Social Networking and Ethics
In the first decade of the 21st century, new media technologies for social networking such as Facebook, MySpace, Twitter and YouTube began to transform the social, political and informational practices of individuals and institutions across the globe, inviting a philosophical response from the community of applied ethicists and philosophers of technology. While this scholarly response continues to be challenged by the rapidly evolving nature of social networking technologies, the urgent need for attention to this phenomenon is underscored by the fact that it is reshaping how many human beings initiate and/or maintain virtually every type of ethically significant social bond or role: friend-to-friend, parent-to-child, co-worker-to co-worker, employer-to-employee, teacher-to-student, neighbor-to-neighbor, seller-to-buyer, and doctor-to-patient, to offer just a partial list. Nor are the ethical implications of these technologies strictly interpersonal. The complex web of interactions between social networking service users and their online and offline communities, social network developers, corporations, governments and other institutions—along with the diverse and sometimes conflicting motives and interests of these various stakeholders—will continue to require rigorous philosophical analysis for decades to come.
Section 1 of the entry outlines the history and working definition of social networking services (hereafter referred to as SNS). Section 2 identifies the early philosophical foundations of reflection on the ethics of online social networks, leading up to the emergence of Web 2.0 standards (supporting user interactions) and full-fledged SNS. Section 3 reviews the primary ethical topic areas around which philosophical reflections on SNS have, to date, converged: privacy; identity and community; friendship, virtue and the good life; democracy and the public sphere; and cybercrime. Finally, Section 4 reviews some of the metaethical issues potentially impacted by the emergence of SNS.
- 1. History and Definitions of Social Networking Services
- 2. Early Philosophical Concerns about Online Social Networks
- 3. Contemporary Ethical Concerns about Social Networking Services
- 3.1 Social Networking Services and Privacy
- 3.2 The Ethics of Identity and Community on Social Networking Services
- 3.3 Friendship, Virtue and the Good Life on Social Networking Services
- 3.4 Democracy, Freedom and Social Networking Services in the Public Sphere
- 3.5 Social Networking Services and Cybercrime
- 4. Social Networking Services and Metaethical Issues
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
‘Social networking’ is an inherently ambiguous term requiring some clarification. Human beings have been socially ‘networked’ in one manner or another for as long as we have been on the planet, and we have historically availed ourselves of many successive techniques and instruments for facilitating and maintaining such networks. These include structured social affiliations and institutions such as private and public clubs, lodges and churches as well as communications technologies such as postal and courier systems, telegraphs and telephones. When philosophers speak today, however, of ‘Social Networking and Ethics’, they usually refer more narrowly to the ethical impact of an evolving and loosely defined group of information technologies, most based on or inspired by the ‘Web 2.0’ software standards that emerged in the first decade of the 21st century.
Prior to the emergence of Web 2.0 standards, the computer had already served for decades as a medium for various forms of social networking, beginning in the 1970s with social uses of the U.S. military’s ARPANET and evolving to facilitate thousands of Internet newsgroups and electronic mailing lists, BBS (bulletin board systems), MUDs (multi-user dungeons) and chat rooms dedicated to an eclectic range of topics and social identities (Barnes 2001; Turkle 1995). These early computer social networks were systems that grew up organically, typically as ways of exploiting commercial, academic or other institutional software for more broadly social purposes. In contrast, Web 2.0 technologies evolved specifically to facilitate user-generated, collaborative and shared Internet content, and while the initial aims of Web 2.0 software developers were still largely commercial and institutional, the new standards were designed explicitly to harness the already-evident potential of the Internet for social networking. Most notably, Web 2.0 social interfaces have redefined the social topography of the Internet by enabling users to build increasingly seamless connections between their online social presence and their existing social networks offline—a trend that has begun to shift the Internet away from its original function as a haven for largely anonymous or pseudonymous identities forming sui generis social networks (Ess 2011).
Among the first websites to employ the new standards explicitly for general social networking purposes were Orkut, MySpace, LinkedIn, Friendster, Bebo, Habbo and Facebook. More recent and specific trends in online social networking include the rise of sites dedicated to media sharing (YouTube, Flickr, Instagram, Vine), microblogging (Tumblr, Twitter), location-based networking (Foursquare, Loopt, Yelp, YikYak) and interest-sharing (Pinterest).
The study of the ethical implications of SNS can be considered a subpart of Computer and Information Ethics (Bynum 2018). While Computer and Information Ethics certainly accommodates an interdisciplinary approach, the direction and problems of that field have largely been defined by philosophically-trained scholars. Yet this has not been the early pattern for the ethics of social networking. Partly due to the temporal coincidence of the social networking phenomenon with emerging empirical studies of the patterns of use and effects of computer-mediated-communication (CMC), a field now called ‘Internet Studies’ (Consalvo and Ess, 2011), the ethical implications of social networking technologies were initially targeted for inquiry by a loose coalition of sociologists, social psychologists, anthropologists, ethnographers, media scholars and political scientists (see, for example, Giles 2006; Boyd 2007; Ellison et al. 2007; Ito 2009). Consequently, those philosophers who have turned their attention to social networking and ethics have had to decide whether to pursue their inquiries independently, drawing only from traditional philosophical resources in applied computer ethics and the philosophy of technology, or to develop their views in consultation with the growing body of empirical data and conclusions already being generated by other disciplines. While this entry will primarily confine itself to reviewing existing philosophical research on social networking ethics, links between those researches and studies in other disciplinary contexts continue to be highly significant.
Among the first philosophers to take an interest in the ethical significance of social uses of the Internet were phenomenological philosophers of technology Albert Borgmann and Hubert Dreyfus. These thinkers were heavily influenced by Heidegger’s (1954/1977) view of technology as a monolithic force with a distinctive vector of influence, one that tends to constrain or impoverish the human experience of reality in specific ways. While Borgmann and Dreyfus were primarily responding to the immediate precursors of Web 2.0 social networks (e.g., chat rooms, newsgroups, online gaming and email), their conclusions, which aim at online sociality broadly construed, are directly relevant to SNS.
