Doctrine of Double Effect
The doctrine (or principle) of double effect is often invoked to explain the permissibility of an action that causes a serious harm, such as the death of a human being, as a side effect of promoting some good end. According to the principle of double effect, sometimes it is permissible to cause a harm as a side effect (or “double effect”) of bringing about a good result even though it would not be permissible to cause such a harm as a means to bringing about the same good end.
- 1. Formulations of the principle of double effect
- 2. Applications
- 3. Misinterpretations
- 4. Criticisms
- 5. One principle or many loosely related exceptions?
- 6. End of Life Decision-making
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1. Formulations of the principle of double effect
Thomas Aquinas is credited with introducing the principle of double effect in his discussion of the permissibility of self-defense in the Summa Theologica (II-II, Qu. 64, Art.7). Killing one’s assailant is justified, he argues, provided one does not intend to kill him. In contrast, Augustine had earlier maintained that killing in self-defense was not permissible, arguing that “private self-defense can only proceed from some degree of inordinate self-love.” Aquinas observes that “Nothing hinders one act from having two effects, only one of which is intended, while the other is beside the intention. … Accordingly, the act of self-defense may have two effects: one, the saving of one’s life; the other, the slaying of the aggressor.” As Aquinas’s discussion continues, a justification is provided that rests on characterizing the defensive action as a means to a goal that is justified: “Therefore, this act, since one’s intention is to save one’s own life, is not unlawful, seeing that it is natural to everything to keep itself in being as far as possible.” However, Aquinas observes, the permissibility of self-defense is not unconditional: “And yet, though proceeding from a good intention, an act may be rendered unlawful if it be out of proportion to the end. Wherefore, if a man in self-defense uses more than necessary violence, it will be unlawful, whereas, if he repel force with moderation, his defense will be lawful.”
The passage can be interpreted as formulating a prohibition on apportioning one’s efforts with killing as the goal guiding one’s actions, which would lead one to act with greater viciousness than pursuing the goal of self-defense would require.
Later versions of the double effect principle all emphasize the distinction between causing a morally grave harm as a side effect of pursuing a good end and causing a morally grave harm as a means of pursuing a good end. We can summarize this by noting that for certain categories of morally grave actions, for example, causing the death of a human being, the principle of double effect combines a special permission for incidentally causing death for the sake of a good end (when it occurs as a side effect of one’s pursuit of that end) with a general prohibition on instrumentally causing death for the sake of a good end (when it occurs as part of one’s means to pursue that end). The prohibition is absolute in traditional Catholic applications of the principle. Two traditional formulations appear below.
The New Catholic Encyclopedia provides four conditions for the application of the principle of double effect:
- The act itself must be morally good or at least indifferent.
- The agent may not positively will the bad effect but may permit it. If he could attain the good effect without the bad effect he should do so. The bad effect is sometimes said to be indirectly voluntary.
- The good effect must flow from the action at least as immediately (in the order of causality, though not necessarily in the order of time) as the bad effect. In other words the good effect must be produced directly by the action, not by the bad effect. Otherwise the agent would be using a bad means to a good end, which is never allowed.
- The good effect must be sufficiently desirable to compensate for the allowing of the bad effect“ (p. 1021).
The conditions provided by Joseph Mangan include the explicit requirement that the bad effect not be intended:
A person may licitly perform an action that he foresees will produce a good effect and a bad effect provided that four conditions are verified at one and the same time:
- that the action in itself from its very object be good or at least indifferent;
- that the good effect and not the evil effect be intended;
- that the good effect be not produced by means of the evil effect;
- that there be a proportionately grave reason for permitting the evil effect” (1949, p. 43).
In both of these accounts, the fourth condition, the proportionality condition is usually understood to involve determining if the extent of the harm is adequately offset by the magnitude of the proposed benefit.
It is reasonable to assume that agents who regret causing harm will be disposed to avoid causing the harm or to minimize how much of it they cause. This assumption could be made explicit as an additional condition on permissibly causing unintended harm:
- 5. that agents strive to minimize the foreseen harm.
Michael Walzer (1977) has convincingly argued that agents who cause harm as a foreseen side effect of promoting a good end must be willing to accept additional risk or to forego some benefit in order to minimize how much harm they cause. Whether this kind of condition is satisfied may depend on the agent’s current circumstances and the options that exist.
