Dutch Book Arguments

First published Wed Jun 15, 2011; substantive revision Sat May 14, 2022

The Dutch Book argument (DBA) for probabilism (namely the view that an agent’s degrees of belief should satisfy the axioms of probability) traces to Ramsey’s work in “Truth and Probability”. He mentioned only in passing that an agent who violates the probability axioms would be vulnerable to having a book made against him and this has led to considerable debate and confusion both about exactly what Ramsey intended to show and about if, and how, a cogent version of the argument can be given. The basic idea behind the argument has also been applied in defense of a variety of principles, some of which place additional constraints on an agent’s current beliefs, with others, such as Conditionalization, purporting to govern how degrees of belief should evolve over time.

1. The Basic Dutch Book Argument for Probabilism

1.1 The Probability Axioms and the Dutch Book Theorem

The conclusion of the basic DBA is that the degrees of belief, or credences, that an agent attaches to the members of a set \(X\) of propositions, or sometimes statements or sentences, should satisfy the axioms of probability. The basic axioms of probability are generally taken as requiring that for \(A \in X\),

\(0 \le \pr(A)\) [Non-Negativity];
if \(A\) is a tautology, then \(\pr(A) = 1\) [Normalization];
if \(A\) and \(B\) are incompatible, then \(\pr(A\vee B) = \pr(A) + \pr(B)\) [Finite Additivity].

Condition 2, which requires only that the truths of propositional logic are given the value one, is sometimes replaced with

if \(A\) is a logical truth, then \(\pr(A) =1\),

or even

if \(A\) is a necessary truth, then \(\pr(A) =1\).

The distinctions between these formulations of the axioms are connected with the objects that probabilities are appropriately attached to and on the reasonableness of the argument’s conclusion; but, for the immediate purpose of outlining the basic argument, the differences are not crucial.

The DBA itself begins with the so-called Dutch Book theorem, which concerns the conditions under which a set of bets guarantees a net loss to one side, or a Dutch Book. With de Finetti, it is here assumed that a bet on a proposition \(H\) is an arrangement that has the following canonical form:

\(H\) Payoff
True \(S - qS\)
False \(-qS\)

The table gives the net payoff to an agent who buys a bet with stake \(S\) for the price \(qS\), where \(S\) is won if \(H\) is true. \(S\) is called the stake, as it is the total amount involved in the wager, that is the payoff in the case that \(H\) is true together with the amount forfeited if \(H\) is false. The quantity \(q\) is called the betting quotient, which is the amount lost if \(H\) is false divided by the stake. The Dutch Book theorem can now be stated:

Given a set of betting quotients that fails to satisfy the probability axioms, there is a set of bets with those quotients that guarantees a net loss to one side.

It is easy to show how it is possible to make book against someone with betting quotients that violate the probability axioms. Let \(Q(H)\) be the agent’s betting quotient for \(H\). Assuming that the agent’s betting quotients violate the axioms, a bookie can guarantee himself a profit by placing bets with the agent as described below. For simplicity the stake is set here at $1, but the following recipes for constructing a book against such a person are easily adapted for other stakes.

Axiom 1: Suppose that \(Q(H) \lt 0\). In this case, the bookie buys the bet that pays $1 if \(H\) is true and 0 otherwise, for the negative price \(Q(H)\), which means that the agent collects \(Q(H)\), and pays out $1 if \(H\) is true, and $0 otherwise. Here the agent is betting against \(H\) and the payoff table for the agent is as follows:

\(H\) Payoff
T \(-[1 - Q(H)]\)
F \(Q(H)\)

Since \(Q(H)\) is negative, the agent will suffer a net loss regardless of the truth-value of \(H\).

Axiom 2: Suppose that an agent’s betting quotient for a tautology (or a logical or necessary truth) \(H\) is not equal to 1. If \(Q(H) \gt 1\) the bookie sells the bet that pays $1 if \(H\) is true and 0 otherwise, for \(Q(H)\). In the case where \(Q(H) \lt 1\), the bookie will buy the bet in which the agent pays the bookie $1 if \(H\) is true and nothing if \(H\) is false, for \(Q(H)\). In this case, the payoff table for the agent will again be as above for axiom 1. Notice that since \(H\) is a tautology (or logical or necessary truth) it must be true, which means that at the conclusion of the bet, the agent will have lost [\(1-Q(H)\)].

Axiom 3 (Additivity): Assume that \(H_{1}\) and \(H_{2}\) are mutually exclusive and that \(Q(H_{1}\vee H_{2}) \ne Q(H_{1}) + Q(H_{2})\). There are two cases,

\[\begin{align} Q(H_1\vee H_2) &\gt Q(H_1) + Q(H_2), \text{ and} \\ Q(H_1\vee H_2) &\lt Q(H_1) + Q(H_2). \end{align}\]

If \(Q(H_{1}\vee H_{2}) \lt Q(H_{1}) + Q(H_{2})\), then the bookie will offer the agent the bet that pays $1 if \(H_{1}\) and 0 otherwise for \(Q(H_{1})\) and the bet that pays $1 if \(H_{2}\) is true and 0 otherwise for \(Q(H_{2})\). The bookie then buys the bet that will pay him $1, if \((H_{1}\vee H_{2})\) is true and 0 otherwise, for the price of \(Q(H_{1}\vee H_{2})\). The possible payoffs to the agent are summed up in the following table:

\(H_{1}\) \(H_{2}\) Net Payoff
T F [\(1 - Q(H_{1}) - Q(H_{2}) + Q(H_{1}\vee H_{2}) - 1\)]
F T [\(1 - Q(H_{1}) - Q(H_{2}) + Q(H_{1}\vee H_{2}) - 1\)]
F F [\(-Q(H_{1}) - Q(H_{2}) + Q(H_{1}\vee H_{2})\)]

Since \(Q(H_{1}\vee H_{2}) \lt Q(H_{1}) + Q(H_{2})\), the agent loses in each case and thus the collection of bets assures a loss. If \(Q(H_{1}\vee H_{2}) \gt Q(H_{1}) + Q(H_{2})\), then the bookie simply reverses the direction of the bets.

Letting \(V(H)\) be the payoff if \(H\) is true, the expected value of a bet on \(H\) is expressed by the equation:

\[ \text{Exp}(H) = V(H)Q(H) + V(-H)(1-Q(H)). \]

Thus, for each axiom, the individual bets involved in making the book are fair, which is to say they have an expected value of zero, when calculated using the agent’s betting quotients, yet collectively they will produce a sure loss. The Dutch Book argument assumes that an agent’s degrees of belief are linked with her betting quotients. This, together with the Dutch Book theorem, is used to establish that degrees of belief that violate the probability axioms are associated with bets that are fair in the above sense, yet are also tied to a sure loss. The argument then concludes that agents ought to obey the axioms. This leaves open just what the association amounts to and what sort of problem the prospect of such sure loss is supposed to be.

1.2 A Detailed Version of the Dutch Book Argument

The Dutch Book argument has often been presented as establishing that degrees of belief that violate the axioms are irrational because they can (or do) lead to bad consequences. It assumes that an agent’s degrees of belief are associated with her betting quotients such that (1) for an agent with degree of belief \(q\) in \(M\) a bet on or against \(M\) at corresponding odds will be acceptable. With payoffs in dollars and stake \(S\), this amounts to the claim that the agent should be willing to take either direction of a bet with a cost of $\(Sq\) that pays

\($S\) if \(M\)
\($0\) otherwise

But then (2) by the Dutch Book theorem a cunning bettor could assure himself a profit from someone who violates the probability axioms. Since (3) violating the axioms leaves the bettor open to being Dutch Booked (that is, being on the losing side of the Dutch Book) because her degrees of belief make acceptable bets leading to a sure loss, it is concluded that (4) one ought to satisfy the probability axioms (i.e. that probabilism is true). In some presentations, the first premise is strengthened to the claim that the agent actually will accept those bets on \(M\) for which her degree of belief matches the betting quotient, in an effort to tighten the connection between violating the axioms and the sure loss.

A bit of terminology is in need of clarification here. De Finetti identified degrees of belief with betting quotients and termed degrees of belief that are susceptible to a Dutch Book incoherent; those that are not so susceptible he called coherent (de Finetti 1937). ‘Susceptible’ here should be understood in the sense of the above theorem, namely that bets are specifiable corresponding to those degrees of belief that will produce a sure loss to one side. Given the theorem, coherence amounts to satisfaction of the probability axioms, with incoherence involving their violation, and accordingly the terms are often used as a shorthand way of specifying whether the axioms are satisfied. However, both Ramsey and de Finetti understood incoherence to be a kind of inconsistency, and some use the term in this sense. There are various questions about understanding violation of the probability axioms and susceptibility to a Dutch Book as a kind of inconsistency, as will be discussed, and so here it will be best to use ‘incoherent’ for degrees of belief that violate the probability axioms, and that by the Dutch Book theorem are associated with susceptibility to a sure loss, and leave open whether incoherence understood as such involves a form of inconsistency.

1.3 The Converse Dutch Book Theorem

There is reason to accept the conclusion of the DBA that one ought to satisfy the probability axioms so as to avoid a Dutch Book only insofar as satisfying the axioms affords at least the possibility of avoiding exposure to a sure loss (Hájek 2005; 2008a,b). Here, the Converse Dutch Book theorem, proven independently by Lehman (1955) and Kemeny (1955), plays an important role. Roughly stated the result is that

For a set of betting quotients that obeys the probability axioms, there is no set of bets (with those quotients) that guarantees a sure loss (win) to one side.

