First published Wed Jul 2, 2014; substantive revision Thu Jun 2, 2022

“Eugenics” is a term loaded with historical significance and a strong negative valence. Its literal meaning – good birth – suggests a suitable goal for all prospective parents, yet its historical connotations tie it to appalling policies, including forced sterilizations, selective breeding programs in North America and Asia, and horrifying concentration camps and mass exterminations in Nazi Germany. Undoubtedly, we have an obligation never to forget the Holocaust, or indeed, any of the horrible policies and actions that have been justified in the name of creating better people. Yet intuitively we have some moral obligation to promote good births – to have, in the most literal sense, eugenic aims. Indeed, if parents are encouraged to provide the best environment for their children (good nutrition, education, health care, a loving family situation, etc.), why not also encourage them to ensure their children have good genes? And if we have some moral obligation to secure the well-being of our future children (a question explored extensively in the literature on the non-identity problem; see the entry on the nonidentity problem), do these obligations entail the use of reprogenetic technologies and practices? This question is particularly important given that current genomic science and technology permit significant control over reproductive choices. Can these contemporary practices be distinguished, in their aims, forms, justifications, and likely consequences, from the clearly morally impermissible eugenic programs of the past?

Some philosophers think they can be distinguished, and they have explored the desirability of a “liberal” or “new” as opposed to an “authoritarian” or “old” eugenics (Agar 2004). Liberal eugenics would be based upon prospective parents’ free choice, pluralist values, and up-to-date scientific understanding of genomic science and technology. Furthermore, advocates of liberal eugenics aim to be sensitive to the effects of some problematic but deeply entrenched social problems (e.g., racism, sexism, heterosexism) on individual choice. Authoritarian eugenics programs, in contrast, were coercive state programs designed to promote social goods, and were based on problematic scientific assumptions about hereditability. Liberal eugenicists point to significant developments in our understanding of genomic science to help distinguish contemporary liberal eugenics from its problematic predecessors. Indeed, scientific advances of the last several decades – years that include the advent of in vitro fertilization (IVF), the funding and completion of the Human Genome Project, creation of the National Human Genome Research Institute (NHGRI), and expansions of pre-implantation screening, prenatal testing panels, as well as development of genome editing – provide not only more precise understandings of genes and their role in shaping phenotypes and gene-environment interactions, but also a multitude of possibilities for intervention in the process of reproduction. How ought we to use this new knowledge and capacities? This entry proceeds as follows. It first offers a short history of the eugenics movement. The second section presents some of the main arguments that attempt to define and defend a new or liberal eugenics. The last section covers a variety of critiques of those arguments.

1. Short history of eugenics

Philosophers have contemplated the meaning and value of eugenics at least since Plato recommended a state-run program of mating intended to strengthen the guardian class in his Republic. However, the modern version of eugenics had its start with the 19th century cousin of Charles Darwin, British scientist Francis Galton (1883). Galton was interested in “improving human stock” through scientific management of mating. His explicit goal was to create better humans. His ideas were taken up widely in the early part of the 20th century by seemingly well-intended, and ideologically diverse, scientists and policy makers, particularly in the United States, Britain, and the Scandinavian countries. Notable eugenicists included Alexander Graham Bell and Margaret Sanger. (For an excellent history of eugenics, see Kevles 1985.)

Eugenicists had two-fold aims: to encourage people with various desirable traits, e.g., health, intelligence, character, to reproduce together to create good births (what is known as “positive” eugenics), and to end certain diseases and disabilities by discouraging or preventing those with characteristics considered undesirable from reproducing (what is known as “negative” eugenics). In the United States, programs to encourage positive eugenics involved the creation of “Fitter Family Fairs” in which families competed for prizes at local county fairs, much in the way that livestock is judged for conformation and physical dexterity (Stern 2002). Negative eugenics took the form of encouraged or forced sterilizations of men and, particularly, women deemed unfit to reproduce (in the language of the day, this included individuals who were “poor, mentally insane, feeble-minded, idiots, drunken” and more). Much of eugenics ideology was reductionistic in nature, with many eugenicists assuming that social and behavioral conditions, such as poverty, vagrancy, or prostitution, were inherited as genetic traits rather than shared as common social situations. Nonetheless proponents of eugenic policies were aware of the interplay between biology and the environment, even if they were not very concerned with differentiating the various contributory factors (Dyck 2014). Social problems such as alcoholism or diseases related to mental health were understood to have a genetic component that could lead to difficulties in taking appropriate care of children (For an interesting discussion of the relevant social moral epistemology, see Buchanan 2007).

Racist, sexist, ableist, xenophobic, and classist assumptions pervaded the discourse. In the US, for instance, alarm calls were raised about the lower birth rates among white Protestant Americans compared to the large immigrant Catholic populations of Italian and Irish descent. German scientists and policymakers visited the United States to learn from their methods, and when the Nazis came to power in Germany, they began eugenic policies of their own. Early German policies called for the killing of people in institutions whose physical or mental illnesses were deemed incurable. Such individuals were considered to have “lives unworthy of life” (lebensunwertes Leben). The Nazis also encouraged selective breeding for Aryan traits (e.g., athletic, blond, blue-eyed). This policy quickly expanded to include bans on marriage between particular groups, forced sterilization, and then internment in concentration camps for individuals belonging to groups deemed inferior (i.e., people who were disabled, homosexual, diagnosed with psychiatric conditions, communists, considered to be Roma/gypsies, and/or Jewish). The purported aim was to promote the “health” of the German population by controlling those who were “unhealthy.” Prisoners faced extremely hard labor, medical experimentation that was torturous and designed to test the limits of the human body (Lifton 1986) and daily degradation and abuse. Eventually, the Nazis escalated their eugenic program to the “final solution” of death camps, ultimately killing more than six million Jewish people in the name of promoting Germany’s health.

Following the end of WWII, the term “eugenic” was so closely associated with the horrific programs of Nazi Germany that eugenics societies across the world changed their names (e.g., the American Eugenics Society became the Society for the Study of Social Biology) and tempered their aims. Yet many of the same practices and beliefs continued under a different guise, from immigration policies, to forced sterilization, to population control (Kevles 1985; MacLaren 1990; Kline 2001; Broberg and Roll-Hansen 2005; Lombardo 2008; Paul, Stenhouse, and Spencer 2018; Willson 2018). In the United States, involuntary eugenic sterilizations of “feeble-minded” women in a variety of states didn’t officially end until the late 1970s and may continue covertly in some state institutions. California had the highest rate of forced sterilizations, which were widely performed on prison inmates, people in mental institutions, and women considered to be bad mothers. Such sterilizations were motivated by both perceived individual and social goods but were grounded on deep-seated prejudice as well as scientific inaccuracies (Kluchin 2009; Stern 2015). Concepts of “feeble-mindedness” were historically entangled in deeply problematic ways with ideas of race, class, and gender (Stubblefield 2007). California has now joined Virginia and North Carolina in passing legislation to compensate forced sterilization victims.

Later, attempts to promote positive eugenics were renewed with the creation of the Repository for Germinal Choice, a sperm bank created in 1978 with the idea of collecting sperm from Nobel laureates, others deemed “geniuses” and Olympic level athletes. Artificial insemination and IVF would thus allow women to choose to reproduce with men presumed to have high-quality genes, without needing to form relationships with them. Although most Nobel prizewinners proved reluctant to donate to the sperm bank, the general idea took off. Today, advances in egg freezing have also permitted the creation of egg banks and print and online ads in college newspapers regularly request sperm or eggs from donors who meet certain qualifications for health, intelligence, athleticism, and/or attractiveness. Individuals or couples who require gamete donation to reproduce can shop around for a donor who meets their desired criteria (see the entry on the donation and sale of human eggs and sperm). Importantly, these practices are not only examples of positive eugenics but also of negative eugenics. Racist, classist, and ableist prejudices underlie these practices in ways that promote negative eugenics by preventing or discouraging some women from reproducing (Roberts 1997; Daar 2018).

