The Human Genome Project

First published Wed Nov 26, 2008; substantive revision Thu Sep 14, 2023

The 20th century opened with rediscoveries of Gregor Mendel’s studies on patterns of inheritance in peas and closed with a research project in molecular biology that was heralded as the initial and necessary step for attaining a complete understanding of the hereditary nature of humankind. Both basic science and technological feat, the Human Genome Project (HGP) sought to map and sequence the haploid human genome’s 22 autosomes and 2 sex chromosomes, bringing to biology a “big science” model previously confined to physics. Officially launched in October 1990, the project’s official date of completion was timed to coincide with celebrations of the 50th anniversary of James D. Watson and Francis Crick’s discovery of the double-helical structure of DNA. On 12 April 2003, heads of government of the six countries that contributed to the sequencing efforts (the U.S., the U.K., Japan, France, Germany, and China) issued a joint proclamation that the “essential sequence of three billion base pairs of DNA of the Human Genome, the molecular instruction book of human life,” had been achieved (Dept. of Trade 2003). HGP researchers compared their feat to the Apollo moon landing and splitting the atom. They foresaw the dawn of a new era, “the era of the genome,” in which the genome sequence would provide a “tremendous foundation on which to build the science and medicine of the 21st century” (NHGRI 2003).

This article begins by providing a brief history of the Human Genome Project. An overview of various scientific developments that unfolded in the aftermath of the HGP follows; these developments came to be referred to as “postgenomics” to distinguish them from activities labelled “genomics” that are associated specifically with the mapping and sequencing of the genomes of humans and other organisms. The article then discusses some of the conceptual and social and ethical issues that gained the attention of philosophers during the project’s planning stages and as it unfolded, and which remain salient today. Novel with the HGP was the decision of its scientific leadership to set aside funds to study the project’s ethical, legal, and social implications (ELSI). Today, from a vantage point more than two-and-a-half decades after that decision was made, it is possible to reflect on the ELSI model and its relevance for ongoing biomedical research in genetics and genomics/postgenomics.

1. The Human Genome Project: From Genomics to Postgenomics

1.1 Map First, Sequence Later

The idea of sequencing the entire human genome arose in the U.S. in the mid-1980s and is attributed to University of California at Santa Cruz chancellor Robert Sinsheimer, Salk Institute researcher Renato Dulbecco, and the Department of Energy’s (DOE’s) Charles DeLisi. While the idea found supporters among prominent molecular biologists and human geneticists such as Walter Bodmer, Walter Gilbert, Leroy Hood, Victor McKusick, and James D. Watson, many of their colleagues expressed misgivings. There were concerns among molecular biologists about the routine nature of sequencing and the amount of “junk DNA” that would be sequenced, that the expense and big science approach would drain resources from smaller and more worthy projects, and that knowledge of gene sequence was inadequate to yield knowledge of gene function (Davis and Colleagues 1990).

Committees established to study the feasibility of a publicly funded project to sequence the human genome released reports in 1988 that responded to these concerns. The Office for Technology Assessment report, Mapping Our Genes: Genome Projects: How Big, How Fast? downplayed the concerns of scientist critics by emphasizing that there was not one but many genome projects, that these were not on the scale of the Manhattan or Apollo projects, that no agency was committed to massive sequencing, and that the study of other organisms was needed to understand human genes. The National Research Council report, Mapping and Sequencing the Human Genome, sought to accommodate the scientists’ concerns by formulating recommendations that genetic and physical mapping and the development of cheaper, more efficient sequencing technologies precede large-scale sequencing, and that funding be provided for the mapping and sequencing of nonhuman (“model”) organisms as well. Genome projects were underway even before the Office for Technology Assessment and National Research Council reports were released. The DOE made the first push toward a “big science” genome project, with DeLisi advancing a five-year plan in 1986. The DOE undertaking produced consternation among biomedical researchers who were traditionally supported by the National Institutes of Health’s (NIH’s) intramural and extramural programs, and James Wyngaarden, head of the NIH, was persuaded to lend his agency’s support to the project in 1987. Congressional funding for both agencies was in place in time for fiscal year 1988. The National Research Council report estimated the total cost of the HGP at $3 billion.

The DOE and NIH coordinated their efforts with a Memorandum of Understanding in 1988 that agreed on an official launch of the Human Genome Project on October 1, 1990 and an expected date of completion of 2005. The DOE established three genome centers in 1988–89: at Lawrence Berkeley, Lawrence Livermore, and Los Alamos National Laboratories. David Smith led the DOE-HGP at the outset; he was followed by David Galas from 1990 to 1993, and Ari Patrinos for the remainder of the project. The NIH instituted a university grant-based program for human genome research and placed Watson, co-discoverer of the structure of DNA and director of Cold Spring Harbor Laboratory, in charge in 1988. In October 1989, Watson assumed the helm of the newly established National Center for Human Genome Research (NCHGR) at the NIH. During 1990 and 1991, Watson expanded the grants-based program to fund seven genome centers for five-year periods to work on large-scale mapping projects: Washington University, St. Louis; University of California, San Francisco; Massachusetts Institute of Technology; University of Michigan; University of Utah; Baylor College of Medicine; and Children’s Hospital of Philadelphia. Francis Collins succeeded Watson in 1993, establishing an intramural research program at the NCHGR to complement the extramural program of grants for university-based research that already existed. In 1997, the NCHGR was elevated to the status of a research institute and renamed the National Human Genome Research Institute (NHGRI).

Although the HGP’s inceptions were in the U.S., it did not take long for mapping and sequencing the human genome to become an international venture (see Cook-Deegan 1994). France began to fund genome research in 1988 and had developed a more centralized, although not very well-funded, program by 1990. More significant were the contributions of Centre d’Etudes du Polymorphisme Humain (CEPH) and Généthon. CEPH, founded in 1983 by Jean Dausset, maintained a collection of DNA donated by intergenerational families to help in the study of hereditary disease; in 1991, with funding from the French muscular dystrophy association, CEPH director Daniel Cohen oversaw the launching of Généthon as an industrial-sized mapping and sequencing operation. The U.K.’s genome project received its official start in 1989, though Sydney Brenner had commenced genome research at the Medical Research Council laboratory several years before this. Medical Research Council funding was supplemented with private monies from the Imperial Cancer Research Fund and, later, the Wellcome Trust. The Sanger Centre, led by John Sulston and funded by Wellcome and the Medical Research Council, opened in October 1993. Japan, ahead of the U.S. in having funded the development of automated sequencing technologies since the early 1980s, was the major genome player outside the U.S. and Europe with several government agencies beginning small-scale genome projects in the late-1980s and early-1990s (Swinbanks 1991). Germany and China subsequently joined the U.S., France, U.K., and Japan in the publicly funded international consortium that was ultimately responsible for sequencing the genome.

The NIH and DOE released a joint five-year plan in 1990 that set specific benchmarks for mapping, sequencing, and technological development. The plan was updated in 1993 to accommodate progress that had been made, with the new five-year plan in effect through 1998 (Collins and Galas 1993). As the National Research Council report had recommended, priority at the outset of the project was given to mapping rather than sequencing the human genome. HGP scientists sought to construct two kinds of maps: genetic maps and physical maps. Genetic maps order polymorphic markers linearly on chromosomes; the aim is to have these markers densely enough situated that linkage relations can be used to locate chromosomal regions containing genes of interest to researchers. Physical maps order collections (or “libraries”) of cloned DNA fragments that cover an organism’s genome; these fragments can then be replicated in quantity for sequencing. Technological progress was needed to make sequencing more efficient and less costly for any significant progress to be made. For the meantime, efforts would focus on sequencing the smaller genomes of less complex model organisms (Watson 1990). The model organisms selected for the project were the bacterium Escherichia coli, the yeast Saccharomyces cerevisiae, the roundworm Caenorhabditis elegans, the fruitfly Drosophila melanogaster, and the mouse Mus musculans.

As 1998, the last year of the revised five-year plan and midpoint of the project’s projected 15-year span, approached, many mapping goals had been met. In 1994, Généthon completed a genetic map with more than 2,000 microsatellite markers at an average spacing of 2.9 centimorgans (cM) and only one gap larger than 20 cM (Gyapay et al. 1994); the goal was a resolution of 2 to 5 cM by 2005. The genetic mapping phase of the project came to a final close in March 1996 with Généthon’s completion of a genetic map containing 5,264 microsatellite markers located to 2,335 positions with an average spacing of 1.6 cM (Dib et al. 1996). In 1995, a physical map with 94 percent coverage of the genome and 15,086 sequence-tagged site (STS) markers at average intervals of 199 kilobases (kb) was published (Hudson et al. 1995); the initial goal was STS markers spaced approximately 100 kb apart by 1995, a deadline the revised plan extended to 1998. In 1998, a physical map of 41,664 STS markers was published (Deloukas et al. 1998). Sequencing presented more of a challenge, despite ramped-up sequencing efforts over the previous several years at the U.K.’s Wellcome Trust-funded Sanger Centre in Cambridge and the NHGRI (previously NCHGR)-funded centers at Houston’s Baylor College of Medicine, Stanford University, The Institute for Genomic Research (TIGR), University of Washington-Seattle, Washington University School of Medicine in St. Louis, and Whitehead Institute for Biomedical Research/MIT Genome Center. The genomes of the smallest model organisms had been sequenced. In April 1996, an international consortium of mostly European laboratories published the sequence for S. cerevisiae which was the first eukaryote completed, with 12 million base pairs and 5,885 genes and at a cost of $40 million (Goffeau et al. 1996). In January 1997, University of Wisconsin researchers completed the sequence of E. coli with 4,638,858 base pairs and 4,286 genes (Blattner et al. 1997). However, with only three percent of the human genome sequenced, sequencing costs hovering at $.40/base, and the desired high output not yet achieved by the sequencing centers, and about $1.8 billion spent, doubts existed about whether the HGP’s target date of 2005 could be met.

