The Problem of Perception
Sense-perception has long been a preoccupation of philosophers. One pervasive and traditional problem, sometimes called “the Problem of Perception”, is created by the phenomena of perceptual illusion and hallucination: if these kinds of error are possible, how can perception be what we ordinarily understand it to be, an openness to and awareness of the world? The present entry is about how these possibilities of error challenge the intelligibility of the phenomenon of perception, and how the major theories of experience in the last century are best understood as responses to this challenge.
- 1. The Ordinary Conception of Perceptual Experience
- 2. The Problem of Perception
- 3. Theories of Experience
- 3.1 The Sense-Datum Theory
- 3.2 The Adverbial Theory
- 3.3 The Intentionalist Theory
- 3.4 The Naive Realist Theory
- 4. Conclusion
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
On our ordinary conception of perceptual experience, perceptual experience is a form of “openness to the world” McDowell (1994: 111). We understand this more precisely as follows:
Openness: Perceptual experience, in its character, involves the presentation (as) of ordinary mind-independent objects to a subject, and such objects are experienced as present or there such that the character of experience is immediately responsive to the character of its objects.
The first component of Openness is,
Mind-Independence: perceptual experience involves the presentation (as) of ordinary mind-independent objects.
On ‘object’: we assume a broad understanding of ‘object’ to encompass perceptible entities in mind-independent reality including material objects, but also features and other entities (e.g., events, quantities of stuff). Mind-Independence is thus a claim otherwise expressed as follows: perceptual experience is a presentation of, or is as of, a public, mind-independent subject-matter. On ‘ordinary’: Mind-Independence concerns familiar perceptible things, things that we admit as part of common sense ontology.
As P.F. Strawson argued, reflection on ordinary perceptual experience supports a characterization of it in terms of Mind-Independence: “mature sensible experience (in general) presents itself as, in Kantian phrase, an immediate consciousness of the existence of things outside us” (1979: 97). Strawson begins his argument by asking how someone would typically respond to a request for a description of their current visual experience. He says that it is natural to give the following kind of answer: “I see the red light of the setting sun filtering through the black and thickly clustered branches of the elms; I see the dappled deer grazing in groups on the vivid green grass…” (1979: 97). There are two ideas implicit in this answer. One is that the description talks about objects and properties which are, on the face of it, things distinct from this particular experience. The other is that the description is “rich”, describing the nature of the experience in terms of concepts like deer and elms and the setting sun. The description of the experience is not merely in terms of simple shapes and colours; but in terms of the things we encounter in the “lived world” in all their complexity. As Heidegger puts it,
We never … originally and really perceive a throng of sensations, e.g., tones and noises, in the appearance of things…; rather, we hear the storm whistling in the chimney, we hear the three-engine aeroplane, we hear the Mercedes in immediate distinction from the Volkswagen. Much closer to us than any sensations are the things themselves. We hear the door slam in the house, and never hear acoustic sensations or mere sounds. (Heidegger (1977: 156); quoted in Smith (2002: 105))
It may be that descriptions of experience like this involve a commitment to the existence of things outside the experience; but surely it is possible to describe experience without this commitment? So let us suppose that we ask our imagined perceiver to repeat their description without committing themselves to the existence of things outside their experience, but without falsifying how their experience seems to them. Strawson claims that the best way for them to respond is to say “I had a visual experience such as it would have been natural to describe by saying that I saw…” and then to add the previous description of the trees and the deer etc. We give a description of our experience in terms of the ordinary objects of our world. And we do this even if we are trying not to commit ourselves to the existence of these objects.
Strawson’s claim that perceptual experience strikes us as if it satisfies what we’re calling Mind-Independence is not a philosophical theory, one that would (for example) refute scepticism, the view that we cannot know anything about the mind-independent world (see the entry on skepticism). Rather, it should be a starting point for philosophical reflection on experience (1979: 94). This is why this intuitive datum of consciousness is not supposed to rule out idealism, the view that the objects and properties we perceive are in fact mind-dependent (see the entry on idealism). The idealist need not disagree with Strawson that reflection on ordinary experience supports Mind-Independence. They will just hold that, for philosophical reasons, this is not how experience really is. Mind-Independence, they can say, is intuitively appealing but ultimately false as a characterization of experience and its objects.
The second component of Openness itself involves two components. First, the phenomenal character of an experience has something to do with its presented objects: experience is, in its character, a presentation of, or as of, ordinary objects; and second the character of perceptual experience involves the presentation of ordinary objects as present or there in that it is immediately responsive to the character of its objects.
Presence: the character of perceptual experience itself involves the presentation (as) of ordinary objects in such a way that it is immediately responsive to the character of its presented objects.
When we reflect upon how the phenomenal character of experience is, and try to “turn inwards” to describe the nature of the experience itself, the best way to do this is to describe the objects of experience and how they seem to us. It seems a simple matter to move to the further claim that the way these objects actually are is part of what determines the phenomenal character of an experience.
But this is to move too fast. For what can be said here about experience can also be said about belief: it is widely accepted that if I want to reflect upon the nature of my beliefs, the best way to do this is to describe the object or content of my belief: that is, what it is in the world that my belief is about. The things my beliefs are about can be as ‘objective’ as the things I perceive. So what is distinctive of the dependence of perceptual experience on its objects?
One answer is that when an object is perceptually experienced, it is experienced as “there”, “given” or “present to the mind” in a way in which it is not in belief, thought and many other mental states and events. Experience seems to involve a particular kind of “presence to the mind”. This “presence” goes beyond the mere fact that the objects of experience must exist in order for the experience to be veridical. For the objects of knowledge must exist too, but states of knowledge do not, as such, have presence in the same way as perceptual experiences—except, of course, in the case when one knows something is there by perceiving it. (Compare here the phenomenon Scott Sturgeon calls “scene immediacy” (2000: Chapter 1)).
So what is this perceptual presence? Compare perceptual experience with pure thought. Pure thought, like experience, goes straight out to the world itself. But a difference between them is that in the case of thought, how the object of thought is at the moment one is thinking of it does not in any way constrain one’s thinking of it; but in the case of perception it does. One’s perception of a snow covered churchyard is immediately responsive to how the churchyard is now, as one is perceiving it. But one’s (non-perceptual) thought need not be: in the middle of winter, one can imagine the churchyard as it is in spring, covered in autumn leaves, and one can think of it in all sorts of ways which are not the ways it presently is. This is not available in perception, because perception can only confront what is presently given: in this sense, it seems that you can only see or hear or touch what is there. It is because of this that perception is sometimes said to have an immediacy or vividness which thought lacks: this vividness derives from the fact that perceived objects and their properties are actually given to the perceiver when being perceived, and determine the nature of the character of the experience.
Openness is the combination of Mind-Independence, and Presence. It is most clearly understood when it applies to those perceptual experiences involved in genuine perception (e.g., when one sees a snow covered churchyard for what it is). But we understand Openness as applying more broadly to even perceptual experiences which don’t involve perceptual contact with the world. This is why we have formulated it in terms of the presentation ‘(as) of’ ordinary objects. For instance, take pure hallucinations of the sort we will consider in §2.2 below. Suppose one has an hallucination of a snow covered churchyard for what it is, even when there is no such churchyard there to be perceived. Here, Mind-Independence characterizes one’s experience. For one’s experience is still as of a public mind-independent scene: the apparent objects of such hallucinatory experiences are ordinary objects. And, in a sense, Presence holds. The hallucination is, in its character as of the snow covered churchyard, and the churchyard seems to be there, present to one, such that the character of the experience is constrained by that apparent scene.
Some recent writers on perception have defended a thesis which has become known as the transparency of experience (see Harman (1990); Speaks (2009); Tye (1992, 1995, 2000); Thau (2002); and for critical discussions of this idea, Martin (2002), Smith (2008), Stoljar (2004) and Soteriou (2013)). Transparency is normally defined as the thesis that reflection on, or introspection of, what it is like to have an experience does not reveal that we are aware of experiences themselves, but only of their mind-independent objects. There are two claims here: (i) introspection reveals the mind-independent objects of experience, and (ii) introspection does not reveal non-presentational features of experience (that is, features of the character of experience not traceable merely to the appearance of some object or feature in the environment).
Transparency is similar to Openness. The latter claim does involve something like (i). But Transparency is not the same as Openness, for it is not obvious that (ii) is part of our intuitive conception of experience. We do not have to hold that the phenomenal character of experience is exhausted (or completely determined) by the nature of the objects and qualities which are presented in experience. This claim can be disputed. For example, a scene can look very different when one removes one’s glasses: one’s visual experience of the churchyard then becomes hazy and blurred. But it can be argued that this phenomenal difference in experience need not derive from any apparent or represented difference in the objects of experience. Rather, it seems to be a difference in the way in which those objects are experienced (although see Tye (2000) for a different understanding of this phenomenon). So there are reasons for thinking that (ii) is not part of the common sense conception of experience. (For further discussion on seeing blurrily see Smith (2008), Allen (2013), and French (2014). For a different challenge to (ii) see Richardson (2010) and Soteriou (2013: Chapter 5)).
Openness can characterize perceptual experience which doesn’t involve genuine perceptual contact with the world. But it is part of our ordinary way of thinking about perceptual experience that we sometimes make perceptual contact with the world. Thus, we come to the second component of our ordinary conception of perceptual experience:
Awareness: perceptual experience sometimes gives us perceptual awareness of ordinary mind-independent objects.
