Environmental Aesthetics

First published Mon Jan 29, 2007; substantive revision Tue Apr 9, 2019

Environmental aesthetics is a relatively new sub-field of philosophical aesthetics. It arose within analytic aesthetics in the last third of the twentieth century. Prior to its emergence, aesthetics within the analytic tradition was largely concerned with philosophy of art. Environmental aesthetics originated as a reaction to this emphasis, pursuing instead the investigation of the aesthetic appreciation of natural environments. Since its early stages, the scope of environmental aesthetics has broadened to include not simply natural environments but also human and human-influenced ones. At the same time, the discipline has also come to include the examination of that which falls within such environments, giving rise to what is called the aesthetics of everyday life. This area involves the aesthetics of not only more common objects and environments, but also a range of everyday activities. Thus, early in the twenty-first century, environmental aesthetics embraced the study of the aesthetic significance of almost everything other than art. Together with this broader scope of environmental aesthetics, the twenty-first century has also given rise to renewed and more intense investigations of the relationship between environmental aesthetics and environmentalism as well as to several new interests and directions.

1. History

Although environmental aesthetics has developed as a sub-field of Western philosophical aesthetics only in the last forty years, it has historical roots in eighteenth and nineteenth century European and North American aesthetics. In these centuries, there were important advances in the aesthetics of nature, including the emergence of the concept of disinterestedness together with those of the sublime and the picturesque, as well as the introduction of the idea of positive aesthetics. These notions continue to play a role in contemporary work in environmental aesthetics, especially in the context of its relationship to environmentalism. (See also Section 5.1 below.)

1.1 Eighteenth Century Aesthetics of Nature

In the West, the first major philosophical developments in the aesthetics of nature occurred in the eighteenth century. During that century, the founders of modern aesthetics not only began to take nature as a paradigmatic object of aesthetic experience, they also developed the concept of disinterestedness as the mark of such experience. Over the course of the century, this concept was elaborated by various thinkers, who employed it to purge from aesthetic appreciation an ever-increasing range of interests and associations. According to one standard account (Stolnitz 1961), the concept originated with the third Earl of Shaftesbury, who introduced it as a way of characterizing the notion of the aesthetic, was embellished by Francis Hutcheson, who expanded it so as to exclude from aesthetic experience not simply personal and utilitarian interests, but also associations of a more general nature, and was further developed by Archibald Alison, who took it to refer to a particular state of mind. The concept was given its classic formulation in Immanuel Kant’s Critique of Judgment, in which nature was taken as an exemplary object of aesthetic experience. Kant argued that natural beauty was superior to that of art and that it complemented the best habits of mind. It is no accident that the development of the concept of disinterestedness and the acceptance of nature as an ideal object of aesthetic appreciation went hand in hand. The clarification of the notion of the aesthetic in terms of the concept of disinterestedness disassociated the aesthetic appreciation of nature from the appreciator’s particular personal, religious, economic, or utilitarian interests, any of which could impede aesthetic experience.

The theory of disinterestedness also provided groundwork for understanding the aesthetic dimensions of nature in terms of three distinct conceptualizations. The first involved the idea of the beautiful, which readily applies to tamed and cultivated gardens and landscapes. The second centered on the idea of the sublime. In the experience of the sublime, the more threatening and terrifying of nature’s manifestations, such as mountains and wilderness, when viewed with disinterestedness, can be aesthetically appreciated, rather than simply feared or despised. These two notions were importantly elaborated by Edmund Burke and Kant. However, concerning the appreciation of nature, a third concept was to become more significant than that of either the beautiful or the sublime: the notion of the picturesque. Thus, by the end of the eighteenth century, there were three clearly distinct ideas each focusing on different aspects of nature’s diverse and often contrasting moods. One historian of the picturesque tradition (Conron 2000) argues that in “eighteenth-century English theory, the boundaries between aesthetic categories are relatively clear and stable”. The differences can be summarized as follows: objects experienced as beautiful tend to be small and smooth, but subtly varied, delicate, and “fair” in color, while those experienced as sublime, by contrast, are powerful, vast, intense, terrifying, and “definitionless”. Picturesque items are typically in the middle ground between those experienced as either sublime or beautiful, being complex and eccentric, varied and irregular, rich and forceful, and vibrant with energy.

It is not surprising that of these three notions, the idea of the picturesque, rather that of the beautiful or the sublime, achieved the greatest prominence concerning the aesthetic experience of nature. Not only does it occupy the extensive middle ground of the complex, irregular, forceful, and vibrant, all of which abound in the natural world, it also reinforced various long-standing connections between the aesthetic appreciation of nature and the treatment of nature in art. The term “picturesque” literally means “picture-like” and the theory of the picturesque advocates aesthetic appreciation in which the natural world is experienced as if divided into art-like scenes, which ideally resemble works of arts, especially landscape painting, in both subject matter and composition. Thus, since the concept of disinterestedness mandated appreciation of nature stripped of the appreciator’s own personal interests and associations, it helped to clear the ground for experience of nature governed by the theory of the picturesque, by which the appreciator is encouraged to see nature in terms of a new set of artistic images and associations. In this way the idea of the picturesque relates to earlier conceptions of the natural world as comprised of what were called “works of nature”, which, although considered in themselves to be proper and important objects of aesthetic experience, were thought to be even more appealing when they resembled works of art. The idea also resonates with other artistic traditions, such as that of viewing art as the mirror of nature. The theory of the picturesque received its fullest treatment in the late eighteenth century when it was popularized in the writings of William Gilpin, Uvedale Price, and Richard Payne Knight. At that time, it provided an aesthetic ideal for English tourists, who pursued picturesque scenery in the Lake District, the Scottish Highlands, and the Alps.

