First published Fri Aug 20, 2010; substantive revision Tue Aug 29, 2017

The heart of the eighteenth century Enlightenment is the loosely organized activity of prominent French thinkers of the mid-decades of the eighteenth century, the so-called “philosophes”(e.g., Voltaire, D’Alembert, Diderot, Montesquieu). The philosophes constituted an informal society of men of letters who collaborated on a loosely defined project of Enlightenment exemplified by the project of the Encyclopedia (see below 1.5). However, there are noteworthy centers of Enlightenment outside of France as well. There is a renowned Scottish Enlightenment (key figures are Frances Hutcheson, Adam Smith, David Hume, Thomas Reid), a German Enlightenment (die Aufklärung, key figures of which include Christian Wolff, Moses Mendelssohn, G.E. Lessing and Immanuel Kant), and there are also other hubs of Enlightenment and Enlightenment thinkers scattered throughout Europe and America in the eighteenth century.

What makes for the unity of such tremendously diverse thinkers under the label of “Enlightenment”? For the purposes of this entry, the Enlightenment is conceived broadly. D’Alembert, a leading figure of the French Enlightenment, characterizes his eighteenth century, in the midst of it, as “the century of philosophy par excellence”, because of the tremendous intellectual and scientific progress of the age, but also because of the expectation of the age that philosophy (in the broad sense of the time, which includes the natural and social sciences) would dramatically improve human life. Guided by D’Alembert’s characterization of his century, the Enlightenment is conceived here as having its primary origin in the scientific revolution of the 16th and 17th centuries. The rise of the new science progressively undermines not only the ancient geocentric conception of the cosmos, but also the set of presuppositions that had served to constrain and guide philosophical inquiry in the earlier times. The dramatic success of the new science in explaining the natural world promotes philosophy from a handmaiden of theology, constrained by its purposes and methods, to an independent force with the power and authority to challenge the old and construct the new, in the realms both of theory and practice, on the basis of its own principles. Taking as the core of the Enlightenment the aspiration for intellectual progress, and the belief in the power of such progress to improve human society and individual lives, this entry includes descriptions of relevant aspects of the thought of earlier thinkers, such as Hobbes, Locke, Descartes, Bayle, Leibniz, and Spinoza, thinkers whose contributions are indispensable to understanding the eighteenth century as “the century of philosophy par excellence”.

The Enlightenment is often associated with its political revolutions and ideals, especially the French Revolution of 1789. The energy created and expressed by the intellectual foment of Enlightenment thinkers contributes to the growing wave of social unrest in France in the eighteenth century. The social unrest comes to a head in the violent political upheaval which sweeps away the traditionally and hierarchically structured ancien régime (the monarchy, the privileges of the nobility, the political power of the Catholic Church). The French revolutionaries meant to establish in place of the ancien régime a new reason-based order instituting the Enlightenment ideals of liberty and equality. Though the Enlightenment, as a diverse intellectual and social movement, has no definite end, the devolution of the French Revolution into the Terror in the 1790s, corresponding, as it roughly does, with the end of the eighteenth century and the rise of opposed movements, such as Romanticism, can serve as a convenient marker of the end of the Enlightenment, conceived as an historical period.

For Enlightenment thinkers themselves, however, the Enlightenment is not an historical period, but a process of social, psychological or spiritual development, unbound to time or place. Immanuel Kant defines “enlightenment” in his famous contribution to debate on the question in an essay entitled “An Answer to the Question: What is Enlightenment?” (1784), as humankind’s release from its self-incurred immaturity; “immaturity is the inability to use one’s own understanding without the guidance of another.” Expressing convictions shared among Enlightenment thinkers of widely divergent doctrines, Kant identifies enlightenment with the process of undertaking to think for oneself, to employ and rely on one’s own intellectual capacities in determining what to believe and how to act. Enlightenment philosophers from across the geographical and temporal spectrum tend to have a great deal of confidence in humanity’s intellectual powers, both to achieve systematic knowledge of nature and to serve as an authoritative guide in practical life. This confidence is generally paired with suspicion or hostility toward other forms or carriers of authority (such as tradition, superstition, prejudice, myth and miracles), insofar as these are seen to compete with the authority of one’s own reason and experience. Enlightenment philosophy tends to stand in tension with established religion, insofar as the release from self-incurred immaturity in this age, daring to think for oneself, awakening one’s intellectual powers, generally requires opposing the role of established religion in directing thought and action. The faith of the Enlightenment – if one may call it that – is that the process of enlightenment, of becoming progressively self-directed in thought and action through the awakening of one’s intellectual powers, leads ultimately to a better, more fulfilled human existence.

This entry describes the main tendencies of Enlightenment thought in the following main sections: (1) The True: Science, Epistemology, and Metaphysics in the Enlightenment; (2) The Good: Political Theory, Ethical Theory and Religion in the Enlightenment; (3) The Beautiful: Aesthetics in the Enlightenment.

1. The True: Science, Epistemology and Metaphysics in the Enlightenment

In this era dedicated to human progress, the advancement of the natural sciences is regarded as the main exemplification of, and fuel for, such progress. Isaac Newton’s epochal accomplishment in his Principia Mathematica (1687), which, very briefly described, consists in the comprehension of a diversity of physical phenomena – in particular the motions of heavenly bodies, together with the motions of sublunary bodies – in few relatively simple, universally applicable, mathematical laws, was a great stimulus to the intellectual activity of the eighteenth century and served as a model and inspiration for the researches of a number of Enlightenment thinkers. Newton’s system strongly encourages the Enlightenment conception of nature as an orderly domain governed by strict mathematical-dynamical laws and the conception of ourselves as capable of knowing those laws and of plumbing the secrets of nature through the exercise of our unaided faculties. – The conception of nature, and of how we know it, changes significantly with the rise of modern science. It belongs centrally to the agenda of Enlightenment philosophy to contribute to the new knowledge of nature, and to provide a metaphysical framework within which to place and interpret this new knowledge.

1.1 Rationalism and the Enlightenment

René Descartes’ rationalist system of philosophy is one of the pillars on which Enlightenment thought rests. Descartes (1596–1650) undertakes to establish the sciences upon a secure metaphysical foundation. The famous method of doubt Descartes employs for this purpose exemplifies (in part through exaggerating) an attitude characteristic of the Enlightenment. According to Descartes, the investigator in foundational philosophical research ought to doubt all propositions that can be doubted. The investigator determines whether a proposition is dubitable by attempting to construct a possible scenario under which it is false. In the domain of fundamental scientific (philosophical) research, no other authority but one’s own conviction is to be trusted, and not one’s own conviction either, until it is subjected to rigorous skeptical questioning. With his method, Descartes casts doubt upon the senses as authoritative source of knowledge. He finds that God and the immaterial soul are both better known, on the basis of innate ideas, than objects of the senses. Through his famous doctrine of the dualism of mind and body, that mind and body are two distinct substances, each with its own essence, the material world (allegedly) known through the senses becomes denominated as an “external” world, insofar as it is external to the ideas with which one immediately communes in one’s consciousness. Descartes’ investigation thus establishes one of the central epistemological problems, not only of the Enlightenment, but also of modernity: the problem of objectivity in our empirical knowledge. If our evidence for the truth of propositions about extra-mental material reality is always restricted to mental content, content before the mind, how can we ever be certain that the extra-mental reality is not other than we represent it as being? Descartes’ solution depends on our having secured prior and certain knowledge of God. In fact, Descartes argues that all human knowledge (not only knowledge of the material world through the senses) depends on metaphysical knowledge of God.

Despite Descartes’ grounding of all scientific knowledge in metaphysical knowledge of God, his system contributes significantly to the advance of natural science in the period. He attacks the long-standing assumptions of the scholastic-aristotelians whose intellectual dominance stood in the way of the development of the new science; he developed a conception of matter that enabled mechanical explanation of physical phenomena; and he developed some of the fundamental mathematical resources – in particular, a way to employ algebraic equations to solve geometrical problems – that enabled the physical domain to be explained with precise, simple mathematical formulae. Furthermore, his grounding of physics, and all knowledge, in a relatively simple and elegant rationalist metaphysics provides a model of a rigorous and complete secular system of knowledge. Though major Enlightenment thinkers (for example Voltaire in his Letters on the English Nation, 1734) embrace Newton’s physical system in preference to Descartes’, Newton’s system itself depends on Descartes’ earlier work, a dependence to which Newton himself attests.

Cartesian philosophy also ignites various controversies in the latter decades of the seventeenth century that provide the context of intellectual tumult out of which the Enlightenment springs. Among these controversies are the following: Are mind and body really two distinct sorts of substances, and if so, what is the nature of each, and how are they related to each other, both in the human being (which presumably “has” both a mind and a body) and in a unified world system? If matter is inert (as Descartes claims), what can be the source of motion and the nature of causality in the physical world? And of course the various epistemological problems: the problem of objectivity, the role of God in securing our knowledge, the doctrine of innate ideas, and others.

Baruch Spinoza’s systematic rationalist metaphysics, which he develops in his Ethics (1677) in part in response to problems in the Cartesian system, is also an important basis for Enlightenment thought. Spinoza develops, in contrast to Cartesian dualism, an ontological monism according to which there is only one substance, God or nature, with two attributes, corresponding to mind and body. Spinoza’s denial, on the basis of strict philosophical reasoning, of the existence of a transcendent supreme being, his identification of God with nature, gives strong impetus to the strands of atheism and naturalism that thread through Enlightenment philosophy. Spinoza’s rationalist principles also lead him to assert a strict determinism and to deny any role to final causes or teleology in explanation. (See Israel 2001.)

The rationalist metaphysics of Leibniz (1646–1716) is also foundational for the Enlightenment, particularly the German Enlightenment (die Aufklärung), one prominent expression of which is the Leibnizian rationalist system of Christian Wolff (1679–1754). Leibniz articulates, and places at the head of metaphysics, the great rationalist principle, the principle of sufficient reason, which states that everything that exists has a sufficient reason for its existence. This principle exemplifies the characteristic conviction of the Enlightenment that the universe is thoroughly rationally intelligible. The question arises of how this principle itself can be known or grounded. Wolff attempts to derive it from the logical principle of non-contradiction (in his First Philosophy or Ontology, 1730). Criticism of this alleged derivation gives rise to the general question of how formal principles of logic can possibly serve to ground substantive knowledge of reality. Whereas Leibniz exerts his influence through scattered writings on various topics, some of which elaborate plans for a systematic metaphysics which are never executed by Leibniz himself, Wolff exerts his influence on the German Enlightenment through his development of a rationalist system of knowledge in which he attempts to demonstrate all the propositions of science from first principles, known a priori.

Wolff’s rationalist metaphysics is characteristic of the Enlightenment by virtue of the pretensions of human reason within it, not by reason’s success in establishing its claims. Much the same could be said of the great rationalist philosophers of the seventeenth century. Through their articulation of the ideal of scientia, of a complete science of reality, composed of propositions derived demonstratively from a priori first principles, these philosophers exert great influence on the Enlightenment. But they fail, rather spectacularly, to realize this ideal. To the contrary, what they bequeath to the eighteenth century is metaphysics, in the words of Kant, as “a battlefield of endless controversies.” However, the controversies themselves – regarding the nature of God, mind, matter, substance, cause, et cetera, and the relations of each of these to the others – provide tremendous fuel to Enlightenment thought.