1.2 Race to the Genome

Suddenly, the publicly funded HGP faced a challenge from the private sector. In May 1998, TIGR’s J. Craig Venter announced a partnership with Applied Biosystems to sequence the entire genome in three short years and for a fraction of the cost. The new company, based in Rockville, MD and later named Celera Genomics, planned to use “whole-genome shotgun” (WGS) sequencing, an approach different from the HGP’s. The HGP confined the shotgun method to cloned fragments already mapped to specific chromosomal regions: these are broken down into smaller bits then amplified by bacterial clones, sequences are generated randomly by automated machines, and computational resources are used to reassemble sequence using overlapping areas of bits. Shotgunning is followed by painstaking “finishing” to fill in gaps, correct mistakes, and resolve ambiguities. What Celera was proposing for the shotgun method was to break the organism’s entire genome into millions of pieces of DNA with high-frequency sound waves, sequence these pieces using hundreds of Applied Biosystem’s new capillary model machines, and reassemble the sequences with one of the world’s largest civilian supercomputers without the assistance provided by the preliminary mapping of clones to chromosomes. When WGS sequencing was considered as a possibility by the HGP, it was rejected because of the risk that repeat sequences would yield mistakes in reassembly (Green 1997; Venter et al. 1996; Weber and Myers 1997). But Venter by this time had successfully used the method to sequence the 1.83 million nucleotide bases of the bacterium Hemophilus influenzae—the first free-living organism to be completely sequenced—in a year’s time (Fleischmann et al. 1995).

HGP scientists downplayed the media image of a race to sequence the genome often over the next couple of years, but they were certainly propelled by worries that funding would dry up before the sequence was complete given private sector willingness to take over and that the sequence data would become proprietary information. Wellcome more than doubled its funds to the Sanger Centre (to £205 million) and the center changed its goal from sequencing one-sixth of the genome to sequencing one-third, and possibly one-half (Dickson 1998). The NHGRI and DOE published a new five-year plan for 1998-2003 (Collins et al. 1998). The plan moved the final completion date forward from 2005 to 2003 and aimed for a “working draft” of the human genome sequence to be completed by December 2001. This would be achieved by delaying the finishing process, no longer going clone-by-clone to shotgun, reassemble, and finish the sequence of one clone before proceeding to the next. With only six percent of the human genome sequence completed, the plan called for new and improved sequencing technologies that could increase the sequencing capacity from 90 Mb per year at about $.50 per base to 500 Mb per year at no more than $.25 per base. Goals for completing the sequencing of the remaining model organisms were also set: December 1998 for C. elegans which was 80 percent complete, 2002 for D. melanogaster which was nine percent complete, and 2005 for M. musculus which was still at the physical mapping stage.

An interim victory for the publicly funded project followed when, on schedule, the first animal sequence, that of C. elegans with 97 million bases and 19,099 genes, was published in Science in December 1998 (The C. elegans Sequencing Consortium 1998). This was the product of a 10-year collaboration between scientists at Washington University in St. Louis (headed by Bob Waterston) and the Sanger Centre (headed by John Sulston), carried out at a semi-industrial scale with more than 200 people employed in each lab working around the clock. In March 1999, the main players—the NHGRI, Sanger Centre, and DOE—advanced the date of completion of the “working draft”: five-fold coverage of at least 90 percent of the genome was to be completed by the following spring (Pennisi 1999; Wadman 1999). This change reflected improved output of the new model of automated sequencing machines, diminished sequencing costs at $.20 to $.30 per base, and the desire to speed up the release of medically relevant data. NHGRI would take responsibility for 60 percent of the sequence, concentrating these efforts at Baylor, Washington University, and Whitehead/MIT; 33 percent of the sequence would be the responsibility of the Sanger Centre; and the remaining sequence would be supplied by the DOE’s Joint Genome Institute (JGI) in Walnut Creek, CA into which its three centers had merged in January 1997.

The first chromosomes to be completed (this was to finished, not working draft, standards) were the two smallest: the sequence for chromosome 22 was published by scientists at the Sanger Centre and partners at University of Oklahoma, Washington University in St. Louis, and Keio University in Japan in December 1999 (Dunham et al. 1999); the sequence for chromosome 21 was published by an international consortium of mostly Japanese and German labs—with half the sequencing carried out at Japan’s RIKEN—in May 2000 (Hattori et al. 2000). The remaining chromosomes lagged behind. On 26 June 2000, when Collins, Venter, and the DOE’s Patrinos joined U.S. President Bill Clinton (and British Prime Minister Tony Blair by satellite link) at a White House press conference (see Clinton, et al. 2000) to announce that the human genome had been sequenced, this was more an arranged truce than a tie for the prize. An editorial in Nature described the fanfare of 26 June as an “extravagant” example—one reaching “an all-out zenith or nadir, according to taste”—of scientists making public announcements not linked to peer-reviewed publication, here to bolster share prices (Celera) and for political effect (the HGP) given the “months to go before even a draft sequence will be scientifically useful” (Anonymous 2000, p. 981). Neither of the two sequence maps was complete (Pennisi 2000). The HGP had not met its previous year’s goal of a working draft covering 90 percent of the genome. Assisted by its researchers’ access to HGP data stored on public databases,[1] Celera’s efforts were accepted as being further along: the company’s press release that day announced 99 percent coverage of the genome.

Peer-reviewed publications came almost eight months later. Negotiated plans for joint publication in Science broke down when terms of agreement over data release could not be negotiated, with the journal’s editors willing to publish Celera’s findings without Venter meeting the standard requirement that the sequence data be submitted to GenBank. Press conferences in London and Washington, D.C. on 12 February preceded publications that week—by HGP scientists in Nature on 15 February 2001 and by Venter’s team in Science on 16 February 2001. The HGP draft genome sequence covered about 94 percent of the genome, with about 25 percent in the finished form already attained for chromosomes 21 and 22. Indeed, the authors themselves described it as “an incomplete, intermediate product” which “contains many gaps and errors” (International Human Genome Sequencing Consortium 2001, p. 871). The results published by Celera had 84–90 percent of the genome covered by scaffolds at least 100 kb in length, with the composition of the scaffolds averaging 91–92 percent sequence and 8–9 percent gaps (Venter et al. 2001). In the end, Celera’s published genome assembly made significant use of the HGP’s publicly available map and sequence data, which left open for debate the question whether WGS sequencing alone would have worked (see Waterston et al. 2002; Green 2002; and Myers et al. 2002).

Since the gaps in the sequence were unlikely to contain genes, and only genes as functional segments of DNA have potential commercial value, Celera was happy to leave the gaps for the HGP scientists to fill in. Despite being timed to coincide with celebrations of the 50th anniversary of the Watson–Crick discovery of the double-helical structure of DNA, there was less fanfare surrounding the official date of completion of the HGP in April 2003, two years earlier than had been anticipated at the time of its official launch in October 1990, and several months earlier than called for in the most recent five-year plan. In the end, sequencing—the third phase of the publicly-funded project—was carried out at 16 centers in six countries by divvying up among them sections of chromosomes for sequencing. 85 percent of the sequencing, however, was done at the five major sequencing centers (Baylor, Washington University, Whitehead/MIT, Sanger Center, and DOE’s JGI), with the Sanger Centre responsible for nearly one-third. The cost was lower than anticipated, with $2.7 billion spent by U.S. agencies and £150 million spent by Wellcome Trust. The “finished” reference DNA sequence for Homo sapiens was made publicly accessible on the Internet. However, for various technical reasons, the human genome’s 3.1 billion nucleotide bases had not yet been completely sequenced at the close of the HGP in 2003.[2]

1.3 Aftermath

Public support was won for the HGP through scientists’ promises of the revolutionary benefits of genome-based research for pharmaceutical and other biomedical applications. At the outset of the HGP, these promises were sometimes alarmingly deterministic, reductionistic, and overblown, such as when Science editor Daniel Koshland (1989) submitted that genes are responsible not only for manic-depression and schizophrenia but also poverty and homelessness, and that sequencing the genome represented “a great new technology to aid the poor, the infirm, and the underprivileged” (p. 189). More circumspect claims by scientist-proponents of the HGP were no less optimistic. Leroy Hood expressed the belief that “we will learn more about human development and pathology in the next twenty-five years than we have in the past two thousand” (1992, p. 163). Hood expected the HGP to facilitate movement from a reactive to preventive mode of medicine, which would “enable most individuals to live a normal, healthy, and intellectually alert life without disease” (p. 158). Francis Collins predicted that sequencing the genome would “dramatically accelerate the development of new strategies for the diagnosis, prevention, and treatment of disease, not just for single-gene disorders but for the host of more common complex diseases (e.g., diabetes, heart disease, schizophrenia, and cancer)” (1999, p. 29). Collins envisioned that, by 2010, genetically-based “individualized medicine” would be a reality: physicians would routinely take cheek swabs from patients and send their DNA out for testing; based on results of genetic testing (returned within a week), physicians would be able to advise their patients about their absolute and relative risks for contracting various adult-onset diseases; by taking preventive measures (e.g., quitting smoking, having an annual colonoscopy, etc.), patients would be able to prevent the onset of any such diseases or minimize their effects; and the field of pharmacogenomics would have “blossomed” sufficiently for physicians to be able to prescribe prophylactic medications tailored precisely to the genetic make-up of their patients, so to promote efficacy and prevent adverse reactions.

Genome-wide association studies (GWAS), in which single nucleotide polymorphisms (SNPs) across the genome are compared in case–control fashion, are the main approach used to investigate the genetic bases of complex traits. The importance of developing rapid, inexpensive methods of genome sequencing and building a database of single nucleotide polymorphisms (SNPs) to support the investigation of complex traits was recognized by the project’s leadership even before completion of the HGP. Worried about the private sector’s efforts to patent SNPs, which would make them costly to use for research, the NHGRI-DOE’s five-year plan for 1998–2003 included the goal of mapping 100,000 SNPs by 2003 (Collins et al. 1998). The development of a public database of SNPs received a $138 million push from the International HapMap Project, a three-year public-private partnership completed in 2005 that mapped variation in four population groups (The International HapMap Consortium 2005). The 1000 Genomes Project, which ran between 2008 and 2015 (Birney and Soranzo 2015), sought to identify genetic variants that occur with a frequency of at least one percent in the populations studied, with the final data set consisting of 2,504 individuals from 26 populations from five continental regions.

The first genome-wide association study was published in 2005; by 2010, 500 genome-wide association studies had been published (Green et al. 2011); and by 2018, more than 5,000 genome-wide association studies had been published and their results added to the GWAS Catalog (Buniello et al. 2019). Despite these efforts, variants isolated by GWAS for complex traits account for a low percentage of heritability associated with the traits, a phenomenon known as “missing heritability” (Maher 2008). Although knowledge of the pathogenesis of common complex diseases such as diabetes, heart disease, schizophrenia, and cancer that arise due to the interaction of numerous genetic and nongenetic factors is lacking despite the numerous GWAS completed, the pathogenesis of so-called single-gene disorders is far better understood. Aided by the HGP’s dense map of genetic markers for use in positional mapping and subsequent development of genome-wide sequencing technologies, since the draft sequence was published 20 years ago, the number of Mendelian diseases with a known genetic basis has increased from 1,257 to 4,377 (Alkuraya 2021). This progress speeds up clinical diagnosis and facilitates prenatal genetic testing. Prevention and treatment remain challenging, however. There are only 59 “actionable genes” on the American College of Medical Genetics and Genomics’ most recent list of genes that are highly penetrant and associated with established interventions (Kalia et al. 2017). Gene therapy, touted as a potential cure for such disorders, yielded discouraging results in trials; only with the discovery of CRISPR, a novel technology of gene editing, has optimism been restored, though how well this basic science translates into clinical applications is yet to be seen (Doudna and Sternberg 2017; Baylis 2019).