Double effect might also be part of a secular and non-absolutist view according to which a justification adequate for causing a certain harm as a side effect might not be adequate for causing that harm as a means to the same good end under the same circumstances. Warren Quinn provides such an account while also recasting double effect as a distinction between direct and indirect agency. On his view, double effect “distinguishes between agency in which harm comes to some victims, at least in part, from the agent’s deliberately involving them in something in order to further his purpose precisely by way of their being so involved (agency in which they figure as intentional objects), and harmful agency in which either nothing is in that way intended for the victims or what is so intended does not contribute to their harm” (1989, p. 343). Quinn explains that “direct agency requires neither that harm itself be useful nor that what is useful be causally connected in some especially close way with the harm it helps bring about” (1989, p. 344). He remarks that “some cases of harming that the doctrine intuitively speaks against are arguably not cases of intentional harming, precisely because neither the harm itself (nor anything itself causally very close to it) is intended” (1991, p. 511). On this view, the distinction between direct and indirect harmful agency is what underlies the moral significance of the distinction between intended and merely foreseen harms, but it need not align perfectly with it.
Many morally reflective people have been persuaded that something along the lines of double effect must be correct. No doubt this is because at least some of the examples cited as illustrations of DE have considerable intuitive appeal:
- The terror bomber aims to bring about civilian deaths in order to weaken the resolve of the enemy: when his bombs kill civilians this is a consequence that he intends. The tactical bomber aims at military targets while foreseeing that bombing such targets will cause civilian deaths. When his bombs kill civilians this is a foreseen but unintended consequence of his actions. Even if it is equally certain that the two bombers will cause the same number of civilian deaths, terror bombing is impermissible while tactical bombing is permissible.
- A doctor who intends to hasten the death of a terminally ill patient by injecting a large dose of morphine would act impermissibly because he intends to bring about the patient’s death. However, a doctor who intended to relieve the patient’s pain with that same dose and merely foresaw the hastening of the patient’s death would act permissibly. (The mistaken assumption that the use of opioid drugs for pain relief tends to hasten death is discussed below in section 6.)
- A doctor who believed that abortion was wrong, even in order to save the mother’s life, might nevertheless consistently believe that it would be permissible to perform a hysterectomy on a pregnant woman with cancer. In carrying out the hysterectomy, the doctor would aim to save the woman’s life while merely foreseeing the death of the fetus. Performing an abortion, by contrast, would involve intending to kill the fetus as a means to saving the mother.
- To kill a person whom you know to be plotting to kill you would be impermissible because it would be a case of intentional killing; however, to strike in self-defense against an aggressor is permissible, even if one foresees that the blow by which one defends oneself will be fatal.
- It would be wrong to throw someone into the path of a runaway trolley in order to stop it and keep it from hitting five people on the track ahead; that would involve intending harm to the one as a means of saving the five. But it would be permissible to divert a runaway trolley onto a track holding one and away from a track holding five: in that case one foresees the death of the one as a side effect of saving the five but one does not intend it.
- Sacrificing one’s own life in order to save the lives of others can be distinguished from suicide by characterizing the agent’s intention: a soldier who throws himself on a live grenade intends to shield others from its blast and merely foresees his own death; by contrast, a person who commits suicide intends to bring his or her own life to an end.
Does the principle of double effect play the important explanatory role that has been claimed for it? To consider this question, one must be careful to clarify just what the principle is supposed to explain. Three misinterpretations of the principle’s force or range of application are common.
First, it is a misinterpretation to claim that the principle of double effect shows that agents may permissibly bring about harmful effects provided that they are merely foreseen side effects of promoting a good end. Applications of double effect always presuppose that some kind of proportionality condition has been satisfied. Traditional formulations of the proportionality condition require that the value of promoting the good end outweigh the disvalue of the harmful side effect.
For example, a physician’s justification for administering drugs to relieve a patient’s pain while foreseeing the hastening of death as a side effect does not depend only on the fact that the physician does not intend to hasten death. After all, physicians are not permitted to relieve the pain of kidney stones or childbirth with potentially lethal doses of opiates simply because they foresee but do not intend the causing of death as a side effect! A variety of substantive medical and ethical judgments provide the justificatory context: the patient is terminally ill, there is an urgent need to relieve pain and suffering, death is imminent, and the patient or the patient’s proxy consents. Note that this last constraint, the consent of the patient or the patient’s proxy, is not naturally classified as a concern with proportionality, understood as the weighing of harms and benefits.