Borgmann’s early critique (1984) of modern technology addressed what he called the device paradigm, a technologically-driven tendency to conform our interactions with the world to a model of easy consumption. By 1992’s Crossing the Postmodern Divide, however, Borgmann had become more narrowly focused on the ethical and social impact of information technologies, employing the concept of hyperreality to critique (among other aspects of information technology) the way in which online social networks may subvert or displace organic social realities by allowing people to “offer one another stylized versions of themselves for amorous or convivial entertainment” (1992, 92) rather than allowing the fullness and complexity of their real identities to be engaged. While Borgmann admits that in itself a social hyperreality seems “morally inert” (1992, 94), he insists that the ethical danger of hyperrealities lies in their tendency to leave us “resentful and defeated” when we are forced to return from their “insubstantial and disconnected glamour” to the organic reality which “with all its poverty inescapably asserts its claims on us” by providing “the tasks and blessings that call forth patience and vigor in people.” (1992, 96) This contrast between the “glamour of virtuality” and the “hardness of reality” continues to be a motif in his 1999 book Holding On to Reality, in which he describes online sociality in MUDs (multi-user dungeons) as a “virtual fog” which seeps into and obscures the gravity of real human bonds (1999, 190–91).
There might be an inherent ambiguity in Borgmann’s analysis, however. On the one hand he tells us that it is the competition with our organic and embodied social presence that makes online social environments designed for convenience, pleasure and ease ethically problematic, since the latter will inevitably be judged more satisfying than the ‘real’ social environment. But he goes on to claim that online social environments are themselves ethically deficient:
If everyone is indifferently present regardless of where one is located on the globe, no one is commandingly present. Those who become present via a communication link have a diminished presence, since we can always make them vanish if their presence becomes burdensome. Moreover, we can protect ourselves from unwelcome persons altogether by using screening devices….The extended network of hyperintelligence also disconnects us from the people we would meet incidentally at concerts, plays and political gatherings. As it is, we are always and already linked to the music and entertainment we desire and to sources of political information. This immobile attachment to the web of communication works a twofold deprivation in our lives. It cuts us off from the pleasure of seeing people in the round and from the instruction of being seen and judged by them. It robs us of the social resonance that invigorates our concentration and acumen when we listen to music or watch a play.…Again it seems that by having our hyperintelligent eyes and ears everywhere, we can attain world citizenship of unequaled scope and subtlety. But the world that is hyperintelligently spread out before us has lost its force and resistance. (1992, 105–6)
Critics of Borgmann have seen him as adopting Heidegger’s substantivist, monolithic model of technology as a singular, deterministic force in human affairs (Feenberg 1999; Verbeek 2005). This model, known as technological determinism, represents technology as an independent driver of social and cultural change, shaping human institutions, practices and values in a manner largely beyond our control. Whether or not this is ultimately Borgmann’s view (or Heidegger’s), his critics are likely responding to remarks of the following sort: “[Social hyperreality] has already begun to transform the social fabric…At length it will lead to a disconnected, disembodied, and disoriented sort of life…It is obviously growing and thickening, suffocating reality and rendering humanity less mindful and intelligent.” (Borgmann 1992, 108–9)
Critics assert that the ethical force of Borgmann’s analysis suffers from his lack of attention to the substantive differences between particular social networking technologies and their varied contexts of use, as well as the different motivations and patterns of activity displayed by individual users in those contexts. For example, Borgmann is charged with ignoring the fact that physical reality does not always enable or facilitate connection, nor does it do so equally for all persons. As a consequence, Andrew Feenberg (1999) claims that Borgmann has missed the way in which online social networks might supply sites of democratic resistance for those who are physically or politically disempowered by many ‘real-world’ networks.
Philosopher Hubert Dreyfus (2001) joined Borgmann in early critical engagement with the ethical possibilities of the Internet; like Borgmann, Dreyfus’s reflections on the ethical dimension of online sociality evince a general suspicion of such networks as an impoverished substitute for the real thing. Like Borgmann, Dreyfus’s suspicion is also informed by his phenomenological roots, which lead him to focus his critical attention on the Internet’s suspension of fully embodied presence. Yet rather than draw upon Heidegger’s metaphysical framework, Dreyfus (2004) reaches back to Kierkegaard in forming his criticisms of life online. Dreyfus suggests that what online engagements intrinsically lack is exposure to risk, and without risk, Dreyfus tells us, there can be no true meaning or commitment found in the electronic domain. Instead, we are drawn to online social environments precisely because they allow us to play with notions of identity, commitment and meaning, without risking the irrevocable consequences that ground real identities and relationships. As Dreyfus puts it:
…the Net frees people to develop new and exciting selves. The person living in the aesthetic sphere of existence would surely agree, but according to Kierkegaard, “As a result of knowing and being everything possible, one is in contradiction with oneself” (Present Age, 68). When he is speaking from the point of view of the next higher sphere of existence, Kierkegaard tells us that the self requires not “variableness and brilliancy,” but “firmness, balance, and steadiness” (Dreyfus 2004, 75)
While Dreyfus acknowledges that unconditional commitment and acceptance of risk are not excluded in principle by online sociality, he insists that “anyone using the Net who was led to risk his or her real identity in the real world would have to act against the grain of what attracted him or her to the Net in the first place” (2004, 78).