The confident claims of leading genome scientists such as Hood and Collins proved to be overly so. Commentary at the time of the 10-year anniversary of completion of the HGP showed unison among scientists in recognizing that the promised revolution had not yet arrived. The HGP has been advanced as a case study in support of the “social bubble” hypothesis: the hypothesis that people will dive into new opportunities that present without due regard for potential risks because they are carried along by social interactions driven by enthusiasts who generate high expectations of returns—for the HGP, projections of commercially lucrative pharmaceutical and other biomedical applications advanced by project proponents (Gisler et al. 2010). The scientific consensus appears to be that although the HGP failed at least in the short term to fulfill proponents’ overly optimistic prognostications for clinical applications, it has been a boon for basic science (Evans 2010). In the HGP’s early years, Norton Zinder, who chaired the NIH’s Program Advisory Committee on the Human Genome, characterized it in this way: “This Project is creating an infrastructure for doing science; it’s not the doing of the science per se. It will provide the biological community with the basic materials for doing research in human biology” (in Cooper 1994, p. 74).

Indeed, the infrastructure of mapping and sequencing technologies and bioinformatics that was developed as part of the HGP—especially the ability to sequence entire genomes of organisms and traffic in big data—has changed the way biology, not just human biology, is done (Stevens 2013). It is recognized that genome structure by itself tells us only so much. Functional genomics places interest in how entire genomes—not just individual genes—function. A surprising discovery of the HGP was that the number of coding genes in humans is many orders smaller than what scientists had assumed at the outset of the project—that is, around 20,000, as in other vertebrates, rather than 80,000–100,000, though the final number remains an open question (Salzberg 2018). The majority of the genome’s DNA is transcribed but not translated and serves a regulatory function, with causal processes at the molecular level associated with interactive networks not linear pathways. The deterministic and reductionistic assumptions underlying the HGP that portrayed the genome as a blueprint for organismal development have been undermined by the research in molecular biology the project made possible (Keller 2000). Systems biology has emerged as a new discipline that seeks to understand this complexity by using computational methods (Hood 2003). In fact, since completion of the HGP, discovery of non-protein-coding elements of the genome and their contributions to regulatory networks has far exceeded the discovery of protein-coding genes (Gates et al. 2021). Evolutionary studies are aided by the ability of scientists to compare the human genome reference sequence to reference sequences for close relatives, such as Neandertals (Green et al. 2010), bonobos (Mao et al. 2021), and chimpanzees (The Chimpanzee Sequencing and Analysis Consortium 2005).

For scientists to deliver on their promises for a revolution in medicine, genome sequencing would need to be far faster, easier, and cheaper for its use to become routine in both research and clinical settings. In the closing years of the HGP, the cost of sequencing a human genome using existing Sanger technology was about $100 million. With high-throughput next-generation sequencing technology, in 2007, Venter’s diploid genome was sequenced at a cost of $10 million, and by 2013, the cost of sequencing an average genome had been lowered to $5,000. These developments were aided by a NHGRI grant program that set its sights on a $1,000 genome, a price point believed to place the “personal genome” within reach for routine use (Check Hayden 2014). Early in 2014, Illumina, a Californian company, claimed a win in the contest, with availability of its HiSeq X Ten system for population-scale whole-genome sequencing initiatives (Sheridan 2014); in March 2016, Veritas Genetics, a company cofounded by Harvard medical geneticist George M. Church, announced commercial availability of whole-genome sequencing for individuals, including interpretation and counseling, for $999 (Veritas Genetics 2016). Church had initiated the Personal Genome Project in 2005 (Church 2005); there are now Personal Genome Projects in Canada, the U.K., Austria, and China as well. The projects recruit volunteers who are willing to support research by releasing their genomes and health and physical information publicly. Research that takes this longitudinal approach combining genetic and clinical data is considered crucial for the promise of genomics to be fulfilled: with faster, easier, and cheaper genome sequencing technologies, genetic data are readily obtainable, but analysis of the data, without which there can be no revolution in medicine, remains challenging.

The National Research Council’s 2011 report saw the route to “personalized medicine,” or “precision medicine” as it was renamed (see Juengst et al. 2016 and Ferryman and Pitcan 2018 for an account of that change), proceeding via a “New Taxonomy” of disease informed by two data repositories: an “Information Commons” that stores molecular data (genome, transcriptome, proteome, metabolome, lipidome, and epigenome) and additional information (phenotypes, treatment outcomes, test results, etc.) gleaned from the electronic health records of millions of individuals; and a “Knowledge Network of Disease” that integrates this information with “fundamental biological knowledge.” Disease generalizations would be “built up from” this large number of individuals, a departure from studies that group individuals based on particular characteristics (e.g., GWAS). Research efforts approaching the scale called for include the All of Us Research Program in the U.S. and the UK Biobank. The data-intensive approach to molecular biology made possible by information technology need not stop at electronic health records but could also include other electronic records such as credit card purchases and social media postings (Weber et al. 2014), and biometric measurements from mobile apps and fitness trackers (Shi and Wu 2017). The increased importance of “big data” is illustrated by contrasting futuristic scenarios envisioned by Collins (1999) and Hood and Rowen (2013) almost 15 years apart. The “individualized medicine” circa 2010 forecasted by Collins is centered in the physician’s office and assumes a traditional view of the doctor–patient relationship. Hood and Rowen foresee individual genome sequences playing a larger role in medical practice and a changed doctor–patient relationship, driven by “patients” who are likely to bring consumer genetic data to their appointments and understand themselves to be active participants in their medical care. The new “P4 medicine” will be not only predictive, preventive, and personalized, but participatory, and based on a data-driven systems approach to disease. Write Hood and Rowen, “We envision a time in the future when all patients will be surrounded by a virtual cloud of billions of data points, and when we will have the analytical tools to reduce this enormous data dimensionality to simple hypotheses to optimize wellness and minimize disease for each individual” (p. 83). In the meanwhile, as Jenny Reardon (2017) tells us, the vast expanse between data and meaning characterizes “the postgenomic condition.”

Physicians are likely to encounter patients who bring consumer genetic data to their appointments because of a development largely unanticipated by HGP proponents and critics alike: “personal genomics” or “recreational genomics.” Efforts to compile SNP databases and develop rapid, inexpensive, whole-genome sequencing technologies have not yet supported the dawn of a new era of personalized medicine and drug development guided by pharmacogenomics, but direct-to-consumer (DTC) genomics has taken off as an industry, with profit-making seemingly unhampered by the lack of treatments for diseases based on knowledge of DNA sequences. The first DTC whole-genome test was marketed in 2006 (Green at al. 2011). By 2018, more than 10 million people had ordered DTC personal genomics tests (Khan and Mittelman 2018), and, that year, the NHGRI, celebrating the HGP’s 15th anniversary, identified DTC genetic testing as one of the “15 for 15” ways in which genomics is influencing the world. In 2019, the global DTC genetic testing market was valued at over $1 billion and forecast to climb to $3.4 billion by 2028 (Ugalmugle and Swain 2020). Although health and ancestry are the most common genetic tests sought, there is a broad range of tests available, and DTC companies usually offer more than one service (Phillips 2016). 23andMe and, for example, offer both health and ancestry tests. The family match function offered by these tests allows biological parentage to be discovered in cases of adoption and gamete donorship/sale. For people who want to confirm paternity, out a cheating spouse, ascertain athletic ability, identify nutritional needs, or find a romantic partner, there are genetic tests and companies for those interests too.

2. Philosophy and the Human Genome Project

At an October 1988 news conference called to announce his appointment, Watson, in an apparently off-the-cuff response to a reporter who asked about the social implications of the project, promised that a portion of the funding would be set aside to study such issues (Marshall 1996b). The result was the NIH/DOE Joint Working Group on Ethical, Legal, and Social Implications (ELSI) of Human Genome Research, chaired by Nancy Wexler, which began to meet in September 1989. The Joint Working Group identified four areas of high priority: “quality and access in the use of genetic tests; fair use of genetic information by employers and insurers; privacy and confidentiality of genetic information; and public and professional education” (Wexler in Cooper 1994, p. 321). The NIH and DOE each established ELSI programs: philosopher Eric T. Juengst served as the first director of the NIH-NCHGR ELSI program from 1990 to 1994. ELSI was funded initially to the tune of three percent of the HGP budget for both agencies; this was increased to four and later five percent at the NIH, a huge boost in bioethics funding, on the order of tens of millions of dollars each year.

Ethical issues such as genetic privacy, access to genetic testing, and genetic discrimination were not the only considerations of interest to philosophers, and besides ethicists, philosophers of science, political theorists and philosophers working in other areas benefited from ELSI-related funding. There is now a vast literature on human genome-related topics. From among these topics, this section attempts to provide a synopsis of those that are most directly associated with the HGP itself, of greatest concern and enduring interest to philosophers, and not covered in other SEP entries. Since there is interest in exporting the ELSI model to other biomedical contexts, such as neuroscience, consideration is also given to its legacy.

2.1 Geneticization, Genetic Reductionism, and Genetic Determinism

Various HGP proponents told us that we would discover our human essence in the genome. According to Dulbecco (1986), “the sequence of the human DNA is the reality of our species” (p. 1056); Gilbert was quoted as saying “sequencing the human genome is like pursuing the holy grail” (in Lee 1991, p. 9); on the topic of his decision to dedicate three percent of HGP funds to ELSI, Watson wrote: “The Human Genome Project is much more than a vast roll call of As, Ts, Gs, and Cs: it is as precious a body of knowledge as humankind will ever acquire, with a potential to speak to our most basic philosophical questions about human nature, for purposes of good and mischief alike” (with Berry 2003, p. 172).

