or demeaning way in keeping with disparaging descriptors associated with one’s racial identity;
- a reflective confrontation with a stable social situation characterized by consistent disparities in the life-prospects, achievements, social station, power, wealth, and cultural recognition typically available to members of one’s race relative to the dominant race;
- a consciousness of and feelings related to a tension associated with being taken for, or acting as, a member or representative of a devalued race to members of the dominant race, in either a cultural, social, or a political capacity;
- a practical attitude or orientation, for strategic purposes related to the pursuit of socially recognized goods or personal goals, involving the ascription to others of beliefs, intentions, expectations or reactions to one’s acts or words predicated on a falsely degrading, fearful, or dismissive judgment of who or what one is, on the basis of one’s race, and revision or adjustment of one’s plans on the basis of such ascriptions;
- a pervasive sense of uncertainty regarding the reception of oneself, one’s activities and projects under the weight of inappropriate, prejudicial, false and/or demeaning generalizations based on one’s race;
- the experience of a feeling or feelings of despair, rage, anger, frustration, distress, or any combination of these arising from and in keeping with recognition or awareness of any of the sorts of experiences listed above.
This list, while including the sense of “double-consciousness” as Du Bois develops the idea in Souls (particularly the first three items), also expands the sense of “double consciousness” to include more active, practical, and critical appropriations of the situation established by the color line.
Primary Literature: Works by W.E.B. Du Bois
These works cited in this article (listed chronologically by original publication date)
- 1897, “The Strivings of the Negro People”, The Atlantic Monthly, August: 194–197. [Du Bois 1897 available online]
- 1903, The Souls of Black Folk, Chicago: A.C. McClurg & Co., page numbers from the version edited by David W. Blight and Robert Gooding-Williams, Boston: Bedford Books, 1997.
- 1920, “The Souls of White Folks”, in Darkwater: Voices from Within the Veil, New York: Harcourt, Brace & Co., page numbers from the Dover Thrift Edition, 1999.
- 1933, “On Being Ashamed of Oneself: An Essay on Race Pride”, in Crisis, 40(9, Sept.): 199–200.
- 1940, Dusk of Dawn: An Essay Toward an Autobiography of a Race Concept, New York: Harcourt, Brace, & Co., page numbers from the Schocken Books edition, New York, 1968.
- 1968, The Autobiography of W.E.B. Du Bois: A Soliloquy on Viewing My Life from the Last Decade of Its First Century, H. Aptheker (ed.), New York: International Publishers.
- Adell, Sandra, 1994, Double-Consciousness/ Double Bind: Theoretical Issues in Twentieth-Century Black Literature, Urbana: Illinois University Press.
- Allen, Ernest Jr., 2002, “Du Boisian Double Consciousness: The Unsustainable Argument”, Massachusetts Review, 43(2, Summer): 217–253.
- Asante, Molefi Kete, 1993, “Racism, Consciousness, and Afrocentricity”, in Early 1993: 127–143 .
- Balfour, Lawrie, 1998, “ ‘A Most Disagreeable Mirror’: Race Consciousness as Double Consciousness”, Political Theory, 26(3): 346–369.
- Blow, Charles M., 2013, “Barack and Trayvon”, New York Times, July 19, 2013. [Blow 2013 available online].
- Breuer, Josef and Sigmund Freud, 1893, “On the Psychical Mechanism of Hysterical Phenomena”, Neurologisches Centralblatt, Nos. 1 and 2; reprinted as the first chapter of their Studien über Hysterie (Studies on Hysteria), 1895.
- Bruce, Dickson D., Jr., 1992 , “W.E.B. Du Bois and the Idea of Double Consciousness”, American Literature: A Journal of Literary History, Criticism, and Bibliography, 64(2): 299–309; page numbers as reprinted in The Souls of Black Folk (Norton Critical Edition), Henry Louis Gates, Jr. and Terri Hume Oliver (eds.), New York: W.W. Norton, 1999, pp. 236–244.
- Early, Gerald (ed.), 1993, Lure and Loathing: Essays on Race, Identity, and the Ambivalence of Assimilation, New York: Penguin Books.
