Aesthetics of the Everyday
In the history of Western aesthetics, the subject matters that received attention ranged from natural objects and phenomena, built structures, utilitarian objects, and human actions, to what is today regarded as the fine arts. However, beginning with the nineteenth century, the discourse has become increasingly focused on the fine arts. This narrowing attention occurred despite the prominence of the aesthetic attitude theory in modern aesthetics, according to which there is virtually no limit to what can become a source of aesthetic experience. The tendency to equate aesthetics with the philosophy of art became widespread in twentieth century aesthetics, particularly within the Anglo-American tradition.
Challenges to this rather limited scope of aesthetics began during the latter half of the twentieth century with a renewed interest in nature and environment, followed by the exploration of popular arts. Everyday aesthetics continues this trajectory of widening scope by including objects, events, and activities that constitute people’s daily life. However, it is more accurate to characterize this recent development as restoring the scope of aesthetics rather than opening a new arena.
In addition, although not formulated as aesthetic theories, many cultural traditions outside the Western sphere are concerned with the aesthetics of daily life. In some cultural traditions, such as Inuit and Navajo, aesthetic considerations are thoroughly integrated in daily activities, including making things such as tools. Even in other traditions, such as Japanese and Chinese, with distinctive art-making practices of paintings, literature, theater, and the like, aesthetic practices permeate people’s daily life. In these cultural traditions, there may not be a need for an aesthetics discourse specifically devoted to everyday life.
Thus, the perception that everyday aesthetics is a new frontier of aesthetics discourse needs to be situated in the context of late twentieth-century Anglo-American aesthetics. That is, it was established as a reaction against what was considered to be an undue restriction on the scope of aesthetics. It aims to give due regard to the entirety of people’s multi-faceted aesthetic life, including various ingredients of everyday life: artifacts of daily use, chores around the house, interactions with other people, and quotidian activities such as eating, walking, and bathing. Everyday aesthetics also seeks to liberate aesthetic inquiry from an almost exclusive focus on beauty (and to a certain extent sublimity) characteristic of modern Western aesthetics. It includes within its purview those qualities that pervade everyday experience, such as pretty, cute, messy, gaudy, tasteful, dirty, lively, monotonous, to name only a few. These items and qualities are characterized by their ubiquitous presence in the daily life of people, regardless of their occupation, lifestyle, economic status, social class, cultural background, and familiarity with art.
Beyond attending to more items and qualities for its inquiry, everyday aesthetics also raises theoretical issues that have not received adequate attention from the prevailing mainstream Western aesthetics. These include: indeterminate identity of the object of aesthetic experience due to a lack of an institutionally agreed-upon framing; changes and modifications everyday objects go through; general anonymity of the designer and creator, as well as absence of any clear authorship behind everyday objects; bodily engagements with objects and activities and their pragmatic outcome; perceived lack of criteria for aesthetic judgments. By raising these issues, everyday aesthetics challenges long-held assumptions underlying art-centered aesthetics discourse. However, everyday aesthetics advocates pose these challenges not as a way of invalidating the established aesthetics discourse. Rather, they are meant to shed new light on the prevailing discourse. Just as new forms of art often introduce qualities and values that were not considered before and enrich the artworld, as suggested by Arthur Danto, everyday aesthetics proposes to help develop the overall aesthetics discourse by adding new avenues of inquiry. Accordingly, the account of everyday aesthetics that follows will focus on these issues that have been raised to illuminate and challenge the prevailing aesthetics discourse in contemporary Western philosophy.
- 1. Recent History
- 2. ‘Everyday’ and ‘Aesthetics’ in Everyday Aesthetics
- 3. Defamiliarization of the Familiar
- 4. Negative Aesthetics
- 5. Everyday Aesthetic Qualities
- 6. Ambient Aesthetics and Social Aesthetics
- 7. Action-Oriented Aesthetics
- 8. Blurring the Line between Art and Life
- 9. Significance of Everyday Aesthetics
- 10. Conclusion
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
With the establishment of environmental aesthetics, efforts to open the field of aesthetics beyond the fine arts started during the latter half of twentieth century. Almost all writers on everyday aesthetics derive inspiration from John Dewey’s Art as Experience, first published in 1934. In particular, his discussion of “having an experience” demonstrates that aesthetic experience is possible in every aspect of people’s daily life, ranging from eating a meal or solving a math problem to having a job interview. By locating ‘the aesthetic’ in the character of an experience rather than in a specific kind of object or situation, Dewey paves the way for everyday aesthetics advocates to explore diverse aspects of people’s aesthetic lives without a pre-configured boundary.
If Dewey’s aesthetics can be considered as the classic for everyday aesthetics discourse, Arnold Berleant’s early works on aesthetic field and engagement continue the trajectory. Despite focusing on the experience of art and without specifically referring to the term ‘everyday aesthetics,’ Berleant’s early works provide a phenomenological account of aesthetic experience by emphasizing the interactive process between the experiencing agent and the object of experience. This notion of ‘engagement’ as a model for aesthetics is applicable to one’s experience beyond art. Indeed, his subsequent works on environmental aesthetics, both natural and built, and more recently on social aesthetics and negative aesthetics have been consistently opening the scope of aesthetic inquiry.
