Notes to Epistemology

1. Both the antiquity of the field and the novelty of the term are clearly documented Woleński 2004.

2. See Moss 2015 and Hedden 2015a and 2015b for defenses of “time-slice epistemology”.

3. See Podgorski 2016 for a defense of “process epistemology”. (Harman 1986 seems to anticipate and defend such a view as well.)

4. Many of the essays in Brady and Fricker (eds) 2016 explore some of the issues that arise in the effort to understand the kinds of cognitive success that are possible for groups.

5. See Moss 2019 for an argument for this view. And see Rinard 2017b for an argument against any view according to which the whole truth of our doxastic states can be captured by any function (credal or otherwise) that takes precise values of any kind, whether points or intervals.

6. Williamson 2002 and Sutton 2007 both take it to be a constitutive norm of belief that it is supposed to be knowledge. Wedgwood 2002 and Whiting 2013 both take it to be a constitutive norm of belief that it is supposed to be true. Shah 2003 argues that it is a conceptual truth that belief is supposed to be true, but he regards this conceptual truth as not metaphysically constitutive of the state of belief.

7. See, for instance, Korsgaard 2009 for an interpretation and defense of this Aristotelian view.

8. Some writers, like Wedgwood 2017, regard epistemic permissibility as a matter of sufficient epistemic value. Others, like Alston 1988 and Plantinga 1993, think that epistemic evaluation is not a form of deontic evaluation at all, and so the very idea of “permissibility” does not have clear application in epistemology. For an extended treatment of sub-optimality in epistemology, see Staffel 2019.

9. James 1896 is typically regarded as the source of this view, though it is popular today as well: see BonJour 1985, Brogard 2009, Greco 1993, Kornblith 1983, and many others.

10. Joyce 1998 provided the first influential articulation of this view. See also Pettigrew 2016.

11. See Rinard (2017a, 2019b) for a defense of the view that it is all and only practical reasons that make beliefs optimal and permissible. See Lycan 1988 for a defense of the view that beliefs are permissible only in so far as they are formed by processes that are evolutionarily adaptive.

12. Such an attempt to reduce or otherwise explain away all non-structural constraints of a particular kind of success—viz., rationality of credence—is characteristic of subjective Bayesians. See, for instance, Titelbaum 2013.

13. See especially Lloyd 1984 and Bordo 1990 for influential discussions of the various ways in which popular conceptions of gender are used to draw invidious distinctions between different ways of forming beliefs.

14. Although this claim is widely accepted, it is not universally accepted. Those who take knowledge of facts not to require belief include Radford 1966, McGinn 1984, Lewis 1996

15. For a book-length discussion of epistemic luck and the conceptual tools employed to capture the way knowledge and epistemic luck are incompatible, see Pritchard 2005. For an ingenious argument that what counts as epistemic luck cannot be fixed independently of how the epistemic agent conceives of her reasons for belief, see Lando 2016. For an argument that true belief alone suffices for knowledge, see Sartwell 1992 and Hetherington 2001.

16. For further reading, see the entry the analysis of knowledge in this Encyclopedia. See also Shope 1983 and Steup 1996: chapters 1 and 2. For an altogether different approach to the analysis of knowledge, see Williamson 2002.

17. They are referred to as Gettier cases because, in his 1963 paper “Is Justified True belief Knowledge”, Edmund Gettier described two cases that are widely taken to decisively refute the analyses of knowledge as justified true belief. For an excellent discussion of the Gettier problem, see the appendix in Pollock 1986.

18. The barn-facades case first appears in Goldman 1976, but Goldman credits it to Carl Ginet. See Gendler and Hawthorne 2005 for some interesting challenges to the view that Henry’s belief does not qualify as knowledge.

19. See Unger 1975 and Hyman 1999 for defenses of this view; see Fantl and McGrath 2009 and also Comesaña and McGrath 2016 for dissent: according to the dissenting view of the latter, the reasons for which we do things are never facts, but rather propositions, and it is only when our justification for believing these propositions satisfies the justification condition for knowledge that these propositions can be the reasons for which we think or do something.

20. For an attempt to distinguish between definitional and substantive questions concerning justification, see Alston 1985; Goldman 1979; and Steup 1996: chapter 2.

21. See Sutton 2007 for an argument to the effect that a belief is justified if and only if it is knowledgeably held. Although Littlejohn 2012 argues that justified beliefs must be true, only Sutton argues that all justified beliefs must be knowledgeably held.