While Borgmann and Dreyfus’s views continue to inform the philosophical conversation about social networking and ethics, both of these early philosophical engagements with the phenomenon manifest certain predictive failures (as is perhaps unavoidable when reflecting on new and rapidly evolving technological systems). Dreyfus did not foresee the way in which popular SNS such as Facebook, LinkedIn and Google+ would shift away from the earlier online norms of anonymity and identity play, instead giving real-world identities an online presence which in some ways is less ephemeral than bodily presence (as those who have struggled to erase online traces of past acts or to delete Facebook profiles of deceased loved ones can attest).
Likewise, Borgmann’s critiques of “immobile attachment” to the online datastream did not anticipate the rise of mobile social networking applications which not only encourage us to physically seek out and join our friends at those same concerts, plays and political events that he envisioned us passively digesting from an electronic feed, but also enable spontaneous physical gatherings in ways never before possible. That said, such predictive failures may not, in the long view, turn out to be fatal to their judgments. It is worth noting that one of the earliest and most accomplished researchers of Internet sociality whose early championing of its liberating social possibilities (Turkle 1995) was directly challenged by Dreyfus (2004, 75) has since articulated a far more pessimistic view of the trajectory of new social technologies (Turkle 2011)—one that now resonates in several respects with Borgmann’s earlier concerns about electronic networks increasingly leading to experiences of alienation in connectedness.
While scholarship in the social and natural sciences has tended to focus on the impact of SNS on psychosocial markers of happiness/well-being, psychosocial adjustment, social capital, or feelings of life satisfaction, philosophical concerns about social networking and ethics have generally centered on topics less amenable to empirical measurement (e.g., privacy, identity, friendship, the good life and democratic freedom). More so than ‘social capital’ or feelings of ‘life satisfaction,’ these topics are closely tied to traditional concerns of ethical theory (e.g., virtues, rights, duties, motivations and consequences). These topics are also tightly linked to the novel features and distinctive functionalities of SNS, more so than some other issues of interest in computer and information ethics that relate to more general Internet functionalities (for example, issues of copyright and intellectual property).
Social networking technologies have added a new sense of urgency and new layers of complexity to the existing debates among philosophers about privacy and information technology. For example, standing philosophical debates about whether privacy should be defined in terms of control over information (Elgesem 1996), restricting access to information (Tavani 2007) or contextual integrity (Nissenbaum 2004) must now be re-examined in the light of the privacy practices of Facebook, Twitter and other SNS. This has become a locus of much critical attention.
Some fundamental practices of concern include: the potential availability of users’ data to third parties for the purposes of commercial marketing, data mining, research, surveillance or law enforcement; the capacity of facial-recognition software to automatically identify persons in uploaded photos; the ability of third-party applications to collect and publish user data without their permission or awareness; the frequent use by SNS of automatic ‘opt-in’ privacy controls; the use of ‘cookies’ to track online user activities after they have left a SNS; the potential use of location-based social networking for stalking or other illicit monitoring of users’ physical movements; the sharing of user information or patterns of activity with government entities; and, last but not least, the potential of SNS to encourage users to adopt voluntary but imprudent, ill-informed or unethical information sharing practices, either with respect to sharing their own personal data or sharing data related to other persons and entities. Facebook has been a particular lightning-rod for criticism of its privacy practices (Spinello 2011), but it is just the most visible member of a far broader and more complex network of SNS actors with access to unprecedented quantities of sensitive personal data.
These new actors in the information environment create particular problems with respect to privacy norms. For example, since it is the ability to access information freely shared by others that makes SNS uniquely attractive and useful, and given that users often minimize or fail to fully understand the implications of sharing information on SNS, we may find that contrary to traditional views of information privacy, giving users greater control over their information-sharing practices may actually lead to decreased privacy for themselves or others. Moreover, in the shift from (early Web 2.0) user-created and maintained sites and networks to (late Web 2.0) proprietary social networks, many users have yet to fully process the potential for conflict between their personal motivations for using SNS and the profit-driven motivations of the corporations that possess their data (Baym 2011). Jared Lanier frames the point cynically when he states that: “The only hope for social networking sites from a business point of view is for a magic formula to appear in which some method of violating privacy and dignity becomes acceptable” (Lanier 2010).
Scholars also note the way in which SNS architectures are often insensitive to the granularity of human sociality (Hull, Lipford & Latulipe 2011). That is, such architectures tend to treat human relations as if they are all of a kind, ignoring the profound differences among types of social relation (familial, professional, collegial, commercial, civic, etc.). As a consequence, the privacy controls of such architectures often fail to account for the variability of privacy norms within different but overlapping social spheres. Among philosophical accounts of privacy, Nissenbaum’s (2010) view of contextual integrity has seemed to many to be particularly well suited to explaining the diversity and complexity of privacy expectations generated by new social media (see for example Grodzinsky and Tavani 2010; Capurro 2011). Contextual integrity demands that our information practices respect context-sensitive privacy norms, where‘context’ refers not to the overly coarse distinction between ‘private’ and ‘public,’ but to a far richer array of social settings characterized by distinctive roles, norms and values. For example, the same piece of information made ‘public’ in the context of a status update to family and friends on Facebook may nevertheless be considered by the same discloser to be ‘private’ in other contexts; that is, she may not expect that same information to be provided to strangers Googling her name, or to bank employees examining her credit.
On the design side, such complexity means that attempts to produce more ‘user-friendly’ privacy controls face an uphill challenge—they must balance the need for simplicity and ease of use with the need to better represent the rich and complex structures of our social universes. A key design question, then, is how SNS privacy interfaces can be made more accessible and more socially intuitive for users.