For instance, in seeing a snow covered churchyard for what it is, one has a visual experience, and is visually aware of a snow covered churchyard. (Here we understand perception as a conscious state or event—as something which is or involves perceptual experience—which is a mode of awareness).
The Problem of Perception is that if illusions and hallucinations are possible, then perception, as we ordinarily understand it, is impossible. The Problem is animated by two central arguments: the argument from illusion (§2.1) and the argument from hallucination (§2.2). (A similar problem has also been raised with reference to other perceptual phenomena such as perspectival variation or conflicting appearances, on which see Burnyeat (1979) and the entry on sense-data). For some classic readings on these arguments, see Moore (1905, 1910); Russell (1912); Price (1932); Broad (1965); and Ayer (1940), see Swartz (1965) for a good collection of readings. And for some fairly recent expositions see Snowdon (1992), Robinson (1994: Chapter 2); Smith (2002: Chapters 1 and 7), and Martin (2006).
In this section we present the arguments from illusion and hallucination both as challenging Awareness. That’s bad enough for our intuitive conception of perceptual experience, but it gets worse: for later we’ll see how the arguments can be supplemented so as they support the rejection of Openness too (§3.1).
According to Awareness, we are sometimes perceptually aware of ordinary mind-independent objects in perceptual experience. Such awareness can come from veridical experiences—cases in which one perceives an object for what it is. But it can also come from illusory experiences. For we think of an illusion as “any perceptual situation in which a physical object is actually perceived, but in which that object perceptually appears other than it really is” Smith (2002: 23). For example, a white wall seen in yellow light can look yellow to one. (In such cases it is not necessary that one is deceived into believing that things are other than they are). The argument from illusion, in a radical form, aims to show that we are never perceptually aware of ordinary objects. Many things have been called “the argument from illusion”. But the basic idea goes as follows:
- In an illusory experience, one is not aware of an ordinary object.
- The same account of experience must apply to both veridical and illusory experiences.
- Therefore, one is never perceptually aware of ordinary objects.
Four immediate comments on this are in order: First, as it stands this is an inadequate representation of the argument as it conceals the complex moves usually invoked by proponents and expositors, but we’ll try to improve on this soon (in particular, a fuller version includes a mini argument for (A)). Second, it is useful to represent the argument in this basic form to begin with as it enables us to highlight its two major movements; what Paul Snowdon calls the base case, and the spreading step (Snowdon 1992). In the base case a conclusion about just illusory experiences is sought: namely, (A). In the spreading step, (B), this result is generalized so as to get conclusion (C). Third, as we’re representing the argument here it is purely negative. But many philosophers have moved from this to the further conclusion that since we are always aware of something in perceptual experience, what we are aware of is a “non-ordinary” object (sometimes called a “sense-datum”). In §3.1, we will examine this further development. Finally, this argument is radical in that it concludes that we are never perceptually aware of ordinary objects. A less radical version concludes instead that we are never directly aware of ordinary objects, but for all that we may be indirectly aware of them. We’ll return briefly to this less radical version of the argument in §3.1 below. For now we’ll set aside complications to do with direct and indirect awareness.
Moving beyond the simple formulation, the argument from illusion is typically presented as involving these steps:
- In an illusory experience, it seems to one that something has a quality, F, which the ordinary object supposedly being perceived does not actually have.
- When it seems to one that something has a quality, F, then there is something of which one is aware which does have this quality.
- Since the ordinary object in question is, by hypothesis, not-F, then it follows that in cases of illusory experience, one is not aware of the object after all. (A).
- The same account of experience must apply to both veridical and illusory experiences. (B).
- Therefore, in cases of veridical experience, one is not aware of the object after all.
- If one is perceptually aware of an ordinary object at all, it is in either a veridical or illusory experience.
- Therefore, one is never perceptually aware of ordinary objects. (C).
This improves on the simple version of the argument in having both a fuller base case stage and a fuller spreading step. That is, the basis of premise (A) is made clear, and the spreading from (B) is expanded.
The most controversial premise in the argument is premise (ii). The other premises just reflect intuitive ways of thinking about perceptual experience, and so are unlikely to be targeted by one seeking to reject the argument from illusion. This is clear enough with premises (i) and (vi), but what about premise (iv)? What this means is that the account of the nature and objects of illusory and veridical experiences must be the same. Though it may be disputed, this premise seems plausible. For veridical and illusory experiences both seem to be cases where one is aware of an ordinary object. The only difference is that in the illusory case, but not in the veridical case, the object one is aware of appears some way other than it in fact is.
Premise (ii) is what Howard Robinson has usefully labelled the “Phenomenal Principle”:
If there sensibly appears to a subject to be something which possesses a particular sensible quality then there is something of which the subject is aware which does possess that sensible quality (1994: 32).
C.D. Broad motivates this principle on explanatory grounds. In cases of perceptual experience things appear some ways rather than others to us. We need to explain this. Why does the penny one sees look elliptical to one as opposed to some other shape? One answer is that there is something of which one is aware which is in fact elliptical. Thus as Broad says “If, in fact, nothing elliptical is before my mind, it is very hard to understand why the penny should seem elliptical rather than of any other shape.” (1923: 240). Other philosophers have simply taken the principle to be obvious. H.H. Price, for example, says that “When I say ‘this table appears brown to me’ it is quite plain that I am acquainted with an actual instance of brownness” (Price 1932: 63).
So much for the argument’s main premises. How is it supposed to work? Here we find the suggestion that it hinges on an application of Leibniz’s Law of the Indiscernibility of Identicals (Robinson (1994: 32); Smith (2002: 25)). The point is that (i) and (ii) tell us that in an illusory experience one is aware of an F thing, but the ordinary object supposedly being perceived is not F, thus the F thing one is aware of and the ordinary object are not identical, by Leibniz’s Law. On these grounds, the conclusion of the base case stage is supposed to follow. And then the ultimate conclusion of the argument can be derived from its further premises.
But as French and Walters (forthcoming) argue, this is invalid. (i), (ii) and Leibniz’s Law entail that in an illusory experience one is directly aware of an F thing which is non-identical to the ordinary object supposedly being perceived. But this doesn’t entail that in the illusion one is not directly aware of the ordinary object. One might be aware of the ordinary object as well as the F thing one is aware of. We should be careful to distinguish not being (directly) aware of the wall from being (directly) aware of something which is not the wall. The argument is invalid in conflating these two ideas.
One option for fixing the argument is to introduce what French and Walters call the Exclusion Assumption (cf., Snowdon (1992: 74)):
If in an illusion of an ordinary object as F one is aware of an F thing non-identical to the ordinary object, one is not also aware of the ordinary object.
This assumption bridges the gap between the conclusion actually achieved:
(iii*) in an illusory experience one is aware of an F thing non-identical to the ordinary object
and the desired conclusion (iii). But whether this assumption is defensible remains to be seen. In the remainder we leave this and the issue of validity aside and consider responses from different theories of experience.
A hallucination is an experience which seems exactly like a veridical perception of an ordinary object but where there is no such object there to be perceived. Like illusions, hallucinations in this sense do not necessarily involve deception. And nor need they be like the real hallucinations suffered by the mentally ill, drug-users or alcoholics. They are rather supposed to be merely possible events: experiences which are indistinguishable for the subject from a genuine perception of an object. For example, suppose one is now having a veridical perception of a snow covered churchyard. The assumption that hallucinations are possible means that one could have an experience which is subjectively indistinguishable—that is, indistinguishable by the subject, “from the inside”—from a veridical perception of a snow covered churchyard, but where there is in fact no churchyard there to be perceived. (For more on hallucination, see the essays collected in Macpherson and Platchias (2013)).
A radical form of the argument again challenges Awareness:
- An hallucinatory experience as of an ordinary object as F is not a case of awareness of an ordinary object.
- Veridical experiences of ordinary objects as F and their hallucinatory counterparts are to be given the same account.
- Therefore, one is not perceptually aware of ordinary objects in veridical experience.
What this argument shows, if it is successful, is that one is not perceptually aware of ordinary objects in veridical experiences. The conclusion here is not as general as the conclusion of the argument from illusion, but the more general conclusion is surely not far off: for it would be difficult to maintain that though one is not perceptually aware of ordinary objects in veridical experiences, there are other cases of experience where one is perceptually aware of ordinary objects. So this argument supports if not entails the rejection of our ordinary conception of perceptual experience. Its aim is to show that an aspect of our ordinary conception of perception is deeply problematic, if not incoherent: perceptual experience cannot be what we intuitively think it is. (It is essentially this problem which Valberg (1992) calls “the puzzle of experience”.) But as with the argument from illusion, the argument can be developed, in supplemented form, to defend the conclusion that we only ever perceptually aware of “non-ordinary” objects (see §3.1).
Once again we can view the argument as having a base case (A) and a spreading step (B) (Snowdon 2005). Unlike with the argument from illusion, the base case here is less controversial: it doesn’t rely on the Phenomenal Principle. We thus don’t need a more complicated argument to support it. (A) simply falls out of what hallucinations are supposed to be, and two principles: first, that awareness of an object is a relation to an object, and second, that relations entail the existence of their relata. For given our principles, if an hallucination as of an ordinary object is to be a mode of awareness of an ordinary object then there must be an ordinary object there for one to perceive. But no such objects are there in hallucinations, therefore, hallucinations are not cases of awareness of ordinary objects.