1.2 Empiricism and the Enlightenment

Despite the confidence in and enthusiasm for human reason in the Enlightenment – it is sometimes called “the Age of Reason” – the rise of empiricism, both in the practice of science and in the theory of knowledge, is characteristic of the period. The enthusiasm for reason in the Enlightenment is primarily not for the faculty of reason as an independent source of knowledge, which is embattled in the period, but rather for the human cognitive faculties generally; the Age of Reason contrasts with an age of religious faith, not with an age of sense experience. Though the great seventeenth century rationalist metaphysical systems of Descartes, Spinoza and Leibniz exert tremendous influence on philosophy in the Enlightenment; moreover, and though the eighteenth-century Enlightenment has a rationalist strain (perhaps best exemplified by the system of Christian Wolff), nevertheless, that the Encyclopedia of Diderot and D’Alembert is dedicated to three empiricists (Francis Bacon, John Locke and Isaac Newton), signals the ascendency of empiricism in the period.

If the founder of the rationalist strain of the Enlightenment is Descartes, then the founder of the empiricist strain is Francis Bacon (1561–1626). Though Bacon’s work belongs to the Renaissance, the revolution he undertook to effect in the sciences inspires and influences Enlightenment thinkers. The Enlightenment, as the age in which experimental natural science matures and comes into its own, admires Bacon as “the father of experimental philosophy.” Bacon’s revolution (enacted in, among other works, The New Organon, 1620) involves conceiving the new science as (1) founded on empirical observation and experimentation; (2) arrived at through the method of induction; and (3) as ultimately aiming at, and as confirmed by, enhanced practical capacities (hence the Baconian motto, “knowledge is power”).

Of these elements of Bacon’s revolution, the point about method deserves special emphasis. Isaac Newton’s work, which stands as the great exemplar of the accomplishments of natural science for the eighteenth century, is, like Bacon’s, based on the inductive method. Whereas rationalist of the seventeenth century tend to conceive of scientific knowledge of nature as consisting in a system in which statements expressing the observable phenomena of nature are deduced from first principles, known a priori, Newton’s method begins with the observed phenomena of nature and reduces its multiplicity to unity by induction, that is, by finding mathematical laws or principles from which the observed phenomena can be derived or explained. The evident success of Newton’s “bottom-up” procedure contrasts sharply with the seemingly endless and fruitless conflicts among philosophers regarding the meaning and validity of first principles of reason, and this contrast naturally favors the rise of the Newtonian (or Baconian) method of acquiring knowledge of nature in the eighteenth century.

The tendency of natural science toward progressive independence from metaphysics in the eighteenth century is correlated with this point about method. The rise of modern science in the sixteenth and seventeenth centuries proceeds through its separation from the presuppositions, doctrines and methodology of theology; natural science in the eighteenth century proceeds to separate itself from metaphysics as well. Newton proves the capacity of natural science to succeed independently of a priori, clear and certain first principles. The characteristic Enlightenment suspicion of all allegedly authoritative claims the validity of which is obscure, which is directed first of all against religious dogmas, extends to the claims of metaphysics as well. While there are significant Enlightenment thinkers who are metaphysicians – again, one thinks of Christian Wolff – the general thrust of Enlightenment thought is anti-metaphysical.

John Locke’s Essay Concerning Human Understanding (1690) is another foundational text of the Enlightenment. A main source of its influence is the epistemological rigor that it displays, which is at least implicitly anti-metaphysical. Locke undertakes in this work to examine the human understanding in order to determine the limits of human knowledge; he thereby institutes a prominent pattern of Enlightenment epistemology. Locke finds the source of all our ideas, the ideas out of which human knowledge is constructed, in the senses and argues influentially against the rationalists’ doctrine of innate ideas. Locke’s sensationalism exerts great influence in the French Enlightenment, primarily through being taken up and radicalized by the philosophe, Abbé de Condillac. In the Treatise on Sensations (1754), Condillac attempts to explain how all human knowledge arises out of sense experience. Locke’s epistemology, as developed by Condillac and others, contributes greatly to the emerging science of psychology in the period.

Locke and Descartes both pursue a method in epistemology that brings with it the epistemological problem of objectivity. Both examine our knowledge by way of examining the ideas we encounter directly in our consciousness. This method comes to be called “the way of ideas”. Though neither for Locke nor for Descartes do all of our ideas represent their objects by way of resembling them (e.g., our idea of God does not represent God by virtue of resembling God), our alleged knowledge of our environment through the senses does depend largely on ideas that allegedly resemble external material objects. The way of ideas implies the epistemological problem of how we can know that these ideas do in fact resemble their objects. How can we be sure that these objects do not appear one way before the mind and exist in another way (or not at all) in reality outside the mind? George Berkeley, an empiricist philosopher influenced by John Locke, avoids the problem by asserting the metaphysics of idealism: the (apparently material) objects of perception are nothing but ideas before the mind. However, Berkeley’s idealism is less influential in, and characteristic of, the Enlightenment, than the opposing positions of materialism and Cartesian dualism. Thomas Reid, a prominent member of the Scottish Enlightenment, attacks the way of ideas and argues that the immediate objects of our (sense) perception are the common (material) objects in our environment, not ideas in our mind. Reid mounts his defense of naïve realism as a defense of common sense over against the doctrines of the philosophers. The defense of common sense, and the related idea that the results of philosophy ought to be of use to common people, are characteristic ideas of the Enlightenment, particularly pronounced in the Scottish Enlightenment.

1.3 Skepticism in the Enlightenment

Skepticism enjoys a remarkably strong place in Enlightenment philosophy, given that confidence in our intellectual capacities to achieve systematic knowledge of nature is a leading characteristic of the age. This oddity is at least softened by the point that much skepticism in the Enlightenment is merely methodological, a tool meant to serve science, rather than a position embraced on its own account. The instrumental role for skepticism is exemplified prominently in Descartes’ Meditations on First Philosophy (1641), in which Descartes employs radical skeptical doubt to attack prejudices derived from learning and from sense experience and to search out principles known with certainty which may serve as a secure foundation for a new system of knowledge. Given the negative, critical, suspicious attitude of the Enlightenment towards doctrines traditionally regarded as well founded, it is not surprising that Enlightenment thinkers employ skeptical tropes (drawn from the ancient skeptical tradition) to attack traditional dogmas in science, metaphysics and religion.

However, skepticism is not merely a methodological tool in the hands of Enlightenment thinkers. The skeptical cast of mind is one prominent manifestation of the Enlightenment spirit. The influence of Pierre Bayle, another founding figure of the Enlightenment, testifies to this. Bayle was a French Protestant, who, like many European philosophers of his time, was forced to live and work in politically liberal and tolerant Holland in order to avoid censorship and prison. Bayle’s Historical and Critical Dictionary (1697), a strange and wonderful book, exerts great influence on the age. The form of the book is intimidating: a biographical dictionary, with long scholarly entries on obscure figures in the history of culture, interrupted by long scholarly footnotes, which are in turn interrupted by further footnotes. Rarely has a work with such intimidating scholarly pretentions exerted such radical and liberating influence in the culture. It exerts this influence through its skeptical questioning of religious, metaphysical, and scientific dogmas. Bayle’s eclecticism and his tendency to follow arguments without pre-arranging their conclusions make it difficult to categorize his thought. It is the attitude of inquiry that Bayle displays, rather than any doctrine he espouses, that mark his as distinctively Enlightenment thought. He is fearless and presumptuous in questioning all manner of dogma. His attitude of inquiry resembles both that of Descartes’ meditator and that of the person undergoing enlightenment as Kant defines it, the attitude of coming to think for oneself, of daring to know. This epistemological attitude, as manifest in distrust of authority and reliance on one’s own capacity to judge, expresses the Enlightenment values of individualism and self-determination.

This skeptical/critical attitude underlies a significant tension in the age. While it is common to conceive of the Enlightenment as supplanting the authority of tradition and religious dogma with the authority of reason, in fact the Enlightenment is characterized by a crisis of authority regarding any belief. This is perhaps best illustrated with reference to David Hume’s skepticism, as developed in Book One of A Treatise of Human Nature (1739–40) and in his later Enquiries Concerning Human Understanding (1748). While one might take Hume’s skepticism to imply that he is an outlier with respect to the Enlightenment, it is more convincing to see Hume’s skepticism as a flowering of a crisis regarding authority in belief that is internal to the Enlightenment. Hume articulates a variety of skepticisms. His “skepticism with regard to the senses” is structured by the epistemological problem bound up with the way of ideas, described above. Hume also articulates skepticism with regard to reason in an argument that is anticipated by Bayle. Hume begins this argument by noting that, though rules or principles in demonstrative sciences are certain or infallible, given the fallibility of our faculties, our applications of such rules or principles in demonstrative inferences yield conclusions that cannot be regarded as certain or infallible. On reflection, our conviction in the conclusions of demonstrative reasoning must be qualified by an assessment of the likelihood that we made a mistake in our reasoning. Thus, Hume writes, “all knowledge degenerates into probability” (Treatise, I.iv.i). Hume argues further that, given this degeneration, for any judgment, our assessment of the likelihood that we made a mistake, and the corresponding diminution of certainty in the conclusion, is another judgment about which we ought make a further assessment, which leads to a further diminution of certainty in our original conclusion, leading “at last [to] a total extinction of belief and evidence”. Hume also famously questions the justification of inductive reasoning and causal reasoning. According to Hume’s argument, since in causal reasoning we take our past observations to serve as evidence for judgments regarding what will happen in relevantly similar circumstances in the future, causal reasoning depends on the assumption that the future course of nature will resemble the past; and there is no non-circular justification of this essential assumption. Hume concludes that we have no rational justification for our causal or inductive judgments. Hume’s skeptical arguments regarding causal reasoning are more radical than his skeptical questioning of reason as such, insofar as they call into question even experience itself as a ground for knowledge and implicitly challenge the credentials of Newtonian science itself, the very pride of the Enlightenment. The question implicitly raised by Hume’s powerful skeptical arguments is whether any epistemological authority at all can withstand critical scrutiny. The Enlightenment begins by unleashing skepticism in attacking limited, circumscribed targets, but once the skeptical genie is out of the bottle, it becomes difficult to maintain conviction in any authority. Thus, the despairing attitude that Hume famously expresses in the conclusion to Book One of the Treatise, as the consequence of his epistemological inquiry, while it clashes with the self-confident and optimistic attitude we associate with the Enlightenment, in fact reflects an essential possibility in a distinctive Enlightenment problematic regarding authority in belief.