Hull et al. (2011) also take note of the apparent plasticity of user attitudes about privacy in SNS contexts, as evidenced by the pattern of widespread outrage over changed or newly disclosed privacy practices of SNS providers being followed by a period of accommodation to and acceptance of the new practices (Boyd and Hargittai 2010). A related concern is the “privacy paradox,” in which users’ voluntary actions online seem to belie their own stated values concerning privacy. These phenomena raise many ethical concerns, the most general of which may be this: how can static normative conceptions of the value of privacy be used to evaluate the SNS practices that are destabilizing those very conceptions? More recently, working from the late writings of Foucault, Hull (2015) has explored the way in which the ‘self-management’ model of online privacy protection embodied in standard ‘notice and consent’ practices only reinforces a narrow neoliberal conception of privacy, and of ourselves, as commodities for sale and exchange.
In an early study of online communities, Bakardjieva and Feenberg (2000) suggested that the rise of communities predicated on the open exchange of information may in fact require us to relocate our focus in information ethics from privacy concerns to concerns about alienation; that is, the exploitation of information for purposes not intended by the relevant community. Heightened concerns about data mining and other third-party uses of information shared on SNS would seem to give further weight to Bakardjieva and Feenberg’s argument. Such considerations give rise to the possibility of users deploying “guerrilla tactics” of misinformation, for example, by providing SNS hosts with false names, addresses, birthdates, hometowns or employment information. Such tactics would aim to subvert the emergence of a new “digital totalitarianism” that uses the power of information rather than physical force as a political control (Capurro 2011).
Finally, privacy issues with SNS highlight a broader philosophical problem involving the intercultural dimensions of information ethics; Rafael Capurro (2005) has noted the way in which narrowly Western conceptions of privacy occlude other legitimate ethical concerns regarding new media practices. For example, he notes that in addition to Western worries about protecting the private domain from public exposure, we must also take care to protect the public sphere from the excessive intrusion of the private. Though he illustrates the point with a comment about intrusive uses of cell phones in public spaces (2005, 47), the rise of mobile social networking has amplified this concern by several factors. When one must compete with Facebook or Twitter for the attention of not only one’s dinner companions and family members, but also one’s fellow drivers, pedestrians, students, moviegoers, patients and audience members, the integrity of the public sphere comes to look as fragile as that of the private.
Social networking technologies open up a new type of ethical space in which personal identities and communities, both ‘real’ and virtual, are constructed, presented, negotiated, managed and performed. Accordingly, philosophers have analyzed SNS both in terms of their uses as Foucaultian “technologies of the self” (Bakardjieva and Gaden 2012) that facilitate the construction and performance of personal identity, and in terms of the distinctive kinds of communal norms and moral practices generated by SNS (Parsell 2008).
The ethical and metaphysical issues generated by the formation of virtual identities and communities have attracted much philosophical interest (see Introna 2011 and Rodogno 2012). Yet as noted by Patrick Stokes (2012), unlike earlier forms of online community in which anonymity and the construction of alter-egos were typical, SNS such as Facebook increasingly anchor member identities and connections to real, embodied selves and offline ‘real-world’ networks. Yet SNS still enable users to manage their self-presentation and their social networks in ways that offline social spaces at home, school or work often do not permit. The result, then, is an identity grounded in the person’s material reality and embodiment but more explicitly “reflective and aspirational” (Stokes 2012, 365) in its presentation. This raises a number of ethical questions: first, from what source of normative guidance or value does the aspirational content of an SNS user’s identity primarily derive? Do identity performances on SNS generally represent the same aspirations and reflect the same value profiles as users’ offline identity performances? Do they display any notable differences from the aspirational identities of non-SNS users? Are the values and aspirations made explicit in SNS contexts more or less heteronomous in origin than those expressed in non-SNS contexts? Do the more explicitly aspirational identity performances on SNS encourage users to take steps to actually embody those aspirations offline, or do they tend to weaken the motivation to do so?
A further SNS phenomenon of relevance here is the persistence and communal memorialization of Facebook profiles after the user’s death; not only does this reinvigorate a number of classical ethical questions about our ethical duties to honor and remember the dead, it also renews questions about whether our moral identities can persist after our embodied identities expire, and whether the dead have ongoing interests in their social presence or reputation (Stokes 2012).
Mitch Parsell (2008) has raised concerns about the unique temptations of ‘narrowcast’ social networking communities that are “composed of those just like yourself, whatever your opinion, personality or prejudices.” (41) He worries that among the affordances of Web 2.0 tools is a tendency to constrict our identities to a closed set of communal norms that perpetuate increased polarization, prejudice and insularity. He admits that in theory the many-to-many or one-to-many relations enabled by SNS allow for exposure to a greater variety of opinions and attitudes, but in practice Parsell worries that they often have the opposite effect. Building from de Laat (2006), who suggests that members of virtual communities embrace a distinctly hyperactive style of communication to compensate for diminished informational cues, Parsell claims that in the absence of the full range of personal identifiers evident through face-to-face contact, SNS may also promote the deindividuation of personal identity by exaggerating and reinforcing the significance of singular shared traits (liberal, conservative, gay, Catholic, etc.) that lead us to see ourselves and our SNS contacts more as representatives of a group than as unique persons (2008, 46).
Parsell also notes the existence of inherently pernicious identities and communities that may be enabled or enhanced by some Web 2.0 tools—he cites the example of apotemnophiliacs, or would-be amputees, who use such resources to create mutually supportive networks in which their self-destructive desires receive validation (2008, 48). Related concerns have been raised about “Pro-ANA” sites that provide mutually supportive networks for anorexics seeking information and tools to allow them to perpetuate and police disordered identities (Giles 2006; Manders-Huits 2010). While Parsell believes that certain Web 2.0 affordances enable corrupt and destructive varieties of personal freedom, he claims that other Web 2.0 tools offer corresponding solutions; for example, he describes Facebook’s reliance on long-lived profiles linked to real-world identities as a way of combating deindividuation and promoting responsible contribution to the community (2008, 54).
