Epistemological Problems of Perception

First published Mon Dec 5, 2016

[Editor's Note: The following new entry by X replaces the former entry on this topic by the previous author.]

The central problem in the epistemology of perception is that of explaining how perception could give us knowledge or justified belief about an external world, about things outside of ourselves. This problem has traditionally been viewed in terms of a skeptical argument that purports to show that such knowledge and justification are impossible. Skepticism about the external world highlights a number of epistemological difficulties regarding the nature and epistemic role of experience, and the question of how perception might bring us into contact with a mind-independent reality. The issues that arise are of central importance for understanding knowledge and justification more generally, even aside from their connection to skepticism.

Two main types of response to the skeptical argument have traditionally been given: a metaphysical response that focuses on the nature of the world, perceptual experience, and/or the relation between them, in an effort to show that perceptual knowledge is indeed possible; and a more directly epistemological response that focuses on principles specifying what is required for knowledge and/or justification, in an effort to show that skepticism misstates the requirements for knowledge.

Much of the philosophical tradition has viewed the central epistemological problems concerning perception largely and sometimes exclusively in terms of the metaphysical responses to skepticism. For that reason, these will be addressed before moving on to the more explicitly epistemological concerns.

1. The Problem of the External World

The question of how our perceptual beliefs are justified or known can be approached by first considering the question of whether they are justified or known. A prominent skeptical argument is designed to show that our perceptual beliefs are not justified. Versions of this argument (or cluster of arguments) appear in René Descartes’s Meditations, Augustine’s Against the Academicians, and several of the ancient and modern skeptics (e.g., Sextus Empiricus, Michel de Montaigne). The argument introduces some type of skeptical scenario, in which things perceptually appear to us just as things normally do, but in which the beliefs that we would naturally form are radically false. To take some standard examples: differences in the sense organs and/or situation of the perceiver might make her experience as cold things that we would experience as hot, or experience as bitter things that we would experience as sweet; a person might mistake a vivid dream for waking life; or a brain in a vat might have its sensory cortices stimulated in such a way that it has the very same perceptual experiences that I am currently having, etc.

It is usually not specified how one gets from here to the conclusion that our perceptual beliefs are unjustified. I offer one possible reconstruction of the skeptical argument, one which helps to illustrate the central problems in the epistemology of perception.

The skeptical scenarios (dreaming, brains in vats, differently situated sense organs, etc.) call our attention to a crucial distinction between appearance and reality: how things perceptually appear is not necessarily how things really are; things could appear the same though really be different, and they could appear to be some other, incompatible way and really be the same. Further reflection on the scenarios suggests that although I might know very little—perhaps nothing—about how things are in the external world, I can nevertheless know quite a lot about how it appears to me that things are. This engenders a shift from thinking about perceptual appearances as features of objects (e.g., “the appearance of the house was quite shabby”), to thinking of them as mental states—experiences—of the perceiving subject (e.g., “she had a visual appearance/experience as of a house”). Finally, it seems that if we are to know anything about the external world at all, that knowledge must be indirect, for what is directly before me is not the world itself, but only these perceptual appearances. I know and have justified beliefs about the external world only insofar as I know and have justified beliefs about appearances.

All this suggests a “veil of perception” between us and external objects: we do not have direct unvarnished access to the world, but instead have an access that is mediated by sensory appearances, the character of which might well depend on all kinds of factors (e.g., condition of sense organs, direct brain stimulation, etc.) besides those features of the external world that our perceptual judgments aim to capture. Paraphrasing David Hume (1739: I.2.vi, I.4.ii; 1748: sec 12.1; see also Locke 1690, Berkeley 1710, Russell 1912): nothing is ever directly present to the mind in perception except perceptual appearances.

But if our only access to the external world is mediated by potentially misleading perceptual appearances, we ought to have some assurance that the appearances we are relying on are not of the misleading variety. And here is where all the trouble arises, for it seems that there is no way we could have any evidence for the reliability of perception (i.e., perceptual appearances) without relying on other perceptions. We have empirical reason, for example, to think that science is not yet capable of stimulating brains in a very precise way, but appealing to this to rebut the possibility of brain-in-a-vat scenarios seems blatantly question begging. At the heart of the problem of the external world is a skeptical argument I will refer to as “PEW” and which I reconstruct in what follows. I have named the premises, as we will want to discuss them individually.

  1. Nothing is ever directly present to the mind in perception except perceptual appearances. (Indirectness Principle) Thus:
  2. Without a good reason for thinking perceptual appearances are veridical, we are not justified in our perceptual beliefs. (Metaevidential Principle)
  3. We have no good reason for thinking perceptual appearances are veridical. (Reasons Claim)
  4. Therefore, we are not justified in our perceptual beliefs.

A few comments on the logic of the argument are in order. (2) and (3) make up the meat of the argument; together they entail (4). This means that (1), which is motivated by the skeptical scenarios mentioned above and the associated veil of perception view, would be unnecessary for deriving the skeptical conclusion, as are those skeptical scenarios, were it not for the fact that (1) is commonly taken to render perception inferential in such a way as to lend support to (2). If (1) is true, then, plausibly, (2) is: if our access is mediated by potentially nonveridical appearances, then we should only trust the appearances we have reason to think veridical. And no other reason to endorse (2) is immediately apparent (although an additional motivation for (2) will be discussed below, in section 3.1). (1) is therefore an important component of the traditional problem. The plausibility of (3) derives from the idea that our only means of verifying the veridicality of appearances would itself depend on perception, in the question-begging manner sketched above.

Notice that PEW addresses justification rather than knowledge. On the reasonable assumption that knowledge requires justification, (4) implies that our perceptual beliefs do not count as knowledge. One who denies this assumption could easily rewrite PEW in terms of knowledge rather than justification with little or no reduction in plausibility. I have reconstructed PEW in a way that is supposed to be intuitively compelling. Were we to get specific about the implicit quantification involved (we have no good reason for thinking that any perceptual appearances are veridical? that perceptual appearances are in general veridical? that this perceptual appearance is veridical?), the argument would get a lot more complicated. The simpler version presented above is sufficient for our current purposes.

The problem of the external world should be distinguished from what is typically called the problem of perception (see the entry on the problem of perception), even though they are motivated by similar considerations, in particular, by the Indirectness Principle. The problem of perception is the problem of how perception is possible—how it is possible, for example, to see mind-independent objects, rather than inferring them from awareness of sense-experiences, in light of the claim that only appearances are ever directly present to the mind. The problem of the external world is a distinctively epistemological problem, and it focuses on the normative status of perceptual judgments about external objects; it matters little for these purposes whether and how such judgments might amount to seeing. What matters is whether such judgments are or could be justified.

PEW illustrates the central problem of the epistemology of perception: if many or any of our perceptual beliefs are justified, PEW must have gone wrong somewhere. But where? Several subsidiary problems in the epistemology of perception arise in the efforts to solve this central problem.

2. Metaphysical Solutions to the Central Problem

The Indirectness Principle is a metaphysical principle: it says something about the nature of perception. The Metaevidential Principle and the Reasons Claim are epistemic principles: one lays down specifically normative requirements for justified belief and the other denies that these requirements are satisfied. Because PEW can be challenged by denying any of the premises, there are two main classes of solution to the central problem: metaphysical solutions, which challenge the Indirectness Principle; and epistemological solutions, which challenge the Metaevidential Principle and/or the Reasons Claim. This section addresses the first class of solutions to the central problem. Section 3 addresses the second class.

PEW starts with the Indirectness Principle, and it has often been thought that the central skeptical worry is due to a metaphysics of perception that holds that, although worldly objects do exist outside of the mind, they are never directly present to the mind, but only indirectly so, through mental intermediaries. Thomas Reid, for example, held that “Des Cartes’ system … hath some original defect; that this skepticism is inlaid in it, and reared along with it” (1785: 1.vii). Consequently, a great deal of philosophy since Descartes has involved various attempts to block PEW by doing away with the intermediaries between the mind and the objects of perception, by offering a metaphysics of perception that puts these objects directly before the mind. If perception is direct in the relevant sense, then the skeptical problem never even gets off the ground.