1.4 Science of Man and Subjectivism in the Enlightenment

Though Hume finds himself struggling with skepticism in the conclusion of Book One of the Treatise, the project of the work as he outlines it is not to advance a skeptical viewpoint, but to establish a science of the mind. Hume is one of many Enlightenment thinkers who aspire to be the “Newton of the mind”; he aspires to establish the basic laws that govern the elements of the human mind in its operations. Alexander Pope’s famous couplet in An Essay on Man (1733) (“Know then thyself, presume not God to scan/ The proper study of mankind is man”) expresses well the intense interest humanity gains in itself within the context of the Enlightenment, as a partial substitute for its traditional interest in God and the transcendent domain. Just as the sun replaces the earth as the center of our cosmos in Copernicus’ cosmological system, so humanity itself replaces God at the center of humanity’s consciousness in the Enlightenment. Given the Enlightenment’s passion for science, the self-directed attention naturally takes the form of the rise of the scientific study of humanity in the period.

The enthusiasm for the scientific study of humanity in the period incorporates a tension or paradox concerning the place of humanity in the cosmos, as the cosmos is re-conceived in the context of Enlightenment philosophy and science. Newton’s success early in the Enlightenment of subsuming the phenomena of nature under universal laws of motion, expressed in simple mathematical formulae, encourages the conception of nature as a very complicated machine, whose parts are material and whose motions and properties are fully accounted for by deterministic causal laws. But if our conception of nature is of an exclusively material domain governed by deterministic, mechanical laws, and if we at the same time deny the place of the supernatural in the cosmos, then how does humanity itself fit into the cosmos? On the one hand, the achievements of the natural sciences in general are the great pride of the Enlightenment, manifesting the excellence of distinctively human capacities. The pride and self-assertiveness of humanity in the Enlightenment expresses itself, among other ways, in humanity’s making the study of itself its central concern. On the other hand, the study of humanity in the Enlightenment typically yields a portrait of us that is the opposite of flattering or elevating. Instead of being represented as occupying a privileged place in nature, as made in the image of God, humanity is represented typically in the Enlightenment as a fully natural creature, devoid of free will, of an immortal soul, and of a non-natural faculty of intelligence or reason. The very title of J.O. de La Mettrie’s Man a Machine (1748), for example, seems designed to deflate humanity’s self-conception, and in this respect it is characteristic of the Enlightenment “science of man”. It is true of a number of works of the Enlightenment, perhaps especially works in the more radical French Enlightenment – notable here are Helvétius’s Of the Spirit (1758) and Baron d’Holbach’s System of Nature (1770) – that they at once express the remarkable self-assertiveness of humanity characteristic of the Enlightenment in their scientific aspirations while at the same time painting a portrait of humanity that dramatically deflates its traditional self-image as occupying a privileged position in nature.

The methodology of epistemology in the period reflects a similar tension. Given the epistemological role of Descartes’ famous “cogito, ergo sum” in his system of knowledge, one might see Descartes’ epistemology as already marking the transition from an epistemology privileging knowledge of God to one that privileges self-knowledge instead. However, in Descartes’ epistemology, it remains true that knowledge of God serves as the necessary foundation for all human knowledge. Hume’s Treatise displays such a re-orientation less ambiguously. As noted, Hume means his work to comprise a science of the mind or of man. In the Introduction, Hume describes the science of man as effectively a foundation for all the sciences since all sciences “lie under the cognizance of men, and are judged of by their powers and faculties.” In other words, since all science is human knowledge, scientific knowledge of humanity is the foundation of the sciences. Hume’s placing the science of man at the foundation of all the sciences both exemplifies the privilege afforded to “mankind’s study of man” within the Enlightenment and provides an interpretation of it. But Hume’s methodological privileging of humanity in the system of sciences contrasts sharply with what he says in the body of his science about humanity. In Hume’s science of man, reason as a faculty of knowledge is skeptically attacked and marginalized; reason is attributed to other animals as well; belief is shown to be grounded in custom and habit; and free will is denied. So, even as knowledge of humanity supplants knowledge of God as the keystone of the system of knowledge, the scientific perspective on humanity starkly challenges humankind’s self-conception as occupying a privileged position in the order of nature.

Immanuel Kant explicitly enacts a revolution in epistemology modeled on the Copernican in astronomy. As characteristic of Enlightenment epistemology, Kant, in his Critique of Pure Reason (1781, second edition 1787) undertakes both to determine the limits of our knowledge, and at the same time to provide a foundation of scientific knowledge of nature, and he attempts to do this by examining our human faculties of knowledge critically. Even as he draws strict limits to rational knowledge, he attempts to defend reason as a faculty of knowledge, as playing a necessary role in natural science, in the face of skeptical challenges that reason faces in the period. According to Kant, scientific knowledge of nature is not merely knowledge of what in fact happens in nature, but knowledge of the causal laws of nature according to which what in fact happens must happen. But how is knowledge of necessary causal connection in nature possible? Hume’s investigation of the idea of cause had made clear that we cannot know causal necessity through experience; experience teaches us at most what in fact happens, not what must happen. In addition, Kant’s own earlier critique of principles of rationalism had convinced him that the principles of (“general”) logic also cannot justify knowledge of real necessary connections (in nature); the formal principle of non-contradiction can ground at best the deduction of one proposition from another, but not the claim that one property or event must follow from another in the course of nature. The generalized epistemological problem Kant addresses in the Critique of Pure Reason is: how is science possible (including natural science, mathematics, metaphysics), given that all such knowledge must be (or include) knowledge of real, substantive (not merely logical or formal) necessities. Put in the terms Kant defines, the problem is: how is synthetic, a priori knowledge possible?

According to Kant’s Copernican Revolution in epistemology addressed to this problem, objects must conform themselves to human knowledge rather than knowledge to objects. Certain cognitive forms lie ready in the human mind – prominent examples are the pure concepts of substance and cause and the forms of intuition, space and time; given sensible representations must conform themselves to these forms in order for human experience (as empirical knowledge of nature) to be possible at all. We can acquire scientific knowledge of nature because we constitute it a priori according to certain cognitive forms; for example, we can know nature as a causally ordered domain because we originally synthesize a priori the given manifold of sensibility according to the category of causality, which has its source in the human mind.

Kant saves rational knowledge of nature by limiting rational knowledge to nature. According to Kant’s argument, we can have rational knowledge only of the domain of possible experience, not of supersensible objects such as God and the soul. Moreover Kant’s solution brings with it a kind of idealism: given the mind’s role in constituting objects of experience, we know objects only as appearances, only as they appear according to our faculties, not as they are in themselves. This is the subjectivism of Kant’s epistemology. Kant’s epistemology exemplifies Enlightenment thought by replacing the theocentric conception of knowledge of the rationalist tradition with an anthropocentric conception.

However, Kant means his system to make room for humanity’s practical and religious aspirations toward the transcendent as well. According to Kant’s idealism, the realm of nature is limited to a realm of appearances, and we can intelligibly think supersensible objects such as God, freedom and the soul, though we cannot know them. Through the postulation of a realm of unknowable noumena (things in themselves) over against the realm of nature as a realm of appearances, Kant manages to make place for practical concepts that are central to our understanding of ourselves even while grounding our scientific knowledge of nature as a domain governed by deterministic causal laws. Though Kant’s idealism is highly controversial from its initial publication, a main point in its favor, according to Kant himself, is that it reconciles, in a single coherent tension, the main tension between the Enlightenment’s conception of nature, as ordered according to deterministic causal laws, and the Enlightenment’s conception of ourselves, as morally free, as having dignity, and as perfectible.

1.5 Emerging Sciences and the Encyclopedia

The commitment to careful observation and description of phenomena as the starting point of science, and then the success at explaining and accounting for observed phenomena through the method of induction, naturally leads to the development of new sciences for new domains in the Enlightenment. Many of the human and social sciences have their origins in the eighteenth century (e.g., history, anthropology, aesthetics, psychology, economics, even sociology), though most are only formally established as autonomous disciplines later. The emergence of new sciences is aided by the development of new scientific tools, such as models for probabilistic reasoning, a kind of reasoning that gains new respect and application in the period. Despite the multiplication of sciences in the period, the ideal remains to comprehend the diversity of our scientific knowledge as a unified system of science; however, this ideal of unity is generally taken as regulative, as an ideal to emerge in the ever-receding end-state of science, rather than as enforced from the beginning by regimenting science under a priori principles.

As exemplifying these and other tendencies of the Enlightenment, one work deserves special mention: the Encyclopedia, edited by Denis Diderot and Jean La Rond d’Alembert. The Encyclopedia (subtitled: “systematic dictionary of the sciences, arts and crafts”) was published in 28 volumes (17 of text, 11 of plates) over 21 years (1751–1772), and consists of over 70,000 articles, contributed by over 140 contributors, among them many of the luminaries of the French Enlightenment. The work aims to provide a compendium of existing human knowledge to be transmitted to subsequent generations, a transmission intended to contribute to the progress and dissemination of human knowledge and to a positive transformation of human society. The orientation of the Encyclopedia is decidedly secular and implicitly anti-authoritarian. Accordingly, the French state of the ancien régime censors the project, and it is completed only through the persistence of Diderot. The collaborative nature of the project, especially in the context of state opposition, contributes significantly to the formation of a shared sense of purpose among the wide variety of intellectuals who belong to the French Enlightenment. The knowledge contained in the Encyclopedia is self-consciously social both in its production – insofar as it is immediately the product of what the title page calls “a society of men of letters” – and in its address – insofar as it is primarily meant as an instrument for the education and improvement of society. It is a striking feature of the Encyclopedia, and one by virtue of which it exemplifies the Baconian conception of science characteristic of the period, that its entries cover the whole range and scope of knowledge, from the most abstract theoretical to the most practical, mechanical and technical.

2. The Good: Political Theory, Ethical Theory and Religion in the Enlightenment

2.1 Political Theory

The Enlightenment is most identified with its political accomplishments. The era is marked by three political revolutions, which together lay the basis for modern, republican, constitutional democracies: The English Revolution (1688), the American Revolution (1775–83), and the French Revolution (1789–99). The success at explaining and understanding the natural world encourages the Enlightenment project of re-making the social/political world, in accord with the models we allegedly find in our reason. Enlightenment philosophers find that the existing social and political orders do not withstand critical scrutiny. Existing political and social authority is shrouded in religious myth and mystery and founded on obscure traditions. The criticism of existing institutions is supplemented with the positive work of constructing in theory the model of institutions as they ought to be. We owe to this period the basic model of government founded upon the consent of the governed; the articulation of the political ideals of freedom and equality and the theory of their institutional realization; the articulation of a list of basic individual human rights to be respected and realized by any legitimate political system; the articulation and promotion of toleration of religious diversity as a virtue to be respected in a well ordered society; the conception of the basic political powers as organized in a system of checks and balances; and other now-familiar features of western democracies. However, for all the enduring accomplishments of Enlightenment political philosophy, it is not clear that human reason proves powerful enough to put a concrete, positive authoritative ideal in place of the objects of its criticism. As in the epistemological domain, reason shows its power more convincingly in criticizing authorities than in establishing them. Here too the question of the limits of reason is one of the main philosophical legacies of the period. These limits are arguably vividly illustrated by the course of the French Revolution. The explicit ideals of the French Revolution are the Enlightenment ideals of individual freedom and equality; but, as the revolutionaries attempt to devise rational, secular institutions to put in place of those they have violently overthrown, eventually they have recourse to violence and terror in order to control and govern the people. The devolution of the French Revolution into the Reign of Terror is perceived by many as proving the emptiness and hypocrisy of Enlightenment reason, and is one of the main factors which account for the end of the Enlightenment as an historical period.