Where the argument from hallucination is controversial is in the spreading step. The spreading step here gets construed in terms of the idea that veridical experiences and hallucinations are essentially the same; mental events of the same fundamental kind (Martin (2006)). (This doesn’t mean that we lose a distinction between veridical experiences and hallucinations. It just means that the difference between veridical experience and hallucination is not to be found in their intrinsic natures). This claim seems plausible, as from a subject’s perspective an hallucination cannot be told apart from a veridical experience. Thus some will accept (B) and thus deny that we are ever perceptually aware of ordinary objects (see sense-datum theories §3.1), and others will accept (B) but argue that we can still have perceptual awareness of ordinary objects (see intentionalist theories §3.3). But as we’ll see, others will want to secure perceptual awareness of ordinary objects by rejecting (B) and holding that hallucinations and veridical experiences are fundamentally different (see naive realist theories and disjunctivism §3.4).
Though it is not plausible to deny the possibility of illusory experiences (though we may argue about how best to construe them; Anthony (2011) and Kalderon (2011)), the claim that subjectively indistinguishable hallucinations are possible is a little more controversial. How do we really know that experiences like this are possible? (Austin (1962), for instance, expresses scepticism). One way to answer this—though certainly not the only way—is to appeal to a broad and uncontroversial empirical fact about experience: that it is the upshot or outcome of a causal process linking the organs of perception with the environment, that our experiences are the effects of things going on inside and outside our bodies. If this is so, then we can understand why hallucinations are a possibility. For any causal chain reaching from a cause C1 to effect E, there are intermediate causes C2, C3 etc., such that E could have been brought about even if C1 had not been there but one of the later causes (see the entry on the metaphysics of causation). If this is true of causal processes in general, and perceptual experience is the product of a causal process, then we can see how it is possible that I could have an experience of the churchyard which was brought about by causes “downstream” of the actual cause (the churchyard). (This plays into the causal argument discussed in §3.4).
In this section we will consider the leading theories of experience of the last hundred years. These theories are understood here as responses to the Problem of Perception. (There are a number of theories of perception which are not discussed in this entry, either because they are not responses to this specific problem (like the causal theory of Grice (1961) and Lewis (1988), and Burge (2010)) or because they require an entire entry of their own (like the phenomenology of Husserl (1900–1) and Merleau-Ponty (1945); see the entry on phenomenology)).
As we understand theories of experience, they operate on two levels. On one level they tell us about the nature or structure of experience, on another level they tell us how what is said at the first level bears on grounding or explaining the phenomenal character of experience. Crudely, and with details and qualifications to explored below:
The Sense-Datum Theory: Level 1: experience is fundamentally a relation to a non-ordinary object; a sense-datum. Level 2: the character of experience is explained by the real presence of sense-data and their qualities in experience (§3.1).
The Adverbial Theory: Level 1: experience is non-relational and fundamentally a state of mind adverbially modified in a certain way (e.g., visually sensing brownly). Level 2: the character of experience is explained by the intrinsic qualities of experience which constitute the ways in which it is modified (§3.2).
The Intentionalist Theory: Level 1: experience is non-relational and fundamentally a matter of representing ordinary objects in certain ways. Level 2: the character of experience is explained by its representational nature (§3.3).
The Naive Realist Theory: Level 1: experience is fundamentally a relation to ordinary aspects of mind-independent reality. Level 2: the character of experience is explained by the real presence of ordinary aspects of mind-independent reality in experience (§3.4).
(In this exposition we do not consider much the possibility of mixed or hybrid views).
Here is what we find: The sense-datum theorist rejects our ordinary conception of perceptual experience. The adverbial theorist tries to improve upon the sense-datum theory, and holds on to Awareness. But it is unclear how they can secure Openness. Intentionalists and naive realists hold to both Openness and Awareness, but they do so in different ways, and with different responses to the Problem of Perception. (The way these positions emerge in response to the Problem of Perception is mapped most clearly in Martin (1995, 1998, 2000)).
On the sense-datum theory, a perceptual experience in which something appears F to one consists in a relation of perceptual awareness to something which is actually F (Level 1). So whenever a subject has a sensory experience, there is something of which they are perceptually aware. This relational conception of experience is sometimes called an “act-object” conception, since it posits a distinction between the mental act of sensing, and the object which is sensed.
A sense-datum theorist calls the object of an experience a sense-datum. We can thus re-formulate the Phenomenal Principle espoused by the sense-datum theorists in these terms:
If there sensibly appears to a subject to be something which possesses a particular sensible quality F then there is something—a sense-datum—of which the subject is directly aware which does possess that sensible quality.
For the sense-datum theorist, the character of an experience is somehow explained (at least in part) by the sensible qualities of the sense-datum one is aware of. (Level 2). Consider an experience which one would describe in terms of seeing a snow covered churchyard for what it is. We can isolate certain aspects of the phenomenal character of such an experience, such as the appearance of whiteness to one. We want a theory of experience to explain such aspects. The sense-datum theorist will claim that things appearing white to you consists in your perceptual awareness of a white sense-datum. The character of your experience is explained by an actual instance of whiteness manifesting itself in experience.
Now ultimately the sense-datum theory opposes our ordinary conception of experience, but it doesn’t as we have it so far. For at the moment we have no opposition between sense-data and ordinary objects. Suppose that one has an experience of a churchyard as described above, and so one is perceptually aware of a white sense-datum. Now suppose one’s experience is veridical. Well, for all we’ve said, the sense-datum one is aware of could be an ordinary bit of mind-independent reality: some white snow. This is not ruled out, for a sense-datum is just whatever it is that one is aware of in a perceptual experience which instantiates the sensible qualities which characterize the phenomenology of one’s experience. All we know about sense-data is that they must satisfy two conditions:
- sense-data are objects of direct awareness; and
- sense-data bear sensible qualities.
But paradigm sense-datum theories are, in contrast, non-minimal. And such non-minimal sense-datum theorists do reject our ordinary conception of perceptual experience. We can make sense of this if we move to a less minimal conception of sense-data themselves, on which they are not ordinary aspects of mind-independent reality. One option here is to articulate a theory of sense-experience and sense-data independently of the problem of perception (Jackson (1977) and Lowe (1992)). But by far the most popular approach for sense-datum theorists has been to move to a more committed conception of sense-data on the basis of arguments like the argument from illusion and the argument from hallucination. How does this work?
Take first the argument from illusion. Suppose one sees a white wall as yellow. The sense-datum theorist accepts the base case of the argument, along with Leibniz’s Law, and so holds that in the illusion one is aware of a yellow sense-datum which is not the wall. And suppose the illusion occurs in a world devoid of ordinary objects which are in fact yellow. Thus the sense-datum is a non-ordinary object. Suppose we accept further that in illusions we are directly aware of such non-ordinary sense-data instead of and not as well as the relevant ordinary objects. So illusions are cases where one is directly aware of just a non-ordinary sense-datum. With this the sense-datum theorist accepts the spreading step and concludes that no perceptual experience is a case of awareness of an ordinary object, and that illusory and veridical experiences are cases of awareness of non-ordinary sense-data.
We can run a similar line of thought with the argument from hallucination. Suppose one has an hallucinatory experience as of a churchyard covered in white snow. But there is no such churchyard there to be perceived. The sense-datum theorist conceives of this experience as a case of perceptual awareness of a white sense-datum. Suppose the hallucination occurs in a world devoid of ordinary white things, so the sense-datum one is aware of is a non-ordinary sense-datum. The sense-datum theorist then endorses the spreading step stage of argument to get the conclusion that even in veridical experiences one is aware of just non-ordinary sense-data.
Initially, the arguments from illusion and hallucination were presented as aiming for a negative claim. But what we’ve seen here is that the minimal sense-datum theorist can supplement the base case with further considerations so as to get not just the negative conclusion but a positive conclusion, which is itself generalised in the spreading step stage. That is, in combination:
- Base Case: (a) illusions and hallucinations are not cases of awareness of ordinary objects; but instead (b) are cases of awareness of non-ordinary sense-data.
- Spreading Step: veridical experiences, illusions and hallucinations are to be given the same account.
- Conclusions: (c) no perceptual experience is a case of awareness of an ordinary object; but instead (d) all perceptual experiences are cases of awareness of non-ordinary sense-data.
The arguments, understood as such, are not arguments for the minimal sense-datum theory—the arguments presuppose such a theory. Rather, they serve as arguments for the transition from the minimal form of the sense-datum theory to the non-minimal form which invokes non-ordinary sense-data.
From now on when we speak of “sense-data” we will mean non-ordinary sense-data. Sense-datum theorists will divide over exactly how to understand sense-data insofar as they are non-ordinary. The early sense-datum theorists (like Moore (1914)) considered sense-data to be mind-independent, but non-physical objects. Later theories treat sense-data as mind-dependent entities (Robinson (1994)), and this is how the theory is normally understood in the second half of the twentieth century. What these different workings out of the theory have in common, though, is that they stand opposed to our ordinary conception of perceptual experience in both its aspects. On the non-minimal sense-datum theory, perceptual experiences are presentations not of ordinary objects, but of sense-data, and the character of experience, though dependent on its objects, is thus dependent upon non-ordinary objects. Thus Openness is false. The sense-datum theorist need not deny that we are presented with objects as if they are ordinary objects. But they will insist that this is an error. (So sense-datum theories are not simply refuted (as Harman 1990 seems to argue) by pointing to the phenomenological fact that the objects of experience seem to be the ordinary things around us). And in perceptual experience we are not aware of ordinary objects but non-ordinary sense-data. Thus Awareness is false.