1.2 Nineteenth Century Aesthetics of Nature

Following its articulation in the eighteenth century, the idea of the picturesque remained a dominant influence on popular aesthetic experience of nature throughout the entire nineteenth and well into the twentieth century. Indeed, it is still an important component of the kind of aesthetic experience commonly associated with ordinary tourism—that which involves seeing and appreciating the natural world as it is represented in the depictions found in travel brochures, calendar photos, and picture postcards. However, while the idea of the picturesque continued to guide popular aesthetic appreciation of nature, the philosophical study of the aesthetics of nature, after flowering in the eighteenth century, went into decline. Many of the main themes, such as the concept of the sublime, the notion of disinterestedness, and the theoretical centrality of nature in philosophical aesthetics, culminated with Kant, who gave some of these ideas such exhaustive treatment that a kind of philosophical closure was seemingly achieved. Following Kant, a new world order was initiated by Hegel. In Hegel’s philosophy, art was the highest expression of “Absolute Spirit”, and it, rather than nature, was destined to become the favored subject of philosophical aesthetics. Thus, in the nineteenth century, both on the continent and in the United Kingdom, relatively few philosophers and only a scattering of thinkers of the Romantic Movement seriously pursued the theoretical study of the aesthetics of nature. There was no philosophical work comparable to that of the preceding century.

However, while the philosophical study of the aesthetics of nature languished in Europe, a new way of understanding the aesthetic appreciation of the natural world was developing in North America. This conception of nature appreciation had roots in the American tradition of nature writing, as exemplified in the essays of Henry David Thoreau. It was also inspired by the idea of the picturesque and, to a lesser extent, that of the sublime, especially in its artistic manifestations, such as the paintings of Thomas Cole and Frederic Church. However, as nature writing became its more dominant form of expression, the conception was increasingly shaped by developments in the natural sciences. In the middle of the nineteenth century, it was influenced by the geographical work of George Perkins Marsh (Marsh 1865), who argued that humanity was increasingly causing the destruction of the beauty of nature. The idea was forcefully presented toward the end of the century in the work of American naturalist John Muir, who was steeped in natural history. Muir explicitly distinguished this kind of understanding of the aesthetic appreciation of nature from that governed by the idea of the picturesque. In a well-known essay, “A Near View of the High Sierra” (Muir 1894), two of Muir’s artist companions, who focus on mountain scenery, exemplify aesthetic experience of nature as guided by the idea of the picturesque. This differs from Muir’s own aesthetic experience, which involved an interest in and appreciation of the mountain environment somewhat more akin to that of a geologist. This way of experiencing nature eventually brought Muir to see the whole of the natural environment and especially wild nature as aesthetically beautiful and to find ugliness primarily where nature was subject to human intrusion. The range of things that he regarded as aesthetically appreciable seemed to encompass the entire natural world, from creatures considered hideous in his day, such as snakes and alligators, to natural disasters thought to ruin the environment, such as floods and earthquakes. The kind of nature appreciation practiced by Muir has become associated with the contemporary point of view called “positive aesthetics” (Carlson 1984). Insofar as such appreciation eschews humanity’s marks on the natural environment, it is somewhat the converse of aesthetic appreciation influenced by the idea of the picturesque, which finds interest and delight in evidence of human presence.

2. Twentieth Century Developments

Western philosophical study of the aesthetics of the natural world reached a low point in the middle of the twentieth century, with the focus of analytic aesthetics almost exclusively on philosophy of art. At the same time, both the view that aesthetic appreciation of nature is parasitic upon that of art and even the idea that it is not in fact aesthetic appreciation at all were defended by some thinkers. However, in the last third of the century, there was a reaction to the neglect of the natural world by the discipline of aesthetics, which initiated a revival of the aesthetic investigation of nature and led to the emergence of environmental aesthetics.

2.1 The Neglect of the Aesthetics of Nature

In the first half of the twentieth century, Anglo-American philosophy largely ignored the aesthetics of nature. However, there were some noteworthy exceptions. For example, in North America, George Santayana investigated the topic as well as the concept of nature itself. Somewhat later, John Dewey contributed to the understanding of the aesthetic experience of both nature and everyday life, and Curt Ducasse discussed the beauty of nature as well as that of the human form. In England, R. G. Collingwood worked on both the philosophy of art and the idea of nature, but the two topics did not importantly come together in his thought. However, other than a few such individuals, as far as aesthetics was pursued, there was little serious consideration of the aesthetics of nature. On the contrary, the discipline was dominated by an interest in art. By the mid-twentieth century, within analytic philosophy, the principal philosophical school in the English-speaking world at that time, philosophical aesthetics was virtually equated with philosophy of art. The leading aesthetics textbook of the period was subtitled Problems in the Philosophy of Criticism and opened with the assertion: “There would be no problems of aesthetics, in the sense in which I propose to mark out this field of study, if no one ever talked about works of art” (Beardsley 1958). The comment was meant to emphasize the importance of the analysis of language, but it also reveals the art-dominated construal of aesthetics of that time. Moreover, if and when the aesthetic appreciation of nature was discussed, it was treated, by comparison with that of art, as a messy, subjective business of less philosophical interest. Some of the major aestheticians of the second half of the century argued that aesthetic judgments beyond what became known as the “artworld” must remain relative to conditions of observation and unfettered by the kind of constraints that govern the appreciation of art (Walton 1970, Dickie 1974).