The political revolutions of the Enlightenment, especially the French and the American, were informed and guided to a significant extent by prior political philosophy in the period. Though Thomas Hobbes, in his Leviathan (1651), defends the absolute power of the political sovereign, and is to that extent opposed to the revolutionaries and reformers in England, this work is a founding work of Enlightenment political theory. Hobbes’ work originates the modern social contract theory, which incorporates Enlightenment conceptions of the relation of the individual to the state. According to the general social contract model, political authority is grounded in an agreement (often understood as ideal, rather than real) among individuals, each of whom aims in this agreement to advance his rational self-interest by establishing a common political authority over all. Thus, according to the general contract model (though this is more clear in later contract theorists such as Locke and Rousseau than in Hobbes himself), political authority is grounded not in conquest, natural or divinely instituted hierarchy, or in obscure myths and traditions, but rather in the rational consent of the governed. In initiating this model, Hobbes takes a naturalistic, scientific approach to the question of how political society ought to be organized (against the background of a clear-eyed, unsentimental conception of human nature), and thus decisively influences the Enlightenment process of secularization and rationalization in political and social philosophy.

Baruch Spinoza also greatly contributes to the development of Enlightenment political philosophy in its early years. The metaphysical doctrines of the Ethics (1677) lay the groundwork for his influence on the age. Spinoza’s arguments against Cartesian dualism and in favor of substance monism, the claim in particular that there can only be one substance, God or nature, was taken to have radical implications in the domains of politics, ethics and religion throughout the period. Spinoza’s employment of philosophical reason leads to the denial of the existence of a transcendent, creator, providential, law-giving God; this establishes the opposition between the teachings of philosophy, on the one hand, and the traditional orienting practical beliefs (moral, religious, political) of the people, on the other hand, an opposition that is one important aspect of the culture of the Enlightenment. In his main political work, Tractatus Theologico-Politicus (1677), Spinoza, building on his rationalist naturalism, opposes superstition, argues for toleration and the subordination of religion to the state, and pronounces in favor of qualified democracy. Liberalism is perhaps the most characteristic political philosophy of the Enlightenment, and Spinoza, in this text primarily, is one of its originators.

However, John Locke’s Second Treatise of Government (1690) is the classical source of modern liberal political theory. In his First Treatise of Government, Locke attacks Robert Filmer’s Patriarcha (1680), which epitomizes the sort of political theory the Enlightenment opposes. Filmer defends the right of kings to exercise absolute authority over their subjects on the basis of the claim that they inherit the authority God vested in Adam at creation. Though Locke’s assertion of the natural freedom and equality of human beings in the Second Treatise is starkly and explicitly opposed to Filmer’s view, it is striking that the cosmology underlying Locke’s assertions is closer to Filmer’s than to Spinoza’s. According to Locke, in order to understand the nature and source of legitimate political authority, we have to understand our relations in the state of nature. Drawing upon the natural law tradition, Locke argues that it is evident to our natural reason that we are all absolutely subject to our Lord and Creator, but that, in relation to each other, we exist naturally in a state of equality “wherein all the power and jurisdiction is reciprocal, no one having more than another” (Second Treatise, §4). We also exist naturally in a condition of freedom, insofar as we may do with ourselves and our possessions as we please, within the constraints of the fundamental law of nature. The law of nature “teaches all mankind … that, being all equal and independent, no one ought to harm another in his life, health, liberty, or possessions” (§6). That we are governed in our natural condition by such a substantive moral law, legislated by God and known to us through our natural reason, implies that the state of nature is not Hobbes’ war of all against all. However, since there is lacking any human authority over all to judge of disputes and enforce the law, it is a condition marred by “inconveniencies”, in which possession of natural freedom, equality and possessions is insecure. According to Locke, we rationally quit this natural condition by contracting together to set over ourselves a political authority, charged with promulgating and enforcing a single, clear set of laws, for the sake of guaranteeing our natural rights, liberties and possessions. The civil, political law, founded ultimately upon the consent of the governed, does not cancel the natural law, according to Locke, but merely serves to draw that law closer. “[T]he law of nature stands as an eternal rule to all men” (§135). Consequently, when established political power violates that law, the people are justified in overthrowing it. Locke’s argument for the right to revolt against a government that opposes the purposes for which legitimate government is taken by some to justify the political revolution in the context of which he writes (the English revolution) and, almost a hundred years later, by others to justify the American revolution as well.

Though Locke’s liberalism has been tremendously influential, his political theory is founded on doctrines of natural law and religion that are not nearly as evident as Locke assumes. Locke’s reliance on the natural law tradition is typical of Enlightenment political and moral theory. According to the natural law tradition, as the Enlightenment makes use of it, we can know through the use of our unaided reason that we all – all human beings, universally – stand in particular moral relations to each other. The claim that we can apprehend through our unaided reason a universal moral order exactly because moral qualities and relations (in particular human freedom and equality) belong to the nature of things, is attractive in the Enlightenment for obvious reasons. However, as noted above, the scientific apprehension of nature in the period does not support, and in fact opposes, the claim that the alleged moral qualities and relations (or, indeed, that any moral qualities and relations) are natural. According to a common Enlightenment assumption, as humankind clarifies the laws of nature through the advance of natural science and philosophy, the true moral and political order will be revealed with it. This view is expressed explicitly by the philosophe Marquis de Condorcet, in his Sketch for a Historical Picture of the Progress of the Human Mind (published posthumously in 1795 and which, perhaps better than any other work, lays out the paradigmatically Enlightenment view of history of the human race as a continual progress to perfection). But, in fact, advance in knowledge of the laws of nature in the science of the period does not help with discernment of a natural political or moral order. This asserted relationship between natural scientific knowledge and the political and moral order is under great stress already in the Enlightenment. With respect to Lockean liberalism, though his assertion of the moral and political claims (natural freedom, equality, et cetera) continues to have considerable force for us, the grounding of these claims in a religious cosmology does not. The question of how to ground our claims to natural freedom and equality is one of the main philosophical legacies of the Enlightenment.

The rise and development of liberalism in Enlightenment political thought has many relations with the rise of the mercantile class (the bourgeoisie) and the development of what comes to be called “civil society”, the society characterized by work and trade in pursuit of private property. Locke’s Second Treatise contributes greatly to the project of articulating a political philosophy to serve the interests and values of this ascending class. Locke claims that the end or purpose of political society is the preservation and protection of property (though he defines property broadly to include not only external property but life and liberties as well). According to Locke’s famous account, persons acquire rightful ownership in external things that are originally given to us all by God as a common inheritance, independently of the state and prior to its involvement, insofar as we “mix our labor with them”. The civil freedom that Locke defines, as something protected by the force of political laws, comes increasingly to be interpreted as the freedom to trade, to exchange without the interference of governmental regulation. Within the context of the Enlightenment, economic freedom is a salient interpretation of the individual freedom highly valued in the period. Adam Smith, a prominent member of the Scottish Enlightenment, describes in his An Inquiry into the Nature and Causes of the Wealth of Nations (1776) some of the laws of civil society, as a sphere distinct from political society as such, and thus contributes significantly to the founding of political economy (later called merely “economics”). His is one of many voices in the Enlightenment advocating for free trade and for minimal government regulation of markets. The trading house floor, in which people of various nationalities, languages, cultures, religions come together and trade, each in pursuit of his own self-interest, but, through this pursuit, supplying the wants of their respective nations and increasing its wealth, represents for some Enlightenment thinkers the benign, peaceful, universal rational order that they wish to see replace the violent, confessional strife that characterized the then-recent past of Europe.

However, the liberal conception of the government as properly protecting economic freedom of citizens and private property comes into conflict in the Enlightenment with the value of democracy. James Madison confronts this tension in the context of arguing for the adoption of the U.S. Constitution (in his Federalist #10). Madison argues that popular government (pure democracy) is subject to the evil of factions; in a pure democracy, a majority bound together by a private interest, relative to the whole, has the capacity to impose its particular will on the whole. The example most on Madison’s mind is that those without property (the many) may seek to bring about governmental re-distribution of the property of the propertied class (the few), perhaps in the name of that other Enlightenment ideal, equality. If, as in Locke’s theory, the government’s protection of an individual’s freedom is encompassed within the general end of protecting a person’s property, then, as Madison argues, the proper form of the government cannot be pure democracy, and the will of the people must be officially determined in some other way than by directly polling the people.

Jean-Jacques Rousseau’s political theory, as presented in his On the Social Contract (1762), presents a contrast to the Lockean liberal model. Though commitment to the political ideals of freedom and equality constitutes a common ground for Enlightenment political philosophy, it is not clear not only how these values have a home in nature as Enlightenment science re-conceives it, but also how concretely to interpret each of these ideals and how properly to balance them against each other. Contrary to Madison, Rousseau argues that direct (pure) democracy is the only form of government in which human freedom can be realized. Human freedom, according to Rousseau’s interpretation, is possible only through governance according to what he calls “the general will,” which is the will of the body politic, formed through the original contract, concretely determined in an assembly in which all citizens participate. Rousseau’s account intends to avert the evils of factions by structural elements of the original contract. The contract consists in the self-alienation by each associate of all rights and possessions to the body politic. Because each alienates all, each is an equal member of the body politic, and the terms and conditions are the same for all. The emergence of factions is avoided insofar as the good of each citizen is, and is understood to be, equally (because wholly) dependent on the general will. Legislation supports this identification with the general will by preserving the original equality established in the contract, prominently through maintaining a measure of economic equality. Rousseau’s account of the ideal relation of the individual citizen to the state differs from Locke’s; in Rousseau’s account, the individual must be actively engaged in political life in order to maintain the identification of his supremely authoritative will with the general will, whereas in Locke the emphasis is on the limits of governmental authority with respect to the expressions of the individual will. Though Locke’s liberal model is more representative of the Enlightenment in general, Rousseau’s political theory, which in some respects presents a revived classical model modified within the context of Enlightenment values, in effect poses many of the enduring questions regarding the meaning and interpretation of political freedom and equality within the modern state.

Both Madison and Rousseau, like most political thinkers of the period, are influenced by Baron de Montesquieu’s The Spirit of the Laws (1748), which is one of the founding texts of modern political theory. Though Montesquieu’s treatise belongs to the tradition of liberalism in political theory, given his scientific approach to social, legal and political systems, his influence extends beyond this tradition. Montesquieu argues that the system of legislation for a people varies appropriately with the particular circumstances of the people. He provides specific analysis of how climate, fertility of the soil, population size, et cetera, affect legislation. He famously distinguishes three main forms of governments: republics (which can either be democratic or aristocratic), monarchies and despotisms. He describes leading characteristics of each. His argument that functional democracies require the population to possess civic virtue in high measure, a virtue that consists in valuing public good above private interest, influences later Enlightenment theorists, including both Rousseau and Madison. He describes the threat of factions to which Madison and Rousseau respond in different (indeed opposite) ways. He provides the basic structure and justification for the balance of political powers that Madison later incorporates into the U.S. Constitution.

