Ethics in Indian Buddhism

First published Tue Jun 22, 2010; substantive revision Thu Feb 1, 2024

Buddhism represents a vast and rich intellectual tradition which, until recently, received very little influence from Western philosophy. This tradition contains a variety of teachings about how to live and what to do in various situations. Buddhism tells us to purify our own minds and to develop lovingkindness and compassion for all beings. The various forms of Buddhism offer systematic frameworks for understanding the traits of character and types of actions that cause problems for ourselves and others, as well as those qualities and actions that help to heal the suffering of the world. When starting a Buddhist path, one agrees to follow rules of moral discipline that forbid various destructive actions; but once the mind has reached a very high degree of spiritual development, the rules are transcended and one acts spontaneously for the benefit of others.

Buddhism upholds lofty and demanding ethical values, but recognizes the need to adapt those values to the conditions of the real world. From a Buddhist point of view, animal life is precious, and human life is even more so. Ideally we should refrain from killing animals, adopt a vegetarian diet, renounce all forms of violence and live in harmony with nature. Yet there are some difficult cases in which violence and killing seem almost unavoidable. Some Buddhist writers have offered guidance on how to act appropriately and realistically in such situations, without abandoning the compassion and lovingkindness that form the basis of the Buddhist approach to ethics.

1. Basic Teachings of Buddhist Ethics

The main goal of Buddhist practice is to reach freedom from suffering by coming to see the world as it actually is and abandoning the distorted projections that our thoughts and emotions create. A very important means to reach this goal is to refrain from destructive actions, since these actions cause harm to others and create mental disturbances in us that generate suffering and keep us from seeing things as they are. Moreover, according to Buddhist teachings, those who reach the goal of freedom thenceforward act in a loving and compassionate manner towards others, helping these others in turn to be more happy and free. Ethical action is thus both an important part of the Buddhist path and an important aspect of the results said to flow from that path.

There is no word in Buddhist languages such as Sanskrit, Pāli and Tibetan that exactly corresponds to the English word “ethics.” The term most commonly translated as “ethics” is Sanskrit śīla (Pāli sīla). But this word actually means something more like “moral discipline”; someone has śīla when, having made a commitment to follow a certain set of moral rules, she is actually disposed to follow those rules.

There are central concepts of Western ethical theory that have no exact equivalent in Buddhist texts. It’s not clear that Buddhist thinkers have a concept of moral obligation at all. Moreover, Buddhist texts often make points which we can understand in terms of the distinction between intrinsic and instrumental value – that is, the distinction between what is valuable in itself and what is valuable as a means to bring about something else. But they have no technical terms that correspond to “intrinsic value” and “instrumental value.” And many statements that can be read as being about ethics can also be understood in a non-normative way, as descriptions of how a spiritually developed being actually behaves.

Nevertheless, there are many statements in Buddhist scriptures and treatises that are hard to understand otherwise than as ethical claims. The Sanskrit terms kuśala and śubha are used in a strongly evaluative way and often translated as “good,” though in some contexts there are other possible translations (“skillful” for kuśala, “beautiful” for śubha). Buddhist texts talk about what we should do, and hold up models of spectacular altruism for our admiration and emulation. And Buddhism attaches considerable importance to systems of rules that codify moral discipline.

A consideration that has motivated many Buddhists to vow to follow rules of moral discipline is a wish to avoid the karmic consequences of actions that harm others. These consequences have traditionally been understood largely in terms of rebirth in the various realms of cyclic existence. In the earliest texts, there are five such realms: the hells, the worlds of hungry ghosts, animals, and humans, and the heavenly worlds of the gods (Skt. deva). Later texts add a sixth realm, that of the titans (Skt. asura).

The hells are terrible places of torture and suffering, in which beings who are dominated by anger and hatred are cut to pieces, burned, frozen, and tormented by demonic apparitions that are in fact projections of their own distorted minds. Hungry ghosts are depicted with large bellies and tiny mouths; driven by greed, they seek endlessly for something to eat or drink, but even when they find a morsel they can swallow, it turns into filth or fire in their mouths. Animals are seen as dominated by stupidity, limited to a fixed set of possible behaviors and primarily trying simply to survive. In this system, the human world is primarily characterized by the instrumental pursuit of objects of desire. The titans are powerful beings who live in relatively pleasant circumstances, but are driven by competitiveness and obsessively envious of the splendor of the gods. They continually plot to invade the heavens. Unfortunately for the titans, when they actually do battle with the gods, they always lose. The gods of the lower heavens, the heavens of desire, live in palaces of astonishing beauty and exquisite sensual pleasure. Blinded by pride, they disregard the suffering of those below them and ignore the fact that their high status is impermanent: they, too, will die. At the top of cyclic existence, in the heavens of form and the formless heavens, other gods rest in a state of peaceful, quiet bliss, with almost no manifest suffering and for vast, but finite, periods of time.

Actions motivated by greed, hatred and delusion have a tendency to drive those who do them into the three lower realms of suffering: the hells, the hungry ghost realm, and the animal realm. Actions carried out with better motivations, but still infused with a sense of self, tend to produce rebirth in the three higher realms of titans, humans, and gods. Vast numbers of sentient beings are trapped in this cycle, continually wandering from one realm to another, unable to escape and forced to experience the forms of suffering that exist in each realm. The human realm is particularly fortunate, because it is only in this realm that one can attain Awakening, which liberates one from the whole cycle.

Some modern teachers have interpreted the doctrine of the six realms as a psychological process unfolding in this one life: the realms are understood as the different ways we understand the world when under the influence of the reactive emotions of anger, greed, stupidity, desire, competitiveness, and pride. (See, e.g., McLeod 2002, 146–51.) But historically, most Buddhists have taken this system literally, as a cosmological account of how the world works and what happens when we die. Therefore, to avoid the actions most likely to drive them into the lower realms, many Buddhists have undertaken to obey rules of moral discipline.

The two most important systems of moral discipline in Buddhism are the Five Precepts, which apply to lay people, and the Vows of Individual Liberation (Skt. prātimokṣa) which apply to monks and nuns. Accepting these commitments is a crucial part of what defines someone as a Buddhist lay person or as a Buddhist monastic. The Five Precepts are quite similar to basic lists of prohibitions in other great world religions: those who take them make a commitment to refrain from killing, stealing, sexual misconduct, lying, and drunkenness. The Vows of Individual Liberation are stricter, ruling out all forms of sexual activity and laying down detailed regulations for monastic etiquette and deportment.

Following the Five Precepts is said to lead to rebirth as a human and prevent rebirth in one of the lower realms of suffering. This form of moral discipline helps people develop self-respect, so that they are confident in appearing in any gathering. It prevents many forms of trouble and suffering that harmful actions produce for both the agent and others. Meanwhile, the Vows of Individual Liberation help the monastic community function in a way that serves the spiritual development of the monks and nuns. They also create a foundation for meditation practice that leads toward freedom.

Other notable aspects of Buddhist moral discipline are captured in a list known as the Ten Good Courses of Action (Pāli dasa-kusala-kamma-patha). They are negatively phrased: each of the Ten Good Courses of Action just consists in refraining from the corresponding element of the Ten Bad Courses of Action. The Ten Bad Courses of Action are:

  1. Taking life
  2. Stealing
  3. Sexual misconduct
  4. Lying
  5. Divisive speech
  6. Harsh speech
  7. Idle chitchat
  8. Covetousness
  9. Malice
  10. Wrong view

(See Keown, 1992, 30 for this list, with somewhat different translations.) Note that the behaviors forbidden by four of the five precepts are included in this list, with the exception of drunkenness. The reason for omitting drunkenness may be that getting drunk does not necessarily harm others, though it may put one in a state in which the risk of harming others is much greater.