The widespread practice of prenatal genetic testing (traditionally through chorionic villus sampling or amniocentesis in the second trimester of pregnancy, but now more routinely done through non-invasive blood tests in the first trimester, at least as a first screen), similarly presents the opportunity for individuals or couples to identify genes or genetic markers for traits they prefer for their future children not to have. If prenatal testing identifies an undesired gene variant, prospective parents may choose to abort the fetus, often with the plan to later attempt a new pregnancy. Studies suggest that approximately 80 to 90% of parents terminate pregnancies identified with certain disorders (Rothschild 2005, Blakeley et al 2019). With the advent of preimplantation genetic testing, prospective parents can choose to use IVF, and then test early cells of the created embryos to identify embryos with genomic variants they favor or those prefer to avoid. In this way, they preclude the potential need for abortion by choosing to implant only embryos that contain the desired genes.

The aim of these practices certainly appears eugenic, though without an obviously coercive structure, and presumably directed at benefiting the individual family rather than the state. The profession of genetic counseling, started in the 1990s, provides prospective parents with detailed information about the meaning of the tests, and the opportunity for discussion of test results. In part due to concerns about eugenic overtones, genetic counseling is built on a policy of “non-directiveness” to ensure that the reproductive autonomy of prospective parents is respected. That tenet of genetic counseling has been challenged by scholars on grounds that it is impossible (Clarke 2017) and that it is undesirable (Davis 2010; Dietz and Reynolds 2021).

Finally, while past testing methods allowed identification of chromosomal abnormalities such as Trisomy 13, Trisomy 18, Trisomy 21 (Down Syndrome), and monogenic disorders such as Huntington’s disease, next generation sequencing (NGS) technologies now permit an unparalleled wealth of information about fetuses’ and embryos’ genomes. Although these technologies are not yet used routinely, their utility is being assessed in clinical trials. Should this expanded genomic information be available on prenatal testing panels? Or for all prospective parents who request prenatal testing? What about other additions that might be of interest to particular parents, even if the genetic linkages to the particular traits are less direct or even only mildly predictive: diabetes, obesity, or psychiatric conditions such as bipolar disorder or schizophrenia?

Moreover, new genome editing technologies are now being used to modify sperm, eggs, and embryos. Indeed, although genome editing for reproductive purposes is implicitly or explicitly prohibited in most countries, in November 2018, Chinese researcher He Jiankui used it to modify human embryos (Kirksey 2021). He and his team edited the embryos to disable a genetic pathway that HIV uses to infect cells. According to reports, three babies have been born from the edited embryos

These new genomic technologies could provide prospective parents –and others – with a significant degree of control over the characteristics of their children and the traits that should and should not be promoted. Deciding how to deal with them – as a society, and potentially as individual prospective parents – is a monumental task that calls for clarity about the benefits and drawbacks of genomic testing and editing, and requires us to revisit the meaning of eugenics and the problems associated with it.

As this short history should make clear, past, state-run, involuntary eugenic endeavors have been unjust and socially disastrous. Yet advances in genomic testing and interventions continue to make possible practices that have eugenic features, albeit framed differently. Prenatal testing and preimplantation genetic testing, for instance, are understood to enhance reproductive choice, even as they are clearly used by prospective parents to determine which individuals should come into existence. Should they be considered eugenic practices? Is that necessarily morally troubling? As technological advances push us to consider what genomic variants we ought to be able to test for, which to choose prenatally, and which to manipulate we may need to reassess our current practices, explore their justifications, and sort through the ways in which they are eugenic and morally worrisome.

2. Arguing for “liberal” eugenics

2.1 Distinguishing “old” and “new” eugenics

Advocates of liberal or new eugenics agree that past eugenic practices were morally wrong and should not be repeated. However, they contend that the use of current reprogenetic technologies does not share any of the morally impermissible features of such past eugenic programs (Silver 1997; Agar 2004; Harris 2007; Savulescu and Kahane 2009). They argue that current practices do not involve the morally troubling characteristics of their historical predecessors. First, reprogenetic technologies and practices are individual in nature rather than state-sponsored. The intended benefit of any reprogenetic intervention is individual/private welfare (that of the child-to-be or of the family), rather than the welfare of the state. Second, they are premised on individual liberty, the freedom of parents to choose according to their own values and conceptions of the good life. The state does not mandate contraception, sterilization, prenatal testing, abortion, or any other form of eugenic intervention (note: there are potential exceptions in which judges or states have offered long-term contraception such as Norplant as a condition of probation related to a criminal offense or for the continued provision of welfare, see e.g., Dresser 1996). Rather, it allows individuals to choose among a range of alternatives. Third, recognizing that individual parents will often desire different things for their offspring, current reprogenetic technologies and practices presume value pluralism. This means allowing others to choose in ways that we ourselves would not, in the interest of preserving a liberal society that is neutral about conceptions of the good. The aim of a liberal eugenic program is to expand reproductive choices for individuals, in contrast to the historical eugenic programs that clearly cut off reproductive options for many.

Of course, this does not mean that no limits can be imposed on people’s choices. Even liberal eugenics advocates typically presume that some restrictions would need to be in place to ensure that prospective parents could not act in ways clearly contrary to the interests of their future children, or in ways that seem clearly vicious. As will be discussed below, disagreements exist about how and where those limits should be set.

Finally, advocates of current reprogenetic technologies and practices highlight the difference between the kind and quality of the science underlying past and current reproductive policies. Past eugenic programs relied on views of race, intelligence, and genetics that were, from our current perspective, “hopelessly wrong” (Agar 2004: 7), while reprogenetic technologies are grounded on purportedly sound scientific theories and evidence.

For advocates of liberal eugenics, the fundamental differences between the old and the new practices are reasons to reject claims about the moral wrongness of current reprogenetic technologies. In their view, what current and past eugenic practices share is the aim of improving our offspring, and arguably that is a morally worthy goal.

2.2 Using reprogenetic technologies

Many theorists argue in favor of permitting parents to make choices about their future children’s genetic make-up. Such arguments run the gamut from a completely laissez-faire market system – or “genetic supermarket” – of the sort considered by Robert Nozick (1974: 315) to a more highly regulated system, with controls to protect the well-being of future children as well as socially valued goods (e.g., rough equality, efforts to eliminate discrimination) that might be put at risk in a completely free market environment (Buchanan et al 2000). Many also contend that there is a morally relevant difference between choices aimed at addressing diseases and those aimed at selecting or enhancing non-disease traits such as intelligence, self-confidence, height, eye color, or attractiveness. Further, while some liberal eugenics advocates contend that reproductive interventions for non-disease traits are permissible (Agar 2004, Green 2006), some argue that they are morally obligatory (Harris 2007; Savulescu 2005; Savulescu and Kahane 2009).

2.2.1 Addressing diseases

Liberal eugenics arguments often start by recognizing the value of treatment of disease. Disease, typically defined as a negative departure from species typical functioning (Boorse 1975; Daniels 1994), can interfere with an individual’s participation in society and/or individual flourishing. Buchanan et al. (2000) link disease to a reduction of opportunity, and so argue that provision of medical treatment for disease is a way for the state to promote equality of opportunity. Parents are obliged to ensure that their children get medical treatment for diseases and can be charged with negligence if they fail to do so. This obligation does not obtain in cases of diseases that result in relatively small negative effects on participation (e.g., mild asthma) or where the potential benefits of treatment are still somewhat uncertain or might be outweighed by the possible harms (e.g., some cancer treatments). Parents whose conceptions of the good life do not include medical treatment for serious diseases – as in some religious communities – are not allowed to impose this view on their children because the children deserve the opportunity to choose to adopt those views or not when they are adults. Mandatory life-saving treatment of their childhood diseases helps to ensure that they survive to make such decisions as adults (Feinberg 1980). This requirement has been the subject of some debate (see, e.g., DesAutels, Battin and May 1999).