It assures that the agent would not be exploitable in any event, and thus establishes an advantage to obeying the axioms. Notice that the theorem states that having betting quotients adhering to the axioms assures that one will not be susceptible to a sure loss, rather than making just the minimal claim required to establish an advantage to coherence that such vulnerability may be avoided.

Both the Dutch Book theorem and its converse are sensitive to the formulation of the axioms, as well as to the understanding of ‘bet’, ‘sure loss’ and what it means for such a loss to be guaranteed. Special care must be taken with the characterization of the probability axioms when it comes to the Converse Dutch Book theorem. Given that the axioms are formulated such that the second axiom only requires that tautologies receive probability one, it is possible to satisfy the axioms, yet still be open to a sure loss. Consider the claim that if \(b\) has \(F\) then something has \(F\). This is not tautological, but betting against it would leave one vulnerable to a sure loss. Sometimes the second axiom is instead formulated as requiring that all logical truths receive probability one, but satisfying this constraint leaves open the possibility of a sure loss by betting against a necessary truth such as ‘nothing is both red and green all over’. Even with strengthening the second axiom to require that all necessary truths receive probability one, there is still a reading upon which the Converse Dutch Book theorem is false, since an agent will be vulnerable to a sure loss if she attaches a probability less than one to a known truth (or a probability greater than zero to a known falsehood). One response to this is to restrict ‘sure loss’ to those losses that do not depend on contingent facts. Instead the restriction could be made to losses that are ‘sure’ in the sense that there is a mechanical formula for inflicting the loss, thus removing the sort of counterexample to the Converse Dutch Book theorem with which we began, and the need to strengthen the axioms. A related move involves restricting the allowable bets, rather than limiting what counts as a sure loss.

In observing that the Dutch Book theorem and the DBA are sensitive to the formulation of the probability axioms, it should be noted that whereas classical logic is generally presumed, probability axioms can be formulated, with suitable adjustments, for non-classical logics. Weatherson argues that this is appropriate in representations of rational belief, and formulates axioms of probability that are built upon an intuitionistic logic, for which he then gives a Dutch Book argument (Weatherson 2003).

It is clear that in order for the Dutch Book theorem to hold, ‘sure loss’ must be taken to mean loss if the bets are in fact placed and settled. Violation of the probability axioms under any of their formulations does not guarantee an actual loss. Still more must be said here about the meaning of ‘sure loss’, which suggests some sort of necessity but does not tell us whether this is supposed to be a particular form of logical necessity, metaphysical necessity, or perhaps some other relative necessity. If ‘sure loss’ were taken as foreseeable loss, then an agent could violate the axioms by attaching positive probability to a necessary falsehood, where there is no foreseeable loss given the current state of knowledge concerning the proposition in question. There is also an issue concerning whether it is the agent who must be able to foresee the loss. If ‘sure’ means decidable, then neither the formulation that logical nor that necessary truths receive probability one will do, since there is no decision procedure for determining in general whether a given sentence is a logical truth, let alone a necessary one. Clearly, there is a delicate balance that must be struck between the formulation of the probability axioms, and the understanding of ‘bets’ and ‘sure loss’ for the Dutch Book theorem and its converse to hold.

There is a further issue with the Converse Dutch Book theorem, because there are books that can be made against agents who violate other probabilistic norms, such as Reflection, countable additivity and others (see sections 3, 4, and 5). Satisfaction of the basic axioms is no guarantee that one will not be open to a book due to violation of some other norm. A correct formulation of the theorem must accordingly restrict the form and number of the allowable bets. Kemeny and Lehman put restrictions on the allowable bets (for example their betting systems are restricted to a finite number of bets), and these seem to rule out such counterexamples. However, it remains to be shown that avoiding book with such a restricted set of bets suffices to justify adherence to the axioms. The problem here becomes especially pressing with the observation, discussed in the following section, that incoherent agents need not be generally vulnerable to a sure loss, and thus that both coherent and incoherent agents alike may be subject to some books and not others. What is needed in arguing for adherence to the probability axioms is the further claim that the bets which lead to sure losses and that are associated with incoherence pose a special problem, although this threatens the use that many proponents of the DBA have wanted to make of Dutch Book arguments in defending other norms.

A related problem concerns the assumption made in the version of the DBA presented in section 1.2 that agents will accept, or at least find acceptable, those ‘fair bets’ on or against \(P\) where their degree of belief matches the betting quotient for the bet. As discussed in the next section, it is not true that all such bets will be accepted, or even be regarded as acceptable, and additional bets may be accepted (or found acceptable). For various reasons someone might accept bets in cases where her credences do not correspond to the betting quotients of those bets, including where the bets constitute a Dutch Book. Thus, we need to be concerned more generally with the array of bets that agents will accept (or find acceptable). But since this widens the class of bets that can be used to produce a book, if anything it makes the problem for the DBA that a coherent agent may be subject to a Dutch Book even worse. The version of the DBA in section 1.2 could be modified with the claim that agents accept (or find acceptable) only bets that are fair or favorable, that is those with a non-negative expected value as calculated using their degrees of belief. This rules out some additional bets that would produce a Dutch Book for a coherent agent, but not those that enter into the DBAs for other norms. However, this assumption does not hold generally, and fails to address other issues confronting the argument.

1.4 Can it be Rational to Violate the Probability Axioms?

As noted above, the sure loss guaranteed by the Dutch Book theorem need not amount to an actual loss. Indeed a bookie could reverse the direction of the bets that would guarantee a loss for an incoherent agent so as to guarantee her a win, or there could be some sort of other prize that might be awarded for being incoherent. An incoherent agent might not be confronted by a clever bookie who could, or would, take advantage of her, perhaps because she can take effective measures to avoid such folk. Even if so confronted, the agent can always prevent a sure loss by simply refusing to bet. It won’t do to respond to such a possibility by insisting on the stronger assumption that an agent will always take bets where the expected value of each is non-negative, because this simply gives the argument a false premise. In any case, it is clear that the trouble with being incoherent cannot be that it will lead to losses. Rather, the idea behind the version of the argument in section 1.2 should be taken to be that incoherence opens one up to sure losses, in a way that having coherent beliefs does not (given an appropriate version of the Converse Dutch Book theorem), and that such potential vulnerability demands adherence to the axioms.

We may question whether either the conclusion that one ought to satisfy the axioms or that incoherence is irrational follows from simply being open to a sure loss. If the threat of such a loss is seen as unlikely, say, if the agent thinks she won’t face a clever bookie, has confidence that her charms will prevent her from ending up on the losing side of a Dutch Book, or just thinks she won’t take bets leading to a Dutch Book if they are offered, then it is hard to see why the mere potential of a sure loss should demand coherence. Another problem here is the special status accorded to sure losses. In fact the potential sure loss is symmetric with a possible sure gain. As Hájek emphasizes, there is a corresponding “Czech Book Argument”, which parallels the DBA, with the conclusion that one ought to violate the probability calculus (Hájek 2005, 2008a). Construed as above, the DBA appears to be canceled out by the “Czech Book Argument”, although Hájek shows that the potential canceling out can be avoided by reformulating the DBA with the assumption that the agent should accept bets that are either fair or favorable (Hájek 2008a). Still, it is compatible with the Dutch Book theorem that an incoherent agent could end up on the side of a sure gain, and so incoherence cannot be condemned as irrational simply by citing the possibility of sure losses.

Although the threat of a sure loss may be remote, and an agent could face a sure gain, there are some situations in which incoherence is more closely tied to actual losses. Some versions of the DBA appeal to such scenarios as a preliminary to attempting to establish the general irrationality of being incoherent. One tactic has been to argue that incoherence is irrational in so-called forced betting situations, and then that the prohibition against being incoherent in such situations can be universalized (Jackson and Pargetter 1976). In a forced betting situation the agent is required to post betting quotients, and then to place bets with those quotients, where the stake and direction of the bets are dictated by an opponent. Assuming that the only source of value is the money (valued linearly) involved in the wagers, it is claimed that it is irrational to be incoherent in such a situation. But this doesn’t follow if the irrationality is taken as arising from actual losses that would result. Even in a forced betting scenario, there may be reasons to suppose that incoherent betting quotients will not be taken advantage of, as may occur if making book would require knowledge of some very complicated logical truth (Kennedy and Chihara 1979). Here too, the direction of the bets could be chosen so that an incoherent agent will have a sure gain. This would be an odd forced betting situation, but if the agent had reason to believe that this would occur, it could actually be advisable for her to post incoherent odds.

One might begin instead with a competitive betting situation, in which it is given that both sides attempt to maximize their gain. Here there is a closer connection between incoherence and loss, since the bookie will be trying to maximize his profit, and so a sure gain for an incoherent agent could only be the result of a mistake. If it is assumed that the agent is also forced to bet and that the bookie will act optimally, the agent should post coherent odds, for otherwise she will be subject to a bankrupting Dutch Book. Of course if the competitive situation is one in which the agent can refuse to bet, having incoherent betting quotients need not leave her open to an actual loss.