It is striking how unenlightened many of the Enlightenment’s celebrated thinkers are concerning issues of race and of gender (regarding race, see Race and Enlightenment: A Reader, edited by Emmanuel Chukwudi Eze). For all the public concern with the allegedly universal “rights of man” in the Enlightenment, the rights of women and of non-white people are generally overlooked in the period. (Mary Wollstonecraft’s Vindication of the Rights of Woman (1792) is a noteworthy exception.) When Enlightenment thinkers do turn their attention to the social standing of women or of non-white people, they tend to spout unreasoned prejudice. Moreover, while the philosophies of the Enlightenment generally aspire or pretend to universal truth, unattached to particular time, place or culture, Enlightenment writings are rife with rank ethno- and Eurocentrism, often explicit.

In the face of such tensions within the Enlightenment, one response is to affirm the power of the Enlightenment to improve humanity and society long beyond the end of the eighteenth century, indeed, down to the present day and into the future. This response embraces the Enlightenment and interprets more recent emancipation movements and achievement of recognition of the rights and dignity of traditionally oppressed and marginalized groups as expressions of Enlightenment ideals and aspirations. Critics of the Enlightenment respond differently to such tensions. Critics see them as symptoms of disorder, ideology, perversity, futility or falsehood that afflict the very core of the Enlightenment itself. (See James Schmidt’s “What Enlightenment Project?” for discussion of critics of the Enlightenment.) Famously, Adorno and Horkheimer interpret Nazi death camps as the result of “the dialectic of the Enlightenment”, as what historically becomes of the supremacy of instrumental reason asserted in the Enlightenment. As another example, we may point to some post-modern feminists, who argue, in opposition to the liberal feminists who embrace broadly Enlightenment ideals and conceptions, that the essentialism and universalism associated with Enlightenment ideals are both false and intrinsically hostile to the aspirations to self-realization of women and of other traditionally oppressed groups. (See Strickland and the essays in Akkerman and Stuurman.) This entry is not the place to delineate strains of opposition to the Enlightenment, but it is worth noting that post-Enlightenment social and political struggles to achieve equality or recognition for traditionally marginalized or oppressed groups are sometimes self-consciously grounded in the Enlightenment and sometimes marked by explicit opposition to the Enlightenment’s conceptions or presuppositions.

2.2 Ethical Theory

Many of the leading issues and positions of contemporary philosophical ethics take shape within the Enlightenment. Prior to the Enlightenment in the West, ethical reflection begins from and orients itself around religious doctrines concerning God and the afterlife. The highest good of humanity, and, accordingly, the content and grounding of moral duties, are conceived in immediately religious terms. During the Enlightenment, this changes, certainly within philosophy, but to some significant degree, within the population of western society at large. As the processes of industrialization, urbanization, and dissemination of education advance in this period, happiness in this life, rather than union with God in the next, becomes the highest end for more and more people. Also, the violent religious wars that bloody Europe in the early modern period motivate the development of secular, this-worldly ethics, insofar as they indicate the failure of religious doctrines concerning God and the afterlife to establish a stable foundation for ethics. In the Enlightenment, philosophical thinkers confront the problem of developing ethical systems on a secular, broadly naturalistic basis for the first time since the rise of Christianity eclipsed the great classical ethical systems. However, the changes in our understanding of nature and cosmology, effected by modern natural science, make recourse to the systems of Plato and Aristotle problematic. The Platonic identification of the good with the real and the Aristotelian teleological understanding of natural things are both difficult to square with the Enlightenment conception of nature. The general philosophical problem emerges in the Enlightenment of how to understand the source and grounding of ethical duties, and how to conceive the highest good for human beings, within a secular, broadly naturalistic context, and within the context of a transformed understanding of the natural world.

In ethical thought, as in political theory, Hobbes’ thought is an important provocation in the Enlightenment. Hobbes understands what is good, as the end of human action, to be “whatsoever is the object of any man’s appetite or desire,” and evil to be “the object of his hate, and aversion,” “there being nothing simply and absolutely so; nor any common rule of good and evil, to be taken from the nature of the objects themselves” (Leviathan, chapter 6). Hobbes’ conception of human beings as fundamentally motivated by their perception of what is in their own best interest implies the challenge, important for Enlightenment moral philosophy, to construct moral duties of justice and benevolence out of such limited materials. The basis of human action that Hobbes posits is immediately intelligible and even shared with other animals to some extent; a set of moral duties constructed on this basis would also be intelligible, de-mystified, and fit within the larger scheme of nature. Bernard Mandeville is sometimes grouped with Hobbes in the Enlightenment, especially by critics of them both, because he too, in his popular Fable of the Bees; or, Private Vices, Public Benefits (1714), sees people as fundamentally motivated by their perceived self-interest, and then undertakes to tell a story about how moral virtue, which involves conquering one’s own appetite and serving the interests of others, can be understood to arise on this basis.

Samuel Clarke, an influential rationalist British thinker early in the Enlightenment, undertakes to show in his Discourse concerning the Unchangeable Obligations of Natural Religion (1706), against Hobbes, that the absolute difference between moral good and moral evil lies in the immediately discernible nature of things, independently of any compacts or positive legislation by God or human beings. Clarke writes that “in men’s dealing … one with another, it is undeniably more fit, absolutely and in the nature of the thing itself, that all men should endeavor to promote the universal good and welfare of all; than that all men should be continually contriving the ruin and destruction of all”. Likewise for the rest of what morality enjoins upon us. According to Clarke, that some actions (those we call morally good or required) are “fit to be done” and others not fit is grounded upon the immediately evident relations in which things stand to each other in nature, just as “the proportions of lines or numbers” are evident to the rational perception of a reasonable being. Similarly, Christian Wolff’s rationalist practical philosophy also grounds moral duties in an objective rational order. However, the objective quality on which moral requirements are grounded for Wolff is not the “fitness” of things to be done but rather their perfection. Wolff counts as a founder of the Aufklärung in part because of his attempted derivation of ethical duties from an order of perfection in things, discernable through reason, independently of divine commands.

Rationalist ethics so conceived faces the following obstacles in the Enlightenment. First, as implied above, it becomes increasingly implausible that the objective, mind-independent order is really as rationalist ethicists claim it to be. Second, even if the objective realm were ordered as the rationalist claims, it remains unclear how this order gives rise (on its own, as it were) to obligations binding on our wills. David Hume famously exposes the fallacy of deriving a prescriptive statement (that one ought to perform some action) from a description of how things stand in relation to each other in nature. Prima facie, there is a gap between the rationalist’s objective order and a set of prescriptions binding on our wills; if a supreme legislator must be re-introduced in order to make the conformity of our actions to that objective order binding on our wills, then the alleged existence of the objective moral order does not do the work the account asks of it in the first place.

Alongside the rationalist strand of ethical philosophy in the Enlightenment, there is also a very significant empiricist strand. Empirical accounts of moral virtue in the period are distinguished, both by grounding moral virtue on an empirical study of human nature, and by grounding cognition of moral duties and moral motivation in human sensibility, rather than in reason. The Third Earl of Shaftesbury, author of the influential work Characteristics of Men, Manners, Opinions, Times (1711), is a founding figure of the empiricist strand. Shaftesbury, like Clarke, is provoked by Hobbes’ egoism to provide a non-egoistic account of moral virtue. Shaftesbury conceives the core notion of the goodness of things teleologically: something is good if it contributes to the well-being or furtherance of the system of which it is a part. Individual animals are members of species, and therefore they are good as such insofar as they contribute to the well-being of the species of which they are a part. Thus, the good of things, including human beings, for Shaftesbury as for Clarke, is an objective quality that is knowable through reason. However, though we can know what is good through reason, Shaftesbury maintains that reason alone is not sufficient to motivate human action. Shaftesbury articulates the structure of a distinctively human moral sensibility. Moral sensibility depends on the faculty of reflection. When we reflect on first-order passions such as gratitude, kindness and pity, we find ourselves approving or liking them and disapproving or disliking their opposites. By virtue of our receptivity to such feelings, we are capable of virtue and have a sense of right and wrong. In this way, Shaftesbury defines the moral sense that plays a significant role in the theories of subsequent Enlightenment thinkers such as Francis Hutcheson and David Hume.

In the rationalist tradition, the conflict within the breast of the person between the requirements of morality and self-interest is canonically a conflict between the person’s reason and her passions. Shaftesbury’s identification of a moral sentiment in the nature of humanity renders this a conflict within sensibility itself, a conflict between different sentiments, between a self-interested sentiment and an unegoistic sentiment. Though both Shaftesbury and Hutcheson, no less than Clarke, oppose Hobbes’s egoism, it is nonetheless true that the doctrine of moral sensibility softens moral demands, so to speak. Doing what is morally right or morally good is intrinsically bound up with a distinctive kind of pleasure on their accounts. It is significant that both Shaftesbury and Hutcheson, the two founders of modern moral sense theory, articulate their ethical theory in conjunction with an aesthetic theory. Arguably the pleasure we feel in the apprehension of something beautiful is disinterested pleasure. Our susceptibility to aesthetic pleasure can be taken to reveal that we apprehend and respond to objective (or, anyway, universal) values, not only or necessarily on the basis of reason, but through our natural sensibility instead. Thus, aesthetics, as Shaftesbury and Hutcheson independently develop an account of it, gives encouragement to their doctrines of moral sensibility. But an account of moral virtue, unlike aesthetics, requires an account of moral motivation. As noted above, both Shaftesbury and Hutcheson want to do justice to the idea that proper moral motivation is not the pursuit of pleasure, even disinterested pleasure, but rather an immediate response to the perception of moral value. The problem of giving a satisfying account of moral motivation is a difficult one for empiricist moral philosophers in the Enlightenment.

While for Shaftesbury, at the beginning of the moral sense tradition, moral sense tracks a mind-independent order of value, David Hume, motivated in part by a more radical empiricism, is happy to let the objective order go. We have no access through reason to an independent order of value which moral sense would track. For Hume, morality is founded completely on our sentiments. Hume is often regarded as the main originator of so-called “ethical subjectivism”, according to which moral judgments or evaluations (regarding actions or character) do not make claims about independent facts but merely express the subject’s feelings or attitudes with respect to actions or character. Such subjectivism is relieved of the difficult task of explaining how the objective order of values belongs to the natural world as it is being reconceived by natural science in the period; however, it faces the challenge of explaining how error and disagreement in moral judgments and evaluations are possible. Hume’s account of the standards of moral judgment follows that of Hutcheson in relying centrally on the “natural” responses of an ideal observer or spectator.