Must a non-minimal sense-datum theorist deny Awareness? It seems not. Some sense-datum theorists introduce a distinction between direct and indirect awareness. With this, they don’t deny that we are ever perceptually aware of ordinary objects, only that we are ever directly perceptually aware of ordinary objects. The sense-datum theorist can say that we are indirectly aware of ordinary objects: that is, aware of them by (in virtue of) being aware of sense-data. A sense-datum theorist who says this is known as an indirect realist or representative realist, or as someone who holds a representative theory of perception (see Jackson (1977), Lowe (1992); see also the entry on epistemological problems of perception). A theorist who denies that we are aware of mind-independent objects at all, directly or indirectly, but only of sense-data construed as mental entities, is known as a phenomenalist or an idealist about perception (see Foster (2000) for a recent defence, see Crane and Farkas (2004: Section 2) for an introduction to the subject; and the entry on idealism).
On the face of it the indirect realist form of the sense-datum theory salvages something of our ordinary conception of perceptual experience, but securing Awareness. But this shouldn’t be at all satisfying to one who wants to defend our intuitive conception of perceptual experience, for two reasons. First, Openness is still being denied. Second, once we are given the distinction between direct and indirect perception, a defender of our ordinary conception of perceptual experience is likely to uphold Awareness in a more specific form, that is, as the idea that perceptual experience sometimes gives us direct awareness of ordinary objects. That is, the main theories of experience which uphold our ordinary conception of perceptual experience—intentionalism and naive realism—are both usually regarded as versions of direct realism.
The sense-datum theory was widely rejected in the second half of the 20th century, though it still had its occasional champions in this period (e.g., Jackson (1977), O’Shaughnessy (1980, 2000, 2003), Lowe (1992), Robinson (1994), Foster (2000)). A number of objections have been made to the theory. Some of these objections are objections specifically to the indirect realist version of the sense-datum theory: for example, the claim that the theory gives rise to an unacceptable “veil of perception” between the mind and the world. The idea is that the sense-data “interpose” themselves between perceivers and the mind-independent objects which we normally take ourselves to be perceiving, and therefore leaves our perceptual, cognitive and epistemic access to the world deeply problematic if not impossible. In response to this, the indirect realist can say that sense-data are the medium by which we perceive the mind-independent world, and no more create a “veil of perception” than the fact that we use words to talk about things creates a “veil of words” between us and the things we talk about. (For recent discussion see Silins (2011)).
A common objection in contemporary philosophy is to attack the Phenomenal Principle (see Barnes (1944–5); Anscombe (1965)). The objection is that the Phenomenal Principle is fallacious. It is not built into the meaning of “something appears F to one” that “one is aware of an F thing”. Defenders of the sense-datum theory can respond that the Phenomenal Principle is not supposed to be a purely logical inference; it is not supposed to be true simply because of the logical form or semantic structure of “appears” and similar locutions. Rather, it is true because of specific phenomenological facts about perceptual experience. But this just means that theorists who reject the Phenomenal Principle are not disagreeing about whether the Phenomenal Principle involves a fallacy or about some semantic issue, but rather about the nature of experience itself.
Another influential objection to sense-data comes from the prevailing naturalism of contemporary philosophy. Naturalism (or physicalism) says that the world is entirely physical in its nature: everything there is supervenes on the physical, and is governed by physical law. Many sense-datum theorists are committed to the claim that non-ordinary sense-data are mind-dependent: objects whose existence depends on the existence of states of mind. Is this consistent with naturalism? If so, the challenge is to explain how an object can be brought into existence by the existence of an experience, and how this is supposed to be governed by physical law.
Many contemporary sense-datum theorists, however, will not be moved by this challenge, since they are happy to accept the rejection of naturalism as a consequence of their sense-data theory (see Robinson 1994, Foster 2000). On the other hand, one might think that there is no conflict here with naturalism, as long as experiences themselves are part of the natural order. But if sense-data are non-ordinary in being mind-independent but non-physical, then it is much less clear how naturalism can be maintained (cf., what Martin (2004, 2006) calls “experiential naturalism” which serves as a constraint on theories of experience and rules out some but not all forms of the sense-datum theory).
Some philosophers agree with the Phenomenal Principle that whenever a sensory quality appears to be instantiated then it is instantiated, but deny that this entails the existence of sense-data. Rather, they hold that we should think of these qualities as modifications of the experience itself (Level 1). Hence when someone has an experience of something brown, something like brownness is instantiated, but in the experience itself, not an object. This is not to say that the experience is brown, but rather that the experience is modified in a certain way, the way we can call “perceiving brownly”. The canonical descriptions of perceptual experiences, then, employ adverbial modifications of the perceptual verbs: instead of describing an experience as someone’s “visually sensing a brown square”, the theory says that they are “visually sensing brownly and squarely”. This is why this theory is called the “adverbial theory”; but it is important to emphasise that it is more a theory about the phenomenal character of experience itself (Level 2) than it is a semantic analysis of sentences describing experience.
Part of the point of the adverbial theory, as defended by Ducasse (1942) and Chisholm (1957) was to do justice to the phenomenology of experience whilst avoiding the dubious metaphysical commitments the sense-datum theorists take on in responding to the Problem of Perception. The only entities which the adverbialist needs to acknowledge are subjects of experience, experiences themselves, and ways these experiences are modified. This makes the theory appear less controversial than the sense-datum theory.
When used in a broad way, “qualia” picks out whatever qualities a state of mind has which constitute the state of mind’s having the phenomenal character it has. In this broad sense, any conscious state of mind has qualia. (This is the way the term is used in, e.g., Chalmers (1996)) Used in a narrow way, however, qualia are non-intentional, intrinsic properties of experience: properties which have no intentional or representational aspects whatsoever. To use Gilbert Harman’s apt metaphor, qualia in this sense are “mental paint” properties (1990). Harman rejects mental paint, the idea of experience as involving mental paint is taken up and defended by Block (2004)).
It is relatively uncontroversial to say that there are qualia in the broad sense. It can be misleading, however, to use the term in this way, since it can give rise to the illusion that the existence of qualia is a substantial philosophical thesis when in fact it is something which will be accepted by anyone who believes in phenomenal character. (Hence Dennett’s (1991) denial of qualia can seem bewildering if “qualia” is taken in the broad sense). It is controversial to say that there are qualia in the narrow sense, though, and those who have asserted their existence have therefore provided arguments and thought-experiments to defend this assertion (see Block (1997), Peacocke (1983 Chapter 1), Shoemaker (1990)). In what follows, “qualia” will be used exclusively in the narrow sense.
The adverbial theory is committed to the view that experiencing something red, for example, involves one’s experience being modified in a certain way: experiencing redly. The most natural way to understand this is that the experience is an event, and the modification of it is a property of that event. Since this property is both intrinsic (as opposed to relational or representational) and phenomenal (that is, consciously available) then this way of understanding the adverbial theory is committed to the existence of qualia.
An important objection to the adverbial theory has been proposed by Frank Jackson (1975). Consider someone who senses a brown square and a green triangle simultaneously. The adverbial theory will characterise this state of mind as “sensing brownly and squarely and greenly and triangularly”. But how can it distinguish the state of mind it is describing in this way from that of sensing a brown triangle and a green square? The characterisation fits that state of mind equally well. Obviously, what is wanted is a description according to which the brownness “goes with” the squareness, and the greenness “goes with” the triangularity. But how is the theory to do this without introducing objects of experience—the things which are brown and green respectively—or a visual field with a spatial structure? The challenge is whether the adverbial theory can properly account for the spatial structure and complexity in what is given in visual experience. (See Tye (1984) for an attempt to respond to this challenge.)
A related objection concerns the relationship between the adverbial theory and our ordinary conception of experience. The adverbial theorist might admit that, in a sense, we are aware of ordinary objects. When one “senses redly“ if this state of mind is appropriately caused by a red thing (e.g., a tomato), perhaps this is what being aware of such an object amounts to. And it is not as if such awareness is indirect or mediated by sense-data. However, it is not at all clear that the adverbialist is in a position to secure Openness. For the adverbialist rejects not just the idea that experience has a genuine act-object structure, but the idea that the character of experience is even a presentation as of ordinary things and qualities. Qualities get into the picture, and are constitutive of phenomenal character, but not by being presented from outside of experience as qualities of things, as Openness would have it. How, then, can the adverbialist account even for the appearance of an act-object structure within experience, for Openness? It is unclear how the adverbialist is to answer this question (see Martin (1998); Crane (2000)). And so it is unclear how much of an improvement the adverbial approach, and the qualia theory, is over the sense-datum theory.
At Level 1, the intentional theory of experience treats perceptual experience as a form of intentionality conceived of as a form of mental representation (hence it is also sometimes called the representationalist theory of experience). “Intentionality” is a term with its origins in scholastic philosophy (see Crane 1998b), but its current use derives from Brentano (1874), who introduced the term “intentional inexistence” for the “mind’s direction upon its objects”. Intentional inexistence, or intentionality, is sometimes explained as the “aboutness” of mental states (see the entries on Franz Brentano, representational theories of consciousness and intentionality). An intentional mental state is normally understood, therefore, as one which is about, or represents, something in the world.