22. This definition employs the notion of obligation. Alternative definitions can be given employing other members of the family of deontological terms: requirement, duty, permission, or prohibition. Still further definitions are possible when we widen the range of relevant concepts, employing notions such as responsibility, being in the clear, and blameworthiness.

23. For literature on the deontological understanding of justification, see Alston 1988; Ginet 1975; BonJour 1985: chapter 2; R. Feldman 1988, 2001a; Haack 2001; Plantinga 1993; Bruce Russell 2001; and Steup 1996: chapter 4.

24. I say “may be” something else, since some philosophers think that the moral or prudential point of view may be ultimately all that is relevant even when epistemically assessing beliefs. See, for instance, Nolfi 2015 and Rinard 2017a, Rinard 2019b.

25. For defenses of evidentialism, see Adler 2002; Kelly 2002; Conee and Feldman 2001 [2004]; Shah 2006. For criticisms of evidentialism, see, Fantl and McGrath 2009; Foley 1987; Nozick 1993; Owens 2000; S. Stroud 2006; Reisner 2008, 2009; McCormick 2015; and Marušić 2015. McCain 2018 is a recent collection of essays attempting to defend or rebut evidentialism.

26. For discussion of truth as the epistemic goal and the connection between truth and justification, see Conee 2004, David 2001, and the exchange between Kvanvig and David (2005 [2013]). For accounts of epistemic norms governing belief that do not make truth fundamental, see Nolfi 2015 and Rinard 2019a and 2019b. For accounts of epistemic norms governing credences that make accuracy fundamental, see Pettigrew 2016.

27. Alston writes: “I agree that ‘justification’ is the wrong word for a non-deontological concept, but we seem to be stuck with it in contemporary theory of knowledge” (1989: 7f.).

28. A belief can be very likely to be true in a way that is completely irrelevant to the beliefs being, or not being, an instance of knowledge. In that case, it wouldn’t be “sufficiently likely to be true” in a way that is at all relevant to any question of justification. Suppose Jack believes Meyer will win the election. Suppose further Jack’s belief originates solely in wishful thinking. Finally, suppose Meyer’s winning the election is objectively probable because it’s a fact that 80% of those who will vote will vote in his favor. So the p that Jack believes is very likely to be true. As a result, it’s very likely that Jack’s belief is true. But, since Jack’s belief is the result of wishful thinking, it wouldn’t be justified or an instance of knowledge. What we need is likelihood of truth that arises not by virtue of what the subject believes (the belief’s content), but rather by virtue of the way in which the subject holds, or comes to hold, the belief. But then we must find, in a systematic and principled way, a way of specifying the relevant ways of holding, or coming to hold, a belief. This endeavor raises what has been called the “generality problem”. See Conee and Feldman 1998 [2004].

29. The characterization of internalism by appeal to the thought that the brain in a vat is as justified as the normal agent comes from Lehrer and Cohen 1983. For defenses of internalism, see BonJour 1985, BonJour’s contributions to BonJour and Sosa 2003; Conee and Feldman 2001; R. Feldman in Greco and Feldman 2005 [2013]; Steup 1999 & 2001b; and Smithies 2019.

30. For literature advocating externalism, see Alston 1985; Alston 1988; Greco in Greco and Feldman 2005 [2013]; Goldman 1999a; Kornblith 1999, 2001; Sosa’s contributions to BonJour and Sosa 2003; Miracchi 2017a and 2017b; Srinivasan forthcoming.

31. The word “always” is important here because externalists need not, and indeed should not, assert that justification, understood externalistically in terms of reliability, is never recognizable on reflection. For example, suppose you hear, and thus come to believe, that there is a dog barking outside. Arguably, in a typical case like this, reflection will tell you that your belief has a reliable origin. If it does, then you can, on this occasion, recognize on reflection that your belief is justified even if we understand justification in terms of reliability.