Hume’s ethics is exemplary of philosophical ethics in the Enlightenment by virtue of its belonging to the attempt to provide a new, empirically grounded science of human nature, free of theological presuppositions. As noted above, the attempts by the members of the French Enlightenment to present a new understanding of human nature are strongly influenced by Locke’s “sensationalism”, which, radicalized by Condillac, amounts to the attempt to base all contents and faculties of the human mind on the senses. Typically, the French philosophes draw more radical or iconoclastic implications from the new “science of man” than English or Scottish Enlightenment figures. Claude-Adrien Helvétius (1715–1771) is typical here. In De l’ésprit (1758), Helvétius follows the Lockean sensationalism of Condillac and pairs it with the claim that human beings are motivated in their actions only by the natural desire to maximize their own pleasure and minimize their pain. De l’ésprit, though widely read, gives rise to strong negative reactions in the time, both by political and religious authorities (the Sorbonne, the Pope and the Parlement of Paris all condemn the book) and by prominent fellow philosophes, in great part because Helvétius’s psychology seems to critics to render moral imperatives and values without basis, despite his best attempts to derive them. Helvétius attempts to ground the moral equality of all human beings by portraying all human beings, whatever their standing in the social hierarchy, whatever their special talents and gifts, as equally products of the nature we share plus the variable influences of education and social environment. But, to critics, Helvétius’s account portrays all human beings as equal only by virtue of portraying all as equally worthless (insofar as the claim to equality is grounded on all being equally determined by external factors). However, Helvétius’s ideas, in De l’ésprit as well as in its posthumously published sequel De l’homme (1772), exert a great deal of influence, especially his case for the role of pleasure and pain in human motivation and the role of education and social incentives in shaping individuals into contributors to the social good. Helvétius is sometimes regarded as the father of modern utilitarianism through his articulation of the greatest happiness principle and through his influence on Bentham.

Helvétius is typical in the respect that he is radical in the revisions he proposes, not in common moral judgments or customs of the time, but rather regarding the philosophical grounding of those judgments and customs. But there are some philosophers in the Enlightenment who are radical in the revisions they propose regarding the content of ethical judgments themselves. The Marquis de Sade is merely the most notorious example, among a set of Enlightenment figures (including also the Marquis de Argens and Diderot himself in some of his writings) who, within the context of the new naturalism and its emphasis on the pursuit of pleasure, celebrate the avid pursuit of sexual pleasure and explicitly challenge the sexual mores, as well as the wider morality, of their time. The more or less fictionalized, philosophically self-conscious “libertine” is one significant expression of Enlightenment ethical thought.

If the French Enlightenment tends to advance this-worldly happiness as the highest good for human beings more insistently than the Enlightenment elsewhere, then Rousseau’s voice is, in this as in other respects, a discordant voice in that context. Rousseau advances the cultivation and realization of human freedom as the highest end for human beings and thereby gives expression to another side of Enlightenment ethics. As Rousseau describes it, the capacity for individual self-determination puts us in a problematic relation to our natural desires and inclinations and to the realm of nature generally, insofar as that realm is constituted by mechanistic causation. Though Rousseau places a great deal of emphasis on human freedom, and makes significant contributions to our understanding of ourselves as free, he does not address very seriously the problem of the place of human freedom in the cosmos as it is conceived within the context of Enlightenment naturalism.

However, Rousseau’s writings help Kant to the articulation of a practical philosophy that addresses many of the tensions in the Enlightenment. Kant follows Rousseau, and disagrees with empiricism in ethics in the period, in emphasizing human freedom, rather than human happiness, as the central orienting concept of practical philosophy. Though Kant presents the moral principle as a principle of practical reason, his ethics also disagrees significantly with rationalist ethics in the period. According to Kant, rationalists such as Wolff, insofar as they take moral prescriptions to follow from an end given to the will(in Wolff’s case, the end of perfection), do not understand us as autonomous in our moral activity. Through interpreting the faculty of the will itself as practical reason, Kant understands the moral principle as internally legislated, thus as not only compatible with freedom, but as equivalent to the principle of a free will, as a principle of autonomy. As noted above, rationalists in ethics in the period are challenged to explain how the objective moral order which reason in us allegedly discerns gives rise to valid prescriptions binding on our wills (the gap between is and ought). For Kant, the moral order is not independent of our will, but rather represents the formal constraints of willing as such. Kant’s account thus both avoids the is-ought gap and interprets moral willing as expressive of our freedom.

Moreover, by virtue of his interpretation of the moral principle as the principle of pure practical reason, Kant is able to redeem the ordinary sense of moral requirements as over-riding, as potentially opposed to the claims of one’s happiness, and thus as different in kind from the deliverances of prudential reasoning. This ordinary sense of moral requirements is not easily accommodated within the context of Enlightenment empiricism and naturalism. Kant’s stark dichotomy between a person’s practical reason and her sensible nature is strongly criticized, both by the subsequent Romantic generation and in the contemporary context; but this dichotomy is bound up with an important benefit of Kant’s view – much promoted by Kant himself – within the context of the Enlightenment. Elaborated in the context of Kant’s idealism as a contrast between the “realm of freedom” and the “realm of nature”, the dichotomy enables Kant’s proposed solution to the conflict between freedom and nature that besets Enlightenment thought. As noted above, Kant argues that the application of the causal principle is restricted to the realm of nature, thus making room for freedom, compatibly with the causal determination of natural events required by scientific knowledge. Additionally, Kant attempts to show that morality “leads ineluctably to” religious belief (in the supersensible objects of God and of the immortal soul) while being essentially not founded on religious belief, thus again vindicating the ordinary understanding of morality while still furthering Enlightenment values and commitments.

2.3 Religion and the Enlightenment

Though the Enlightenment is sometimes represented as the enemy of religion, it is more accurate to see it as critically directed against various (arguably contingent) features of religion, such as superstition, enthusiasm, fanaticism and supernaturalism. Indeed the effort to discern and advocate for a religion purified of such features – a “rational” or “natural” religion – is more typical of the Enlightenment than opposition to religion as such. Even Voltaire, who is perhaps the most persistent, powerful, vocal Enlightenment critic of religion, directs his polemic mostly against the Catholic Church in France – “l’infâme” in his famous sign-off in his letters, “Écrasez l’infâme” (“Crush the infamous”) refers to the Church, not to religion as such. However, controversy regarding the truth-value or reasonableness of religious belief in general, Christian belief in particular, and controversy regarding the proper place of religion in society, occupies a particularly central place in the Enlightenment. It’s as if the terrible, violent confessional strife in the early modern period in Europe, the bloody drawn-out wars between the Christian sects, was removed to the intellectual arena in the Enlightenment and became a set of more general philosophical controversies.

Alongside the rise of the new science, the rise of Protestantism in western Christianity also plays an important role in generating the Enlightenment. The original Protestants assert a sort of individual liberty with respect to questions of faith against the paternalistic authority of the Church. The “liberty of conscience”, so important to Enlightenment thinkers in general, and asserted against all manner of paternalistic authorities (including Protestant), descends from this Protestant assertion. The original Protestant assertion initiates a crisis of authority regarding religious belief, a crisis of authority that, expanded and generalized and even, to some extent, secularized, becomes a central characteristic of the Enlightenment spirit. The original Protestant assertion against the Catholic Church bases itself upon the authority of scripture. However, in the Enlightenment, the authority of scripture is strongly challenged, especially when taken literally. Developing natural science renders acceptance of a literal version of the Bible increasingly untenable. But authors such as Spinoza (in his Tractatus Theologico-Politicus) present ways of interpreting scripture according to its spirit, rather than its letter, in order to preserve its authority and truth, thus contributing to the Enlightenment controversy of whether some rationally purified version of the religion handed down in the culture belongs to the true philosophical representation of the world or not; and, if so, what its content is.

It is convenient to discuss religion in the Enlightenment by presenting four characteristic forms of Enlightenment religion in turn: deism, religion of the heart, fideism and atheism.

Deism. Deism is the form of religion most associated with the Enlightenment. According to deism, we can know by the natural light of reason that the universe is created and governed by a supreme intelligence; however, although this supreme being has a plan for creation from the beginning, the being does not interfere with creation; the deist typically rejects miracles and reliance on special revelation as a source of religious doctrine and belief, in favor of the natural light of reason. Thus, a deist typically rejects the divinity of Christ, as repugnant to reason; the deist typically demotes the figure of Jesus from agent of miraculous redemption to extraordinary moral teacher. Deism is the form of religion fitted to the new discoveries in natural science, according to which the cosmos displays an intricate machine-like order; the deists suppose that the supposition of God is necessary as the source or author of this order. Though not a deist himself, Isaac Newton provides fuel for deism with his argument in his Opticks (1704) that we must infer from the order and beauty in the world to the existence of an intelligent supreme being as the cause of this order and beauty. Samuel Clarke, perhaps the most important proponent and popularizer of Newtonian philosophy in the early eighteenth century, supplies some of the more developed arguments for the position that the correct exercise of unaided human reason leads inevitably to the well-grounded belief in God. He argues that the Newtonian physical system implies the existence of a transcendent cause, the creator God. In his first set of Boyle lectures, A Demonstration of the Being and Attributes of God (1705), Clarke presents the metaphysical or “argument a priori” for God’s existence. This argument concludes from the rationalist principle that whatever exists must have a sufficient reason or cause of its existence to the existence of a transcendent, necessary being who stands as the cause of the chain of natural causes and effects. Clarke also supports the empirical argument from design, the argument that concludes from the evidence of order in nature to the existence of an intelligent author of that order. In his second set of Boyle lectures, A Discourse Concerning the Unchangeable Obligations of Natural Religion (1706), Clarke argues as well that the moral order revealed to us by our natural reason requires the existence of a divine legislator and an afterlife, in which the supreme being rewards virtue and punishes vice. In his Boyle lectures, Clarke argues directly against the deist philosophy and maintains that what he regards as the one true religion, Christianity, is known as such on the basis of miracles and special revelation; still, Clarke’s arguments on the topic of natural religion are some of the best and most widely-known arguments in the period for the general deist position that natural philosophy in a broad sense grounds central doctrines of a universal religion.

Enlightenment deism first arises in England. In On the Reasonableness of Christianity (1695), Locke aims to establish the compatibility of reason and the teachings of Christianity. Though Locke himself is (like Newton, like Clarke) not a deist, the major English deists who follow (John Toland, Christianity Not Mysterious [1696]); Anthony Collins, A Discourse of Freethinking [1713]; Matthew Tindal, Christianity as Old as Creation [1730]) are influenced by Locke’s work. Voltaire carries deism across the channel to France and advocates for it there over his long literary career. Toward the end-stage, the farcical stage, of the French Revolution, Robespierre institutes a form of deism, the so-called “Cult of the Supreme Being”, as the official religion of the French state. Deism plays a role in the founding of the American republic as well. Many of the founding fathers (Jefferson, Franklin, Madison, Paine) author statements or tracts that are sympathetic to deism; and their deistic sympathies influence the place given (or not given) to religion in the new American state that they found.

Religion of the Heart. Opposition to deism derives sometimes from the perception of it as coldly rationalistic. The God of the deists, arrived at through a priori or empirical argument and referred to as the Prime Mover or Original Architect, is often perceived as distant and unconcerned with the daily struggles of human existence, and thus as not answering the human needs from which religion springs in the first place. Some important thinkers of the Enlightenment – notably Shaftesbury and Rousseau – present religion as founded on natural human sentiments, rather than on the operations of the intellect. Rousseau has his Savoyard Vicar declare, in his Profession of Faith in Emile (1762), that the idea of worshiping a beneficent deity arose in him initially as he reflected on his own situation in nature and his “heart began to glow with a sense of gratitude towards the author of our being”. The Savoyard Vicar continues: “I adore the supreme power, and melt into tenderness at his goodness. I have no need to be taught artificial forms of worship; the dictates of nature are sufficient. Is it not a natural consequence of self-love to honor those who protect us, and to love such as do us good?” This “natural” religion – opposed to the “artificial” religions enforced in the institutions – is often classed as a form of deism. But it deserves separate mention, because of its grounding in natural human sentiments, rather than in reason or in metaphysical or natural scientific problems of cosmology.