Such tools, however, come at some cost to user autonomy—a value that in other circumstances is critical to respecting the ethical demands of identity, as noted by Noemi Manders-Huits (2010). Manders-Huits explores the tension between the way in which SNS treat users as profiled and forensically reidentifiable “objects of (algorithmic) computation” (2010, 52) while at the same time offering those users an attractive space for ongoing identity construction. She argues that SNS developers have a duty to protect and promote the interests of their users in autonomously constructing and managing their own moral and practical identities.
The ethical concern about SNS constraints on user autonomy is also voiced by Bakardjieva and Gaden (2012) who note that whether they wish their identities to be formed and used in this manner or not, the online selves of SNS users are constituted by the categories established by SNS developers, and ranked and evaluated according to the currency which primarily drives the narrow “moral economy” of SNS communities: popularity (2012, 410). They note, however, that users are not rendered wholly powerless by this schema; users retain, and many exercise, “the liberty to make informed choices and negotiate the terms of their self constitution and interaction with others,” (2012, 411) whether by employing means to resist the “commercial imperatives” of SNS sites (ibid.) or by deliberately restricting the scope and extent of their personal SNS practices.
SNS such as Facebook can also be viewed as enabling authenticity in important ways. While the ‘Timeline’ feature (which displays my entire online personal history for all my friends to see) can prompt me to ‘edit’ my past, it can also prompt me to face up to and assimilate into my self-conception thoughts and actions that might otherwise be conveniently forgotten. The messy collision of my family, friends and coworkers on Facebook can be managed with various tools offered by the site, allowing me to direct posts only to specific sub-networks that I define. But the far simpler and less time-consuming strategy is to come to terms with the collision—allowing each network member to get a glimpse of who I am to others, while at the same time asking myself whether these expanded presentations project a person that is more multidimensional and interesting, or one that is manifestly insincere. As Tamara Wandel and Anthony Beavers put it:
I am thus no longer radically free to engage in creating a completely fictive self, I must become someone real, not who I really am pregiven from the start, but who I am allowed to be and what I am able to negotiate in the careful dynamic between who I want to be and who my friends from these multiple constituencies perceive me, allow me, and need me to be. (2011, 93)
Even so, Dean Cocking (2008) argues that many online social environments, by amplifying active aspects of self-presentation under our direct control, compromise the important function of passive modes of embodied self-presentation beyond our conscious control, such as body language, facial expression, and spontaneous displays of emotion (130). He regards these as important indicators of character that play a critical role in how others see us, and by extension, how we come to understand ourselves through others’ perceptions and reactions. If Cocking’s view is correct, then as long as SNS continue to privilege text-based and asynchronous communications, our ability to use them to cultivate and express authentic identities may be significantly hampered.
Ethical preoccupations with the impact of SNS on our authentic self-constitution and representation may also be regarded as assuming a false dichotomy between online and offline identities; the informational theory of personal identity offered by Luciano Floridi (2011) problematizes this distinction. Soraj Hongladarom (2011) employs such an informational metaphysic to deny that any clear boundary can be drawn between our offline selves and our selves as cultivated through SNS. Instead, our personal identities online and off are taken as externally constituted by our informational relations to other selves, events and objects.
Likewise, Charles Ess makes a link between relational models of the self found in Aristotle, Confucius and many contemporary feminist thinkers and emerging notions of the networked individual as a “smeared-out self” (2010, 111) constituted by a shifting web of embodied and informational relations. Ess points out that by undermining the atomic and dualistic model of the self upon which Western liberal democracies are founded, this new conception of the self forces us to reassess traditional philosophical approaches to ethical concerns about privacy and autonomy—and may even promote the emergence of a much-needed “global information ethics” (2010, 112). Yet he worries that our ‘smeared-out selves’ may lose coherence as the relations that constitute us are increasingly multiplied and scattered among a vast and expanding web of networked channels. Can such selves retain the capacities of critical rationality required for the exercise of liberal democracy, or will our networked selves increasingly be characterized by political and intellectual passivity, hampered in self-governance by “shorter attention spans and less capacity to engage with critical argument” (2010, 114)? Ess suggests that we hope for, and work to enable the emergence of, ‘hybrid selves’ that cultivate the individual moral and practical virtues needed to flourish within our networked and embodied relations (2010, 116).
SNS can facilitate many types of relational connections: LinkedIn encourages social relations organized around our professional lives, Twitter is useful for creating lines of communication between ordinary individuals and figures of public interest, MySpace was for a time a popular way for musicians to promote themselves and communicate with their fans, and Facebook, which began as a way to link university cohorts and now connects people across the globe, has seen a surge in business profiles aimed at establishing links to existing and future customers. Yet the overarching relational concept in the SNS universe has been, and continues to be, the ‘friend,’ as underscored by the now-common use of this term as a verb to refer to acts of instigating or confirming relationships on SNS.
This appropriation and expansion of the concept ‘friend’ by SNS has provoked a great deal of scholarly interest from philosophers and social scientists, more so than any other ethical concern except perhaps privacy. Early concerns about SNS friendship centered on the expectation that such sites would be used primarily to build ‘virtual’ friendships between physically separated individuals lacking a ‘real-world’ or ‘face-to-face’ connection. This perception was an understandable extrapolation from earlier patterns of Internet sociality, patterns that had prompted philosophical worries about whether online friendships could ever be ‘as good as the real thing’ or were doomed to be pale substitutes for embodied ‘face to face’ connections (Cocking and Matthews 2000). This view is robustly opposed by Adam Briggle (2008), who notes that online friendships might enjoy certain unique advantages. For example, Briggle asserts that friendships formed online might be more candid than offline ones, thanks to the sense of security provided by physical distance (2008, 75). He also notes the way in which asynchronous written communications can promote more deliberate and thoughtful exchanges (2008, 77).