Buchanan et al. (2000) note that as technology advances, theories of justice need no longer consider “natural inequalities” to be given, or outside the scope of distribution. If equality of opportunity is one of the aims of a society, then, provision of certain forms of genetic intervention – including interventions that determine who will be brought into existence – may become owed to future people as a matter of justice. If parents can decide between implanting an embryo that carries a genetic marker associated with a serious disease – e.g., Tay Sachs – or an embryo without that marker, they would have a moral obligation to choose the latter, in the name of promoting the health and well-being of the future child (impersonally, perhaps, given the non-identity problem).

Liberal eugenics advocates thus move from a commonly accepted position regarding the obligation to treat serious diseases in children, to a requirement for people to use genetic interventions in reproduction (e.g., pre-implantation genetic testing or genome editing) as a way to avoid transmitting serious diseases to one’s offspring (Savulescu 2001; Agar 2004; Glover 2006; Green 2007; Harris 2007; Savulescu and Kahane 2009).

To be clear, though, most liberal eugenics proponents do not suggest that all prospective parents would be obliged to seek reproductive counseling and use IVF in order to fulfill their parenting or impersonal duties (but see Savulescu and Kahane 2009). Such a requirement would present serious ethical concerns. Given the prohibitive costs and relatively low success rates of IVF treatment, this kind of obligation would be overly demanding on prospective parents, and particularly on women. Arguably, it would also constitute an infringement on people’s procreative liberty.

Similarly, proponents contend that the obligation to use reprogenetics to avoid transmitting diseases to one’s offspring does not extend to legal mandates on prenatal testing or abortion (or one day, genome editing). For them, such practices would be consistent with the old eugenics but not with the new, liberal version which values reproductive liberty (but see below for challenges to whether such view can be maintained consistently by at least some proponents of liberal eugenics).

2.2.2 Addressing non-disease traits

Liberal eugenics advocates recognize that many prospective parents may be interested not only in addressing health-related problems in their offspring but also in selecting or editing non-disease related genes to improve their children’s wellbeing. Why settle for the likelihood of normal functioning if one could safely choose other traits that are likely to make a child’s life better?

Two reasons are given for the use of reprogenetic technologies in this way. First, according to some liberal eugenics proponents, non-disease traits such as intelligence, memory, sex, hair or skin color, height, or beauty affect people’s wellbeing (Savulescu 2001; Harris 2005; Green 2007). Sometimes their effect on wellbeing is at least as significant as that of some diseases. If so then, using reprogenetic technologies to select or edit some of those traits would be morally permissible.

Second, as mentioned earlier, liberal eugenics advocates place significant value in reproductive freedom, and they contend that reprogenetic technologies can advance people’s reproductive choices in meaningful ways (Roberston 1994; Buchanan et al. 2000; Savulescu 2001; Agar 2004; Harris 2007; Green 2007; Buchanan 2011). If selecting or enhancing non-disease traits contributes to people’s reproductive projects, then provided that their actions do not clearly and seriously harm others, they should be able to use reprogenetic technologies with such aims.

Liberal eugenics proponents recognize that the permissibility to use reprogenetic technologies for non-disease traits raises significant moral concerns. For instance, obsessively focused prospective parents might design their children in ways that are overbearing or narrowly focused on a particular goal of the parents (Kass 2003; Sandel 2007). To avoid this problem, liberal eugenics advocates propose various limits on genetic interventions for non-disease traits. There is widespread agreement that interventions should not harm the future child (by creating a life so miserable as to be not worth living, as might be the subject of a wrongful life suit). Beyond that, variations include, for instance: (1) only interventions on traits that will benefit the future children no matter what life plan they decide to pursue and that do not reinforce problematic social norms (Agar 2004), (2) only interventions that preserve a child’s right to an open future (Davis 2010), or (3) only interventions that preserve open futures and protect some central core of our human nature (Glover 2006), or (4) only interventions that rational people agree can be understood to be in the best interest of the child (Green 2007).

How might one harm a child through choosing genetic traits? Perhaps by selecting for traits that clearly cause significant suffering and a typically short life span (e.g., Tay-Sachs disease, Lesch-Nyhan syndrome). Such constraints may seem unnecessary, given that most parents do not intentionally desire painful states for their children and would not seek to engineer them in this way. Also, relatively few genetic conditions will be so inherently debilitating as to make life so obviously miserable that would prevent one to consider that life is, on balance, a benefit.

Some of the other constraints are more contentious because they involve decisions about lives that would be worth living but have different features. For instance, it can be difficult to determine how one might ensure a child’s capacity to choose from a variety of life plans, or what traits would be necessary to protect a child’s right to an open future.

Davis (2010) and Agar (2004) both use deafness as a case for clarification, as such a case calls attention to the contentious nature of these decisions. They both take hearing to be a core human capacity, or a trait that is necessary for a wide variety of life plans. Hence, they argue, engineering a child to be deaf will limit that child’s future options. This is not, of course, to say that deaf individuals cannot live rewarding lives in which they flourish. Indeed, Agar recognizes that in some circumstances, lacking a capacity like hearing will only lead to a small difference in relative freedom, and if so, then we might not have a “general requirement to replace genetic arrangements linked with deafness” (2004: 105). On his view, prospective parents could engineer a child to be hearing because it would increase her real freedom but could not engineer a child to be deaf. Weighing in on the now widely analyzed case of two Deaf women (the capital “D” marks membership in the linguistic-cultural group of the Deaf; a small “d” only signifies the physical state of the body) who sought out a deaf sperm donor in hopes of having a deaf child (Spriggs 2002; Mundy 2002), Agar argues that they reduced their child’s real freedom by attempting to ensure that the child would be deaf. (Although this case did not involve reprogenetic technologies, one can easily imagine the use of such technologies to ensure the birth of a child who would be deaf.) Davis, too, acknowledges the claims of Deaf culture, and the reasons parents might prefer to have a child more like themselves, but argues that deliberately trying to conceive a child who will have relatively limited options – limited, in her view, not just due to enduring discrimination and social constraints, but also to bodily deficits – is morally impermissible.

Constraints on parental reproductive decisions about what traits to choose can also be seen as conflicting with reproductive freedom and parental autonomy. For instance, Green (2007) rejects the “right to an open future” language in part because he thinks parents must be allowed to do things that are more for their own interests than for the sake of their children, even when doing so affects how the children develop. Following William Ruddick (2007), he thinks of parents as both guardians and gardeners – protecting their children so that they can grow as they will, but also shaping how they grow in line with the parents’ hopes. Because he thinks “parental love almost always prevails” (Green, 2007: 114) – when we are faced with an actual child of ours, we will (typically) love the child, regardless of the child’s traits – he finds it morally acceptable that parents might want to choose traits for their children that do not strictly speaking preserve an open future. If parents want a child with a good shot at an athletic career, for instance, why not allow them to engineer for athleticism or great vision? Doing so might narrow other life opportunities, but not to the extent that the child couldn’t choose how her life goes. Her future would still be open enough. Green emphasizes parental reproductive autonomy, and the continuum between shaping the future possibilities for our existing children through parental values, education, religion, and more, and doing so through genetic interventions. His central recommendation is that genetic interventions should be aimed at what is reasonably in the child’s best interests (2007: 216), recognizing that the parents’ own interests are also relevant. By “reasonably” he means that it is not enough for parents to think that something is in their child’s best interests; their judgment must accord with that of most other informed members of society (2007: 216). Once that condition is satisfied, parents would be permitted to choose, according to their own tastes and preferences, within a wide range of options of relatively “all-purpose” traits (2007: 218). Just who the “informed” members of society are, is of course, a matter of some contention (for discussion, see Hayry 2010).

In sum, theorists who argue for the permissibility of using reprogenetic technologies and practices for disease and non-disease traits seek to preserve parental reproductive autonomy and to expand rather than reduce parental options. At the same time, they emphasize the need to increase the future child’s options, so long as doing so does not reinforce unjust social prejudices or threaten deeply held core values. One problem with this thesis, to be explored more in depth below in the section on critiques, is the appropriate scope of its central claims. Some critics (e.g., Asch 2000; Saxton 2000; Sparrow 2005), for instance, suggest that it fails to recognize that many of the presumptions about social prejudice could be extended to prejudice against people with certain diseases and disabilities, many of whom live relatively well with traits or characteristics that genetic enhancers may well desire to eliminate or attempt to improve upon. If we ought not collude with and exacerbate the social prejudices of sexism and racism through our reproductive genetic choices, why is doing the same for ableist norms permissible?