We have added a fifth condition on causing unintended harm: that the agent seek to minimize the harm involved. This ensures that Double Effect is not misunderstood as principle issuing a blanket permission on causing any unintended harm that yields a benefit. Whether this fifth condition is satisfied will depend on the agent’s circumstances and the options that exist. For example, as techniques for managing pain, for titrating the doses of pain-relieving medication, and for delivering analgesic medication have been refined, what might in the past have been an adequate justification for hastening death in the course of pain relief would now fail because current techniques provide the better alternative of managing pain without the risk of hastening death. (See section 6 for a full discussion of this application of double effect.)
A second misinterpretation is fostered by applications of double effect that contrast the permissibility of causing a harm as a merely foreseen side effect of pursuing a good end with the impermissibility of aiming at the same kind of harm as one’s end. Since it is widely accepted that it is wrong to aim to produce harm to someone as an end, to rule this out is not part of double effect’s distinctive content. The principle presupposes that agents do not aim to cause morally grave harms as an end and seeks to guide decisions about causing harm while pursuing a morally good end. For example, double effect contrasts those who would (allegedly permissibly) provide medication to terminally ill patients in order to alleviate suffering with the side effect of hastening death with those who would (allegedly impermissibly) provide medication to terminally ill patients in order to hasten death in order to alleviate suffering. In the allegedly impermissible case, the physician’s ultimate end is a good one — to alleviate suffering — not to cause death.
The principle of double effect is directed at well-intentioned agents who ask whether they may cause a serious harm in order to bring about a good end of overriding moral importance when it is impossible to bring about the good end without the harm. A third common misinterpretation of double effect is to assume that the principle assures agents that they may do this provided that their ultimate aim is a good one that is ordinarily worth pursuing, the proportionality condition is satisfied and the harm is not only regretted but minimized. That is not sufficient: it must also be true that causing the harm is not so implicated as part of an agent’s means to this good end that it must count as something that is instrumentally intended to bring about the good end. Some discussions of double effect wrongly assume that it permits acts that cause certain kinds of harm because those harms were not the agent’s ultimate aim or were regretted rather than welcomed. The principle of double effect is much more specific than that. Harms that were produced regretfully and only for the sake of producing a good end may be prohibited by double effect because they were brought about as part of the agent’s means to realizing the good end.
Those who defend the principle of double effect often assume that their opponents deny that an agent’s intentions, motives, and attitudes are important factors in determining the permissibility of a course of action. If the permissibility of an action depended only on the consequences of the action, or only on the foreseen or foreseeable consequences of the action, then the distinction that grounds the principle of double effect would not have the moral significance claimed for it (see the related entry on consequentialism). Some opponents of the principle of double effect do indeed deny that the distinction between intended and merely foreseen consequences has any moral significance.
Nevertheless, many criticisms of the principle of double effect do not proceed from consequentialist assumptions or skepticism about the distinction between intended and merely foreseen consequences. Instead they ask whether the principle adequately codifies the moral intuitions at play in the cases that have been taken to be illustrations of it. One important line of criticism has focused on the difficulty of distinguishing between grave harms that are regretfully intended as part of the agent’s means and grave harms that are regretfully foreseen as side effects of the agent’s means. Since double effect implies that the latter may be permissible even when the former are not, those who wish to apply double effect must provide principled grounds for drawing this distinction. The application of Double Effect to explain the permissibility of performing a hysterectomy on a pregnant woman and the impermissibility of performing an abortion to save a woman’s life is often singled out for criticism on this score. Lawrence Masek (2010) offers a thoughtful defense of the principle of double effect that proposes to construe what is intended by an agent as narrowly or strictly as possible while also distinguishing between motivating side effects and non-motivating side effects.
In contrast, Warren Quinn’s proposal to substitute the concept of direct agency for the concept of intending to cause harm to someone as a means (see Section 1) would effectively broaden the category of results that count as cases of causing intended harm. If the soldier who throws himself on the grenade in order to shield his fellow soldiers from the force of an explosion acts permissibly, and if the permissibility of his action is explained by Double Effect, then he must not intend to sacrifice his own life in order to save the others, he must merely foresee that his life will end as a side effect of his action. But many have argued that this is an implausible description of the soldier’s action and that his action is permissible even if he does intend to let himself be blown up by the grenade as a means of protecting the others from the explosion. Shelly Kagan (1999) points out that if someone else were to shove the soldier on the grenade we would certainly say that that the harm to the soldier was intended by the person who did the shoving. Equally, Kagan argues, we should say that it is intended in this case (p. 145). The same kind of argument can be made for cases of killing in self-defense when overwhelming and lethal force is used. If these arguments are correct, then they cast doubt on the claim that Double Effect explains the permissibility of these actions. Double Effect is silent about cases in which it is permissible to cause a death as a means to a good end.