Other notable early works specifically addressing issues of everyday aesthetics include Melvin Rader and Bertram Jessup’s Art and Human Values (1976), Joseph Kupfer’s Experience as Art: Aesthetics in Everyday Life (1983) and David Novitz’s The Boundaries of Art: A Philosophical Inquiry into the Place of Art in Everyday Life (1992), as well as Thomas Leddy’s “Everyday Surface Aesthetic Qualities: ‘Neat,’ ‘Messy,’ ‘Clean,’ ‘Dirty’” (1995) and “Sparkle and Shine” (1997). Marcia Eaton devotes considerable attention to aesthetic issues beyond art, with a particular emphasis on aesthetics’ intersection with the ethical, in her Aesthetics and the Good Life (1989) and later in Merit, Aesthetic and Ethical (2001).
The first anthology on this topic, The Aesthetics of Everyday Life, edited by Andrew Light and Jonathan M. Smith, published in 2005, includes many articles that together lay the groundwork for more recent literature on everyday aesthetics. A more recent collection is the Special Volume on “Artification” (2012), edited by Ossi Naukkarinen and Yuriko Saito, published in Contemporary Aesthetics. Articles in this collection explore the increasingly popular strategy of employing an artistic approach in various dimensions of life, ranging from business and education to science and sports.
Paralleling these works devoted to the wide scope of everyday aesthetics are works dedicated to specific aspects of daily life, such as gustatory aesthetics (Korsmeyer 1999), domestic aesthetics (McCracken 2001), body aesthetics (Shusterman 1999, 2013; Bhatt 2013; Irvin forthcoming), functional beauty (Parsons and Carlson 2008) and the aesthetics of design (Forsey 2013).
The first single-author work with the specific title Everyday Aesthetics, accompanied by the subtitle Prosaics, the Play of Culture and Social Identities, was written by Katya Mandoki and published in 2007. She offers an extensive critique of the prevailing Western aesthetic discourse burdened by what she characterizes as “fetishes” regarding art and beauty, as well as a detailed semiotic analysis of aesthetics involved in areas ranging from religion and education to family and medicine. Almost immediately after the publication of Mandoki’s book, Yuriko Saito’s Everyday Aesthetics was published. Mandoki’s and Saito’s works, both featuring the title Everyday Aesthetics, together secured the place of everyday aesthetics as a sub-discipline of aesthetics. With the publication of Thomas Leddy’s The Extraordinary in the Ordinary: the Aesthetics of Everyday Life (2012), the discourse of everyday aesthetics became firmly established. These books have given rise to an increasingly lively debate on the subject in journals such as The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, The British Journal of Aesthetics, and Contemporary Aesthetics, as indicated in the bibliography.
Although Saito’s work includes extensive discussion of Japanese aesthetics, the first explicitly and specifically multi-cultural exploration of everyday aesthetics appeared in the form of an anthology, Aesthetics of Everyday Life: East and West (2014), edited by Liu Yuedi and Curtis Carter, with a number of pieces on Chinese aesthetics.
Because everyday aesthetics was initially proposed as a way of overcoming modern Western aesthetics’ limitation on what comprises people’s aesthetic life as its subject matter, its scope has not been clearly defined except as including what has not been covered by art-centered aesthetics. With the development of this discourse, however, questions emerged as to what constitutes ‘everyday’ and ‘aesthetics’ in everyday aesthetics. Inclusion of not only daily activities like eating, grooming, dressing, and cleaning but also occasional and even rare events such as parties, sporting events, holidays, weddings, and travelling calls into question whether ‘everyday’ should be understood literally. Furthermore, what may count as an everyday activity for one person may be a special occasion for other people. Working on a farm constitutes a farmer’s everyday life, while it is a rare experience sought by a city dweller who participates in a tour that incorporates work experience, such as a day working in a vineyard. Besides people’s occupation and lifestyle, diverse living environments determine what is included in their everyday life. For those residents in a densely populated urban area with a developed network of public transportation, as well as for those living in different parts of the world, riding in a car may be a rare occasion, while it is a daily routine for many living in typical American suburbs.
The notion of ‘everyday’ thus becomes hopelessly unwieldy, and it is impossible to come up with a list of objects and activities that belong to it. However, one could point to some core activities and objects that transcend individual and cultural differences, such as eating, dressing, grooming, shelter, and basic utilitarian objects, such as clothing, furniture, and eating implements (Melchionne 2013). The most important factor for the purpose of everyday aesthetics, however, is not so much an inventory of objects and activities but rather the typical attitude we take toward them. We tend to experience these objects and activities mostly with pragmatic considerations that eclipse their aesthetic potentials (Bullough 1912–13; Stolnitz 1969; Ziff 1997). These experiences are generally regarded as ordinary, commonplace, and routine. Such characterization may be the best way to capture ‘everyday,’ allowing diverse occupations, lifestyles, and living environments that give rise to different ingredients of everyday life. Locating the defining characteristics of ‘everyday’ in attitude and experience rather than in specific kinds of objects and activities has the advantage of accounting for how works of art, such as paintings, could be an ingredient of somebody’s everyday experience if his job is to wrap, package, and ship them.