The Ten Bad Courses of Action are traditionally classified into three actions of the body (1–3), four forms of speech (4–7), and three mental states (8–10). Among the actions of speech, divisive speech means speaking in a way as to aggravate conflict and divide friends from each other. Harsh speech is speech motivated by anger that wounds another emotionally through insulting and severely critical words. Idle chitchat is speech which fills time and absorbs attention without communicating anything of practical or spiritual importance.

The three mental states on the list are closely related to the three poisons, which are among the most fundamental psychological causes of the cycle of existence and the suffering that comes with it. The three poisons are attraction, aversion and indifference. When we encounter an experience that appears to strengthen and confirm our sense of self, we are attracted to that experience and attempt to prolong or repeat it. When an experience appears to threaten our sense of self, we react with aversion, trying to avoid it or push it away. Any experience that doesn’t fall into these two categories seems unimportant; since we are indifferent to it, we ignore that experience. Thus, in Buddhist teachings, indifference is very closely associated with ignorance, confusion, and incorrect understandings of the way things are. Completely overcoming these three poisons leads to liberation from cyclic existence, compassion, joy, freedom, and happiness.

2. Forms of Buddhist Ethics

The lineages of Buddhism that have survived to the present day can be grouped into three traditions: Theravāda, Mahāyāna, and Vajrayāna. The Theravāda, or “Teaching of the Elders,” is the dominant form of Buddhism in Sri Lanka and in the Southeast Asian nations of Thailand, Cambodia, Burma, and Laos. The Mahāyāna, or “Great Way,” originated in India, but is now the principal form of Buddhism in the Chinese cultural sphere, which includes China, Japan, Korea, and Vietnam. East Asian forms of the Mahāyāna are outside the scope of this article, but we will discuss Indian texts from the early period of this tradition. The Vajrayāna, or “Diamond Way,” is practiced by Buddhists in the Himalayas and parts of Central Asia, including Tibet, Nepal, Bhutan, and Mongolia. A small number of Japanese Buddhists also belong to the Vajrayāna.

Both historically and doctrinally, the principal difference between the Theravāda and the Mahāyāna lies in the goals they recommend. Most Theravāda practitioners aspire to become Saints (Skt. Arhat, Pāli Arahant). The life in which someone becomes a Saint is that person’s last life; this person will no longer be reborn, but will instead enter Nirvana at death. A small minority of Theravādins, however, aspire to become Buddhas. As they understand that goal, a Buddha is someone who rediscovers the truths of Buddhism after they have been lost to the world, and teaches them to others so as to benefit them. The Theravāda tradition maintains that, like Saints, Buddhas pass into Nirvana at death. Becoming a Buddha is believed to be more difficult and take more time than becoming a Saint; it is a demanding path for a small minority. A practitioner who is on the way to becoming a Buddha is known in Sanskrit as a bodhisattva (Pāli bodhisatta).

By contrast, all serious Mahāyānists take the bodhisattva vow, promising to become Buddhas in order to help all beings. Indeed, some scholars have concluded that the Mahāyāna movement began within the framework of early Buddhism as a group of practitioners holding the same doctrines and embracing the same rituals as their fellow Buddhists, and distinguished only by their common choice to follow the path to Buddhahood. However, over time, many other differences evolved. In particular, mature Mahāyāna traditions tend to hold that those who have become Buddhas, even after they die, continue to manifest in various forms and in various parts of cyclic existence in order to carry on the work of benefiting beings. They will remain in cyclic existence until all sentient beings have reached liberation.

Followers of Vajrayāna also embrace the commitment to become Buddhas for the benefit of all beings. The Vajrayāna can be seen as a branch of the Mahāyāna, since it shares the same spiritual goal. The main differences between the Vajrayāna and other forms of Mahāyāna concern ritual, iconography, and meditation techniques. Those who practice Vajrayāna seek to attain Mahāyāna goals using Tantric means.

The Theravāda is the only surviving tradition of Buddhism that is not Mahāyāna. But at one time, there were many such traditions: eighteen, according to one influential classification. However, apart from the Theravāda, all of these traditions have died out. There is no generally accepted term to refer collectively to all the Buddhist lineages that held Sainthood as their primary spiritual aspiration. In Mahāyāna texts, these forms of Buddhism are called Hīnayāna, the “lesser vehicle”, a pejorative term. More neutrally, these texts sometimes refer to Buddhists who aspire to Sainthood as Disciples (Skt. Śrāvaka) and their path as the Way of the Disciples (Skt. Śrāvaka-yāna). Some scholars have proposed the term “Mainstream Buddhism.”

Mahāyāna texts repeatedly affirm the superiority of their approach to the non-Mahāyāna forms of Buddhist practice. According to these texts, the Disciples wish to attain Nirvana for themselves alone, so that they disregard the needs of others. Since they choose a less difficult path, their aspiration is inferior. Since they propose to abandon other beings trapped in the prison of cyclic existence, on this account, the Disciples lack compassion.

These criticisms may be unfair; it can be argued that they are directed at a straw man and not at the real Theravāda tradition. Most lineages of Buddhism, including the Theravāda, value and practice the Four Divine Abidings (Pāli brahma-vihāra), also known as the Four Immeasurables. These are lovingkindness (Pāli metta), compassion (karuṇā), joy (pamudita) and equanimity (upekkhā). The content of lovingkindness is a wish for others to be happy. Lovingkindness, which can be a very enjoyable state, is a kind of opening to others and to the reality of their lives. The content of compassion is a wish for others to be free from suffering. This quality makes it possible to be fully aware and present in the face of others’ suffering. Joy is traditionally understood as the ability to rejoice in the happiness and good qualities of others. To operate in someone, joy requires the absence of envy, jealousy and self-hatred. Equanimity makes it possible to see situations as they are, without preference or prejudice. It makes it possible to extend the other three Divine Abidings equally to all beings.

Most emotions that ordinary people experience are overcome or transformed by the path; someone who was fully awake would not abide in or act from greed, hatred, competitiveness, or pride, for example. But the Four Divine Abidings are emotions in which awake people rest and from which they act. Not only are these qualities recognized in the Theravāda, they are extensively practiced in that tradition. In fact, the Metta Sutta, the Discourse on Lovingkindness, is one of the most important and frequently recited scriptures in Southeast Asia today. Any discussion of similarities and differences between Theravāda and Mahāyāna should take these facts into account.

The Mahāyāna path to awakening, like many textual discussions of that path, is organized around the qualities known as the Six Perfections (Skt. pāramitā). The Six Perfections are:

  1. Generosity (dāna)
  2. Moral discipline (śīla)
  3. Patient endurance (kṣānti)
  4. Perseverance (vīrya)
  5. Meditative stability (dhyāna)
  6. Wisdom (prajñā)

Kṣānti, the third perfection, is a complex concept, difficult to render with a single English word. It has three main aspects. One is the ability to endure and maintain one’s calm and clarity of intention in the face of obstacles such as frustrations, delays, and unpleasant sensations. “Patience” would be a plausible translation for this aspect of kṣānti. The second, and most important, aspect of the perfection is the ability to remain peaceful, not becoming angry, when other people harm us or cause difficulties for us. This second and primary aspect could justify a translation as “forbearance”. When insulted, someone with strong moral discipline would not retaliate, but might become angry and restrain the expression of the anger; someone with strong patient endurance would not become angry in the first place. The term kṣānti is also often used to refer to the ability to remain calm and not react with fear or anger when hearing presentations of the ultimate truth, the way things really are.

Perseverance, the fourth perfection, is the ability to pour energy enthusiastically into constructive activities that benefit oneself and others. Meditative stability, the fifth perfection, is the ability to maintain clear, stable attention during meditation practice. Though thoughts may arise during meditation, they do not cause distraction in someone with strong meditative stability, but merely appear as movements of mind. Prajñā, which could be translated as “wisdom” or as “discernment,” is difficult to define and varies subtly in meaning among different Buddhist lineages. This quality allows those who have it to make distinctions between phenomena and to understand things as they actually are. It is often described as intuitively based and can only partially be put into words.

