A Greek philosopher of 1st and early 2nd centuries C.E., and an exponent of Stoic ethics notable for the consistency and power of his ethical thought and for effective methods of teaching. Epictetus’s chief concerns are with integrity, self-management, and personal freedom, which he advocates by demanding of his students a thorough examination of two central ideas, the capacity he terms ‘volition’ (prohairesis) and the correct use of impressions (chrēsis tōn phantasiōn). Heartfelt and satirical by turns, Epictetus has had significant influence on the popular moralistic tradition, but he is more than a moralizer; his lucid resystematization and challenging application of Stoic ethics qualify him as an important philosopher in his own right.
- 1. Life and Works
- 2. Antecedents
- 3. Preliminaries to interpretation
- 4. Main contentions
- 5. Educational method
- 6. Influence
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Born sometime in the 50s C.E. in Hierapolis, a Greek city of Asia Minor, Epictetus spent a portion of his life as the slave of Epaphroditus, an important administrator in the court of Nero. The date at which he came to Rome is unknown, but it must have been either prior to 68, at which time Epaphroditus fled the capital, or after the accession of Domitian in 81, under whom Epaphroditus was allowed to return and perhaps to resume his position. The circumstances of Epictetus’s education are likewise unknown, except that he studied for a time under Musonius Rufus, a Roman senator and Stoic philosopher who taught intermittently at Rome. Eventually receiving his freedom, he began lecturing on his own account but was forced to leave the city, presumably by the edict of Domitian (in 89) banning philosophers from the Italian peninsula. He then established his own school at Nicopolis, an important cultural center in Epirus, on the Adriatic coast of northwest Greece, and remained there teaching and lecturing until his death around 135. The teaching represented in the Discourses is that of his later career, around the year 108 by Millar’s (1965) dating, at which time he walked with a limp attributed variously to arthritis or to physical abuse during his time of slavery. Epictetus never married, but for reasons of benevolence he late in life adopted a child whose parents could not provide for its maintenance.
The major compilation of Epictetus’s teaching is the four-volume work standardly referred to in English as the Discourses; it was variously titled in antiquity. According to their preface, the Discourses are not the writing of Epictetus but are ghostwritten by the essayist and historiographer Arrian of Nicomedia in an effort to convey the personal impact of his instruction. Although we lack independent means of verification, we have reason to be confident that the works we have represent Epictetus’s thought rather than Arrian’s own: first, because the language employed is koinē or common Greek rather than the sophisticated literary language of Arrian’s other writings; and second because the brusque, elliptical manner of expression, the precise philosophical vocabulary, and the intellectual rigor of the content are quite different from what Arrian produces elsewhere. A few scholars, including especially Dobbin (1998), argue that Epictetus must have composed them himself, the role of Arrian being merely to preserve a mild fiction of orality.
The shorter Encheiridion (titled in English either Manual or Handbook) is a brief abridgment of the Discourses, apparently including the four or more additional volumes of Discourses that circulated in antiquity. As such it offers a much attenuated account which is of little independent value for the understanding of Epictetus’s thought and which at some points gives a misleading impression of his philosophical motivations. There are also some quotations by other ancient authors from the Discourses as they knew them. A few of these fragments, notably those numbered by Schenkl 8, 9, and 14, are useful supplements to our knowledge of Epictetus.
The standard Greek edition of all the above works is by Schenkl (1916); for the Discourses, there is also a valuable edition by Souilhé (4 vols., 1948–65) which includes a French translation. Important English translations include the one occasionally quoted in this article, a revision by Robin Hard (1995) of the classic translation by Elizabeth Carter (1759). There is also a slightly-abridged new translation by Robert Dobbin (2008). Dobbin (1998) provides an extensive general introduction and notes to accompany a translation of Discourses Book I.
The so-called “Golden Sayings” is a later compendium of aphorisms drawn from the Discourses and Encheiridion.