Warren Quinn has argued that double effect does not rest on the distinction between intended and merely foreseen harm, but instead is best formulated using a distinction between direct and indirect agency (see the Formulations section). Quinn’s view would imply that typical cases of self-defense and self-sacrifice would count as cases of direct agency. One clearly intends to involve the aggressor or oneself in something that furthers one’s purpose precisely by way of his being so involved. Therefore, Quinn’s account of the moral significance of the distinction between direct and indirect agency could not be invoked to explain why it might be permissible to kill in self-defense or to sacrifice one’s own life to save the lives of others. But perhaps this is as it should be: double effect might be easier to explain and justify if the range of cases to which it applies is limited in this way. If Quinn’s view is correct, and if the distinction between direct and indirect agency can be drawn clearly, then perhaps the objections outlined above can be answered.
If we are more inclined to call a harmful result a merely foreseen side effect when we believe that it is permissibly brought about, and if we are more inclined to describe a harmful result something that was intended as part of the agent’s means when we believe that it is impermissibly brought about, then there will be an association between permissible harms that are classified as side effects and impermissibly caused harms that are classified as results brought about intentionally, as part of the agent’s means, but this association cannot be explained by the principle of double effect. Instead, independently grounded moral considerations have influenced how we draw the distinction between means and side effects in the first place. Empirical research by Joshua Knobe (2003, 2006) has demonstrated that the ways in which we distinguish between results that are intended or brought about intentionally and those that are mere side effects may be influenced by normative judgments in such a way as to bias our descriptions. This was first pointed out by Gilbert Harman (1976), but is now often referred to as “The Knobe Effect” or “The Side Effect Effect”. Richard Holton (2010) has observed that norm violation merely involves knowingly violating a norm, while complying with a norm involves an intention to comply with it, and that this might explain the asymmetry Knobe has documented in judgments about whether bad and good results are brought about intentionally. This discussion raises questions about the suitability of the distinction highlighted by the principle of double effect for serving as an evaluatively neutral basis for moral judgments.
Does the principle of double effect explain the permissibility of switching a runaway trolley away from a track with five people on it and onto a track containing only one person? This is an alleged application of Double Effect in which it seems clear to many people that if one were to switch the trolley, the harm to the one person would not be intended as part of one’s means of diverting the trolley from the five. Of course, if the harm to the one is rightly described as a merely foreseen side effect of switching the trolley, then this alone does not show that it is permissible to cause it. However, if the proportionality condition is satisfied, and if the agent attempts to minimize the harm or to identify alternative means of saving the five and fails, then these factors together might seem to imply that the principle of double effect can be invoked to explain the permissibility of switching the trolley. Moreover, Double Effect seems to explain the impermissibility of pushing someone onto the track in front of the speeding trolley in order to stop it and protect the five on the track ahead. In both scenarios, a person would be killed as part of saving the five; the difference in permissibility seems to depend on whether the death of that person is a means or a side effect of saving them.
Discussions of the Trolley Problem and the relevance of the principle of double effect to explaining our intuitions about it can be divided into three groups. First, there are consequentialists who view the widespread reluctance people feel to push someone in the path of the trolley in order to stop it and save the five as irrational (Joshua Greene, 2013). Second, there are those who take the paired intuitions in the Trolley Problem as proof of the fundamental role of Double Effect as an implicit principle guiding moral judgment (Philippa Foot, 1985), John Mikhail, 2011). Third, some argue that it would be wrong for a bystander to switch the trolley (Judith Jarvis Thomson, 2008) and suggest that people’s willingness to view it as permissible is a result of inadequate reflection or insufficient emotional engagement. This group would include those who uphold the principle of double effect but deny that it provides a permission to swerve the trolley (Elizabeth Anscombe, 1982) and those who reject the principle of double effect while conceding that the standard intuitive judgments about the Trolley Problem comport with the principle as it ordinarily interpreted.