Even in those forced betting situations and competitive betting situations in which it is irrational to post incoherent betting quotients, it still need not be irrational to have incoherent degrees of belief (Kennedy and Chihara 1979; Adams and Rosenkrantz 1980). For example, if the agent must post odds on what she knows to be either a logical truth or a logical falsehood in a forced betting situation, she may be better off with a betting quotient of either 1 or 0, rather than some intermediate value, for she is susceptible to a Dutch Book in the latter event, but she could end up with the objectively correct value in the former case and thus would avoid a loss. But it seems that she can have reasons for an intermediate level of confidence, making such an evaluation more rational, at least in the sense of reflecting her available evidence, than an extreme one. Alternatively the agent may simply have no idea whatsoever about the logical status of what is in fact a logical truth upon which she must post odds, in which case a confidence of .5, or perhaps remaining entirely agnostic by not adopting any particular level of confidence, seems more reasonable than her being fully confident despite her ignorance.

At the least, such examples raise questions about the connection that the DBA presupposes between partial beliefs and favorable/unfavorable betting odds. In the case where an agent must give her betting quotient for what is in fact a logical truth, any value less than one leaves her vulnerable to a sure loss, possibly a bankrupting one, yet in such cases not all such credences are rationally on a par. The issue here seems to be more than simply one about how well the underlying theory of action and belief works for extreme values, but also about the relevant conception of rational belief. Rational action-guiding credences should generally reflect the agent’s evidence, yet at least in the cases above, probabilism seems sometimes to require that they do not. One may question whether the appropriate or intended sense of ‘rational’ is invoked in these cases in which it seems right to say that rational beliefs can come apart from betting quotients, but such objections just highlight the lack of clarity in most presentations of the argument over what sort of rationality is supposed to be at stake. It has been said, for instance, that it is ideal rationality that demands adherence to the axioms, but this notion too is unclear. What can be said though is that there are cases in which degrees of belief do satisfy an important ideal of rationality but where they seem to come apart from betting quotients, and this puts additional pressure on the premise that agents should be willing to accept bets where their degrees of belief match the betting quotient.

Neither a forced nor a competitive betting situation per se guarantees that incoherence will result in actual losses, and even in the special cases in which it would bring them about, it appears that having incoherent degrees of belief need not be irrational. Indeed, whereas degrees of belief may generally be thought of as guides to action, and as well-modeled by betting quotients in many cases, forced and competitive betting situations in fact reinforce the point that they are not always straightforwardly linked. Thus, arguments for the claim that incoherence is generally irrational that begin with the claim that it is irrational in forced betting situations fail to get off the ground, let alone show that it is irrational outside of such situations, where the connection between incoherence and the possibility of losses is even more tenuous. Still, forced and competitive betting situations are helpful in identifying rational constraints under idealized conditions, and can serve as useful models of action in some situations. Under highly circumscribed conditions, where the agent’s goals are limited, they show that it is prudent to post coherent betting quotients. It is a bad feature of incoherent betting quotients, whether or not they correspond to such degrees of belief, that in a forced betting situation they provide the opportunity for a clever bookie to inflict a sure loss, and guarantee it in competitive ones with a utility-maximizing opponent. But, the special conditions that make it rational to have coherent betting quotients, so as to avoid a sure loss, are not met in general. In some circumstances, a small sure loss can be better than the chance of a greater loss. Additionally, where there is something of value that is linked to a wager besides the stake, it can also be rational to act so as to bring about a sure loss on a bet.

Aside from the reasons given above for the fact that it can be rational to leave oneself open to, or act so as to guarantee, a sure loss, situations in which the value of a bet is not fully represented by its monetary payoff conditions present challenges for versions of the DBA that take the problem with incoherence as stemming from the threat of losing money. An agent may not wish to risk losing money on a large bet, due to additional bad consequences that would or might ensue, or the agent may suffer anxiety over the prospect of loss. De Finetti and others insist on limiting the stakes in an effort to get around this problem, but Ramsey already observed that one might have a “reluctance to bother with trifles”, which is to say that there is a negative value to placing bets with little potential gain. Perhaps there is some range for which the stakes are neither too high nor too low, such that the monetary payoffs may be taken as at least a reasonable approximation of the value of the bets, but this further limits the situations in which a sure loss may be inflicted.

It is standardly assumed, as in the version of the DBA given in section 1.2, that an agent will be willing to buy or sell a bet on \(S\) for which her credence matches the betting quotient. But in practice, buying a bet may have a different value for an agent than selling that bet, because there is typically a lag between the time that a bet is placed and when it is settled, as Rowbottom (2007) points out. Selling a bet involves collecting a sum up front and potentially paying out latter, which often has greater value than paying the same price up front and with the potential payoff obtained later. This asymmetry between the value of buying and selling bets also constrains the situations in which a Dutch Book can be made.

Another problem involving the value of bets arises in establishing the additivity axiom, for even if each in a set of bets is acceptable, it does not follow that they would be jointly acceptable. Consider a person with 4 dollars, who needs 2 dollars for bus fare. He might be willing to take either one of two wagers that cost 2 dollars for a chance at winning enough money to buy a newspaper to read on the ride, but be unwilling to risk all 4 dollars, and the possibility of having to walk home. One response here is to insist that the bets should be presented in terms of utilities rather than money, although this raises difficulties of its own, since these are not objective commodities. Such an approach involves assuming either directly or indirectly that such utilities are additive, but even this is not enough. While it may plausibly be argued that given a set of credences and utilities, pragmatic rationality requires maximizing expected value with respect to those credences and utilities, so that an agent with incoherent degrees of belief is committed to accepting bets (paying off in utility) that lead to a sure loss, the problem for the DBA remains that being so committed to a sure loss is still not necessarily irrational. See (Maher 1993).

It is clear that the version of the DBA presented in section 1.2 is far from cogent. There is a gap between the agent’s degrees of belief and the acceptance of bets that would produce a sure loss, and the possibility of such a loss need not entail irrationality. One can specify situations in which the connections are tighter, but this fails to establish the general claim of probabilism.

2. The Dutch Book Argument and Probabilistic Consistency

2.1 The Dutch Book Argument as Revealing Inconsistency

A popular response to the objections to the DBA considered in section one suggests that incoherence is not a pragmatic defect per se, and that the Dutch Book is merely a dramatic device for illustrating a kind of logical defect. Skyrms (1987) attributes this reading of the DBA to Ramsey, finding support in his remarks that

Any definite set of degrees of belief which broke them [the laws of probability] would be inconsistent in the sense that it violated the laws of preference between options…If anyone’s mental condition violated these laws, his choice would depend on the precise form in which the options were offered him, which would be absurd. He could have a book made against him by a cunning bettor and would stand to lose in any event. (Ramsey 1926, p. 41)

Additional support for this interpretation can be found in Ramsey’s assertion that the subject of his paper is the logic of partial belief.

Many authors, including Armendt (1993), Christensen (1996, 2004), Hellman (1997), Howson and Urbach (1993), and more recently, Briggs (2009) and Mahtani (2015), have endorsed and elaborated upon the idea that violation of the probability axioms amounts to a kind of inconsistency. For example, Armendt (1993) tells us that it involves an inconsistency that is revealed by the fact that degrees of belief guide action, and that Dutch Book vulnerability amounts to giving conflicting evaluations to the same option(s). He calls this “divided-mind” inconsistency, which he says is a flaw of rationality. This fits the typical sort of case where an agent violates additivity, and sometimes applies to violations of the other axioms, but incoherence does not always entail having two different evaluations of the same option. Although degrees of belief often serve as guides to action, they need not be tied to an evaluation of options at all. However, it is a fundamental assumption of most versions of the DBA that credences do have such a role, as in the theories of Ramsey and de Finetti, so it is of interest that even with this assumption, incoherence need not involve giving conflicting evaluations (Vineberg 2001). Consider for instance a person who is less than fully confident of Fermat’s Last Theorem, perhaps because they don’t know that it has been proven. On at least some ways of understanding propositions, this need not entail attaching two different judgments to the same proposition. One could also violate coherence by only attaching a probability of less than one to a single proposition that is a logical truth, or one could avoid different evaluations by having the same level of confidence in every proposition. These examples aside, even the additivity axiom is problematic on Armendt’s interpretation, for it requires, for mutually exclusive propositions \(p\) and \(q\), that joint bets on \(p\) and on \(q\) amount to the same option as a bet on \(p\) or \(q\). This in turn presumes that values are additive, which goes beyond simply having degrees of confidence in \(p, q\), and their disjunction, although Armendt (1993) suggests that the assumption is generally met and appropriate for the purposes of the DBA.

In “Truth and Probability”, Ramsey assumes that, at least under idealized conditions, degrees of belief manifest themselves in preferences for options. This allows Ramsey to characterize the inconsistency involved in violating the probability axioms in terms of violating the axioms of rational preference. While he never claims that degrees of belief are necessarily linked to preferences, the model of belief and preference that he offers assumes such an association, and indeed a great achievement of the paper is what amounts to a representation theorem establishing that an agent satisfying the axioms that he specifies for rational preference can be represented as having degrees of belief that satisfy the probability axioms. In the model he offers, degrees of belief serve as guides to action through their connection with preferences, so that therein at least incoherence does manifest itself in preference inconsistency. But the way that Ramsey casts the inconsistency involved in violating the axioms in terms of preference inconsistency leaves it unclear that his goal of characterizing the logic of partial belief has been satisfactorily met. One trouble is that it does not show us that the preference inconsistency to which incoherent beliefs are tied is appropriately analogous to inconsistency for simple (or full) belief, which involves believing inconsistent propositions, i.e. a set of propositions that cannot all be true. Another worry is that in Ramsey’s model degrees of belief are linked with preferences, and it seems that having a degree of belief does not by its nature require any such connection with preference and action. One can surely have finely graded beliefs in propositions without those beliefs being connected to preferences. Moreover, consistency for full belief derives from the concept of belief as holding propositions to be true and from the logic of propositions, without any such assumed tie to action, and although Ramsey thought that such a connection was necessary to clarify the idea of partial belief, it seems that a fully analogous characterization of consistency for partial belief should do without it.

