The Problem of Perception
The Problem of Perception is a pervasive and traditional problem about our ordinary conception of perceptual experience. The problem is created by the phenomena of perceptual illusion and hallucination: if these kinds of error are possible, how can perceptual experience be what we ordinarily understand it to be: something that enables direct perception of the world? These possibilities of error challenge the intelligibility of our ordinary conception of perceptual experience; the major theories of experience are responses to this challenge.
- 1. Our Ordinary Conception of Perceptual Experience
- 2. The Problem of Perception
- 3. Theories of Experience
- 3.1 The Sense-Datum Theory
- 3.2 Adverbialism
- 3.3 Intentionalism
- 3.4 Naive Realist Disjunctivism
- 4. Conclusion
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
A.D. Smith claims that what most authors have in mind in talking about the Problem of Perception is the “question of whether we can ever directly perceive the physical world”, where “the physical world” is understood in a realist way: as having “an existence that is not in any way dependent upon its being... perceived or thought about” (2002: 1). The arguments at the heart of the Problem of Perception challenge this direct realist perspective on perceptual experience. But since this perspective is embedded within our ordinary conception of perceptual experience, the problem gets to the heart of our ordinary ways of thinking.
So, what is our ordinary conception of perceptual experience? And how does it embed a direct realist perspective?
We conceive of perceptual experiences as occurrences with phenomenal character. The phenomenal character of an experience is what it is like for a subject to undergo it (Nagel (1974)). Our ordinary conception of perceptual experience emerges from first-personal reflection on its character, rather than from scientific investigation; it is a conception of experience from a “purely phenomenological point of view” (Broad 1952: 3–4). We’ll present this conception by outlining what phenomenological reflection suggests first about the objects (§1.2), structure (§1.3), and character (§1.5) of experience, and then about the relation between veridical, illusory, and hallucinatory experiences, and in particular whether these cases form a common kind (§1.6).
Let’s begin with P.F. Strawson’s idea that “mature sensible experience (in general) presents itself as, in Kantian phrase, an immediate consciousness of the existence of things outside us” (1979: 97), and similarly McDowell’s idea that perceptual experience appears to be an “openness to the world” (1994: 111), conceived of as openness to mind-independent reality (1994: 25–26).
These ideas reflect the basic phenomenological observation that perceptual experiences have objects, and more specifically direct objects: objects that are simply perceived or experienced, but not in virtue of the perception or experience of distinct, more “immediate”, objects.
Various authors appeal to a notion of directness in outlining our ordinary conception of perceptual experience, and the Problem of Perception. A dissenting voice is Austin (1962), and for recent critical discussion see Martin (2017). For further discussion of how to understand notions of direct and indirect perception, see Jackson (1977), Snowdon (1992), Foster (2000), Smith (2002), and Martin (2005).
This starting point gives rise to the following questions (cf. Martin 1998: 176):
- The Objects Question: what is the nature of the direct objects of experience?
- The Structure Question: in what sense are experiences directly of their objects?
Let’s turn to the answers to these questions suggested by Strawson and McDowell’s remarks (for a more critical stance on these remarks see Mackie (2020)).
Strawson begins his argument by asking how someone might typically respond to a request for a description of their current visual experience. He says that it is natural to give the following kind of answer: “I see the red light of the setting sun filtering through the black and thickly clustered branches of the elms; I see the dappled deer grazing in groups on the vivid green grass…” (1979: 97). There are two ideas implicit in this answer. First, the description talks about objects which are things distinct from experience. Second, the description is “rich”, describing the nature of the experience not merely in terms of simple shapes and colours; but in terms of the familiar things we encounter in the “lived world” in all their complexity (see also Heidegger (1977: 156)).
So, we can highlight the following answer to the Objects Question:
- Ordinary Objects: perceptual experiences are directly of ordinary mind-independent objects.
There are three things to clarify about this. First, it incorporates realism in that it appeals to the notion of a mind-independent object of experience: one that doesn’t depend for its existence upon experience. Second, it concerns familiar or ordinary objects, things that we admit as part of common-sense ontology. Third, “object of experience” is understood broadly to encompass perceptible entities in mind-independent reality including ordinary material objects, but also features and other entities (e.g., events, quantities of stuff). When we talk of “ordinary objects”, “the world” etc, we take this as shorthand for: familiar or ordinary mind-independent perceptible entities.
Some writers have defended a thesis known as the transparency of experience (see Harman (1990); Speaks (2009); Tye (1992, 1995, 2000); Thau (2002); and for critical discussions, Martin (2002a), Smith (2008), Stoljar (2004) and Soteriou (2013)). Transparency is normally defined as the thesis that introspecting what it is like for a subject to have an experience does not reveal awareness of experiences themselves, but only of their mind-independent objects. There are two claims here: (i) introspection reveals the mind-independent objects of experience, and (ii) introspection does not reveal any features of anything else.
Transparency is similar to Ordinary Objects. The latter claim does involve something like (i). But it does not involve (ii). And it is not obvious that (ii) is part of our ordinary conception of perceptual experience. After all, we readily admit that an ordinary scene (e.g., a snow-covered churchyard) can look very different when one removes one’s glasses: one’s visual experience then becomes blurred. But this phenomenal difference does not seem to derive from any apparent difference in the objects of experience. Rather, it seems to be a difference in the way in which those objects are experienced. (See Tye (2000) and Gow (2019) for different responses. For further discussion, see Crane (2000), Smith (2008), Allen (2013), and French (2014). For a different challenge to (ii) and its ilk see Richardson (2010) and Soteriou (2013: Chapter 5), and French (2018)).
What, then, about the Structure Question? Strawson speaks of the manner in which we directly experience objects as a matter of “immediate consciousness”, and McDowell talks of our “openness” to objects. Other notions commonly invoked here include the idea that we are directly “acquainted” with objects, we directly “apprehend” them, they are “given” to us, or directly “present to the mind”. What these notions all aim to capture is the intuitive idea that perceptual experience of an object involves a special intimate perceptual relation to an object, a relation which differentiates perceptual experiences from non-perceptual states of mind which are similarly directed on the world (e.g., non-sensory, non-perceptual thoughts).
One function of this relation is to make objects present in such a way that they can shape or mould the character of one’s experience. In virtue of this, perceptions of the world are unlike (non-perceptual) thoughts about the world: they are constrained by the objects actually given. One’s perception of a snow-covered churchyard is responsive to how the churchyard is now, as one is perceiving it. But one’s (non-perceptual) thought need not be: in the middle of winter, one can imagine the churchyard as it is in spring, and one can think of it in all sorts of ways which are not the ways it presently is.
In what follows we will use the notion of perceptual presentation to capture this perceptual relation. We can thus highlight the following answer to the structure question:
- Presentation: perceptual experiences are direct perceptual presentations of their objects.
In what follows, we use “direct presentation” for short.
Putting the pieces together, our ordinary conception of perceptual experience involves:
- Direct Realist Presentation: perceptual experiences are direct perceptual presentations of ordinary objects.
If direct perceptual presentation of an ordinary object is a way of directly perceiving it, then this gives us:
- Direct Realism: we can directly perceive ordinary objects.
We can now shed light on the phenomenal character of perceptual experience. Consider, then, the following question:
- The Character Question: what determines the phenomenal character of experience?
We began with the basic phenomenological observation that perceptual experiences are directly of things. A similarly basic observation is that what it is like for us to experience is at least partly a matter of such things appearing certain ways to us. When we reflect upon what determines what it is like to have an experience, we naturally begin with what is presented to us, and how it is presented. This is why it is so natural for Strawson to describe his experience in terms of what he perceives, and for Martin to say that “our awareness of what an experience is like is inextricably bound up with knowledge of what is presented to one in having such experience” (1998: 173).
Further, when we reflect upon what determines what it is like for us to experience, we naturally begin with the ordinary objects that are presented to us, and how they are presented or appear. This is why it is so natural for Strawson to describe his experience in terms of such objects, and why many find (at least component (i) of) Transparency intuitive.
So, we can highlight the following answer to the Character Question:
- Direct Realist Character: the phenomenal character of experience is determined, at least partly, by the direct presentation of ordinary objects.
Perceptual experiences are not just veridical experiences: there are illusions and hallucinations too. What does phenomenological reflection say about how these cases relate to each other? More specifically:
- The Common Kind Question: are veridical, illusory, and hallucinatory experiences fundamentally the same, do they form of a common kind?
In the context of the Problem of Perception, these cases are usually distinguished as follows: a veridical experience is an experience in which an ordinary object is perceived, and where the object appears as it is; an illusory experience is an experience in which an ordinary object is perceived, and where the object appears other than it is; a hallucination is an experience which seems to the subject exactly like a veridical perception of an ordinary object but where there is no such perceived or presented object. (For illusions and hallucinations which don’t fit these forms, see Johnston (2011), and Batty and Macpherson (2016)).