“Geneticization” is a term used to describe the phenomenon characterized by an increasing tendency to reduce human differences to genetic ones (Lippman 1991). The several billion dollars of funding for the HGP was justified by the belief that genes are key determinants of not only rare Mendelian diseases like Huntington’s disease or cystic fibrosis but common multi-factorial conditions like cancer, depression, and heart disease. Wrote an early critic of the HGP: “Without question, it was the technical prowess that molecular biology had achieved by the early 1980s that made it possible even to imagine a task as formidable as that of sequencing what has come to be called ‘the human genome.’ But it was the concept of genetic disease that created the climate in which such a project could appear both reasonable and desirable” (Keller 1992, p. 293). Given that the development of any trait involves the interaction of both genetic and nongenetic factors, on what bases can genes be privileged as causes to claim that a particular disease or nondisease trait is “genetic” or caused by a “genetic susceptibility” or “genetic predisposition”? This question has led philosophers of science to grapple with appropriate definitions for terms such as “genetic disease” and “genetic susceptibility” and how best to conceptualize genetic causation and gene–environment interaction (e.g., Kitcher 1996; Gannett 1999; Kronfeldner 2009). Closely related to the concepts of geneticization and genetic disease/ susceptibility/ predisposition are assumptions about genetic reductionism and genetic determinism.

Genetic reductionism can be understood as governing the whole–part relation in which organismal properties are explained solely in terms of genes and organisms are identified with their genomes. Definitions of health and disease attach to organisms and their physiological and developmental processes in particular contexts (provided by populations and environments) and cannot simply be relocated to the level of the genome (Griesemer 1994; Limoges 1994; Lloyd 1994), however, and diseases do not become more objectively defined entities once they receive a genetic basis since social and cultural values implicated in designations of health and disease can become incorporated at the level of the genome, in what counts as a normal or abnormal gene (Gannett 1998). In contrast to physical reductionism, which does not privilege DNA but considers it on par with proteins, lipids, and other molecules (Sarkar 1998), genetic reductionism assumes that genes are in some sense more causally efficacious. Genetic determinism concerns such assumptions about the causal efficacy of genes.

In a public lecture held to celebrate completion of the HGP, Collins characterized the project as “an amazing adventure into ourselves, to understand our own DNA instruction book, the shared inheritance of all humankind” (see National Human Genome Research Institute, 2003). At the cellular level, the book is said to contain “the genetic instructions for the entire repertoire of cellular components” (Collins et al. 2003, p. 3). At this level, genetic determinism is sustained by metaphors of Weismannism and DNA as “code” or “master molecule” (Griesemer 1994; Keller 1994), which accord DNA causal priority over other cellular components. This may be in a physical sense: Weismannism assumes (falsely) that intergenerational continuity exists only for germ cell nuclei whereas somatic cells and germ cell cytoplasm arise anew in each generation. It may also be in the sense of a point of origin for the transfer of information: the central dogma of molecular biology, which represents a 1950s reformulation of Weismannism in terms of information theory, asserts that information travels unidirectionally from nucleic acids to protein, and never vice versa. It is contentious, however, whether amongst the cell’s components only nucleic acids can be said to transmit information: for some philosophers, genetic coding plays a theoretical role at least at this cellular level (Godfrey-Smith 2000); for others, genetic coding is merely (and misleadingly) metaphorical, and all cellular components are potential bearers of information (Griffiths 2001; Griffiths and Gray 1994; Sarkar 1996).

At the organismal level, new research in functional genomics may lead to less deterministic accounts even of so-called single gene disorders. For these, the concepts of penetrance and expressivity operate in ways that accommodate the one–one genetic determinist model where the mutation is necessary and/or sufficient for both the presence of the condition and confounding patterns of phenotypic variability. But the severity of even a fully penetrant condition like Huntington’s disease seems to depend on not just genetic factors like the number of DNA repeats in the mutation but epigenetic factors like the sex of the parent who transmitted the mutation (Ridley et al. 1991). For complex conditions to which both genetic and environmental differences contribute—for example, psychiatric disorders or behavioral differences—genetic determinism is denied, and everyone is an interactionist these days, in some sense of “interaction.” Both genes and environment are recognized to be necessary for development: by themselves, genes cannot determine or do anything. Yet, theorists still seem to give the nod to one or the other, suggesting that it is mostly genes or mostly the environment, mostly nature or mostly nurture, that make us what we are. This implies that it is possible to apportion the relative contributions of each. Gilbert (1992) suggests this in his dismissal of a more simplistic version of genetic determinism: “We must see beyond a first reaction that we are the consequences of our genes; that we are guilty of a crime because our genes made us do it; or that we are noble because our genes made us so. This shallow genetic determinism is unwise and untrue. But society will have to wrestle with the questions of how much of our makeup is dictated by the environment, how much is dictated by our genetics, and how much is dictated by our own will and determination” (pp. 96–97). However, the assertion that the relative contributions of genes and environment can be apportioned in this way is misleading if not outright false. Building on R. C. Lewontin’s (1974) classic paper on heritability, work in developmental systems theory (DST) undermines any such attempts to apportion causal responsibility in organismal development: traits are jointly determined by multiple causes, each context-sensitive and contingent (Griffiths and Gray 1994; Griffiths and Knight 1998; Oyama 1985; Oyama et al. 2001; Robert 2004).

Geneticization, genetic reductionism, and genetic determinism helped to sell the HGP. Gilbert (1992) endorsed the reduction of individual humans to their genes: “The information carried on the DNA, that genetic information passed down from our parents,” he wrote, “is the most fundamental property of the body” (p. 83), so much so, in fact, that “one will be able to pull a CD out of one’s pocket and say, ‘Here is a human being; it’s me!’” (p. 96). Cancers that we consider to be environmental in their origins were recast as genetically determined. In Watson’s words: “Some call New Jersey the Cancer State because of all the chemical companies there, but in fact, the major factor is probably your genetic constitution” (in Cooper 1994, p. 326). In Bodmer’s words: “Cancer, scientists have discovered, is a genetic condition in which cells spread uncontrollably, and cigarette smoke contains chemicals which stimulate those molecular changes” (Bodmer and McKie 1994, p. 89). (See Proctor 1992 and Plutynski 2018 for discussions of cancer as a genetic disease.) Marking the 20th anniversary of the release of the draft sequences, Richard Gibbs, director of the sequencing center at Baylor, admits that “there was plenty of hype that was shared with the media and the wider community” and that such “outlandish visions” as personalizing therapies, revealing the “mysteries of the architecture of common complex diseases,” and predicting criminality have not been realized. But Gibbs excuses the hype as necessary for generating support for the project: “The hyperbole that we look back on did not, however, come from the front line. It came from those who championed the programme, mindful of its long-term benefits. Thanks to them, they generated the enthusiasm to fund this transformative work” (2020, p. 575).

Like Gibbs, bioethicist Timothy Caulfield (2018) finds the hype and hyperbole of scientists understandable: “Enthusiasm and optimistic predictions of near-future applications are required in order to mobilize the scientific community and potential funders, both public and private. This is particularly so in areas like genomics, where large amounts of sustained funding are required in order to achieve the hoped for scientific and translational goals” (p. 561). However, unlike Gibbs, Caulfield details possibilities of “real harm,” which include “potentially eroding public trust and support for science; inappropriately skewing research priorities and the allocation of resources and funding; creating unrealistic expectations of benefit for patients; facilitating the premature uptake of expensive and potentially harmful emerging technologies by health systems; misinforming policy and ethics debates; and accelerating the marketing and utilization of unproven therapies” (p. 567). The hype and hyperbole used to promote personalized (or precision) medicine carry the risks Caulfield mentions.

Approaching 20 years since completion of the HGP, genome science has not revolutionized medicine or markedly improved human health. Progress has been made on rare diseases (e.g., spinal muscular atrophy) and some forms of cancer (e.g., non-small cell lung cancer), though these interventions can be prohibitively expensive (Tabery 2023). For most complex diseases, however, predictions based on “family history, neighborhood, socioeconomic circumstances, or even measurements made with nothing more than a tape measure and a bathroom scale” outperform predictions based on the possession of genetic variants identified by GWAS. Pressing public health problems such as increasing obesity, the opiate epidemic, and mental illness fail to be addressed by the “human genome-driven research agenda” to which the lion’s share of resources go (Joyner and Paneth 2019). So even though the deterministic and reductionistic assumptions underlying the HGP have been undermined by the research in molecular biology the project made possible (Keller 2000), the critics’ worries about geneticization, genetic reductionism, and genetic determinism remain relevant, in particular their belief that embracing a reductionist approach to medicine that conceives of human health and disease in wholly molecular or genetic terms individualizes these and detracts attention from risks factors associated with our shared social and physical environments (Nelkin and Tancredi 1989; Hubbard and Wald 1993; Tabery 2023).

2.2 Genetic Testing, Genetic Discrimination, and Genetic Privacy

Genetic testing is carried out for a range of purposes: diagnostic, predictive, and reproductive. Genetic testing carried out at the population level for any of these purposes is referred to as genetic screening. Diagnostic genetic testing is performed on individuals already experiencing signs and symptoms of disease as part of their clinical care. Newborn screening programs to diagnose conditions such as PKU and hemoglobinopathies based on blood components and circulating metabolites (thus providing indirect genetic tests) have been carried out for many decades. Predictive genetic testing is performed on individuals who are at risk for inheriting a familial condition, such as cystic fibrosis or Huntingdon’s disease, but do not yet show any signs or symptoms. Reproductive genetic testing is carried out through carrier screening, prenatal testing of the fetus in utero, and preimplantation genetic diagnosis (PGD) of embryos created by in vitro fertilization (IVF). In carrier screening, prospective parents find out whether they are at risk for passing on disease-related genes to their offspring. Prenatal genetic testing of fetuses in utero is conducted using blood tests early in a woman’s pregnancy, chorionic villus sampling (CVS) at 10–12 weeks, and amniocentesis at 15–18 weeks. Testing is increasingly offered to all women who are pregnant, not just those for whom risk is elevated because of age or family history; based on the results, women can elect to continue the pregnancy or abort the fetus. In PGD, a single cell is removed from the 8-cell embryo for testing; based on the results, a decision is made about which embryo(s) to implant in the woman’s uterus.