2.2 Depragmatized Arguments

Several philosophers have sought to establish coherence as a consistency constraint on degrees of belief through a version of the DBA that does not presuppose any definite connection between degrees of belief and preference (Christensen 1996, 2004; Howson and Urbach 1993; Hellman 1997). These so-called depragmatized arguments purport to improve upon Ramsey’s treatment by making clear how coherence is supposed to mirror the ordinary notion of consistency. Howson and Urbach attempt this by identifying an agent’s degree of belief in \(M\) with the bets she regards as fair, such that for credence \(q\) in \(M\), a bet with cost $\(Sq\) that pays

\($S\) if \(M\)
\($0\) otherwise

is taken as fair. They then employ the Dutch Book theorem to argue that incoherent degrees of belief cannot in fact be fair betting quotients, and thus that incoherence involves taking a set of bets as fair that cannot be fair, which is supposed to parallel having inconsistent beliefs.

There are several problems that undermine Howson and Urbach’s approach. The most basic is that an agent with degree of belief \(q\) in \(M\) need not regard bets of the above form as fair for a variety of reasons. To begin with she may simply lack the concept of a fair bet. Secondly, she could have credence \(q\), yet acknowledge the bet above as explicitly unfair. For instance, if she knows \(M\) to be either a logical truth or a logical falsehood, but has no idea which, her confidence that it is true could be ½, though she may well know that this would not be a fair betting quotient for it. Casting credences in terms of the bets that are regarded as fair is also problematic in that it appears to associate degrees of belief with having certain full beliefs, which some take to be problematic. The argument also clearly falters over the additivity axiom, since even if an agent regards each of a set of bets as individually fair, they may not be collectively fair by her lights, so she need not evaluate the bets required to produce a book as fair bets. Here, and in the basic assumption about the individual bets that an agent finds fair, it is in effect assumed that money acts as a measure of value. Not only is this not generally true, it calls attention to the fact that the argument has not really been depragmatized. While Howson and Urbach do not rely on either the assumption that agents will (or should) act in accordance with their degrees of belief or that they should be willing to accept either direction of a fair bet, they do assume that agents make evaluations of bets, which are tied to the concept of pragmatic value. Maher (1997) argues that their way of spelling out fairness in terms of a primitive concept of advantage, so as to avoid the notions of preference and utility, fails. Indeed, it is hard to see that the latter notions can be avoided in explicating the concept of fairness, upon which their argument depends.

A similar argument is offered by Christensen (1996), except that his depragmatized DBA further weakens the connection between degrees of belief and bets. Where Howson and Urbach specify that an agent will regard a bet as fair, Christensen assumes only that the bet is sanctioned as fair or justified by the agent’s beliefs, thus avoiding the first objection to Howson and Urbach’s treatment. He then invokes the Dutch Book theorem to argue that incoherent degrees of belief sanction as fair a set of bets that cannot be fair, and claims this reveals that incoherence is fundamentally an epistemic, and indeed a logical, defect. But his argument clearly faces the previous difficulty over the additivity axiom since, even if two bets are sanctioned individually, it does not follow that they are sanctioned jointly. In response to this problem, Christensen (2004) modified his argument by restricting the assumption about the sanctioning of bets to “simple agents” who value only money, value it linearly, etc., so that monetary payoffs function as utilities for them. He then argued that degrees of belief that violate the probability axioms in a simple agent are rationally defective because they sanction bets that would be guaranteed to lose money. From this he claimed that since it is the incoherent beliefs themselves that have been shown to be defective, such beliefs are rationally defective in all agents.

Here again, the pragmatic dimension of the argument seems to have been merely submerged. Degrees of belief do not sanction bets in isolation from preference, and so the alleged defect in the simple agent who violates the probability axioms cannot be pinned merely on those beliefs. Since it is not the simple agent’s beliefs themselves that have been shown to be defective, but rather those beliefs in combination with her preferences, the inference that incoherent degrees of belief are rationally defective in all agents is invalid. For all that has been shown, such beliefs might be fine in combination with a different preference structure. Not only is it premature to conclude that incoherence is rationally defective generally, Christensen has not argued convincingly that incoherence is rationally or logically defective even in simple agents. It could be rational for a simple agent to be incoherent if she were surrounded by “Czech bookies”, who will offer bets so that she is on the winning, rather than the losing, side of the book, because in this situation incoherence will lead to satisfaction of her one goal as a simple agent of increasing her monetary gain. Of course it is incoherence as a logical defect, rather than one of means/ends rationality, that is Christensen’s focus, but since sanctioning bets as fair that cannot be fair is not a property of incoherent credences alone, he has not shown incoherence to be on a par with inconsistency with full belief, where the defect lies with the beliefs themselves.

2.3 Coherence as a Pragmatic Consistency Constraint

The depragmatized DBAs attempt to use the Dutch Book theorem to show that incoherent degrees of belief involve a kind of inconsistency on their own, irrespective of the way in which they link up with particular preferences. But the claim of inconsistency here requires that credences be tied to evaluations of fairness, which in turn invokes a concept of valuation that goes beyond merely having degrees of belief. If an agent’s degrees of belief are incoherent, and he makes evaluations of bets using the standard expectation rule, then there will be bets (with payoffs in some measure of utility) such that calculated individually these will have expected value zero, and will in this sense be fair by his lights, but which lead to a net loss, and so may be said to be unfair. The unfairness can be deduced from the agent’s beliefs and their connection with the agent’s utilities, which establishes the defect brought out by the Dutch Book as internal to the agent, marking a crucial difference between the loss so inflicted and the sort requiring superior factual knowledge on the part of the bookie. While the linkage between the agent’s credences and his evaluation of bets is crucial to this result, the needed connection is independent of the agent’s particular preference for goods, and so it could be said that the failure to correspond to fair betting quotients is a property of the agent’s beliefs, as tied to evaluations of acts, yielding the result that incoherent credences, appropriately connected with preference, display a property that is analogous to inconsistency for full belief.

There is then a version of the DBA that seems close to what Ramsey had in mind, which claims that insofar as degrees of belief link up suitably with preferences, incoherence is associated with a property mirroring inconsistency, although this still need not amount to divided-mind inconsistency in Armendt’s sense, nor is it entirely akin to inconsistency for full beliefs, which are characterized directly without any assumed connection to preference and action. The agent by whose lights each of a set of bets looks fair (or favorable), that is, should be evaluated as fair (or favorable) although they lead collectively to a Dutch Book, which can be set up by examining simply the agent’s credences, has a system of evaluation that is self-defeating, and as such may be said to exhibit a form of irrationality. On this reading, the vulnerability associated with incoherence is theoretical, and linked closely with the agent’s utilities, which means that actual vulnerability depends not only upon an appropriately situated bookie, but also upon the availability of suitable commodities that measure those utilities. With this in place, bets can be fixed that constitute a book on the basis of the agent’s credences, but which are fair (or favorable) by the agent’s lights. Notice that the previous points, that an agent might avoid book by refusing to bet and that one might end up on the side of a sure gain, are now otiose, for here it is the agent’s evaluations, rather than their consequences that are implicated by the Dutch Book. Still, the DBA depends upon the theory of preference and utility, and as Kaplan notes (Kaplan 1996), this does not emerge straightforwardly from standard presentations of the argument of the sort considered in section one, nor in the depragmatized versions, as observed in the previous section.

The assumptions of the DBA are significant. It is the agent’s system of credences together with the way they are involved in evaluating options that is implicated by the Dutch Book. To conclude that simply having incoherent credences is irrational, a further argument is needed showing that rationality demands that credences be linked to evaluations of bets as in the DBA, but there is little to suggest that graded degrees of belief must be so connected. Indeed, the DBA assumes not only that there is some connection between an agent’s credences and the evaluation of options, but that one should evaluate a bet as fair if it has an expected value of zero, using one’s credences with the standard expectation rule. This builds in that an agent’s credences are related such that for each \(H\),

\[ \cr(\text{not }H) = 1 - \cr(H). \]

Hedden calls attention to this assumption, which he terms Negation Coherence, noting that it follows from the claim that credences satisfy finite additivity and normalization (Hedden 2013). The premise of the DBA that connects credences with fair betting quotients thus presupposes a significant part of the probabilist’s claim.

Even assuming the appropriate kind of connection between credences and evaluations of options, it may be objected still that the sort of inconsistency revealed through the Dutch Book vulnerability involved in violating the probability axioms is not necessarily irrational, particularly in cases where this is due to the failure to grasp some subtle or complex logical or other necessary truths. It is hard to see that rationality requires agents to attempt to remove such inconsistencies in their belief systems; indeed for most it would be both hopeless and counterproductive. Nor does it seem correct to count as more rational the person who avoids inconsistency, by refusing to have an opinion in the face of evidence, than the person with less than full confidence in a logical truth, who takes the incomplete evidence into account. One option is to insist that coherence is a requirement on ideal agents. It might be suggested instead that coherence is one of a number of ideals, whose satisfaction may sometimes conflict, and that an incoherent agent may still be rational in the sense that they have optimally managed their opinions in light of the totality of their goals and constraints. Whatever the conclusion about the irrationality of being incoherent though, with idealizing assumptions about the connection between degrees of belief and the evaluation of options, the DBA succeeds in establishing incoherence as an evaluative defect.