32. Access internalism has been defended by Roderick Chisholm, who can reasonably be viewed as the chief advocate of internalist, traditional epistemology in the second half of the twentieth century. In his Theory of Knowledge ([1966, second edition] 1977: 17), Chisholm writes:

We presuppose … that the things we know are justified for us in the following sense: we can know what it is, on any occasion, that constitutes our grounds, or reason, or evidence for thinking that we know. (Emphasis added)

33. Arguably, there are non-evidentialist versions of internalism. For example, consider the view that the coherence of one’s belief system is a J-factor. According to this view, the justificational status of one’s beliefs is determined by more than just one’s evidence. If a belief system’s coherence is something suitably internal, such a non-evidentialist view would count as internalist. Among externalist theories, reliabilism is not the only candidate either. For example, Plantinga’s proper functionalism, Nozick’s tracking theory, and Dretske’s conclusive reasons theory all qualify as externalist, but none of them are in any straightforward sense a version of reliabilism. See Plantinga 1993b; Nozick 1981; and Dretske 1971 and 1981.

34. I borrow the term “luminosity” from Williamson 2002, chapter 4. Williamson rejects the claim that mental states are luminous.

35. At first sight, this might seem a strange claim. For example, when upon being immersed in a liquid a strip of litmus paper turns red, that could be viewed as being evidence for the liquid’s being an acid solution. Surely, it could be argued, that the paper’s color change is evidence of acidity is not the sort of thing that can be found out solely on reflection. However, if you don’t know that litmus paper when being immersed in an acid solution turns red, your observation of the paper’s color change will not be any evidence for you at all for thinking that the liquid in question is an acid solution. So if we are careful about describing what the evidence in this case really is, we would have to say that it consists of the following two items:

  1. The general principle that, when immersed in an acid solution, litmus paper turns red.
  2. The observation that the strip of litmus paper immersed in the liquid turned red.

So, what’s evidence for

  1. The liquid is an acid solution.

is not (2) by itself but the conjunction of (1) and (2). When some internalists argue that evidential connections are recognizable on reflection, they always have in mind principles that identify the relevant evidence in its completeness. So, regarding the present example, advocates of Necessity might claim that what’s recognizable on reflection is the proposition that the conjunction of (1) and (2) is evidence for (3). That claim can certainly be disputed, but it is not in any obvious way lacking in plausibility.

36. Chisholm held that there are necessarily true and a priori recognizable principles of evidence, and that these principles are internal “in that the proper use of them at any time will enable us to ascertain the epistemic status of our own beliefs at that time”. Chisholm [1966, third edition] 1989: 62. For Chisholm’s view regarding the a priori status of these principles, see p. 72. For a critical discussion of classical internalism, Chisholmian internalism, and post-Chisholmian internalism, see Plantinga 1993.

37. Does the conjunction of evidentialism with Luminosity and Necessity entail access internalism? To settle this issue, we would have to address the question of conjunction closure, viz., whether being able to recognize on reflection what evidence one has, and being able to recognize on reflection what is supported by any particular body of evidence, entails being able to recognize on reflection what is supported by one’s own body of evidence.

38. Externalists typically also reject Luminosity and Necessity.

39. For literature on the internalism-externalism issue, see Goldberg 2015, Kornblith 2001, and the encyclopedia entry on internalist vs. externalist conceptions of epistemic justification.

40. For literature on the foundationalism-coherentism issue, see Audi and Wolterstorff 1997; BonJour 1999, 2001, 2002: chapter 2; BonJour and Sosa 2003; Chisholm 1982, [1966, third edition] 1989; chapters 4, 8, and 9 in Dancy 1985; DePaul 2001; chapter 4 in R. Feldman 2003; Fumerton 2001; Haack 1993; Pryor 2005 [2013]; Sosa 1980a [1991], 1980b [1991], 1999; chapters 5–7 in Steup 1996; the exchanges between Klein and Ginet (2005 [2013]), and between Elgin and Van Cleve (2005 [2013]); Williams 1977 [1999], 2005; and Van Cleve 1985.

41. But see Fumerton 1995 and BonJour’s contribution to BonJour and Sosa 2003 for efforts to clarify this.

42. A conception of basicality along this lines is employed in Huemer 2001 and Pryor 2000 & 2005 [2013]. It is also at work in Van Cleve in Elgin and Van Cleve 2005 [2013]. According to Huemer’s view, which he labels phenomenal conservatism: a belief that p can be justified solely by a seeming that p. In his 2000, Pryor defends a similar view, which he calls dogmatism: a perceptual belief that p can be justified solely by a perceptual experience that p. Van Cleve argues in support of a foundationalist position characterized by the claim that memory beliefs can be justified solely by ostensible memories. So each of them holds that a belief can be justified by an experiential ground alone, that is, without the subject’s having any further justification for believing something in addition to the belief in question. For two excellent collections of essays discussing this type of foundationalism, see Tucker 2013, and Dodd and Zardini 2014.