Clearly, there are differences between these categories, but from a phenomenological point of view, these experiences seem the same in at least this sense: for any veridical perception of an ordinary object, we can imagine a corresponding illusion or hallucination which cannot be told apart or distinguished, by introspection, from the veridical perception. This suggests the following answer to the Common Kind Question:
- Common Kind Claim: veridical, illusory, and hallucinatory experiences (as) of an F are fundamentally the same; they form a common kind.
Thus, a veridical, illusory, and hallucinatory experience, all alike in being experiences (as) of a churchyard covered in white snow, are not merely superficially similar, they are fundamentally the same: these experiences have the same nature, fundamentally the same kind of experiential event is occurring in each case. Any differences between them are external to their nature as experiences (e.g., to do with how they are caused).
The Problem of Perception is that if illusions and hallucinations are possible, then perceptual experience, as we ordinarily understand it, is impossible. The Problem is animated by two central arguments: the argument from illusion (§2.1) and the argument from hallucination (§2.2). (A similar problem arises with reference to other perceptual phenomena such as perspectival variation or conflicting appearances: see Burnyeat (1979) and the entry on sense-data). For some classic readings on these arguments, see Moore (1905, 1910); Russell (1912); Price (1932); Broad (1965); and Ayer (1940), see Swartz (1965) for a good collection of readings. And for more recent expositions see Snowdon (1992), Valberg (1992), Robinson (1994: Chapter 2), Smith (2002: Chapters 1 and 7), Martin (2006), Fish (2009: Chapter 2), Brewer (2011: Chapter 1) and Pautz (2021).
The two central arguments have a similar structure which we can capture as follows:
- In an illusory/hallucinatory experience, a subject is not directly presented with an ordinary object.
- The same account of experience must apply to veridical experiences as applies to illusory/hallucinatory experiences.
- Subjects are never directly presented with ordinary objects.
(C) contradicts Direct Realist Presentation, and thus our ordinary conception of perceptual experience. And since Direct Realism seems to follow from Direct Realist Presentation, the argument challenges Direct Realism too (for more on this see §3.2.6).
Representing the arguments in this basic form enables us to highlight their two major movements; what Paul Snowdon calls the base case, and the spreading step (1992, 2005). In the base case a conclusion about just illusory/hallucinatory experiences is sought: (A). In the spreading step, (B), this result is generalised so as to get (C). This generalising move works on these background assumptions: (a1) that (B) yields the claim that one is not directly presented with ordinary objects in veridical experiences (given (A)), and (a2) if one is not directly presented with such objects in even veridical experiences, one never is.
We’ll look at more complex versions of the argument shortly. As we’ll see, the main burden on the arguer from illusion is in supporting the relevant version of (A), whereas the main burden on the arguer from hallucination is in defending the relevant version of (B).
Now, the argument here is purely negative. But many philosophers have moved from this to the further conclusion that since we are always directly presented with something in perceptual experience, what we are presented with is a “non-ordinary” object (see §3.1.2).
Applying the above structure, the argument from illusion is:
- In illusory experiences, we are not directly presented with ordinary objects.
- The same account of experience must apply to veridical experiences as applies to illusory experiences.
- We are never directly presented with ordinary objects.
Moving beyond the simple formulation, the argument is typically presented as involving these steps, for an arbitrary subject S:
- In an illusion, it seems to S that something has a sensible quality, F, which the ordinary object supposedly being perceived does not have.
- When it seems to S that something has a sensible quality, F, then there is something directly presented to S which does have this quality.
- Since the ordinary object in question is, by hypothesis, not-F, then it follows that in an illusion, S is not directly presented with the ordinary object supposedly being perceived.
- The same account of experience must apply to both veridical and illusory experiences.
- In veridical experience, S is not directly presented with the ordinary object supposedly being perceived.
- If S is not directly presented with the ordinary object supposedly being perceived in veridical experience, S is never directly presented with an ordinary object.
- We are never directly presented with ordinary objects.
The most controversial premise here is premise (ii). The others reflect intuitive ways of thinking about perceptual experience, or plausible assumptions. This is clear enough with (i) and (iv). Premise (i) articulates the operative conception of illusions. An example to illustrate is a case where a white wall looks yellow to you, in peculiar lighting (Smith (2002: 25)). And premise (vi) reflects the intuitive idea that if we aren’t directly presented with the ordinary objects we seem to perceive in veridical experiences, then we aren’t directly presented with ordinary objects at all. For it would be implausible to relinquish the idea that we are directly presented with the ordinary objects we seem to perceive in veridical experience, yet maintain that we can still somehow else be directly presented with ordinary objects, e.g., with the idea that hallucinations are direct presentations of ordinary objects, or with the idea that veridical experiences are direct presentations of ordinary objects just not those we seem to perceive.
But what about (iv)? On one way of interpreting this, it reflects the Common Kind Claim applied to veridical experiences and illusions. Furthermore, various authors hold that (iv) is supported by the continuity between veridical experiences and illusory experience (Price (1932: 32), Ayer (1940: 8–9), Broad (1952: 9), Robinson (1994: 57), Smith (2002: 26–28): the fact that they may form a “continuous series” in which they “shade into one another” (Ayer (1940: 8–9)). This, it is held, supports the idea that experiential differences between illusions and veridical perceptions are differences of “degree and not of kind” (Ayer (1940: 8)).
Premise (ii) is a version of what Robinson calls the Phenomenal Principle:
If there sensibly appears to a subject to be something which possesses a particular sensible quality then there is something of which the subject is aware which does possess that sensible quality (1994: 32).
C.D. Broad motivates this principle on explanatory grounds. In cases of perceptual experience things appear some ways rather than others to us. We need to explain this. Why does the penny look elliptical to you as opposed to some other shape? One answer is that there is something directly presented to you which is in fact elliptical. Thus, as Broad says “If, in fact, nothing elliptical is before my mind, it is very hard to understand why the penny should seem elliptical rather than of any other shape.” (1923: 240). Other philosophers have simply taken the principle to be obvious. H.H. Price, for example, says that “When I say ‘this table appears brown to me’ it is quite plain that I am acquainted with an actual instance of brownness” (1932: 63).
So much for the argument’s main premises. How is it supposed to work? Here we find the suggestion that it hinges on an application of Leibniz’s Law of the Indiscernibility of Identicals (Robinson (1994: 32); Smith (2002: 25)). The point is that (i) and (ii) tell us that in an illusory experience you are directly presented with an F thing, but the ordinary object supposedly being perceived is not F, thus the F thing and the ordinary object are not identical, by Leibniz’s Law. On these grounds, the conclusion of the base case is supposed to follow. And then the ultimate conclusion of the argument can be derived from its further premises.
But as French and Walters (2018) argue, this is invalid. (i), (ii) and Leibniz’s Law entail that in an illusory experience you are directly presented with an F thing which is non-identical to the ordinary object supposedly being perceived. However, this doesn’t entail that in the illusion you are not directly presented with the ordinary object. You might be directly presented with the ordinary object as well as the F thing. We should be careful to distinguish not being directly presented with the ordinary object from being directly presented with something which is not the ordinary object (e.g., between not being directly presented with the white wall, and being directly presented with something that is not the white wall, e.g., a yellow entity). The argument is invalid in conflating these two ideas.
One option for fixing the argument is to introduce what French and Walters call the Exclusion Assumption (cf., Snowdon (1992: 74)): If in an illusion of an ordinary object as F, a subject is directly presented with an F thing non-identical to the ordinary object, then they are not also directly presented with the ordinary object.
This assumption bridges the gap between the conclusion actually achieved: namely, in an illusory experience S is directly presented with an F thing non-identical to the ordinary object, and the desired conclusion (iii). But whether this assumption is defensible remains to be seen. We leave this and the issue of validity aside and consider responses from different theories of experience below.
The argument from hallucination relies on the possibility of hallucinations as understood above. Such hallucinations are not like real drug-induced hallucinations or hallucinations suffered by those with certain mental disorders. They are rather supposed to be merely possible events. For example, suppose you are now having a veridical perception of a snow-covered churchyard. The assumption that hallucinations are possible means that you could have an experience which is subjectively indistinguishable—that is, indistinguishable by you, “from the inside”—from a veridical perception of a snow-covered churchyard, but where there is in fact no churchyard presented or there to be perceived. The claim that such hallucinations are possible is widely accepted but not indisputable (see Austin (1962) and Masrour (2020)). For more on hallucinations, see Macpherson and Platchias (2013).
The argument from hallucination runs as follows:
- In hallucinatory experiences, we are not directly presented with ordinary objects
- The same account of experience must apply to veridical experiences as applies to hallucinatory experiences.
- We are never directly presented with ordinary objects.
Unlike with the argument from illusion, the base case doesn’t rely on the Phenomenal Principle: (A) simply falls out of what hallucinations are supposed to be.
The spreading step can be interpreted in terms of the Common Kind Claim, applied to veridical experiences and hallucinations. Accepting (B) understood in this way puts a constraint on what can be said about the nature of veridical experience: whatever can be said had better be able to apply to hallucinations too. The argument is that, given (A), this then rules out an account of veridical experiences as direct presentations of ordinary objects. But then (C) follows (given that if we are not directly presented with ordinary objects in veridical experience, we never are).