- Emerson, Ralph Waldo, 1842, “The Transcedentalist”, A Lecture read at the Masonic Temple, Boston, January, 1842 printed in Nature; Addresses and Lectures, 1849, Boston and Cambridge: James Munroe and Company, pp. 316–348. [Emerson 1842 available online]
- Fanon, Frantz, 1967, Black Skin, White Masks (French original Peau noire, masques blancs, 1952), New York: Grove Press.
- Gates, Henry Louis Jr., 2006, “The Black Letters on the Sign: W E B Du Bois and the Canon”, Oxford University Press (this is the Series Editor’s introduction to the “Oxford W.E.B. Du Bois”, Oxford University Press’s uniform edition of the major works of Du Bois), page numbers from the version in Dusk of Dawn, Kwame Anthony Appiah (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2007, pp. xi–xxiv.
- Gilroy, Paul, 1993, The Black Atlantic: Modernity and Double Consciousness, Harvard: Harvard University Press.
- Gooding-Williams, Robert, 2009, In the Shadow of Du Bois: Afro-Modern Political Thought in America, Harvard University Press.
- Gordon, Lewis, 2008, Introduction to Africana Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Henry, Paget, 2000, Caliban’s Reason: Introducing Afro-Caribbean Philosophy, (Africana Thought), New York: Routledge.
- –––, 2005, “Africana Phenomenology: Its Philosophical Implications”, C.L.R. James Journal, 11(1): 79–112.
- Hine, Darlene Clark, 1993, “‘In the Kingdom of Culture’: Black Women and the Intersection of Race, Gender, and Class”, in Early 1993: 337–351.
- James, William, 1890, Principles of Psychology, New York: Henry Holt and Company.
- Kirkland, Frank M., 2013, “On Du Bois’s Notion of Double Consciousness”, Philosophy Compass, 8(2): 137–148.
- Lewis, David Levering, 2000, “Du Bois and Garvey: Two ‘Pan-Africas’”, in W.E.B. Du Bois, Vol. II, The Fight for Equality and the American Century, 1919-1963, New York: Henry Holt and Company, esp. pp 63-84.
- Mitchill, [Samuel Latham], 1817, “A double consciousness, or a duality of person in the same individual: from a communication of Dr. Mitchill to the Reverend Dr. Nott, President of Union College, dated January 16, 1816”, The Medical Repository, (New York, new series), 3: 185–186. [Mitchill 1817 available online]
- Morrison, Toni, 2012, [ quoted in Leve, A.,] “Toni Morrison on Love, Loss, and Modernity”, The Telegraph [UK], 17 July, 2012. [Morrison 2012 available online]
- Reed, Adolph, Jr., 1997, W.E.B. Du Bois and American Political Thought: Fabianism and the Color Line, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Strachey, James, 1996, “Editor’s Introduction”, in Breuer, Josef and Sigmund Freud, Studies on Hysteria, James Strachey (trans. and ed.), New York: Basic Books, pp. ix–xxviii.
- West, Cornel, 1982, Prophecy Deliverance! An Afro-American Revolutionary Christianity, Philadelphia, PA: The Westminster Press.
- Williamson, Joel, 1978, “W.E.B. Du Bois as a Hegelian”, in David G. Sansing (ed.), What Was Freedom’s Price, Jackson, MS: University Press of Mississippi, pp. 21–50.
- Zack, Naomi, 1993, Race and Mixed-Race, Philadelphia, PA: Temple University Press.
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Thanks to Tommie Shelby, who commissioned this article, discussed it with me, and steadily, patiently encouraged its production. Thanks also to Martha Bragin. Early versions of this essay were presented to a meeting of the Society for the Study of Africana Philosophy in New York City, and at the ‘Diverse Lineages of Existentialism’ conference in St. Louis, both in 2014; and at a meeting of SOFPHIA in Amherst in 2015, at which Cory Aragon gave helpful commentary. The essay has benefitted from discussion in all those venues. Thanks finally to the hardworking librarians at Lloyd Sealy Library, John Jay College, CUNY, and those at the Research Division, New York Public Library, whose help facilitated this research.