There are two main branches to this tradition. The more obvious and commonsensical one originates with Reid (1764, 1785) who denies that only mental items can be directly present to the mind, arguing that physical objects and their properties can be directly present as well. This is the direct realist option. A somewhat older tradition, however, tracing back to George Berkeley (1710, 1713), agrees with Descartes that only mental items are directly present to the mind but insists that the objects of perception—tables, rocks, cats, etc.—are really mental items after all. This is the idealist/phenomenalist option. Despite the manifest differences between realist and idealist metaphysics, both branches of the “direct presence” tradition are united in rejecting the Indirectness Principle, insisting that tables and such are indeed directly present to the mind in perception. If perception is thus direct, the Indirectness Principle is false, and support for the Metaevidential Principle is undercut, and PEW ceases to pose a threat to knowledge.

2.1 Varieties of Direct Presence

Whether in the realist or idealist tradition, the direct presence theorist rejects the Indirectness Principle, insisting that when one perceives a cat, for example, the cat is directly in view, directly present to, simply there before the mind. But what is meant by these spatial metaphors? The metaphors can be unpacked in several importantly different ways, having different implications for the rest of PEW. In the next five subsections, I will briefly distinguish some different ways in which perception might be (or fail to be) direct. The spatial/metaphorical terminology has been so vastly prevalent in the literature that it is very often hard to tell which author intends which conception(s) of directness. Consequently, I won’t be naming names much in the next few paragraphs or pinning particular conceptions of directness on particular authors. Instead, these paragraphs aim to map out the more salient possibilities. Later, in sections 2.2 and 2.3, I will use these distinctions to examine how the traditional metaphysical theories of perception bear on the epistemology of perception.

Before we try to understand “direct presence”, notice that what is metaphorical here is the notion of presence, not of directness. To be directly present is to be present, but not in virtue of the presence of another thing (that would be indirect presence). Directness is merely unmediatedness, but what kind of mediation is at issue will depend on what kind of presence is intended.

2.1.1 Phenomenal Directness

One dimension of directness, emphasized by Reid (1785), notes that perceptual judgments are phenomenally noninferential, in the sense that they do not result from any discursive or ratiocinative process; they are not introspectibly based on premises. This noninferentiality is usually understood loosely enough to allow for perceptual beliefs’ being based on things other than beliefs (in particular, on experiential states, as we will see below) and also to allow for the possibility of unconscious or subpersonal inferential involvement in the formation of perceptual beliefs, so long as the agent is not deliberately basing these perceptual beliefs on other beliefs. Without these two allowances, claims of noninferentiality would quickly run afoul of standard views in epistemology and psychology, respectively. To claim that perception is phenomenally direct is to claim that it is noninferential in this sense.

2.1.2 Referential Directness

Another way that perception might be direct is if perception represents external objects, as such, without that representation being mediated by representation of other things. Contrast this with the classical empiricists’ opposing view, that the only way to represent external objects is as the cause of our sensations (Locke 1690, Berkeley 1710). One might worry, however, that unless perception puts objects directly before us, we are in danger of not genuinely being able to think about the objective, external world at all, but only about ourselves. To say that perception is referentially direct is to say that the ability of perceptual states to represent does not depend on the ability of other states to represent.

2.1.3 Perceptual Directness

One version of indirectness claims that we perceive outer things by perceiving (or standing in a quasi-perceptual relation to) inner things—usually sense-data (see below and the entry on sense-data). This makes it sound as if what we thought was ordinary direct perceiving of tables and rocks and such is really more like “perceiving” that someone has broken into your house—indirectly, on the basis of actually perceiving the broken window, empty area where the TV used to be, etc. It is easy to see how such perceptual indirectness may invite the semantic and epistemological worries we have been seeing. To claim that perception of external objects is perceptually direct is to claim that it is not mediated by the perception (or quasi-perceptual apprehension or awareness) of something else.

2.1.4 Direct World-Involvement

One could endorse phenomenal directness and perceptual directness while still holding that perceptual contact is mediated by experience, where experience is conceived as something in virtue of which we have perceptual contact, though it is not the perceptual contact itself. An alternative is a relational metaphysics of perception according to which elements of the perceived world are literally parts of the perceptual experience. On idealist versions of this view, the mental states whose immediate apprehension constitutes perceptual experience just are the objects of perception (or parts of these objects). On (direct) realist versions of the view, perceptual experiences are not internal mental states of the agent but are relations between the agent and some external objects or states of affairs. Thus the agent is in a different type of mental state in the case of veridical perception (the “good case”) than in the case of hallucination (the “bad case”). Veridical perception is a certain kind of relation to a distal array, while hallucination or dreaming is an introspectively indistinguishable but metaphysically distinct relation to something else entirely.

2.1.5 Epistemological Directness

Finally, one might hold that perception is direct in the sense that one’s perceptual beliefs about external objects, like rocks and cats and such, enjoy a kind of justification or knowledge that does not depend on—is not mediated by—any other justification or knowledge. Such beliefs are said to be or “epistemically noninferential”, or “epistemologically basic” and the normative status is sometimes referred to as “immediate justification/knowledge” or “basic justification/knowledge”. This possibility will be explored in more detail below, in section 3.4. Epistemological directness will be treated separately from the previous senses of direct presence, which can all be viewed as metaphysical senses of direct presence. The relation between metaphysical and epistemological directness will be addressed below, in section 2.4.

With these distinctions in hand, we can better situate the traditional theories of perception that are often thought to bear on the skeptical problem.

2.2 Idealism and Phenomenalism

Idealism and phenomenalism are views that hold that ordinary objects (tables, clouds, rocks, etc.) are really collections of or constructs out of actual and/or possible mental states, especially perceptual experiences. (I won’t try to distinguish phenomenalism from idealism but will use “idealism” to include both.) There are several varieties of idealism and several motivations for holding the view. But one motivation is that it promises to solve the skeptical problem of the external world. Berkeley (1710) held that idealism was a cure for skepticism. Transcendental idealism (Kant 1781) aims to split the difference with the skeptic by distinguishing the phenomenal objects of perception—which are collections of appearances and about which we can know something—from the noumenal objects—which are things in themselves and not mere appearances, and about which skepticism is true.

One way in which idealism might help to solve the skeptical problem is by attacking the Indirectness Principle. If the problem of the external world starts with the gap between the proximal and the distal objects of perceptual experience, then idealism would avoid skepticism by simply closing that gap. The idealist can embrace direct world-involvement while retaining the claim that nothing is ever directly present to the mind but its own mental states, by holding that the world is fundamentally mental, that, e.g., tables are just collections of ideas. Although metaphysical solutions are usually aimed at the Indirectness Principle, idealism also offers a response to PEW by way of undermining the Reasons Claim. Hume (1739) argued that we couldn’t have any good reason to think that external objects are plausible causes of our experiences without first observing a constant conjunction between external objects and experiences; but we can’t “observe” external objects unless we justifiedly believe in their existence, and we can only do that if we can reasonably posit them as plausible causes of our experiences. On the other hand, if the objects of perception are not external after all, we are in a better position to infer causal relations between them and individual experiences.

The main difference between idealism and an indirect realism concerns not so much the metaphysics of perception as a larger metaphysical view about what else exists outside of the mind. Berkeley and Descartes agree about the direct objects of perception, but Descartes posits an additional stratum of mind-independent external objects in addition. The idealist denies that there is a veil of perception not because Descartes was wrong about the nature of perception, but because he was wrong about the natures of cats and rocks.

Idealism has a few contemporary defenders (e.g., Foster 2008, Hoffman 2009), though it is nowhere near the dominant view that it had been for almost two centuries after Berkeley. Most responses to PEW in the last century have endorsed some kind of realism instead, insisting that ordinary objects are indeed mind-independent.

2.3 Realisms, Direct and Indirect

The problem of the external world, especially the Indirectness Principle, sees its modern renaissance in Descartes’s representative realism, which was offered as an alternative to both the commonsense view of naive (aka direct) realism, and the hylomorphic theory standard among Scholastics. This latter doctrine holds that objects are combinations of primordial matter and forms impressed upon them, which determine the objects’ properties; these objects then cast off forms that can enter the mind through the sense organs. A red thing is simply something that has the form of RED, which it can transmit, making the receptive, perceiving mind also—though presumably in a different sense—red.

Both theories suffer from an apparent inability to handle error. Science frequently teaches us that things are not in reality the way they appear to the senses. The sun, for example, perceptually appears as a small disk rather than the large sphere that it is (Descartes 1641). This perceptual experience cannot involve either the transmission of forms (since the sun doesn’t have those forms), or the “direct pick-up” of objective properties (again, those properties aren’t there to pick up). Nor could we simply be picking up relational properties, like looking small from here, Descartes argues, because I could have the very same perceptual experience in a vivid dream (where even the relational properties are not instantiated) as I do in waking life. Therefore, perceptual appearances must be entirely mental and internal, rather than relational. Insofar as external objects are at all present to the mind, it is only because of these appearances, which thus serve as inner stand-ins, or proxies, for them. As John Locke puts it,

the understanding is not much unlike a closet wholly shut from light, with only some little openings left, to let in external visible resemblances, or ideas of things without. (1690: 163)

It is this notion of standing in that the term “representative realism” is supposed to capture. The representative realist may, but need not, hold that these proxies are also representations in the sense of having semantic contents, i.e., truth- or accuracy-conditions. In fact, the most recognizable form of representative realism denies that experiences are in this sense representational.