The term pāramitā, which I have been translating as “perfection,” could also be rendered as “transcendence.” In order to awaken fully, a bodhisattva must train in these qualities so deeply as to transcend how they are ordinarily understood. This is done by achieving what is known as “the threefold purity,” meaning that the bodhisattva does not regard either herself, the action being performed, or the object of that action as being a real, objectively existing thing. So, for example, someone who thinks that he has a substantial self and is giving real food to an objectively existing recipient would be showing worldly generosity. But someone who can give while regarding herself, the gift, and the recipient as like mirages, existing only from a certain point of view and not in objective reality, can practice the transmundane perfection of generosity. (On this see, e.g., Huntington trans. 1989, 150.)

3. Theoretical Structure of Buddhist Ethics

Buddhist texts don’t often take up the question of the general theoretical principles that differentiate between good and bad, or right and wrong; they more often tend to lay down a variety of particular moral rules, guidelines, virtues, and vices, and leave the matter there. But when the texts do address what differentiates right from wrong in general, they tend to focus on the consequences of our decisions and actions. Take, for instance, this passage from the Advice to Rāhula at Ambalaṭṭhikā:

When you reflect, if you know: ‘This action that I wish to do with the body would lead to my own affliction, or to the affliction of others, or to the affliction of both; it is an unwholesome bodily action with painful consequences, with painful results,’ then you definitely should not do such an action with the body. But when you reflect, if you know: ‘This action that I wish to do with the body would not lead to my own affliction, or to the affliction of others, or to the affliction of both; it is a wholesome bodily action with pleasant consequences, with pleasant results,’ then you may do such an action with the body. (Ñānamoli and Bodhi trans. 1995, 524–25)

This passage identifies the criterion of permissible action in terms of consequences, and in particular, consequences that consist of happiness and suffering. Passages such as this one suggest the possibility of regarding Theravāda ethics as having a consequentialist foundation.

Most Buddhist authors don’t say enough about the overall structure of their normative commitments to make it possible to attribute any particular ethical theory to them. One exception would be Śāntideva (late 7th-mid 8th century CE), whose writings contain a number of passages of great interest from the perspective of ethical theory. Perhaps the most revealing of these can be found in the Training Anthology (Śikṣā-samuccaya) at standard page 15 (see Goodman 2016a, 17). The passage reads:

If a bodhisattva does not make a sincere, unwavering effort in thought, word, and deed to stop all the present and future pain and suffering of all sentient beings, and to bring about all present and future pleasure and happiness, or does not seek the collection of conditions for that, or does not strive to prevent what is opposed to that, or does not bring about small pain and suffering as a way of preventing great pain and suffering, or does not abandon a small benefit in order to accomplish a greater benefit, if he neglects to do these things even for a moment, he undergoes a downfall.

Here Śāntideva focuses our attention on the future consequences that our actions can causally “stop” or “bring about”; at least in this passage, he seems to be advocating consequentialism. In particular, what Śāntideva is concerned with here is the experienced quality of certain feelings; he is trying to stop “pain and suffering” and bring about “pleasure and happiness.” Philosophers use the term “hedonism” to refer to the view that takes the presence of happiness and the absence of suffering to constitute well-being. Moreover, the view Śāntideva advocates is universalist, because it extends moral concern to all sentient beings. It’s fairly clear, moreover, that Śāntideva is an advocate of maximization: he regards it as mandatory to bring about a small amount of suffering to prevent a greater amount, and to sacrifice a small amount of happiness to achieve a larger amount. And since he does not say anything about constraints or important considerations arising from the distribution of happiness and suffering, the most plausible reading of this passage would involve accepting aggregation, in which the happiness and suffering of all beings are considered together, without attaching significance to how these are distributed. Now the ethical view called “classical utilitarianism” can be defined as aggregative, maximizing, universalist, hedonist consequentialism. This passage, then, can most naturally be interpreted as a statement of the classical utilitarian form of consequentialism.

Though this passage gives us strong reasons to accept that Śāntideva is committed to assigning impartial benevolence a central role in how we should live and behave toward others, a number of scholars have questioned whether we have enough evidence to interpret him as a utilitarian (e.g., Harris 2015). And as Michael Barnhart and others have argued, even if Śāntideva himself actually was a utilitarian, it does not follow that such a view can be attributed to the Buddhist tradition as a whole (Barnhart 2012, 19).

According to many of the world’s intellectual traditions, each person is a real, individual substance with a true essence or self. According to Buddhism, this widely held view is false; you are not a substance. Instead, all there is to a person is a complex, rapidly changing stream of mental and physical phenomena, connected by causal links and inextricably interrelated with the rest of the universe. This view is known as the doctrine of no self (Pāli anattā; Skt. anātman.) Śāntideva draws on this teaching to argue that egoism is irrational, and that we should work for the benefit of all sentient beings. As he writes, “Without exception, no sufferings belong to anyone. They are to be warded off simply because they are suffering. Why is any limitation put on this?” (Crosby and Skilton trans. 1995, 97) If you are not a real thing, there is no reason to place any greater intrinsic importance on preventing your own future suffering than on preventing the future suffering of others. As writers such as Mark Siderits (2003, ch. 9) have often noted, this strategy for justifying altruism, which some scholars now call the Ownerless Suffering Argument, closely resembles the arguments for consequentialism in Parfit 1984 (ch. 15). In fact, it’s hard to see how the Ownerless Suffering Argument could support any moral view that is not some form of universalist consequentialism.

From the perspective of this argument, your suffering has no greater significance than that of anyone else, but it also has no less. You are one of the many sentient beings whose welfare is to be promoted. Moreover, you may have more effective means available to advance your own happiness than you do to advance the happiness of others. And you often know much more about yourself than you do about others. So there is scope within this view to justify prudential concern for your own future; in the early and middle stages of the path, you may end up in practice spending more time taking care of your own future needs than those of others. This kind of prudential concern is compatible with the doctrine of no self, and is not the same as egoism. Here egoism would mean attaching more intrinsic significance to your own welfare than to that of others, or even disregarding others’ welfare and merely making an effort to promote your own. Buddhists would see egoism as reflecting a damaging lack of perception of the absence of self.

Any interpretation of Buddhist ethics must find room for the absolutely crucial role of intention. There are many contexts in which Buddhism seems to emphasize the intention with which an act was performed much more than the benefit or harm that actually resulted. One case often cited is that of Channa, who presented a gift of food to the Buddha which gave him dysentery and thus caused his death. Since Channa’s intention was to perform a meritorious act of generosity, the Buddha tells his followers not to condemn Channa; since he did not know that the food was contaminated, he actually gained goodness from this action.

Less dramatically, the amount of good or bad karma generated by an action is said to be strongly dependent on the motivation with which it was carried out. Thus actions performed out of hatred are more karmically damaging than those performed out of greed. Meanwhile, some Buddhist texts seem to say that any action performed with good intentions is a good action, whereas any action performed with bad intentions is a bad one. These suggestions may support a theoretical reconstruction that focuses more on motivation than on consequences.

As we will see in Section 6, most forms of Buddhism also take a strongly negative attitude to killing. Sometimes, this opposition is taken to an extent which may be difficult to justify from a consequentialist perspective. Many consequentialist theories, such as classical utilitarianism, notoriously make it much easier to justify killing than it would be on other moral perspectives. The most straightforward application of utilitarianism would imply that it is sometimes morally permissible to kill someone when doing so would bring about benefits or prevent harms sufficient to outweigh the value of the future existence that would otherwise be enjoyed by the person to be killed. Many Buddhists, especially in the Theravāda, would recoil from this implication and place a much higher standard on the justification of killing, if it can be justified at all. This issue poses a significant problem that a consequentialist interpretation needs to solve.