2.2.3 Morally permissible or obligatory?

But are parental choices regarding non-disease traits simply morally permissible or are they morally obligatory? While advocates of liberal eugenics agree on the obligation to address disease-related genomic variants, they disagree regarding whether the use of reprogenetic technologies for non-disease traits is a matter of moral permissibility or obligation. For some proponents, it is morally permissible, but not obligatory, for parents to use (with some constraints) reprogenetic technologies to select or edit non-disease traits (Agar 2004; Green 2007). They reject the moral obligatoriness of these practices for several reasons. First, there is the difficulty of determining just what counts as an improvement (beyond addressing serious disease). For instance, Agar (2004) questions whether it is obviously better for a child to be highly intelligent (roughly approximated by a likely IQ of 160). Might some parents reasonably choose a more moderate level of intelligence for a child, presuming the child will have greater social opportunities in the latter case? Perhaps the overall freedom of the child of moderate intelligence will be greater than that of the child with high intelligence, even though on that one dimension the child’s capacities are comparatively lower. Second, while one might consider it reasonable to incur risks of reprogenetic intervention to treat or prevent diseases, it is by no means clear that the risk-benefit balance would be appropriate when dealing with non-medical traits. Third, many recognize the importance and value of diversity (Green 2007). Given the many ways in which parents can attempt to improve the lives of their children, it is not clear why there would be a moral obligation to choose some non-disease traits over others rather than simply allowing parents to choose what they wish. Additionally, even if many people agree on the value of some non-disease characteristic and it becomes so common that its possession is practically required for equal participation in society, we might want to resist the temptation to make that intervention obligatory. For example, Agar (2004: 85) suggests this might happen with the trait “being somewhat happier than is now normal” if treatment tied to 5-HTTLPR, a genetic marker associated with upbeat temperament, became common. The now-typical temperament is not a disease, but a mere variety within the capacious normal range of functioning and would likely remain so even in a future society of 5-HTTLPR-enhanced people. A liberal eugenics cannot mandate any one view of the good life for its citizens.

Other proponents (Harris, 2002, 2007; Savulescu 2005; Savulescu and Kahane 2009) recognize the potential benefits of genetic enhancement, and forthrightly argue in favor of moral obligations to pursue them. Some such enhancements might be relatively minor, while others might be radical enough to eventually create a new species (Glover 2006).

Early work by Savulescu (2001), for instance, argues that parents have an obligation to produce the best children possible. This obligation cannot be owed to any particular child (given the non-identity problem), but is an impersonal obligation, to make the world a better place. If parents are using pre-implantation genetic diagnosis, they should always choose the embryo with the best chances at the best life. Non-disease traits, as mentioned earlier, can have significant effects on how well people’s lives go. Savulescu imagines that the rational parent could make no other decision but to avoid the negative linkages and promote the positive ones, where possible.

But this obligation is a moral one. Thus, the state need not (indeed, should not) legally coerce parents to select or edit their offspring to produce the best children they can have (Savulescu 2001). To the contrary, the state must balance the benefits of potential enforcement against its existing obligations to protect reproductive liberties. Nonetheless, the state might have good reason to encourage parents to take such action, through education and persuasive public health campaigns (not unlike anti-smoking campaigns). On this stronger view, others, too, would be right to express disapproval (Savulescu and Kahane 2009)

A similar position is advocated by Harris (2007). Although the arguments are about a moral obligation, these liberal eugenics advocates recognize that other competing priorities (e.g., autonomy of parents, welfare of other siblings, harm to others) could potentially trump this obligation.

For other liberal eugenics advocates the moral obligation to select or edit non-disease traits is grounded on social benefits. For instance, Buchanan (2011) is broadly optimistic about biomedical enhancement technologies – seeing them as not significantly unlike other enhancing societal innovations, such as literacy, numeracy and agriculture – and argues in favor of funding research and development into a broad array of enhancements. Doing so will be socially good: good for economic growth to avoid problems of illiteracy, sickness, etc. that can accompany, for instance, lower intelligence and merely typical immune systems.

Other theorists likewise offer social benefit justifications for genetic enhancement. Elster (2011) advocates a principle of general procreative beneficence, changing the last part of Savulescu’s PPB to an obligation to produce the best child, of those possible, “whose life will maximize the expected overall value in the world.” (2011: 483). Rather than focus on individual welfare, he recommends a system of obligations that starts from general social goods. Parents considering reproduction are then bound by a maximizing duty to the world.

Although Savulescu highlights the well-being of the individual in his work on procreative beneficence, in more recent work, the obligation to produce the best seems to have shifted from an obligation to improve the world by privately producing the best individuals, to an obligation to improve the world by producing individuals who will help to solve social problems. For instance, in their book Unfit for the Future (2012), Persson and Savulescu argue that we are obligated to fund and explore moral bioenhancement (2012: 2) – the idea that we could genetically or pharmacologically enhance our moral motivation, to reduce selfishness and aggression, and increase our sense of fairness, altruism, and our willingness to cooperate (see also Douglas 2008). Given the massive threats to human well-being presented by global climate change and the abundance of weapons of mass destruction – and the fact that solutions to these large-scale problems will require collective action to prevent future problems – Persson and Savulescu claim that traditional methods of moral change (e.g., education, public campaigns) are unlikely to be effective. If we care about the planet – and we should – then we are obligated to invest in moral bioenhancement research, and presumably ensure that if successful, it gets wide uptake (Persson and Savulescu 2012). Buchanan (2011) is sympathetic, noting that critics who worry about whether we will use this technology wisely may be short-sighted.

This suggestion about moral bioenhancement has sparked criticism focused on threats to human freedom (Harris 2011; Simkulet 2013), the meaning of being virtuous (Kabasenche 2013; Levin 2021), the complexity of human moral psychology (Zarpentine 2011), and the complexities of human biology (Wiseman 2016, Levin 2021).

3. Criticisms of “liberal” eugenics

Given the historical horrors associated with eugenics, it should be unsurprising that criticisms of liberal eugenics – whether regarding permission or obligation – are numerous and varied. Proponents have tried to address some of those criticisms in more or less convincing ways. In this section, we discuss some of the most significant criticisms that have been presented against liberal eugenics.

Some critics point out the difficulty of making meaningful comparisons about what is the “best” life (de Melo Martin 2004; Parker 2007). Other theorists – attentive to pervasive unjust discrimination in respect to sexism, racism, classism, and heterosexism – emphasize the broadly negative consequences of promoting or allowing liberal eugenic policies, given the aggregation of many individual choices, and the slippery slope to an older style of coercive eugenics (Duster 1990; Sparrow 2011a). When some parents insist that eliminating a trait will increase their child’s relative freedom and the group of people who live with that trait point to the ways in which that choice contributes to and reinforces social prejudice against their group (Lane and Grodin 1997; Saxton 2000; Asch 2000; Kaposy 2018), how are we to proceed with the regulation of “liberal” eugenics? Other critics call attention to the problematic conceptions of disability that underlie many of the arguments as well as the negative effects liberal eugenics is likely to have on existing people with disabilities (Asch 1999; Saxton 2000; Amundson 2005). Still other critics highlight potential damage to some core values, such as our conception of ourselves (Habermas 2003), what it means to be human (Sandel 2007; Kass 2003), and the parent-child relationship. When parents attempt to design their children, critics argue, they demonstrate a lack of humility in the face of nature, and more specifically, an attempt to control where they should instead appreciate what is given (Sandel 2007; Kass 2003).

3.1 The comparison problem

The reproductive choices that prospective parents are encouraged – or morally required – to make regarding their offspring are choices about selecting or enhancing their children or selecting the best they can have. All involve comparisons about traits that contribute to better or worse lives. But deciding which traits are positive, and of those, which are better than others, is a task far from simple. Critics point to the difficulty of ranking the expected well-being of future possible lives, given 1) disagreements about what traits are positive and negative, and the need to contextualize such traits in a particular environmental or societal context or family situation, and 2) the reality that most embryos will have a complex mixture of positive and negative traits making meaningful pairwise comparisons very difficult (de Melo Martin 2004; 2017; Parker 2007).