The domination of analytic aesthetics by an interest in art had two ramifications. On the one hand, it helped to motivate a controversial philosophical position that denied the possibility of any aesthetic experience of nature whatsoever. The position held that aesthetic appreciation necessarily involves aesthetic judgments, which entail judging the object of appreciation as the achievement of a designing intellect. However, since nature is not the product of a designing intellect, its appreciation is not aesthetic (Mannison 1980). In the past, nature appreciation was deemed aesthetic because of the assumption that nature is the work of a designing creator, but this assumption is simply false or at least inadequate for grounding any aesthetics of nature. On the other hand, the art-dominated construal of aesthetics also gave support to approaches that stand within the many different historical traditions that conceptualize the natural world as essentially art-like—for example, as a set of the “works of nature”, or as the “handiwork” of a creator, or as picturesque scenery. For example, what might be called a landscape model of nature appreciation, which stems directly from the tradition of the picturesque, proposes that we should aesthetically experience nature as we appreciate landscape paintings. This requires seeing it to some extent as if it were a series of two-dimensional scenes and focusing either on artistic qualities dependent upon romantic images of the kind associated with the idea of the picturesque or simply on its formal aesthetic qualities. Such art-oriented models of the aesthetic appreciation of nature, in addition to being supported by powerful and long-standing traditions of thought (Biese 1905, Nicolson 1959), are reconsidered in some recent work in environmental aesthetics (Stecker 1997, Crawford 2004, Leddy 2005a, Tafalla 2010, Paden 2015b). Likewise, the defense of formalist aesthetic appreciation of nature has recently been renewed (Zangwill 2001 2013, Welchman 2018), along with related discussion and debate (Parsons 2004, Parsons and Carlson 2004, Moore 2006).

2.2 The Emergence of Environmental Aesthetics

In the last third of the twentieth century, a renewed interest in the aesthetics of nature emerged. This revival was the result of several different factors. In part, it was a response to the growing public concern about the apparent degeneration of the environment, aesthetic and otherwise. It was also the result of the academic world becoming aware of the significance of the environmental movement—at the level of both theoretical discussion and practical action. It is noteworthy that the emergence of the philosophical study of environmental ethics also dates from this time. Some of the earlier work in environmental aesthetics focused on empirical research conducted in response to public apprehension about the aesthetic state of the environment. Critics of this research argued that the landscape assessment and planning techniques used in environmental management were inadequate in stressing mainly formal properties, while overlooking expressive and other kinds of aesthetic qualities (Sagoff 1974, Carlson 1976). Empirical approaches were also faulted as fixated on “scenic beauty” and overly influenced by ideas such as that of the picturesque (Carlson 1977). In general, the area was thought to be beset by theoretical problems (Sparshott 1972), and the empirical research in particular was said to lack an adequate conceptual framework, often being conducted in what one critic called a “theoretical vacuum” (Appleton 1975b). Attempts to fill this vacuum prompted the idea of sociobiological underpinnings for the aesthetic appreciation of nature, such as “prospect-refuge theory” (Appleton 1975a 1982), as well as other kinds of evolution-related accounts (Orians and Heerwagen 1986 1992), the idea of which has recently received more attention from some philosophers (Davies 2012, Paden et al 2012, Paden 2015a 2016, Bartalesi and Portera 2015). In addition, the concerns of this period motivated the development of a variety of theoretical models of aesthetic response grounded in, for example, developmental and environmental psychology (Kaplan and Kaplan 1989, Bourassa 1991). There are overviews (Zube 1984, Cats-Baril and Gibson 1986, Daniel 2001) and collections (Saarinen et al 1984, Nasar 1988, Sheppard and Harshaw 2001) of this and related kinds of research, as well as more recent studies that, although they are essentially empirical in orientation, are of considerable theoretical interest (Porteous 1996, Bell 1999, Parsons and Daniel 2002, Gobster et al 2007, Hill and Daniel 2008, Gobster 2008 2013). One comprehensive review of this kind of research also includes some discussion of its relationship to philosophical work in environmental aesthetics (Thompson and Tarvlou 2009).

Within philosophical aesthetics itself, the renewed interest in the aesthetics of nature was also fueled by another development: the publication of Ronald Hepburn’s seminal article “Contemporary Aesthetics and the Neglect of Natural Beauty” (Hepburn 1966). Hepburn’s essay is commonly recognized as setting the agenda for the aesthetics of nature for the late twentieth century (Brook 2010, Saito 2010, Sepänmaa 2010, Carlson 2014b). After noting that by essentially reducing all of aesthetics to philosophy of art, analytic aesthetics had virtually ignored the natural world, Hepburn argued that aesthetic appreciation of art frequently provides misleading models for the appreciation of nature. However, he nonetheless observed that there is in the aesthetic appreciation of nature, as in the appreciation of art, a distinction between appreciation that is only trivial and superficial and that which is serious and deep. He furthermore suggested that for nature such serious appreciation might require new and different approaches that can accommodate not only nature’s indeterminate and varying character, but also both our multi-sensory experience and our diverse understanding of it. By focusing attention on natural beauty, Hepburn demonstrated that there could be significant philosophical investigation of the aesthetic experience of the world beyond the artworld. He thereby not only generated renewed interest in the aesthetics of nature, he also laid foundations for environmental aesthetics in general as well as for the aesthetics of everyday life.

In the wake of Hepburn’s article, the next major developments in the emerging field of environmental aesthetics challenged both the idea that nature appreciation is not aesthetic and the persistence of art-oriented approaches to the aesthetic appreciation of nature. Although these views about the appreciation of nature had found some grounding in analytic aesthetics’ reduction of aesthetics to philosophy of art, as art’s monopoly on philosophical aesthetics began to weaken, they were increasing recognized to be deeply counterintuitive. Concerning the former, many of our fundamental paradigms of aesthetic experience seem to be instances of appreciation of nature, such as our delight in a sunset or in a bird in flight. Moreover, the Western tradition in aesthetics, as well as other traditions, such as the Japanese, has long been committed to doctrines that explicitly contradict the nonaesthetic conception of nature appreciation, such as the conviction that, as one philosopher expressed it, anything that can be viewed can be viewed aesthetically (Ziff 1979). Concerning the art-oriented models, it was argued by some that such approaches do not fully realize serious, appropriate appreciation of nature, but rather distort the true character of natural environments. For example, the landscape model recommends framing and flattening environments into scenery. Moreover, in focusing heavily on artistic qualities, these accounts are thought to neglect much of our normal experience and understanding of nature (Hepburn 1966 1993, Carlson 1979 2000, Berleant 1985 1988 1992, Saito 1998a 1998b). The problem, in short, is that they do not acknowledge the importance of aesthetically appreciating nature, as one aesthetician puts it, “as nature” (Budd 2002).