Another way of understanding Buddhist ethics is to read it as similar, not to consequentialism, but to virtue ethics. This account was first proposed by Damien Keown (in Keown 1992) and has since been followed by several scholars. The virtue ethics approach begins from the undoubted fact that Buddhist texts devote a great deal of attention to what kind of people we should strive to be and what virtues we should seek to cultivate in ourselves. In this respect, Buddhist ethics may seem more similar to the views of ancient Greek thinkers such as Aristotle than to more modern Western thought. For Aristotle, the goal we should aim at in life is eudaimonia, often translated “happiness” or “human flourishing.” This condition of eudaimonia is the good for humans. Keown argues that the role of Nirvana in Theravāda ethics is analogous: Nirvana is the good. The various abilities and virtues that are cultivated on the Buddhist path would then derive their value from their relation to this good, either as means to attaining Nirvana or as constituent aspects of the awakened life.

One way to settle the issue between consequentialist and virtue ethics interpretations of Buddhist teachings would be to identify the most fundamental aim of the Buddhist worldview. Is it the perfection of the individual’s character, as in virtue ethics, or the welfare of all sentient beings, as in universalist, welfarist consequentialism?

Now on a traditional Buddhist view, the Law of Karma says that those of our actions that are intended to harm others will evolve into misery for us, whereas those of our actions that are intended to benefit others will evolve into happiness for us. Moreover, the highest states of well-being we can attain are also characterized by lovingkindness and compassion for others. In all or nearly all cases, then, the action that is best for the agent and the action that is best for all beings will coincide, on this view. There is no deep conflict between self-interest and morality.

This is wonderful, if true, but it makes our theoretical task much harder. Should we say that the most fundamental aim of Buddhist practice is to benefit all sentient beings everywhere and advance their welfare, and that it so happens that the most effective way for each agent to do this is to work toward her own awakening? Or should we say that the most fundamental aim of practice is the practitioner’s own awakening, and that it so happens that pursuing this aim will turn out to benefit others as well?

Mahāyāna texts are full of passages that focus on the importance of the welfare of all beings and extol those who promote this goal. Therefore, the virtue ethics interpretation appears more plausible when applied to the Theravāda than when applied to the Mahāyāna. And in fact, Keown proposed his account primarily in relation to the Theravāda; he offers a rather different interpretation of the Mahāyāna, which in fact involves a certain kind of consequentialism. We should not necessarily assume that all forms of Buddhism have the same structure at the level of ethical theory.

It is possible to construct an interpretation that acknowledges the central importance of virtue and the cultivation of character in Buddhism within an overall framework that is consequentialist. One approach is character consequentialism, in which the good consequences that are to be maximized are defined by the welfare of sentient beings, and the welfare of sentient beings is understood to consist in both happiness and virtue. On this view, we have a non-instrumental reason to promote the virtue of ourselves and others. (This theory is defended at length in Goodman 2009.) Character consequentialism thus rejects hedonism, the view that identifies welfare with happiness, and advances a theory in which the good has two major components. This approach allows us to avoid some of the damaging philosophical objections that have been raised against hedonism. But it also creates questions about how to compare the value of greater virtue against the value of greater happiness, should these considerations ever conflict.

Another approach is aretaic consequentialism, an indirect form of consequentialism in which the primary objects of evaluation are character traits, not actions or rules. This theory tells us to develop in ourselves those states of character which are conducive to the happiness of sentient beings. (See Siderits 2007, 292–93) This elegant interpretation explains why Buddhist texts so often focus on character traits, but it also retains a hedonist view of well-being. It allows us to interpret instructions on moral discipline not as inflexible rules, but as advice about what traits of character to cultivate.

How plausible is it to interpret Buddhist authors as committed to a hedonist view of well-being––or indeed, to any view of well-being at all? South Asian Buddhist texts often use terms such as artha and hita that plausibly express the same concept as our term “well-being,” so it is reasonable to ask what account the authors of those texts might have given of what they meant. Given the central importance of the prevention of suffering in Buddhism, as expressed in such teachings as the First Noble Truth, it must be true that well-being in Buddhism includes freedom from suffering as, at least, one of its components. Meanwhile, given the strongly negative Buddhist view of desire, it would not be plausible at all to regard Buddhism as holding a desire-fulfillment theory of well-being.

However, hedonism is not our only interpretive option. Śāntideva claims in several passages that the Buddhist virtues work together and reinforce each other. This makes it possible to read him as holding a “homeostatic cluster” view of well-being like that of Richard Boyd (see Goodman 2016b, 149-152.) Those who defend the analogy between Buddhist ethics and Aristotelian virtue ethics could advance a nature-fulfillment theory as the proper interpretation of well-being in Buddhism. Mark Siderits (2007) rejects this interpretation on the grounds that it conflicts with the doctrine of no self, which implies that, ultimately, humans have no nature to fulfill. But Christopher Gowans has pointed out that, if we regard well-being as existing at the conventional level of truth, this objection may lose its force (see Gowans 2015, 117).

Another interpretation has been proposed by Javier Hidalgo (2022). Hidalgo claims that Buddhist ethics is best interpreted as Normative Gradualism. On this view, what one ought to do depends on where one is on the path to awakening. This interpretation helps to explain why multiple interpretations of Buddhist ethics seem plausible. Hidalgo’s account rests on a distinction between subjective and objective reasons. Importantly, subjective reasons can align with objective reasons, but for most of us our subjective reasons are clouded by false or inaccurate beliefs. For instance, our mistaken belief in the self provides us with a subjective reason for developing Buddhist virtues like patient forbearance (Skt. kṣānti). We can see an example of reasoning that seems to rely on the subjective belief in the self in Śāntideva’s work: “There is nothing which remains difficult if it is practised. So, through practice with minor discomforts, even major discomfort becomes bearable.” (Crosby and Skilton trans. 1995, 51). However, as we engage in Buddhist practice and progress along the path towards awakening, we will begin to see things as they actually are. As we begin to understand and see more clearly the doctrine of anātman, we will no longer be able to accept reasoning that relies on the existence of a self. Instead of focusing on developing virtues to develop our characters and reduce our own suffering, we will instead begin to treat all suffering as equally bad and something to be reduced wherever it occurs, employing an ethical system that more closely resembles consequentialism.

Some scholars, such as Charles Hallisey (1996) and Jay Garfield, have concluded that it is futile and misleading to try to interpret Buddhist ethics as a systematic theory fitting into one of the recognized types of ethical theories in the West. Rather, they suggest that Buddhist ethics is pluralist, in that it draws on various kinds of moral considerations in different cases, and particularist, rejecting the entire enterprise of formulating general moral principles to cover all cases. This view can easily accommodate textual evidence of various kinds of moral reasoning used by Buddhists in different situations. But since the resulting interpretation lacks an overarching structure, it has few theoretical resources to adjudicate conflicts between different values, and it may become quite unclear what the view says about particular difficult cases.

Buddhist texts say relatively little about metaethics, and attempts to construct metaethical views that would be consistent with Buddhist philosophical commitments have encountered many difficulties. One fascinating recent attempt to provide a metaethics for early Buddhism, in the work of Jake Davis (2016 and 2017), takes statements about what the wise would approve or criticize as indicating the source of ethical normativity. This kind of formulation is frequently encountered in canonical texts, as for instance in the Metta Sutta: “Let them not do the slightest thing that the wise would later reprove.” Buddhists accept that a mind that is calm, clear and stable sees the truth more accurately than disturbed, fluctuating ordinary consciousness. For Davis, the ethical truth just consists of those normative statements that would be accepted unanimously by those whose inner life exhibits, to a sufficient degree, these qualities of mental clarity and insight. Thus, on his view, even if the wise would often approve of taking actions that would have valuable consequences, it is not those consequences but the approval of the wise that makes those actions morally right.