At Level 2, this is put to work in explaining phenomenal character. Take an experience as of a churchyard covered in white snow. Why is this a case of things appearing white to one? Here the intentionalist appeals to the experience’s representation of whiteness in the environment. It is not generally true that when a representation represents something as being F, there has to actually be something which is F. Thus for the intentionalist, experience is representational in a way that contrasts with it being relational. Experience does not genuinely have an act-object structure. This is in keeping with a standard tradition in the theory of intentionality which treats it as non-relational (the tradition derives from Husserl 1900/1901; for discussion see Zahavi 2003: 13–27). So intentionalism contrasts with the sense-datum theory: since it is not of the essence of experience or its character that it is relational, it is not of its essence that it is a relation to a non-ordinary sense-datum.
The intentionalist can thus reject the argument from illusion in the form presented in §2.1 and the supplemented form presented in §3.1.1. This is because these arguments hinge on the minimal sense-datum theory, or the Phenomenal Principle which the intentional theory is an alternative to. An illusory experience in which a white wall appears yellow to one is thus not conceived of as a case in which one is aware of a yellow sense-datum. It is instead conceived of as a case in which a white wall is represented as being yellow. As we’ll see, the intentionalist can even maintain the intuitive idea that in such illusions one is aware of the ordinary objects one seems to be aware of—but that’s something we’ll come back to shortly.
What about hallucinations? Again the intentionalist can reject the supplemented form of the argument from hallucination from §3.1.1 because this version of the argument relies on the Phenomenal Principle. But what about the original form of the argument from hallucination? This argument does not rely on the Phenomenal Principle, yet its conclusion is that not even veridical experiences give us direct awareness of ordinary mind-independent objects. So how is the intentionalist to deal with this argument? The intentionalist accepts (A) but also (B) in a specific form. That is, they accept (B) where that is understood in terms of what Martin (2004, 2006) has called the Common Kind Assumption, that is:
(CKA) Whatever fundamental kind of mental event occurs when one veridically perceives, the very same kind of event could occur were one hallucinating.
Take a veridical perception of a white snow covered churchyard for what it is. The experience involved in this perception, the intentionalist thinks, is fundamentally a matter of experientially representing the presence of a white snow covered churchyard. And this fundamental kind of mental event is exactly what is present in the subjectively indistinguishable hallucinatory case, for such hallucinatory experiences have the same representational nature as their veridical counterparts.
But then doesn’t this mean that the intentionalist is saddled with the conclusion of the argument from hallucination (C)? If so, the rejection of Awareness and our ordinary conception of perceptual experience is not far off. Since if we are not perceptually aware of ordinary objects in veridical experiences, it is unclear how any form of perceptual awareness of ordinary objects can be secured.
However, the intentionalist can distinguish between two readings of the conclusion. On the first reading, we have
(C*) veridical experiences are not fundamentally cases of awareness of ordinary objects.
This is entailed by the argument as we have construed it. But what is not entailed is
(C**) veridical experiences don’t give us perceptual awareness of ordinary objects.
As long as (C**) doesn’t follow, the intentionalist can suggest, Awareness is secure. The intentionalist admits that not even veridical experiences are fundamentally cases of perceptual awareness of ordinary objects. Such experiences are fundamentally representational in a way that contrasts with them being relational. But that simply doesn’t mean that we can’t come to be perceptually aware, even directly perceptually aware, of an ordinary object by having a veridical experience. Veridical experiences may be the occasions for such awareness even if they are not themselves constituted by instances of such awareness. They can be occasions for such awareness precisely because they represent ordinary objects. In their very character they are about, directed on, the mind-independent world (in contrast to both sense-datum theories, and adverbialist theories). We come to have (direct) perceptual awareness by having such experiences when the world also plays its part: when things in the world are as they are represented to be in the experience, and when the world is hooked up to the experience in an appropriate way. This also helps us to see how even illusions can give us (direct) awareness of ordinary objects. In these cases, experience represents an ordinary object which is there to be perceived, and it is appropriately related to one’s experience, yet there is some misrepresentation of the object.
Thus the intentionalist can respond to Problem of Perception: it has solutions to both arguments which animate the Problem. And the intentionalist response secures both aspects of our ordinary conception of perceptual experience. The intentionalist explains how experience satisfies Openness in terms of it having a certain sort of representational nature. That is, a perceptual experience involves, in its very character, the presentation of ordinary mind-independent objects to a subject precisely because it is a matter of perceptual representation of ordinary aspects of the environment. And such aspects are represented as there, present. The character of experience is immediately responsive to the character of its objects because it is constituted, at least in part, by the way those objects are represented, at the time they are experienced.
Some of the most influential intentional theories are Anscombe (1965), Armstrong (1968), Pitcher (1970), Peacocke (1983), Harman (1990), Tye (1992, 1995), Dretske (1995), Lycan (1996); for more recent accounts, see Byrne (2001), Siegel (2010), Pautz (2010) and the entry on the contents of perception.
Within analytic philosophy, the intentionalist theory of perception is a generalisation of an idea presented by G.E.M. Anscombe (1965), and the “belief theories” of D.M. Armstrong (1968) and George Pitcher (1970). (Within the phenomenological tradition intentionality and perception had always been discussed together: see the entry on phenomenology.) Anscombe had drawn attention to the fact that perceptual verbs satisfy the tests for non-extensionality or intensionality (see the entry on intensional transitive verbs). For example, just as ‘Vladimir is thinking about Pegasus’ is an intensional context, so ‘Vladimir has an experience as of a pink elephant in the room’ is an intensional context. In neither case can we infer that there exists something Vladimir is thinking about, or that there is exists something he is experiencing. This is the typical manifestation of intensionality. Anscombe regarded the error of sense-data and naive realist theories of perception as the failure to recognise this intensionality.
Armstrong and Pitcher argued that perception is a form of belief. (More precisely, they argued that it is the acquisition of a belief, since an acquisition is a conscious event, as perceiving is; rather than a state or condition, as belief is.) Belief is an intentional state in the sense that it represents the world to be a certain way, and the way it represents the world to be is said to be its intentional content. Perception, it was argued, is similarly a representation of the world, and the way it represents the world to be is likewise its intentional content. The fact that someone can have a perceptual experience that a is F without there being any thing which is F was taken as a reason for saying that perception is just a form of belief-acquisition.
The belief theory of perception (and related theories, like the judgement theory of Craig (1976)) is a specific version of the intentional theory. But it is not the most widely accepted version (though see Glüer (2009) for a recent defence). Everyone will agree that perception does give rise to beliefs about the environment. But this does not mean that perception is simply the acquisition of belief. One obvious reason why it isn’t, discussed by Armstrong, is that one can have a perceptual illusion that things are a certain way even when one knows they are not (this phenomenon is sometimes called “the persistence of illusion”). The famous Müller-Lyer illusion presents two lines of equal length as if they were unequal. One can experience this even if one knows (and therefore believes) that the lines are the same length. If perception were simply the acquisition of belief, then this would be a case of explicitly contradictory beliefs: one believes that the lines are the same length and that they are different lengths. But this is surely not the right way to describe this situation. (Armstrong recognised this, and re-described perception as a “potential belief”; this marks a significant retreat from the original claim). The intentionalist theory is, however, not committed to the view that perceptual experience is belief; experience can be a sui generis kind of intentional state or event (see Martin 1992–3).
Intentionalists hold that what is in common between perceptions and indistinguishable hallucinations is their intentional content: roughly speaking, how the world is represented as being by the experiences. Many intentionalists hold that the sameness of phenomenal character in perception and hallucination is exhausted or constituted by this sameness in content (see Tye (2000), Byrne (2001)). But this latter claim is not essential to intentionalism (see the discussion of intentionalism and qualia below). What is essential is that the intentional content of perception explains (whether wholly or partly) its phenomenal character.
The intentional content of perception is sometimes called “perceptual content” (see the entry on the contents of perception). What is perceptual content? A standard approach to intentionality treats all intentional states as propositional attitudes: states which are ascribed by sentences of the form “S ___ that p” where ‘S’ is to be replaced by a term for a subject, ‘p’ with a sentence, and the ‘___’ with a psychological verb. The distinguishing feature of the propositional attitudes is that their content—how they represent the world to be—is something which is assessable as true or false. Hence the canonical form of ascriptions of perceptual experiences is: “S perceives/experiences that p”. Perception, on this kind of intentionalist view, is a propositional attitude (see Byrne (2001) for a recent defence of this idea, see also Siegel (2010)).
But intentionalism is not committed to the view that perception is a propositional attitude. For one thing, it is controversial whether all intentional states are propositional attitudes (see Crane (2001: Chapter 4)). Among the intentional phenomena there are relations like love and hate which do not have propositional content; and there are also non-relational states expressed by the so-called “intensional transitive” verbs like seek, fear, expect (see the entry on intensional transitive verbs). All these states of mind have contents which are not, on the face of it, assessable as true or false. If I am seeking a bottle of inexpensive Burgundy, what I am seeking—the intentional content of my seeking, or the intentional object under a certain mode of presentation—is not something true or false. Some argue that these intentional relations and intentional transitives are analysable or reducible to propositional formulations (see Larson (2003) for an attempt to defend this view of intensional transitives; and Sainsbury (2010) for a less radical defence). But the matter is controversial; and it is especially controversial where perception is concerned. For we have many ways of talking about perception which do not characterise its content in propositional terms: for example, “Vladimir sees a snail on the grass”, or “Vladimir is watching a snail on the grass” can be distinguished from the propositional formulation “Vladimir sees that there is a snail on the grass” (for an interesting recent discussion of watching, see Crowther 2009). There are those who follow Dretske (1969) in claiming that these semantical distinctions express an important distinction between “epistemic” and “non-epistemic” seeing. However, the view that perceptual content is non-propositional is not the same as the view that it is “non-epistemic” in Dretske’s sense. For ascriptions of non-epistemic seeing are intended to be fully extensional in their object positions, but not all non-propositional descriptions of perception need be (for example, some have argued that “Macbeth saw a dagger before him” does not entail “there is a dagger which Macbeth saw”: cf. Anscombe (1965)). The question of whether perception has a propositional content is far from being settled, even for those who think it has intentional content (see McDowell (2008); Crane (2009)).