2.3.1 Sense-data

This best known, though now widely rejected, form of representative realism incorporates a sense-datum theory (see the entry on sense-data), which holds that every perceptual experience as of something’s being F involves the subject’s awareness of something that really is F. My having a perceptual (veridical or hallucinatory) experience as of something’s being blue requires there to be a nonphysical, inner, mental object—a sense-datum—that is blue. Sense-data are not normally taken to be true or false, any more than rocks or tables are; nonetheless, sense-data constitute the inner rocks and tables in virtue of which we perceive external rocks and tables and are in that sense the latter’s representatives. Two important features of this theory are worth highlighting: (i) that sense-data really do have the properties that external objects appear to have, and (ii) that the relation one stands in to one’s sense-data is a perceptual, or quasi-perceptual, relation: one is perceptually aware of objects due to a more fundamental awareness of one’s sense-data.

Any version of representative realism denies direct world-involvement. The sense-datum theory is further incompatible with perceptual directness, as it has us perceive objects by way of perceiving our sense-data; and it is typically fleshed out in such a way as to be incompatible with referential directness as well, holding that we can think about mind-independent objects only as the external causes of these sense-data. It is compatible, however, with phenomenal and epistemological directness. For example, one could deny that the “inference” from sense-data to external objects is conscious and deliberate and insist that only such deliberate inferences would render a belief epistemically inferential (i.e., nonbasic) in the sense of 2.1.5 above.

2.3.2 Intentionalism and Adverbialism

Intentionalism holds that to have a perceptual experience as of something blue is to be in a state with a distinctively semantic property of meaning blue, of referring to the property of blueness (see the entry on consciousness and intentionality). On this view, the inner states are not just representatives but representations; they have semantic values. Such representations typically lack the properties they depict external objects as having. Furthermore, the relation one stands in to one’s perceptual representations is not necessarily a quasi-perceptual one: it is normally held that one simply has, or tokens, the representations; they are not in any sense objects of perception or awareness in the ordinary course of events, but the vehicles of perception (Huemer 2001). (They might, of course, become objects of something like perception if we reflectively attend to them, but this is something more than merely having the experience.)

Sense-datum and intentionalist views both see perceptual experience as a two-place relation between perceiver and inner representative. Adverbialism, on the other hand, holds that perceptual experience itself is monadic; it doesn't involve the perceiver standing in a relation to something (see the entry on the problem of perception).[1] Different kinds of perceptual experiences are simply different ways of sensing: one “senses greenly” or “is appeared to horsely”, and such locutions do not commit us to the existence of either sense-data or representations. Adverbialism is sometimes offered as an ontologically neutral way of talking about experiences (Chisholm 1957), sometimes as the more contentious claim that perceptual experience is primitive and unanalyzable.

Intentionalism and adverbialism deny direct world-involvement but are compatible with the other varieties of directness. They are also compatible with any of the corresponding varieties of indirectness.

2.3.3 Direct Realism

Proponents of intentionalist and adverbialist theories have often thought of themselves as defending a kind of direct realism; Reid (1785), for example, clearly thinks his proto-adverbialist view is a direct realist view. And perceptual experience is surely less indirect on an intentionalist or adverbialist theory than on the typical sense-datum theory, at least in the sense of perceptual directness. Nevertheless, intentionalist and adverbialist theories render the perception of worldly objects indirect in at least two important ways: (a) it is mediated by an inner state, in that one is in perceptual contact with an outer object of perception only (though not entirely) in virtue of being in that inner state; and (b) that inner state is one that we could be in even in cases of radical perceptual error (e.g., dreams, demonic deception, etc.). These theories might thus be viewed as only “quasi-direct” realist theories; experiences still screen off the external world in the sense that whether the agent is in the good case or the bad case, the experience might still be the same. Quasi-direct theories thus reject the Indirectness Principle only under some readings of “directness”. A fully direct realism would offer an unequivocal rejection of the Indirectness Principle by denying that we are in the same mental states in the good and the bad cases. In recent years, direct realists have wanted the perceptual relation to be entirely unmediated: we don’t achieve perceptual contact with objects in virtue of having perceptual experiences; the experience just is the perceptual contact with the object.

In recent years, therefore, “direct realism” has been usually reserved for the view that perceptual experience is constituted by the subject’s standing in certain relations to external objects, where this relation is not mediated by or analyzable in terms of further, inner states of the agent. Thus, the brain in the vat could not have the same experiences as a normal veridical perceiver, because experience is itself already world-involving.

A type of direct realism that has received much recent attention is disjunctivism (e.g., Snowdon 1980, McDowell 1982, Martin 2002, Haddock & Macpherson 2008; see the entry on the disjunctive theory of perception). There are many different versions of disjunctivism, but a common thread is the claim that the experiences involved in the veridical case are ipso facto of a different type than those involved in the hallucinatory cases. The theory of appearing (Alston 1999) is a type of disjunctivism but one that emphasizes the direct world-involvement in the veridical case rather than the radical difference between the cases.

Some forms of behaviorism, functionalism, and embodied mind are also direct realist views. If, for example, having a certain perceptual experience constitutively involves being disposed to act on worldly objects and properties in certain ways—that is, if behavioral dispositions are themselves individuated as world-involving—then this would render the experience relational in the way required by direct realism; disembodied brains in vats could not have the same experiences as we have in normal, veridical cases. Similar consequences follow if perceptual experience is understood in terms of “skilled coping” (Dreyfus 2002) or “sensorimotor know-how” (Noë 2004), again, if these terms are read as requiring certain interactions with real, external objects. Any such theory implies that brains in vats couldn’t have the same experiences we do, because they’re causally disconnected from the physical world. Such a view need not be a form of disjunctivism, however; depending on the details of the theory, a hallucinating subject who is nevertheless embedded in and disposed to act on the world in the right ways might have the same experience as a veridically perceiving subject.

Direct realism is compatible with all the metaphysical species of direct presence listed above. As such, it allows for an unequivocal denial of premise (1) of PEW, while quasi-realist views only reject that premise under certain understandings of direct presence.

2.4 Comments on Metaphysical Solutions

If representative realism is the cause of the central epistemological problem for perception, then perhaps direct realism or idealism will be the solution. Some philosophers have thought that these metaphysical views resolved the epistemological problem by closing the gap between appearance and reality, by making ordinary objects (e.g., tables and rocks) directly present to the mind.

On further reflection, however, it is clear that the metaphysical account will be, at best, a part of the solution.

Consider again PEW:

  1. Nothing is ever directly present to the mind in perception except perceptual appearances. (Indirectness Principle) Thus:
  2. Without a good reason for thinking perceptual appearances are veridical, we are not justified in our perceptual beliefs. (Metaevidential Principle)
  3. We have no good reason for thinking perceptual appearances are veridical. (Reasons Claim)
  4. Therefore, we are not justified in our perceptual beliefs.

Most metaphysical solutions attack the Indirectness Principle as a way of undercutting the Metaevidential Principle. But they only attack metaphysical readings of the Indirectness Principle, and while the various metaphysical theories of perception from sections 2.2 and 2.3 may have certain intuitive affinities with the Metaevidential Principle or its denial, it follows from Hume’s “no ought from is” dictum that none of them immediately implies either premise (2) or its negation. Epistemological directness does straightforwardly entail the rejection of (2), but epistemological directness is compatible with any of the metaphysical theories of perception glossed above and is entailed by none of them. At best, a metaphysical theory of perception will block one avenue of intuitive support for (2), but it will not imply that (2) is false.

An idealist, for example, will allow that we sometimes dream and that there is a real difference between hallucination and veridical perception, even though in both cases the direct object of awareness is a collection of ideas. The standard view (Berkeley 1710) is that a hallucinatory table is a different sort of collection of ideas than a real table; certain counterfactuals are true of the latter that are not true of the former (e.g., that if I were to will certain movements, my visual perceptions would change in certain ways, etc.). But this reopens the gap between perceptual experiences and ordinary objects. Tables are not just experiences; they are larger entities of which experiences are parts, and those parts are shared by hallucinations. So what is directly present to the mind is something common to hallucination and veridical perception. So my perceptual experience would seem to be neutral with respect to whether I am seeing or hallucinating a table. So to be justified in believing there is a table in front of me, I will need some reason to think this particular experience is veridical, and PEW is back in business (Alston 1993, Greco 2000).