Jonathan Gold (2023) provides another framework that can help make sense of the apparent tensions in Buddhist metaethics. The Buddhist skeptic that accepts the doctrine of emptiness asserts that every position, including ethical ones, can only be held relativistically. This is supported by Nāgārjuna’s Mūlamadhyamakakārikā, in which we are presented with a number of arguments that demonstrate how all views lead us to contradictions or absurd conclusions. However, we need not fall into nihilism. As Gold sees it, we can adopt a relativist position that acknowledges the distinction between conventional and ultimate truth and accepts that ethics is “always and only practical and psychological” (Gold 2023, 324). Ethics can be understood as a goal oriented practice not rooted in ultimate truth about the world, but in a collectively constructed practice geared towards making our existence less painful. While some worry that this would lead to a world where everything is permissible, Gold responds that those who come to accept relativism will have a much harder time holding views that appear morally reprehensible. In order for a relativist to think that one race is inferior to another, for instance, they would need to think both that their view is conditioned and not ultimately true and also that one race is naturally inferior to another. While not impossible, this view is psychologically difficult to maintain.

The theoretical structure of Buddhist ethics is a subject of continuing research and debate among a number of scholars, and further developments are likely in our understanding of this field.

4. Beyond Moral Discipline

Buddhist texts contain a large number of enigmatic statements, of various different types, seemingly to the effect that once a practitioner reaches a sufficiently advanced stage of spiritual development, moral discipline is no longer necessary. These statements have been interpreted in dramatically different ways by various Asian traditions, and Western scholars disagree about how we should understand them.

The Pāli Canon contains the claim that Saints have “abandoned goodness (puñña) and vile actions (pāpa).” Some writers have interpreted this statement as meaning that ethical norms no longer apply to Saints. But Damien Keown has argued quite convincingly against this interpretation (1992, ch. 4). “Goodness” and “vile actions” refer to actions which have karmic effects in the future, projecting a future existence that includes happiness or suffering, respectively. Since the life in which one becomes a Saint is one’s last life, it is impossible that any actions that occur after Sainthood is attained could project future existence through karma. The change which stops the accumulation of karma is most plausibly identified as the abandonment of clinging to the belief in a substantial self. Someone who no longer thinks of actions as stemming from and having effects on a real, persisting self is no longer trapped in cyclic existence.

Theravāda texts contain intriguing suggestions that Saints no longer have to worry about following rules of moral discipline; they just spontaneously act in appropriate ways. But there are also statements in Theravāda texts to the effect that a Saint would never knowingly and intentionally break any of the rules of monastic discipline. These rules forbid many actions which the Buddhist tradition regards as reprehensible merely by convention, such as eating after noon. If someone has not taken a vow that prohibits eating after noon, then doing so is not wrong: the wrongness of the action stems merely from the fact that it infringes a valuable system of discipline that the agent has chosen to undertake. If Saints just act spontaneously and aren’t psychologically bound by rules, it’s not clear why they would, in all circumstances, avoid actions which are wrong merely because they are forbidden by rules of monastic discipline. There seems to be a serious tension here.

Writers expounding Mahāyāna ethics face somewhat similar issues, but handle them rather differently. According to Mahāyāna philosophers such as Asaṅga and Śāntideva, an advanced practitioner who is motivated by compassion may sometimes see that an action which is forbidden by the usual rules of Buddhist moral discipline would actually be more effective at preventing suffering and promoting happiness than any action the rules would permit. Under such circumstances, that practitioner can permissibly break the rules out of compassion.

For example, Asaṅga tells us that it would be permissible to tell a lie to save another sentient being from being killed or seriously harmed. If someone takes up with bad friends, it would be permissible to criticize those friends to him, a case of divisive speech, in order to protect him from being corrupted by them. It would be permissible to overthrow a wicked king or remove a corrupt temple administrator from office. If a thief steals items belonging to the monastic community, it would be permissible to steal them back in order to protect him from the severe bad karma of consuming those items. In fact, if a bandit is planning to murder a large number of spiritually advanced beings, it would be permissible to kill the bandit preemptively, thus saving him from the terrible torment of aeons in the hells. In all such cases, according to Asaṅga, these acts, if done with the right kind of motivation, would result in much merit for the one who carries them out. (Tatz trans. 1986, 70–73)

One thing that many of these cases seem to have in common is that the rule-violating action proceeds from a compassion that includes in its scope not only the potential victims of the harms that are to be prevented, but also the perpetrator of those harms. When people hear of the Buddhist commitment to nonviolence, one question they often ask is whether someone with foreknowledge of the events of the 1940s would be permitted by Buddhist principles to assassinate Hitler in 1930. If we follow Asaṅga, the answer would seem to be: yes, you may kill Hitler, if you have compassion for him and you do it partly for his sake. Thus, in extreme cases, violence may be permissible; but hatred is never justified.

One way to understand Asaṅga’s view here would be to imagine that one of your loved ones, such as your brother or son, is slipped a drug which makes him temporarily insane, and he then attacks you with a knife. To remain passive and let him kill you would not be the best thing you could do for him. If you are able to knock him down, take the knife away and restrain him, you thereby protect him from a lifetime of regret and distress resulting from having killed you. This use of coercive force would therefore naturally flow from your love for him.

In addition to particular examples of permissible violations of the rules of moral discipline, both Asaṅga and Śāntideva give us general statements about when the rules should be broken. These statements are strikingly consequentialist in flavor. Thus Asaṅga tells us this: “If the bodhisattva sees that some caustic means, some use of severity would be of benefit to sentient beings, and does not employ it in order to guard against unhappiness, he is possessed of fault, possessed of contradiction; there is fault that is not defiled” (Tatz trans., 1986, 76). Śāntideva’s view is similar; he writes: “Realizing this, one should always be striving for others’ well-being. Even what is proscribed is permitted for a compassionate person who sees it will be of benefit.” (Crosby and Skilton trans., 1995, 41). According to these statements, an agent who is truly motivated by compassion can break the usually applicable rules of moral discipline whenever doing so would benefit those involved in the situation.

Several Mahāyāna texts, then, allow for certain cases in which advanced practitioners may violate the rules of moral discipline. Texts from the Vajrayāna, or Tantric, traditions of Buddhism go further than this. Revered Tantric masters such as Nāropa, Kukkurīpa, and Padmasambhava are shown engaging in shocking actions that flagrantly violate the conventions of society and the rules of Buddhist moral discipline. But these stories do not necessarily mean that the Vajrayāna rejects all forms of ethics. Numerous texts make it clear that even as they break the rules, Tantric adepts are motivated by compassion for all sentient beings. They see that given the situation, unconventional and even grotesque actions are the most effective means to bring about the welfare of others. Since they are totally free of all bonds of ideology or social conditioning, they spontaneously do what will be best on the whole, without worrying about what others might think or what the rulebook might say. They have transcended moral discipline completely, while remaining, in a deeper sense, ethical exemplars.

5. Animals and the Environment

Like several other Asian traditions, Buddhism does not regard humans as fundamentally different from other animals. Through the process of rebirth, what is in some sense the same entity can be a human now, but an animal in the past and in the future. One consequence of this claim is that any animal you meet is likely to have been a human at one time, and may even have been your own mother in a previous life. Moreover, animals are seen as just as capable of suffering as humans are; they are also appropriate objects of the emotions of compassion, lovingkindness and equanimity. Thus we have powerful reasons not to cause them unnecessary suffering and to refrain from harming or killing them.

Though animals are sentient beings and possess consciousness, just as humans do, there is one reason why human lives are more precious than animal lives. Only in a human body can one attain awakening; in an animal body, this is not possible. Therefore, Buddhists maintain that it is worse to kill a human than to kill an animal.

Though all Buddhist traditions attach moral significance to animal life and animal suffering, not all Buddhists practice vegetarianism. For example, Theravāda monks, who live by begging, are expected to eat whatever food is placed in their bowl, including meat, without preference or discrimination. However, they are forbidden to eat meat from an animal if they have seen, heard, or suspected that the animal in question was killed specifically for them.

Some sources in the Buddhist tradition hold that it is worse to kill an animal yourself than to eat the meat of an animal someone else has killed. Many faithful Buddhists go to great lengths not to kill animals. Moreover, the professions of hunting and fishing are classified as “wrong livelihood,” and Buddhists are expected not to follow them. In majority Buddhist countries, butchers are often members of non-Buddhist religious minorities.