These sorts of questions about how online friendships measure up to offline ones, along with questions about whether or to what extent online friendships encroach upon users’ commitments to embodied, ‘real-world’ relations with friends, family members and communities, defined the ethical problem-space of online friendship as SNS began to emerge. But it did not take long for empirical studies of actual SNS usage trends to force a profound rethinking of this problem-space. Within five years of Facebook’s launch, it was evident that a significant majority of SNS users were relying on these sites primarily to maintain and enhance relationships with those with whom they also had a strong offline connection—including close family members, high-school and college friends and co-workers (Ellison, Steinfeld and Lampe 2007; Ito et al. 2009; Smith 2011). Nor are SNS used to facilitate purely online exchanges—many SNS users today rely on the sites’ functionalities to organize everything from cocktail parties to movie nights, outings to athletic or cultural events, family reunions and community meetings. Mobile SNS applications such as Foursquare, Loopt and Google Latitude amplify this type of functionality further, by enabling friends to locate one another in their community in real-time, enabling spontaneous meetings at restaurants, bars and shops that would otherwise happen only by coincidence.
Yet lingering ethical concerns remain about the way in which SNS can distract users from the needs of those in their immediate physical surroundings (consider the widely lamented trend of users obsessively checking their social media feeds during family dinners, business meetings, romantic dates and symphony performances). Such phenomena, which scholars like Sherry Turkle (2011) worry are indicative of a growing cultural tolerance for being ‘alone together,’ bring a new complexity to earlier philosophical concerns about the emergence of a zero-sum game between offline relationships and their virtual SNS competitors. They have also prompted a shift of ethical focus away from the question of whether online relationships are “real” friendships (Cocking and Matthews 2000), to how well the real friendships we bring to SNS are being served there (Vallor 2012). The debate over the value and quality of online friendships continues (Sharp 2012; Froding and Peterson 2012; Elder 2014); in large part because the typical pattern of those friendships, like most social networking phenomena, continues to evolve.
Such concerns intersect with broader philosophical questions about whether and how the classical ethical ideal of ‘the good life’ can be engaged in the 21st century. Pak-Hang Wong claims that this question requires us to broaden the standard approach to information ethics from a narrow focus on the “right/the just” (2010, 29) that defines ethical action negatively (e.g., in terms of violations of privacy, copyright, etc.) to a framework that conceives of a positive ethical trajectory for our technological choices. Edward Spence (2011) further suggests that to adequately address the significance of SNS and related information and communication technologies for the good life, we must also expand the scope of philosophical inquiry beyond its present concern with narrowly interpersonal ethics to the more universal ethical question of prudential wisdom. Do SNS and related technologies help us to cultivate the broader intellectual virtue of knowing what it is to live well, and how to best pursue it? Or do they tend to impede its development?
This concern about prudential wisdom and the good life is part of a growing philosophical interest in using the resources of classical virtue ethics to evaluate the impact of SNS and related technologies, whether these resources are broadly Aristotelian (Vallor 2010), Confucian (Wong 2012) or both (Ess 2008). This program of research promotes inquiry into the impact of SNS not merely on the cultivation of prudential virtue, but on the development of a host of other moral and communicative virtues, such as honesty, patience, justice, loyalty, benevolence and empathy.
As is the case with privacy, identity, community and friendship on SNS, ethical debates about the impact of SNS on civil discourse, freedom and democracy in the public sphere must be seen as extensions of a broader discussion about the political implications of the Internet, one that predates Web 2.0 standards. Much of the literature on this subject focuses on the question of whether the Internet encourages or hampers the free exercise of deliberative public reason, in a manner informed by Jürgen Habermas’s (1992/1998) account of discourse ethics and deliberative democracy in the public sphere (Ess 1996 and 2005b; Dahlberg 2001; Bohman 2008). A related topic of concern is the potential of the Internet to fragment the public sphere by encouraging the formation of a plurality of ‘echo chambers’ and ‘filter bubbles’: informational silos for like-minded individuals who deliberately shield themselves from exposure to alternative views. The worry is that such insularity will promote extremism and the reinforcement of ill-founded opinions, while also preventing citizens of a democracy from recognizing their shared interests and experiences (Sunstein 2008). Finally, there is the question of the extent to which SNS can facilitate political activism, civil disobedience and popular revolutions resulting in the overthrow of authoritarian regimes. Commonly referenced examples include the 2011 North African revolutions in Egypt and Tunisia, with which Facebook and Twitter were respectively associated (Marturano 2011; Frick and Oberprantacher 2011).
When SNS in particular are considered in light of these questions, some distinctive considerations arise. First, sites like Facebook and Twitter (as opposed to narrower SNS utilities such as LinkedIn) facilitate the sharing of, and exposure to, an extremely diverse range of types of discourse. On any given day on Facebook a user may encounter in her NewsFeed a link to an article in a respected political magazine followed by a video of a cat in a silly costume, followed by a link to a new scientific study, followed by a lengthy status update someone has posted about their lunch, followed by a photo of a popular political figure overlaid with a clever and subversive caption. Vacation photos are mixed in with political rants, invitations to cultural events, birthday reminders and data-driven graphs created to undermine common political, moral or economic beliefs. Thus while a user has a tremendous amount of liberty to choose which forms of discourse to pay closer attention to, and tools with which to hide or prioritize the posts of certain members of her network, she cannot easily shield herself from at least a superficial acquaintance with a diversity of private and public concerns of her fellows. This has the potential to offer at least some measure of protection against the extreme insularity and fragmentation of discourse that is incompatible with the public sphere.