There are significant ethical issues associated with genetic testing. These issues are informed by empirical studies of the psychosocial effects of testing (Wade 2019). Increased knowledge that comes from predictive genetic testing is not an unmitigated good: denial may be a coping mechanism; individuals may feel guilty for passing on harmful mutations to their offspring or stigmatized as having the potential to do so; survivor guilt may arise in those who find out they are not at risk for a disease such as Huntingdon’s after all, or they may become at a loss about how to live their lives differently; those who find out they are destined to develop Huntingdon’s or early-onset Alzheimer’s disease may become depressed or even suicidal; paternity may not be what it is assumed to be; decisions about disclosing results have implications for family members. During debates about the HGP, many authors appealed to the history of eugenics to warn about the dangers of reproductive genetic testing and urge caution as we move forward—so much so that historian Diane Paul (1994) characterized eugenics as the “‘approved’ project anxiety” (p. 143). Paul noted that attempts to draw lessons from the history of eugenics are confounded by disagreements about how to define “eugenics”—whether to characterize eugenics according to a program’s intentions or effects, its use of coercive rather than voluntary means, or its appeals to social and political aims that extend beyond the immediate concerns of individual families. The label “liberal eugenics” has become increasingly accepted for characterizing offspring selection based on parental choice. Reproductive rights are no longer just about the right not to have a child (to use contraception, to have an abortion) or the right to bear a child (to refuse population control measures). Reproductive rights have come to encompass the right to access technological assistance to procreate and to have a certain kind of child (Callahan 1998).

Concerns about genetic discrimination resulting from genetic testing were frequently expressed at the outset of the HGP. Concerns focused mostly on insurance companies and employers, but possibilities for genetic discrimination occurring in other institutional settings were raised as well (Nelkin 1992; Nelkin and Tancredi 1989). A number of general arguments have been made against institutional forms of genetic discrimination: we don’t choose our genes and ought not be punished for what is outside our control (Gostin 1991); the social costs of creating a “biologic” or “genetic underclass” of people who lack health care and are unemployed or stuck in low-wage jobs are too great (Lee 1993; Nelkin and Tancredi 1989); people’s fears of genetic discrimination, whether realistic or not, may lead them to forego genetic testing that might benefit their lives and be less inclined to participate in genetic research (Kass 1997); people have the right not to know their genetic risk status (Kass 1997). Genetic discrimination may also occur in less formal circumstances. Mate choice could increasingly proceed based on genetic information, with certain people being labeled as undesirable. As more and more fetuses are aborted on genetic grounds, families of children born with similar conditions, and people with disabilities and their advocates more broadly, worry that increased stigmatization will result. In addition, group-based genetic research into diseases or behavioral differences risks stigmatizing people based on racial, ethnic, and gender differences, with such risks informed by the troubling history of the study of the genetics of intelligence (Tabery 2015).

In the U.S., where unlike other industrialized countries there is no publicly funded system of universal health care, genetic discrimination by insurance companies and employers has been a particularly serious worry; existing or prospective employees found to be at genetic risk could be fired or not hired by employers to reduce costs of providing health care coverage. ELSI research relating to genetic privacy and the risk of genetic discrimination is credited with bringing about changes in federal law with “far reaching” effects on society (McEwen et al. 2014)—in particular, passage of the Genetic Information Nondiscrimination Act (GINA) in May 2008, which prohibits U.S. health insurance companies and employers from discriminating based on genetic information, defined to include genetic test results and family history but not manifest disease. The Affordable Care Act, passed in 2010, by prohibiting discrimination by health insurers based on preexisting conditions, which include genetic test results and manifest disease, fills in that gap and negates the need for GINA in the context of health insurance. As for employment, there remains a gap: employees who are substantially impaired are covered by the Americans with Disabilities Act and employees who are asymptomatic with genetic tests showing a predisposition for disease are covered by GINA, but employees with manifest disease who are not substantially impaired are covered by neither (Green et al. 2015). GINA does not prohibit use of genetic information in underwriting for life, disability, or mortgage insurance. Discrimination takes the form of refusing coverage on the basis that the genetic susceptibility counts as a “preexisting condition,” charging high premiums for the policy, limiting benefits, or excluding certain conditions. In 2020, Florida became the first state to prohibit use of genetic test results by life insurance companies.

The insurance industry argues that there is no principled reason to treat genetic information any differently from other medical information used in underwriting. They point to the problem of “adverse selection”: people who know themselves to be at high risk are more likely to seek insurance than people who know themselves to be at low risk, which threatens the market when insurers are deprived of the same information (Meyer 2004; Pokorski 1994). Taking an approach to legislation and policy that singles out genetic information for protection has also been criticized philosophically for being based on “misconceptions [that] include the presumption that a clear distinction exists between genetic and nongenetic information, tests, and diseases and the genetic essentialist belief that genetic information is more definitive, has greater predictive value, and is a greater threat to our privacy than is nongenetic medical information” (Beckwith and Alper 1998, p. 208; see also Rothstein 2005). The approach has been dubbed “genetic exceptionalism” and is criticized for drawing from, and in turn fostering, myths of genetic determinism and genetic reductionism (Murray 1997, p. 61; see also O’Neill 2001). Rather than assuming the binarism implicated in here—that genetic information is unique and targeted policies are necessary or that genetic information is not unique and targeted policies are unnecessary—“genomic contextualism” has been recommended as alternative approach (Garrison et al. 2019a). This approach recognizes that there are both similarities and differences between genomic and other types of clinically relevant information and that the specific context in which the policy or practice is implemented determines how best to proceed. Since completion of the HGP, the contexts in which genomics is practiced have changed sufficiently that while privacy concerns remain pressing, the debate has been largely recast.

At the outset of the HGP, concerns about genetic privacy focused on how to protect the public from intrusive governments, employers, and insurance companies. But the explosion of DTC genomics has raised privacy concerns caused by the very public in need of protection! In DTC genomics, Y-chromosomal, mitochondrial, and autosomal DNA ancestry tests are used to provide familial matches. These matches enable adoptees in closed adoptions and offspring of anonymous gamete donors to track down biological parents and other family members, raising obvious privacy concerns for those who gave up children for adoption or agreed to donate or sell eggs or sperm expecting that their anonymity would be protected. Additional privacy concerns arise as the result of genetic genealogy’s use of matches to cousins of various degrees to fill out missing branches in family trees. Genome scientists rely on cell lines, DNA sequence data, and clinical data sets that have been di-identified to protect the anonymity of volunteers; however, access to genetic genealogy databases that combine genetic and traditional genealogical information makes re-identification possible. In genetic genealogy, surname projects based on the co-inheritance of surnames and Y-chromosomal haplotypes furnish candidate surnames when sequence information is available; using Internet searches to match surnames with year of birth and U.S. state of residence, researchers were able to identify individuals who had participated in the 1000 Genomes Project; by extension, they also identified family members who had not participated in the project or consented to share information (Gymrek et al. 2013). Based on population genetic modelling, researchers suggest that with a genetic genealogy database that covers two percent of a target population, a third cousin match can be obtained for 99 percent of the population. With this match, family trees constructed using traditional genealogical methods and additional sources of information can be used to identify an unknown individual for whom DNA is available: this is the “long range familial search” approach that law enforcement is using in an increasing number of active as well as cold cases (Erlich et al. 2018).

A response to the inability to guarantee anonymity for participants in genomic research is to consider concerns about genetic privacy and privacy more generally to be passée. Such concerns are increasingly seen to stand in the way of scientific progress. Watson and Venter have promoted the idea that there is nothing to fear by making one’s sequence public rather than protecting it as private. Venter’s diploid genome was fully sequenced and the findings published in the October 2007 issue of PLoS Biology (Levy et al. 2007); this was followed by the publication of Watson’s “complete” genome in the 17 April 2008 issue of Nature (Wheeler et al. 2008). Relevant to the privacy question, Watson did not bare all: at Watson’s request, the APOE gene which is linked to Alzheimer’s disease was omitted from his sequence. Along similar lines, the volunteers Church recruits for the Personal Genome Project agree to release their genomes and health and physical information publicly, a model of “open consent” replacing genetic privacy (Lunshof et al. 2008). Says Church: “Ideally, everybody on the planet would share their medical and genomic information” (in Dizikes 2007). Large-scale biobanking initiatives such as the All of Us Research Program, originally called the Precision Medicine Initiative or PMI, appeal to collective altruism. The Internet has radically changed people’s expectations of privacy, the boundary between their personal and public lives, and their expectations of accessing information, and these changes are welcomed by genome scientists. To ensure “the free flow of research data,” the 2011 National Research Council report calls for the “[g]radual elimination of institutional, cultural, and regulatory barriers to widespread sharing of the molecular profiles and health histories of individuals, while still protecting patients’ rights” (p. 60).

With this free flow of research data, across institutions and globally, with varying degrees of oversight, people’s ability to consent to use of their biospecimens and data for some but not other purposes becomes impossible (Zarate et al. 2016). Privacy concerns are amplified insofar as genomics is a science driven by big data. The promise of personalized and precision medicine is premised, for some, on amassing all obtainable data on individuals, whether mined from electronic health records, government databases, DTC genomics, genealogy sites, mobile devices, social media, credit card transactions, fitbits, etc. Data-driven biology forgoes hypotheses for algorithms, but these algorithms are not innocuous. Hallam Stevens (2021) describes “an emerging medical-industrial complex” that presents “substantial challenges for privacy, data ownership, and algorithmic bias,” which, if not addressed, will lead to a genomic science that operates in the interests of “surveillance capitalism” and the corporate tech giants (pp. 565–566). Governments, especially authoritarian ones, are building databases that supplement DNA with biometics and social media posts to carry out genomic surveillance that often targets minorities (Moreau 2019).

Of course, significant social privilege attaches to some people’s ability not to worry that genetic testing offered as an employee benefit (Singer 2018) or their virtual cloud of billions of data points will cause them harm. Or that they will regret spitting into a tube and sending it off to 23andMe. As Anna Jabloner (2019) argues, “molecular identification technologies … tell a tale of two molecular Californias: one is a tale of an unchanged biological determinism that continues to mark some bodies as risky and criminal, the other tale is of individual empowerment through the consumption of molecular knowledge” (p. 15). Black and Latino men are overrepresented in CAL-DNA, which is one of the largest criminological DNA databases in the world, while 23andMe’s even larger database contains the DNA of mostly wealthy white Americans. Similarly, Reardon (2017) comments on the tension between the democratizing impulse of the open-data model of Church’s Personal Genome Project and the overwhelming Whiteness, affluence, and maleness of the tech-savvy volunteers who have contributed their genomes

Indigenous groups resist this open consent model that appeals to collective altruism and seek to maintain control over biospecimens contributed and data generated. As participants in scientific studies, they have experienced lack of support for their interests and priorities, failure to share benefits of research, disrespect for cultural and spiritual beliefs, theft of traditional knowledge, conduct of unapproved secondary research, and opportunistic commercialization (Garrison et al. 2019b). Genetics and genomics bring specific concerns, as “genomic data are commonly seen by Indigenous communities as more sensitive than other types of health data, particularly with regard to genealogy and ancestry research that can influence traditionally held beliefs, cultural histories and identity claims affecting rights to land and other resources ” (Hudson et al. 2020, p. 378). Given distrust of funding agencies, universities, and researchers arising from these experiences and concerns, Indigenous underrepresentation in biobanks, DNA sequence databases, and clinical datasets is not surprising. Genome scientists desire access to biospecimens and data of Indigenous peoples for a range of purposes: geographical isolation of populations over tens of thousands of years can yield genetic variants of physiological and clinical interest associated with adaptive responses to environments; comparative genomics and ancient DNA studies contribute to knowledge of human evolutionary history; and efforts to identify genetic contributions to complex traits using GWAS and admixture mapping depend on access to populations that incorporate the genetic diversity of the species. Any progress in the prevention and treatment of disease that arises through precision medicine will be weighted towards populations most studied. Indigenous peoples make up only 0.022% of participants in GWAS conducted worldwide (Mills and Rahal 2019).