Many advocates of everyday aesthetics also include rare, standout, and more artistically-charged occasions in its scope. For example, a holiday celebration is laden with all kinds of aesthetic considerations, ranging from interior and exterior decorations to special dishes, a carefully-arranged table setting and festive music. Many of us specifically attend to these aesthetic aspects both as providers and as receivers, giving aesthetics a predominant role in these experiences. In light of these different kinds of experiences, some suggest allowing gradation among various objects and activities, with one end designating the most quotidian objects and activities that are experienced primarily with a pragmatic mindset, and the other end those occasions standing out from daily life and marked by much more conscious attention to the aesthetic dimension, rendering the experience more like art appreciation (Naukkarinen 2013; Leddy 2015).
Debates surrounding what constitutes ‘aesthetics’ in everyday aesthetics are not unique to this discourse. The nature of aesthetics has been a perennial point of contention in aesthetics at large, whether regarding fine arts, nature, popular culture or everyday objects and activities. However, there are at least two points of particular interest and significance regarding the notion of ‘aesthetics’ in everyday aesthetics. First is the status of bodily sensations. They can be felt by us as we receive sensory stimulation such as the wafting smell of baked goods, the sensation of silk against our skin, the taste of sushi, or the feeling of massage. They can also result from bodily activities, such as running, chopping vegetables, using tools, or mowing the lawn. The debate regarding whether or not these bodily sensations belong to the realm of aesthetics proper is not new. The best-known classical treatment of this issue is Immanuel Kant’s distinction between the beautiful and the agreeable or the pleasant. Many contemporary art projects also give rise to this discussion through the creation of olfactory art, art happenings that include cooking and eating, and participatory art that requires the audience’s bodily engagement. However, the issue becomes more acute with everyday aesthetics because our daily experience is permeated by sensory experiences and bodily activities.
Another important issue regarding the term ‘aesthetics’ in everyday aesthetics is the distinction between its honorific and classificatory use. In both aesthetics discourse and common vernacular, the term ‘aesthetic’ is generally used in the honorific sense. Hence, something having an aesthetic property is generally regarded positively and gaining an aesthetic experience is understood to mean that it is a meaningful and satisfying experience. However, many, though not all, advocates of everyday aesthetics return to the root meaning of ‘aesthetic’ as experience gained through sensibility, whatever its evaluative valence may be. Some things strike us with powerful positive aesthetic values, as in a great work of art or a spectacular landscape, while other things do not affect us much because they are boring, non-descript, or plain. Then there are those objects and phenomena that offend or disturb us profoundly because their sensuous appearance is hideous, monstrous, or appalling, without any overall redeeming value such as an artistic message. Everyday aesthetics casts a wide net for capturing these diverse dimensions of our aesthetic life. It is noteworthy that in academic discourses outside of philosophical aesthetics, ‘aesthetics’ is often regarded in the classificatory sense, such as the aesthetics of manners, which includes both polite and rude behaviors, and the aesthetics of politics which, among other things, refers to the social and political construction of what counts as the sensible (Rancière 2009).
If ‘everyday’ is characterized as the familiar, ordinary, commonplace, and routine, regardless of the specific content that varies from people to people depending upon their lifestyle, occupation, living environment, and other factors, what makes its aesthetic appreciation possible? The following response dominates everyday aesthetics discourse: the aesthetic appreciation of everyday life requires defamiliarization, making strange, or casting an aura. Because we are most of the time preoccupied by the task at hand in our daily life, pragmatic considerations mask the aesthetic potential of commonplace objects and ordinary activities. Once we experience them with a different attitude and perceptual gear, we can unearth latent aesthetic values in the most ordinary and routine. This view can be interpreted as a faithful application of the claim made by the aesthetic attitude theory that theoretically anything can be an object of aesthetic experience. Mundane objects can acquire a kind of ‘aura’ that heightens their aesthetic value (Leddy 2008, 2012a; Leonhardt 1985; Tuan 1993; Visser 1997; Gumbrecht 2006). According to this interpretation, what is new about everyday aesthetics is its illumination of those aspects of our lives that are normally neglected or ignored because they are eclipsed by standout aesthetic experiences we often have with works of art and nature. More careful attention and a different mindset can reveal a surprisingly rich aesthetic dimension of the otherwise mundane, non-memorable, ordinary parts of our daily life. Many works of art are helpful in guiding us through the morasses of everyday life toward a rewarding aesthetic experience (Dillard 1974; Prose 1999; Stabb 2002; Martin 2004).
This trajectory of everyday aesthetics is welcomed by a number of thinkers for its contribution to enriching life experience, encouraging mindful living, and facilitating satisfaction without problematic consequences that often accompany a hedonistic lifestyle (Irvin 2008b; Melchionne 2014; Shusterman 2013). At the same time, some point out the danger of over-emphasizing defamiliarization as a precondition for everyday aesthetics. That is, this way of accounting for everyday aesthetics risks losing the very everyday-ness of everyday experience, thereby becoming unable to capture the aesthetic texture of everyday life characterized by its familiar, ordinary, and mundane quality (Haapala 2005; Felski 2002, 2009; Highmore 2004, 2011a). The challenge then becomes how to capture the very ordinary everyday-ness of everyday life while engaging aesthetically. That is, experiencing and appreciating the ordinary as extraordinary follows a rather well-trodden path in aesthetics discourse, while experiencing and appreciating the ordinary as ordinary poses a specific challenge to everyday aesthetics discourse.