Second, while users can often ‘defriend’ or systematically hide the posts of those with whom they tend to disagree, the high visibility and perceived value of social connections on these sites makes this option less attractive as a consistent strategy. Philosophers of technology often speak of the affordances or gradients of particular technologies in given contexts (Vallor 2010) insofar as they make certain patterns of use more attractive or convenient for users (while not rendering alternative patterns impossible). In this respect, social networks like those on Facebook, in which users must take actions somewhat contrary to the site’s purpose in order to effectively shield themselves from unwelcome or contrary opinions, may be viewed as having a modestly democratic gradient in comparison to networks deliberately constructed around a particular political cause or identity. However, this gradient may be undermined by Facebook’s own algorithms, which curate users’ News Feed in ways that are opaque to them, and which almost certainly prioritize the appeal of the ‘user experience’ over civic benefit or the integrity of the public sphere.
Third, one must ask whether SNS can skirt the dangers of a plebiscite model of democratic discourse, in which minority voices are inevitably dispersed and drowned out by the many. Certainly, compared to the ‘one-to-many’ channels of communication favored by traditional media, SNS facilitate a ‘many-to-many’ model of communication that appears to lower the barriers to participation in civic discourse for everyone, including the marginalized. However, if one’s ‘Facebook friends’ or people you ‘follow’ are sufficiently numerous, then minority opinions may still be heard as lone voices in the wilderness, perhaps valued for providing some ‘spice’ and novelty to the broader conversation but failing to receive serious public consideration of their merits. Existing SNS lack the institutional structures necessary to ensure that minority voices enjoy not only free, but qualitatively equal access to the deliberative function of the public sphere.
Fourth, one must also consider the quality of informational exchanges on SNS and the extent to which they promote a genuinely dialogical public sphere marked by the exercise of critical rationality. While we have noted above that exposure to well-informed opinions and reliable evidential sources is facilitated by many of the most popular SNS, exposure does not guarantee attention or consumption. For example, the number of contacts in the average Facebook user’s network is sufficiently large to make it virtually impossible for a typical user to see every relevant post even among those which Facebook’s algorithm selects for their News Feed, and only a very small number of those may be closely attended or responded to. Many scholars worry that in SNS environments, substantive contributions to civic discourse increasingly function as flotsam on a virtual sea of trivially amusing or shallow content, weakening the civic habits and practices of critical rationality that we need in order to function as well-informed and responsible democratic citizens (Carr 2010; Ess 2010). Furthermore, while the most popular SNS do promote norms of responsive practice, these norms tend to privilege brevity and immediate impact over substance and depth in communication; Vallor (2012) suggests that this bodes poorly for the cultivation of those communicative virtues essential to a flourishing public sphere. This worry is only reinforced by empirical data suggesting that SNS perpetuate the ‘Spiral of Silence’ phenomenon that results in the passive suppression of divergent views on matters of important political or civic concern (Hampton et. al. 2014). In a related critique, Frick and Oberprantacher (2011) claim that the ability of SNS to facilitate public ‘sharing’ can obscure the deep ambiguity between sharing as “a promising, active participatory process” and “interpassive, disjointed acts of having trivia shared.” (2011, 22)
A fifth issue for online democracy relates to the contentious debate emerging on social media platforms about the extent to which controversial or unpopular speech ought to be tolerated or punished by private actors, especially when the consequences manifest in traditional offline contexts and spaces such as the university. For example, the norms of academic freedom in the U.S. have been greatly destabilized by the ‘Salaita Affair’ and several other cases in which academics were censured or otherwise punished by their institutions as a result of their controversial social media posts. It remains to be seen what equilibrium can be found between civility and free expression in communities increasingly mediated by SNS communications.
There is also the question of whether SNS will necessarily preserve a democratic ethos as they come to reflect increasingly pluralistic and international social networks. The current split between networks such as Facebook and Twitter dominant in Western liberal society and dedicated SNS in countries such as China (RenRen) and Russia (VKontakte) with more communitarian and/or authoritarian regimes may not endure; if SNS become increasingly multinational or global in scale, will that development tend to disseminate and enhance democratic values and practices, dilute and weaken them, or perhaps precipitate the recontextualization of liberal democratic values in a new ‘global ethics’ (Ess 2010)?
An even more pressing question is whether civic discourse and activism on SNS will be compromised or manipulated by the commercial interests that currently own and manage the technical infrastructure. This concern is driven by the growing economic power and political influence of companies in the technology sector, and the potentially disenfranchising and disempowering effects of an economic model in which users play a fundamentally passive role (Floridi 2015). Indeed, the relationship between social media users and service providers has become increasingly contentious, as users struggle to demand more privacy, better data security and more effective protections from online harassment in an economic context where they have little or no direct bargaining power. This imbalance was powerfully illustrated by the revelation in 2014 that Facebook researchers had quietly conducted psychological experiments on users without their knowledge, manipulating their moods by altering the balance of positive or negative items in their News Feeds (Goel 2014). The study adds yet another dimension to growing concerns about the ethics and validity of social science research that relies on SNS-generated data (Buchanan and Zimmer 2012).
Ironically, in the power struggle between users and SNS providers, social networking platforms themselves have become the primary battlefield, where users vent their collective outrage in an attempt to force service providers into responding to their demands. The results are sometimes positive, as when Twitter users, after years of complaining, finally shamed the company in 2015 into providing better reporting tools for online harassment. Yet by its nature the process is chaotic and often controversial, as when later that year, Reddit users successfully demanded the ouster of CEO Ellen Pao, under whose leadership Reddit had banned some of its more repugnant ‘subreddit’ forums (such as “Fat People Hate,” devoted to the shaming and harassment of overweight persons.)
The only clear consensus emerging from the considerations outlined here is that if SNS are going to facilitate any enhancement of a Habermasian public sphere, or the civic virtues and praxes of reasoned discourse that any functioning public sphere must presuppose, then users will have to actively mobilize themselves to exploit such an opportunity (Frick and Oberprantacher 2011). Such mobilization may depend upon resisting the “false sense of activity and accomplishment” (Bar-Tura, 2010, 239) that may come from merely clicking ‘Like’ in response to acts of meaningful political speech, forwarding calls to sign petitions that one never gets around to signing oneself, or simply ‘following’ an outspoken social critic on Twitter whose ‘tweeted’ calls to action are drowned in a tide of corporate announcements, celebrity product endorsements and personal commentaries. Some argue that it will also require the cultivation of new norms and virtues of online civic-mindedness, without which online ‘democracies’ will continue to be subject to the self-destructive and irrational tyrannies of mob behavior (Ess 2010).