Before the time of the historical Buddha, animal sacrifice was an important part of Indian religious practice. The Buddha expressed his unqualified opposition to animal sacrifice, holding that far from creating religious merit, it would only produce bad karma for those engaged in it. As a result of his teachings, along with those of Mahāvīra, the founder of Jainism, ideals of nonviolence became more prevalent in India, and animal sacrifice declined rapidly in frequency and prestige. Among a few marginal Buddhist or quasi-Buddhist groups in the Himalayas, animal sacrifice is still practiced today; but Buddhist monastic institutions have fairly consistently opposed the killing of animals for religious purposes.

Most Buddhist texts hold that plants are not sentient beings and do not have moral status in and of themselves. Although a few scattered sources suggest that plants might be sentient, the mainstream of the tradition sees it as morally unproblematic in itself to use, kill, or eat plants. However, since animals depend on plants, there are sometimes instrumental reasons to protect plants for the sake of animal welfare. We do find guidance, for example, to be careful in cutting down trees to refrain from harming the animals who live in and around them. In Southeast Asia, some Buddhist monks have been very active in protecting forests from logging.

Buddhism does not see a great gulf between humans and non-human animals, as some adherents of Western religions do; the suffering of animals is morally significant, just like the suffering of humans. Moreover, Buddhist theories of causality stress that things arise in dependence on a diverse collection of causes and conditions, implying that human life is interdependent in complex ways with other forms of life on Earth. And as mentioned above, the cultivation of lovingkindness and compassion for all sentient beings is an important part of most systems of Buddhist meditation practice. As a result of these teachings, many contemporary Buddhists, especially in the West, place great value on ecological awareness and environmental sustainability. They seek to develop a way of life for humanity that supports spiritual practice and can coexist in harmony with the non-human animals who share our planet.

6. War, Violence and Punishment

The Buddhist tradition generally sees war and violence as deeply morally problematic. War is seen as tragic and typically unnecessary, and the position of a soldier is seen as highly karmically dangerous. Violence directly causes harm and suffering to sentient beings, pollutes the minds of those who use it, and creates cycles of hatred and retribution that can inflict terrible damage, both physical and psychological.

In general, the Buddhist attitude toward violence is expressed in verses X. 1–2 of the Dhammapada:

Everybody fears being struck by a rod.
Everybody fears death.
Therefore, knowing this, feeling for others as for yourself,
Do not kill others or cause others to kill.
Everybody fears being struck by a rod,
Life being dear to all.
Therefore, knowing this, feeling for others as for yourself,
Do not kill others or cause others to kill.
(Maitreya, trans, 1995, 37)

The phrase translated “feeling for others as for yourself” is the Pāli attānaṃ upamaṃ katvā, which might be more literally rendered as “having made an analogy with oneself.” Here a form of moral reasoning is used that is quite similar to the Golden Rule: imaginatively put yourself in the place of others, and you will see that certain ways of treating them are morally impermissible. The Dhammapada also tells us:

Whoever withholds the rod from creatures
Both weak and strong,
Abstaining from killing and causing killing
Him do I call a Noble One.
(Maitreya, trans, 1995, 107)

Buddhists explicitly reject the Hindu teaching that a soldier in a just war will be reborn in a heavenly realm. Instead, Buddhists hold that those who die in battle are likely to be reborn as animals or in the hells, especially if they die with a feeling of anger or hatred toward the soldiers on the other side. In his commentary on the Four Hundred Stanzas (Catuḥśataka) of Āryadeva, Candrakīrti expresses a very low opinion of those who give their lives in battle for their king and country: “In this world people who give up all of their possessions for gambling, liquor, and prostitutes are not entitled to respect. Virtuous-minded people do not honor the sacrifice of these people, since they pursue an addiction. In the same way, the sacrifice of life in battle should not be respected, since this is the basis for harmful actions” (Lang trans., 2003, 200). He also criticizes the view that kings may permissibly engage in warfare, and offers what looks like a general statement of pacifism: “a sage is inferior when his treatises explain violence as virtuous behavior. A mediocre sage has doubts: ‘it may be so or it may not be so.’ A superior sage does not regard violence as virtuous behavior” (Lang trans., 2003, 197).

Buddhist monks, especially in the Theravāda tradition, are expected to practice a strict form of non-violence; they should prefer being killed to killing others, and should even practice lovingkindness and compassion toward those who harm them or their families. The Buddha himself is said to have mediated a dispute over water rights between two neighboring kingdoms, preventing it from escalating into an armed conflict. In troubled times, Buddhist monks have often sought opportunities to bring about peace and the resolution of conflict through dialogue. Normative Buddhist texts praise the role of peacemaker and an attitude of impartial benevolence toward all parties to a conflict (see, e.g., Thurman trans. 2000, 70). The Buddhist attitude toward war is thus quite negative, and passages glorifying military victory or sanitizing the realities of warfare are hard to find in texts.

Nevertheless, the common perception of Buddhism as a whole as an unequivocally pacifist tradition is questionable. Many forms of Buddhism have arrived at the position that in rare cases, war may be necessary.

One way that Buddhist ethical theory might be used, in certain extreme cases, to justify war relies on Asaṅga’s account of justifiable killing, discussed in section 4 above. For example, if the officials of a militarily powerful state, monitoring the situation in a small developing country, see that a genocide has begun to take place there, they might reflect that those who are now committing genocide are not only causing terrible harm to their victims, but also accumulating severe negative karma for themselves. These officials might decide to intervene to stop the genocide, motivated by compassion for everyone involved, including the killers. If they are sincerely motivated in this way, Mahāyāna Buddhists might see their actions as acceptable, even if they involved using military force and killing many people, because less suffering would result and the overall consequences would therefore be much better.

As Stephen Jenkins has shown in an important recent article, a number of influential Mahāyāna texts provide arguments of this general type. Both Candrakīrti and Nāgārjuna offer the example “of a physician, certainly one of the most important and pervasive metaphors for a bodhisattva, amputating a finger that has been bitten by a poisonous snake, thus preventing the spread of greater suffering” (Jenkins 2011, 12). Candrakīrti then develops this theme through another example,

of a hunter who kills one of his sons to prevent both from dying. The two sons are arguing at the edge of a precipice and one of them grabs the other with the intention of hurling them both over. Since he cannot reach them, and so has no other option, the hunter shoots one son with an arrow to prevent them both from dying. This case shows a concern for reducing the proportional extent of harm, as in the example of amputation (Jenkins 2011, 15–16).
How could the permissibility of shooting one son to save both be reconciled with the seemingly pacifist statements offered elsewhere by Candrakīrti? Jenkins suggests (at 2011, 13) that we can see the passages as consistent if we realize that the Sanskrit word himsā, though translated by Lang and many other writers as “violence,” does not exactly correspond to our concept of violence, and is somewhat closer in meaning to “harm.” In killing one son to save both, it can be argued that the hunter does not harm anyone, since the son who was shot with an arrow would have died anyway. Similarly, killing thugs intent on genocide would clearly be an example of violence, but we would not necessarily describe it as a harmful act, and it may not count as himsā.

Several Mahāyāna scriptures also contain statements inconsistent with an unqualified pacifism. For instance, the Mahā-parinirvāṇa Sūtra states that it is permissible for someone with a pure intention to kill those who persecute Buddhism (Jenkins 2011, 18). Another scriptural text, the Range of the Bodhisattva (ārya-bodhisattva-gocara), explicitly endorses defensive warfare, when carried out with strict limitations and in order to protect the people:

Although in war, injury and death may be inflicted on the opposing army, a ruler by his skillful means will commit less unspeakable and less nonvirtuous action and may not necessarily experience retribution, since he undertook such measures with heedfulness and compassion. (Jamspal trans. 2010, 61)

In practice, Buddhist societies have not always refrained from war. For example, in Sri Lanka, Buddhist monks and rulers have endorsed the use of military force to defend their island, seen as a sacred land and a sanctuary for the Buddhist religion, against Hindu invaders from South India. During the recent civil war, similar justifications were used to defend the use of military measures against separatist rebels, mostly Hindus belonging to the Tamil minority. In general, Buddhist kings in many parts of the world, including Southeast and Central Asia, have called on their military forces to resist foreign invasions.