One proposed response to this challenge is to regard qualities such as the familiar and the ordinary as positively appreciable as a counterpart to those qualities that make some experiences stand out for being intense and extraordinary. Though not stunning or intense, those qualities characterizing the ordinary life provide a quiet calm, comfort, stability, and security to our life experience (Haapala 2005). It is difficult to imagine how we can handle, let alone enjoy, a constant series of extraordinary, intense experiences with no restful period. Many aspects of domestic life instead offer comfort and stability, in short hominess, because of the very ordinary and repetitive nature, and such qualities are indispensable for good life and appreciable in their own right (Irvin 2008b; Melchionne 2014, Highmore 2004, 2011a).
In contrast, others characterize the ordinariness of everyday life as a dreary humdrum with no aesthetic merits. It is monotonous, boring, and dull; John Dewey even goes so far as to declare such humdrum as “anesthetic.” Unless these aspects of our life get defamiliarized and made into “an” experience in Dewey’s sense or transformed into something extraordinary, they are outside the purview of aesthetics, according to this view.
Some question, however, whether there are any parts of our experience that are “anesthetic.” They claim that the lack of coherent structure, slackness, monotony, and humdrum themselves characterize the aesthetic texture of everyday life, if we understand ‘aesthetic’ in the classificatory, not honorific, sense (Highmore 2011a). Deficiency in positive aesthetic qualities, such as exciting intensity, coherent narrative structure, or pervasive unifying theme, does not necessarily mean lack of aesthetic qualities. Those aspects of our lives can still be regarded as permeated by aesthetic qualities, though negative, such as dreariness and painful monotony. Such negative characterization of everyday life has often been the subject of Marxist interpretations of workers’ daily lives, whether at work or at home, providing a platform for rebellious movements, such as the Situationist International (Highmore 2010).
This account of everyday life as pervaded by negative aesthetic qualities rather than lacking any aesthetic qualities gives rise to ‘negative aesthetics.’ This notion may at first appear to be an oxymoron, if ‘aesthetics’ is understood in the usual honorific sense. Katya Mandoki and Arnold Berleant stress the importance of attending to this aesthetically negative aspect of people’s lives that is unfortunately all-too-common (Mandoki 2007; Berleant 2010, 2012). Negative aesthetic qualities such as ugliness, grotesqueness, repulsiveness, and disgust have not been absent in the prevailing aesthetics discourse, but they don’t occupy a prominent place. Furthermore, more often than not, these negative qualities become justified as a necessary means to facilitating an ultimately positive aesthetic experience. For example, a disgusting content of art may be necessary for conveying an overall message, such as an exposé and critique of social ills, or a repulsive sight in nature, such as a predator devouring its prey, can be appreciated as an integral part of nature’s process.
Negative aesthetic qualities experienced as negative, in comparison, are quite pervasive in everyday life and they directly affect the quality of life. They range from less noteworthy qualities such as the boring, the monotonous, the uninspiring, the banal, and the dull to “aesthetic violence,” “aesthetic pain,” “aesthetic poisoning,” or “aesthetic assault,” such as the hideous, the offensive, the repulsive, and the vulgar (Mandoki 2007). These more dramatically negative qualities can be experienced in a squalid urban space, deafening noise, cluttered billboard with gaudy signage and sordid visual images, stench from a nearby factory, and the like. In light of the fact that aesthetics has tended to confine its scope to positive qualities and experiences, everyday aesthetics challenges us to pay serious attention to the aesthetically negative aspects of our lives because of their immediate impact on the quality of life.
The focus on negative aesthetics is particularly important in everyday aesthetics discourse because it leads to what may be regarded as its activist dimension. When confronted with negative aesthetic qualities, we generally don’t remain a mere spectator but rather spring into action to eliminate, reduce, or transform them. Even if we don’t or can’t act, we wish we could do so and we think we should. According to the prevailing mode of aesthetic analysis regarding art, and to a certain extent nature, our aesthetic life is primarily characterized from a spectator’s point of view. We are not literally engaged in an activity with the object other than aesthetic engagement. Even if we are inspired to act by art or nature, the resultant action is generally indirect, such as joining a political movement or making a contribution to an organization.
In comparison, the action we undertake motivated by negative aesthetics in daily life has a direct impact on life. On a personal level, we launder a stained shirt and iron it, clean the carpet soiled by spilled wine, repaint the exterior of the house, open a window to get fresh air after cooking fish indoors, tidy up the living room, reformat a document for a clearer look, and the list goes on. These actions are taken primarily in response to our negative aesthetic reaction against stain, wrinkle, peeling paint, fishy smell, mess and clutter, and disorganized look. On a community level, eyesore-like abandoned structures get torn down or given a make-over, a squalid neighborhood gets cleaned up, and ordinances are created to eliminate factory stench and cluttered billboards. At least we often work, or believe we should work, toward improving the aesthetics of everyday environment and life. Negative aesthetic experiences are thus useful and necessary in detecting what is harmful to the quality of life and environment and provide an impetus for improvement (Berleant 2012, 2012).