Direct realism precludes this particular relapse into skepticism by denying that the experience is the same in the good and the bad cases. If our perceptual evidence includes the experience, then our evidence in the good case is different from our evidence in the bad case—they are different mental states. It does not follow, however, that these two bits of evidence have differing evidential import; both may—for all we’ve been told so far—be evidentially neutral with respect to, e.g., whether there is actually a chair in front of me or whether it merely appears so. Two very different mental states might nevertheless license all the same inferences; most pertinently, both might only license beliefs of the form “I”m either seeing or hallucinating a table’. Additionally, the direct realist is free to impose a metaevidential demand on justified perceptual belief, a demand that we know which kind of experience we are having before that experience can serve as evidence. Unsurprisingly, direct realists tend to endorse some kind or other of epistemological directness (section 3.4 below, especially 3.4.2), but the metaphysical view is by itself silent on this epistemological issue.

Even with the metaphysical premise (1) removed, a purely epistemological version of PEW, consisting of (2) through (4), still challenges the justification of our perceptual beliefs. A satisfying solution to the problem of the external world requires the articulation of some plausible epistemic principles, one that explains which of the two crucial premises (2) and (3) of PEW are being rejected, and provides an epistemological context which renders that rejection plausible. An entirely metaphysical solution to the problem of the external world will not suffice. An epistemological solution to this epistemological problem will be needed in addition or instead.

3. Epistemological Solutions

Epistemological solutions to PEW deny one or more of its explicitly epistemological premises. They try to make that denial plausible and to situate it within a larger epistemology of perception and a larger epistemology more generally.

3.1 Classical Foundationalism

Foundationalism is the view that some beliefs are epistemologically basic—i.e., their justification does not depend on evidential support from other beliefs—and all other beliefs ultimately derive their justification from basic beliefs. (Basically justified beliefs are sometimes referred to as “immediately justified” or “directly justified” as well.) Classical foundationalism is the view that (i) it is appearance beliefs—i.e., beliefs about perceptual appearances—that are basic, and perceptual beliefs about ordinary objects are based at least partly on these, and (ii) perceptual justification requires us to have good reason to think that the relevant current appearances are veridical. Basing is a relation of epistemic dependence and does not imply explicit inference, although particular theories might hold that the relation is satisfied only when inference occurs.

(i) is defended in one of several ways. Here are brief versions of some of the more common, often implicit, arguments:

  • The empirical foundation must consist of the most highly justified contingent beliefs, and these are appearance beliefs.
  • In order for perception to give us genuine knowledge of the external world, perceptual knowledge must be grounded in direct acquaintance with something; we are not directly acquainted with physical objects, but only with our experiences, so beliefs about these experiences must serve as the foundations of perceptual knowledge.
  • We can and do articulate beliefs about our experiences in defense of our perceptual beliefs when challenged; so these appearance beliefs must be at least part of our evidence for the perceptual beliefs.
  • Perceptual beliefs about external objects are not self-evident (if they were, they would be justified whenever held), so they must be based on some other belief; the only candidates are appearance beliefs, which plausibly are self-evident.

(ii) includes an endorsement of the Metaevidential Principle. We have looked at representative realism as one motivation for that principle, but there are others. Classical foundationalists have traditionally endorsed it because it follows from two other claims they find plausible. The first is (i) above, that our perceptual beliefs are based on appearance beliefs. The second is the claim that in order to be justified in believing hypothesis h on the basis of evidence e, one must be justified in believing that e makes h probable (or that e entails h, or e is good evidence for h, etc.) This second claim is a version of Richard Fumerton’s “Principle of Inferential Justification” and is often defended by citing examples (Fumerton 1995; see the entry on foundationalist theories of justification). My belief that you’re going to die soon cannot be justified on the basis of your tarot card reading unless I’m justified in believing that tarot cards really do tell the future. Whether such examples generalize to all inferences is an open question. Some fairly strong though controversial forms of internalism (see the entry on internalist vs. externalist conceptions of epistemic justification) would imply the Principle of Inferential Justification as well.

The classical foundationalist avoids skepticism by rejecting the Reasons Claim, insisting that we do often have good, non-viciously-circular, reasons for thinking that our experiences are veridical. Two questions thus arise for classical foundationalism, one about the nature and justification of appearance beliefs and one about the allegedly non-circular inference from appearance beliefs to perceptual beliefs.

3.1.1 The Justification of Appearance Beliefs

Appearance beliefs are said not to be based on other beliefs. This raises the question of how they are themselves justified.

Appearance beliefs are a species of introspective belief, and introspection is sometimes thought to involve a “direct contact”, or “confrontation”, or “acquaintance with”, or “access to”, or “self-presentation” of certain truths. As we saw in section 2.1, regarding “direct presence”, such metaphors could be unpacked in a variety of ways. If claims about “acquaintance” and the like (for simplicity, I will refer to them all indiscriminately as “acquaintance”) are given an epistemological reading, then they seem to restate or reiterate the classical foundationalist’s claim that we can have foundational justification for appearance beliefs, rather than to explain or argue for that claim. If they are making some metaphysical claim, then the consequences for epistemology are indirect and unclear. Epistemologists are sometimes less than fully explicit about how they are understanding acquaintance. And however acquaintance is understood, the classical foundationalist must make acquaintance broad enough that we are plausibly acquainted with appearances but narrow enough that we are not acquainted with physical objects as well.

Roderick Chisholm’s (1977) conception of acquaintance (he calls it “self-presentation”) is explicitly and fundamentally epistemic—a self-presenting state is simply one such that a person is justified in believing she is in it whenever she is actually in it. This doesn’t explain or argue for the special epistemic status of appearance beliefs, but Chisholm denies that this needs to be argued: it is self-presenting that appearance beliefs are self-presenting. In a somewhat similar vein, Fumerton (1995, 2001) claims that the acquaintance relation is not an epistemic relation but insists that it is sui generis and unanalyzable; he holds that we nevertheless understand the acquaintance relation, as we are acquainted with it.

Attempts to explicate acquaintance in non-epistemic terms fall into one of two categories. The traditional way to understand acquaintance is in terms of a containment relation between appearance beliefs and appearances, with the result that appearance beliefs entail their own truth. This is the indirect realist’s analogue of the world-involvement invoked by direct realists (above, sections 2.1.4, 2.3.3). Descartes (1641) held that appearance beliefs, like any belief about one’s own mental states, are infallible for this reason and thereby self-evident (and thus justified). Though some still endorse this view (McGrew 2003), most epistemologists deny that we are infallible in our self-attributions. A more modest claim is that only some appearance beliefs are infallible. David Chalmers (2003) argues that phenomenal qualities are literally elements or constituents of a special type of phenomenal concept (“direct phenomenal concepts”), and so introspective judgments that involve the application of such concepts cannot be mistaken.

This does not yet account for the distinctive epistemic status of appearance beliefs, as the epistemic implications of infallibility remain unclear, especially in the context of an internalist epistemology. One might believe some necessary truth as the result of a lucky guess; the belief is infallible, but not justified. This seems at least in part to result from the fact that the infallibility occurs, in some sense, outside of the agent’s perspective. (The infallibility involved in self-attribution, however, seems intuitively to fall within the agent’s perspective.)

The second type of approach views appearance beliefs as justified by something extrinsic to them, so that an appearance belief is justified when it is accompanied by acquaintance with the experiential fact that the appearance belief describes. Laurence BonJour (2003), for example, understands acquaintance in terms of constitutivity, though in a very different way from Chalmers. BonJour claims that awareness of the sensory content of an experience is partly constitutive of what it is to have a conscious experience. That awareness is thus infallible, but appearance beliefs—which purport to describe the experience and constituent awareness—are fallible.