Fideism. Deism or natural religion of various sorts tends to rely on the claim that reason or human experience supports the hypothesis that there is a supreme being who created or authored the world. In one of the most important philosophical texts on natural religion to appear during the Enlightenment, David Hume’s Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion (published posthumously in 1779), this supposition is criticized relentlessly, incisively and in detail. Naturally, the critical, questioning attitude characteristic of the Enlightenment in general is directed against the arguments on which natural religion is based. In Part Nine of the Dialogues, Samuel Clarke’s “argument a priori” (as defended by the character Demea) is dispatched fairly quickly, but with a battery of arguments. But Hume is mainly concerned in the Dialogues with the other major pillar of natural religion in the Enlightenment, the “empirical” argument, the teleological argument or the argument from design. Cleanthes, the character who advances the design argument in the dialogue, proceeds from the rule for empirical reasoning that like effects prove like causes. He reasons that, given the resemblance between nature, which displays in many respects a “curious adaptation of means to ends”, and a man-made machine, we must infer the cause of nature to be an intelligence like ours, though greater in proportion as nature surpasses in perfection the products of human intelligence. Philo, the skeptical voice in the Dialogues, presses Cleanthes’ argument on many fronts. He points out that the argument is only as strong as the similarity between nature or parts of nature and man-made machines, and further, that a close scrutiny reveals that analogy to be weak. Moreover, according to the principle of the argument, the stronger the evidence for an author (or authors) of nature, the more like us that author (or authors) should be taken to be. Consequently, according to Philo, the argument does not support the conclusion that God exists, taking God to be unitary, infinite, perfect, et cetera. Also, although the existence of evil and disorder in nature may serve actually to strengthen the case for the argument, given the disorder in human creations as well, the notion that God authors evil and disorder is disturbing. If one denies that there is disorder and evil in nature, however implausibly, the effect is to emphasize again the dissimilarity between nature and human products and thus weaken the central basis of the argument. With these and other considerations, Philo puts the proponent of the empirical argument in a difficult dialectical position. But Cleanthes is not moved. He holds the inference from the phenomenon of the curious adaptation of means to ends in nature to the existence of an intelligent and beneficent author to be so natural as to be impervious to the philosophical cavils raised by Philo. And, in the ambiguous conclusion of the work, Philo seems to agree. Though Hume himself seems to have been an atheist, one natural way to take the upshot of his Dialogues is that religious belief is so “natural” to us that rational criticism cannot unseat it. The ambiguous upshot of the work can be taken to be the impotence of rational criticism in the face of religious belief, rather than the illegitimacy of religious belief in the face of rational criticism. This tends toward fideism, the view according to which religious faith maintains its truth over against philosophical reasoning, which opposes but cannot defeat it. Fideism is most often associated with thinkers whose beliefs run contrary to the trends of the Enlightenment (Blaise Pascal, Johann-Georg Hamann, Søren Kierkegaard), but the skeptical strain in the Enlightenment, from Pierre Bayle through David Hume, expresses itself not only in atheism, but also in fideism.

Atheism. Atheism is more present in the French Enlightenment than elsewhere. In the writings of Denis Diderot, atheism is partly supported by an expansive, dynamic conception of nature. According to the viewpoint developed by Diderot, we ought to search for the principles of natural order within natural processes themselves, not in a supernatural being. Even if we don’t yet know the internal principles for the ordering and development of natural forms, the appeal to a transcendent author of such things is reminiscent, to Diderot’s ear, of the appeal to Aristotelian “substantial forms” that was expressly rejected at the beginning of modern science as explaining nothing. The appeal to a transcendent author does not extend our understanding, but merely marks and fixes the limits of it. Atheism (combined with materialism) in the French Enlightenment is perhaps most identified with the Baron d’Holbach, whose System of Nature (1770) generated a great deal of controversy at the time for urging the case for atheism explicitly and emphatically. D’Holbach’s system of nature is strongly influenced by Diderot’s writings, though it displays less subtlety and dialectical sophistication. Though most Enlightenment thinkers hold that morality requires religion, in the sense that morality requires belief in a transcendent law-giver and in an after-life, d’Holbach (influenced in this respect by Spinoza, among others) makes the case for an ethical naturalism, an ethics that is free of any reference to a supernatural grounding or aspiration. Like Helvétius before him, d’Holbach presents an ethics in which virtue consists in enlightened self-interest. The metaphysical background of the ethics he presents is deterministic materialism. The Prussian enlightened despot, Frederick the Great, famously criticizes d’Holbach’s book for exemplifying the incoherence that troubles the Enlightenment generally: while d’Holbach provides passionate moral critiques of existing religious and social and political institutions and practices, his own materialist, determinist conception of nature allows no place for moral “oughts” and prescriptions and values.

3. The Beautiful: Aesthetics in the Enlightenment

Modern systematic philosophical aesthetics not only first emerges in the context of the Enlightenment, but also flowers brilliantly there. As Ernst Cassirer notes, the eighteenth century not only thinks of itself as the “century of philosophy”, but also as “the age of criticism,” where criticism is centrally (though not only) art and literary criticism (Cassirer 1932, 255). Philosophical aesthetics flourishes in the period because of its strong affinities with the tendencies of the age. Alexander Baumgarten, the German philosopher in the school of Christian Wolff, founds systematic aesthetics in the period, in part through giving it its name. “Aesthetics” is derived from the Greek word for “senses”, because for Baumgarten a science of the beautiful would be a science of the sensible, a science of sensible cognition. The Enlightenment in general re-discovers the value of the senses, not only in cognition, but in human lives in general, and so, given the intimate connection between beauty and human sensibility, the Enlightenment is naturally particularly interested in aesthetics. Also, the Enlightenment includes a general recovery and affirmation of the value of pleasure in human lives, against the tradition of Christian asceticism, and the flourishing of the arts, of the criticism of the arts and of the philosophical theorizing about beauty, promotes and is promoted by this recovery and affirmation. The Enlightenment also enthusiastically embraces the discovery and disclosure of rational order in nature, as manifest most clearly in the development of the new science. It seems to many theorists in the Enlightenment that the faculty of taste, the faculty by which we discern beauty, reveals to us some part of this order, a distinctive harmony, unities amidst variety. Thus, in the phenomenon of aesthetic pleasure, human sensibility discloses to us rational order, thus binding together two enthusiasms of the Enlightenment.

3.1 French Classicism and German Rationalism

In the early Enlightenment, especially in France, the emphasis is upon the discernment of an objective rational order, rather than upon the subject’s sensual aesthetic pleasure. Though Descartes’ philosophical system does not include a theory of taste or of beauty, his mathematical model of the physical universe inspires the aesthetics of French classicism. French classicism begins from the classical maxim that the beautiful is the true. Nicolas Boileau writes in his influential didactic poem, The Art of Poetry (1674), in which he lays down rules for good versification within different genres, that “Nothing is beautiful but the true, the true alone is lovable.” In the period the true is conceived of as an objective rational order. According to the classical conception of art that dominates in the period, art imitates nature, though not nature as given in disordered experience, but the ideal nature, the ideal in which we can discern and enjoy “unity in multiplicity.” In French classicism, aesthetics is very much under the influence of, and indeed modeled on, systematic, rigorous theoretical science of nature. Just as in Descartes’ model of science, where knowledge of all particulars depends on prior knowledge of the principle from which the particulars are deduced, so also in the aesthetics of French classicism, the demand is for systematization under a single, universal principle. The subjection of artistic phenomena to universal rules and principles is expressed, for example, in the title of Charles Batteaux’s main work, The Fine Arts Reduced to a Single Principle (1746), as well as in Boileau’s rules for good versification.

In Germany in the eighteenth century, Christian Wolff’s systematic rationalist metaphysics forms the basis for much of the reflection on aesthetics, though sometimes as a set of doctrines to be argued against. Wolff affirms the classical dictum that beauty is truth; beauty is truth perceived through the feeling of pleasure. Wolff understands beauty to consist in the perfection in things, which he understands in turn to consist in a harmony or order of a manifold. We judge something beautiful through a feeling of pleasure when we sense in it this harmony or perfection. Beauty is, for Wolff, the sensitive cognition of perfection. Thus, for Wolff, beauty corresponds to objective features of the world, but judgments of beauty are relative to us also, insofar as they are based on the human faculty of sensibility.

3.2 Empiricism and Subjectivism

Though philosophical rationalism forms the basis of aesthetics in the early Enlightenment in France and Germany, thinkers in the empiricist tradition in England and Scotland introduce many of the salient themes of Enlightenment aesthetics. In particular, with the rise of empiricism and subjectivism in this domain, attention shifts to the ground and nature of the subject’s experience of beauty, the subject’s aesthetic response. Lord Shaftesbury, though not himself an empiricist or subjectivist in aesthetics, makes significant contributions to this development. Shaftesbury re-iterates the classical equation, “all beauty is truth,” but the truth that beauty is for Shaftesbury is not an objective rational order that could also be known conceptually. Though beauty is, for Shaftesbury, a kind of harmony that is independent of the human mind, under the influence of Plotinus, he understands the human being’s immediate intuition of the beautiful as a kind of participation in the original harmony. Shaftesbury focuses attention on the nature of the subject’s response to beauty, as elevating the person, also morally. He maintains that aesthetic response consists in a disinterested unegoistic pleasure; the discovery of this capacity for disinterested pleasure in harmony shows the way for the development of his ethics that has a similar grounding. And, in fact, in seeing aesthetic response as elevating oneself above self-interested pursuits, through cultivating one’s receptivity to disinterested pleasure, Shaftesbury ties tightly together aesthetics and ethics, morality and beauty, and in that respect also contributes to a trend of the period. Also, in placing the emphasis on the subject’s response to beauty, rather than on the objective characteristics of the beautiful, Shaftesbury makes aesthetics belong to the general Enlightenment interest in human nature. Thinkers of the period find in our receptivity to beauty a key both to understanding both distinctively human nature and its perfection.