3. Basic Orientations in Environmental Aesthetics

After the emergence of environmental aesthetics as a significant area of philosophical research, some initial positions crystallized. In the last part of the last century, these positions developed distinct orientations concerning the aesthetic appreciation of natural environments. At that time, the positions were frequently distinguished as belonging in one or the other of two groups, alternatively labeled cognitive and non-cognitive (Godlovitch 1994, Eaton 1998, Carlson and Berleant 2004), conceptual and non-conceptual (Moore 1999), or narrative and ambient (Foster 1998). The distinction marks a division between those points of view that take knowledge and information to be essential to aesthetic appreciation of environments and those that take some other feature, such as engagement, emotion arousal, or imagination, to be paramount. The distinction thereby gives structure and organization to the diverse points of view represented in the field. Moreover, it is in line with similar distinctions used in aesthetic theory concerning the appreciation of art, music, and literature.

3.1 Cognitive Views

What are called cognitive, conceptual, or narrative positions in environmental aesthetics are united by the thought that knowledge and information about the nature of the object of appreciation is central to its aesthetic appreciation. Thus, they champion the idea that nature must be appreciated, as one author puts it, “on its own terms” (Saito 1998b). These positions tend to reject aesthetic approaches to environments, such as that governed by the idea of the picturesque, that draw heavily on the aesthetic experience of art for modeling the appreciation of nature. Yet they affirm that art appreciation can nonetheless show some of what is required in an adequate account of nature appreciation. For example, in serious, appropriate aesthetic appreciation of works of art, it is taken to be essential that we experience works as what they in fact are and in light of knowledge of their real natures. Thus, for instance, appropriate appreciation of a work such as Picasso’s Guernica (1937) requires that we experience it as a painting and moreover as a cubist painting, and therefore that we appreciate it in light of our knowledge of paintings in general and of cubist paintings in particular (Walton 1970). Adopting this general line of thought, one cognitive approach to nature appreciation, sometimes labeled the natural environmental model (Carlson 1979) or scientific cognitivism (Parsons 2002), holds that just as serious, appropriate aesthetic appreciation of art requires knowledge of art history and art criticism, such aesthetic appreciation of nature requires knowledge of natural history—the knowledge provided by the natural sciences and especially sciences such as geology, biology, and ecology. The idea is that scientific knowledge about nature can reveal the actual aesthetic qualities of natural objects and environments in the way in which knowledge about art history and art criticism can for works of art. In short, to appropriately aesthetically appreciate nature “on its own terms” is to appreciate it as it is characterized by natural science (Carlson 1981 2000 2007, Rolston 1995, Eaton 1998, Matthews 2002, Parsons 2002 2006b).

Other cognitive or quasi-cognitive accounts of the aesthetic appreciation of environments differ from scientific cognitivism concerning either the kind of cognitive resources taken to be relevant to such appreciation or the degree to which these resources are considered relevant. On the one hand, several cognitive approaches emphasize different kinds of information, claiming that appreciating nature “on its own terms” might well involve experiencing it in light of various cultural and historical traditions. Thus, in appropriate aesthetic appreciation, local and regional narratives, folklore, and even mythological stories about nature are endorsed either as complementary with or as alternative to scientific knowledge (Sepänmaa 1993, Saito 1998b, Heyd 2001). On the other hand, another at least quasi-cognitive approach strongly supports the idea that nature must be appreciated “as nature”, but does not go beyond that constraint. The justification for accepting the “as nature” restriction is that the aesthetic experience of nature should be true to what nature actually is. This, however, is the extent of the approach’s commitment to cognitivism and marks the limits of the similarity that it finds between art appreciation and the appreciation of nature. It rejects the idea that scientific knowledge about nature can reveal the actual aesthetic qualities of natural objects and environments in the way in which knowledge about art history and art criticism can for works of art. Moreover, it holds that, unlike the case with art, many of the most significant aesthetic dimensions of natural objects and environments are extremely relative to conditions of observation. The upshot is that aesthetic appreciation of nature is taken to allow a degree of freedom that is denied to the aesthetic appreciation of art (Fisher 1998, Budd 2002).

3.2 Non-cognitive Views

Standing in contrast to the cognitive positions in environmental aesthetics are several so-called non-cognitive, non-conceptual, or ambient approaches. However, “non-cognitive” here should not be taken in its older philosophical sense, as meaning primarily or only “emotive”. Rather it indicates simply that these views hold that something other than a cognitive component, such as scientific knowledge or cultural tradition, is the central feature of the aesthetic appreciation of environments. The leading non-cognitive approach, called the aesthetics of engagement, draws on phenomenology as well as on analytic aesthetics. In doing so, it rejects many of the traditional ideas about aesthetic appreciation not only for nature but also for art. It argues that the theory of disinterestedness involves a mistaken analysis of the concept of the aesthetic and that this is most evident in the aesthetic experience of natural environments. According to the engagement approach, disinterested appreciation, with its isolating, distancing, and objectifying gaze, is out of place in the aesthetic experience of nature, for it wrongly abstracts both natural objects and appreciators from the environments in which they properly belong and in which appropriate appreciation is achieved. Thus, the aesthetics of engagement stresses the contextual dimensions of nature and our multi-sensory experiences of it. Viewing the environment as a seamless unity of places, organisms, and perceptions, it challenges the importance of traditional dichotomies, such as that between subject and object. It beckons appreciators to immerse themselves in the natural environment and to reduce to as small a degree as possible the distance between themselves and the natural world. In short, appropriate aesthetic experience is held to involve the total immersion of the appreciator in the object of appreciation (Berleant 1985 1988 1992 2013b).