However, questions can be raised as to whether qualities such as messiness and clutter belong to aesthetics discourse. Appreciation of more typical aesthetic qualities, such as beauty, sublimity, elegance, grace, artistic excellence, powerful expression, and the like, is said to require a certain degree of aesthetic sensibility or ‘standard of taste’ that needs to be cultivated. Moreover, their appreciation often demands a certain conceptual understanding of things, such as the object’s historical and cultural context, the artist’s oeuvre, and some basic information regarding nature, among others. In comparison, the detection of the everyday aesthetic qualities in question, such as messiness, shabbiness, cuteness, and prettiness, seems to result from an almost knee-jerk reaction without any background knowledge or aesthetic sophistication and, as such, does not make a worthy subject matter for aesthetics.
Two responses have been given to this challenge. First, even if some qualities can be experienced without the same kind and degree of aesthetic sensibility or sophistication required for art appreciation, this alone does not render them outside the realm of aesthetics. Even a seemingly unreflective response to qualities, such as dirty, messy, and disorganized, is not free of a cultural and contextual framework (Douglas 2002; Saito 2007). Second, it is possible to provide a kind of sliding scale with one end requiring utmost sensibility often obtained after extensive education and practice, such as the ability to appreciate twelve-tone music, Joyce’s novels, Japanese Noh theater, and bogs, and the other end requiring very little education and practice, such as Norman Rockwell paintings, a military march, a sparkling jewelry piece, and a colorful flower garden. Some aesthetic qualities can be considered ‘major league’ or heavy-weight while other aesthetic qualities are ‘minor league’ or light-weight, without disqualifying the latter from the realm of the aesthetic altogether. After all, they refer to our qualitative response to the sensory experience of the objects and phenomena (Leddy 1995, 1997, 2012a, 2012b; Harris 2000; Ngai 2012; Postrel 2013; Mollar 2014).
If minor league aesthetic qualities lack sophistication and profundity compared to major league aesthetic qualities, a case can be made that they make up for this lack by their pervasiveness in daily life with serious consequences. While we do experience beauty and sublimity in our daily life, such occasions are rather rare. More often than not, in our everyday life, we judge things for being pretty, nice, interesting, cute, sweet, adorable, boring, plain, drab, dowdy, shabby, gaudy, ostentatious, and the like. It is particularly important to attend to these qualities because, due to their prevalence and relatively easy recognition, they exert a powerful influence on our decisions and actions regarding mundane matters (Saito 2012). Indeed, strategies in advertising, political campaigning, and propaganda often make use of these qualities to direct people’s behavior (Postrel 2003; Mandoki 2007; Saito 2007; Sartwell 2010). This consideration leads some thinkers to charge everyday aesthetics with the task of cultivating aesthetic literacy and vigilance by critically analyzing these qualities.
A similar controversy exists regarding the ‘aesthetic credential’ of some experiences (Dowling 2010). It concerns the purely bodily-oriented responses such as the sensation of scratching an itch, receiving a massage, drinking tea, or smelling fishy odor (Irvin 2006, 2008). There is a concern that they are too private and subjective to allow any inter-subjective discussion and critical discourse, resulting in subjective relativism. Kant’s distinction between the beautiful and the merely agreeable is often invoked to support this criticism (Parsons and Carlson 2008; Soucek 2009; Dowling 2010).
In response, some thinkers point out that it is a mistake to treat these bodily sensations as an isolated, singular sensory experience. According to them, in ordinary life, we almost never have an experience of smell, taste, or touch by itself. Instead, our experiences are usually multi-sensory or synaesthetic and take place in a specific context (Howes 2005; Howes and Classen 2014). Scratching an itch can be a part of experiencing a mosquito-infested bog, or experienced as an annoyance caused by the stiff fabric label sewn on the inside of a new shirt collar. The taste of tea cannot be separated from its aroma, visual appearance, and the tactile sensations of texture and warmth as one holds the mug and presses the lip against its rim. All of these sensory experiences take place in a certain surrounding and situation with its own ambiance, as well as within the specific flow of one’s daily life. One may grab a cup of tea on the run and gulp it down to get the caffeine kick as one rushes to a meeting, or savor each sip as one sits in front of a fireplace relaxing, or participate in the Japanese tea ceremony. Even if the tea itself were to remain the same, the experience surrounding its ingestion changes, sometimes even affecting the taste of tea itself (Irvin 2009a; Melchionne 2011, 2014). Thus, purely bodily sensation can be folded into the atmosphere or ambiance constituted by many ingredients. Then what we appreciate is not merely a singular bodily sensation in isolation such as the tactile sensation or smell but the fittingness or, one may even say, Kantian ‘purposiveness,’ or lack thereof, created by the relationship between and among factors making up the atmosphere.