All the authors just mentioned, except for Chisholm, see acquaintance as a metaphysical (i.e., non-epistemic) relation that does not immediately entail any epistemological theses. They lay down as a separate, further thesis one that is not entailed by but is rendered highly plausible, they think, by the nature of the acquaintance relation: that when one is thus acquainted with an experience, one has a strong prima facie justification to believe that one has that experience, and furthermore, that justification does not depend on any other beliefs. On either non-epistemic understanding of acquaintance, it puts us in a very good position to make correct judgments about our current experiences. Most classical foundationalists allow that all appearance beliefs are defeasible (i.e., having a kind of justification that is capable of being overridden or undermined by further reasons); hence the claim made is merely for prima facie, rather than ultima facie, justification. (To say that a belief is prima facie [aka pro tanto] justified is to say that it is has some positive epistemic status, in the sense that it is justified if it is not defeated by overriding or undermining considerations.) Chisholm (1977) and Timothy McGrew (2003) endorse the stronger claim that acquaintance provides indefeasible, ultima facie justification.

It is possible that the experience (or acquaintance with it) is intended to serve not only as a truth-maker and justifier for the appearance belief, but as evidence for that belief as well. By “evidence” is meant here not just any factor that serves to confer justification on a belief, but something that serves as a ground, or reason, or rational basis, for that belief.[2] Not all justification-conferring or justification-relevant factors count as evidence in this sense (if they did, Earl Conee and Richard Feldman [2004] would not have to defend evidentialism). For example, Descartes held that all clear and distinct judgments were justified, though certain judgments—e.g., “I think”—are justified without evidential appeal to clarity and distinctness. It is the fact that it is clear and distinct that makes it justified, not the agent’s awareness of that fact or appreciation of that fact’s epistemic significance, so clarity and distinctness are not functioning here as evidence. Similarly, reliabilism holds, roughly, that being reliably formed renders a belief justified; although reliability need not—and typically does not—figure in as the agent’s evidence or grounds for believing something. Thus, one can claim that perceptual experiences are nondoxastic (i.e., non-belief) states that serve as evidence for appearance beliefs, in much the way that beliefs serve as evidence for other beliefs, though with one crucial difference: for one belief to serve as evidence for another, the former must be justified; experiences are not susceptible to justification, thus can be neither justified nor unjustified, but—on this view—can nevertheless serve as evidence and confer justification on beliefs. The justification of appearance beliefs would then depend on evidential connections to other mental states but not to other beliefs, and because experiences need not be justified in order to serve as evidence, the threatened regress is halted in a way that is consistent with foundationalism. The idea of such nondoxastic evidence raises several problems, as we will see shortly.

Classical foundationalism is sometimes objected to on the grounds that we typically do not have beliefs about our experiences (e.g., Pollock 1986, Greco 2000). This raises interesting and difficult issues about the natures of evidence and the basing relation. For the belief that p to serve as justifying evidence for the belief that q, must I consciously form the belief that p, or is it enough that, e.g., I have good reason to believe that p? Surely the classical foundationalist never denied phenomenal directness or thought our perceptual beliefs were reasoned out explicitly. If one could show that only consciously formed beliefs could ground other beliefs, this would be bad news indeed for classical foundationalism, but this is a controversial claim. Alternatively, the objection might be that we are typically not even yet in a position to form justified appearance beliefs, in some situations where we are already quite justified in our perceptual beliefs. Being in a position to form justified appearance beliefs would require further investigation, in an “inward” direction. This investigation is not always easy (Pollock 1986), and it is possible that such investigation would alter the nature of the experience. In addition, some perceivers may lack the conceptual resources to distinguish appearances from external objects, although they seem to be justified in their perceptual beliefs nonetheless.

3.1.2 From Appearance Beliefs to External Object Beliefs

Cartesian foundationalism was the strictest form of classical foundationalism, requiring a deductive metaevidential argument for the reliability of perception. Descartes believed that he could give a non-circular argument for thinking that some perceptual experiences were veridical, by constructing an a priori argument for the reliability of perception. He also aimed for certainty, so his argument was a deductive one, starting with the existence and perfection of God and concluding that any clear and distinct awareness (including elements of perceptual awarenesses) must be true; so some perceptual experiences—namely, the clear and distinct ones—are veridical. This would have licensed a rejection of the Reasons Claim, by showing how we could have a good reason for thinking our experiences to be veridical. However, Descartes’s a priori arguments for the existence of God were at best controversial, and the theology needed to deduce the reliability of perception from the perfection of the deity was unconvincing, so deductive metaevidential arguments along these lines were not pursued further.

NonCartesian forms of classical foundationalism have tried to combine the a priority required by non-circularity with a probabilistic form of inference, the most promising candidate being abduction, or inference to the best explanation (Russell 1912, BonJour 2003). According to this view, the best explanation of our experiences is the commonsense hypothesis that there is a mind-independent external world that conforms in some measure to these experiences and is the cause of them. The superiority of this explanation to the alternatives (idealism, a Cartesian demon, etc.) is held to be an a priori matter, thus not dependent on assuming the veridicality of the very experiences the argument is supposed to legitimate. There is a good deal of intuitive plausibility to the claim that an external world serves as the best explanation for our sense experience, but making that case in any detail, especially enough to satisfy the idealist, would require taking on some large and complex issues, like what makes one explanation better than another (see they entry on abduction), and—since the commonsense view is sometimes (e.g., Russell 1912, BonJour 2010) held to be simpler than competitors—what counts as simplicity, a vexed question in the philosophy of science (see the entry on simplicity). William Alston (1993) offers an influential critique of abductive arguments for the reliability of sense-experience.

Furthermore, if we are trying to explain how the ordinary person’s perceptual beliefs are justified, then it is not enough that there be some good deductive or abductive argument for the reliability of perception; this argument must be in some important sense available to or possessed by the agent. Premise (2) of PEW, after all, is the claim that the agent must have some good reason for thinking her experiences are veridical. Some (e.g., Pollock & Cruz 1999) think this imposes a significantly more onerous burden on the proponent of classical foundationalism, although others (e.g., BonJour 2010) claim that the superiority of the commonsense view is quite accessible to ordinary epistemic agents.

3.2 Fundamental Epistemic Principles

Other foundationalists have responded to PEW by denying the Metaevidential Principle. Most such views have rejected both parts of the standard argument for the Metaevidential Principle (3.1 above), but one important exception is worth noting. Chisholm (1966, 1977) agrees with the classical foundationalist that perceptual beliefs are based on appearance beliefs but denies that any argument for the legitimacy of the appearance-reality inference is needed. Chisholm posits as a fundamental epistemic principle that if one is justified in believing herself to be perceptually appeared to as if p, then one is prima facie justified in believing that p. The significance of insisting that this principle is fundamental is to insist on the legitimacy of the move from p-appearance to p-reality while denying that that legitimacy is derived from deduction or abduction.

To the classical foundationalist, this move seems illicitly ad hoc. Admittedly, it gives the answer we desire—that perceptual beliefs are justified—but it doesn’t explain how this can be so or give us any reason to think it is true (Fumerton 1995). The objection holds that the postulation of fundamental epistemic principles licensing the inferences we like, despite our inability to provide an argument for the legitimacy of such inferences, has, to use Bertrand Russell’s apt phrase, all the advantages of theft over honest toil.

3.3 Coherentism

The coherentist, like the classical foundationalist, endorses the Metaevidential Principle but holds that we can indeed have good arguments for the reliability of perception. Coherentism is the view that at least some justification comes from mutual support among otherwise unsupported beliefs instead of tracing back to basic beliefs. As such, coherentists are sometimes said to endorse certain kinds of circular (they prefer to call them holistic) argument, but a coherentist will reject the Reasons Claim by insisting that there is nothing viciously circular about our arguments for the reliability of perception (BonJour 1985, Lehrer 1990). Because it allows mutual support, coherentism can tolerate empirical arguments for the reliability of perception, in principle, allowing appeals to track records, evolution, and other scientific evidence.

3.3.1 The Isolation Objection and the Role of Experience

Coherentism has traditionally been propounded as a doxastic theory: one that holds that only beliefs can serve as evidence. This is in part because one of the major motivations for coherentism derives from an argument due to Wilfrid Sellars (1956), Donald Davidson (1986) and Laurence BonJour (1980) that purports to show that nondoxastic states (e.g., experiences) cannot play an evidential role (about which, more below, in section 3.4.1). This doxasticism is the source of one of the most notorious problems for coherentism, however, for the internal coherence of a belief system could result from the ingenuity of the believer, rather than from its fit with reality. A detailed enough and cleverly constructed fairy tale could be highly internally coherent, but surely I am not justified in believing the fairy tale, in my current situation and environment. This is the famous isolation objection to coherentism: a belief system could be isolated from the world and yet be fully coherent. Since those beliefs would not be justified, coherence is not sufficient for justification.