Buddhist discussions of the ethics of punishment are fairly rare, but there is an important passage about punishment in the Precious Garland (Ratnāvalī), a letter to a king from the great Buddhist philosopher Nāgārjuna. Whether or not Buddhist ethics in general is consequentialist, the theory of punishment Nāgārjuna presents is clearly a consequentialist one. To maintain social order, punishment is a regrettable necessity. But the king should not punish out of anger or a desire for revenge. Instead, he should inflict punishment out of compassion, especially compassion for the criminals themselves, whose destructive actions may have condemned them to many lifetimes of suffering. (See Hopkins 1998 for a translation of the text and Goodman 2009, ch. 9, for discussion.)

Moreover, punishment should be as mild as is consistent with achieving the goal of restraining crime. Prisoners should be treated well and held under humane conditions. Moreover, those prisoners who are physically weak, and therefore pose less danger to society, should be released early. It’s fairly clear that Nāgārjuna would reject retributivist theories of punishment, which hold that prisoners should be punished because they deserve to suffer or in order to take away any unjust advantage they may have gained by their actions. From the point of view of retributivism, the physical strength or weakness of prisoners is irrelevant to how much punishment they deserve. Moreover, some forms of retributivism, especially cruder, popular versions, would endorse harsh conditions of punishment in order to ensure that prisoners have to undergo the degree of suffering that they deserve.

Just as Asaṅga’s theory can be used to justify certain kinds of military action, it could also help justify punishment. Punishment can have a number of beneficial effects: it can incapacitate criminals, physically preventing them from repeating their crimes; it can deter criminals, inducing them to follow the law from fear of further punishment; it can rehabilitate criminals by giving them education and skills that provide them with better options than a life of crime; sometimes, it can even reform criminals, helping them change their character to become better people, so that they will no longer wish to commit crimes. These good effects of punishment benefit society, since they reduce the crime rate; but from a Buddhist point of view, they also benefit criminals themselves by preventing them from creating more bad karma. Thus punishment can be motivated by compassion for both criminals and their victims, and so it could be acceptable in Buddhist ethics.

Some people see Buddhism as maintaining unqualified pacifism and rejecting violence completely in general. In fact, some Buddhist scriptures and treatises do allow for extreme cases in which compassionately motivated punishment, violence, and even war could be justified. They reserve their unqualified opposition for the reactive emotions that often lead to violence, such as anger, hatred, malice, and the desire for revenge. Buddhists should cultivate lovingkindness and compassion for everyone, even those guilty of the worst actions, and even while recognizing that some people need to be forcibly restrained from doing even more damage. In a world that has been so terribly scarred by violence and cruelty, the Buddhist rejection of most forms of warfare seems wise and appropriate. But in a complicated world of difficult choices, allowing for the necessity of violence in rare instances may be difficult to avoid.

7. Abortion and Euthanasia

There is considerable controversy about the moral status of abortion in Buddhist ethics, with the majority of writers taking a pro-life position. The basic premise of the traditional understanding of abortion in Buddhism is that reincarnation is a discrete event which happens at the time of conception. This claim can be found in discussions of reincarnation in prestigious sources such as the Treasury of Metaphysics (Abhidharma-kośa) of Vasubandhu. It implies that an embryo, even during the first week of pregnancy, is a human being. As discussed in section 5, what is distinctively valuable about human life is the possibility of awakening. When the life of a fetus is taken through abortion, this possibility is foreclosed. It follows that abortion is seriously wrong, almost as serious as the deliberate murder of an adult. This is the view of most Buddhists on the mainland of Asia today.

It’s important to keep in mind that the technological and social context of abortion has changed dramatically since the time when the Pāli Canon was composed. Today, a woman might be informed by her doctor that the fetus she is carrying suffers from a severe genetic abnormality; if she gives birth, her baby will live for a few days or a few months in great pain before its inevitable early death. At the time of the Buddha, medical technology was obviously far too undeveloped to make such a situation possible. In the Pāli Canon, many of the cases that involve abortion relate to a woman in a polygamous marriage who is jealous of her co-wife’s pregnancy and wishes to cause her rival to miscarry. Buddhist teachers who formulated a blanket prohibition on abortion with this latter type of case in mind might reconsider if they were aware of the former type of case.

Unlike some other world religions, Buddhism does not have any moral objection to contraception. Thus Buddhists could easily agree to support programs to reduce the need for abortion by making contraception more widely available and educating people in its use.

Some Buddhists might question the premise that a human being exists from the time of conception onward. Some Buddhists in the contemporary West do not read the traditional teachings about reincarnation literally, and so would not have reason to accept that reincarnation happens at the moment of conception. Moreover, there are scientific reasons to believe that consciousness does not begin until at least the twentieth week of pregnancy (McMahan 2002, 267). There can be no reincarnation without consciousness. If we want both to believe in reincarnation and to accept what science tells us about the physical bases of consciousness, we should perhaps hold that reincarnation is a gradual process that slowly brings about a new conscious being that is connected with one who has recently died. This concept of a gradual beginning of life may be counterintuitive in some respects, but it harmonizes well with the fundamental Buddhist doctrine of no self. If we accept this understanding, then early abortion would not constitute killing a sentient being.

Despite these counterarguments, most Buddhists today would accept that, in their ethical system, abortion is morally wrong. It does not necessarily follow that they would advocate making abortion illegal. In many ways, it is contrary to the spirit of Buddhism to impose Buddhist values on others by force. Buddhists were early advocates of religious toleration, and the political environment of India before the Islamic invasions was mostly quite a tolerant one in practice. Moreover, Buddhist states have usually not chosen to prohibit such practices as slaughtering and eating animals, even when their rulers have held that these practices are immoral. Some writers have argued that due to the severity of the offense of killing a human, abortion in particular should not be legally tolerated by Buddhist societies (for example, see Harvey 2000, 342–350). In fact, in some Buddhist countries, such as Japan, abortion is legal; in others, it is technically illegal, but the law is not strictly enforced. In a diverse society where the moral status of fetuses is controversial, a strict prohibition on abortion is likely to be difficult and costly to enforce, and doing so would lead to intense social controversy, alienating people from their own government. The inevitable use of coercion and violence in law enforcement, in the form of police and prisons, itself represents a grave karmic cost of imposing any penal law on segments of the population who do not accept it as legitimate. Thus many of the reasons internal to the Buddhist tradition that could be used to argue in favor of religious toleration would also seem to support a legal regime that permits abortion, even if Buddhist ethical views imply that abortion is wrong.

The Buddhist tradition is less strongly opposed to suicide than some other world religions. For a young, healthy person to complete suicide is seen unequivocally as a destructive action. Yet the texts have a perspective of greater ambivalence and complexity toward the suicide of the gravely ill. Nevertheless, since the overall outlook of their religion encourages Buddhists to value life and oppose killing, they tend to be quite concerned about the moral status of euthanasia and assisted suicide.

Traditional Buddhist beliefs imply that to die mindfully, with full awareness of the processes of death, is a powerful spiritual practice. The vivid, direct experience of impermanence and the strong sense of non-attachment that result from dying this way could contribute profoundly to the spiritual progress of that person in future lives. This consideration motivates some Buddhists to allow death to take its natural course, neither hastening it through suicide nor putting it off briefly through desperate measures of little benefit. Those who lack the needed depth of spiritual training may not be able to die mindfully, and therefore may be better candidates for aggressive medical intervention to prolong life. Even for them, though, the chaos, excitement, confusion and fear of dying in the midst of aggressive medical intervention may increase the risk of an unfavorable rebirth. If the intervention promises no more than a chance of a few more hours or days of life, with no hope of a genuine recovery, those who believe in future lives may see it as a poor option.