Savulescu and Kahane have tried to reply to these concerns in various ways. For instance, they have argued that critics are overstating their case and that we do this kind of ranking all the time when we make decisions about bringing up and educating our children. Ordinary morality, they argue, already asks parents to make these comparisons (Savulescu and Kahane 2009).

But it is far from obvious that this is the case (de Melo-Martin 2017). Clearly, common morality requires that prospective parents care about their children’s wellbeing, not that they maximize it. Moreover, in ordinary life, parents are not required to choose between child A and child B in virtue of which one is more likely to have the best life. Rather, when prospective parents make decisions that are likely to have an impact on their children’s welfare, such decisions involve comparisons between the life of a child if one does A or if one does B (e.g., if one promotes music training or sports).

Savulescu and Kahane (2009) also contend that in complex cases where different forms of life might be equally good or that are likely to contain incomparable forms of well-being, prospective parents choosing the child whose life can be expected to go best are free to choose any of the available options.

While this response suggests some greater flexibility in their view than might be apparent from the language of obligation, they do not always seem consistent in advocating for this flexibility (Sparrow 2007). Moreover, how will we know when different forms of life are equally good or when the associated well-being is incomparable?

Rather than giving a substantive account of well-being (they argue that their account is compatible with several theories of wellbeing such as hedonism, desire-fulfillment accounts, and objective list theories), Savulescu and Kahane simply assert confidence that we will be able to find an agreeable one. They offer simple examples to illustrate their view. Mild asthma, though only a minor impediment to well-being, is nonetheless not acceptable to choose if we have the information and an alternative embryo without the mild asthma. Deafness is clearly a detriment to well-being – at least in this society – and so should not be selected. They are careful to add that their view can appreciate deafness and recognize that it is clearly compatible with a good, even flourishing life. But a life without asthma or deafness, they submit, would clearly be better. Our obligation is to produce the best, not just a life compatible with flourishing. They thus see the need for two steps: finding a reasonable theoretical model of well-being, and then investigating whether a particular trait or condition is, on balance, a detriment to overall well-being on that view.

Despite their confidence, there is reason to think there will be significant disagreement in both steps. A theory of well-being that is acceptable to most might be so abstract as to fail to offer any significant help, and then the matter of determining how traits or conditions in question are related to expected well-being – such that we can do a comparison and select the best – will be even more difficult (Parker 2007). Parents who see value in a wide variety of ways of being in the world – both for the individual, and for society as a whole – may welcome children who have traits that are not standardly considered advantageous. Consider, for instance, positive accounts about raising children with Down syndrome (Berube 1998; Estreich 2011; Kaposy 2018), and even profound cognitive and physical disability (Kittay 1999). Indeed, as Sparrow (2007) has pointed out, on any of the accounts of wellbeing that Savulescu and Kahane consider, their proposal to choose the best child will turn out to have either counterintuitive or incoherent results. For instance, prospective parents who have a hedonist conception of wellbeing would be justified in choosing –indeed obligated to do so – the child whose brain chemistry is more likely to cause feelings of pleasure. Similarly, on a desire-fulfillment account, parents would have reasons to choose children who will grow up to have less ambition or curiosity as their preferences will be more likely satisfied, and thus would have better lives.

3.2 The promoting injustice problem

One of the most serious challenges to liberal eugenics is the concern that promoting –and more so requiring – these practices will contribute to social injustices. Indeed, the past use of eugenic policies provides good reasons for these worries.

The use of reprogenetic technologies to select or edit embryos can contribute to social injustices in various ways. For instance, given the significant costs of these technologies, its use is likely to increase inequalities between people who have the finances to afford them, and those who do not. The wealthy already have advantages; if we allow them to select or edit their offspring for improvements – so that they are smarter, faster, stronger, with less need to sleep, etc. – those children will be ever more competitive, and liable to increase the divide between rich and poor. (Lee Silver explores this dystopian possibility with the GenRich and the Naturals in his Remaking Eden, 1997, though he still supports the use of these technologies.)

Proponents of liberal eugenics have offer several responses to this concern. Some contend that these technologies will eventually become widely available and thus, that the critics’ worries are overstated. For example, Green (2007) notes that all innovations have a period of diffusion, during which early adopters pay higher prices and take some risks for the potential of leading the way forward, and then, if the technology is successful, prices drop and the wider public gains access through the market. Similarly, Buchanan (2011) compares genetic intervention to literacy, numeracy, and agriculture, and argues that these innovations too were only available to a few at the start, but then became broadly accessible.

For others this problem would be avoided by ensuring that the technologies are available to everyone, at least for traits that offer significant advantages (Buchanan 2011). Traits that only offer positional advantages – being taller than, perhaps faster than – would then be self-defeating (Buchanan et al. 2000) if available to all, and the allure might fade. Other traits – perhaps enhanced concentration, memory, or immunity – might be advantageous regardless of how many people have them. Providing funding to improve accessibility would then be necessary in order to ensure fairness.

Of course, whether these responses assuage concerns about increasing inequality depends on their feasibility. We have at least some reasons not to be very hopeful in such regard. After all, technologies such as IVF have been around for several decades, and though more people now have access to them, they are far from being cheap technologies, accessible to everyone who wishes to use them. Also, given the many serious problems our society faces, prioritizing access to these technologies rather than using resources for something else that would be more cost-effective would require justification.

Another way in which the use of reprogenetic technologies to select or edit embryos can contribute to social injustices is related not to access but to the kinds of values that are likely to guide parental choices. Critics highlight the troubling aggregate effect of individual choices, particularly when they are often ill-informed or relatively biased (de Melo Martin 2004; Goering 2000). They call attention to the deeply entrenched social injustices that pervade many societies, and that would typically inform individual free choices. Tremain (2006) discusses this effect in relation to disability. Russell (2010) argues that taking race to be a morally neutral feature (as Harris does) is only a “veiled attempt” to distinguish contemporary from historical eugenics practices. Perhaps race should be morally neutral, but it is not commonly treated as such, and opening up “choice” for people who harbor explicit or implicit biases related to race allows for those biases to shape the next generation. Oliver (2010) likewise highlights the trick of labeling gender a morally neutral category in a world filled with sexism, and also rightly emphasizes the levels of surveillance and control over women that are likely to follow the implementation of liberal eugenics. The unintended negative effects on pregnant women of increased attention to prenatal testing and surveillance of pregnancy generally are explored in Katz Rothman (1986), Rapp (1999), and Kukla (2008), but tend to be ignored by liberal eugenics advocates (Oliver 2010; de Melo-Martin 2017). (See also the entry on pregnancy, birth and medicine).

Liberal eugenics proponents are generally sympathetic to these concerns –indeed, some of them, have explored directly issues related to collective action problems (Anomaly 2020) – and have tried to respond to them. Some argue for constraints on the types of traits that parents should be allowed to select or edit (Agar 2004; Green 2007). Some characteristics, e.g., homosexuality, dark skin, will only be harmful to the individual in a morally defective social environment. What is needed in such a case, proponents argue, is to change attitudes and social practices instead of people’s genomes. For instance, Agar acknowledges that it would be preferable to eliminate racism (2004: 155), but given how entrenched it is in many societies, he considers whether we might want to allow some genetic interventions (e.g., engineering lighter skin tone) that could help individuals avoid suffering from it. On this view, the use of reprogenetic technologies to select or edit certain traits could be helpful at least in the short term, as it would help reduce some near-term suffering, and the social solutions are distant and rather unlikely. Ultimately, however, he claims that we should not allow this kind of genetic engineering – not simply because it seems to collude with a morally defective social environment, but because it reinforces and perhaps exacerbates that environment (it undermines work toward changing the morally defective social environment) (2004: 156–157). Liberal states remain neutral about what constitutes the good life, but impose certain restrictions (laws, policies) and offer education or aid (public health campaigns, food stamps) in the name of ensuring that citizens are safe, relatively stable, and have equal opportunity to pursue their goals.