Other non-cognitive positions in environmental aesthetics contend that dimensions other than engagement are central to aesthetic experience. What is known as the arousal model holds that we may appreciate nature simply by opening ourselves to it and being emotionally aroused by it. On this view, this less intellectual, more visceral experience of nature constitutes a legitimate way of aesthetically appreciating it that does not require any knowledge gained from science or elsewhere (Carroll 1993). Another alternative similarly argues that neither scientific nor any other kind of knowledge facilitates real, appropriate appreciation of nature, but not because such appreciation need involve only emotional arousal, but rather because nature itself is essentially alien, aloof, distant, and unknowable. This position, which may be called the mystery model, contends that appropriate experience of nature incorporates a sense of being separate from nature and of not belonging to it—a sense of mystery involving a state of appreciative incomprehension (Godlovitch 1994). A fourth non-cognitive approach brings together several features thought to be relevant to nature appreciation. It attempts to balance engagement and the traditional idea of disinterestedness, while giving center stage to imagination. This approach distinguishes a number of different kinds of imagination—associative, metaphorical, exploratory, projective, ampliative, and revelatory. It also responds to concerns that imagination introduces subjectivity by appealing to factors such as guidance by the object of appreciation, the constraining role of disinterestedness, and the notion of “imagining well” (Brady 1998 2003). A related point of view, which stresses the metaphysical dimensions of imagination, might also be placed in the non-cognitive group, although doing so requires making certain assumptions about the cognitive content of metaphysical speculation. According to this account, the imagination interprets nature as revealing metaphysical insights: insights about things such as the meaning of life, the human condition, or our place in the cosmos. Thus, this point of view includes within appropriate aesthetic experience of nature those abstract meditations and ruminations about ultimate reality that our encounters with nature sometimes engender (Hepburn 1996).

4. Environmental Aesthetics beyond Natural Environments

Since they first took form in the late twentieth century, the initial positions in environmental aesthetics expanded from their original focus on natural environments to consider human and human-influenced environments. At the same time, the discipline has also come to include the examination of that which falls within such environments, giving rise to what is called the aesthetics of everyday life. This area involves the aesthetics of not only more common objects and environments, but also a range of everyday activities. Concerning both the aesthetics of human environments and the aesthetics of everyday life, approaches that combine the resources of both cognitive and non-cognitive points of views have become more common and seem especially fruitful.

4.1 The Aesthetics of Human Environments

Both the cognitive and the non-cognitive orientations in environmental aesthetics have resources that are brought to bear on the aesthetic investigation of human and human-influenced environments. Of the initial positions, some non-cognitive approaches have made the most substantial contributions to this area of research. The aesthetics of engagement is particularly significant in this regard, constituting a model for the aesthetic appreciation not simply of both nature and art, but also of every other aspect of human experience; it studies the aesthetic dimensions of rural countrysides, small towns, large cities, theme parks, gardens, museums, and even human relationships. Moreover, although, as is clear from the early collections of essays in environmental aesthetics (Kemal and Gaskell 1993, Carlson and Berleant 2004), the field initially concentrated on natural environments, the aesthetics of engagement, unlike most other approaches, from very early on focused not simply on natural environments, but also on human environments and especially on urban environments (Berleant 1978 1984 1986). Much of this material is available in more recently published volumes (Berleant 1997 2004 2005 2010b 2012). It has become a foundation for a substantial body of research on the aesthetic appreciation of urban and as well as other kinds of environments (Haapala 1998, von Bonsdorff 2002, Blanc 2013, Paetzold 2013, Alvarez 2017). Other non-cognitive accounts, such as that which stresses imagination, likewise illuminate our aesthetic responses to a range of human environments as well as to our use of them for purposes such as resource extraction and agricultural production (Brady 2003 2006).

Cognitive accounts also investigate the aesthetic appreciation of human environments, arguing that, as with natural environments, appropriate appreciation depends on knowledge of what something is, what it is like, and why it is as it is. Scientific cognitivism claims that for human environments knowledge provided by the social sciences, especially history, is equally as relevant to aesthetic appreciation as that given by the natural sciences (Carlson 2009). For appropriate appreciation of rural and urban environments, as well as specialized environments such as those of industry and agriculture, what is needed is information about their histories, their functions, and their roles in our lives (Carlson 1985 2001, Parsons 2008b, Parsons and Carlson 2008). Other approaches emphasize the aesthetic potential of cultural traditions, which seem especially relevant to the appreciation of what might be termed cultural landscapes—environments that constitute important places in the cultures and histories of particular groups of people. What is often called a sense of place, together with ideas and images from folklore, mythology, and religion, frequently plays a significant role in individuals’ aesthetic experience of their own home landscapes (Saito 1985, Sepänmaa 1993, Carlson 2000, Sandrisser 2007, Firth 2008, Nomikos 2018).

Fruitful approaches to the aesthetic appreciation of human environments can also be found in views that draw on both cognitive and non-cognitive points of view. There have been attempts to explicitly forge connections between the two orientations (Foster 1998, Moore 1999 2008, Fudge 2001), and there are several collections and studies that, moving beyond the cognitive/non-cognitive distinction, inform our understanding of the appreciation of an array of environments and address issues that arise concerning them (Berleant and Carlson 2007, Arntzen and Brady 2008, Herrington 2009, Brady et al 2018). There are investigations of both rural landscapes (Sepänmaa 2005, von Bonsdorff 2005, Andrews 2007, Benson 2008, Leddy 2008, Brook 2013, Benovsky 2016) and urban cityscapes (von Bonsdorff 2002, Macauley 2007, Sepänmaa 2007, Erzen and Milani 2013, Frydryczak 2015) as well as more specialized environments, such as industrial sites (Saito 2004, Maskit 2007, Kover 2014), shopping centers (Brottman 2007), restored and rewilded environments (Heyd 2002, Prior and Brady 2017, Brady et al 2018), and even environments after the end of nature (Vogel 2015). Beyond the consideration of these larger, more public environments, the aesthetics of everyday life becomes especially relevant.