With the argument understood in this way, we can see the power of the Problem of Perception. (A) is intuitive, and (B) is part of our ordinary conception of perceptual experience, yet what follows, (C), contradicts another aspect of our ordinary conception (Direct Realist Presentation). Thus, the very intelligibility of our ordinary conception of perceptual experience is threatened.
Now it might be argued that the Common Kind Claim applied to veridical perceptions and hallucinations is not as plausible as it is when applied to veridical perceptions and illusions. For veridical and illusory experiences are more naturally grouped together anyway, unlike veridical perceptions and hallucinations. For, at least before we encounter the argument from illusion, veridical perceptions and illusions are both naturally thought of as direct presentations of ordinary objects (it’s just that in illusory cases the presented objects appear other than they are). However, as noted above, from a phenomenological point of view, hallucinations too seem as though they are direct presentations of ordinary objects: from the subject’s perspective a hallucination as of an F cannot be distinguished from a veridical experience of an F. This is why it seems so plausible to think of them as fundamentally the same.
Even so, the Common Kind Claim applied to veridical perceptions and hallucinations is controversial, and rejecting it is central to the disjunctivist response to the Problem of Perception that we will consider later (§3.4).
A number of philosophical theories of experience have emerged as responses to the Problem of Perception, or in relation to such responses. Here we consider the sense-datum theory (§3.1), adverbialism (§3.2), intentionalism (§3.3), and naive realist disjunctivism (§3.4). In this exposition we do not consider much the possibility of hybrid views. The way these positions relate to the Problem of Perception is mapped most clearly in Martin (1995, 1998, 2000).
We present these theories as operating on two levels. On Level 1, they tell us about the nature of experience. With the exception of adverbialism (for reasons that will emerge shortly), this can be investigated by considering the stance of each theory on the nature of the objects of experience, and the structure of our experience of objects. On Level 2, they tell us how what is said at the first level bears on the explanation of the character of experience. We also consider how each theory addresses the common kind question.
In what follows, we’ll work with the example of a visual experience of a snow-covered churchyard. To simplify, we will discuss the character of this experience in terms of one aspect of it: things looking white to a subject. The question at Level 1 is: what is the nature of such an experience? Does it involve the direct presentation of objects, or not? If so, what sorts of objects? If not, how are we to understand the nature of this experience? The question at Level 2 is: what is it about the nature of this experience that explains why things look any way at all to someone, and why they look, specifically, white?
What does the sense-datum theorist say at Level 1? On this theory, whenever a subject has a sensory experience, there is something which is presented to them. This relational conception of experience is sometimes called an “act-object” conception, since it posits a distinction between the mental act of being presented with something, and the object presented. More precisely, the sense-datum theorist holds that an experience in which something appears F to S, where F is a sensible quality (e.g., whiteness), consists in S being directly presented with something which actually is F (e.g. a white thing). They thus endorse the aforementioned Phenomenal Principle. The sense-datum theorist calls these objects of perception “sense-data”.
Understood in this way, a sense-datum is just whatever it is that you are directly presented with that instantiates the sensible qualities which characterise the character of your experience. This involves no further claim about the nature of sense-data, though as we’ll see shortly, sense-datum theorists do go on to make further claims about the nature of sense-data.
What about Level 2? With respect to our example, the sense-datum theorist claims that things appearing any way at all to you consists in the fact that you are directly presented with a sense-datum, and things appearing white to you consists in the fact that you are directly presented with a white sense-datum. The character of your experience is explained by an actual instance of whiteness manifesting itself in experience.
The sense-datum theorist endorses the Common Kind Claim. So, a veridical experience in which something appears white to you consists in your being directly presented with a white sense-datum; but so do corresponding illusory and hallucinatory experiences. These experiences have the same nature.
The sense-datum theorist endorses the following negative claim:
- We are never directly presented with ordinary objects.
They accept this on the basis of the arguments from illusion and hallucination. However, the intended contrast with Direct Realist Presentation usually involves a stronger claim:
- We are only ever directly presented with sense-data, which are non-ordinary objects.
This involves a positive claim about what we are directly presented with, given that we are never directly presented with ordinary objects. And it embeds a claim about the nature of sense-data that goes beyond that outlined above: now sense-data are understood as non-ordinary objects.
Sense-datum theorists divide over exactly how to understand sense-data insofar as they are non-ordinary. Some early sense-datum theorists (such as Moore) initially took sense-data to be mind-independent, but peculiar non-physical objects. Later theorists treat sense-data as mind-dependent entities (Robinson (1994)). This is how the theory tends to be understood in literature from second half of the 20th century on.
Sense-datum theorists have developed more positive Problem of Perception style reasoning to support these additional ideas. For instance, Macpherson (2013: 12–13) outlines a more complicated version of the argument from hallucination than that above which concludes that “All perceptual experience, hallucinatory and non-hallucinatory, involves awareness of a mind-dependent, nonphysical object—a sense-datum”. And some sense-datum theorists have attempted to support non-ordinary sense-data outside of the context of the Problem of Perception (see Jackson (1977) and Lowe (1992)).
From now on when we speak of “sense-data” we will mean non-ordinary sense-data, and when we speak of the “sense-datum theory” we have in mind a theory that endorses not just (1) but (2).
The sense-datum theorist agrees with some aspects of our ordinary conception of perceptual experience. They endorse the Common Kind Claim. They also endorse Presentation – the idea that the direct objects of experience are perceptually presented to us. It’s just that they don’t agree that the direct objects of experience are ordinary objects – they are non-ordinary sense-data. They thus reject Ordinary Objects, and hence Direct Realist Presentation, and Direct Realist Character.
Is the sense-datum theory a theory on which we completely lose contact with the world, a theory on which we cannot perceive the world?
Though it is possible for a sense-datum theorist to accept this, a more popular position has been one on which we still have some form of perception of the world, just not direct perception. That is, the sense-datum theorist can say that we indirectly perceive ordinary objects: we perceive them by being directly presented with sense-data. A sense-datum theorist who says this is known as an indirect realist or representative realist (see the entry on epistemological problems of perception). The task for such a sense-datum theorist is to spell out how the direct presentation of sense-data can lead to indirect perception of ordinary objects. This is something early sense-datum theorists pursued by asking how sense-data are related to ordinary objects. A theorist who denies that we perceive mind-independent objects at all, directly or indirectly, but only sense-data construed as mental entities, is known as a phenomenalist or an idealist (see Foster (2000), see Crane and Farkas (2004: Section 2) for an introduction to the subject; and the entry on idealism).
The sense-datum theory was widely rejected in the second half of the 20th century, though it still had its occasional champions (e.g., Jackson (1977), O’Shaughnessy (2000, 2003), Lowe (1992), Robinson (1994), Foster (2000)). A number of objections have been made to the theory. Some of these are objections specifically to the indirect realist version: for example, the claim that the theory gives rise to an unacceptable “veil of perception” between mind and world. The idea is that sense-data “interpose” themselves between perceivers and ordinary objects, and therefore problematise our perceptual, cognitive, and epistemic access to the world. In response, the indirect realist can say that sense-data are the medium by which we perceive ordinary objects, and no more create a “veil of perception” than the fact that we use words to talk about things creates a “veil of words” between us and what we talk about. (For recent discussion see Silins (2011)).
A common objection is to attack the Phenomenal Principle (see Barnes (1944–5); Anscombe (1965)). The objection is that the Phenomenal Principle is fallacious. It is not built into the meaning of “something appears F to one” that “one is directly presented with an F thing”. Defenders of the sense-datum theory can respond that the Phenomenal Principle is not supposed to be a purely logical inference; it is not supposed to be true simply because of the logical form or semantic structure of “appears” and similar locutions. Rather, it is true because of specific phenomenological facts about perceptual experience. But this just means that theorists who reject the Phenomenal Principle are not disagreeing about whether the Phenomenal Principle involves a fallacy or about some semantic issue, but rather about the nature of experience itself.
Another influential objection to sense-data comes from the prevailing naturalism of contemporary philosophy. Naturalism (or physicalism) says that the world is entirely physical in its nature: everything there is supervenes on the physical, and is governed by physical law. Many sense-datum theorists are committed to the claim that non-ordinary sense-data are mind-dependent: objects whose existence depends on the existence of states of mind. Is this consistent with naturalism? If so, the challenge is to explain how an object can be brought into existence by the existence of an experience, and how this is supposed to be governed by physical law.
Many contemporary sense-datum theorists, however, will not be moved by this challenge, since they are happy to accept the rejection of naturalism as a consequence of their theory (Robinson (1994), Foster (2000)). On the other hand, one might think that there is no conflict here with naturalism, as long as experiences themselves are part of the natural order. But if sense-data are non-ordinary in being mind-independent but non-physical, then it is much less clear how naturalism can be maintained (cf., what Martin (2004, 2006) calls “experiential naturalism” which serves as a constraint on theories of experience and rules out some but not all forms of the sense-datum theory).