Another debate about the content of perceptual experience—independent of the issue of whether it is propositional—is whether it is singular or general in nature (see Soteriou (2000); and for a more general discussion, see Chalmers (2006)). A singular content is one that concerns a particular object, and such that it cannot be the content of a state of mind unless that object exists. Singular contents are also called “object-dependent”. A general content is one whose ability to be the content of any intentional state is not dependent on the existence of any particular object. General contents are also called “object-independent”. Those who think (like Snowdon (1992), McDowell (1994), Brewer (2000)) that the content of perceptual experience can be expressed by a sentence containing an irreducible demonstrative pronoun (e.g., of the form “that F is G’) will also argue that the content of experience is singular; those who think (like Davies (1992) and McGinn (1989)) that the content of experience is general (e.g., of the form, “there is an F which is G”) are committed to its object-independence. It might seem that an intentionalist must say that the content of perception is wholly general. However, Burge (1991) has argued that any genuinely perceptual episode has an irreducibly singular element, even though the episode could share a component of content with a numerically distinct episode. Martin (2002) argues that the availability of this position shows that intentionalism could deny that the content of experience is wholly general.
The issue about whether the content of perceptual experience is singular or general is not simply about whether the existence of the experience entails or presupposes the existence of its object. An example will illustrate this. Suppose for the sake of argument that experience essentially involves the exercise of recognitional capacities, and I have a capacity to recognise the Queen. Let’s suppose too that this is a general capacity which presupposes her existence. It is consistent with this to say that I could be in the same intentional state when I am hallucinating the Queen, as when I am perceiving her. Although the capacity might depend for its existence on the Queen’s existence, not every exercise of the capacity need depend on the Queen’s presence. The capacity can “misfire”. Hence intentionalism can hold that experiences are the same in the hallucinatory and veridical cases, even though the existence of the involved recognitional capacity presupposes the existence of the object recognised.
The objects of intentional states are sometimes called “intentional objects” (Crane (2001: Chapter 1)). What are the intentional objects of perceptual experience, according to intentionalists? In the case of veridical perception, the answer is simple: ordinary, mind-independent objects like the churchyard, the snow (etc.) and their properties. But what should be said about the hallucinatory case? Since this case is by definition one in which there is no mind-independent object being perceived, how can we even talk about something being an “object of experience” at all here? As noted above, intentionalists say that experiences are representations; and one can represent what does not exist (see Harman (1990), Tye (1992)). This is certainly true; but isn’t there any more to be said? For how does a representation of a non-existent churchyard differ from a representation of a non-existent garbage dump, say, when one of those is hallucinated? The states seem to have different objects; but neither of these objects exist (see the entry nonexistent-objects).
One proposal is that the objects of hallucinatory experience are the properties which the hallucinated object is presented as having (Johnston (2004)). Another answer is to say that these hallucinatory states of mind have intentional objects which do not exist (Smith (2002: Chapter 9)). Intentional objects in this sense are not supposed to be entities or things of any kind. When we talk about perception and its “objects” in this context, we mean the word in the way it occurs in the phrase “object of thought” or “object of attention” and not as it occurs in the phrase “physical object”. An intentional object is always an object for a subject, and this is not a way of classifying things in reality. An intentionalist need not be committed to intentional objects in this sense; but if they are not, then they owe an account of the content of hallucinatory experiences.
How does the content of perceptual experience differ from the content of other intentional states? According to some intentionalists, one main difference is that perception has “non-conceptual” content. The basic idea is that perception involves a form of mental representation which is in certain ways less sophisticated than the representation involved in (say) belief. For example, having the belief that the churchyard is covered in snow requires that one have the concept of a churchyard. This is what it means to say that belief has conceptual content: to have the belief with the content that a is F requires that one possess the concept a and the concept F. So to say perception has non-conceptual content is to say the following: to have a perception with the content that a is F does not require that one have the concept of a and the concept F. The idea is that one’s perceptual experience can represent the world as being a certain way—the “a is F” way—even if one does not have the concepts that would be involved in believing that a is F. (For a more detailed version of this definition, see Crane (1998a) and Cussins (1990); for a different way of understanding the idea of non-conceptual content, see Heck (2000) and Speaks (2005). The idea of non-conceptual content derives from Evans (1982); there are some similar ideas in Dretske (1981); see Gunther (2002) for a collection of articles on this subject. Other support for non-conceptual content can be found in Bermúdez (1997); Peacocke (1992); Crowther (2006); for opposition see Brewer (2000) and McDowell (1994a)).
Critics of the intentional theory have argued that it does not adequately distinguish perceptual experience from other forms of intentionality, and therefore does not manage to capture what is distinctive about experience itself. (McDowell (1994), Martin (2002), Robinson (1994: 164)).
One objection of this kind is that intentionalists can give no account of the qualitative or sensory character of perceptual experience. Experiencing something, unlike thinking about it, has a certain “feel” to it. Yet, the objection runs, intentionalism has no resources to deal with this fact, since it explains experience in terms of representation, and merely representing something need have no particular “feel” whatsoever. Believing that something is the case, for example, or hoping that something is the case, are both forms of mental representation, but neither state of mind has any “feel” or qualitative character to call its own. (Words or images may come to mind when mentally representing something in this way, but it is not obvious that these are essential to the states of mind themselves.) So the challenge is the following: if there is nothing about representation as such which explains the “feel” of an experience, how is experience supposed to be distinguished from mere thought?
There are a number of ways an intentionalist can respond. One is simply to take it as a basic fact about perceptual intentionality that it has a qualitative or phenomenal character (see Kriegel (2013)). After all, this response continues, even those who believe in qualia have to accept that some states of mind have qualia and some do not, and that at some point the distinction between mental states which are conscious/qualitative, and those which are not, just has to be accepted as a brute fact.
Another response is to say that in order to explain the phenomenal character of perceptual experience, we need to treat perception as involving non-intentional qualia as well as intentionality (see Peacocke (1983: Chapter 1); Shoemaker (1993); Block (1997)). There is, accordingly, a dispute between these intentionalists who accept qualia (like Block and Shoemaker) and those who don’t (like Harman (1990) or Tye (1992)). The first kind of intentionalist holds that in addition to its intentional properties, perceptual experience also involves qualia; the second kind denies this. (See the discussion of “the transparency of experience” in §1.1.3 above; and see Spener (2003)).
Consider the inverted spectrum argument (see the entry on inverted qualia). This argument is based on an ancient speculation: that it is possible that two people’s colour experience could vary massively and systematically and that this difference be undetectable from the third person perspective (see Shoemaker (1996)). For example, consider two people Alice and Bob, whose colour perceptions are inverted relative to one another. Whenever Alice sees something red, Bob sees something blue and vice versa. Yet Alice and Bob each call all the same things “red”, and arguably believe that all the same things are red (fire engines, poppies etc.). It can further be argued that the representational or intentional content of their belief that fire engines are red is derived from the representational content of their experiences of red fire engines, since this belief is a perceptual belief. What then explains their mental difference? Defenders of qualia say that what explains this is the difference in the qualia of their mental states. Alice and Bob are intentionally or representationally identical—they represent the world in the same way—they differ in the non-representational qualia of their experience. (Intentionalists who deny qualia will dispute this by saying that the difference between Alice and Bob is indeed a representational difference: see Tye (2000) and Hilbert and Kalderon (2000). For more on the inverted spectrum, see Block (2007), Egan (2006), Marcus (2006). For other arguments attempting to establish qualia, see Block (1997), (2010), Peacocke (1983)).
Consider the veridical experiences involved in cases of perception; cases where one genuinely sees or otherwise perceives an object for what it is. Like sense-datum theorists, and unlike intentionalists, naive realists hold that such experiences themselves consist of relations of awareness to objects. However, like intentionalists, naive realists reject sense-data and appeal instead to ordinary objects. So the naive realist holds, in contrast to both the sense-datum theory and intentionalism (and, adverbialism), that the veridical experiences involved in genuine cases of perception consist, in their nature, of relations to ordinary objects (Level 1). And this is put to work in explaining the phenomenal character of such experiences (Level 2). Take the churchyard covered in white snow and suppose one sees this for what it is. Why is this a case of things appearing white to one? Here the naive realist appeals to the real presence in the experience of the white snow itself. The character of one’s experience is explained by an actual instance of whiteness manifesting itself in experience.