4.2 The Aesthetics of Everyday Life

The aesthetics of everyday life tends to focus on the aesthetics of smaller environments as well as the common objects and the everyday activities that occupy such environments. Thus it investigates not only the aesthetic qualities of more personal environments, such as individual living spaces, for example, yards and houses (Melchionne 1998 2002, Lee 2010), but also the aesthetic dimensions of normal day-to-day experiences (Leddy 1995 2005b 1012b, Saito 2001 2008 2012 2017b, Haapala 2005, Irvin 2008a 2008b, Mandoki 2010, Maskit 2011). Moreover, it explores the aesthetic aspects of somewhat more specialized and perhaps uniquely human interests and activities, such as the appreciation of the human body (Davies 2014, Irvin 2016b, Saito 2016), of sports (Welsch 2005, Edgar 2013), and of food, cuisine, and dining (Korsmeyer 1999, Sweeney 2017, Ravasio 2018). There are major monographs that address the general topic of the aesthetics of everyday life (Mandoki 2007, Saito 2008 2017a, Leddy 2012b) as well as several collections (von Bonsdorff and Haapala 1999, Light and Smith 2005, Yuedi and Carter 2014a, Irvin 2016a) that pursue particular areas of interest and thus yield insight into and encourage the appreciation of almost every aspect of human life. However, although these various lines of research are clearly very productive, the credentials of the aesthetics of everyday life as an investigation of genuine aesthetic experiences have been challenged, debated, and defended (Dowling 2010, Melchionne 2011 2013 2014, Leddy 2012a 2014 2015, Naukkarinen 2013 2017, Carlson 2014a, Davies 2015, Puolakka 2018).

Nonetheless, in spite of these challenges and concerns about the aesthetics of everyday life, when it turns to the investigation of things such as sports and food, it begins to come full circle, connecting environmental aesthetics back to more traditional aesthetics and to the study of clearly genuine aesthetic experiences. By way of the aesthetics of everyday life, together with the aesthetics of human environments, environmental aesthetics makes contact with the artistic activities involved not only in sports and cuisine, but also in gardening (Miller 1993, Saito 1996, Carlson 1997, Ross 1998, Cooper 2006, Parsons 2008a, Chung 2018, Brady et al 2018) and in landscaping, architecture, and design (Stecker 1999, Carlson 2000, Parsons 2008b 2011 2016, Forsey, 2013, Svabo and Ekelund 2015, van Etteger et al 2016). In addition, and now within the context of environmental aesthetics, traditional art forms, such as poetry and literature (Berleant 1991 2004, Ross 1998, Sepänmaa 2004) and painting, sculpture, dance, and music (Berleant 1991 2004, Ross 1998, Mullis 2014) as well as newer forms, such as environmental art (Crawford 1983, Carlson 1986, Ross 1993, Brady 2007, Brook 2007, Fisher 2007, Lintott 2007, Parsons 2008a, Simus 2008b, Brady et al 2018, Nannicelli 2018), are explored and re-explored—both as aesthetically significant dimensions of our everyday experiences and concerning their roles in shaping our aesthetic appreciation of both natural and human environments. (For more detailed consideration of the aesthetics of everyday life, see the SEP entry on the Aesthetics of the Everyday.)

5. Environmental Aesthetics, Environmentalism, and Future Directions

Together with wider scope of environmental aesthetics, including both the aesthetics of human environments and the aesthetics of everyday life, the twenty-first century has also given rise to renewed investigations of the relationship between environmental aesthetics and environmentalism. This relationship has been increasingly scrutinized, resulting in criticism of earlier work on the aesthetics of nature as well as detailed assessments of contemporary positions. Hand in hand with these developments have come several new interests and directions.

5.1 Environmental Aesthetics and Environmentalism

The relationships between contemporary environmentalism and the positions and ideas of environmental aesthetics have sources in the aesthetics of nature developed in the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries. As noted, early environmental movements, especially in North America, were fueled by a mode of aesthetic appreciation shaped not only by the notion of the picturesque but also by ideas developed by thinkers such as Muir (Hargrove 1979, Callicott 1994, Wattles 2013, Brady 2018). However, more recently the relationship between environmental aesthetics and environmentalism has seemed somewhat more problematic (Carlson 2010). Some individuals interested in the conservation and protection of both natural and human heritage environments have not found in traditional aesthetics of nature the resources that they believe are needed in order to carry out an environmentalist agenda (Loftis 2003). Others investigate problems posed by environments with unique features, such as isolation (Parsons 2015). The problem is especially acute concerning environments, such as wetlands, that do not fit conventional conceptions of scenic beauty (Rolston 2000, Callicott 2003). Moreover, in line with earlier criticisms that much of the empirical work in landscape assessment and planning was focused only on scenic, picturesque environments, much of the historical tradition concerning the aesthetic appreciation of nature has been called into question. Various themes in the aesthetics of nature, such as appreciation grounded in the idea of the picturesque, have been criticized in a number of ways: as anthropocentric (Godlovitch 1994), scenery-obsessed (Saito 1998a), trivial (Callicott 1994), subjective (Thompson 1995), and/or morally vacuous (Andrews 1998). Similarly, in agreement with the aesthetics of engagement’s critique of the theory of disinterestedness, some find that concept to be questionable from an environmental standpoint (Rolston 1998).