For other objections to the sense-datum theory, including the worry that it must admit “indeterminate” sense-data (e.g., on the basis of seeing a speckled hen, which appears to have a number of speckles but no definite number), see the entry on sense-data.
Part of the point of adverbialism, as defended by Ducasse (1942) and Chisholm (1957) is to do justice to the phenomenology of experience whilst avoiding the dubious metaphysical commitments of the sense-datum theory. The only entities which the adverbialist needs to acknowledge are subjects of experience, experiences themselves, and ways these experiences are modified. Let us explain.
At Level 1, the adverbialist rejects the Phenomenal Principle and the whole idea that experience consists in being directly presented with perceptible entities. For the adverbialist, when someone has an experience of something white, something like whiteness is instantiated, but in the experience itself, not a presented thing. This is not to say that the experience is white, but rather that the experience is modified in a certain way, the way we can call “perceiving whitely”. The canonical descriptions of perceptual experiences, then, employ adverbial modifications of the perceptual verbs: instead of describing an experience as someone’s “visually sensing a white sphere”, the theory says that they are “visually sensing whitely and spherely”. This is why this theory is called the “adverbial theory”; but it is important to emphasize that it is more a theory about the nature of experience itself than it is a semantic analysis of sentences describing experience.
It is also intended as a theory of the character of experience (Level 2). The adverbialist claims that things appearing white to you consists in you sensing whitely. It is because you are sensing in some way that explains why things appear a certain way to you at all, and it is the fact that you are sensing whitely that explains why things appear white to you, rather than some other way. The character of your experience is explained by the specific “white” way in which your experience is modified.
The adverbialist endorses the Common Kind Claim. So, a veridical experience in which something appears white to you, consists in you sensing whitely, but so do corresponding illusory and hallucinatory experiences: these experiences have the same nature.
When used in a broad way, “qualia” picks out whatever qualities a state of mind has which constitute the state of mind’s having the phenomenal character it has. In this broad sense, any phenomenally conscious state of mind has qualia. (This is the way the term is used in, e.g., Chalmers (1996)). Used in a narrow way, however, qualia are non-intentional, intrinsic properties of experience: properties which have no intentional or representational aspects whatsoever. To use Gilbert Harman’s apt metaphor, qualia in this sense are “mental paint” properties (1990). Harman rejects mental paint, but the idea of experience as involving mental paint is defended by Block (2004)).
It is relatively uncontroversial to say that there are qualia in the broad sense. It can be misleading, however, to use the term in this way, since it can give rise to the illusion that the existence of qualia is a substantial philosophical thesis when in fact it is something which will be accepted by anyone who believes in phenomenal character. (Hence Dennett’s (1991) denial of qualia can seem bewildering if “qualia” is taken in the broad sense). It is controversial to say that there are qualia in the narrow sense, though, and those who have asserted their existence have therefore provided arguments and thought-experiments to defend this assertion (see Block (1997), Peacocke (1983: Chapter 1), Shoemaker (1990)). In what follows, “qualia” will be used exclusively in the narrow sense.
As noted, adverbialism is committed to the view that experiencing something white, for example, involves your experience being modified in a certain way: experiencing whitely. A natural way to understand this is in terms of the idea that the experience is an event, and the modification of it is a property of that event. Since this property is both intrinsic (as opposed to relational or representational) and phenomenal then this way of understanding adverbialism is committed to the existence of qualia.
An important objection to adverbialism is the “Many Property Problem” proposed by Frank Jackson (1975). Consider someone who senses a brown square and a green triangle simultaneously. The adverbialist will characterize this state of mind as “sensing brownly and squarely and greenly and triangularly”. But how can they distinguish the state of mind they are describing in this way from that of sensing a brown triangle and a green square? The characterization fits that state of mind equally well. Obviously, what is wanted is a description according to which the brownness “goes with” the squareness, and the greenness “goes with” the triangularity. But how is the adverbialist to do this without introducing objects of experience—the things which are brown and green respectively—or a visual field with a spatial structure? The challenge is whether the adverbialist can properly account for the spatial structure and complexity in what is given in visual experience. See Tye (1984), Breckenridge (2018: Chapter 10), and D’Ambrosio (2019) for adverbialist responses to this challenge. For a helpful overview, see Fish (2010: Chapter 3).
A further challenge is that adverbialism is “incapable of doing justice to the most obvious and indeed essential phenomenological fact about perceptual consciousness… namely… its object-directness” (Butchvarov (1980: 272)). Recall here the basic phenomenological observation we began with: perceptual experiences are directly of things.
As we’ve seen, at Level 1, the adverbialist denies that perceptual experiences are direct presentations of objects. And at Level 2, in explaining character, the adverbialist assigns no role to the direct presentation of things, just ways of sensing. But then if it is an aspect of the phenomenology of experience that our experiences have direct objects, then it is not clear that the adverbialist has the resources to capture this. For the adverbialist, to capture your experience of a snow-covered churchyard we invoke seeing whitely not seeing a white thing. How, then, can we explain why phenomenologically, your experience is directly of a white thing – or even why it seems to be object-directed in this way? Butchvarov’s charge is that the adverbialist doesn’t have the resources to answer these questions. (See D’Ambrosio (2019) for a recent adverbialist attempt to capture something like object-directness).
The argument from illusion relies on the Phenomenal Principle. In rejecting this, the adverbialist thus rejects the argument. But what about the argument from hallucination? This does not rely on the Phenomenal Principle. The adverbialist accepts (A). And they also accept (B) in the form of the Common Kind Claim. (C) follows (given assumptions (a1) and (a2)). For this reason, the adverbialist must reject Direct Realist Presentation. So, like the sense-datum theorist, the adverbialist must admit that we are never directly presented with ordinary objects, not even in veridical experience.
Like the sense-datum theorist, though the adverbialist accepts some of our ordinary conception of perceptual experience (the Common Kind Claim), they reject other aspects of it. The argument from hallucination forces them to reject Direct Realist Presentation (and therefore Direct Realist Character). Underlying this is the adverbialist’s rejection of Presentation, and arguably Ordinary Objects too. They reject Presentation in denying that experiences have a relational structure. And given our discussion of Butchvarov’s challenge, it seems as though they must reject (or at least don’t have the resources to accept) Ordinary Objects. For it is unclear how they can validate the phenomenological claim that experiences are of objects, let alone directly of ordinary objects.
So, even though adverbialism arises as a response to the sense-datum theory, given its almost wholesale rejection of our ordinary conception of perceptual experience, it is unclear how much of an improvement the approach is in the broader dialectic of the Problem of Perception.
One response to this is that we should not suppose that the only way to articulate direct realism is through the claim we’ve labelled Direct Realist Presentation. There is another way to articulate it which, it might be suggested, enables the adverbialist to account for direct perception of the world. Consider, then:
- Direct Realist Presentation: perceptual experiences are direct perceptual presentations of ordinary objects.
This entails Direct Realism – that we can directly perceive ordinary objects – on the assumption that being directly perceptually presented with an ordinary object is a way of directly perceiving it. On this way of thinking, direct perception of an ordinary object is built into perceptual experience itself. However, one might reject this claim about experience (as adverbialists do), and still hold that we can have direct perception of an ordinary object. How?
Instead of thinking of direct perception of the world as built into experience, we can think of direct perception of the world as built out of experience together with the satisfaction of other conditions. This idea is usually developed through a causal theory of perception (Grice 1961): where perception of an object is analysed in terms of (i) experience of an ordinary object (conceived as something which is not sufficient for perception), and (ii) the satisfaction of a causal condition which requires that the experience be caused by the object (in a non-deviant way). This is a causal theory of direct perception on the assumption that the account doesn’t involve any perceptual intermediaries.
The adverbialist might suggest that they can embrace this: by combining their theory of experience with a causal analysis of direct perception. Thus, they can hold that when you have an experience of a snow-covered churchyard, if this experience is appropriately caused by an ordinary white thing (e.g., some snow), this is what directly perceiving such an object amounts to (given that no perceptual intermediaries are involved).
However, whether the adverbialist is entitled to this way of making sense of direct perceptual contact with the world hinges on whether they can make sense of the idea of an experience of an ordinary object. But as we have seen in considering Butchvarov’s challenge, it is unclear whether the adverbialist can do this. It is thus unclear whether the adverbialist can really make sense of clause (i).
In response, the adverbialist might offer a causal analysis of experiences being of objects. They might thus attempt to fall back on the idea that an experience in which you sense whitely is an experience “of” a white thing insofar as it is causally related to a white thing (or, insofar as it is of a type, instances of which are typically caused by white things). However, as Butchvarov argues, the fact that “x is causally related to S’s sensing in a certain way can no more reasonably be described as S’s being conscious of [i.e. having a conscious experience of] x than the fact that the presence of carbon monoxide in the air is causally related to S’s having a headache can be described as S’s being conscious of [having a conscious experience of] carbon monoxide” (1980: 273).