SNS are hosts for a broad spectrum of ‘cybercrimes’ and related offenses, including but not limited to: cyberbullying/cyberharassment, cyberstalking, child exploitation, cyberextortion, cyberfraud, illegal surveillance, identity theft, intellectual property/copyright violations, cyberespionage, cybersabotage and cyberterrorism. Each of these forms of criminal or antisocial behavior has a history that well pre-dates Web 2.0 standards, and perhaps as a consequence, philosophers have tended to leave the specific correlations between cybercrime and SNS as an empirical matter for social scientists, law enforcement and Internet security firms to investigate. Nevertheless, cybercrime is an enduring topic of philosophical interest for the broader field of computer ethics, and the migration to and evolution of such crime on SNS platforms raises new and distinctive ethical issues.
Among those of great ethical importance is the question of how SNS providers ought to respond to government demands for user data for investigative or counterterrorism purposes. SNS providers are caught between the public interest in crime prevention and their need to preserve the trust and loyalty of their users, many of whom view governments as overreaching in their attempts to secure records of online activity. Many companies have opted to favor user security by employing end-to-end encryption of SNS exchanges, much to the chagrin of government agencies who insist upon ‘backdoor’ access to user data in the interests of public safety and national security (Friedersdorf 2015).
Another emerging ethical concern is the increasingly political character of cyberharassment and cyberstalking. In the U.S., women who speak out about the lack of diversity in the tech and videogame industries have been particular targets, in some cases forcing them to cancel speaking appearances or leave their homes due to physical threats after their addresses and other personal info were posted online (a practice known as ‘doxxing’). A new political vernacular has emerged among online contingents such as ‘MRAs’ (men’s rights activists), who perceive themselves as locked in a fierce ideological battle against those they derisively label as ‘SJWs’ (‘social justice warriors’): persons who advocate for equality, security and diversity in and through online mediums. For victims of doxxing and associated cyberthreats of physical violence, traditional law enforcement bodies offer scant protection, as these agencies are often ill-equipped or unmotivated to police the blurry boundary between virtual and physical harms.
A host of metaethical questions are raised by the rapid emergence of SNS as a dominant medium of interpersonal connection. For example, SNS lend new data to the existing philosophical debate (Tavani 2005; Moor 2008) about whether classical ethical traditions such as utilitarianism, Kantian ethics or virtue ethics possess sufficient resources for illuminating the ethical implications of emerging information technologies, or whether we require a new ethical framework to handle such phenomena. One novel approach commonly employed to analyze SNS (Light, McGrath and Gribble 2008; Skog 2011) is Philip Brey’s (2000) disclosive ethics. This interdisciplinary ethical framework aims to analyze how particular moral values are embedded in specific technologies, allowing for the disclosure of otherwise opaque tendencies of a technology to shape moral practice. Ess (2006) has suggested that a new, pluralistic “global information ethics” may be the appropriate context from which to view emerging information technologies. Other scholars have suggested that technologies such as SNS invite renewed attention to existing ethical approaches such as pragmatism (van den Eede 2010), virtue ethics (Vallor 2010) feminist or care ethics (Hamington 2010; Puotinen 2011) that have often been neglected by applied ethicists in favor of conventional utilitarian and deontological resources.
A related metaethical project relevant to SNS is the development of an explicitly intercultural information ethics (Ess 2005a; Capurro 2008; Honglaradom and Britz 2010). SNS and other emerging information technologies do not reliably confine themselves to national or cultural boundaries, and this creates a particular challenge for applied ethicists. For example, SNS practices in different countries must be analyzed against a conceptual background that recognizes and accommodates complex differences in moral norms and practices concerning, for example, privacy (Capurro 2005; Hongladarom 2007). Other SNS phenomena that one might expect to benefit from intercultural analysis and that are relevant to the ethical considerations outlined in Section 3 include: varied cultural patterns and preference/tolerance for affective display, argument and debate, personal exposure, expressions of political, interfamilial or cultural criticism, religious expression and sharing of intellectual property. Alternatively, the very possibility of a coherent information ethics may come under challenge, for example, from a constructivist view that emerging socio-technological practices like SNS continually redefine ethical norms—such that our analyses of SNS and related technologies are not only doomed to operate from shifting ground, but from ground that is being shifted by the intended object of our ethical analysis.
Finally, there are pressing practical concerns about whether and how philosophers can actually have an impact on the ethical profile of emerging technologies such as SNS. If philosophers direct their ethical analyses only to other philosophers, then such analyses may function simply as ethical postmortems of human-technology relations, with no opportunity to actually pre-empt, reform or redirect unethical technological practices. But to whom else can, or should, these ethical concerns be directed: SNS users? Regulatory bodies and political institutions? SNS software developers? How can the theoretical content and practical import of these analyses be made accessible to these varied audiences? What motivating force are they likely to have? The profound urgency of such questions becomes apparent once we recognize that unlike those ‘life or death’ ethical dilemmas with which applied ethicists are understandably often preoccupied (e.g., abortion, euthanasia and capital punishment), emerging information technologies such as SNS have in a very short time worked themselves into the daily moral fabric of virtually all of our lives, transforming the social landscape and the moral habits and practices with which we navigate it. The ethical concerns illuminated here are, in a very real sense, anything but ‘academic,’ and neither philosophers nor the broader human community can afford the luxury of treating them as such.
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