Presumed subjective relativism regarding a purely bodily sensation, therefore, can be mitigated at least to a certain extent if it is regarded as one of the many ingredients that make up a larger whole permeated by a unified atmosphere, such as a sense of well-being, contentment, comfort, or negatively, a sense of isolation, discomfort, uneasiness, or anxiety. Such an appreciation (or depreciation) allows some degree of inter-subjective communication and sharing; indeed many literary narratives provide a rich reservoir of such experiences.
This attention to atmosphere or ambiance of a certain situation constituted by various ingredients gives rise to one newly emerging subfield of everyday aesthetics: ambient aesthetics. Gernot Böhme suggests that atmosphere should be the central focus of new aesthetics. In our daily life, we often experience the atmospheric character of a situation: tense or relaxed, cheerful or melancholic, exuberant or subdued, inviting or alienating, electrifying or dull. Sometimes a distinct character of a situation is intentionally orchestrated, oftentimes in a special occasions like a wedding or a funeral, with specifically selected music, decorations, attire, and choreographed movements, to name a few. Some other times, a unified atmosphere arises spontaneously when various elements making up the physical environment and human interactions and movements within it happen to congeal (Böhme 1993, 1998; Miyahara 2014).
Although in our daily life we experience and appreciate (or depreciate) a certain atmosphere or ambiance quite frequently, it has not received adequate attention in the aesthetics discourse primarily because of the lack of clearly defined and delineated ‘object’ of the experience. Without a clear ‘frame’ around the object of experience, critics suggest, inter-subjective discussion of its aesthetics is not possible. Nor are there clear criteria, such as art historical conventions, that are helpful in determining what is and is not a part of the aesthetic experience (Parsons and Carlson 2008). Ambiance, air, or atmosphere is indeed subjectively-oriented in the sense that one’s experience becomes colored accordingly. However, it should also be noted that it is not purely subjective or private, as claimed by critics, insofar as it refers to objectively identifiable features of the environment and situation.
Part of what determines the ambiance or atmosphere is human interactions. The character of such interactions is constituted by the participants’ personality and relationships with others that are subject to aesthetic considerations. In addition to what one does and says, one can be considered warm, cold, formal, aloof, friendly, intimidating, gentle, and so forth, largely due to aesthetic factors such as tone of voice, way of speaking, facial expression, bodily gesture and posture, and outward presentation such as clothing, hair style, ornamentation, and the like. Sometimes the moral character of one’s action is assessed by aesthetic dimensions over and beyond what the action accomplishes. For example, one may gobble up a lovingly prepared and meticulously arranged meal carelessly and indifferently, or one may take time and savor every bite respectfully and mindfully to show one’s appreciation for the cook. One can close a door roughly, making a loud noise and startling others, or one can close it gently and carefully so as not to disturb others. Finally, one can help a person in need grudgingly and spitefully or do so with care and good cheer (Saito forthcoming).
In these examples, important desiderata in aesthetic experiences can also be regarded as desirable in human relationships: open-mindedness to accept and appreciate diversity, respect and reciprocity, full and sincere engagement, among others. Established as a sub-category of everyday aesthetics by Arnold Berleant, social aesthetics calls attention to the fact that the aesthetics plays a surprisingly and often unrecognized role in determining the moral character of actions, persons, and human interactions (Berleant 2005, 2010, 2012).
Furthermore, social aesthetics promotes cultivating virtues through everyday practice. One’s kindness, compassion, thoughtfulness, and respect require appropriate expressions guided by aesthetic sensibility and skills, in addition to accomplishing a certain deed. Harmonious and cooperative interaction with others also requires aesthetic sensibility to decipher group dynamics and determine how best to help create a certain atmosphere.
Social aesthetics also sheds light on another new avenue of inquiry ushered in by everyday aesthetics: the aesthetic dimension of doing things instead of, or in addition to, the experience gained as a spectator or beholder. The traditional mode of aesthetic inquiry is primarily concerned with analyzing the aesthetic experience of a spectator who derives aesthetic pleasure from contemplating an object (or a phenomenon or an event). Even in such an experience, as Berleant’s engagement model indicates, the person is never passive; she is actively engaged with the object through exercising imagination and interacts with it perceptually, intellectually, and emotionally. However, in the most literal sense, she is still an onlooker of the object: a painting, a symphony, a tea bowl, a figure skating performance, a flower garden, a piece of furniture, an automobile, a house, and a freshly laundered shirt.
While everyday aesthetics includes such spectator-oriented aesthetics, a major part constituting the flow of everyday life is our active engagement with doing things by handling an object, executing an act, and producing certain results, all motivated by aesthetic considerations. Until recently, very little has been explored of the aesthetic dimensions of active involvement in painting a canvas, playing a violin, skating, gardening, repairing a garment, hanging laundry outdoors, and giving birth (Rautio 2009; Lintott 2012) . Perhaps food aesthetics illustrates this contrast most clearly. Food aesthetics generally focuses on the taste of the food rather than the experience of eating itself or the activity of cooking (Curtin and Heldke 1992; Visser 1997; Giard 1998; Korsmeyer 1999; Shusterman 2013).