Even if the adverbialist is able to sustain such a causal form of direct realism, it is very different from the phenomenological form of direct realism embedded in our ordinary conception of perceptual experience. It is thus unlikely to satisfy a direct realist sensitive to the phenomenological concerns which give rise to our ordinary conception of perceptual experience.
The intentionalist holds that we directly experience ordinary objects. The distinguishing feature of the view is a specific conception of the manner in which experiences are directly of ordinary objects: here the intentionalist appeals to intentionality conceived of as a form of mental representation (hence it is also sometimes called the representationalist theory of experience). “Intentionality” is a term with its origins in scholastic philosophy (see Crane (1998b)), but its current use derives from Brentano (1874), who introduced the term “intentional inexistence” for the “mind’s direction upon its objects”. Intentional inexistence, or intentionality, is sometimes explained as the “aboutness” of mental states (see the entries on Franz Brentano, representational theories of consciousness and intentionality).
At Level 1, then, the intentionalist holds that to experience a snow-covered churchyard is to directly perceptually represent such an object (i.e. to represent such an object but not in virtue of representing another more “immediate” object). At Level 2, this is put to work in explaining phenomenal character. In relation to our example, why is this a case of things appearing any way at all to you, and why is it a case of things appearing white to you? Here the intentionalist appeals to the experience’s directly representing things in a certain way, and specifically to experience’s directly representing whiteness in the environment, to account for this. The character of your experience is explained by the specific way in which your experience directly represents the world.
Critics of intentionalism have argued that it does not adequately distinguish perceptual experience from other forms of intentionality, and therefore does not manage to capture what is distinctive about experience (Robinson (1994: 164)). One objection of this kind is that the aforementioned intentionalist explanation of character is inadequate. The worry is that believing that something is the case, for example, or hoping that something is the case, are both forms of mental representation, but neither state of mind has any “feel” or phenomenal character to call its own. (Words or images may come to mind when mentally representing something in this way, but it is not obvious that these are essential to the states of mind themselves.) So, the challenge is that if there is nothing about representation as such which explains the character of an experience, how is experience supposed to be distinguished from mere thought?
There are a number of ways an intentionalist can respond. One is simply to take it as a basic fact about perceptual intentionality that it has phenomenal character (see Kriegel (2013)). After all, even those who believe in qualia have to accept that some states of mind have qualia and some do not, and that at some point the distinction between mental states which are phenomenally conscious, and those which are not, just has to be accepted as a brute fact. Another response is to say that in order to fully explain the phenomenal character of perceptual experience, we need to treat experience as involving non-intentional qualia as well as intentionality (see Peacocke (1983: Chapter 1); Shoemaker (1996); Block (1997)). There is, accordingly, a dispute between these intentionalists who accept qualia (like Block and Shoemaker) and those who don’t (like Harman (1990) or Tye (1992)). (For more on this see the entries on qualia and inverted qualia. Additional readings are: Block (2005) (2010), Egan (2006), Hilbert and Kalderon (2000), Marcus (2006), Shoemaker (1990), Speaks (2015), Spener (2003), and Tye (2000)).
Intentionalists endorse the Common Kind Claim. So, a veridical experience of churchyard covered in white snow, consists in direct representation of such a scene, but so do corresponding illusory and hallucinatory experiences: these experiences have the same nature.
Like adverbialists, the intentionalist has no need to postulate non-ordinary perceptible entities in the cases of illusion and hallucination. It is not generally true that when a representation represents something (as being F), there has to actually be something (which is F). Thus, for the intentionalist, experience is representational in a way that contrasts with it being relational/presentational. Experience does not genuinely have an act-object structure. This is in keeping with a standard tradition in the theory of intentionality which treats it as non-relational (the tradition derives from Husserl (1900/1901); for discussion see Zahavi (2003: 13–27). So, for the intentionalist, since it is not of the essence of experience or its character that it is relational, it is not of its essence that it is a relation to a sense-datum.
Some of the most influential (at least partial) intentional theories are Anscombe (1965), Armstrong (1968), Pitcher (1970), Peacocke (1983), Harman (1990), Tye (1992, 1995), Dretske (1995), Lycan (1996); for more recent accounts, see Byrne (2001), Siegel (2010), Pautz (2010) and the entry on the contents of perception.
Within analytic philosophy, intentionalism is a generalisation of an idea presented by G.E.M. Anscombe (1965), and the “belief theories” of D.M. Armstrong (1968) and George Pitcher (1970). (Within the phenomenological tradition intentionality and perception had always been discussed together: see the entry on phenomenology.) Anscombe had drawn attention to the fact that perceptual verbs satisfy the tests for non-extensionality or intensionality (see the entry on intensional transitive verbs). For example, just as ‘Vladimir is thinking about Pegasus’ is an intensional context, so ‘Vladimir has an experience as of a pink elephant in the room’ is an intensional context. In neither case can we infer that there exists something Vladimir is thinking about, or that there is exists something he is experiencing. This is the typical manifestation of intensionality. Anscombe regarded the error of sense-datum and naive realist theories as the failure to recognise this intensionality. (Her own example was the alleged intensionality of ‘see’, but this is controversial.)
Armstrong and Pitcher argued that perception is a form of belief. (More precisely, they argued that it is the acquisition of a belief, since an acquisition is a conscious event, as perceiving is; rather than a state or condition, as belief is.) Belief is an intentional state in the sense that it represents the world to be a certain way, and the way it represents the world to be is said to be its intentional content. Perception, it was argued, is similarly a representation of the world, and the way it represents the world to be is likewise its intentional content. The fact that someone can have a perceptual experience of something as F, without there being any thing which is F was taken as a reason for saying that perception is just a form of belief-acquisition.
Certain cases put pressure on this. For instance, consider the famous Müller-Lyer illusion in which two lines of equal length look unequal. You can experience this even if you know (and therefore believe) that the lines are the same length. If perception were simply the acquisition of belief, then this would be a case of explicitly contradictory beliefs: you believe that the lines are the same length and that they are different lengths. But this is surely not the right way to describe this situation. (Armstrong recognized this, and re-described perception as a “potential belief”; this marks a significant retreat from the original claim).
The belief theory (and related theories, like the judgement theory of Craig (1976)) is a specific version of the intentional theory. But it is not the most widely accepted version (though see Glüer (2009) for a recent defence; and Byrne (forthcoming)). Intentionalism is, however, not committed to the view that perceptual experience is belief; experience can be a sui generis kind of intentional state or event (Martin (1993)).
Intentionalists hold that what is in common between veridical experiences and indistinguishable hallucinations/illusions is their intentional content: roughly speaking, how the world is represented as being by the experiences. Many intentionalists hold that the sameness of phenomenal character in perception and hallucination/illusion is exhausted or constituted by this sameness in content (see Tye (2000), Byrne (2001)). But this latter claim is not essential to intentionalism (see the discussion of intentionalism and qualia above). What is essential is that the intentional content of perception explains (whether wholly or partly) its phenomenal character.
The intentional content of perceptual experience is sometimes called “perceptual content” (see the entry on the contents of perception). What is perceptual content? A standard approach to intentionality treats all intentional states as propositional attitudes: states which are ascribed by sentences of the form “S ___ that p” where ‘S’ is to be replaced by a term for a subject, ‘p’ with a sentence, and the ‘___’ with a psychological verb. The distinguishing feature of the propositional attitudes is that their content—how they represent the world to be—is something which is assessable as true or false. Hence the canonical form of ascriptions of perceptual experiences is: “S perceives/experiences that p”. Perceptual experience, on this kind of intentionalist view, is a propositional attitude (see Byrne (2001), Siegel (2010)).
But intentionalism is not committed to the view that experience is a propositional attitude. For one thing, it is controversial whether all intentional states are propositional attitudes (see Crane (2001: Chapter 4)). Among the intentional phenomena there are relations like love and hate which do not have propositional content; and there are also non-relational states expressed by the so-called “intensional transitive” verbs like seek, fear, expect (see the entry on intensional transitive verbs). All these states of mind have contents which are not, on the face of it, assessable as true or false. If I am seeking a bottle of inexpensive Burgundy, what I am seeking—the intentional content of my seeking, or the intentional object under a certain mode of presentation—is not something true or false. Some argue that these intentional relations and intentional transitives are analysable or reducible to propositional formulations (see Larson (2003) for an attempt to defend this view of intensional transitives; and Sainsbury (2010) for a less radical defence). But the matter is controversial; and it is especially controversial where experience is concerned. For we have many ways of talking about experience which do not characterize its content in propositional terms: for example, “Vladimir sees a snail on the grass”, or “Vladimir is watching a snail on the grass” can be distinguished from the propositional formulation “Vladimir sees that there is a snail on the grass” (for discussion of watching, see Crowther 2009).
There are those who follow Dretske (1969) in claiming that these semantical distinctions express an important distinction between “epistemic” and “non-epistemic” seeing. However, the view that perceptual content is non-propositional is not the same as the view that it is “non-epistemic” in Dretske’s sense. For ascriptions of non-epistemic seeing are intended to be fully extensional in their object positions, but not all non-propositional descriptions of perception need be (for example, some have argued that “Macbeth saw a dagger before him” does not entail “there is a dagger which Macbeth saw”: cf. Anscombe (1965)). The question of whether perceptual experience has a propositional content is far from being settled, even for those who think it has intentional content (see McDowell (2008); Crane (2009)).