The brunt of the isolation objection is that (doxastic) coherentism is unable to do justice to perception, for it does not require any genuinely perceptual contact with the world. But without perception, the whole of one’s beliefs is just another plausible story, not the one true description of things. (Even with perception, there is unlikely to be a single best belief set, but the number of equally good contenders will be vastly reduced.) For some time, BonJour (1985) thought that the problem could be solved with more beliefs; he required a candidate belief system to include a number of beliefs attributing reliability to beliefs that seem to be involuntary, noninferential, and directly caused by the outside world. But this solution seemed ad hoc, and it still didn’t require the belief set to be very highly constrained by perception; at best it constrained the belief set by what the agent believes to be perception, and even then, only those putatively perceptual beliefs about which she has favorable metabeliefs would need to constrain the rest of the system in any way. This seems to render perception epistemically “optional”, in an objectionable way.

Although BonJour (1997) has consequently abandoned this approach in favor of a form of foundationalism, others have sought to incorporate experiences into a nondoxastic coherentism (Conee 1988, Haack 1993, Kvanvig 2012, Kvanvig & Riggs 1992). If experiences are among the relata over which the coherence relation is defined, then a fully isolated agent won’t be able to satisfy the coherence requirement, and the isolation objection may be averted.

It is unclear whether such a move genuinely rescues coherentism or simply replaces it with a version of foundationalism. If consonance with experience can increase the credibility of a belief, then it begins to look as if that belief satisfies at least some (“weak”) foundationalist definitions of an epistemologically basic belief. Instead, the nondoxastic coherentist might insist that experiences justify perceptual beliefs, but only in the presence of the right background beliefs about which experiences reliably indicate which distal states of affairs, where these background beliefs are themselves justified in a coherentist manner (Gupta 2006). This view seems to be securely coherentist, though it threatens to render coherence with experience optional in just the way BonJour’s older view did. The crucial question here is whether experiences—alone, and in and of themselves—affect the coherence of a belief system, or whether they do so only in the presence of the relevant metabeliefs. If the former, then “nondoxastic coherentism” may not be significantly different from some form of foundationalism. If the latter, then an agent lacking the requisite metabeliefs might satisfy the coherence requirements quite well but have a belief system that clashes with her experience, and the nondoxastic coherentist would have to hold that she is none the worse, epistemically, for that fact.

The very spirit of coherentism seems to dictate that perception yields justification only because and insofar as the perceiver has metabeliefs that favor perception, while it is central to the foundationalist theory of perception that perceptual experience imposes epistemic constraints on us, whether we believe it or not.

3.4 Modest Foundationalism

The epistemological views considered so far can all be considered egoistic theories, for they hold that justification for beliefs about external objects depends in part on justification for beliefs about oneself—about one’s current mental states, about the connections between one’s experiences or putatively perceptual beliefs and certain distal states of affairs, rendering perceptual beliefs nonbasic. Modest foundationalism is a nonegoistic version of foundationalism, one that allows some beliefs about external objects and their properties—particularly, perceptual beliefs—to be epistemologically basic. (Both types of foundationalism also countenance other basic beliefs, e.g., beliefs about simple arithmetical truths.) Modest foundationalism thus denies the Metaevidential Principle; perceptual beliefs are not based on other beliefs and thus not based on appearance beliefs, and if they are based on something other than beliefs (namely, experiences) the agent need not have a justified belief about the reliability of this connection.

Some proponents of modest foundationalism go a step further and offer a derivative denial of the Reasons Claim: since we already have justified beliefs about our surroundings, and introspective knowledge of the deliverances of perception, we can construct non-circular arguments for the reliability of perception. Indeed, if I can have first-order knowledge about the world around me without first having metaevidence about the reliability of perception, I should be able to accumulate empirical evidence for thinking that I am not a brain in a vat, that I am not dreaming, etc., without begging the question. Whether this should count as a virtue or a vice of the theory is a matter of debate. Proponents of a “Moorean” response to skepticism (see the entries on skepticism and epistemic closure) will see this as a selling point for modest foundationalism (Pryor 2000). Others (Vogel 2000, 2008; Cohen 2002) have interpreted this result as revealing a fundamental flaw of the theory: it makes justification and knowledge “too easy”. It is as if I used an untested speedometer to form beliefs both about my speed and what the meter indicated my speed to be, then used a number of such belief pairs to inductively argue for the reliability of the speedometer.

Modest foundationalism endorses epistemological directness (section 2.1.5 above) and could be considered a kind of epistemological direct realism, for it makes the world and its elements “directly present” to the mind in a fairly clear, epistemological sense: perceptual justification is not dependent on any other justification; no other beliefs are interposed between us and the world (in fact, John Pollock’s term for his [1986] modest foundationalism is “direct realism”; cf. Pollock & Cruz 1999). Modest foundationalism is compatible with any metaphysical view about the nature of perception. Even a sense-datum theorist could embrace this epistemological direct realism, provided she held that the inference from sense-data to external objects was a kind of (perhaps unconscious or subpersonal) inference that does not impose evidential requirements on the conclusion belief.

3.4.1 Internalist Modest Foundationalism

Modest foundationalism is usually associated with the internalist versions of the theory. Roughly, epistemological internalism is the claim that the factors that determine justification supervene on the mental states of the cognizer (mentalism) or can be determined to obtain by mere reflection (access internalism; see the entry on internalist vs. externalist conceptions of epistemic justification). Internalist modest foundationalist theories hold that perceptual beliefs are directly justified by the corresponding perceptual experiences; it is the experiences themselves, rather than beliefs about the experiences, that do the justificatory work.

The most straightforward version is one that holds that having a certain experience is by itself sufficient for prima facie justification for the corresponding perceptual belief. Michael Huemer’s (2007) “phenomenal conservatism”, James Pryor’s (2000) “dogmatism”, and Pollock’s (1974, 1986) “direct realism” all endorse something like the following principle:

If S has a perceptual experience as of p, then S is prima facie justified in believing that p.

That is, S is prima facie justified whether or not perception is reliable for S and whether or not S has any evidence in favor of the claim that perception is reliable. Perceptual beliefs are justified by the experience alone, in virtue of some intrinsic feature of that experience (its content, or phenomenal character, or assertive force, etc.). Of course, because the justification here is only prima facie justification, this justification could be defeated if, say, S has good enough reason to think that perception is unreliable, or has independent evidence that p is false.

To have a neutral term, I call this view “seemings internalism”, for it holds that perceptual beliefs are based on “seemings”, i.e., appearance states, i.e., experiences. (There is no fixed, established terminology here, so I will use these terms interchangeably.)

Perhaps the most important problem for this view concerns the relevant understanding of seemings, or perceptual experience. It is clear that seemings must be non-belief states of some sort, as their epistemological role is to confer justification on basic beliefs, and the latter wouldn’t be basic if seemings were themselves beliefs. The “Sellarsian dilemma” is a famous argument, due perhaps as much to BonJour (1978, 1985) as to Sellars (1956), which claims that “experience” and “seemings” and the like are ambiguous in a way that undermines the epistemological role foundationalism requires of experiences. That role, of course, is to provide justification for beliefs without being themselves in need of it. (Sellars’s original argument is aimed at classical foundationalism, but I discuss it here, because it threatens any theory that has experiences justifying beliefs—by themselves and in the absence of background beliefs—and because most recent discussion of the Sellarsian dilemma occurs within the context of seemings internalism.) According to Sellars (1956), there is a kind of awareness of sensations that does not involve learning or the application of concepts, but this kind of awareness does not account for the justification of our appearance beliefs; one might well have this kind of awareness without having any idea what kind of experiences one is having (or any idea that there are such things as experiences!). There is another kind of awareness of our sensations that does involve the application of concepts and does entail knowledge and justification. But this awareness just is one’s knowledge of one’s experiences (i.e., one’s justified, true, unGettiered appearance belief). But that kind of awareness cannot then serve as a nondoxastic foundation that confers justification on beliefs without being itself in need of justification.

Sellars himself (1956) thought that there are two elements to perception: a bare sensation, which is an inner event with qualitative character but no representational content; and a perceptual belief (or belief-like state, in cases where the agent does not accept appearances at face value; see Reid 1764, 1785 for a similar view). Recent formulations of the Sellarsian dilemma have focused on this mismatch in content between experience and perceptual belief. There are several variants of the argument; what follows is an amalgamated version.