There remain some disputes about how to understand the DBA for probabilism, and whether it provides an appropriate defense for the claim. As discussed, some take the DBA to show that the probability axioms are a condition of consistency for action guiding degrees of belief, where having incoherent credences involves faulty evaluations of options. It is sometimes added that incoherence thus indicates a form of epistemic irrationality. Although incoherence may be held to depart from a certain ideal of rationality in this way, it need not mean that it is, all things considered, irrational to violate the probability axioms, as noted by Huttegger (2013). On this understanding, the claim that violating the probability axioms is a form of irrationality proceeds from the claim of inconsistency.

Others who accept the idea that the problem with Dutch Book vulnerability is not that it leads to bad consequences, but that it signals an internal defect in the agent’s credences, simply say that DBAs that meet certain conditions, including being constructible by a bookie without requiring more than knowledge of the agent’s credences, establish that the credences leading to a Dutch Book under these conditions display a form of irrationality, without suggesting that Dutch Book vulnerability is form of inconsistency. Both ways of understanding DBAs have been carried over to arguments in support of additional probabilistic norms.

Taking the view that Dutch Book vulnerability indicates a form of inconsistency has the advantage that it makes clear the sort of irrationality involved in cases of Dutch Book vulnerability, and avoids the implausible claim that rationality always requires avoiding Dutch Book vulnerability. However, the view faces a difficulty in that the Dutch Book vulnerability for those who violate other proposed norms of probability seems less clearly a matter of inconsistency, as will be suggested in the following sections. Those who understand DBAs as proceeding directly from Dutch Book vulnerability to the claim of irrationality, without the intermediate conclusion that Dutch Books indicate inconsistency, must qualify what is to count as Dutch Book vulnerability and the sort of irrationality that is at stake. Pettigrew (2020) suggests that the relevant sort of Dutch Book vulnerability is a sure loss in every world that is epistemically possible for the agent, and that the conclusion to draw from this is that someone who is so vulnerable is epistemically irrational. Insofar as it is epistemic rationality that is of concern, this formulation has the virtue of not counting the person who could be made to lose money in every metaphysically possible world, on the basis of having less than full confidence in some metaphysical truths, as subject to a proper Dutch Book and so irrational. But, this still leaves questions about what is to count as epistemically rational, and how in general this lines up with Dutch Book vulnerability. Questions remain too about whether the pragmatic basis of the Dutch Book argument offers appropriate grounds for defending probabilistic norms of epistemic rationality, and this has spurred interest in alternative nonpragmatic justifications of such norms. See Pettigrew (2019).

3. A Dutch Book Argument for Countable Additivity

Given a countable infinity of mutually exclusive and exhaustive ways \(W_i\) in which the proposition \(A\) can be true, the Principle of Countable Additivity requires that

\[ \pr(A) = \sum_{i=1}^{\infty} \pr(W_i). \]

A Dutch Book argument can be constructed for the principle by extending the Dutch Book for finite additivity (Adams 1962; Jeffrey 2004; Williamson 1999) by appealing to an infinite set of bets that each pay $1 if \(W_i\) is true for the price \(\pr(W_i)\). In the case of the Dutch Book argument for countable additivity, there is an additional reason beyond those for the basic argument to favor the interpretation of it, as Jeffrey does, as establishing the principle as a consistency constraint, since the loss is purely theoretical. There is no threat of an actual loss to an agent since this would require an infinite series of bets, which cannot all be made and settled. However, the principle itself is controversial, making the Dutch Book argument for countable additivity highly provocative. Both de Finetti (1972) and Savage (1954) argued that the principle should not be invoked as a constraint on rational degrees of belief. A consequence of the principle is that it prohibits positive credences that are uniformly distributed over a countably infinite partition, and yet it seems at least acceptable, in the absence of a reason to favor some possibilities over others, to adopt such a distribution. Intuitively, a uniform distribution ought to count as consistent, which puts pressure on the idea, at least when it comes to countable additivity, that Dutch Books reveal a defect that is substantially analogous to inconsistency. In the background, as with the basic argument, the Dutch Book argument for countable additivity makes significant assumptions about how degrees of belief are linked with preference and assessments of value. For details concerning how these relate to the demand that an agent’s degrees of belief satisfy countable additivity, see (Seidenfeld and Schervish 1983). For a recent critical discussion of the argument, see Pettigrew (2020).

4. Diachronic Dutch Book Arguments

The basic idea behind the Dutch Book argument for probabilism has been used in defense of a variety of principles that purport to govern how beliefs should evolve over time. In each case, it is argued that the agent who violates the principle is subject to a Dutch Book. Here, the bets involved are placed at different times, but there is an algorithm for placing the bets that is available at the outset guaranteeing a profit to one side. Such arguments are generally referred to as “Dutch Strategy” arguments.

4.1 Conditionalization

The Rule of Conditionalization is commonly endorsed for updating probabilities in response to new information. It states that an agent with the probability function \(\pr_1\) at time \(t_1\) who learns \(E\) and nothing stronger at time \(t_2\) should obtain her new probability function \(\pr_2\) from her old probability function by conditionalizing on \(E\), i.e. for each proposition \(A\), \(\pr_2(A) = \pr_1(A\mid E)\), where the conditional probability \(\pr(A\mid E)\) is given in terms of the ratio formula: \(\pr(A\mid E) = \pr(A \& E)/\pr(E)\). There is a Dutch Book (strategy) argument purporting to show that an agent ought to change beliefs by conditionalization, which was constructed by Lewis (1999), but was first reported by Teller (1973). If an agent violates this rule by adjusting her probabilities such that \(\pr_2(A) \lt \pr_1(A\mid E)\), a bookie can inflict a sure loss by first selling the agent the following three bets:

(Bet 1) for \(\pr_1(A\wedge E)\):
\($1\) if \(A \wedge E\)
  \($0\) otherwise
(Bet 2) for \(\pr_1(A\mid E)\pr_1(\neg E)\):
  \($\pr_1(A\mid E)\) if \(\neg E\)
  \($0\) otherwise
(Bet 3) for \([\pr_1(A\mid E) - \pr_2(A)]\cdot \pr_1(E)\):
  \($\pr_1(A\mid E) - \pr_2(A)\) if \(E\)
  \($0\) otherwise

If \(E\) is false, the agent has a net loss of [\(\pr_{1}(A\mid E) -\) \(\pr_{2}(A)\)] \(\pr_{1}(E)\). If \(E\) is true, then the bookie buys back a fourth bet:

(Bet 4) for \(\pr_2(A)\):
  \($1\) if \(A\)
  \($0\) otherwise

Bets 1 and 2 together amount to a conditional bet on \(A\), which is called off if \(E\) is false. In the event that \(E\) is true, this bet is bought back at the lower price of \(\pr_{2}(A)\). Bet 3 spreads the expected winnings of that exchange in order to assure a profit in the case that \(E\) is false. Thus, if \(E\) is true the agent suffers a net loss of [ \(\pr_{1}(A\mid E) - \pr_{2}(A)\)] \(\pr_{1}(E)\). If \(\pr_{2}(A) \gt \pr_{1}(A\mid E)\), then the strategy involves reversing the direction of the above bets. Where dollars are taken as measures of utility, each bet is fair given the agent’s beliefs at the time offered. There is also a converse Dutch Book theorem that shows that adhering to conditionalization avoids Dutch Book vulnerability Skyrms (1987b).

While the argument has often been cited in support of the Rule of Conditionalization as characterized above, there are significant assumptions and limitations to Lewis’ Dutch Strategy argument in defense of the claim that rational updating requires conditionalization on the evidence in accordance with the rule. As van Fraassen points out, the Dutch Strategy given above does not yield an argument for the diachronic Principle of Conditionalization as stated (van Fraassen 1989). There is no strategy for the bookie that guarantees him a profit from an agent for whom \(\pr_{2}(A) \ne \pr_{1}(A\mid E)\) unless the agent makes a commitment to violate the rule in a particular way in advance. The idea that the above bets constitute a betting strategy yielding a Dutch Book tacitly assumes that the agent’s alternative rule \(D\) is fixed at time \(t_{1}\), before it is known whether or not \(E\) is true, and that the agent is sure to follow the rule if \(E\) is learned.

However, the bookie can guarantee himself a profit in some cases even if it is not assumed that the agent will follow though by placing a side bet that he wins in the event that the agent does not change beliefs as planned. The Dutch Strategy depends upon the fact that the agent initially has some definite probability that he will shift probabilities in the event that \(E\), in some particular way that is not the result of conditionalization on \(E\). The Dutch Strategy argument in no way establishes that one must have such a probability, and so at most shows that one should not have a plan involving a fixed probability to update upon learning \(E\) in a way that differs from conditionalizing on \(E\).