Another debate about the content of perceptual experience is whether it is object-dependent, or object-independent (see Soteriou (2000) and Schellenberg (2018: Part II); and for a more general discussion, see Chalmers (2006)). An object-dependent content is a content which concerns a particular object, and is such that it cannot be the content of a state of mind unless that object exists (McDowell (1987) and Brewer (1999)). An object-independent content is one whose ability to be the content of any intentional state is not dependent on the existence of any particular object (Davies (1992) and McGinn (1989)).
The intentionalist holds that the content that is common to veridical experiences and subjectively indistinguishable hallucinations is object-independent: since such hallucinations occur in the absence of objects for such content to depend upon. However, as Martin (2002b) argues, drawing on (Burge 1991), the intentionalist can still appeal to the idea that particular veridical experiences have particular object-dependent contents in addition to the object-independent contents they share with subjectively indistinguishable hallucinations.
The objects of intentional states are sometimes called “intentional objects” (Crane (2001: Chapter 1)). What are the intentional objects of perceptual experience, according to intentionalists? In the case of veridical perception, the answer is simple: ordinary objects like the churchyard, the snow etc. But what should be said about the hallucinatory case? Since this case is by definition one in which there is no ordinary object being perceived, how can we even talk about something being an “object of experience” here? As noted above, intentionalists say that experiences are representations; and one can represent what does not exist (see Harman (1990), Tye (1992)). This is certainly true; but isn’t there any more to be said? For how does a representation of a non-existent churchyard differ from a representation of a non-existent cat, say, when one of those is hallucinated? The states seem to have different objects; but neither of these objects exist (see the entry nonexistent-objects).
One proposal is that the objects of hallucinatory experience are the properties which the hallucinated object is presented as having (Johnston (2004)). Another answer is to say that these hallucinatory states of mind have intentional objects which do not exist (Smith (2002: Chapter 9)). Intentional objects in this sense are not supposed to be entities or things of any kind. When we talk about perception and its “objects” in this context, we mean the word in the way it occurs in the phrase “object of thought” or “object of attention” and not as it occurs in the phrase “physical object”. An intentional object is always an object for a subject, and this is not a way of classifying things in reality. An intentionalist need not be committed to intentional objects in this sense; but if they are not, then they owe an account of the content of hallucinatory experiences.
How does the content of perceptual experience differ from the content of other intentional states? According to some intentionalists, one main difference is that perception has “non-conceptual” content. The basic idea is that experience involves a form of mental representation which is in certain ways less sophisticated than the representation involved in (say) belief. For example, having the belief that the churchyard is covered in snow requires that you have the concept of a churchyard. This is what it means to say that belief has conceptual content: to have the belief with the content that a is F requires that you possess the concept a and the concept F. So, to say that experience has non-conceptual content is to say the following: for you to have an experience with the content that a is F does not require that you have the concept of a and the concept F. The idea is that your perceptual experience can represent the world as being a certain way—the “a is F” way—even if you do not have the concepts that would be involved in believing that a is F. (For a more detailed version of this definition, see Crane (1998a) and Cussins (1990); for a different way of understanding the idea of non-conceptual content, see Heck (2000) and Speaks (2005). The idea of non-conceptual content derives from Evans (1982); there are some similar ideas in Dretske (1981); see Gunther (2002) for a collection of articles on this subject. Other support for non-conceptual content can be found in Bermúdez (1997); Peacocke (1992); Crowther (2006); for opposition see Brewer (1999) and McDowell (1994)).
The intentionalist rejects the argument from illusion as it hinges on the Phenomenal Principle which they reject. For the intentionalist, an illusory experience in which you see a white wall as yellow is not a case in which you are directly presented with a yellow sense-datum, but a case in which a white wall is directly represented as being yellow.
However, the intentionalist must accept the argument from hallucination. They accept (A), and they also accept (B) in the form of the Common Kind Claim. (C) follows (given (a1) and (a2)). Thus, like sense-datum theorists and adverbialists, intentionalists reject Direct Realist Presentation, and admit that we are not ever directly presented with ordinary objects, not even in veridical experience.
In response to this, the intentionalist can suggest that although they reject Direct Realist Presentation, they do not reject Direct Realism. They can suggest that the former is not the only way to understand the latter. As we saw above, another way to understand Direct Realism is with a causal understanding of direct perception.
As we noted above, it is unclear whether the adverbialist is entitled to this, since it is unclear how the adverbialist can make sense of the object-directedness of experience. But the intentionalist doesn’t face this problem. The object-directedness of experience is at the heart of their approach. Even though intentionalism denies that experiences involve the direct presentation of ordinary objects, it (a) respects and is motivated by the phenomenological observation that experiences are directly of ordinary objects, and (b) offers an alternative account of the manner in which experiences are directly of ordinary objects. As we’ve seen, instead of presentation, the intentionalist appeals to representation.
Thus, the intentionalist can maintain that when you see a snow-covered churchyard for what it is you do directly perceive a snow-covered churchyard. This is not because your experience itself directly presents you with a snow-covered churchyard. It doesn’t. After all, your experience is of such a kind that it could occur in a hallucination, where it wouldn’t directly present any ordinary object. It is rather because your experience directly perceptually represents the presence of a snow-covered churchyard and is non-deviantly caused by the churchyard in question. This is what direct perception amounts to for the intentionalist
A concern about adverbialism that we raised above, from the perspective of one who wants to uphold our ordinary conception of perceptual experience, is that (a) it rejects our ordinary conception of perceptual experience almost wholesale, and (b) adverbialist causal direct realism, even if it could be made to work, doesn’t seem to compensate for that: it isn’t sensitive enough to the phenomenological concerns that motivate our ordinary conception of perceptual experience. In contrast, intentionalism seems to fare better on both scores.
First, strictly speaking, the intentionalist must reject our ordinary conception of perceptual experience. Even though they accept the Common Kind Claim, they reject Direct Realist Presentation. Underlying this is not rejection of Ordinary Objects but of Presentation. But even here, their rejection of Presentation is not too radical. For intentionalists can say that experiences are quasi-presentational. The appeal to representation enables this. For when you directly perceptually represent the snow-covered churchyard, it certainly seems to you as if a churchyard is directly present to you, even if it is not (as you are, say, hallucinating). As we noted above, it is not clear from the resources the adverbialist offers how they can account for how it even seems as if an object is present to you. How does perceiving whitely make it seem as if a white thing is present to you?
Similarly, though strictly speaking the intentionalist must reject Direct Realist Character, the departure from this is not too radical. For instead, the intentionalist holds that the character of experience is determined, at least partly, by the direct perceptual representation of ordinary objects. It is not as if ordinary objects and their apparent presence drops out of the picture on the intentionalist account of phenomenal character. The account is similar to Direct Realist Character, just stripped of the genuine relationality.
Finally, the causal direct realist story that the intentionalist offers is intelligible in the way that it arguably isn’t for the adverbialist. And although it invokes causal notions, this is not to the exclusion of a core phenomenological understanding of direct experience of an object, which the intentionalist accounts for with the notion of direct perceptual representation.
Intentionalism, then, is a Direct Realist theory which upholds some of our ordinary conception of perceptual experience, and insofar as it rejects aspects of our ordinary conception, it does so in a non-radical way, sensitive to the phenomenological concerns that motivate this conception in the first place.
Consider the veridical experiences involved in cases where you genuinely perceive objects as they actually are. At Level 1, naive realists hold that such experiences are, at least in part, direct presentations of ordinary objects. At Level 2, the naive realist holds that things appear a certain way to you because you are directly presented with aspects of the world, and – in the case we are focusing on – things appear white to you, because you are directly presented with some white snow. The character of your experience is explained by an actual instance of whiteness manifesting itself in experience.
Naive realists thus assign an important explanatory role to the world itself in explaining the character of veridical experiences. But this doesn’t mean that they are committed to the idea that such character is fully explained or exhausted by the presented world. Naive realists admit that even holding fixed presented aspects of the world there can be variation in the character of experience. This is worked out in different (but compatible) ways by different theorists. One approach is to note how variations in the perceiver can make for variations in the character of experience (Logue (2012a)). Another is to highlight a third-relatum (of the relation of presentation) which encapsulates various conditions of perception such as one’s spatiotemporal perspective and the operative perceptual modality, where variation in such conditions can make for variation in phenomenal character (Campbell (2009), Brewer (2011)). Finally, some suggest that there can be variation in the way or manner in which one is related to perceived objects which makes a difference to phenomenal character (Soteriou (2013), Campbell (2014), French and Phillips (2020)). For further discussion see French (2018).