The difficulty of accounting for the aesthetics involved in these activities from the participants’ perspective is the same difficulty facing ambient aesthetics: the lack of clear delineation of object-hood of aesthetic experience. The constituents of an aesthetic object are more or less clear in the case of a painting or a flower garden appreciated from the spectator’s point of view. Furthermore, there is an object one can point to for inter-subjective communication. However, there is no equivalent ‘object’ of aesthetic experience when it comes to an activity one undertakes. This lack, according to some thinkers, signals the demise of any reasonable discussion as the subject matter becomes hopelessly private with little possibility of inter-subjective discourse. While we can meaningfully debate the aesthetic merit of a painting or a flower garden by giving reasons to justify our judgment, it is difficult to imagine an equivalent discussion of my experience of bodily engagement when executing brush ink painting or digging the ground and planting flowers for the flower garden.
If one accepts John Dewey’s notion of having “an experience” which gives an aesthetic character to whatever experience one is undergoing, it becomes a challenge to facilitate a critical discourse to determine whether or not one is truly having “an experience.” The act of planting flowers involves a multi-sensory experience and bodily engagement, as well as designing the garden’s layout. These ingredients may come together in a unified manner to give rise to a sense of joy felt by the gardener at the arrival of spring and the anticipation of fully-blossomed flowers. It is difficult to imagine how this gardener’s experience can be subjected to a critical discourse in the same way the flower bed gets evaluated aesthetically for its design. Can we have a debate about whether the gardener’s experience was truly aesthetic or whether it provided a rich or only mediocre aesthetic experience? If not, is this aspect of our life forever closed to any mode of aesthetic inquiry?
The difficulty felt here regarding the aesthetics of ambiance and actions could be attributed to the mode of contemporary Western aesthetic inquiry which is predominantly judgment-oriented (Böhme 1993). Much of mainstream aesthetic debates surrounds the objectivity and justifiability of aesthetic judgment. A judgment presupposes the determinability of an object and its inter-subjectively sharable experience. Anything falling outside of it is considered hopelessly subjective and relativistic. However, phenomenological accounts of bodily engagement in cooking, sports, and other mundane activities are plentiful not only in some aestheticians’ writings but also, perhaps more commonly, in writings by practitioners and literary authors. Body aesthetics is also garnering more attention in recent philosophy and a large part of its concern is the bodily engagement in aesthetic experience (Bhatt 2013; Irvin forthcoming).
Furthermore, some agree that the practice of mundane activities, domestic chores in particular, provides an opportunity for one to exercise imagination and creativity to inspire an aesthetic experience (McCracken 2001; Lee 2010; Highmore 2011a). For example, the activity of outdoor laundry hanging can be a chance for the person to arrange and hang the items in an aesthetically pleasing way to express her respect and thoughtfulness toward her neighbors and passersby who are inevitably exposed to the visual parade of laundered items. At the same time, this activity will occasion her appreciation of the arrival of spring after a long winter, as well as anticipation of the sweet smell and crisp texture of dried items thanks to the sunshine and fresh air carried by the breeze (Rautio 2009). Dismissing these experiences from aesthetic discourse because they do not fit the expected format of analysis and cannot be subjected to a verdict-oriented discourse unduly impoverishes the rich content of our aesthetic life. In addition, these experiences can be generated and shared communally. Gardening, cooking, and participation in sporting activities can be a group activity and the participants can share and help with each other to mutually enrich and enhance aesthetic experiences by pointing out the aesthetic contribution of some aspects that others may have missed.
The emergence of everyday aesthetics discourse parallels the increasing attempt at blurring the distinction between art and life in today’s Western artworld. Although there have been many examples throughout art history of depicting slices of everyday life, such as Dutch still life paintings, twentieth-century art introduced and experimented with different modes of appropriating everyday life, most famously with the use of ready-mades. Since then, artists have been trying to overcome the long-held separation between art and real life in a number of ways: rejecting the art institutional setting as a location for their art; denying the necessity of authorial authority; embracing various changes made to their works both by nature and human agency; blurring the creator/spectator dichotomy by collaborating with the general public to create art as a joint venture; changing the role of the artist from the creator/choreographer to a facilitator who provides an occasion or an event for things to happen; literally improving the environment and society by planting trees, cleaning a river, and playing the role of a social worker to promote a dialogue among people in conflict; and engaging in mundane activities like cooking and farming with tangible products for consumption. These attempts have given rise to a number of genres, including situationist art, conceptual art, environmental art, happening, performance, activist art, socially engaged art, and art projects characterized as embodying “relational aesthetics” or “dialogical aesthetics” (Kaprow 1993; Spaid 2002, 2012; Johnstone 2008; Kester 2004, 2011; Bishop 2012; Bourriaud 2002; Dezeuze 2006).
Paralleling the movement of art to embrace everyday life, there is a movement in the opposite direction: for everyday life to embrace art. The newly emerging and increasingly popular strategy of ‘artification’ is one such example. It is the deployment of art and art-like ways of thinking and acting in those areas of life which have not been traditionally associated with art or aesthetics: medicine, business, education, sports, and science, among others (Naukkarinen and Saito 2012). Art and aesthetics in this context are not regarded as decorative amenities or prettifying touches to human life and the world. Rather, this strategy is based upon the premise that art and aesthetics can be a powerful ally in directing human endeavors and actions and determining the quality of activities and environments. Such effects range from facilitating creativity and imagination in educational and business ventures and providing humane and healing environments for the vulnerable population, such as hospital patients and nursing home residents, to rendering scientific data easily graspable (Pine and Gilmore 1998; Linstead 2000; Postrel 2003; Howes 2005, 2013; Dee 2010; Duncum 2007; Tavin 2007; Vihma 2012; Moss and O’Neill 2013, 2014).