Even where it is assumed that an agent is fully committed to following through on some alternative to the Rule of Condtionalization, there are questions about what the Dutch Strategy shows. As with the basic DBA for probabilism, it is possible to devise scenarios in which it would be rational to leave oneself open to a Dutch Strategy by announcing a deviant updating rule, and so the Dutch Strategy argument should not be taken to show that it is strictly irrational to have an updating rule other than Conditionalization. Rather, the existence of the strategy points to a tension in adopting such a rule. Shifting from \(\pr_{1}\) to \(\pr_{2}\) by conditionalizing on \(E\) is equivalent to invariance, i.e. for each proposition \(A\), \(\pr_{1}(A\mid E) =\) \(\pr_{2}(A\mid E)\). Adopting a rule for updating other than Conditionalization is thus tantamount to holding at time \(t_{1}\) that for some \(A\), \(\pr_{1}(A\mid E) \ne\) \(\pr_{2}(A\mid E)\). Note that the bookie simply takes advantage of the difference between the agent’s probability for A given \(E\) at \(t_{1}\) and at \(t_{2}\). Where the agent is certain at \(t_{1}\) that he would update via some deviant rule \(D\), the rule induces a conditional probability at that time for \(A\) given \(E\) that differs from \(\pr_{1}(A\mid E)\). In such a case, \(\pr_{2}(A\mid E)\) is fixed at \(t_{1}\) by the agent’s credal state, and so given that \(\pr_{1}(A\mid E) \ne\) \(\pr_{2}(A\mid E)\), the agent’s credences may be said to exhibit a kind of inconsistency. While this is problematic in a way that the sort of inconsistency involved in simply having different levels of confidence for a proposition at different times is not, it appears less like inconsistency for full belief than failing to obey the probability axioms, where the agent has evaluations according to which each in a set of bets is fair at a single time. While \(\pr_{2}(A\mid E)\) may be fixed at \(t_{1}\), this is not the agent’s conditional probability at \(t_{1}\), but rather the probability for \(A\) given \(E\) that she will come to have at \(t_{2}\) upon learning \(E\). Such updating plans are part of the agent’s credal system though, for which Dutch Book vulnerability may plausibly be held to signal a defect.

The Dutch Strategy against the non-conditionalizer, as described above, also depends upon the assumption that either E will be learned or the altenative not E will be learned. Otherwise, there is no guarantee that a loss can be inflicted, even if, on the condition that E is learned, the agent plans to adjust her credences such that \(\pr_2(A) ≠\pr_1(A\mid E)\). More generally, the existence of a Dutch Strategy assumes a learning scenario in which the agent’s possible total evidence is one of a set of propositions \(\{E_1, E_2, \ldots, E_n\}\) that characterize what can be learned.

Gallow (2019) calls attention to the fact that the Rule of Conditionalization as stated in the form above does not depend upon the possible evidential propositions that may be learned, but only the prior credences and what is actually learned. Constructing a Dutch Strategy against a non-conditionalizer requires having a rule that specifies how they will update their credences given the alternative possible evidence that they might have learned. So, at most the Dutch Strategy Argument defends the Rule of Conditionalization in an appropriate learning scenario that specifies the possible evidence that may be obtained. Gallow also emphasizes that the propositions in the learning scenario must form a partition, as some presentations explicitly assume. If they do not, that is some of the \(E_i\) overlap, he shows that Dutch Strategies are possible against conditionalizers. For instance, where \(E_1\) and \(E_2\) are the evidential propositions that may be learned and they overlap, learning either will raise the conditionalizer's credence in their conjunction. A Dutch Strategy can be constructed that takes advantage of the difference between the prior credence for the conjunction and the foreseeable rise in the conjunction upon either learning \(E_1\) or learning \(E_2\). Gallow suggests that learning scenarios may exist in which the possible evidence fails to form a partition, and that evidence can be acquired outside of any learning scenario at all.

These observations put significant pressure on the Dutch Strategy argument, especially when the argument is read, as Gallow does, as drawing the conclusion that violating the Rule of Conditionalization is epistemically irrational on the grounds that doing so involves vulnerability to a Dutch Strategy. The Rule of Conditionalization, as stated above, says to conditionalize on the evidence E obtained, irrespective of the evidence that might have been obtained instead, so in particular it counsels conditionalizing both in learning scenarios that form a partition and those that do not. But, as Gallow shows, conditionalizing in the latter case can involve vulnerability to a diachronic Dutch Book, so Dutch Strategy vulnerability fails to discriminate between cases in which the rule, as characterized above, is adopted and cases in which it is violated.

One option for preserving the force to the Dutch Strategy argument for the Rule of Conditionalization as given is to insist that ideally rational agents will always obtain evidence in a learning scenario that forms a partition, which is a view that Gallow plausibly attributes to Lewis (1999). Even if this is right for highly idealized epistemic agents, it leaves the status of the Principle of Conditionalization unclear in more ordinary circumstances and so fails to establish the principle as a general norm. Moreover, such a defense of conditionalization would depend upon more than just the claim that vulnerability to a Dutch Strategy involves irrationality, but also upon the claim that there are rationality constraints on possible learning scenarios.

An alternative is simply to amend the Rule of Conditionalization to build in that it only applies in learning scenarios that form a partition. This would allow for a Dutch Strategy argument for the narrower claim that epistemic rationality requires conditionalizing in learning scenarios that form a partition, provided that the notion of epistemic rationality here also makes sense of the Dutch Strategy vulnerability of conditionalizers in other learning scenarios.

One more limitation to observe about Lewis’ Dutch Strategy argument for changing credences by Conditionalization stems from his formulation of the principle itself in terms of the ratio formula, which requires that the prior probability of the evidence conditionalized on is non-zero. Rescorla (2019) addresses this by giving a form of conditionalization, which he terms Kolmogorov Conditionalization, that permits conditionalizing on evidence with null priors. He then proves a Dutch Book theorem and converse for it, where the theorems involve generalized learning scenarios.

4.2 Jeffrey Conditionalization

Jeffrey proposes a further Generalized Conditionalization Rule (also termed Probability Kinematics or Jeffrey Conditionalization) to cover cases in which experience does not manifest itself in some evidential proposition \(E\) shifting to one, but rather stems from a shift in probabilities over some partition \(\{E_{i}\}\) (Jeffrey 1983). Jeffrey’s Rule states that

\[ \pr_2(A) = \sum_{i=1}^{n} \pr_1(A \mid E_i) \pr_2(E_i), \]

which is equivalent to the invariance condition that \(pr_1(A\mid E_i) = pr_2(A\mid E_i)\), for each element \(E_i\) of the partition. To maintain that updating goes by Jeffrey Conditionalization is to mandate invariance for each proposition \(A\). This might seem to be required, as Armendt shows that a Dutch Strategy can be constructed against an agent who has a rule for updating that conflicts with Jeffrey’s Rule (Armendt 1980). As with the Rule of Conditionalization though, the Dutch Strategy does not show that there is any problem with having probabilities over a partition, and then abandoning one’s prior conditional probabilities over that partition, that is violating invariance; the problem is with adopting a rule of this sort in advance. As with the simple Rule of Conditionalization, Skyrms (1987b) shows that there is also a converse Dutch Strategy argument showing that following Jeffrey’s Rule avoids a Dutch Book. It is built in here that Jeffrey’s Rule applies in cases in which credences shift over a partition, but as before if the agent’s learning scenario does not form a partition, Gallow (2019) shows that, as with the Simple Conditionalization, Jeffrey Conditionalizers may be subject to a Dutch Strategy as well.

While the Rule of Conditionalization is generally presented as demanding that agents satisfy invariance for each proposition, and various authors have rightly complained that this demands an unreasonable rigidity of belief (Bacchus, Kyburg, and Thalos 1990; Levi 2002), Jeffrey does not treat the condition as a strict requirement on rational belief change (Jeffrey 2004). He leaves open the possibility that when probabilities are shifted over a partition, the conditional probabilities could change, although this leaves the unanswered question as to when invariance is reasonable to assume. In any case, as with the Simple Rule of Conditionalization, the Dutch Strategy argument here tells in the same way against planned violations of invariance.

4.3 The Principle of Reflection

A Dutch Strategy argument has also been given for the controversial Principle of Reflection, which requires that for any proposition \(A\) and any future time \(t\), an agent’s current probability for \(A\) conditional on later assigning it probability \(r\) is itself \(r\), that is pr \((A\mid \pr_{t}(A) = r) = r\). In violating Reflection, the agent fails to endorse certain of her possible future judgments, which as van Fraassen showed (van Fraassen 1984), opens the door to a Dutch Strategy. If the agent violates Reflection in that \(\pr(A\mid \pr_{t}(A) = r) \gt r\), the bookie sells the following bets:

(Bet 1) for \(\pr(A \wedge \pr_t(A) = r)\):
  \($1\) if \((A \wedge \pr_t(A) = r)\)
  \($0\) otherwise
(Bet 2) for \(x\,\pr(\pr_t(A)\ne r)\):
  \($x\) if \(\pr_t(A)\ne r\)
  \($0\) otherwise
(Bet 3) for \((x-r)\,\pr(\pr_{t}(A) = r)\):
  \($x-r\) if \(\pr_t(A) = r\)
  \($0\) otherwise

where \(x = \pr(A \mid \pr_{t}(A) = r)\).

In the event that \(\pr_{t}(A) = r\), the bookie then buys a fourth bet from the agent on \(A\) with a prize of 1, with a price of the agent’s new probability.