For the naive realist, insofar as experience and experiential character is constituted by a direct perceptual relation to aspects of the world, it is not constituted by the representation of such aspects of the world. This is why many naive realists describe the relation at the heart of their view as a non-representational relation. This doesn’t mean that experiences must lack intentional content, but it means that (a) insofar as appeal is made to presentation to explain character, no appeal is made to intentional content for that purpose, and (b) what is fundamental to experience is something which itself cannot be explained in terms of representing the world: a primitive relation of presentation. (For further discussion of naive realism as a non-representational view, see the articles in Part Three of Brogaard (2014)).
The other theories we have considered all endorse the Common Kind Claim. We’ve noted that naive realism applies to the veridical experiences involved in genuine perception, but does it apply more widely? Though naive realists may extend their approach to illusions, they typically deny that it applies to hallucinations and so reject the Common Kind Claim. Naive realists who deny the Common Kind Claim are disjunctivists. We call such a position naive realist disjunctivism. Let’s explore these ideas now.
There are various different naive realist approaches to illusion (see e.g., Fish (2009: Chapter 6), Brewer (2008, 2011: Chapter 5), Kalderon (2011), Genone (2014), French and Phillips (2020)). When it comes to the argument from illusion, the naive realist (like the intentionalist) rejects the Phenomenal Principle. So how does naive realism differ from intentionalism about illusions? In two respects: first, naive realists can maintain that illusory experiences are fundamentally direct presentations of the world. Second, the naive realist can explain the character of such illusory experiences without appeal to intentional content, but instead by appealing to the direct presentation of ordinary objects. Consider, for example, the approach developed by Brewer:
visually relevant similarities are those that ground and explain the ways that the particular physical objects that we are acquainted with in perception look. That is to say, visually relevant similarities are similarities by the lights of visual processing of various kinds... very crudely, visually relevant similarities are identities in such things as the way in which light is reflected and transmitted from the objects in question, and the way in which the stimuli are handled by the visual system, given its evolutionary history and our shared training during development (2011: 103)... in a case of visual illusion in which a mind-independent physical object, o, looks F, although o is not actually F, o is the direct object of visual perception from a spatiotemporal point of view and in circumstances of perception relative to which o has visually relevant similarities with paradigm exemplars of F although it is not actually an instance of F (2011: 105).
So though o may not itself be F, it can exist in certain conditions, C, such that it has visually relevant similarities to paradigm F things and in that sense it will objectively look F, or look like an F thing—that is, it will itself have a property, a look or an appearance, independently of anyone actually seeing it (see also Martin (2010), Kalderon (2011), Antony (2011), and Genone (2014) on objective looks). If o is then seen in C, o itself will look F to you in perception. Brewer spells this all out in more detail, and with various examples. One is seeing a white piece of chalk as red. The chalk is seen in abnormal illumination conditions such that the white piece of chalk itself looks like a paradigm red piece of chalk—it has “visually relevant similarities with a paradigm piece of chalk, of just that size and shape” (2011: 106). Given that it is seen in those conditions, it looks red to you, even though it is not in fact red. Here, then, we have an account of illusions in which we appeal to objects and the ways those objects are, not the ways they are represented to be, in explaining character.
What about the argument from hallucination? The naive realist thinks that at least veridical experiences are direct presentations of ordinary objects. They thus reject the conclusion (C) of the argument. But typically, naive realists accept (A). They therefore block the argument by rejecting the spreading step (B), understood in terms of the Common Kind Claim applied to veridical and hallucinatory experiences.
Such a naive realist reasons as follows: suppose that when you see a snow-covered churchyard for what it is, you have an experience which is in its nature a relation between you and ordinary objects. But a subjectively indistinguishable hallucinatory experience does not have such a nature. For such a hallucination could occur in the absence of any relevant worldly items (e.g., in the lab of a scientist manipulating your brain, in a world with no white things). Instead of taking (B) and these facts about hallucination to ground the rejection of naive realism, the naive realist instead rejects (B): even though the hallucination as of a snow-covered churchyard is subjectively indistinguishable from a veridical experience of such a scene, it is not of the same fundamental kind. (For a more nuanced formulation of the naive realist reasoning here, see Martin (2004), (2006). Raleigh (2014) and Ali (2018) advocate a naïve realist position which keeps the Common Kind Claim but rejects (A) and hence the understanding of hallucinations we are operating with here. See also Masrour (2020) who argues that it is an open question whether hallucinations are possible.).
In blocking the argument from hallucination in this way the naive realist endorses disjunctivism. This theory was first proposed by Hinton (1973) and was later developed by P.F. Snowdon (1979, 1990), John McDowell (1982, 1987) and M.G.F. Martin (2002, 2004, 2006). Disjunctivism is not best construed as it is by one of its proponents, as the view “that there is nothing literally in common” in veridical perception and hallucination, “no identical quality” (Putnam (1999: 152)). For both the veridical perception of an F and a subjectively indistinguishable hallucination of an F are experiences which are subjectively indistinguishable from a veridical perception of an F. What disjunctivists deny is that what makes it true that these two experiences are describable in this way is the presence of the same fundamental kind of mental state. Disjunctivists reject what J.M. Hinton calls “the doctrine of the ‘experience’ as the common element in a given perception” and an indistinguishable hallucination (Hinton (1973: 71)). The most fundamental common description of both states, then, is a merely disjunctive one: the experience is either a genuine perception of an F or a mere hallucination as of an F. Hence the theory’s name.
The disjunctivist rejects the Common Kind Claim. Underlying this is a rejection of what Martin (2004, 2006) calls the “common kind assumption”, namely:
- (CKA) whatever fundamental kind of mental event occurs when you veridically perceive, the very same kind of event could occur were you undergoing a subjectively indistinguishable hallucination.
But is the disjunctivist’s rejection of (CKA) plausible? The disjunctivist can note how the fact that a hallucination is subjectively indistinguishable from a veridical experience does not entail that they are of the same fundamental kind, even if it does suggest this.
However, some argue that even if such an appeal to subjective indistinguishability is not enough to establish (CKA), it is nonetheless well supported by a causal argument (Robinson (1985)). We can suppose that when you see the snow-covered churchyard for what it is, there is some proximal cause of this experience: the experience is preceded by a certain sort of brain state B. But now we can imagine a situation in which we bring about B thus producing an experience in you, yet where B is not brought about through any interaction between you and a snow-covered churchyard—e.g., in laboratory conditions. In this scenario you have an hallucinatory experience as of a snow-covered churchyard. It is plausible to suppose that these experiences are of the very same kind given that they have the same proximal cause.
The point here is that (CKA) looks like a plausible principle for causally matching veridical and hallucinatory experiences – veridical and hallucinatory experiences with the same proximal cause. This way of motivating (CKA) appeals to a same-cause, same-effect principle:
- Causal Principle 1: an event e1 is of the same kind as an event e2 if event e1 is produced by the same kind of proximate causal condition as e2 (Nudds 2009: 336).
Is this the end of the road for the naive realist disjunctivist, then? Not quite, since as Martin argues, the naive realist should reject this principle:
On [the naive realist] conception of experience, when one is veridically perceiving the objects of perception are constituents of the experiential episode. The given event could not have occurred without these entities existing and being constituents of it; in turn, one could not have had such a kind of event without there being relevant candidate objects of perception to be apprehended. So, even if those objects are implicated in the causes of the experience, they also figure non-causally as essential constituents of it... Mere presence of a candidate object will not be sufficient for the perceiving of it, that is true, but its absence is sufficient for the non-occurrence of such an event. The connection here is [one] of a constitutive or essential condition of a kind of event. (2004: 56–57).
Martin’s point is that the naive realist may well admit the possibility of veridical experiences and causally matching hallucinations, but they will resist the idea that sameness of proximal cause implies sameness of the kind of experience involved. This is because there are non-causal constitutive conditions for the occurrence of the veridical experience which are not satisfied in the hallucinatory case.
However, Martin suggests that the arguer from hallucination can develop their case against naive realism further. This development involves an argument with two stages. First, a modified causal argument: the reverse causal argument, and second the screening-off problem.
The modified causal argument involves a modified causal principle:
- Causal Principle 2: an event e1 is of the same kind K as an event e2 if event e1 is produced by the same kind of proximate causal condition as e2 in circumstances that do not differ in any non-causal conditions necessary for the occurrence of an event of kind K (Nudds 2009: 337).
(Martin’s own modified causal principle is more complicated than this in allowing for indeterministic causation. We gloss over this important complication here). Take N to be the fundamental kind which characterizes a veridical experience of a snow-covered churchyard, according to the naive realist. Does Causal Principle 2 allow us to say that N is present in the causally matching hallucinatory case, as (CKA) predicts? No. For the hallucination is produced in circumstances that differ in non-causal conditions necessary for the occurrence of N given how the naive realist understands N: in the circumstances in which the hallucination occurs there is no appropriate object of perception, but the presence of such an object is necessary for the occurrence of N.