There are a variety of responses to these kinds of criticisms of traditional aesthetics of nature and of the notions of disinterestedness and the picturesque. Some reassess and defend the idea of the picturesque, arguing that it, as well as some other aspects of the eighteenth century tradition, has been misunderstood by some contemporary aestheticians (Brook 2008, Paden et al 2013, Paden 2013 2015a 2015b, Earle 2015). Others turn to the investigation of the long neglected member of the original eighteenth-century triumvirate of the beautiful, the sublime, and the picturesque, finding in the sublime new resources for approaching the aesthetic appreciation of the natural world (Brady 2012 2013, Shapshay 2013, Mahoney 2016). However, whatever the final verdict about the significance of the picturesque and the sublime, the resources of non-cognitive approaches, especially the aesthetics of engagement, are taken to counter the criticisms that, due to the influence of ideas such as that of the picturesque, aesthetic experience of nature must be both anthropocentric and scenery-obsessed (Rolston 1998 2002). The charge of anthropocentricity is also explicitly addressed by the mystery approach, which attempts to give aesthetic appreciation of nature an “acentric” basis (Godlovitch 1994). Concerning the concept of disinterestedness, some philosophers yet hold the view that some form of the theory of disinterestedness is essential, since without it the notion of the aesthetic itself lacks conceptual grounding (Budd 2002), while others claim that an analysis of aesthetic experience in terms of the concept of disinterestedness helps to meet the charges that traditional aesthetics is anthropocentric and subjective, since such an analysis supports the objectivity of aesthetic judgments (Brady 2003). Similarly, cognitive accounts also furnish replies to some of these charges. Scientific cognitivism in particular, with its focus on scientific knowledge such as that given by geology and ecology, is claimed to help meet the worry that aesthetic appreciation of environments is of little significance in environmental conservation and preservation since aesthetic appreciation is trivial and subjective (Hettinger 2005, Parsons 2006a 2008a). Nonetheless, the extent to which scientific cognitivism and related ecology-dependent views can successfully address such problems and doubts concerning the appropriate aesthetic appreciation of both natural and human environments is also questioned on various grounds (Budd 2002, Hettinger 2007, Berleant 2010a 2016, Bannon 2011, Stecker 2012, Herguedas 2018, Mikkonen 2018).

Like the movement toward more ecologically informed aesthetic appreciation, the line of thought that connects the aesthetic appreciation of nature with positive aesthetics has also been debated. The contention that untouched, pristine nature has only or primarily positive aesthetic qualities has been related to scientific cognitivism by suggesting that linking the appreciation of nature to scientific knowledge explains how positive aesthetic appreciation is nurtured by a scientific worldview that increasingly interprets the natural world as having positive aesthetic qualities, such as order, balance, unity, and harmony (Carlson 1984). Other philosophers either see the relationship between scientific cognitivism and positive aesthetics somewhat conversely, arguing that the latter should just be assumed, in which case it provides support for the former (Parsons 2002), or simply contend that the positive aesthetics tradition actually has much earlier roots than contemporary scientific cognitivism (Phemister and Strickland 2015). Nonetheless, however it is justified, some versions of the positive aesthetics position are supported by several environmental philosophers (Rolston 1988, Hargrove 1989, Hettinger 2017, Cheng 2017a), while others find it problematic, either since it appears to undercut the possibility of the kind of comparative assessments thought to be necessary for environmental planning and preservation (Thompson 1995, Godlovitch 1998a) or because the idea itself seems unintuitive, obscure, and/or inadequately justified (Godlovitch 1998b, Saito 1998a, Budd 2002, Stecker 2012). Even philosophers who are somewhat open to the idea of positive aesthetics have some reservations about its original formulation, arguing that it depends too heavily on a now out-dated conception of ecology and/or does not adequately stress an evolutionary understanding of nature as an essential component of aesthetic appreciation (Simus 2008a, Paden et al 2012, Paden 2015a 2016). Such considerations may point to a more plausible version of positive aesthetics.

5.2 Environmental Aesthetics: New Interests and Future Directions

In spite of the above noted reservations about various cognitivist approaches, in light of the seeming relevance of natural sciences such as geology, biology, and especially ecology to the aesthetic appreciation of nature, scientific cognitivim is sometimes interpreted as “an ecological aesthetic” in the tradition of Aldo Leopold, who linked the beauty of nature to ecological integrity and stability (Callicott 1994 2003, Gobster 1995). However, although it clearly has roots in Leopold’s thought, the explicit idea of ecological aesthetics, or as it is sometimes called, ecoaesthetics, seems to have later origins (Meeker 1872, Koh 1988). Moreover, although the idea has had for some time a place within analytic environmental aesthetics, perhaps best filled by scientific cognitivism, more recently it has also been adopted by some philosophers working in the “continental tradition”. For example, it is claimed that although phenomenological work in “ecological aesthetics” is “still in its infancy”, the work of Husserl, Heidegger, and Merleau-Ponty is applicable to its development. Moreover, it is suggested that the aesthetics of engagement is the first and currently the strongest “comprehensive phenomenological theory of ecological aesthetics” and that it in combination with scientific cognitivism would constitute a stronger ecological aesthetics (Toadvine 2010). There is also other recent research in environmental aesthetics that draws, more or less, on both analytic and continental traditions (Tafalla 2011, Leddy 2012b, Maskit 2014, Paetzold 2014, Seel 2015, Jóhannesdóttir 2016).