  1. Let us say that a state is “cognitive” just in case it has conceptual and propositional content, and assertive force; it is “noncognitive” otherwise.[3]
  2. If an experience is noncognitive, then it cannot justify a perceptual belief.
  3. If an experience is cognitive, then it cannot justify any beliefs unless it is itself justified.
  4. Therefore, in neither case can an experience confer justification without being itself justified.

In defense of (2), experiences have frequently been construed as lacking representational contents altogether (Sellars 1956, Martin 2002, Brewer 2011), or as having nonconceptual contents (Heck 2000, Peacocke 2001).[4] An influential argument (e.g., McDowell 1994, Brewer 1999) holds that without conceptual content, an experience would have to stand outside the “logical space of reasons” and thus cannot justify a belief. This line is perhaps most plausible if the relevant mode of justification is assumed to be a specifically evidential one (see section 3.1.1 above). To serve as evidence, the experience would need to stand in logical or probabilistic relations to beliefs, and without (conceptual) contents, it is unclear how it could stand in evidential relations to beliefs, or which beliefs it would serve as evidence for (McDowell 1994). A common response is that as long as experiences have contents of any sort, they can have truth conditions and thus stand in entailment and probabilistic relations to beliefs (Heck 2000, Byrne 2005). One way to follow through on the original argument for (2) is to emphasize the kind of content necessary for evidence appreciable as such by the perceiver. If experiences are nonconceptual, then it seems that I could have a nonconceptual experience of a cat without being in any position to appreciate the fact that the experience is in fact of a cat. In such a case, I could fail to have any justification for believing that there is cat in front of me. So nonconceptual experiences cannot, by themselves, justify perceptual beliefs (Lyons 2016). Such an argument requires the controversial assumption that an agent must “appreciate” e’s evidential significance vis-à-vis h, in order for e to supply that agent with evidence for h. Some (e.g., Alston 1988) have explicitly rejected this assumption.

As for the other horn of the dilemma, premise (3), one can argue that so-called “experiences” that have assertive force and the same contents as beliefs are, if not themselves beliefs, at least sufficiently belief-like that they are susceptible to epistemic evaluation in much the way that beliefs are; if so and if only the “justified” ones can confer justification on beliefs, then these experiences will not have filled the role foundationalism had carved out for them (Sellars 1956, BonJour 1978, Sosa 2007).

In recent years, several authors (Lyons 2005, 2009; Bengson, Grube, & Korman 2011; Brogaard 2013) have argued that what we think of as perceptual experiences is actually a composite of two (or more) distinct elements, what Chris Tucker (2010) calls the “sensation” (an imagistic state, rich in perceptual phenomenology) and a “seeming” (here construed as a purely representational state, applying conceptual categories to things in the world). Seemings understood in this way are still non-belief states: in cases of known perceptual illusion, it might seem to me that p, even though I don’t believe that p. Something like the above Sellarsian dilemma can be run with this distinction in hand: sensations without seemings are insufficient to justify beliefs; and seemings without sensations would be subjectively too similar to mere hunches to justify beliefs (Lyons 2009). The seemings internalist can reply by arguing that seemings alone, even construed as just one component of perceptual experience, can indeed justify beliefs (Tucker 2010), or by rejecting this composite view, insisting that a seeming is a single, unified state, whose perceptual phenomenology and conceptual content are inextricably linked (Chudnoff & Didomenico 2015).

Seemings internalism as formulated above claims that the content of the experience is the same as the content of the belief, thus rejecting premise (3) of the Sellarsian argument. There may be variations close enough to still count as seemings internalism that deny (2) instead, allowing experiences with nonconceptual contents to justify beliefs. The standard schema would have to be modified:

If S has a perceptual experience as of p*, then S is prima facie justified in believing that p.

One would, of course, want to say more about the relation between p and p*. Although his concern is not with nonconceptual content, Nico Silins (2011) defends a view much like seemings internalism, where the experiences are not required to have the same contents as the beliefs.

A second problem is that of alien sense modalities (Bergmann 2006). There are possible creatures with sense modalities and experiences that are foreign to us: echolocation, electeroception, etc. If metaevidential beliefs are not necessary for perceptual justification, then these same experiences ought to justify us in those same beliefs. Intuitively, however, a sudden electeroceptive experience would not justify me in believing there was a medium sized animal about three feet behind me. In fact, a famous objection that is normally pressed against reliabilist theories seems to apply equally well to seemings internalism. Norman (BonJour 1980) has no reason for thinking that he has clairvoyant powers, but one day he has a clairvoyant experience as of the president being in New York; intuitively, he is not prima facie justified in believing that the president is in New York, yet seemings internalism seems to imply that he is. One might argue that Norman’s experience is not exactly perceptual; perhaps this might offer a way out. Some versions of seemings internalism restrict their claims to perception (Pryor 2000), although some (Huemer 2007) apply to seemings much more generally.

Another potential problem is that seemings internalism is insensitive to the etiology of the experience, where it intuitively seems that this should matter. If the only reason Jack looks angry to Jill is that she has an irrational fear that he would be angry, then her perceptual experience as of angry-Jack should not carry its usual evidential weight (Siegel 2011). In general, experiences that result from wishful thinking, fear, and various irrational processes should not have the same evidential import as do experiences with a more respectable etiology (Siegel 2013). But seemings internalism makes the experience itself sufficient for (prima facie) justification and thus leaves no role for etiology to play. One response to these sorts of cases is that if it genuinely looks to Jill as if Jack is angry, then the only appropriate thing for Jill to do is believe that he is angry (Huemer 2013). This is compatible with there still being something else epistemically wrong with Jill; e.g., she presumably doesn’t know that Jack is angry (even if he is).

A question that arises for any epistemology of perception but that is more salient for seemings internalism concerns which perceptual beliefs are epistemologically basic. Is my belief that there’s a dog in front of me basic, or does its justification depend on the justification of more elemental beliefs: that there’s a medium sized, 3-dimensional object of such-and-such a shape and a furry texture, etc.? Is my belief that that’s Django on the floor in front of me basic, or does it depend on the beliefs that there’s a black and tan dog of a certain description, and that Django is a black and tan dog who fits that description, etc.? One reason this matters, especially for the present views, is that it is closely linked to separate issues concerning the contents of perception (see the entry on the contents of perception). If I can have the basic perceptual belief that Django the dog is here in front of me, then does this mean that I must be capable of having a perceptual experience with the content that Django is in front of me?

A final worry for seemings internalism is one that we encountered above in section 3.2: the proposal seems to be an ad hoc attempt to get the desired nonskeptical answer without further justification for the principle.[5]

There is a nonstandard form of internalist modest foundationalism that might be able to solve some of these problems by finding a distinctive role for background knowledge to play. Peter Markie (2006) suggests that background knowledge of how to form perceptual beliefs can determine which experiences count as evidence for which beliefs. If this background served as evidence, the view in question would no longer be a modest foundationalism. Markie, however, understands this know-how entirely in nondoxastic terms—in terms of behavioral dispositions. This presumably keeps it from serving as evidence, although the know-how is mental and available to introspection, which renders the theory internalist. On this view, the content of perceptual experiences would not matter, for their status as evidence is not supposed to be determined entirely by the nature of themselves and their justificanda. This view does, however, flout the intuitively plausible, though controversial, principle of evidence essentialism, which holds that if e is evidence of h for S, then necessarily, e is evidence of h for any S (Lyons 2009; Pollock 1986 calls the principle “cognitive essentialism” and Conee & Feldman 2004 call it “strong supervenience”). It also violates the plausible and less controversial claim that evidential relations are objective (Bergmann 2004), i.e., that the agent’s subjective sense of evidential fit is insufficient for genuine fit.

3.4.2 Epistemological Disjunctivism

Seemings internalism employs a conception of seemings that is neutral between hallucination and veridical perception. The view thus holds that our epistemic status is the same in both cases, as do coherentism and classical foundationalism. The epistemological disjunctivist, on the other hand, holds that we are more justified in the good case (perhaps significantly more justified).

The debate between epistemological disjunctivists is actually orthogonal to the debates between foundationalism and coherentism. The disjunctivist need not endorse modest foundationalism and hold that perceptual beliefs are basic. I discuss the theory here under the heading of modest foundationalism, because proponents of epistemological disjunctivists have typically embraced a version of modest foundationalism, at least with respect to perception.

Epistemological disjunctivism fits naturally with metaphysical disjunctivism, although neither implies the other. The proponent of both can claim that the reason we are justified in the good case but not in the bad is that a veridical perceptual experience is a distinct type of mental state from a hallucination and that different types of mental states frequently have different evidential significance. An epistemological disjunctivist who denied metaphysical disjunctivism would claim that we are in the same mental state in both cases but that the justificatory potency of an experiential state is partly determined by further factors, including the veridicality or not of the experience. On the standard mentalist understanding of internalism, the latter view is clearly externalist; the former view might count as internalist, at least on a rather unusually liberal understanding of internalism, which allows the supervenience base for justification to include factive mental states.