So how does Causal Principle 2 help the arguer from hallucination? We have to run an argument in “the reverse direction, from what must be true of cases of causally matching hallucinations, to what must thereby be true of the veridical perceptions they match” (Martin 2006: 368). That is, take a hallucination as of a snow-covered churchyard h, and suppose that h is of some fundamental kind H. Now we can apply Causal Principle 2 to show that H is present in a causally matching veridical experience of a snow-covered churchyard, v. For now v is produced by the same kind of proximal cause in circumstances where there is no difference in the non-causal conditions necessary for the occurrence of an event of kind H. This is because all that is necessary for an occurrence of H is some brain condition, which is present in the circumstances in which v is brought about. This reverse causal argument does not show that v is not of fundamental kind N. What it does show, however, is that whatever fundamental kind is present in a hallucinatory case will also be present in a causally matching veridical case. So even if v is fundamentally N it is also H. That is, we have the Reverse Common Kind Assumption:
- (RCKA) Whatever fundamental kind of event occurs when you hallucinate, the very same kind of event also occurs in a causally matching veridical experience.
But now we run into the screening-off problem. There is something it is like for you to have an hallucinatory experience as of a snow-covered churchyard, and the experience seems to relate you to a snow-covered churchyard. This fact about the hallucinatory experience is grounded in its being of kind H. But now if an experience of that kind is present in the veridical case, it is difficult to see how what the naive realist says is fundamental to that case, N, is doing anything by way of explaining what it is like for a subject to have the experience. The presence of H in the veridical case seems to make N explanatorily redundant, or “screen off” N’s explanatory role, contra the ambitions of naive realism. (For more detailed expositions of this two-stage argument see Martin (2004), Byrne and Logue, (2008), Hellie (2013) and Soteriou (2014: Chapter 6)).
The most widely discussed naive realist response to this argument is that of Martin (2004, 2006). Though there are now a range of different naive realist responses available, some of which integrate critical discussion of Martin’s own approach (see Allen (2015), Logue (2012b, 2013), Fish (2009: Chapter 4), Hellie (2013), Moran (2019), Sethi (2020)).
Martin argues that the screening-off stage of the argument is only problematic if we accept a positive, non-derivative account of causally matching hallucinations. On such an account, hallucinations have a positive nature which doesn’t derive from that of veridical perception: a nature that can be specified independently of any reference to veridical perception. For instance, hallucinations are direct presentations of sense-data, or representations of ordinary objects. Instead, Martin suggests, the disjunctivist should conceive of causally matching hallucinations in a purely negative epistemic way: such a hallucination as of an F is a state of mind which is not introspectively knowably not a veridical perception of an F. What makes it the case that your hallucinatory experience is as of a snow-covered churchyard, with a certain sort of phenomenal character, is just that it is an occurrence which cannot be discriminated, by introspection alone, from a veridical perception of a snow-covered churchyard. The particular subjective perspective that a hallucinator has in a causally matching hallucination as of a snow-covered churchyard is explained just by the obtaining of this negative epistemic condition, not by anything more positive such as a relation to a white sense-datum or the representation of white snow (c.f., Dancy (1995: 425)). On such a view, causally matching hallucinations are derivative: specifying their nature requires essential reference to the basic case of veridical perception.
If we accept Martin’s account of causally matching hallucinations, then we can see how H can be present in both the hallucinatory and the veridical case: since trivially a veridical experience of a snow-covered churchyard is indiscriminable from a veridical experience of a snow-covered churchyard. But what about screening off? Does H have a nature which means that the presence of H in the veridical case threatens the explanatory power of N? It doesn’t, Martin argues, since H’s explanatory force is derivative or dependent: it is parasitic on that of N. As Martin notes with his own example:
But if that is so [if H screens off the explanatory role of N], then the property of being a veridical perception of a tree [i.e. N] never has an explanatory role, since it is never instantiated without the property of being indiscriminable from such a perception being instantiated as well. But if the property of being a veridical perception lacks any explanatory role, then we can no longer show that being indiscriminable from a veridical perception has the explanatory properties which would screen off the property of being a veridical perception (2004: 69).
Here, then, is a summary of this complex dialectic: the argument from hallucination seems to disprove naive realism, but the naive realist appeals to disjunctivism in response. However, the causal argument puts pressure on disjunctivism, by supporting the common kind assumption. In response, the naive realist rejects the key principle of this argument (Causal Principle 1). But then a two-stage argument consisting of the reverse causal argument and the screening-off problem attempts to show that: (1) the fundamental kind of experience present in hallucination is also present in causally matching veridical experience, and (2) this undermines the naive realist idea that the character of veridical experience is shaped by the directly presented world. In response, Martin accepts a form of naive realism which embraces disjunctivism (in the form of the claim that causally matching veridical and hallucinatory experiences are fundamentally different). But which also accepts (as per the reverse causal argument) that there is a common element across the cases, for the hallucinatory kind is present in veridical cases too. But since he conceives of this common element in a derivative, and purely negative epistemic way, he blocks the argument at the second stage, rejecting screening off.
Naturally, then, much subsequent critical discussion has focused on Martin’s negative epistemic conception of hallucination. Further discussion and development of Martin’s approach is to be found in Nudds (2009, 2013) and Soteriou (2014: Chapter 6). For criticism of Martin’s approach see Hawthorne and Kovakovich (2006), Farkas (2006), Sturgeon (2008), Siegel (2004, 2008), and Robinson (2013). See Burge (2005) for a general and polemical attack on disjunctivism. For more on disjunctivism, see Haddock and Macpherson (eds.) (2008), Byrne and Logue (eds.) (2009), Macpherson and Platchias (eds.) (2013) and the entry on the disjunctive theory of perception.
According to naive realist disjunctivists, at least veridical experiences are directly of ordinary objects (Ordinary Objects), and are direct presentations of their objects (Presentation). Naive realist disjunctivists thus maintain Direct Realist Presentation, and hence Direct Realism for at least veridical experiences – indeed they maintain Direct Realism without the need for any appeal to a causal theory of direct perception. Further, naive realist disjunctivists hold that the phenomenal character of such experiences is determined, at least in part, by the direct presentation of ordinary objects (Direct Realist Character). The only aspect of our ordinary conception of perceptual experience which naive realist disjunctivists reject outright is the Common Kind Claim.
Sense-datum theorists and adverbialists depart substantially from our ordinary conception of perceptual experience. Advocates of each view will argue, in their different ways, that this is a consequence of responding adequately to the Problem of Perception.
Intentionalists and naive realist disjunctivists disagree, and argue,
in different ways, that we can respond to the Problem of Perception
without departing substantially from our ordinary conception of
perceptual experience: by maintaining Direct Realism
in some form, and maintaining or at least being sensitive to many of
the specific phenomenological components of our ordinary conception of
Whilst the debate between sense-datum theorists and adverbialists (and between these and other theories) is not as prominent as it once was, the debate between intentionalists and naive realist disjunctivists is a significant ongoing debate in the philosophy of perception: a legacy of the Problem of Perception that is arguably “the greatest chasm” in the philosophy of perception (Crane (2006)). The question, now, is not so much whether to be a direct realist, but how to be one.
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Any serious attempt to master the literature on the problem of perception should include a reading of Anscombe (1965), Armstrong (1968: Chapter 10), Dretske (1969), Jackson (1977), Martin (2002), Moore (1905), Peacocke (1983: Chapter 1), Robinson (1994), Russell (1912), Smith (2002), Snowdon (1992), Strawson (1979), Tye (1992), and Valberg (1992a). Useful collections: Swartz (1965), Dancy (1988), Noë and Thompson (2002), Gendler and Hawthorne (2006), Haddock and Macpherson (2008), Byrne and Logue (2009), Nanay (2010), and Brogaard (2014). Matilal (1986) explores how issues around the Problem of Perception and theories of experience play out in Classical Indian philosophy.
For discussion of how the problem of perception, somewhat differently construed, arises in the senses other than vision, see Perkins (1983). There is much literature on non-visual perception, not all of it addressing the problem of perception, but much of it will be relevant to considering the problem of perception in non-visual modalities: on sounds, see Nudds (2001), O’Callaghan (2007), Nudds and O’Callaghan (2009); on smell, see Batty (2011), Richardson (2013a, 2013b); on touch, see O’Shaughnessy (1989), Martin (1992) and Fulkerson (2014); for the senses in general, see Nudds (2003), Macpherson (2011, 2011a) and Stokes, Matthen, and Briggs (2015)). On multisensory perception, see O’Callaghan (2019).
How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up topics and thinkers related to this entry at the Internet Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
- The Illusions Index maintained by Fiona Macpherson (University of Glasgow, Centre for the Study of Perceptual Experience), designed by Keith Wilson and Mucky Puddle.
- Akiyoshi’s Illusion Pages: The Latest Works, maintained by Akiyoshi Kitaoka (Ritsumeikan University).
- Edward Adelson’s illusion pages, by Edward Adelson, MIT.
We are very grateful to Tim Bayne, David Chalmers, Katalin Farkas, Mike Martin and Susanna Siegel for their comments on previous versions of this entry. For discussion thanks to Arif Ahmed, Joshua Gert, Anil Gomes, Penelope Mackie, and Lee Walters.