The essentials of Epictetus’s thought derive from the early or foundational period of Stoicism, from the third-century writings of Zeno of Citium, Cleanthes, and Chrysippus. Treatises he mentions by title include Chrysippus’ On Choice, On Impulse, and On the Possibles, and he also mentions reading in works by Zeno, Cleanthes, Antipater, and Archedemus. Extant reports and fragments of these and other Stoic works offer many points of congruence with what we find in him.
It may still be the case that he accepts influence from other currents in philosophy, or that he develops some ideas on his own. The clearest instance of such influence concerns Plato, for Epictetus draws much inspiration from the Socrates depicted in Plato’s shorter dialogues. Comparisons can be drawn especially to the Socrates of Plato’s Gorgias, with his fondness for give and take, his willingness to challenge the hearer’s presuppositions, and his optimism about what can be achieved through values clarification. The Theaetetus may also have been influential on Epictetus’s thinking about contemplation and the relation of human to divine; see Bénatouïl 2013. Epictetus also knows the Master Argument from Megarian philosophy (3rd c. BCE) and even names Diodorus and Panthoides, although this knowledge might easily have been drawn from Stoic treatises on logic (2.19.1–11; see further Barnes 1997 ch. 3 and Crivelli in Scaltsas and Mason 2007).
An argument has sometimes been made for Aristotelian influence, primarily because Epictetus’s favored term prohairesis (see section 4.3 below) is prominent in Nicomachean Ethics 3.1–5 as a quasi-technical term (there usually translated “choice” or “decision”). In particular, Dobbin (1991) has suggested that Epictetus’s use of this term reflects the influence of the early Aristotle commentaries (1st c. BCE-1st c. CE), none of which has survived for our inspection. But neither Aristotle nor any author in the Aristotelian tradition is ever mentioned in the Discourses, and to obscure an important connection is hardly in keeping with Epictetus’s usual mode of presentation. It is better to make the provisional assumption that his interest in volition derives, like other main elements of his philosophy, from the early Stoa, though with greater emphasis. Although the term prohairesis is only barely attested in surviving accounts of early Stoic philosophy, there is some evidence to suggest that it did play a significant role; see Graver 2003.
Epictetus never refers by name to the second century BCE Stoics Panaetius and Posidonius, and although he has something in common with Panaetius’s reported interest in practical ethics and role-based responsibilities, the evidence hardly suffices for an influence claim. References to other philosophers or schools are only in passing. He is impressed with Cynicism, but sees it as a vocation to itinerant teaching and bare-bones living rather than as a body of doctrine (3.22). Epicureanism he identifies with the pleasure principle and accordingly despises (3.7).
Any effort to come to grips with Epictetus’s thought must proceed from an awareness of his chosen objectives. The philosopher we meet in the Discourses seeks above all to foster ethical development in others, keeping his personal intellectual satisfaction strictly subordinate. Consequently we possess no point-by-point exposition of his views. The themes he regards as most difficult for students to internalize appear repeatedly and are developed and expanded in many different ways. Other issues he treats sporadically as the occasion arises, or omits them altogether, if he regards them as inessential to moral development. His apparent inclination to hold back some of his thinking, as well as the incomplete condition in which the Discourses have been transmitted to us, make it quite unsafe to draw any assumption about his views from silences or gaps in the account we have. On the other hand, the recursive manner of presentation makes it unlikely that the non-extant volumes broached any entirely new themes.
Interpreters must be careful not to prejudge the question of Epictetus’s relation to earlier Greek philosophy. While it is evident that his principal contentions are substantially related to earlier philosophical developments, claims concerning his relation to the earlier Stoics, or possible philosophical innovations or shifts of emphasis, must be governed by a healthy respect for the fragmentary nature of our sources. We possess no comparable record of the oral teaching that took place in the Hellenistic Stoa. Where corroborating evidence exists in literary or doxographical works, we are justified in describing his views as reformulations of the Stoic tradition; otherwise the question of continuity should generally be left open.
The linchpin of Epictetus’s entire philosophy is his account of what it is to be a human being; that is, to be a rational mortal creature. “Rational” as a descriptive term means that human beings have the capacity to “use impressions” in a reflective manner. Animals, like humans, use their impressions of the world in that their behavior is guided by what they perceive their circumstances to be. But human beings also examine the content of their impressions to determine whether they are true or false; we have the faculty of “assent” (1.6.12–22).