43. For articles advocating compromise positions, see Cohen 2002; DeRose 2005; and Steup 2004 and 2018. For a response to the problem of easy knowledge that Cohen raises in his 2002, see Pryor 2004.

44. One problem that arises for this approach is the following: Many epistemologists share the intuition that, if an evil demon deceives you and your perceptual experiences are therefore completely misleading you, they are nevertheless a source of justification for you because, from your own, internal point of view, such deception is not detectable. The externalist answer we just considered, however, implies that they would not be a source of justification.

45. It follows from this internalist answer that your perceptual experiences are a source of justification for you even if they are systematically unreliable concerning the truth of their contents.

46. Malmgren 2018 argues that, if the distinction between basic and nonbasic belief is construed as both exclusive and exhaustive, then it will be radically indeterminate, even given the totality of psychological facts, which beliefs are basic and which are nonbasic.

47. Thus Richard Fumerton says the following, in the context of employing circular reasoning for the purpose of rebutting skepticism:

You cannot use perception to justify the reliability of perception! You cannot use memory to justify the reliability of memory! You cannot use induction to justify the reliability of induction! Such attempts to respond to the skeptic’s concerns involve blatant, indeed pathetic, circularity. (1995: 177);

See also Alston 1993 for an excellent discussion of the problems involved in arguing for the reliability of perception.

48. The “foundherentism” defended in Haack 1993 is an example of such dependence coherentism, as is Conee 1988 and McCain 2014. For recent literature defending various versions of coherentism, see BonJour 1985; Elgin 1996; Lehrer 1990; Lycan 1996; and Poston 2014.

49. There is a further option: the regress ends in a belief that is not justified. It is difficult to see, though, how a belief that is not justified could possibly justify any other beliefs.

50. We should distinguish between the regress problem and various regress arguments. The regress problem is that of explaining how justification is possible given that it generates a seemingly infinite regress of justification. A regress argument is meant to support a particular solution to the regress problem on the basis of rejecting the competing solutions. Thus the regress argument for foundationalism rejects coherentism and infinitism as viable options. Klein, however, rejects both foundationalism and coherentism to argue for infinitism. (See Klein 1999 and Klein in Klein & Ginet 2005 [2013]; see Ginet in Klein & Ginet 2005 [2013] for a response to Klein’s defense of infinitism.) Likewise, coherentists could argue that neither foundationalism nor infinitism is a viable option.

51. Doxastic coherentists might reply that, when the chameleon changes its color to purple, Kim forms the belief that the chameleon looks purple to her. Because of this belief, she would not be justified in still believing that the chameleon is blue. Therefore, doxastic coherentism can explain after all why Kim’s belief (the chameleon is blue) is unjustified after the chameleon changed its color to purple. The problem with this reply is that foundationalists are free to describe the example in whatever way they want (as long as it remains conceivable). And obviously, they would want to describe it by stipulating that Kim does not form any beliefs about how the chameleon appears to her. In response to that, doxastic coherentists could say that Kim’s failing to form beliefs about how the chameleon appears to her is inconceivable. That claim, however, does not recommend itself as a plausible one.

52. For literature on this issue, see Brewer 1999; Sellars 1956 [1963]; Williams 2005, and the debate between Bill Brewer and Alex Byrne (Brewer and Byrne 2005).

53. It could be argued that, by ascribing propositional content to perceptual experiences, we thereby turn them into mental states that are sufficiently belief-like to be like beliefs in this regard: they can justify only if they are justified themselves. This claim is more easily made than defended. If the hat looks blue to you, then your perceptual experience presents a certain propositional content to you, namely that the hat is blue. Nevertheless, even though it has that content, it is distinct from the belief that the hat is blue. Why? Obviously, because it’s possible that the hat looks blue to you while you fail to believe, or while you even disbelieve, that the hat is blue. You might know independently, for example, that the hat is white and looks blue to you only because you are wearing blue tinted glasses. In that case, the hat would look blue to you without your believing that it looks blue to you. It is not easy to see, therefore, in which sense the possession of propositional content should make perceptual experiences in any significant sense “belief-like”.