Critics, however, fear that regulations put in place by advocates – whether in the form of laws, restrictions of the use of federal or state funds, or mere recommendations or guidelines from medical societies – will not be sufficient to avoid the negative consequences of eugenic practices (Duster 1990; Sparrow 2011a). They point out the many ways that a collection of individual choices, pressured by unjust social norms and assumptions, may lead to results not wholly unlike those of the old eugenics programs.

Green (2007) also recommends against interventions that would reinforce or increase discrimination, economic inequality, or racism (2007: 216–226), but he does so with some reservations. Parents understandably might want to reduce social burdens on their children through genetic interventions, he believes, and if we make doing so illegal, they will likely go elsewhere or underground to get what they want. He also – optimistically – suggests that stereotypes and fashions ebb and flow and may be self-corrective (2007: 227). Groups who have experienced significant discrimination over many generations will understandably reject such optimism. Indeed, the insufficient progress made against these social ills and the historical evidence arguably calls for all of us to be skeptical of this optimism.

Some have denied that social injustice could result from selecting or editing for particular traits that increase people’s chances at a better life (Savulescu 2001). To the extent that those traits contribute to inequality, the argument goes, it is unlikely that they could promote wellbeing (Savulescu 2001, 424). This claim seems, however, either irrelevant or false (de Melo-Martin 2017). Prospective parents choosing certain traits for their children could do so without realizing that they are actually undermining their children’s wellbeing (see Anomaly 2020, a proponent of liberal eugenics, who explicitly acknowledges coordination problems resulting from prospective parents’ choices – although he does not discuss choices that might increase sexism or racism). For instance, in a sexist society where parents systematically select for boys, it might be the case that the wellbeing of those boys could diminish because of the effects in society of fewer females. However, parents will realize this only once the choices contributing to injustice have already been made. But quite likely the claim is simply false. Consider racists societies. It is implausible that the selection of fair-skinned children in such societies would ever contribute to either a decrease in wellbeing for fair-skinned selected children or a decrease in social injustices against those with darker skin (Sparrow 2007).

In some cases, liberal eugenics proponents simply bite the bullet and argue that social injustices should be addressed by changing the social context rather than by constraining peoples’ reproductive choices (Savulescu 2001; Harris 2007; Savulescu and Kahane 2009). For them, prospective parents have a moral requirement to create the best child even if doing so results in social injustice. Savulescu and Kahane, for example, maintain that restricting access to reprogenetic interventions regarding sex, sexuality, or skin color, in order to ensure that unjust norms are not promoted is not justified. Indeed, Savulescu explicitly maintains that prospective parents have a moral obligation to select the best child, even if doing so increases social injustices (Savulescu 2001). For these proponents, society should address the unfair treatment of various groups, but they believe it should not be done through regulation of reproductive decision-making. Reproduction should not become an instrument of social change, at least not mediated or motivated at a social level.

3.3 The inconsistency problem

Recall that proponents of liberal eugenics argue that insofar as the choice of whether and how to use reprogenetic technologies is left up to individuals, these practices do not involve the immoral characteristics of their historical predecessors. Critics however have been highly skeptical that liberal eugenics proposals can escape the charge of being problematically eugenic. For instance, Bennett (2008) notes that an obligation to bring to birth the best children possible can only be established by placing a lower moral value on people with disabilities and that this obligation strongly argues for the introduction of eugenic policies.

Koch (2011) highlights similarities to past eugenic policies and accuses the central theorists of hubris – even a “huckster’s promise” (p. 199) – in presuming not only that we will be able to engineer complex traits like intelligence, but that they can know the appropriate regulatory limits and speak for all parents. In fact, the title of one of Persson and Savulescu’s book – Unfit for the Future (2012) – combined with its thesis regarding the need for tightened controls on liberal societies to preserve human security, makes comparisons to eugenicists ideas about unworthy lives unavoidable. (For a chilling review of Persson and Savulescu’s book, see Munsterhjelm 2011).

Buttressing these concerns, critics have also called attention to other potentially troubling assumptions in the theoretical framework of liberal eugenics that undermine claims about the differences with the old eugenics. Bennett (2008), for instance, contends that an appeal to impersonal or non-person-affecting harm cannot get supporters of liberal eugenics out of the non-identity problem without resorting to troubling social justifications. Insofar as the liberal eugenic project is not interested in the welfare of particular people but in producing what liberal eugenicists believe is the best world possible, it is difficult to see the differences with the old eugenics which aimed at promoting social and not personal goods.

So, even though advocates of liberal eugenics claim to value people equally (while acknowledging that their lives can go better or worse), this does not square with the idea of some worlds being morally preferable simply because they do not contain people with even mild disabilities or other presumably undesirable traits.

Similarly, Sparrow (2011a) points out the profound tension between the consequentialist justifications favored by liberal eugenics advocates and their assurances about the preservation of reproductive liberties. For example, taking Savulescu to task, Sparrow draws attention to the fact that in order to address concerns about colluding with unjust social norms – which Savulescu does by admitting that in certain cases parents ought not choose the “best” child for their social environment, given sexism, racism, etc. – Savulescu must revert to attending to social consequences, rather than individual welfare. But, this would commit proponents to sacrifice the well-being of individuals for the sake of social goals (2011a: 35–36). At a minimum, this calls for some justification about what social goods would trump the reproductive choices of individual prospective parents and about who should be making those decisions.

Sparrow also questions the justification for the assumption that parents ought to have the best child they could have. If we are morally obligated to produce the best, and if any embryos we can produce are not likely to rank very high relative to those of others, wouldn’t there also be an obligation to use a donated embryo (or a clone of the embryo that is the best) (Sparrow 2011a)? To be fair, Savulescu argues that other moral reasons can trump prospective parents’ moral obligations to choose the best child, and some degree of reproductive autonomy will surely fit there. Nonetheless, the tension between parental choices and consequentialist demands is difficult to escape. Moreover, as Sparrow points out, even if advocates of an obligation to enhance – like Savulescu and Harris – deny any requirement for the government to coerce individuals to participate in genetic interventions for the sake of enhancement, governments might still be obligated to implement policies that are not strictly coercive, e.g., systems of incentives and targeted health campaigns. Doing so would be a form of state-sponsored control – even if only through non-coercive pressure – of reproduction, and thus much more like troubling old-style eugenics.

Liberal eugenics proponents, particularly those who argue for a moral obligation to use reprogenetic technologies to improve our offspring, also have difficulties responding to concerns about the ways in which societal norms can lead toward homogeneity, even without state-sponsored programs. Parents who are free to choose characteristics for their offspring may be inclined to choose similarly, either because they agree (perhaps wrongly) that those characteristics are better, or because they worry their child will be at a substantial disadvantage relative to other children if they choose what is unpopular (or simply fail to intervene to ensure what is popular). If so, societal pressures on parental choices will have effects similar to policies enforced by a state – homogeneity of traits selected across the population (Duster 1990).

Indeed, some liberal eugenics proponents, aware of this concern, are willing to defend restrictions on parental reproductive freedom (Agar 2004). But here again, such restrictions are proposed in the name of ensuring a social good. Thus advocates of liberal eugenics face a dilemma: if parents should be the ones determining the future well-being of their children, then they will likely choose in ways that a) some liberals find counter-intuitive, i.e., choosing a Deaf child, and b) may, through market pressures and social norms, lead to homogeneity from “tyranny of the majority” (Sparrow 2011b: 515). If, on the other hand, parents should not have this leeway, if some restrictions prevent them from choosing in certain ways, then reproductive decisions about improving our offspring fall in the hands of the state. While, as mentioned earlier, most advocates of liberal eugenics express concern about the problem of aggregate effects of individual choices, they often end up seeming to dismiss them (Green 2007), presuming that education or other modes of dealing with the problems will be sufficient (Savulescu 2001), or just adding a qualification about the need to avoid reinforcing unjust social norms (Agar 2004), without fully exploring the difficulty of doing so.