Assent is regulated by our awareness of logical consistency or contradiction between the proposition under consideration and beliefs that one already holds: when we are not aware of any contradiction, we assent readily, but when we perceive a conflict we are strongly constrained to reject one or the other of the conflicting views (2.26.3). Thus Medea kills her children because she believes it is to her advantage to do so; if someone were to show her clearly that she is deceived in this belief, she would not do it (1.28.8). Our hatred of being deceived, our inability to accept as true what we clearly see to be false, is for Epictetus the most basic fact about human beings and the most promising (1.28.1–5).
Equally important for him is that human rationality has as its setting a maximally rational universe. His confidence in the fundamental orderliness of all things is expressed in frequent references to Zeus or “the god” as the designer and administrator of the universe. There seems to be no question of competition with any other deities or powers. Epictetus does sometimes speak, conventionally for a Greek, of “gods” in the plural, but Zeus remains unquestionably supreme: he enjoys having some company, just as we do (3.13.4), but does not require assistance and cannot be opposed.
Immanent rather than transcendent, Zeus inheres in, and may indeed be identified with, the natural order. As such he is in theory fully accessible to human comprehension in the same way as all objects and events are accessible to our comprehension. With effort, rational beings can come to understand Zeus as a person, a rational being with thoughts and intentions like ours. That recognition inspires awe and gratitude, a “hymn of praise” that it is our duty to offer in each occasion of life (1.16.19).
God is the creator of humankind as of all else, and his attitude toward us is one of complete benevolence. It is by his gift that we are rational beings, and our rational nature qualifies us as his kindred. More: our minds are actually fragments of Zeus’s mind, “parts and offshoots of his own being” (1.14.6, 2.8.10–12). When we make choices on our own account, we exercise the very same power as governs the universe. Hence it can be said that Zeus has ceded to us a portion of his governance (1.1.12).
It is, again, the capacity for choice that makes us accountable for our own actions and states. Epictetus is particularly fond of exploring the implications of this essentially Stoic conception. In studying his usage it is helpful to remember that his favored term prohairesis refers more often to the capacity for choice than it does to particular acts of choosing. The word is variously translated; the rendering “volition” is adopted here as in Long 2002.
The volition, Epictetus argues, is “by nature unimpeded” (1.17.21), and it is for this reason that freedom is for him an inalienable characteristic of the human being. The very notion of a capacity to make one’s own decisions implies as a matter of logical necessity that those decisions are free of external compulsion; otherwise they would not be decisions. But humans do have such a capacity and are thus profoundly different from even the higher animals, which deal with impressions merely in an unreflective way (2.8).
It is the volition that is the real person, the true self of the individual. Our convictions, attitudes, intentions and actions are truly ours in a way that nothing else is; they are determined solely by our use of impressions and thus internal to the sphere of volition. The appearance and comfort of one’s body, one’s possessions, one’s relationships with other people, the success or failure of one’s projects, and one’s power and reputation in the world are all merely contingent facts about a person, features of our experience rather than characteristics of the self. These things are all “externals”; that is, things external to the sphere of volition.
This distinction between what is internal to the sphere of volition and what is external to it is the foundation of Epictetus’s system of value. What is ultimately worth having, the “good of humankind,” consists in “a certain disposition of the volition” (1.8.16). More explicitly, this disposition is the condition of virtue, the proper expression of our rational nature, in which we not only act correctly and on the basis of knowledge, but also recognize our kinship to god and witness with joy the god’s orderly management of the universe. This glad condition is the only thing a person can properly desire.
We are not wrong to believe that whatever is good is advantageous to us and worthy of unconditional pursuit, for this is just the “preconception” (prolēpsis) of good which all human beings possess (1.22). But we err in applying that preconception to particular cases, for we frequently assume that external objects have unconditional value. In reality, the various circumstances of our lives are merely what the volition has to work with and cannot in themselves be either good or bad. “The materials of action are indifferent, but the use we make of them is not indifferent” (2.5.1).