One motivation for epistemological disjunctivism is that it would allow for a kind of infallibilism in perception: in the good case, the basis for my perceptual belief is something that absolutely guarantees the truth of that belief (McDowell 1982, Pritchard 2012). At the same time, it does so in a way that is compatible with a (somewhat unusual) kind of access internalism (Pritchard 2012): in the good case, my experience justifies me not only in believing, say, that there’s a cat in front of me, but also in believing that I’m perceiving veridically. This allows me, at least in the good case, to know on the basis of mere reflection that I’m in a state that infallibly guarantees that there is a cat in front of me. I cannot, however, know whether or not I am in a state that guarantees that there’s a cat. Because veridical and hallucinatory experiences are indistinguishable, epistemological disjunctivism implies that even if one can know that she does have good (infallible) evidence for p in the good case, one might yet fail to know that she lacks good evidence for p in the bad case, where she would continue to think she had good evidence. This brand of access internalism is unlikely to satisfy most internalists (Smithies 2013).

Other versions of epistemological disjunctivism (not all of which embrace the title) are motivated differently. Some are motivated by the idea that what justifies a perceptual belief that p is the fact that one sees that p (Millar 2011, Byrne 2016), some by the idea that all evidence consists of facts (Williamson 2000), and some by the idea that veridical involves a successful exercise of a capacity while the hallucinatory case does not (Schellenberg 2016).

3.4.3 Externalist Theories

Coherentism and classical foundationalism attempt to satisfy the Metaevidential Principle in a way that allows these theories to (a) defend, rather than simply postulate, the epistemic legitimacy of perception, and (b) satisfy the internalist demand that the factors relevant to the justification of a belief be internal to the agent. Internalist modest foundationalism does (b) but not (a); externalist versions do (a) but not (b). (Both reject the Metaevidential Principle.) Although it is possible to defend an externalist epistemology that is otherwise structurally similar to classical foundationalism or coherentism (Goldman 1986), extant externalist theories have followed modest foundationalism in allowing beliefs about external objects and properties to be epistemologically basic.

Externalist theories impose more (and also sometimes less) than the seemings internalist requirement that the agent have the relevant perceptual experience. One obvious candidate factor is reliability. Alvin Goldman (1979, 1986) argues that, so long as perception really is reliable,[6] the agent need not have reasons for believing perception to be reliable in order to be justified in her perceptual beliefs. What makes perceptual beliefs justified, on such a view, is that they are reliably formed. The simplest reliabilist theory of perceptual belief is one that holds

(SR): a belief is prima facie justified iff it is the result of a reliable cognitive process.

This offers a nonevidentialist theory of perceptual justification; rather than being justified by evidential connections to experiences or other beliefs, it is the mere fact that the producing or sustaining process has a tendency to yield true beliefs that makes the perceptual belief justified. This is not to say that it precludes evidence from playing any epistemic role but only that it does not require evidence for perceptual justification; an agent can have justified perceptual beliefs without having any evidence.

A second externalist approach can be offered either as an alternative or an addendum to reliabilism. It holds that what makes certain beliefs about the world justified is that they have a distinctive psychological etiology, e.g., that they are the outputs of a perceptual module (where what counts as a perceptual module is spelled out in architectural terms, rather than in terms of phenomenology or the agent’s background beliefs; Lyons 2009). Psychological etiology is not available to mere reflection, and the theory leaves open the possibility that the agent has a justified perceptual belief with the requisite perceptual etiology, without having any conscious experiences or evidence of any other kind. Obviously, the lack of an evidential requirement will be controversial, but the proponent of this view sees this as little more than the externalist had already signed on for.

A third possibility is to claim that what makes perceptual beliefs justified is that they are properly formed, where the operative conception of “proper” is cashed in terms of a biological—usually evolutionary—understanding of proper function. Again, this can be offered either in conjunction with (Plantinga 1993) or in opposition to (Bergmann 2006, Graham 2012) reliabilism.

Many of the objections to these views are just specific applications of objections to reliabilism, externalism, and teleological theories more generally. For instance, clairvoyance objections (BonJour 1980) aim to show that reliability is not sufficient for prima facie justification, and new evil demon arguments (Lehrer & Cohen 1983) insist that reliability is not necessary (see the entry on reliabilist epistemology). Teleological theories face the additional problem of the Swampman (Davidson 1987), who is a randomly occurring (therefore, lacking in any biological functions) molecular duplicate of a normal person; intuitively he seems to have justified perceptual beliefs, although this cannot be accounted for in terms of proper function.

3.4.4 Mixed Theories

In addition to these standard worries, there is a pervasive sense among epistemologists that perceptual experiences must play some important role in the justification of perceptual belief, probably an evidential one. There are two ways to make room for experiences in an externalist epistemology. One is to add an auxiliary thesis to the effect that the requisite external property is essentially mediated in certain cases by experiences. For example, some perceptual processes might only be highly reliable when experiences are among the inputs; or they might be designed (Plantinga 1993) to take experiences as inputs. The other way is to defend a genuinely hybrid account, which posits an internalist (usually evidentialist) constraint that is not taken to reduce to the more general external criteria already in place.

An example of this second approach is Alston’s (1988) internalist externalism. He requires that every justified belief have some ground, or evidence, and that this ground be accessible; that is the internalist element. He claims, however, that what makes a ground (good) evidence for some belief is that the ground reliably indicates the truth of that belief, and this fact is one that need not be accessible to the agent; this is the externalist element. Juan Comesaña (2010) endorses a similar view, though in ostensibly process reliabilist terms (the processes he has in mind, however, are very narrow, of the form “believing h on the basis of e”, which makes it more similar to an indicator reliabilism than a typical process reliabilism). Goldman (2011) wants experiential evidence to play a central role in perception, though he does not explicitly endorse an experiential/evidential requirement. He offers a two-factor reliabilist proposal for understanding evidence, which combines process and indicator reliabilism; for e to be evidence for h (i) e must be among the inputs to a reliable process that outputs h, and (ii) there must be an objective fittingness relation between e and h, that is, e must reliably indicate the truth of h.

These theories understand evidential justification in terms of reliability. One could alternatively understand it in teleological terms (Plantinga 1993) and couple this with a requirement that every justified perceptual belief be based on some appropriate experiential evidence (although teleological theories tend not to take this extra step). Either way, we get a theory that solves some of the Sellarsian problems for seemings internalism. The reliability or teleology can determine which experiences serve as proper evidence for which beliefs, and it shouldn’t matter whether experiences have the right kind of content, or any content at all. The external factor thus plays roughly the same role as internalized know-how does for Markie’s view. Like Markie’s view, externalist theories of perceptual evidence violate evidence essentialism, but unlike that view, they retain the objectivity of evidence, even if the teleological views see it as species-relative.

Of course, such hybrid theories will still be unsatisfying to internalists. Even if they require certain internal factors for justification, they still leave the total determinants of justification outside the agent’s ken. Some experience of mine will count as evidence for some belief of mine, but it is an utter mystery to me which belief the experience is evidence for. This will not satisfy the internalist, at least not the sort who thinks that if we are justified in believing something, then this is a fact we can ascertain on the basis of mere reflection. At the same time, nonevidentialist externalists are not likely to see what is compelling about the experiential requirement, especially if it doesn’t go far enough to appease internalist scruples anyway.

4. Conclusion

The epistemological problems of perception have traditionally centered on the threat of skepticism, in particular, on the “veil of perception” implicated by a well-known metaphysics of perception, which threatens to lead inexorably to skepticism. Although certain metaphysical theories of perception have natural affinities for certain epistemological views, the epistemology and metaphysics tend to be logically independent. Even once our metaphysics is in place, we will need to make difficult decisions about the epistemology. There is a wide variety of direct realist epistemological theories of perception and a number of non-direct-realist epistemologies as well, each boasting certain strengths and facing problems yet to be solved.

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Other Internet Resources

Acknowledgments

Thanks to Bill Fish and Susanna Siegel for comments on earlier drafts, and to Joe Cruz, Alvin Goldman, Peter Graham, Anna-Sara Malmgren, and Tom Senor for helpful discussion.

Copyright © 2016 by
Jack Lyons <jclyons@uark.edu>

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