The very strong emphasis on the relief of suffering we find in Buddhist ethics might lead us to conclude that Buddhists should favor assisted suicide or euthanasia when a patient is in severe pain, wants to die, but is unable to complete suicide due to physical limitations. A doctor who carries out such procedures, though, even with the consent of the patients involved, is in a karmically perilous position. If the doctor’s motives for killing terminal patients are in any way impure, the karmic consequences could be very serious. The same applies to family members who cause the death of their relative while motivated, even in part, by greed or by dislike of that person.

For more information on these issues, see the detailed and helpful discussion by Peter Harvey (Harvey 2000, 286–310). The questions of euthanasia and assisted suicide involve several important Buddhist values which may be in tension with each other. In looking at these matters from a Buddhist perspective, we are unlikely to find any easy answers.

8. AI and Technology

AI and technology have been receiving more attention by philosophers and an entire industry has arisen that generates profit through capturing people’s attention, often referred to as the attention economy. AI plays a crucial part in capturing attention for the purpose of generating profit. In Buddhist ethics, attention pays a central role and thus can offer insight into the moral dimensions of the attention economy.

One dominant criticism directed towards the attention economy is what some call the libertarian critique (Bombaerts et al., 2023). On this criticism, attention is seen as a valuable and scarce commodity that needs to be protected from being unjustifiably taken. However, from a Buddhist ethical perspective we should see attention not as a commodity, but as a practice (Bombaerts et al. 2023, 25). We can look to right attention and the eightfold path to better understand how attention functions morally. Right attention, or right mindfulness (Skt. samyak smṛti, Pāli samma sati), is the practice of staying focused without confusion, attachment, or distraction. Buddhist ethical theories largely converge on the idea that attachment is the locus of wrong action, so right attention is essential for acting rightly. Without right attention, one stands little chance of doing the right thing. If attention is a practice that can be done rightly or wrongly, then the way we criticize the attention economy must shift. Attention as a practice requires not just resisting technological nudges, but making a distinction between right and wrong attention and asking ourselves what promotes the former and reduces the latter (Bombaerts et al., 2023).

Another development in the Buddhist ethics of AI concerns privacy. The emergence of the attention economy can be explained by what Shoshana Zuboff calls surveillance capitalism (Zuboff, 2018). Surveillance capitalism is primarily fueled by a logic that views behavioral data as a raw material that can be harvested, packaged, and sold. This logic naturally gives rise to concerns related to privacy. Privacy is often thought to be important based on the assumption that some information is closely tied to what makes a person themselves. Each of us has a right to privacy over this information as a matter of human dignity. However, from a Buddhist perspective, nothing can be thought of as intrinsically private, and no information can be thought of as belonging to anyone, even behavioral data. This is one of the logical implications of emptiness. In a view proposed by Bryce Goodman (Goodman, 2023), the primary reason Buddhist ethics advises us to be suspicious of surveillance capitalism is not that it violates our privacy, but rather that it distorts our perception and exacerbates the primary causes of suffering, namely ignorance, craving, and aversion.

The moral concerns that AI, social media, and other forms of information technology present to us are sure to grow in both scope and complexity, and an increasing number of scholars and Buddhist practitioners are exploring these concerns and seeking to develop wise and compassionate responses.


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  • Goodman, Bryce, 2023, “Privacy without Persons: A Buddhist Critique of Surveillance Capitalism,” AI and Ethics, 3(3): 781–792.
  • Goodman, Charles, 2009, Consequences of Compassion: An Interpretation and Defense of Buddhist Ethics, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2016a, The Training Anthology of Śāntideva: A Translation of the Śikṣā-samuccaya, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2016b, “From Madhyamaka to Consequentialism,” in The Cowherds, Moonpaths: Ethics and Emptiness, New York: Oxford University Press, pp. 141–158.
  • Gowans, Christopher, 2016, Buddhist Moral Philosophy: An Introduction, New York: Routledge.
  • Hallisey, Charles, 1996, “Ethical Particularism in Theravāda Buddhism,” Journal of Buddhist Ethics, 3: 32–43.
  • Harris, Stephen, 2015, “On the Classification of Śāntideva’s Ethics in the Bodhicaryāvatāra,” Philosophy East and West 65(1): 249–275.
  • Harvey, Peter, 2000, An Introduction to Buddhist Ethics, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Hidalgo, Javier, 2022, “Buddhist Ethics as a Path: A Defense of Normative Gradualism,” Philosophy East and West, 72(2): 355–374.
  • Hopkins, Jeffrey, trans, 1998, Buddhist Advice for Living & Liberation: Nāgārjuna’s Precious Garland, Ithaca, NY: Snow Lion.
  • Huntington, C. W., trans, 1989, The Emptiness of Emptiness: An Introduction to Early Indian Mādhyamika, Honolulu: University of Hawai‘i Press.
  • Jamspal, Lozang, trans, 2010, The Range of the Bodhisattva, a Mahāyāna Sūtra, New York: American Institute of Buddhist Studies.
  • Jenkins, Stephen, 2011, “On the Auspiciousness of Compassionate Violence,” Journal of the International Association of Buddhist Studies, 33(1–2): 299–331.
  • Keown, Damien, 1992, The Nature of Buddhist Ethics, New York: Palgrave.
  • Lang, Karen, trans, 2003, Four Illusions: Candrakīrti’s Advice for Travelers on the Bodhisattva Path, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Maher, Derek F, 2008, “The Rhetoric of War in Tibet: Toward a Buddhist Just War Theory,” Political Theology, 9(2): 179–191.
  • Maitreya, Ananda, trans, 1995, The Dhammapada, Berkeley, CA: Parallax Press.
  • McLeod, Ken, 2002, Wake Up To Your Life: Discovering the Buddhist Path of Attention, New York: HarperCollins.
  • McMahan, Jeff, 2002, The Ethics of Killing: Problems at the Margins of Life, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Ñānamoli and Bodhi, trans, 1995, The Middle Length Discourses of the Buddha: A New Translation of the Majjhima Nikāya, Boston: Wisdom Publications.
  • Parfit, Derek. 1984. Reasons and Persons. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Siderits, Mark, 2003, Personal Identity and Buddhist Philosophy: Empty Persons, Burlington, VT: Ashgate.
  • –––, 2007, “Buddhist Reductionism and the Structure of Buddhist Ethics,” in P. Bilimoria, J. Prabhu, and R. Sharma (eds.), Indian Ethics: Classical Traditions and Contemporary Challenges, vol. 1, pp. 283–296, Burlington, VT: Ashgate.
  • Tatz, Mark, trans, 1986, Asanga’s Chapter on Ethics With the Commentary of Tsong-Kha-Pa, The Basic Path to Awakening, The Complete Bodhisattva, Lewiston/Queenston: Edwin Mellen Press.
  • Thurman, Robert, trans, 2000, The Holy Teaching of Vimalakīrti: A Mahāyāna Scripture, University Park, PA: Pennsylvania State University Press.
  • Walshe, Maurice, trans, 1995, The Long Discourses of the Buddha: A Translation of the Dīgha Nikāya, Boston: Wisdom Publications.
  • Zuboff, Shoshana, 2018, The Age of Surveillance Capitalism: The Fight For a Human Future at the New Frontier of Power, New York: PublicAffairs.

Other Internet Resources

  • Journal of Buddhist Ethics, online journal, an important venue for research in this field.
  • Access to Insight, a website providing translations of numerous scriptures from the Pāli Canon of the Theravāda tradition.
  • The 37 Practices of a Bodhisattva, an excellent translation by Ken McLeod of a short Tibetan Buddhist text explaining the practices and ethics of Mahayana Buddhism.

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