Admittedly some external things are more natural to us than others, just as it is natural for a foot, considered solely for itself, to be clean rather than muddy, and for an ear of grain to continue growing rather than being cut. But this is only when we consider ourselves in isolation rather than as parts of a larger whole. As Chrysippus says, the foot if it had a mind would welcome becoming muddy for the sake of the whole (2.6.11). Even one’s own death is of no particular concern if that is what the orderly workings of the universe require.
This does not mean that one is to be heedless of externals. “Externals must be used with care, because their usage is not an indifferent matter, yet at the same time with composure and tranquility, because the material being used is indifferent” (2.5.6). One can recognize that a thing is without ultimate value and still act vigorously in pursuit of it, when doing so is in accordance with one’s rational character. Epictetus offers the analogy of ball players who recognize that the ball they are running after is of no value in itself, and yet exert their full energy to catch it because of the value they set on playing the game properly (2.5).
The revaluation of external objects brings with it a tremendous sense of confidence and inner peace. Grief, fear, envy, desire, and every form of anxiety, result from the incorrect supposition that happiness is to be found outside oneself (2.16, 3.13.10, etc.). Like earlier Stoics, Epictetus rejects the supposition that such emotions are imposed on us by circumstances or internal forces and are largely beyond our control. Our feelings, as well as our behavior, are an expression of what seems right to us, conditioned by our judgments of value (1.11.28–33). If we correct our judgments, our feelings will be corrected as well.
The analysis is applicable also to feelings like anger and betrayal which relate to the conduct of other people. The choices made by others are of ethical significance only for the agents themselves; to anyone else they are externals and so of no consequence. One should not, then, be angry at Medea for her bad decision. Pity would be better than that, though the really proper response, if one has the opportunity, would be to help her to see her mistake (1.28).
Epictetus’s conception of emotional adjustment is not that one should be “unfeeling like a statue” (3.2.4). Even the wisest person may tremble or grow pale at some sudden danger, though without false assent (fragment 9). More importantly, there are affective responses it is right to have. “It is fitting to be elated at the good”; that is, at the goods of soul (2.11.22; 3.7.7), and one should also experience the aversive feeling he calls “caution” (eulabeia, 2.1.1–7) when considering potential bad choices. Gratitude toward god is also affective in nature (2.23). In addition, it is appropriate during the period of ethical training to experience the pain of remorse as a stimulus to ethical development (3.23.30–38).See Long 2006, 377-394.
In our relations with other people we are to be governed by the attitudes Epictetus calls “modesty” (aidōs) and “love of humanity”(philanthrōpia). Modesty consists in an awareness of the perspective of others and a readiness to curtail one’s own unseemly behavior; love of humanity is a willingness to exert oneself on others’ behalf. The latter extends especially toward those with whom we are associated by our particular role in life: toward children if one is a parent, toward husband or wife if one is married, and so on (2.10, 2.22.20). While our best service to others is in helping them develop their own rational nature, it is also entirely appropriate that we should act to further the temporal interests of those to whom we are connected by birth or situation.
It is a misconception to suppose that proper affection for friends and family members necessarily leaves us vulnerable to debilitating emotions when their welfare is threatened. Just as one can be fond of a crystal goblet and yet not be upset when it breaks, having realized all along that it was a fragile thing, so we should love our children, siblings, and friends while also reminding ourselves of their mortality (3.24). The primary relationship is with god; our human relationships should never give us reason to reproach god but should enable us to rejoice in the natural order. Concern for others, and enjoyment of their company, is indeed part of human nature (3.13.5); whereas irresponsible behavior driven by emotion is not. The father who remains at the bedside of a desperately sick child behaves more, not less, naturally than the one who runs away to weep (1.11).
Achieving the correct disposition of one’s capacity for choice requires more than inclination. The learner must also undertake an extensive program of self-examination and correction of views. While ethical development is made easier by the direct instruction and self-help techniques a teacher like Epictetus himself might provide, it is also possible without such aid. It is indeed a capability inherent in human nature, for the faculty that perceives and corrects errors of judgment is the reasoning faculty itself. It is even possible to alter such emotional dispositions as timorousness or quickness of temper, through repeated practice in giving more appropriate responses (2.16, 2.18).