There is, in addition, considerable interest in environmental aesthetics in the East, which likewise draws on both analytic and continental traditions as well as on Eastern philosophy (Cheng 2010 2013b 2017b, Yuedi 2014, Chen 2015). Several different topics concerning both natural and human environments are addressed in the recent work in this area, which includes research not only by Eastern but also by Western scholars (Xue 2008 2018, Xue and Carlson 2010, Saito 2014a, Aota 2016, Berleant 2013a 2016, Carlson 2017, Odin 2017, Zeng Y. 2017, Brubaker 2018, Chung 2018, Parsons and Zhang 2018). There are also some collections that contain relevant essays (Cheng et al 2013, Yuedi and Carter 2014a, Callicott and McRae 2017, Nguyen 2018) as well as some journal issues devoted especially to recent work in Eastern aesthetics, for example, Critical Theory, 1, 2 (2017) and Contemporary Aesthetics, Special Volume 6 (2018). Within this body of work, perhaps the most dominate area of interest is ecological aesthetics, which is pursued by several Chinese aestheticians, who have developed robust versions of ecoaesthetics (Cheng 2013a 2016, Zeng F. 2017). Other than the sources cited here, much of this work is available only in Chinese. However, one prominent version of ecoaesthetics, which is accessible in English, embraces, as the “four keystones of ecological aesthetic appreciation”, not only the centrality of ecological knowledge and the rejection of the duality of humanity and the natural world, but also the over-arching value of ecosystem biodiversity and health and the continued guidance of ecological ethics (Cheng 2013c). While the first two of these four “keystones” reflect scientific cognitivism and the aesthetics of engagement, the last two go well beyond these Western positions. By placing ecosystem health and ecological ethics within the framework of ecoaesthetics, Chinese ecological aesthetics directly and powerfully addresses the question of the relationship between environmental aesthetics and environmental ethics (Carlson 2018). This move is comparable to, and perhaps more successful than, the attempts by Western aestheticians to bring aesthetic appreciation of both natural and human environments in line with moral obligations to maintain environmental and ecological health (Rolston 1995, Eaton 1997 1998, Lintott 2006, Saito 2007 2008, Varandas 2015) and to forge strong positive links between aesthetic appreciation of nature and nature protection and preservation (Rolston 2002, Brady 2003, Carlson and Lintott 2007, Parsons 2008a, Carlson 2010, Lintott and Carlson 2014, Parsons 2018). Nonetheless, the degree to which aesthetic appreciation of both natural and human environments and ethical considerations are related to one another continues to be a matter of investigation, discussion, and debate (Loftis 2003, Bannon 2011, Stecker 2012, Carlson 2018, Stewart and Johnson 2018).

The current research in environmental aesthetics that draws on the continental tradition and the extensive work on ecoaesthetics by Eastern scholars are examples of the globalization of environmental aesthetics. Recently there have been calls in both the East and the West for the globalization of aesthetics in general (Li and Cauvel 2006, Higgins 2017) and of environmental aesthetics in particular (Saito 2010, Yuedi and Carter 2014b). Such calls are vital to the continuing growth of the field, yet it is also important to note that, although work on ecoaesthetics within the continental tradition and its development in the East are relatively recent, environmental aesthetics itself has long had a global orientation. Since its inception, there has been interest in the field by a wide range of scholars exploring different philosophical traditions and/or working in different countries. For example, drawing on continental philosophy is not new to environmental aesthetics (Berleant 1985). Likewise, there was significant research on Japanese aesthetics of nature early in the development of environmental aesthetics (Saito 1985 1992 1996) which has continued into the present century (Saito 2002 2014a). Another example is the research produced in Finland, where a number of conferences were hosted during the 1990s and 2000s, each followed by a collection of articles, such as (Sepänmaa and Heikkilä-Palo 2005, Sepänmaa et al 2007). Similarly, several conferences have been held in China in recent years, to which Western scholars have been invited and from which have followed collections of articles (Cheng et al 2013, Yuedi and Carter 2014a). Similar collections have also published papers presented at conferences in Europe (Drenthen and Keulartz 2014) and in North America, from which papers are included in a recent special issue of the Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism (Shapshay and Tenen 2018a). Another indication of the global appeal of environmental aesthetics is that many articles and books in environmental aesthetics have been translated from English into a number of other languages, including several European languages as well as Korean and especially Chinese, into which several of the basic Western texts in environmental aesthetics have been translated. Moreover, this global appeal is further evidenced by the prolific research in the field currently being published in several different countries and languages.

The continuing globalization of environmental aesthetics as well as the currently fruitful discussions both within and among the various points of view represented in contemporary research, such as in ecoaesthetics, suggests that the work that is most productive for promoting and supporting the aesthetic appreciation and preservation of all kinds of environments, both natural and human, is that which depends not simply on any one particular approach to environmental aesthetics, but rather on attempts to bring together the resources of several different orientations and traditions (Nassauer 1997, Lintott 2006, Carlson 2009, Moore 2008, Cheng et al 2013, Carlson 2018). For example, in addition to the Chinese research in ecoaesthetics, there are, as noted, similar efforts by Western scholars to combine elements of cognitive and non-cognitive points of view (Rolston 1998 2002, Saito 2007, Toadvine 2010). Moreover, many thinkers explore other topics that they constructively relate to environmental aesthetics, for instance, feminist theory (Lee 2006, Lintott 2010, Lintott and Irvin 2016), political and social issues (Berleant 2005 2012, Ross 2005, Simus 2008b, McShane 2018, Saito 2018), philosophy of biology (Parsons and Carlson 2008), animal treatment and protection (Parsons 2007, Hettinger 2010, Semczyszyn 2013, Brady 2014a, Tafalla 2017, Cross 2018), weather and climate change (Brady 2014b, Diaconu 2015, Nomikos 2018), and, perhaps most important, the enrichment of the quality of human life (Saito 2017a 2018, Jamieson 2018). This kind of work can also pursue the application of these and related topics to environmental policy and practice (Saito 2007, Berleant 2010b 2012, Parsons 2010, Sepänmaa 2010, Robinson and Elliott 2011, Cheng et al 2013, Brady 2014b). In this way, these contributions continue to shape the future directions of environmental aesthetics (Saito 2010 2014b, Blanc 2012, Drenthen and Keulartz 2014, Shapshay and Tenen 2018b). Such innovative, eclectic approaches, coupled with the globalization of environmental aesthetics, will hopefully not only further a wide range of environmental goals and practices but also foster a deeper understanding and appreciation of the aesthetic potential of the world in which we live.

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