54. Schellenberg 2013 argues that some perceptual experiences—the factive ones—provide knowledge of external objects, whereas others—mere appearances—provide weaker justification for those same beliefs. Siegel 2017 agrees that different perceptual experiences can provide different levels of warrant, or justification, but for Siegel, these difference perceptual experiences can themselves be more or less justified.

55. For literature on the epistemological problems of perception, see Alston 1999 and chapters 10 and 11 in Dancy 1985. More bibliographical references can be found on p. 442 in Greco and Sosa 1999. See also the entries on epistemological problems of perception and the problem of perception in this encyclopedia.

56. For an introductory article and bibliographical references, see Brie Gertler’s article “Self-Knowledge” in this encyclopedia, linked at the end of this article.

57. For an introductory article and bibliographical references, see Tom Senor’s article “Epistemological Problems of Memory” in this encyclopedia, linked at the end of this article.

58. There is no escape from Gettier problems even in the area of a priori justification. What would be an example of a true belief that is justified a priori but is nevertheless not an instance of knowledge? Suppose Carl is a logician. He is trying to prove that p is a necessary truth, where p is a rather complicated proposition. He runs through a long and complex proof and concludes that p is indeed necessarily true. Unfortunately, even though Carl is right, he made a small and subtle mistake so difficult to spot that it leaves Carl’s justification intact. It seems we should judge that, because of his mistake, that Carl does not know that p is a necessary truth. So Carl’s belief that p is a necessary truth is a justified true belief that fails to be knowledge.

59. Devitt in BonJour & Devitt 2005 [2013]. See Jenkins 2014 for criticism of Devitt’s argument, and Devitt 2014 for a reply. For a rich and sophisticated account of the distinction and the interaction between a priori and empirical justification, see Jenkins 2008.

60. For literature on this issue see Lackey 2003 and 2008, and Lackey and Sosa 2006. Burge 1993 argues that it is a necessary truth, knowable a priori, that trust in testimonial sources is prima facie justified. See Malmgren 2006 for an influential rebuttal.

61. For a selection of the literature on skepticism, see chapter 1 in Dancy 1985; chapters 6 and 7 in R. Feldman 2003; chapter 10 in Steup 1996; B. Stroud 1984; and Williams 1977 [1999]. See also DeRose’s introduction to, as well as the articles in, DeRose and Warfield 1999, and the debate between Vogel and Fumerton (2005 [2013]). For further recent literature on skepticism and how to reply to it, see Fumerton 1995, Greco 2000, Huemer 2001, Pryor 2000, and Rinard 2018.

62. For an early defense of closure denial and the relevant alternatives approach, see Dretske 1970. Closure denial as a strategy of anti-skepticism is also defended in Nozick 1981. For the “abominable conjunction” objection to closure denial, see DeRose 1995. For a debate on the merits of avoiding skepticism by giving up closure, see the debate between Dretske and Hawthorne (2005 [2013]).

63. For G. E. Moore’s response to skepticism, see Moore 1959b,c. An objection to the Moorean response that’s not discussed here is that the response is question begging. It’s, however, an open question whether it really is. What’s needed to make that charge stick is a precise account of when an argument begs the question. Until such an account is provided, the charge of question begging is rather ad hoc. But even if Counter-BIV is not question begging, we may still wonder whether we could come to know we are not BIVs on the basis of employing this argument. The issue here is that of epistemic priority. It might be that I must know in the first place that I’m not a BIV if I am to know that I have hands. If that’s right, one couldn’t acquire knowledge of not being a BIV by virtue of employing Counter BIV. For discussion on the Moorean response, see Pritchard 2004, Pryor 2004 and Sosa 1999b.

64. Arguments for one or another version of contextualism can be found in Cohen 1988, 2001, 2013; DeRose 1992, 1999, 2009; Lewis 1996; Neta 2002, 2003; Blome-Tillman 2014; and Ichikawa 2017. For arguments against contextualism, see Conee 2013; Stanley 2005. The issue of how broadly to understand the category of “contextualist” views in epistemology is itself disputed: thus, the “contrastivism” defended by Schaffer 2005 is thought by some, but not by others, to be a version of contextualism.

65. This is Lasonen-Aarnio’s own reply (in 2014b) to the puzzle.

66. See DeRose 1991 for an influential account of epistemic possibility that entails this view. Most other accounts of epistemic possibility carry the same entailment: e.g. Egan, Hawthorne, and Weatherson 2005. See Worsnip 2015 for a notable exception to this consensus.

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