Our ability to improve our own dispositions also provides the implicit answer to any question that might be asked about human autonomy in a Zeus-governed universe. Since for Epictetus action is determined by character (what seems right to an individual; 1.2) and not by spontaneous impulses, some readers might be inclined to object that this autonomy is only of a limited kind, for a person’s character must itself have been assigned to him by Zeus, through the circumstances of his birth and education. Epictetus would reply that autonomy is guaranteed not by the absence of antecedent causes but by the very nature of the reasoning faculty. Specific skills like horsemanship make judgments about their own subject matter; the reasoning faculty judges other things and also its own prior judgments. When it performs this function well, the inherited character will improve over time; otherwise it will deteriorate.
Zeus’s power is limited in that he cannot do what it is logically impossible to do. He could not cause a person to be born before his parents (1.12.28–29), and he could not have made volition execute any choices but its own (1.1.23, 1.17.27). For the same kind of reason, he could not, for all his benevolence, cause a person’s body to be unimpeded in the way volition is unimpeded (4.1.100). Our bodies do not in fact belong to us, since we cannot always decide what will happen to them. There is therefore a clear contrast in status between body and mind or soul. Epictetus repeatedly uses language belittling the body or representing it as a mere instrument of the mind: it is “pathetic little flesh,” “cleverly molded clay,” a “little donkey” (1.1.10, 1.3.5, 4.1.79). At least once he speaks of the body and possessions together as “fetters” upon the mind (1.9.11), language that recalls the image in Plato’s Phaedo of the body as prison house. Still, Epictetus appears to prefer his own school’s position on the mind’s material nature to the Platonic view of it as a separate incorporeal substance; at least, he speaks of the mind as “breath” (pneuma) that is “infused” by god into the sense organs, and in one striking image he describes the mind (again pneuma) as a vessel of water entered by impressions as by rays of light (3.3.20–22).
Epictetus draws a sharp distinction between book learning, i.e. mastering the content of particular treatises, and what may be called education for living, in which one acquires the attitudes and habits that enable correct behavior. The latter is of paramount importance; the former may be of instrumental value but if overemphasized may prove a hindrance to ethical development.
The program of study offered in the school at Nicopolis included the reading of philosophical treatises by Stoic authors of the Hellenistic period, for instance the work On Impulse by Chrysippus (1.4.14) and the logical writings of Archedemus (1.10.8). Frequent references to formal logical schemata suggest that these, too, were taught, as they had been in the curriculum of Musonius Rufus, Epictetus’s own teacher at Rome (1.7.32; cf. 1.7.5–12). Learning of this kind may be instrumental in developing one’s intellectual acumen, just as the lead weights used by athletes in their exercises serve to develop the muscles (1.4.13; 1.17). Finally, there is some evidence for instruction in what the ancients called physics (philosophy of nature); this is discussed by Barnes (1997).
Education for living is primarily self-education, a function of that capacity for self-correction which is inherent in our rational nature. Epictetus rejects the way of thinking that says moral improvement is achievable only by divine assistance.
Have you not hands, fool? Has not god made them for you? Sit down now and pray your nose may not run! Wipe it, rather, and do not blame god. (2.16.11)
The example of Socrates serves to remind the hearer that intellectual independence remains the primary objective. For while Socrates teaches others, he is himself untaught or rather self-taught; his unshakeable comprehension of ethical issues has been attained through rigorous application of methods anyone might use. Admittedly, Socrates was exceptionally gifted, and yet his achievement is what all are born for and can at least hope to match (1.2.33–37).