The contrast between the Terror Bomber and the Strategic Bomber is often viewed as the least controversial pair of examples illustrating the distinction between intention and foresight that underlies the principle of double effect. The judgment that the Terror Bomber acts impermissibly and the Strategic Bomber acts permissibly is widely affirmed. Terror bombing was engaged in by both sides in World War II (see Douglas Lackey (1989) for a thoughtful historical account of the decision process engaged in by Allied decision-makers and the controversy it generated at the time). The view that terror bombing is always impermissible would condemn the kind of incendiary bombing carried out by Allied forces in Germany and Japan.
The common judgment that strategic bombing is permissible provided that it is proportionate also deserves more scrutiny than it usually receives when it is taken to be justified by the principle of double effect. How much of an obligation do military strategists have to avoid harm to civilian populations? This is a substantive issue about the conventions that constrain military decision-making and the principles that underlie these conventions. Many relevant considerations depend on judgments that are far outside the ambit of Double Effect. For example, the Rules of Customary International Humanitarian Law displayed on the website of the International Committee of the Red Cross prohibit attacks targeting civilians. They also include protections denied to minimize harm to civilians:
Rule 15. Precautions in Attack In the conduct of military operations, constant care must be taken to spare the civilian population, civilians and civilian objects. All feasible precautions must be taken to avoid, and in any event to minimize, incidental loss of civilian life, injury to civilians and damage to civilian objects.
Rule 20. Advance Warning Each party to the conflict must give effective advance warning of attacks which may affect the civilian population, unless circumstances do not permit.
Rule 24. Removal of Civilians and Civilian Objects from the Vicinity of Military Objectives Each party to the conflict must, to the extent feasible, remove civilian persons and objects under its control from the vicinity of military objectives.
These considerations suggest that the principle of double effect does not contain, even when the principle of proportionality is included as part of its content, a sufficient condition of permissibility for bombardment that affects civilian populations. The example concerning strategic bombing so frequently invoked by philosophers never mentions a duty to warn or remove civilians.
5. One principle or many loosely related exceptions?
It is not at all clear that all of the examples that double effect has been invoked to justify can be explained by a single principle. There may in fact be a variety of considerations that bear on the permissibility of causing unintended harm.
Proponents of the principle of double effect have always acknowledged that a proportionality condition must be satisfied when double effect is applied, but this condition typically requires only that the good effect outweigh the foreseen bad effect or that there be sufficient reason for causing the bad effect. Some critics of the principle of double effect have maintained that when double effect has been invoked, substantive independent justifications for causing the kind of harm in question are implicitly relied upon, and are in fact, doing all of the justificatory work. These independent considerations are not derived from the distinction between intended and merely foreseen consequences and do not depend on it (Davis (1984), McIntyre (2001)). If this criticism is correct, then perhaps the cases that have traditionally been cited as applications of the principle of double effect are united only by the fact that each is an exception to the general prohibition on causing the death of a human being.
The historical origins of the principle of double effect as a tenet of Catholic casuistry might provide a similar explanation for the unity of its applications. If one were to assume that it is absolutely prohibited to cause the death of a human being, then it would not be permissible to kill an aggressor in self-defense, to sacrifice one’s life to protect others, to hasten death as a side effect of administering sedation for intractable pain, or to endanger non-combatants in warfare. If one were to assume instead that what is absolutely prohibited is to cause the death of a human being intentionally, then these cases can be viewed as cases of non-intentional killing. Controversy about the principle of double effect concerns whether a unified justification for these cases of non-intentional killing can be provided and if so, whether that justification depends on the distinction between intended and merely foreseen consequences.
In an essay that develops Warren Quinn’s view that Double Effect is best understood as resting on a distinction between direct and indirect agency, Dana Nelkin and Samuel Rickless (2014) formulate the principle in this way: “In cases in which harm must come to some in order to achieve a good (and is the least costly of possible harms necessary), the agent foresees the harm, and all other things are equal, a stronger case is needed to justify harmful direct agency than to justify equally harmful indirect agency” (2014). In harmful indirect agency, harm comes to some victims in order to achieve a good, but “nothing in that way is intended for the victims, or what is so intended does not contribute to their harm.” In harmful direct agency “harm comes to some victims, at least in part, from the agent’s deliberately involving them in something in order to further his purpose precisely by way of their being so involved” (Nelkin and Rickless (2014), quoting Quinn (1989)).