The idea that the existence of such a strategy shows that agents should satisfy Reflection has been widely disputed, even by many who take the Dutch Book arguments for probabilism and conditionalization as having force. Much of the discussion stems from a variety of counterexamples to Reflection in which it appears irrational not to violate the principle. One example, due to Talbott, turns on the fact that real agents lack perfect recall (Talbott 1991). He considers a person who had spaghetti \((S)\) the previous night, say November 16, and contemplates the probability that she will give to her having eaten spaghetti on that day in year’s time. Since she eats spaghetti on average one out of every ten days, she thinks it likely that \(\pr_{t}(S) = 0\).1. But surely she should not assign a probability of 0.1 to her having had spaghetti the previous night conditional on the claim that \(\pr_{t}(S) = 0\).1, since she is nearly certain (say \(\pr_{t}(S) = 0\).99) of what she had for dinner the previous night.

The forgetting that makes it reasonable to violate Reflection in Talbott’s spaghetti dinner example involves one type of limited future impairment. Christensen gives a different case in which an agent has just consumed a mind-altering drug (LSQ) that he expects in hour’s time will make him believe that he can fly, without conferring upon him any such power (Christensen 1991). However, this is the only effect of the drug, so that the agent’s faculties will remain otherwise acute. Before the drug takes effect, the agent should not take his probability that he can fly conditional on his coming to believe it in an hour to be high, as required by Reflection, because what he will think when under the influence is irrelevant to his ability to fly. A similar example involving Ulysses and the Sirens is discussed by van Fraassen (1995).

It is important in both of these examples that it is not only reasonable to violate Reflection, but that to do otherwise would involve failing to properly account for the evidence about the unreliability of one’s future beliefs. Christensen’s own response involves arguing that because the bets in diachronic Dutch Book arguments are made over time, unlike in the synchronic argument for the probability axioms, they do not reveal a form of inconsistency that is generally irrational. One of several troubles with this is that it would require rejecting the claim that the Dutch Strategy against agents who plan to violate Conditionalization reveals any sort of problematic inconsistency. Other problems with Christensen’s response are discussed in (Vineberg 1997).

Others have tried to respond to the counterexamples by distinguishing features of the Dutch Strategy argument for Reflection that do not involve dismissing all diachronic Dutch Book arguments. For instance, Hitchcock emphasizes that it is important to consider what the bookie knows in assessing the relevance of Dutch Books on an agent’s rationality (Hitchcock 2004). He observes that unlike the case in which an agent violates the probability axioms, where the bookie can determine and place the bets with only the knowledge of the agent’s beliefs, in Talbott’s example, the bookie may need to exploit information that is unavailable to the agent in order to make the Dutch Book.

Taking into account what a bookie needs to know in order to guarantee himself a profit fails to distinguish adequately between the Dutch Books that appear to be norms of rationality and those that do not. First, as Hitchcock acknowledges, this won’t work to resolve the tension between the Dutch Strategy argument for Reflection and many of the other counterexamples. In Christensen’s example, taking LSQ does not have any effect on memory, it merely changes the agent’s evaluation of his ability to fly, that is, he changes his view of a very limited bit of evidence, so that the Dutch Strategy can be carried out without the bookie having relevant information that the agent lacks.

Still, perhaps we might take the fact that a book can be made without having knowledge beyond that of the agent as at least a necessary condition for a telling book. Various cases, besides that of the spaghetti dinner, give plausibility to the idea that a Dutch Book only establishes the unreasonableness of violating a particular principle when the book is made with no special knowledge not possessed by the agent. Consider an agent who violates the probability axioms in virtue of failing to recognize some complicated logical truth. Arguably this is not unreasonable, and setting up a Dutch Book in this case would require knowledge that the agent lacks. But, insofar as the irrationality in violating the axioms stems from the fact that it is supposed to be a form of inconsistency, as both Hitchcock and Christensen maintain, then the fact that a bookie might need (logical) knowledge that the agent lacks in order to set up the book, is irrelevant to whether the book has force. Whether an agent’s beliefs are inconsistent, unlike the question of whether she is to be regarded as reasonable, is independent of what she or anybody else knows.

Briggs offers another way of distinguishing those Dutch Books that mark the violation of a genuine norm from those that do not (Briggs 2009). The contention is that whereas the Dutch Strategy against those who violate Conditionalization reveals what Briggs terms incoherence, which is taken to be a form of inconsistency, the Dutch Strategy against violators of Reflection reveals merely self-doubt, which involves an agent who suspects herself of incoherence. Briggs assumes that an agent’s credences “condone” accepting certain bets as fair, and that an agent’s credences admit of a Dutch Book just in case those credences condone a set of bets that yield a net loss to the agent in every world where the agent has those credences and accordingly would condone the bets. Violating the probability axioms, Conditionalization or Reflection makes one vulnerable to a Dutch Book in this sense. Briggs observes that the bets in the Dutch Books that may be constructed against someone violating either the probability axioms or Conditionalization will yield a net loss in every possible world; but, the bets in the Dutch Strategy against the violator of Reflection will not result in a loss in certain worlds in which the agent’s beliefs differ from those that she has in the actual world. Accordingly, Briggs suggests that incoherence is marked by Dutch Books that involve bets that result in a loss in every world, and thus that violation of Reflection does not involve incoherence.

This way of attempting to save the Dutch Strategy argument for Conditionalization, while jettisoning that for Reflection, is criticized by Mahtani (2012), who argues that Briggs’ test mistakenly counts certain cases of mere self-doubt as incoherence. Mahtani proposes a new way of understanding Dutch Book arguments as revealing incoherence, according to which an agent is incoherent if and only if she would accept as fair a set of bets that would result in a loss under any interpretation of the claims involved (Mahtani 2015). With this understanding, violation of the probability axioms reveals incoherence, but violations of Reflection and cases of self-doubt in which the agent isn’t sure of her own credences do not count as incoherence, as they do not involve proper Dutch Books that result in a loss under any interpretation. As she discusses, this way of understanding Dutch Books leaves it open as to whether there is a proper Dutch Book argument for Conditionalization.

Both Briggs and Mahtani extract the condition of incoherence from the features of certain bets. However, it remains unclear as to how precisely the concept of incoherence, in their sense, is to be understood, although they seem to take it as a form of inconsistency. Still, the discussion is important for there is some intuition that violating Reflection is less similar to holding inconsistent beliefs than violating the probability axioms. When it comes to Conditionalization, Briggs takes the Dutch Book argument as establishing the full principle that the rule will be followed, which appears too strong, since the consistency required by rationality does not seem to require having a plan for updating nor to strictly require following through on such a plan. Indeed, precisely what sort of inconsistency is involved in cases where one is susceptible to a Dutch Strategy on account of having an alternative updating rule to Conditionalization remains unclear, and is perhaps a point in favor of Mahtani’s analysis upon which the status of Conditionalization remains inconclusive. Against Mahtani, Pust (2021) claims that her reading of logical form is too narrow, and that given a more plausible account of logical form, cases of self-doubt will be subject to Dutch Books that establish incoherence. Moreover, Pust argues that the point applies to Dutch Books against violators of Reflection, so that they too will count as incoherent. If this is right, Mahtani’s new understanding of Dutch Book arguments would fail to distinguish as intended between Dutch Books to undermine the Dutch Strategy argument for Reflection. The proposals of both Briggs and Mahtani must contend with the subtle connection between credences and bets. Mahtani associates credences with bets that the agent would accept as fair, but as previously noted, having credences need not go along with accepting bets as fair in the way needed to connect the violation of various probabilistic norms with a Dutch Book. While Briggs acknowledges that there is a complex relationship between credences and bets, the notion that credences condone certain bets also appears to be in the spirit of the depragmatized DBAs, which, as observed, suffer from various difficulties.

Pettigrew (2020) offers another way of jettisoning the Dutch Strategy argument for Reflection, while retaining that for Conditionalization. He observes that the Reflection principle is synchronic, whereas the Dutch Strategy argument for it is diachronic. As a result, he claims that the Dutch Strategy argument here fails to target Reflection. Instead, he says that since violators of Reflection can’t follow conditionalization, if they have an updating rule, it is this departure from Conditionalization that is implicated by the Dutch Stategy. This approach to distinguishing the Dutch Strategy argument for Reflection from that for Conditionalization and the probability axioms does not involve some sort of consistency, but rather it is in line with taking Dutch Strategy arguments to move directly from Dutch Book vulnerability to irrationality. The trouble is that violators of Reflection are subject to a Dutch Strategy no matter what future credences they come to have, regardless of whether they adopt a particular updating rule, so given the understanding of Dutch Strategy vulnerability as indicating some form of irrationality, it is hard to see here why the Dutch Strategy argument for Reflection doesn’t defend the principle as a norm.

The significance of distinguishing between different types of Dutch Books so as to mark off some as pointing to a form of incoherence or irrationality is unclear. Whereas one or another proposal may comport better with our intuitions about what is intuitively incoherent (inconsistent), or irrational, if we retain Ramsey’s idea of credences as guides to action, then any way of distinguishing between Dutch Books here looks problematic, since any credences that lead to a sure loss are, at least to some extent, defective as a guide to action.