Direct coaching by a philosophical teacher may nonetheless be of assistance to persons seeking to correct their own dispositions. Epictetus explains the process in Discourses 3.2. Above all, one must attend to “desire and aversion”: one must correct one’s emotional responses by pondering questions of value and indifference, for desire or fear of objects outside one’s own control results in a host of strong emotions that make one “incapable of listening to reason” while experiencing them. Further, one must study practical ethics, “the impulse to act and not to act,” for vigorous action may be part of proper relations to the gods, to family members, and to the state, and those actions should be orderly and well-considered. Finally, one must attend to one’s own reasoning processes, to “freedom from deception and hasty judgment and in general whatever is concerned with assent.” This last entails some study of logic, to prevent the conclusions reached in the two principal areas of study from being dislodged “even in dreams or drunkenness or melancholy.” This however is a non-technical approach to logic, grounded in essentials, in contrast to the sterile conundrums and oversubtle analyses enjoyed by some of Epictetus’s contemporaries.
The actual process of self-improvement is initially a matter of consciously slowing down one’s thought processes to allow for reflection prior to assent. “Impression, wait for me a little. Let me see what you are, and what you represent” (2.18.24). As the habit of screening impressions becomes established, correct responses will begin to come automatically. Yet constant vigilance is still required, to guard against backsliding (4.3). One can never rely solely on habituation.
More specific therapeutic techniques may also be of use to the one making ethical progress. Epictetus recommends that pupils refrain from using the terms “good” and “bad,” not because those terms have no application in human life, but because they are too easily misapplied. Thus one should “suppress” desire and aversion, and use only plain, emotionally unadorned impulse and counter-impulse (Encheiridion 2). To combat some individual bad habit, one should practice the opposite behavior: for instance, if one is quick tempered, one should accustom oneself to bearing insults with patience (3.12.6–12). Regular self-examination at bedtime—a practice borrowed from the Pythagorean tradition—will enable one to correct errors before they become ingrained (3.10.1).
Occasionally Epictetus offers pre-professional advice to pupils who intend to pursue a teaching career of their own. He chastises the teacher who assigns a technical treatise in logic without providing any preliminary training or assessing the pupil’s capabilities (1.23.13). In Discourses 3.23.33 he distinguishes three “modes” or “characters” of philosophical discourse. The “protreptic” mode is that which convinces hearers, singly or in groups, to care about philosophical study as a means toward personal ethical development. The “elenctic” mode, named from the Socratic elenchos, is more confrontational and is aimed at removing false convictions, while the “instructional” mode imparts sound doctrines. As Long (2002) has noted, the three modes are associated respectively with Diogenes the Cynic, with Socrates, and with Zeno of Citium, the founder of the Stoic school (3.21.19; cf. 2.12.5).
Though much cultivated in person by the nobles of local Greek cities (as Brunt 1997 describes), Epictetus exerted far more influence through the written works produced by Arrian. The emperor Marcus Aurelius was never in fact his pupil, but was so deeply impressed with what he had read as to consider himself a follower of the freedman philosopher. In the early third century Origen remarks on the popularity of Epictetus with his own contemporaries, which he finds to rival that of Plato (Contra Celsum 6.2). Whether Origen was himself much influenced by Epictetus’s version of Stoicism is another matter, for Origen had studied the writings of Chrysippus on his own account and the strands cannot easily be separated. More demonstrable is the homage paid to Epictetus by Simplicius, the sixth-century Aristotle commentator, who composed a long philosophical commentary on the Encheiridion combining Stoic elements with his own Neoplatonism.
The Encheiridion was translated into Latin by Poliziano in 1497 and during the subsequent two centuries became exceptionally popular in Europe. Spanneut (1972) traces its use in monasteries in superficially Christianized form. Seventeenth-century intellectuals like Guillaume du Vair, Justus Lipsius, and Thomas Gataker generally found Epictetus’s Stoicism to be fully compatible with Christianity; see the discussion in Brooke (2006). Pascal reacted against this perception; he admired Epictetus as a moralist but regarded it as sheer arrogance to believe that the human psyche is part of the divine and can be perfected by one’s own efforts. Descartes adopted a recognizably Epictetan value system as part of his personal ethics. An engagingly satirical portrayal of the potential impact of Epictetus’s philosophy in contemporary American life may be found in Tom Wolfe’s 1998 novel A Man in Full.
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