For the naive realist, the character of the experience one has in seeing the churchyard for what it is is constituted in part by the whiteness of the snow itself and not by the representation of such whiteness where representation is understood as it is by the intentionalist: that is, where an experience’s representation of something as white is something which doesn’t require the presence of an actual instance of whiteness. And many naive realists describe the relation at the heart of their view as a non-representational relation. This means that many naive realists think of experience and its character as non-representational in this sense: (a) intentional content of the sort appealed to by the intentionalists to explain character is not appealed to, and (b) what is fundamental to experience is something which itself cannot explained in terms of representing the world: a primitive relation of awareness to aspects of the world.
But care is needed here, for two reasons. First, neither (a) nor (b) entail that experience is non-representational tout court, that experiences don’t have representational content. For one might think of experience as representational in a way that is not tied to explaining phenomenal character (for instance content might be needed to explain experience’s epistemic role). If one thought of experience as contentful in a way that is not tied to explaining character, that would not be to endorse intentionalism, nor would it be to reject (a) or (b). And second, McDowell (2013) seems to be a naive realist who rejects (b), for he thinks that experience is relational in virtue of being contentful in a certain way—a way which thus contrasts with the way in which experience is contentful on non-relational views such as intentionalism. (For further discussion see the articles in Brogaard (2014)).
The most prominent form of naive realism invokes (a) and (b). Such naive realists assign an important explanatory role to the world itself, without the involvement of content, in explaining the character of veridical experiences. It would be a mistake, however, to think that such naive realists must think of veridical experiences as consisting just in a simple two-place relation between a perceiver and a worldly subject-matter whereby phenomenal character is constituted entirely by the presented subject-matter. This would mean that there could be no variation in the phenomenal character without a variation in the presented subject-matter. But naive realists admit that even holding fixed the presented subject-matter there can be variation in the character of experience. This is worked out in different (but compatible) ways by different theorists. One approach is to keep the simple two-place view, yet note how variations in the perceiver relatum can make for variations in the character of experience (Logue (2012)). Another is to highlight a third-relatum which encapsulates various conditions of perception such as one’s spatiotemporal perspective, perceptual modality, and other conditions of perception variation in which can make for variation in phenomenal character (Campbell (2009), Brewer (2011)). It makes sense to suppose that if a given experience is of a subject-matter from a certain viewpoint (Martin (1998)), or standpoint (Campbell (2009)), then variation in what goes into one having the particular viewpoint or standpoint one has should make for variation in the phenomenal character. And we also need to look at the relation of awareness itself. Many naive realists hold that there can be variation in the way or manner in which one is related to a subject-matter which makes a difference to phenomenal character (Soteriou (2013), Campbell (2014)). Thus naive realists will reject the transparency thesis as it is discussed in §1.1.3, specifically (ii).
Like intentionalists, naive realists want to maintain our ordinary conception of perceptual experience. They hold to both Awareness and Openness. Naive realists think that we are sometimes perceptually aware of ordinary objects: that’s what we have in veridical and illusory experiences (see §3.4.2). Such experiences are cases of such awareness. And perceptual experience satisfies Openness. In veridical and illusory experiences, the character of experience is a presentation of ordinary objects, and is immediately responsive to the character of such objects because such objects are literally involved in the experience, part constitutive of its character.
How, then, does the naive realist respond to the arguments which animate the Problem of Perception?
There are various different approaches available to a naive realist here (see e.g., Fish (2009: Chapter 6), Brewer (2008, 2011: Chapter 5), Kalderon (2011), Genone (2014), Campbell (2014)). But one approach is to target the base case. Naive realists, like intentionalists, can reject the Phenomenal Principle: in illusions it appears to one as if something is F even though one is not aware of anything which is F. When one sees a white wall as yellow, what one is aware of is a white wall, and that is not yellow. So how does naive realism differ from intentionalism about illusions? In two respects: first, naive realists can group illusory experiences with veridical experiences to the extent that they think of them as fundamentally cases of non-representational relations of awareness to ordinary objects. Second, the naive realist can explain the character of such illusory experiences without appeal to intentional content, but instead by appealing to ordinary objects, and their features. On this second difference, one approach is that developed by Brewer:
visually relevant similarities are those that ground and explain the ways that the particular physical objects that we are acquainted with in perception look. That is to say, visually relevant similarities are similarities by the lights of visual processing of various kinds... very crudely, visually relevant similarities are identities in such things as the way in which light is reflected and transmitted from the objects in question, and the way in which the stimuli are handled by the visual system, given its evolutionary history and our shared training during development (2011: 103)... in a case of visual illusion in which a mind-independent physical object, o, looks F, although o is not actually F, o is the direct object of visual perception from a spatiotemporal point of view and in circumstances of perception relative to which o has visually relevant similarities with paradigm exemplars of F although it is not actually an instance of F (2011: 105).
So though o may not itself be F, it can exist in certain conditions, C, such that it has visually relevant similarities to paradigm F things and in that sense it will objectively look F, or look like an F thing—that is, it will itself have a property, a look or an appearance, independently of anyone actually clapping their eyes upon it (see also Martin (2010), Kalderon (2011) and Genone (2014) on objective looks). If o is then seen in C, o itself will look F to one in perception. Brewer spells this all out in much more detail, and with various examples. One example is seeing a white piece of chalk as red. The chalk is seen in abnormal illumination conditions such that the white piece of chalk itself looks like a paradigm red piece of chalk—it has ’visually relevant similarities with a paradigm piece of chalk, of just that size and shape’ (2011: 106). Given that it is seen in those conditions, it looks red to one, even though it is not in fact red. Here, then, we have an account of illusions in which we appeal to objects and the ways those objects are, not the ways the are represented to be, in explaining character.
How does the naive realist deal with the argument from hallucination? The naive realist denies its conclusion (C) and unlike the intentionalist wants to deny (C) read as
(C*) veridical experiences are not fundamentally cases of perceptual awareness of ordinary objects.
They accept (A) and so block the argument by rejecting the spreading step (B) ((he Common Kind Assumption (CKA)). Suppose that, as the naive realist holds, when one sees a snow covered churchyard for what it is, one has an experience which is in its nature a relation between oneself and ordinary objects. Whatever an hallucinatory experience as of a snow covered churchyard is, it is not an event with that nature. For such a hallucination could occur quite apart from any relevant worldly items (e.g., in the lab of a scientist manipulating your brain, in a world with no white things). Instead of taking (B) and these facts about hallucinations as grounds to reject the supposition of naive realism, the naive realist instead gives up (B)/(CKA) and thinks of veridical experiences and hallucinatory experiences as of different fundamental kinds. (For a much more nuanced and detailed formulation of the naive realist thinking here, see Martin (2004), (2006)).
In blocking the argument from hallucination in this way the naive realist takes on a disjunctive theory. The theory was first proposed by Hinton (1973) and was later developed by P.F. Snowdon (1979, 1990), John McDowell (1982, 1987) and M.G.F. Martin (2002, 2004, 2006). Disjunctivism is not best construed as it is by one of its proponents, as the view “that there is nothing literally in common” in perception and hallucination, “no identical quality” (Putnam (1999: 152)). For both the perception of an X and a subjectively indistinguishable hallucination of an X are experiences which are subjectively indistinguishable from a perception of an X. What disjunctivists deny is that what makes it true that these two experiences are describable in this way is the presence of the same fundamental kind of mental state. Disjunctivists reject what J.M. Hinton calls “the doctrine of the ‘experience’ as the common element in a given perception” and an indistinguishable hallucination (Hinton (1973: 71)). The most fundamental common description of both states, then, is a merely disjunctive one: the experience is either a genuine perception of an X or a mere hallucination of an X. Hence the theory’s name.
But what support is there for the disjunctivist’s rejection of (CKA)? Some defenders of disjunctivism have claimed that there is a relatively simple argument against the (CKA). Putnam, for example, has argued that since the common kind is defined by subjective indistinguishability, and since subjective indistinguishability is not transitive, then it cannot define a sufficient condition for the identity of states of mind, since identity is transitive (Putnam (1999: 130)). The argument that subjective indistinguishability is not transitive derives from the so-called “phenomenal sorites” argument: the possibility that there could be a series of (say) colour samples, arranged in a sequence such that adjacent pairs were subjectively indistinguishable but that the first and last members of the series were distinguishable. Hence sample 1 could be subjectively indistinguishable from sample 2, and so on; and sample 99 could be subjectively indistinguishable from sample 100, but sample 1 nonetheless be subjectively distinguishable from sample 100. Those who want to defend (CKA) need, therefore, to respond to this argument; one way is to follow Graff (2001), and argue that the phenomenal sorites argument is in fact fallacious.
Taking a different approach, Martin (2002: 421) argues that each of the main theories of perception is an “error theory” of perception (in J.L. Mackie’s (1977) sense). That is, each theory convicts common sense of an error about perception: for example, the sense-datum theory convicts common sense of making the erroneous assumption that perception is a direct awareness of mind-independent objects. Against this background, Martin argues that abandoning (CKA) is the least revisionary position among all the possible responses to the Problem of Perception, and thus follows Hinton (1973) in holding the disjunctivist position to be the default starting point for discussions of perception. (A further approach is to be found in McDowell (2008) who attempts to support disjunctivism on epistemological grounds.)