In recognition of the overrepresentation of people of European descent in biobanks, DNA sequence databases, and clinical datasets, the NIH’s All of Us initiative seeks to include at least 50 percent underrepresented minorities, motivated by the goal that precision medicine benefit everyone. Keolu Fox (2020) points out that NIH plans to include Indigenous communities in the All of Us initiative fail to appreciate that the open-source data approach used for previous government-funded, large-scale human genome sequencing efforts such as the International HapMap Project and 1000 Genomes Project facilitates the commodification of data by pharmaceutical and ancestry-testing companies. Nanibaa’ A. Garrison et al. (2019b) suggest that development of alternative models for genetic and genomic research involving Indigenous peoples begin by recognizing Indigenous sovereignty, which is “the inherent right and capacity of Indigenous peoples to develop culturally, socially, and economically along lines consistent with their respective histories and values” (pp. 496–497). There should be tangible benefits for Indigenous communities (e.g., support for health promotion, meaningful results), with equitable sharing of profits should commercialization occur (Hudson et al. 2020). Community engagement is crucial; this may extend to community-based participatory research that views Indigenous communities as partners in research, not merely subjects of research. Individual consent is insufficient and should be preceded by collective consent, and consent needs to be an ongoing process for any subsequent research contemplated (Garrison et al. 2019b; Tsosie et al. 2019). Indigenous control over the use and disposal of DNA samples is needed: on the “DNA on loan” approach developed in Canada (Arbour and Cook 2006), the participant or community retains ownership of biological materials and entrusts these to researchers or research institutions as stewards. As for data gleaned from biological materials, the model of open consent is counter to the concept of Indigenous data sovereignty, which is “the inherent and inalienable rights and interests of indigenous peoples relating to the collection, ownership and application of data about their people, lifeways and territories” (Kukutai and Taylor 2016, p. 2).

2.3 Identity and Difference: The “Normal” Human Genome

Early in the debates surrounding plans for the HGP, questions arose concerning what it means to map and sequence the human genome—“get the genome,” as Watson (1992) put it. About these concerns, McKusick (1989) wrote: “The question often asked, especially by journalists, is ‘Whose genome will be sequenced?’ The answer is that it need not, and surely will not, be the genome of any one person. Keeping track of the origin of the DNA that is studied will be important, but the DNA can come from different persons chosen for study for particular parts of the genome” (p. 913). The HGP and Celera reference sequences are indeed composites based on chromosomal segments that originate from different individuals: the sequence in any given region of the genome belongs to a single individual, but sequences in different regions of the genome belong to different individuals. However, in both cases, the majority of the sequence originates from just one person. As HGP sequencing efforts accelerated, concerns arose that only four genomes, a couple of which belonged to known laboratory personnel, were being used for physical mapping and sequencing (Marshall 1996a). The decision was made to construct 10 new clone libraries for sequencing with each library contributing about 10 percent of the total DNA. In the end, 74.3 percent of the total number of bases sequenced was derived from a single clone library—that of a male, presumably from the Buffalo area; seven other clone libraries contributed to an additional 17.3 percent of the sequence (International Human Genome Sequencing Consortium 2001, p. 866). A similar proportion—close to 71 percent—of the Celera sequence belongs to just one male even though five ethnically diverse donors were selected; incredibly enough, rumors were eventually confirmed that this individual is Venter himself (McKie 2002).

The deeper question, of course, is how we might understand a single human genome sequence, a composite that belongs to no actual individual in its entirety and only a handful of individuals in its parts, to be representative of the entire species. This seems to ignore the extensive genetic variability that exists. Early critics of the HGP pointed out numerous faults with the concept of a representative or putatively normal genome: many DNA polymorphisms are functionally equivalent (Sarkar and Tauber 1991); the genome sequence will contain unknown defective genes (since no one, including donors, is free of these), and it is impossible to identify the genetic basis of a disorder simply by comparing the sequences of sick and well people since there will be many differences between them (Lewontin 2000 [1992]); and from an evolutionary viewpoint, mutations are not “errors” in the genetic code or “damage” to the genome’s structure, but the genetic variants that provide the raw materials that make it possible for new species to arise (Limoges 1994, p. 124). There were related worries that the human genome reference sequence would arbitrate a standard of genetic normality; for example, the application of concepts like “genetic error” and “damage” to the genome institutes a call for correction or repair (Limoges 1994; also Murphy 1994). Indeed, the 1988 Office for Technology Assessment report on the HGP recommended the “eugenic use of genetic information … to ensure … that each individual has at least a modicum of normal genes” (p. 85).

Science named “human genetic variation” as “Breakthrough of the Year” for 2007. Humans have been found to be 99.9 percent alike genetically, but notable for the magazine was the extent to which individuals had been found to differ genetically from one another—in SNPs, insertions, deletions, and other structural elements—and the promise this apparently unexpected amount of variation holds for using genome-wide association studies (GWAS) to discover the genetic bases for complex traits, both disease and non-disease traits, to which multiple genetic and nongenetic factors contribute. The human genome reference sequence has been useful as a tool for discovering and cataloguing that genetic variation by providing a standard shared by the scientific community: “The current reference genome assembly works as the foundation for all genomic data and databases. It provides a scaffold for genome assembly, variant calling, RNA or other sequencing read alignment, gene annotation, and functional analysis. Genes are referred to by their loci, with their base positions defined by reference genome coordinates. Variants and alleles are labeled as such when compared to the reference (i.e., reference (REF) versus alternative (ALT)). Diploid and personal genomes are assembled using the reference as a scaffold, and RNA-seq reads are typically mapped to the reference genome” (Ballouz et al. 2019, p. 159). However, what had portrayed as a journalist’s or philosopher’s question is now being asked by genome scientists too. Even as a tool, there are challenges to overcome. If alleles included in the reference sequence are relatively rare, “reference bias” is introduced: genomes that resemble the reference genome are easier to assemble and align, and variants are missed or misidentified (Ballouz et al. 2019). And when entire stretches of sequence are missing in the reference sequence, those sequences will be discarded and missed entirely because of the reliance on the genome reference sequence for assembling and aligning sequenced genomes (Sherman and Salzberg 2020).

Since 2003, there have been ongoing efforts to update the human genome reference sequence by filling gaps, correcting errors, and replacing minor alleles (the current version of the reference sequence is GRCh38). Diversity has been incorporated in the reference sequence by tacking on additional sequences, but by maintaining a linear representation, this loses location information (Kaye and Wasserman 2021). Suggestions have been made for ways to further improve the genome reference sequence. Recently developed long read sequencing technologies facilitate the discovery of large structural variants (SVs) and not just genetic variants (i.e., SNPs and smaller insertions and deletions, or “indels”). One suggestion calls for “reconstructing a more precise canonical human reference genome” by using those SVs to correct misassemblies in the reference sequence and adding the more common SVs to improve variant detection (Yang et al. 2019). Another suggestion recommends adopting a “consensus sequence” approach, in which the most common alleles and variants in the population are chosen for inclusion (Ballouz et al. 2019). Problems remain, however: these remain composite genomes and may contain sequences that would not be found together in any individual, and ongoing updates undermine the stability of the reference sequence as a reference (Kaye and Wasserman 2021). Suggestions have also been made for the replacement of the genome reference sequence. Long read sequencing allows the “de novo assembly” of genomes, which obviates need of the reference sequence for scaffolding (Chiasson et al. 2015). A human “pan-genome” would accommodate variation by serving as a collection of all the DNA sequences found in the species, both SVs and genetic variants, and replace a linear representation of the genome with more complex genome graphs (Sherman and Salzberg 2020; Miga and Wang 2021). Another possibility is “The Genome Atlas,” which foregoes use of the reference sequence even as a coordinate system, with entries in the atlas instead features of the genome assigned unique feature object identifiers (FOIs). The database generates blueprint genomes based on selected features for use in sequencing reads (Kaye and Wasserman 2021).

Philosophical concerns about whether a human genome reference sequence arbitrates a standard of genetic normality remain, though these may be mitigated by the pan-genome and genome atlas approaches. An empirically validated consensus sequence approach that includes the most common alleles and variants in the population in the genome reference sequence does not imply that those alleles and variants are of biomedical significance because they are conducive to health or of evolutionary significance because they are ancestral. Science’s 18 February 2011 issue in celebration of the 10-year anniversary of publication of the draft human genome sequence contains an essay by genome scientist Maynard V. Olson, which asks, in its title, “What Does a ‘Normal’ Human Genome Look Like?” Although the HGP was criticized as anti-evolutionary, pre-Darwinian, typological, and essentialist for seemingly instituting a standard of genetic normality, it was also argued that the HGP might be seen instead as incorporating a specific set of evolutionary assumptions (Gannett 2003). Indeed, from an evolutionary perspective, Olson contends that genetic variability among relatively healthy humans is largely composed of deleterious mutations, rather than adaptive mutations due to balancing or diversifying selection, and that, consequently, “there actually is a ‘wild-type’ human genome—one in which most genes exist in an evolutionarily optimized form” (p. 872), though individual humans inevitably “fall short of this Platonic ideal.” Judgments about what constitutes a “normal,” “wild-type,” or “ideal” human genome do not escape the socio-cultural contexts in which they arise. Social and cultural values that attach to judgements at the phenotypic level are simply embedded in the genome, where they are less visible as such (Gannett 1998).