This way of characterizing harmful direct agency and harmful indirect agency could be thought of as two possible dimensions of agency in which harm is not intended, rather than as a contrast within a single dimension of agency. This view would be supported if it turns out that some complex plans of action count as both harmful direct agency and harmful indirect agency. For example, consider the deliberations of public health officials who propose to put in place a vaccination program in their region in order to protect citizens from a rapidly spreading, highly contagious, and invariably lethal disease. They foresee that if the program is carried out, about one in ten thousand vaccine recipients will experience adverse effects from the vaccine that will prove fatal, and the officials have no way to identify in advance which vaccine recipients will be susceptible to these adverse effects in order to screen them and exclude them from receiving the vaccine. It might seem that Double Effect is designed to explain why they may proceed with the vaccination program despite these foreseeable, regretted, and unpreventable unintended side effects of promoting a good end: this might seem to be a case of indirect agency. And yet, if the officials’ desire to bring about herd immunity leads them to advocate a widespread program with incentives for participation or even mandatory participation, then it will be true that harm comes to some victims that they have deliberately involved. This would make their actions in promoting the program a case of direct agency. Issues about consent may be relevant here as well: if the vaccine recipients willingly assume the risk of experiencing adverse effects, then a full description of the program must consider their own agency in assessing the information they receive. Examples like these suggest that the cases Double Effect has been taken to apply to may involve many different dimensions of agency rather than a sharp contrast that concerns a single dimension of agency.
Critics of the principle of double effect claim that the pattern of justification used in these cases has some shared conditions: the agent acts in order to promote a good end, shows adequate respect for the value of human life in so acting, and has attempted to avoid or minimize the harm in question. However, they maintain that the justification for causing the harm in question depends on further substantive considerations that are not derived from the contrast between intention and foresight or the contrast between direct and indirect agency.
Some have developed this kind of criticism by arguing that the appeal of the principle of double effect is, fundamentally, illusory: an agent’s intentions are not relevant to the permissibility of an action in the way that the proponents of the principle of double effect would claim, though an agent’s intentions are relevant to moral assessments of the way in which the agent deliberated (see David McCarthy (2002) and T.M. Scanlon (2008). That an agent intended to bring about a certain harm does not explain why the action was impermissible, but it can explain what is morally faulty about the agent’s reasoning in pursuing that line of action.
6. End of Life Decision-Making
The principle of double effect is often mentioned in discussions of what is known as palliative care, medical care for patients with terminal illness in need of pain relief. Three assumptions often operate in the background of these discussions:
- The side effect of hastening death is an inevitable or at least likely result of the administration of opioid drugs in order to relieve pain.
- The hastening of death is a not unwelcome side effect of providing pain relief in the context of palliative care.
- It would be impermissible to hasten death intentionally in order to cut short the suffering of a terminally ill patient.
When these assumptions are made, double effect seems to provide at least part of a justification for administering drugs to relieve pain.
Yet the first assumption is false. Physicians and researchers have insisted repeatedly that it is a myth that opioids administered for pain relief can be expected to hasten death (Sykes and Thorns, 2003 provide a review of a large number of studies supporting this claim). There is no research that substantiates the claim that opioid drugs administered appropriately and carefully titrated are likely to depress respiration. In a survey of research bearing on this issue, Susan Anderson Fohr (1998) concludes: “It is important to emphasize that there is no debate among specialists in palliative care and pain control on this issue. There is a broad consensus that when used appropriately, respiratory depression from opioid analgesics is a rarely occurring side effect. The belief that palliative care hastens death is counter to the experience of physicians with the most experience in this area.” The mistaken belief that pain relief will have the side effect of hastening death may have the unfortunate effect of leading physicians, patients, and the patients’ families to under-treat pain because they are apprehensive about causing this alleged side effect.
The appropriate conclusion, then, is that double effect plays no role whatsoever in justifying the use of opioid drugs for pain relief in the context of palliative care. Why is double effect so frequently mentioned in discussions of pain relief in the context of palliative care if its application rests on (and thereby perpetuates) a medical myth? The popularity and intuitive appeal of this alleged illustration of double effect may have two sources. First, the point of mentioning the permissible hastening of death as a merely foreseen side effect may be to contrast it with what is deemed morally impermissible: administering drugs that are not pain relievers to a patient with a terminal illness in order to hasten death and thereby cut short the patient’s suffering. Second, the myth that pain relief hastens death might have persisted and perpetuated itself because it expresses the compassionate thought behind the second assumption: that the hastening of death may be a welcome side effect of administering pain relief to patients at the end of life. This point of view may not be consistent with invoking Double Effect as a justification: if, in the course of treating a dying patient, death is not viewed as a harm, then Double Effect does not apply (see Allmark, Cobb, Liddle, and Todd (2010)).