Naive realism avoids the argument from hallucination by denying (CKA) and thus taking on disjunctivism. But some object to this and try to support (CKA) with a so-called causal argument (Robinson (1994), Martin (2004, 2006), Nudds (2009, 2013)). Why might one think that the kind of event that occurs in a veridical experience of a churchyard occurs in a subjectively indistinguishable hallucination? One way to justify this is with appeal to the idea that the type of brain state which underpins each experiential occurrence is the same; the resulting experiences should thus be of the very same kind. That is, we can suppose that when S sees the snow covered churchyard for what it is, there is some proximal cause of this experience: the experience is preceded by a certain sort of brain state B. But now we can imagine a situation in which we bring about B thus producing an experience in S, yet where B is not brought about through any interaction between S and a snow covered churchyard—e.g., in laboratory conditions. In this scenario S has an hallucinatory experience as of a snow covered churchyard. It is plausible to suppose that these experiences are of the very same kind given that they have the same proximal cause. Thus, (CKA). The point here is that (CKA) looks like a plausible principle for causally matching veridical and hallucinatory experiences.
This way of motivating (CKA) appeals to a same-cause, same effect principle. That is,
Causal Principle 1: an event e1 is of the same kind as an event e2 if event e1 is produced by the same kind of proximate causal condition as e2 (Nudds 2009: 336).
But the naive realist should reject this principle. As Martin says
On [the naive realist] conception of experience, when one is veridically perceiving the objects of perception are constituents of the experiential episode. The given event could not have occurred without these entities existing and being constituents of it; in turn, one could not have had such a kind of event without there being relevant candidate objects of perception to be apprehended. So, even if those objects are implicated in the causes of the experience, they also figure non-causally as essential constituents of it... Mere presence of a candidate object will not be sufficient for the perceiving of it, that is true, but its absence is sufficient for the non-occurrence of such an event. The connection here is [one] of a constitutive or essential condition of a kind of event. (2004: 56–57).
The naive realist may well admit the possibility of veridical experiences and causally matching hallucinations, but they will resist the idea that sameness of cause implies sameness of the kind of experience involved. This is because there are non-causal conditions constitutive conditions for the occurrence of the veridical experience which are not satisfied in the hallucinatory case.
However, as Martin goes on to argue, this defence of (CKA) doesn’t mean that the naive realist is in the clear. For the arguer from hallucination can adopt a different strategy by adopting a modified causal principle:
Causal Principle 2: an event e1 is of the same kind K as an event e2 if event e1 is produced by the same kind of proximate causal condition as e2 in circumstances that do not differ in any non-causal conditions necessary for the occurrence of an event of kind K (Nudds 2009: 337).
(Martin’s own modified causal principle is more complicated than this in allowing for indeterministic causation. We gloss over this important complication here). Now the arguer from hallucination is taking a different approach by appealing to Causal Principle 2 because this will not allow the arguer to support (CKA). Take N to be the fundamental kind which characterizes a veridical experience of a snow covered churchyard. Does Causal Principle 2 allow us to say that N is present in the causally matching hallucinatory case, as (CKA) predicts? No. For the hallucination is produced in circumstances that differ in non-causal conditions necessary for the occurrence of N given how the naive realist understands N: in the circumstances in which the hallucination comes about there is no appropriate object of perception and that is necessary for the occurrence of N.
So how does Causal Principle 2 help the arguer from hallucination? We have to run an argument from hallucination in “the reverse direction, from what must be true of cases of causally matching hallucinations, to what must thereby be true of the veridical perceptions they match” (Martin 2006: 368). That is, take a hallucination as of a snow covered churchyard h, and suppose that h is of some fundamental kind H. Now we can apply Causal Principle 2 to show that H is present in a causally matching veridical experience of a snow covered churchyard, v For now v is produced by the same kind of proximal cause in circumstances where there is no difference in the non-causal conditions necessary for the occurrence of an event of kind H. This is because all that is necessary for an occurrence of H is some brain condition, which is present in the circumstances in which v is brought about. This reverse causal argument does not show that v is not of fundamental kind N. What it does show, however, is that whatever fundamental kind is present in a causally matching hallucinatory case will also be present in a veridical case. So even if v is fundamentally N it is also H. That is, we have the Reverse Common Kind Assumption:
(RCKA) Whatever fundamental kind of event occurs when one hallucinates, the very same kind of event also occurs in a causally matching veridical experience.
But now we run into the screening off problem for naive realism (Martin 2004). There is something it is like for S to have an hallucinatory experience as of a snow covered churchyard, and the experience seems to relate the subject to a snow covered churchyard. This fact about the hallucinatory experience is grounded in its being of kind H. But now if an experience of that kind is present in the veridical case, it is difficult to see how what the naive realist says is fundamental to that case, N, is doing anything by way of explaining what it is like for a subject to have the experience (Level 2). Consequently the presence of H in the veridical case seems to make N explanatorily redundant. That the veridical experience is H seems to screen off its being N as what explains its phenomenal character.
This is not the end of the road for naive realism, and the way to respond to this problem divides naive realists. The most prominent view is the view of Martin (2004, 2006, 2013). On this view the disjunctivist should conceive of H in a purely negative epistemic way. That is, what makes it the case that one’s hallucinatory experience is as of a snow covered churchyard, with a certain sort of phenomenal character, is just that it is an occurrence which is indiscriminable from—cannot be told apart, introspectively, from—a veridical perception of a snow covered churchyard. The particular subjective perspective that a hallucinator has in a causally matching hallucination as of a snow covered churchyard is explained just by the obtaining of this negative epistemic condition. (Thus, arguably, Dancy’s (1995: 425) demand of the disjunctivist for a positive characterization of hallucination is misplaced, but see Hellie (2013)).
If this is all there is to the nature of H we can see how it can be present in both the hallucinatory and the veridical case: since trivially a veridical experience of a snow covered churchyard is indiscriminable from a veridical experience of a snow covered churchyard. But, crucially, the naive realist can deal with the screening off problem. Does H have a nature which means that the presence of H in the veridical case threatens the explanatory power of N? Plausibly not, for it seems that H’s explanatory force is parasitic on that of N. As Martin notes with his own example:
But if that is so, then the property of being a veridical perception of a tree never has an explanatory role, since it is never instantiated without the property of being indiscriminable from such a perception being instantiated as well. But if the property of being a veridical perception lacks any explanatory role, then we can no longer show that being indiscriminable from a veridical perception has the explanatory properties which would screen off the property of being a veridical perception (2004: 69).
This, in broad outline, is Martin’s approach and one of the key ways in which disjunctivism is developed out of naive realism. With it, we can see how the idea that subjectively indistinguishable hallucinations satisfy Openness. They are, in their very character, as of ordinary objects which appear to one as there or present. It’s just that what grounds or explains this character is a negative epistemic fact.
Further discussion and development of Martin’s approach is to be found in Nudds (2009, 2013). For naive realists who have different reactions to the screening off problem and thus develop disjunctivism in a different way see Fish (2009), Logue (2012a), and Hellie (2013). For criticism of Martin’s approach see Hawthorne and Kovakovich (2006), Farkas (2006), Sturgeon (2008), Siegel (2004, 2008), and Robinson (2013). See Burge (2005) for a general and polemical attack on disjunctivism. For more on disjunctivism, see Haddock and Macpherson (eds.) (2008), Byrne and Logue (eds.) (2009), Macpherson and Platchias (eds.) (2013) and the entry on the disjunctive theory of perception.
The Problem of Perception has given rise to a significant ongoing debate in the philosophy of perception: the debate between intentionalists on the one hand, and naive realists and disjunctivists on the other. This is the greatest chasm in the philosophy of perception (Crane 2006). How is it that perceptual experience is an Openness to the mind-independent world? Is it that some such experiences are themselves in their nature non-representational relations to ordinary objects? Or is it that they are in their nature non-relational representations of ordinary objects?
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Any serious attempt to master the literature on the problem of perception should include a reading of Anscombe (1965), Armstrong (1968: Chapter 10), Dretske (1969), Jackson (1977), Martin (2002), Moore (1905), Peacocke (1983: Chapter 1), Robinson (1994), Russell (1912), Smith (2002), Snowdon (1992), Strawson (1979), Tye (1992), and Valberg (1992a). Useful collections: Swartz (1965), Dancy (1988), Noë and Thompson (2002), Gendler and Hawthorne (2006), Haddock and Macpherson (2008), Byrne and Logue (2009), Nanay (2010), and Brogaard (2014).
For discussion of how the problem of perception, somewhat differently construed, arises in the senses other than vision, see Perkins (1983). There is much literature on non-visual perception, not all of it addressing the problem of perception, but much of it will be relevant to considering the problem of perception in non-visual modalities: on sounds, see Nudds (2001), O’Callaghan (2007), Nudds and O’Callaghan (2009); on smell, see Batty (2011), Richardson (2013a, 2013b); on touch, see O’Shaughnessy (1989), Martin (1992) and Fulkerson (2014); for the senses in general, see Nudds (2003), Macpherson (2011, 2011a) and Stokes, Matthen, and Briggs (2015)).
How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up topics and thinkers related to this entry at the Internet Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
- A Library of Visual and Auditory Illusions, maintained by Fiona Macpherson (University of Glasgow, Centre for the Study of Perceptual Experience).
- Akiyoshi’s Illusion Pages: The Latest Works, maintained by Akiyoshi Kitaoka (Ritsumeikan University).
- Edward Adelson’s illusion pages, by Edward Adelson, MIT.
We are very grateful to Tim Bayne, David Chalmers, Katalin Farkas, Mike Martin and Susanna Siegel for their comments on previous versions of this entry. For discussion thanks to Arif Ahmed, Anil Gomes, and Lee Walters.