In promoting the HGP, Gilbert (1992) suggested that we will find answers to the age-old question about human nature in our genome: “At the end of the genome project, we will want to be able to identify all the genes that make up a human being…. So by comparing a human to a primate, we will be able to identify the genes that encode the features of primates and distinguish them from other mammals. Then, by tweaking our computer programs, we will finally identify the regions of DNA that differ between the primate and the human—and understand those genes that make us uniquely human” (p. 94). Although philosophers challenge the species essentialism that defines species in terms of genetic properties shared by all and only their members (Gannett 2003; Robert and Baylis 2003), genome scientists are indeed comparing the human genome reference sequence to chimpanzee, bonobo, and Neandertal genome reference sequences to explore questions about human nature. Already in 1969, Sinsheimer foresaw the promise of molecular biology to remake human nature: “For the first time in all time, a living creature understands its origin and can undertake to design its future” (in Kevles 1992, p. 18). Remaking human nature is likely to begin with genetic modifications that convey the possibility of resistance to a serious disease, like HIV/AIDS, or minimize the effects of aging to extend lifespan, but transhumanists who view human nature as “a work-in-progress, a half-baked beginning that we can learn to remold in desirable ways” welcome improvements in memory, intelligence, and emotional capacities as well (Bostrom 2003, p. 493). Theories of justice are typically based on conceptions of human nature; although the new field of sociogenomics continues to favor nature over nurture (Bliss 2018), with the capacity to remake human nature, this foundation disappears (Fukuyama 2002; Habermas 2003).

2.4 Identity and Difference: Race, Ethnicity, and the Genome

Concerns about race, ethnicity, and the genome were raised in the early years of the HGP. Racial profiling in the legal system was one such concern: if people belonging to particular racial and ethnic groups are more likely to be arrested, charged, or convicted of a criminal offense, they are more likely to be required to provide DNA samples to forensic databases, and therefore more likely to come back into the system with future offenses (Kitcher 1996). Another concern was that if genetic discrimination by insurers and employers creates a “genetic underclass” (Lee 1993; Nelkin and Tancredi 1989), then to the extent that race and ethnicity correlate with socioeconomic status, some groups—already affected by disparities in health outcomes unrelated to genetic differences—will be disproportionately represented among this “genetic underclass.” A further concern was the social stakes involved when group-based differences are identified, whether these involve sequences localized to particular groups or varying in frequency among groups (Lappé 1994). And given the history of using biological explanations to provide ideological justification for social inequalities associated with oppressive power structures, the prospective use of molecular genetics to explain race differences was met with caution (Hubbard 1994). These concerns were dismissed by HGP proponents, who argued that mapping and sequencing the human genome celebrate our common humanity. At the June 26, 2000 White House press conference announcing completion of “a working draft” of the sequence of the human genome, Venter announced that the results show that “the concept of race has no genetic or scientific basis” (see Clinton, et al. 2000).

Post-HGP genetics and genomics have not lived up to the mantra that because we are 99.9 percent the same, there is no such thing as race. Indeed, a predominantly African American racial identity has been ascribed to the human genome reference sequence itself (Reich et al. 2009), and the de novo assembly of genomes permitted by long read sequencing has led to several countries, such as China, Korea, and Denmark, producing their own “ethnicity-specific reference genomes” (Kowal and Llamas 2019). The International HapMap Project, which was initiated in 2002 with the goal of compiling a haplotype map adequately dense with SNP markers to permit the identification of genes implicated in common diseases and drug responses, sampled the DNA of four populations (European-Americans in Utah; Yoruba in Ibadan, Nigeria; Japanese in Tokyo; and Han Chinese in Beijing). This reproduction of racial categories (here, European, African, and Asian) at the level of the genome has been characterized as the “molecular reinscription of race” (Duster 2015). DTC ancestry testing appeals to a range of group categories, which are defined by geography, nationality, ethnicity, and race: advertises tests for Irish ancestry in early March each year; FamilyTreeDNA confirms Jewish ancestry, whether Ashkenazi or Sephardi; African Ancestry, Inc. finds ancestral ties to present-day African countries and ethnic groups dating back more than 500 years; and DNAPrint’s panels of ancestry informative markers determine proportions of (Indo)European, East Asian, sub-Saharan African, and Native American heritage.

The resurgence in biological thinking about race and ethnicity since the HGP is due in large part to the postgenomic use of racial and ethnic categories of difference to try to capture patterns of group genetic differences in various fields of research. The revolutionary benefits of postgenomic “personalized” or “precision” medicine were supposed to focus on individual genetic differences within populations, not group genetic differences across populations. Pharmaceuticals, a powerful engine driving post-HGP research into human genetic differences, were supposed to be tailored to individual genomes. In 2003, Venter opposed the U.S. Food and Drug Administration (FDA) proposal to carry out pharmaceutical testing using the Office of Management and Budget (OMB) racial and ethnic classification system, arguing that these are “social” not “scientific” categories of race and ethnicity and that the promise of pharmacogenetics lies in its implementation as individualized medicine given the likelihood that variation in drug responses will vary more within racial and ethnic groups than among them (Haga and Venter 2003). However, en route to a “personalized” or “precision” medicine based on individual genetic differences and pharmaceuticals tailored to individual genomes, a detour via research into group genetic differences has been taken. Now that group genetic differences have become of interest to more than just evolutionary biologists and population geneticists, impetus is provided to debates to which philosophers of science have contributed: longstanding debates about whether race is biologically real or socially constructed (Andreasen 2000; Pigliucci and Kaplan 2003; Gannett 2010; Hochman 2013; Spencer 2014) and more recent ones concerning the appropriateness of the use of racial categories in biomedical research (Root 2003; Gannett 2005; Kaplan 2010; Hardimon 2013).

Despite the detour via group genetic differences en route to “personalized” or “precision” medicine, genome-based research into common diseases and drug responses has focused predominantly on Europeans. For GWAS, a 2009 analysis showed that 96 percent of participants were of European descent; by 2016, though the proportion of participants of European descent had decreased to 81 percent, the change was mostly accounted for by a greater number of studies being carried out in Asian countries (Popejoy and Fullerton 2016). Even though African populations are the most genetically diverse in the world, by 2018, only 2 percent of GWAS participants had been African in origin (Sirugo et al. 2019). This European bias makes it more difficult to isolate rare genetic variants contributing to disease, to provide accurate and informative genetic test results to nonEuropeans, and to ensure that any clinical benefits that arise from genomic research will be equitably distributed within the U.S. and globally. Sociologist Dorothy E. Roberts (2021) calls for genetic researchers to “stop using a white, European standard for human genetics and instead study a fuller range of human genetic variation,” which will “give scientists a richer resource to understand human biology” as well as promoting equitable access to the benefits of research. That study of human genetic variation, Roberts argues, should abandon use of race “as a biological variable that can explain differences in health, disease, or responses to therapies,” as it obscures “how structural racism has biological effects and produces health disparities in racialized populations” (p. 566). Structural racism is advanced as a key determinant of population health: for example, the racial and economic segregation of neighborhoods contributes to health disparities because of differences in quality of housing, exposure to pollutants and toxins, good education and employment opportunities, and access to decent health care (Bailey et al. 2017).

The NHGRI has affirmed its commitment to improve the inclusion of participants from diverse populations in research and begun to appreciate that genomic studies are designed in ways that fail to consider the contribution of social and physical environments to disease (Hindorff et al. 2018). However, as sociologist Steven Epstein (2007) has argued more generally, the “inclusion-and-difference paradigm” that has prevailed in U.S. research over the past couple of decades, though correcting researchers’ previously held default assumption of the white, middle-aged, white male as the normative standard, serves to amplify the role of biology in health and disease while drawing attention away from society. Genome scientists understand the ramifications attached to their use of racial and ethnic categories in research, and despite longstanding, well-considered ELSI-funded research that urges care be attached to the use of these categories (Sankar and Cho 2002; Sankar et al. 2007), problems are ongoing and attended to by NHGRI leaders concerned about “the misuse of social categories of race and ethnicity as a proxy for genomic variation” (Bonham et al. 2018, p. 1534). The “weaponization” of genomics by White nationalists and the alt-right has raised the stakes for genome scientists. The self-described fascist, White supremacist, racist, and anti-Semite who murdered 10 African Americans at a Buffalo supermarket in 2022 posted writings that cited dozens of scientific studies, including use of a GWAS of educational attainment to support hereditarian views of racial differences in intelligence and use of a principal components analysis (PCA) that resolved human genetic diversity into continental-level clusters to support realism about biological race (Carlson 2022).

White supremacists chug milk to celebrate their origins in European populations that evolved the ability to digest lactose in adulthood (Harmon 2018), and they appeal to traces of Neanderthal DNA in their genomes to celebrate their origins in populations that evolved outside Africa (Wolinsky 2019). While it seems incumbent on genome scientists to confront racist misuses of their research, they face challenges in doing so. Misuse may result from misunderstanding science, but not always: lay experts among White nationalists capably use cutting-edge genomics research to justify hereditarian views, thereby building a counter-knowledge (Doron, in press) or citizen science of sorts (Panofsky and Donovan 2019). In the U.S., White nationalists take DTC ancestry tests to prove their genetic purity, that they are 100% European/White/non-Jewish (Panofsky and Donovan 2019), while in Europe, this assumed homogeneity of Whiteness comes into question with Nordicists and Mediterraneans using genetic admixture mapping as they vie to prove themselves the most European of Europeans (Doron, in press). When scientists engage with racists, even ones who are scientifically literate, there is the risk of unintentionally helping their cause. “Furthermore,” as Aaron Panofsky et al. (2021) argue, “many of the findings about human evolution and variation are genuinely complex, ambiguous, contested, changing, and involve historically contingent judgments” (p. 396); hence, it may be difficult to claim that research has been misconstrued. As Claude-Olivier Doron notes, insofar as lay experts exploit ambiguities constitutive of scientific discourse in population genetics as they transfer scientific findings to a White supremacist ideological framework, these findings operate within the framework without distortion.

Genome scientists have made recommendations about sampling protocols and standards for visualizations in population genomics to discourage the misappropriation of research by racists who draw conclusions inconsistent with the intentions of scientists (Carlson et al. 2022). However, these recommendations portray population genetic structure, unlike race, as wholly biological, and as science studies scholarship suggests, the challenge of accessing the biological without recourse to the social—and the interests, biases, and imaginaries associated with the social—may be impossible to overcome. Historians, sociologists, and anthropologists of science have insightfully documented how social, political, and cultural constructions of identity are incorporated in, and become defined by, genetics and genomics research in ways specific to their locations: reenactment of continentally-defined races as biogeographical ancestry in the U.S. (Fullwiley 2008; Gannett 2014); influence of population genetics on Irish origin stories and genealogy of the Irish Travellers (Nash 2008; Nash 2017); naturalization and even pathologization of caste and regional differences in India (Egorova 2010); geneticization/genomicization of Mestizo identity in the context of Mexico’s own genome mapping project (López Beltrán 2011); post-apartheid South Africa’s “genomic archive” bound to apartheid’s racialized subjectivities despite advancing nonracial unity through common origins (Schramm 2021); genetic ancestry testing as a basis for Jewishness (El-Haj 2012); Native American DNA as proof of tribal identity (TallBear 2013); and nationalism’s role in interpreting differences between the Korean Reference Genome (KOREF) and HGP’s genome reference sequence as occurring at the population rather than individual level (Kowal and Llamas 2019).