Furthermore, the apparently compassionate assumption that the hastening of death is a welcome result may be unduly paternalistic in the context of end of life care in which the patient is not dying. Patients receiving palliative care whose pain can be adequately treated with opioid drugs may well value additional days, hours or minutes of life. It is unjustified to assume that the hastening of death is itself a form of merciful relief for patients with terminal illnesses and not a regrettable side effect to be minimized. Recall that the most plausible formulations of double effect would require agents to seek to minimize or avoid the merely foreseen harms that they cause as side effects. On this point, popular understandings of double effect, with the second assumption in place, may diverge from the most defensible version of the principle.
Some members of the U.S. Supreme Court invoked double effect as a justification for the administration of pain-relieving drugs to patients receiving palliative care and also as a justification for the practice known as terminal sedation in which sedative drugs are administered to patients with intractable and untreatable pain in order to induce unconsciousness (Vacco et al. v. Quill et al., 117 S.Ct. 2293 (1997)). If artificial hydration and nutrition are not provided, sedation undertaken to deal with intractable pain may well hasten death. (If death is immediately imminent, then the absence of hydration and nutrition may not affect the time of death.) The most plausible and defensible version of the principle of double effect requires that the harmful side effect be minimized, so the principle of double effect provides no justification for withholding hydration and nutrition in cases in which death is not immediately imminent. The decision to withhold hydration and nutrition seems to depend on a judgment that death would not be a harm to the patient who has been sedated. In circumstances in which it would not be a harm to cause a person’s death, the principle of double effect does not apply.
Terminal or full sedation is a response to intractable pain in patients suffering from terminal illness. It involves bringing about a set of conditions (sedation, unconsciousness, the absence of hydration and nutrition) that together might have the effect of hastening death if death is not already imminent. In any case, these conditions make death inevitable. Two important moral issues arise concerning this practice. First, is terminal sedation appropriate if it is necessary to relieve intractable pain in patients diagnosed with a terminal illness, even if death is not imminent? This is what Cellarius (2008) calls early terminal sedation because it does not satisfy the requirement that death is imminent that is typically cited as a condition of the permissibility of terminal sedation. Early terminal sedation could be expected to hasten death as a side effect of providing palliative care for unusually recalcitrant pain. A second issue concerns the moral significance of the fact that once sedation has occurred, death is inevitable either because it was imminent already or because the withholding of nutrition and hydration has made it inevitable. Would it be permissible to increase the level of sedation foreseeing that this would hasten the death that is now inevitable? Traditional applications of the principle of double effect rest on the assumption that the death of an innocent human being may never be brought about intentionally and would rule against such an action. Yet the assumptions that inform the popular understanding of double effect — that the physician’s guiding intention is to relieve pain, that the hastening of death would not be unwelcome in these very specific circumstances, and that this course of action should be distinguished from a case of active euthanasia that is not prompted by the duty to relieve pain — might seem to count in favor of it. It may obscure rather than clarify discussion of these situations to view the principle of double effect as a clear guideline. In this discussion, as in many others, the principle of double effect may serve more as a framework for announcing moral constraints on decisions that involve causing death regretfully than as a way of determining the precise content of those decisions and the judgments that justify them.
- Allmark, Peter; Cobb, Mark; Liddle, Jane B.; and Tod, Angela M., 2010. “Is the doctrine of double effect irrelevant in end-of-life decision making?” Nursing Philosophy, 11: 170–7.
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Other Internet Resources
- List of References for the Principle of Double Effect [PDF], maintained by Jörg Schroth.
- Whether it is lawful to kill a man in self-defense?, St. Thomas Aquinas, Summa Theologica, Second Part of the Second Part, Question 64, Article 7.
- Just War Theory, Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
- The Rules of Customary International Humanitarian Law, International Committee of the Red Cross.
- U.S. Supreme Court decision Vacco v. Quill, concerning the challenge to laws prohibiting assisted suicide posed by Quill, et al., Legal Information Institute, Supreme Court Collection.
- The International Association for Hospice and Palliative Care.