Francis Hutcheson follows Shaftesbury in his emphasis on the subject’s aesthetic response, on the distinctive sort of pleasure that the beautiful elicits in us. Partly because the Neo-Platonic influence, so pronounced in Shaftesbury’s aesthetics, is washed out of Hutcheson’s, to be replaced by a more thorough-going empiricism, Hutcheson understands this distinctive aesthetic pleasure as more akin to a secondary quality. Thus, Hutcheson’s aesthetic work raises the prominent question whether “beauty” refers to something objective at all or whether beauty is “nothing more” than a human idea or experience. As in the domain of Enlightenment ethics, so with Enlightenment aesthetics too, the step from Shaftesbury to Hutcheson marks a step toward subjectivism. Hutcheson writes in one of his Two Treatises, his Inquiry Concerning Beauty, Order, Harmony, Design (1725) that “the word ‘beauty’ is taken for the idea raised in us, and a sense of beauty for our power of receiving this idea” (Section I, Article IX). However, though Hutcheson understands beauty to be an idea in us, he takes this idea to be “excited” or “occasioned” in us by distinctive objective qualities, in particular by objects that display “uniformity amidst variety” (ibid., Section II, Article III). In the very title of Hutcheson’s work above, we see the importance of the classical ideas of (rational) order and harmony in Hutcheson’s aesthetic theory, even as he sets the tenor for much Enlightenment discussion of aesthetics through placing the emphasis on the subjective idea and aesthetic response.

David Hume’s famous essay on “the standard of taste” raises and addresses the epistemological problem raised by subjectivism in aesthetics. If beauty is an idea in us, rather than a feature of objects independent of us, then how do we understand the possibility of correctness and incorrectness – how do we understand the possibility of standards of judgment – in this domain? The problem is posed more clearly for Hume because he intensifies Hutcheson’s subjectivism. He writes in the Treatise that “pleasure and pain….are not only necessary attendants of beauty and deformity, but constitute their very essence” (Treatise, Book II, part I, section viii). But if a judgment of taste is based on, or expresses, subjective sentiments, how can it be incorrect? In his response to this question, Hume accounts for the expectation of agreement in judgments of taste by appealing to the fact that we share a common human nature, and he accounts for ‘objectivity’ or expertise in judgments of taste, within the context of his subjectivism, by appealing to the normative responses of well-placed observers. Both of these points (the commonality of human nature and the securing of ‘objectivity’ in judgments based on sentiments by appeal to the normative responses of appropriately placed observers) are typical of the period more generally, and especially of the strong empiricist strain in the Enlightenment. Hume develops the empiricist line in aesthetics to the point where little remains of the classical emphasis on the order or harmony or truth that is, according to the French classicists, apprehended and appreciated in our aesthetic responses to the beautiful, and thus, according to the classicists, the ground of aesthetic responses.

3.3 Late Enlightenment Aesthetics

Immanuel Kant faces squarely the problem of the normativity of judgments of taste. Influenced by Hutcheson and the British empiricist tradition in general, Kant understands judgments of taste to be founded on a distinctive sort of feeling, a disinterested pleasure. In taking judgments of taste to be subjective (they are founded on the subject’s feeling of pleasure) and non-cognitive (such judgments do not subsume representations under concepts and thus do not ascribe properties to objects), Kant breaks with the German rationalist school. However Kant continues to maintain that judgments of beauty are like cognitive judgments in making a legitimate claim to universal agreement – in contrast to judgments of the agreeable. The question is how to vindicate the legitimacy of this demand. Kant argues that the distinctive pleasure underlying judgments of taste is the experience of the harmony of the faculties of the imagination and the understanding, a harmony that arises through their “free play” in the process of cognizing objects on the basis of given sensible intuition. The harmony is “free” in an experience of beauty in the sense that it is not forced by rules of the understanding, as is the agreement among the faculties in acts of cognition. The order and harmony that we experience in the face of the beautiful is subjective, according to Kant; but it is at the same time universal and normative, by virtue of its relation to the conditions of human cognition.

The emphasis Kant places on the role of the activity of the imagination in aesthetic pleasure and discernment typifies a trend in Enlightenment thought. Whereas early in the Enlightenment, in French classicism, and to some extent in Christian Wolff and other figures of German rationalism, the emphasis is on the more-or-less static rational order and proportion and on rigid universal rules or laws of reason, the trend during the development of Enlightenment aesthetics is toward emphasis on the play of the imagination and its fecundity in generating associations.

Denis Diderot is an important and influential author on aesthetics. He wrote the entry “On the Origin and Nature of the Beautiful” for the Encyclopedia (1752). Like Lessing in Germany, Diderot not only philosophized about art and beauty, but also wrote plays and influential art criticism. Diderot is strongly influenced in his writings on aesthetics by the empiricism in England and Scotland, but his writing is not limited to that standpoint. Diderot repeats the classical dictum that art should imitate nature, but, whereas, for French classicists, the nature that art should imitate is ideal nature – a static, universal rational order – for Diderot, nature is dynamic and productive. For Diderot, the nature the artist ought to imitate is the real nature we experience, warts and all (as it were). The particularism and realism of Diderot’s aesthetics is based on a critique of the standpoint of French classicism (see Cassirer 1935, p. 295f.). This critique exposes the artistic rules represented by French classicists as universal rules of reason as nothing more than conventions marking what is considered proper within a certain tradition. In other words, the prescriptions within the French classical tradition are artificial, not natural, and constitute fetters to artistic genius. Diderot takes liberation from such fetters to come from turning to the task of observing and imitating actual nature. Diderot’s emphasis on the primeval productive power and abundance of nature in his aesthetic writings contributes to the trend toward focus on artistic creation and expression (as opposed to artistic appreciation and discernment) that is a characteristic of the late Enlightenment and the transition to Romanticism.

Lessing’s aesthetic writings play an important role in elevating the aesthetic category of expressiveness. In his famous Laocoön: An Essay on the Limits of Painting and Poetry (1766), Lessing argues, by comparing the famous Greek statue with the representation of Laocoön’s suffering in Virgil’s poetry, that the aims of poetry and of the visual arts are not identical; he argues that the aim of poetry is not beauty, but expression. In elevating the aesthetic category of expressiveness, Lessing challenges the notion that all art is imitation of nature. His argument also challenges the notion that all the various arts can be deduced from a single principle. Lessing’s argument in Laocoön supports the contrary thesis that the distinct arts have distinct aims and methods, and that each should be understood on its own terms, not in terms of an abstract general principle from which all arts are to be deduced. For some, especially for critics of the Enlightenment, in this point Lessing is already beyond the Enlightenment. Certainly it is true that the emphasis on the individual or particular, over against the universal, which one finds in other late Enlightenment thinkers, is in tension with Enlightenment tenets. Herder (following Hamann to some extent) argues that each individual art object has to be understood in its own terms, as a totality complete unto itself. With Herder’s stark emphasis on individuality in aesthetics, over against universality, the supplanting of the Enlightenment with Romanticism and Historicism is well advanced. But, according to the point of view taken in this entry, the conception of the Enlightenment according to which it is distinguished by its prioritization of the order of abstract, universal laws and principles, over against concrete particulars and the differences amongst them, is too narrow; it fails to account for much of the characteristic richness in the thought of the period. Indeed aesthetics itself, as a discipline, which, as noted, is founded in the Enlightenment by the German rationalist, Alexander Baumgarten, owes its existence to the tendency in the Enlightenment to search for and discover distinct laws for distinct kinds of phenomena (as opposed to insisting that all phenomena be made intelligible through the same set of general laws and principles). Baumgarten founds aesthetics as a ‘science’ through the attempt to establish the sensible domain as cognizable in a way different from that which prevails in metaphysics. Aesthetics in Germany in the eighteenth century, from Wolff to Herder, both typifies many of the trends of the Enlightenment and marks the field where the Enlightenment yields to competing worldviews.


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  • –––, 1730. Philosophia prima sive ontologia methodo scientifica pertractata qua omnis cognitionis humanae principia continentur (First Philosophy or Ontology), Frankfurt, 1730.
  • Wollstonecraft, M., 1792. Vindication of the Rights of Woman, edited by Mariam Kramnick, Baltimore: Penguin Books, 1975.

Secondary Literature

  • Akkerman, Tjitske and Stuurman, Siep, 1998. Perspectives on Feminist Political Thought in European History: From the Middle Ages to the Present, New York: Routledge.
  • Adorno, Theodor W, and Max Horkheimer, 1947. Dialectic of Enlightenment, tr. by Edmund Jephcott and edited by Gunzelin Schmid Noerr, Stanford: Stanford University Press, 2002.
  • Becker, Carl L., 2003 (originally 1932). The Heavenly City of the Eighteenth Century Philosophers, second edition, with a forward by Johnson Kent Wright, New Haven: Yale University Press.
  • Berlin, Isaiah, 1997. The Proper Study of Mankind, edited by Henry Hardy and Roger Hausheer, New York: Farrar, Straus, Giroux.
  • –––, 1999, The Roots of Romanticism, edited by Henry Hardy, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Cassirer, Ernst, 1932. The Philosophy of the Enlightenment, tr. Fritz C.A. Koelln and James P. Pettegrove, Boston: Beacon, 1955.
  • Crocker, Lester, 1959. An Age of Cisis: Man and World in eighteenth century French Thought, Baltimore: Johns Hopkins University Press.
  • –––, 1963. Nature and Culture: Ethical Thought in the French Enlightenment, Baltimore: Johns Hopkins University Press.
  • Dupré, Louis, 2004. The Enlightenment and the Intellectual Foundations of Modern Culture, New Haven: Yale University Press.
  • Eze, Emmanuel Chukwudi (ed.), 1997. Race and the Enlightenment: A Reader, Cambridge, MA: Blackewell.
  • –––, 2002. “Answering the Question, What Remains of the Enlightenment?”, Human Studies, 23(3): 281–288.
  • Fleischacker, Samuel, 2013. What is Enlightenment? (Kant’s Questions), New York: Routledge.
  • Garrett, Aaron (ed.), 2014. The Routledge Companion to Eighteenth Century Philosophy, New York: Routledge.
  • Gay, Peter, 1966–69. The Enlightenment: An Interpretation, New York: Knopf.
  • Hirschman, Albert O., 1991. The Rhetoric of Reaction: Perversity, Futility, Jeopardy, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Israel, Jonathan, 2001. Radical Enlightenment: Philosophy and the Making of Modernity 1650–1750, Oxford University Press.
  • Kivy, Peter, 1973. “Introduction” to Francis Hutcheson: An Inquiry Concerning Beauty, Order, Harmony, Design, The Hague: Martinus, Nijhoff.
  • Kramnick, Isaac, 1995. “Introduction” to The Portable Enlightenment Reader, New York: Penguin.
  • Popkin, R. H., 1979. The History of Scepticism from Erasmus to Spinoza, Berkeley: University of California Press.
  • Schmidt, James (ed.), 1996. What is Enlightenment? Eighteenth-Century Answers and Twentieth-Century Questions, Berkeley, CA: University of California Press.
  • –––, 2000. “What Enlightenment Project?”, Political Theory, 28(6): 734–757.
  • Strickland, Susan, 1994. “Feminism, Postmodernism and Difference”, in Knowing the Difference: Feminist Perspectives in Epistemology, edited by Kathleen Lennon and Margaret Whitford, New York: Routledge, 265–274.
  • Zuckert, Rachel, 2014. “Aesthetics” in Garrett (ed.), Companion to Eighteenth Century Philosophy, London: Routledge.

Other Internet Resources


Mark Alznauer, Margaret Atherton, Kyla Ebels-Duggan, Alan Nelson, Julius Sensat and Rachel Zuckert provided helpful comments on an earlier draft, which lead to substantial revisions.

Copyright © 2017 by
William Bristow <bristow@uwm.edu>

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