3.4 Disability rights critiques

Common among liberal eugenic proponents is the assumption that disability is a bad state. Selecting or editing against disability is thus understood as what parents who care about their children’s wellbeing ought to do. In response, the disability community has presented strong arguments against liberal eugenics. The disability rights critique of the “new” eugenics takes on current practices such as prenatal testing and PGT and selective abortion or destruction of embryos, as well as options such as gene editing.

3.4.1 The expressivist argument

In what is known as the expressivist argument, disability theorists have argued that screening embryos or fetuses followed by destruction of the embryos or abortion of fetuses sends a negative message – “It is better not to exist than to have a disability” (Saxton 2000), “We do not want any more like you” (Wendell 1996) – to existing people with disabilities, particularly those living with disabilities for which testing is routinely done. The negative message is harmful and might be considered a form of discrimination.

The expressivist argument highlights the ways in which prenatal testing feels threatening to people with disabilities and their allies/advocates. As Parens and Asch point out,

If one thinks for even a moment about the history of our society’s treatment of people with disabilities, it is not difficult to appreciate why people identified with the disability rights movement might regard such testing as dangerous. … living with disabling traits need not be detrimental either to an individual’s prospects of leading a worthwhile life, or to the families in which they grow up, or to society at large. (2000: 4).

The expressivist argument is often defended by theorists who are staunchly pro-choice about abortion; they typically defend a woman’s legal right to choose abortion for any reason but present a moral argument against particular reasons for selective abortion. In making this distinction, they rely on the “any/particular” distinction proposed by Asch (2000): a woman who does not want any child because she is not ready to be a mother is different from one who is eager to be a mother but then rejects this particular fetus or embryo, based on screening. A different version of the expressivist argument looks beyond the individual act of testing to focus on the social offer of prenatal testing, particularly in a society where it has become routinized, to consider the negative evaluation it expresses about the lives of existing people with disabilities (Press 2000).

Objections have been raised regarding the meaning of such “expressions” (see, for instance, Buchanan 1996; Nelson 2000), and the necessity of the negative message (Baily 2000; McMahan 2005), as well as the relative moral significance of the message even if it is negative and expressed (Edwards 2004). Many theorists emphasize that one can value the person with a disability, while devaluing the disability (Savulescu 2001; Glover 2006; McMahan 2005). Glover (2006), for instance, is careful to note that we should be very clear about expressing support for existing people with disabilities even as we seek prenatal testing or other genetic interventions.

Such distinction, however, can be difficult to accept for individuals who experience their disability as a central part of their identity (for discussion, see Wendell 1996; Saxton 2000; Edwards 2004). Furthermore, as Holm (2007) notes, even if we could conceptually separate prenatal testing from the disrespectful and discriminatory messages about people with disabilities, that does not mean they aren’t deeply intertwined in current screening practices.

Some disability rights advocates reject the expressivist argument and are more concerned with the fairness and completeness of the information provided in the context of prenatal testing than in the practice as a whole (Shakespeare 2006; Klein 2011; Kaposy 2018). These advocates call attention to the attitudes, practices, education, and research of professionals involved in administering prenatal testing and the prejudices rampant in our society against people with disabilities. They evince a disregard for the experiences of disability as well as an ignorance of disability issues. The biases against people with disabilities that underly decisions about selective abortion threaten the wellbeing of those with disabilities.

Kaposy’s book, Choosing Down Syndrome, for example, presents an extended argument for the position that people with Down Syndrome can and often do have good lives, full of the wide variety of joys and sorrows attendant to being human. As he notes early on, the genetic realities (i.e., what is available during prenatal testing) of Down Syndrome don’t tell the whole story.

He worries that expanded use of non-invasive first trimester tests may ultimately increase the number of abortions of fetuses with Trisomy 21 and with it, further threaten the wellbeing of people with Down Syndrome. But rather than arguing that people should not selectively abort fetuses with Trisomy 21, pro-choice Kaposy argues for a more capacious understanding of how good life can be and why choosing to continue pregnancy after such a diagnosis is perfectly reasonable. Indeed, if more people chose to have children with Down syndrome this would counter the prevalence of harmful prejudices. His key concern is that much of the impetus to abort following a prenatal diagnosis comes from misinformation, faulty inferences, and biases that people might disavow if they were made aware of them. He offers his book as a way to increase the “social fund of knowledge.”

3.4.2 The meaning of disability

Part of what concerns disability rights advocates is the questionable relation between the existence of certain impairments or bodily anomalies and the availability of equality of opportunity or well-being (Silvers, Wasserman, and Mahowald 1998; Amundson 2005; Asch and Wasserman 2005) that seems to be a common presumption in liberal eugenics theories. Broadly, they worry that many of these theorists are relatively uninformed about the life experiences of people with disabilities, or unfairly dismissive of their claims (Amundson 2005; Goering 2008), and thus rely on an overly negative evaluation of their quality of life. As such, efforts to promote “good birth” often undervalue existing people with disabilities. Additionally, advocates of liberal eugenics, it is argued, allow one trait to stand in for all of what a potential person can be (Asch and Wasserman 2005), and underestimate the value of human diversity that includes non-standard modes of human functioning linked to disability (Silvers 1998; Garland-Thomson 2012), and the possibility of “gains” made possible through living with disability (Baumrin and Murray 2014). (For more discussion, see entries on disability: definitions and models; and feminist perspectives on disability.)

At least some liberal eugenic advocates are aware of this concern and have explored the possibility that our current social norms might be “morally defective” in respect to disability. For instance, Glover defends the permissibility of parental choice within some limits, but he investigates just what counts as a disability. He proposes that a disability involves a functional limitation that “impairs the capacity for human flourishing” (2006: 9), either by itself or in conjunction with social disadvantage. Thus, although racism results in social disadvantage, having dark skin is not itself a disability, because it has no associated functional limitation. Some conditions previously considered disabilities – e.g., achondroplasia – need not be disabilities at all, according to this view (for more on achondroplasia, see Miller 2006; Davis 2010). Glover understands “functional limitations” as a contrast to normal human functioning, a species-based notion that itself involves significant degrees of variation and the matter of setting (rather than discovering) boundaries. As such, “normal” is not purely statistical, but also partly normative (see also Buchanan et al. 2000). Glover recognizes the conceptual messiness of “normal functioning” but still prefers it to alternatives. If an individual prefers a bodily state that might otherwise count as a functional limitation (his example is Asperger’s syndrome), then it isn’t a disability for her (2006: 14); it does not affect her flourishing. He is much less sanguine about blindness and deafness. Both conditions, he suggests, confer significant functional limitations, and although they can certainly allow individuals to have lives of great worth and flourishing – he explores conflicting first-person accounts about going blind and gaining sight to explore the positive sides of the conditions and the negative side of normalizing (2006: 15–22) – he concludes that they are nonetheless disabilities that confer clear disadvantages (related to navigation, safety, etc.). As such, they are disabilities that are understandably acceptable to some, but that ought not be chosen for future children. Such future children, like their parents, might be able to flourish with the condition, but engineering it means intentionally impairing at least some capacities commonly relevant to flourishing. Interestingly, Glover concludes that the Deaf lesbian couple who sought a deaf sperm donor did nothing wrong in conceiving their deaf child (the child cannot be harmed by his clearly worthwhile existence), but he argues they would be wrong in not giving him a cochlear implant if the technology were perfected (2006: 26).

Glover’s attention to the difficulty of defining disability is helpful, and he emphasizes the importance of taking seriously the perspectives of people who have lived with the disabilities in question. But disability scholars push back on this line of argument by noting the inherent presumptions about what constitutes flourishing or well-being that underlie the view (Campbell and Stramondo 2017; see also Schroeder 2018 who articulates a different view about the relevance of well-being, but with similar practical conclusions). For instance, what justifies the claim that living in some disabled bodies is clearly disadvantageous, even if the individual living that way understandably values her body, and not just as a necessary reality but as a point of pride (Barnes 2016, esp. Ch 6)? What epistemic grounds are there for the claim that such a person has adapted – perhaps admirably, to a lesser condition – rather than simply enjoys living one of a wide variety of good lives (Amundson 2005, Barnes 2016, Stramondo 2021)?