Use of “ancestry” as a category for genetics and genomics research is considered a means of averting problems associated with the use of “race” and “ethnicity”; for example, for the mapping of complex traits, rather than relying on self-identified race, it has been recommended that population structure be assessed empirically by genotyping individuals to determine their “continental ancestry” proportions (Shields et al. 2005). Critics contend, however, that “continental ancestry” belies the continuous pattern with which genetic variation is distributed across the species and reenacts race as it has been traditionally defined, thus contributing to its reification (Fullwiley 2008; Gannett 2014; Lewis et al. 2022). In 2023, the National Academy of Sciences published a Consensus Study Report, “Using Population Descriptors in Genetics and Genomics Research: A New Framework for an Evolving Field,” in response to a request by the National Institutes of Health to assess the status of use of race, ethnicity, ancestry, and other population descriptors. The report recommends against use of racial labels in genetics and genomics research, a possible exception being studies of health disparities with genomic data, in which race serves as a proxy for environmental variables (e.g., racism). A distinction is drawn between genetic ancestry (paths through which an individual’s DNA is inherited from specific ancestors, known as the “ancestral recombination graph”) and genetic similarity (a quantitative measure of genetic resemblance among individuals that reflects shared genetic ancestry). The report recognizes geographic origins, ethnicity, and genetic ancestry as appropriate categories for reconstructing human evolutionary history, but advocates use of genetic similarity to constitute groups in most other research contexts, including gene discovery for complex traits.

Relying on genetic similarity does not necessarily lead researchers away from race, ethnicity, and ancestry. In an ethnographic study, sociologists Joan H. Fujimura and Ramya Rajagopalan (2011) found that although the statistical machinery associated with GWAS allows researchers to avoid race and ethnic categories by analyzing samples based wholly on genetic similarity, there was “slippage” from genetic similarity to shared ancestry, which, in turn, since mediated by geography and genealogy, became interpreted as racial or ethnic. While ancestral recombination graphs situate individuals in the context of their genealogical relations without assigning them to geographically or culturally defined populations or groups, in practice, these categories are almost always incorporated in genetic ancestry estimation (Lewis et al. 2022). Population geneticist Graham Coop (2022) favours replacing genetic ancestry with genetic similarity, arguing that describing a sampled individual’s genetic similarity to a reference panel (e.g., “X is genetically similar to the GBR 1000 Genome samples”) is preferable to attributing genetic ancestry to that individual (e.g., “X has Northwestern European genetic ancestry”), as it recognizes the conventionalism of the reference panel and continuity of genetic variation (pp. 11–12). However, given that the 1000 Genomes Project’s 26 populations across five continental regions are named using language that reflects “both the ancestral geography or ethnicity of each population and the geographic location where the samples from that population were collected” (Coriell Institute)—e.g., “British from England and Scotland”—the slippage remarked upon by Fujimura and Rajagopalan is encouraged. Nevertheless, as sociologists Aaron Panofsky and Catherine Bliss (2017) observe, “Geneticists face a complex set of pressures regarding population labeling” (p. 75). Ambiguous labels for populations that conflate geography, race, and ethnicity may offer geneticists the flexibility to fulfill their own research goals while accessing repositories of preclassified biospecimens and data, collaborating with researchers pursuing quite different agendas, and maintaining goodwill with populations studied. These pressures compete with pressures about labels imposed by funders and journals, which may provoke skepticism and resistance.

2.5 ELSI and Its Legacy

Although ELSI may have had an inauspicious argued beginning in Watson’s apparent off-the-cuff remarks at a 1988 news conference, the research program has outlasted the HGP itself. ELSI funding is mandated through the National Institutes of Health Revitalization Act of 1993, which calls for a minimum of 5 percent of the NIH budget for the HGP—the monies directed to the NCHGR-NHGRI—to be set aside to study the ethical, legal, and social implications of the science of genomics (McEwen et al. 2014). The Division of Genomics and Society at the NIH’s NHGRI, created in 2012, maintains the Ethical, Legal and Social Implications (ELSI) Research Program as an extramural grant funding initiative to the present day; the division also includes an intramural bioethics program. Input concerning the ELSI program is provided by the NHGRI Genomics and Society Working Group through the National Advisory Council for Human Genome Research.

A review article by NIH staff (McEwen et al. 2014) characterizes the ELSI program as “an ongoing experiment.” Since it was established in 1990, the ELSI program has supported empirical and conceptual research carried out by researchers from a broad range of disciplines: “genetics and genomics, clinical medicine, bioethics, the social sciences (e.g., psychology, sociology, anthropology, political science, and communication science), history, philosophy, literature, law, economics, health services, and public policy” (p. 485). This research is considered to have had impacts on genomics studies (e.g., requirements for informed consent, protection of the privacy of subjects, and nomenclature for socially defined groups), genomic medicine (e.g., personal impacts of acquiring genetic information from screening and testing carried out in clinical, research, and direct-to-consumer settings), and wider society (e.g., federal legislation prohibiting genetic discrimination in health insurance and employment, increased awareness about DNA forensics, and policies on gene patenting). The experimental aspect remarked upon refers to the organizational and physical situation of ELSI, a program charged with critically evaluating the implications genomics research, within the very agency that funds that research. While this institutional arrangement supports the growing trend to integrate ELSI research with genomics research and policy formulation, ensuring that ELSI research is scientifically informed and practically relevant, excessive proximity also risks compromising “the autonomy, objectivity, and intellectual independence of ELSI investigators” (McEwen et al. 2014).

Since the early years of the HGP, bioethicists have criticized ELSI on various institutional grounds: for a lack of independence from scientist-overseers (Murray 1992; Yesley 2008), for an absence of structure conducive to providing guidance regarding policy (Hanna 1995), and for a negative impact on bioethics in narrowing the range of topics covered and creating an isolated subspecialty within the field (Annas and Elias 1992; Hanna et al. 1993). And from history and philosophy of science quarters, broader philosophical concerns have been raised about ELSI’s focus on the ethical, legal, and social implications of genetic research. Such a focus promotes a “downstream” rather than “upstream” framework for understanding the relationship between science and ethics that fails to appreciate that foundational concepts in genetic research such as normality and mutation are themselves evaluative and operate as directives to action (Limoges 1994). ELSI’s European counterpart, Ethical, Legal and Social Aspects or ELSA, chose to use the term “aspects” in order to avoid the connotations of narrowness, linearity, and determinism attached to the term “implications” (Hilgartner et al. 2016).

The “ongoing experiment” at the NIH’s NHGRI has come to define a particular model for doing research in bioethics that is being exported to other rapidly developing scientific fields, as expressed in the title of a target article published in AJOB Neuroscience, “To ELSI or Not to ELSI Neuroscience: Lessons for Neuroethics from the Human Genome Project” (Klein 2010). Indeed, although “ELSI” entered the lexicon as an acronym for the specific extramural research program supported by US government funding set aside for the HGP (elsewhere in the world, similar programs received their own appellations and acronyms—e.g., Genomics and its Ethical, Environmental, Economic, Legal, and Social Aspects or GE3LS in Canada), with that program offering a possible model for other emerging sciences, the term has come to receive a broader meaning that refers instead to a field of research, defined by its “research and scholarship content, rather than a particular set of funding sources” (Morrissey and Walker 2012, p. 52). Given the interest in exporting the ELSI model, its merits as a field of research, as bioethicists Clair Morrissey and Rebecca L. Walker argue (Morrissey and Walker 2012; Walker and Morrissey 2014), need to be examined. Investigating the content and methods of ELSI as a field of research, Morrissey and Walker combed through hundreds of articles and book chapters published between 2003 and 2008 (Morrissey and Walker 2012, Walker and Morrissey 2014). They found that funding sources influenced what research is carried out: though only 17 percent of all publications involved empirical research, for publications whose authors received US government funding, 30 percent of those with non-NHGRI support and 52 percent of those with NHGRI support were empirically based. They found that institutional and professional forces, irrespective of funding sources, promoted the coverage of topics of greatest interest to affluent populations (e.g., “genomics and clinical practice,” “intellectual property,” “genetic enhancement,” and “biorepositories”). They found that the vast majority (89 percent) of publications were prescriptive, recommending to diverse actors (scientists, clinicians, bioethicists, government, etc.) that certain policies or practices be pursued. Given this overwhelmingly prescriptive posture, they were dismayed to find that publications made use of multiple bioethical methods in piecemeal fashion with little depth. For the most part (77 percent), publications did not reflect on methods.

ELSI itself has become an object of research in science and technology studies (STS) scholarship. The ELSI model, as incorporated more recently in areas such as nano and synthetic biology, is understood as serving as “a new governance tool built on the prior institutionalization of ‘bioethics’ as a way to manage problems of moral ambiguity and disagreement in biomedicine” (Hilgartner et al. 2016, p. 824). At the outset of the HGP, ELSI relied on a governance model in which ethicists and social scientists lent their expertise by producing a body of scholarship that could inform public policy; subsequently, especially in Europe, social scientists were expected to facilitate mechanisms for making public policy in more democratic ways by engaging stakeholders and the broader public. Hilgartner et al. (2016) argue that STS scholarship sits somewhat uneasily alongside ELSI scholarship inasmuch as STS scholarship problematizes elements of the “traditional imaginaries of orderly science-society relations” to which ELSI subscribes, such as the fact/value distinction, the “neutrality” of science and technology, and “the self-evidence of power relations” (p. 832). Criticisms are also made that as a tool of governance, bioethics exercises power in ways often unseen, thereby foreclosing questions asked and debates had—for e.g., taking the boundary between facts and values as given not made, presenting rational moral arguments as outside politics to dismiss issues of public concern, or circumventing legislation by justifying the extension of existing regulations.


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For the original entry, I am grateful for the assistance of a California State University Faculty Development Grant and the help of three very capable student research assistants: Isabel Casimiro at California State University, Chico and Andrew Inkpen and Ashley Pringle at Saint Mary’s University. This revised entry has benefited from the excellent advice and thoughtful encouragement provided by Jim Griesemer and Jim Tabery.

Copyright © 2023 by
Lisa Gannett <>

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