Rather than defend the idea that violations of Reflection can be rational by attempting to distinguish the Dutch Strategy argument for the principle from other Dutch Book arguments that are desirable to retain, an alternative is to take each kind of Dutch Book as pointing to a defect, and then argue that the most reasonable attitude in some circumstances is to hold on to less than ideal credences. The view that Dutch Book vulnerability generally involves a departure from the ideal of consistency is endorsed in defense of Reflection by Huttegger (2013). The idea is that whereas the Dutch Strategy argument does establish Reflection as a kind of consistency constraint, this doesn’t require that in bad circumstances departure from the ideal cannot be the most rational option overall. This response does assume that violations of Reflection can sensibly be held as a form of inconsistency, and this remains controversial.

5. Other Uses of Dutch Book Arguments

5.1 Sleeping Beauty

An interesting application of Dutch Strategy arguments has been made by Hitchcock to the perplexing Sleeping Beauty problem (Hitchcock 2004). In the problem, Beauty is to undergo an experiment in which she will be put to sleep on Sunday night, after which a fair coin will be tossed. If it comes up heads, she will be awakened just once for a short time on Monday, and if tails she will also be awakened again on Tuesday. In each case, after being awakened, she will be put back to sleep with drugs that will erase her memory of having been awake. On Wednesday, she is awakened and the experiment ends. Beauty is aware of these facts about the experiment, so that when she wakes up during the experiment she will not know whether it is Monday or Tuesday. The problem is to determine what her probability should be for heads upon awakening within the experiment. Elga introduced the problem into the philosophical literature (Elga 2000), and argued that upon awakening Beauty should shift her probability from the value of ½ that she assigned on Sunday night to ⅓. Lewis argued shortly thereafter that Beauty’s probability upon awakening should remain at ½ (Lewis 2001), and additional arguments have followed on both sides. Hitchcock shows that there is a Dutch Strategy against either answer, but then argues that there is only force to the one against Beauty if she sticks with ½.

The strategies serve as potential counterarguments to the two ways of answering the problem, rather than showing that it is irrational to switch to ⅓ or stick with ½ per se, since the individual strategies depend upon the plan to have a particular probability upon awakening. If Beauty plans to switch to probability ⅓ for heads, the Dutch Strategy is just an application of the general strategy against someone who violates Reflection. Hitchcock argues that this would not establish Beauty’s irrationality, since in this case the bookie must know during the experiment what day it is in order to implement the strategy, which is information that Beauty lacks. On the other hand, if Beauty sticks with ½, a strategy can be carried out without the bookie having to know more than Beauty by having the bookie undergo the experiment with her and offer a bet against heads on Sunday and a bet on heads whenever Beauty and the bookie awake within the experiment. If the coin lands heads, the bookie sells Beauty just one bet on heads, with her gain totaling less than her loss on the first bet against heads. If the coin lands tails, the bookie sells a bet on heads once on Monday and the same bet again on Tuesday, so as to again produce a loss for Beauty. Hitchcock takes this book to tell against the answer ½, and in favor of ⅓.

One trouble with defending the answer of ⅓ in this way is that what a bookie must know to assure himself a profit does not characterize what is essential to a proper Dutch Book. There is also a particular reason to suppose that Beauty’s predicament is one in which reasonable degrees of belief and betting quotients can come apart, because the third bet needed to make book in the switching case is only offered when it is sure to be a losing bet (discussed in Vineberg 2004—see the Other Internet Resources, and Bradley and Leitgeb 2006). In this case the bookie exploits features of the experiment, so that the strategy can be carried out without his possessing knowledge of the day. But the fact that the bets leading to book are triggered by the circumstances suggests that it is not just Beauty’s beliefs on which the strategy depends, and hence the loss does not reflect a purely internal defect, despite the fact that the bookie can implement the strategy without having access during the experiment to knowledge that Beauty lacks. Draper and Pust also argue that Hitchcock’s use of a Dutch Book argument is subject to an objection from evidential decision theory (Draper and Pust 2008).

5.2 The Principal Principle

Recently, Richard Pettigrew (2020) has offered a Dutch Book argument for Lewis’ Principal Principle as an additional constraint on rational credences. The Principal Principle requires that an agent’s credences about chances be such that her credence for the proposition, \(A\) conditional on the chance of \(A\) being \(r\), is equal to \(r\). Supposing that \(\text{cr}\) is the agent’s credence function and \(\text{ch}\) a chance function such that \(\text{ch}(A) = r\) says that the chance of \(A\) is \(r\), the requirement is that \(\text{cr}(A/\text{ch}(A) = r) = r\). The principle has a similar structure to the Principle of Reflection, with the chance of \(A\) at the current time t in place of the agent's credence in \(A\) at a future time \(t\). So, it is not so surprising that if \(\text{cr}(A/\text{ch}(A) = r) \neq r\), there is a collection of bets in accordance with those credences that produce a kind of Dutch Book. For details see Pettigrew (2020). However, there are significant differences between the arguments for the Principal Principle and that for the Reflection Principle. First, since the agent’s future credences do not figure in the Principal Principle, the bets are part of a Dutch Book proper, rather than a Dutch Strategy. While this avoids some concerns about Dutch Strategy arguments, a problematic difference is that the bets, which are given in terms of chances do not guarantee a sure loss, but only an expected one, whatever the chances may be.

For Ramsey and de Finetti, the point of appealing to a Dutch Book argument was to establish probabilistic constraints using precise terms that were tied to verifiable conditions, making it crucial that the bets constituting a book are given definite payoff conditions and can be settled. However, the book against the violator of the Principal Principle involves bets on chances, which lack the definitive settlement conditions that would produce a sure loss. To the extent that the underlying problem associated with Dutch Book vulnerability lies with the agent’s evaluations rather than merely with their pragmatic consequences, as discussed previously, the lack of a sure loss here may not be crucial. Still, the motivation for taking the Dutch Book vulnerability in cases where the probability axioms are violated as an indication of irrationality appears to derive from the idea that it leads to a sure loss, so that the merely expected loss associated with violating the Principal Principle, is less clearly irrational. In particular, credences that are associated with a mere expectation of loss, rather than a sure loss, are less clearly held to indicate an inconsistency in the agent’s action guiding evaluations. Such credences may still be irrational, but clarifying the source seems to require appealing to the nature of chance, which remains unsettled.

5.3 Dutch Books and Rational Choice

Dutch Books have also been used to show that there are limitations on the proper applications of credences within the standard decision theoretic framework. Given that the available evidence often appears to dictate only vague or interval-valued credences, it has been argued that rationality permits having such unsharp credences. Elga uses a kind of reverse Dutch Book involving a series of bets that are sure to result in a net gain for the agent to argue that credences must be sharp (Elga 2010). The idea is that a rational agent must accept at least one of the bets in the series, but that there does not appear to be a satisfactory set of decision rules for unsharp credences with this consequence.

McGee constructs another type of Dutch Book with implications for decision theory. Suppose that an agent’s probability function is not concentrated at finitely many points. Such a state of opinion, in which the agent does not rule out all but a finite number of possibilities, seems both consistent and reasonable, yet assuming that an agent’s utilities are unbounded, McGee shows that there is an infinite series of bets, each with positive expected value, which together assure a loss (McGee 1999). Assuming that it is reasonable to have probabilities that are not concentrated at finitely many points, McGee calls into question the general adequacy of the decision theoretic framework, and in particular the principle of utility maximization that his Dutch Book argument presumes.

6. Conclusion

It remains defensible that the Dutch Book argument shows that the probability axioms are something like consistency constraints on partial belief, at least given some substantial decision-theoretic assumptions, unlike the idea that their violation is a pragmatic liability. But this interpretation is less successful for the various other norms for which Dutch Book arguments have been constructed. The Dutch Strategy arguments for the Principle of Conditionalization and for Jeffrey’s Rule do not fully support the norms, but only the weaker claim that one should not commit in advance to following an alternative rule under some additional conditions, and the sense in which it may be said to be inconsistent to do so seems different from what is involved in violating the axioms. The other claims considered here for which Dutch Book arguments have been constructed are even less plausibly regarded as consistency constraints, and thus seem to be a different sort of requirement on ideal rationality. This suggests the need to identify ‘consistency’ with a narrower set of conditions than mere Dutch Book vulnerability, if we are not to abandon the idea of the probability axioms as a consistency constraint that extends the ordinary concept and, perhaps, reject the DBA altogether. A more fine-grained analysis of the various Dutch Books might yield a way of marking off those that point to genuine inconsistency from those exhibiting some other sort of defect, but a satisfactory way of accomplishing this remains illusive.

Among those who endorse at least certain Dutch Book arguments, some regard them as establishing rationality requirements without embracing the idea that Dutch Book vulnerability involves a kind of inconsistency. This avoids the problem of making sense of the inconsistency involved in Dutch Book vulnerability, but faces challenges in specifying the sort of rationality that is at stake. Responses to the Dutch Strategy argument for Reflection have prompted a particularly wide array of attitudes towards Dutch Book vulnerability. It is striking that nearly a century after the publication of Ramsey’s paper, there remains so much disagreement and continued work on how to understand Dutch Book arguments.


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Other Internet Resources


Special thanks to Branden Fitelson, Alan Hájek, and an anonymous SEP referee for their helpful comments on previous drafts of this article. Thanks are also due to my colleagues, Eric Hiddleston, Gregory Novack, and Larry Powers, for their discussions with me about Dutch Book arguments.

Copyright © 2022 by
Susan Vineberg <susan.vineberg@wayne.edu>

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