While the power of everyday aesthetics can be harnessed to improve the quality of life, it can also be used to serve a political agenda or a business goal. As stated in the section on the Everyday Aesthetic Qualities above, everyday aesthetic responses often guide people’s actions in the most direct way. If something attracts us with its aesthetic appeal, we tend to protect it, purchase it, or try to maintain its aesthetic value; on the other hand, if we don’t find an object or an environment aesthetically appealing, we tend to be indifferent to its fate, discard it, or try to make it more attractive. In particular, today’s global capitalist economy is fueled by ‘perceived obsolescence’ regarding the products’ fashionableness and stylishness with little to no improvement in their functional values. Additional aesthetic ‘hidden persuaders’ include branding, advertising campaigns, and environments aesthetically orchestrated for stores. These positive aesthetic values of and surrounding a product often hide various instances of ‘ugliness’ involved in its manufacturing process and afterlife. The negative aesthetics associated with manufacturing includes environmental devastation caused by resource extraction and pollution, and dismal working conditions of the factory workers, often in developing nations, who are forced to endure aesthetic deprivation, not to mention health and safety hazards. The negative aesthetics of the product’s afterlife can be seen in the ever-increasing volume of discarded items, no longer considered trendy and fashionable, not only in municipal landfills but in the ocean. Such ‘trash’ is also shipped to developing nations where re-usable, and often toxic, parts are harvested by local people with no protective gear.
Negative consequences of everyday aesthetics can also be found in the American attraction to the weed-free, velvety-smooth, uniformly green lawn. Creation and maintenance of such a look is often accompanied by serious environmental ramifications, such as excessive water use and chemical fertilizer, herbicide, and insecticide. When outdoor laundry hanging and wind turbines are judged to be an eyesore, communities create an ordinance to prohibit them, preventing the opportunity to create a more sustainable way of living (Duerksen and Goebel 1999; Saito 2004; Gray 2012). Aesthetics also plays a primary role in producing a desired appearance of humans as well as non-human animals, with problematic, sometimes devastating, results (Rhode 2010; Lintott 2003; Brand 2000, 2012; Tuan 1984).
Contrariwise, the success of sustainable design and goods produced under humane conditions often depends upon the acceptance of new aesthetic paradigms, such as gardens consisting of wildflowers or edible plants, garments and furniture made with recycled or reused materials, and green buildings that reduce literal footprints on the land as well as carbon footprints. Some work has also been done to explore the ways in which moral virtues, such as respect, thoughtfulness, and humility can be expressed not only by persons but also by the aesthetic features of objects and built structures and environments (Berleant 2005, 2010, 2012; Berleant and Carlson 2007; Chapman 2006; Norman 1990; Orr 2002; Pallasmaa 1999; Saito 2007; Sepänmaa 1995a, 1995b; Taylor 2000; Whiteley 1993, 1999). In addition, as indicated by social aesthetics, cultivation of aesthetic sensibility and practice of aesthetic skills can contribute to facilitating respectful, thoughtful, and humane social interactions
The relationship between the aesthetic and the ethical has been one of the contested issues in the mainstream aesthetics discourse regarding art. The positions range from their complete separation supported by aestheticism to their integration advocated by moralists. However, the ethical implications of art do not have a direct bearing on changing the world. They may affect the audience’s perception, attitude, and worldview, which may lead them toward a certain action, but the impact is indirect. In comparison, the aesthetic impact of everyday affairs often leads to direct consequences that change the state of the world. Just as in art-centered aesthetics, however, there are differing views on whether or not and to what degree the ethical implications should affect the aesthetic value of the object. Some prefer to separate them and protect the autonomous realm of the aesthetic (Forsey 2013). Others advocate integration by calling for an aesthetic paradigm shift (Orr 2002; Saito 2007; Maskit 2011).
Regardless of how the relationship between the aesthetic and the ethical is conceived, there is no denying that the power of the aesthetic is considerable. Thus, one important mission of everyday aesthetics is consciousness-raising and educating the public. Its role is to cultivate aesthetic literacy and sensibility so that the power of the aesthetic can be harnessed toward bettering quality of life and the state of the world. The cumulative and collective effects of these aesthetically-led judgments and actions can direct the society to be more civil and humane and the world to be more sustainable, or lead them away from these ideals. Given this power of everyday aesthetics, despite various debates and disagreements outlined above, aesthetics discourse can no longer exclude a large swath of our everyday life from the scope of its inquiry.
This bibliography includes only contemporary works in English. For classical philosophical works and non-Western traditions, consult respective entries.
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- –––, 2015 (forthcoming), “The Experience of Awe: An Expansive Approach to Everyday Aesthetics,” Contemporary Aesthetics, 13
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