Further, some scholars argue that disability (and also race) are not simple passive products of reproduction. They are instead active technologies in reproduction. They are instruments created and used in particular contexts and in the service of certain goals and processes (Valentine 2021). Eugenics arguments often naturalize race and disability as features of bodies, but these categories can instead be understood as practices, relations, and forms of social organization (Valentine 2021, Benjamin 2019). On this view, the idea that disability just is a functional limitation with inherent disadvantages – disadvantages that can be addressed through reprogenetics interventions – ignores the fluidity of the categories and the ways in which larger forces are at play, and it thereby ignores social problems, and social, structural solutions (Valentine 2021).

3.5 Undermining core values

Given the emphasis that liberal eugenics proponents place on reproductive freedom, another concern raised by critics is related to the possibility that the choices prospective parents will make will undermine some central core of human nature or of our normal human capacities. For some critics such as Kass (2003) and Sandel (2007), the human disposition of hubris or mastery that the project of genetic engineering expresses and promotes, undermines a central aspect of humanity: our appreciation of the gifted character of human life, the sense that the way we are is not solely the product of our own doing. Similarly, Habermas (2003) contends that in transforming reproduction from a natural process of creation to one of manufacture, genetic engineering practices will fundamentally alter relationships in the moral community as well as human freedom and autonomy.

Concern with the effects of reprogenetics on human nature are also present in proponents of liberal eugenics. For instance, Glover proposes two potential features of great value in our current nature: our capacity to rein in our violent and destructive tendencies, and our capacity to aim for a good life (for Glover, this is about a balance between happiness and flourishing). These are very tentatively offered, with many qualifications about possible linkages to other traits of value, and the likelihood that we might be more successful in securing containment through non-genetic means. Still, the suggestion is that if parents might be tempted to select for genetic markers linked to, for instance, extreme selfishness or emotional coldness, in an attempt to have their child succeed in gaining power and riches, doing so would seem to endanger parts of our nature that we can widely agree are deeply valuable for society as a whole.

Most advocates of liberal eugenics, however, dismiss worries about effects on human nature. They contend that we have likely unjustifiable intuitions that our present nature is worth preserving (Buchanan 2011) or they argue that a main trait of human nature is its changeability (Harris 2007). Other advocates claim that we have a tendency to overvalue the “status quo” and this leads us to see some core values, e.g. openness to the unbidden, current longevity parameters, etc., as optimal when in fact we are simply affected by status quo bias (Green 2007; Bostrom and Ord 2006).

Some critics (Sparrow 2012) have argued that advocates of liberal eugenics face a problem if they reject the idea that some conception of human nature or of normal human capacities matters for debates about genetic improvement. They must accept that parents’ have reasons to choose some traits in spite of repugnant consequences, or that parents’ choices regarding some human traits must take into account the interests of society. Others contend that proponents of liberal eugenics simply fail to appreciate the historicity of the human condition and view human beings as a collection of parameters that can be optimized in isolation of each other (Nordmann 2007).

Still other critics (Sandel 2007; Kass 2003) highlight the ways in which the motivations for the genetic improvement of our offspring express hubris, a “drive to mastery” (Sandel 2007: 27) that, left unchecked, threatens not just human nature, but the meaning of parent-child relationships, from openness to the “unbidden” and unconditional love to design and manufacture (Kass 2003); from loving whatever child comes along, to loving a particular child because of chosen traits (Herissone-Kelly 2007).

Sandel recognizes that many parents already exert excessive influence on their children’s lives, and may fail to love them unconditionally, but he worries that genetic technologies will only exasperate that tendency. Even though we might undertake genetic practices for the benefit of our offspring, in so doing, we make them into creatures who must be indebted to us for their gifts, and for whom our love may be conditional on fulfilling our desires. If a parent designs a child to be a certain way, her investment will increase the parent’s demands. In a similar vein, Kass (2003) notes that parental hopes will become parental expectations if we allow the designing of children. The concern about parental expectations and how choice might affect the unconditional love we envision for parents is also explored by disability scholars (Kittay and Kittay 2000; Asch and Wasserman 2005).

Proponents of liberal eugenics respond that much of what we attempt to do in medicine to create treatments for disease could itself fit under a “drive to mastery” and might likewise question our commitment to being “open to the unbidden” (see Buchanan 2011). Also, if the point is simply that we must be attentive to our inclinations to hubris – we might get carried away in thinking we can enhance appropriately – then we could heed that warning without rejecting the use of genetic technologies to improve our offspring entirely. Other advocates simply deny the value of humility (Glover 2006: 113).

Kamm (2005) dismisses Sandel’s worries about mastery and openness to the unbidden but raises a different kind of worry about the enhancement project, one related to concerns regarding aggregate effects of individual choice. Her fear is that we may lack imagination to see how a variety of traits (and different combinations of traits) can create goods we have yet to envision or experience. Parents who might wish to design their child to have the good trait of composing classical music, for instance, would have been unable to conceive that it would be good to have a child who turns out to be one of the Beatles, at to have conceived it, would have involved creating the style before the Beatles did.

Another worry linked to the desire for control comes from Habermas (2003) who grounds his arguments in a deontological framework. He argues that by engineering our children in very specific ways – beyond the treatment of disease – we may undermine their capacity for self-definition, their sense of being responsible for themselves (in respect to creating their own identities), and their freedom (2003: 12–13). He claims that it is not genetic engineering per se that is the problem, but rather the scope of its use as well as the attitude. In this case, the wrong attitude is one that is not attentive to likely second person consent to the changes – would the child have granted approval for the selected traits? For Habermas, what matters is the attitude of appreciating the need for the future person’s presumed consent, rather than the idea of making the change merely according to parental preferences.

Further, he worries that parents who engineer their children will have expectations of their children “without, however, providing the addressee [the child] with an opportunity to take a revisionist stand” (2003: 51). Why not? The genetic program is a mute, and in a sense, unanswerable fact. This is so because, unlike persons born naturally, someone who is at odds with genetically fixed intentions is barred from developing, in the course of a reflectively appropriated and deliberately continued life history, an attitude toward her talents (and handicaps) which implies a revised self-understanding and allows for a productive response to the initial situation (Habermas 2003: 62).

The basis for this claim seems to rest on a distinction between “the grown and the made” (Habermas, 2003: 52). Being created to be a particular way is being made, and so objectified, a product of the parents. Being grown, by contrast, recognizes the individual subjectivity of the new person, who is equal to her parents and not defined by them. This objection shares much with Kass’s (2003) concerns about genetic despotism – control of one generation by the previous one.

Many liberal eugenics advocates (Glover 2006; Green 2007; Buchanan 2011) are also dismissive of these concerns. For them, it is unclear how genetic selection or editing is different from other activities that presumably are also intended by parents to “make” their children, such as registering them in school, sports practice, or piano lessons with the aim of having children who are likely to became academics, athletes, or musicians. Moreover, liberal eugenics proponents contend that it is not clear either why the genetically designed child could not be revisionist in her response to her parents. Designing a child to have features that make, for example, an athletic career possible (even likely) is not the same as ensuring such a career, or even an athletic body. Parenting would not lose its challenges simply because of the origins of the features of the child in question.

However, critics contend that advocates of liberal eugenics assume that there are no morally relevant differences in the means parents take to try to shape their children. Such assumption seems questionable. For instance, the longer iterative process of educating a child enforces a kind of communicative engagement in ways that cannot be part of engineering an embryo (Malmqvist 2011). Indeed, arguably it is not just the means that are different (de Melo-Martín 2018). The goals of engineering an embryo –through selection or editing – and the goals of educating a child –in various ways – are similar only in appearance. While genetic selection or editing focuses on a particular trait, the emphasis of education or training is the whole person, with attention to the particular child’s personality, even if the aspect of interest –e.g., music or sport excellence – are the characteristic that parents aim to inculcate in their children.


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