The Donation and Sale of Human Eggs and Sperm

First published Thu Jun 15, 2017; substantive revision Thu Dec 16, 2021

The donation and transfer of human gametes (eggs and sperm) for reproductive purposes raises many important and difficult questions. Some of these relate directly to policy and practice; others are more conceptual. Gamete donation occupies an interesting position within bioethics, having something in common both with other forms of donation (blood and organs, for example) and with reproductive technologies not involving donation (ranging from IVF through to more controversial areas like cloning, embryo selection, and genetic modification). It also shares some features with adoption and surrogacy, practices which also (arguably at least) involve the transfer or delegation of parental duties and rights. (See the entries on cloning, eugenics, feminist perspectives on reproduction and the family, the donation of human organs, and parenthood and procreation.)

Conceptually, gamete donation provides a valuable ‘lens’ through which to re-examine questions such as:

  • What grounds parental rights and responsibilities?
  • What rights and obligations do parents have regarding their children (actual or future) and to what extent can these be transferred or delegated?

It also raises questions in practical ethics and policy, such as:

  • Should there be donor offspring limits (to prevent the same sperm donor having hundreds of biological children)? And, if so, what is the basis for these?
  • Do donor-conceived children have a right to know about their origins? Should donor anonymity be permitted?
  • What ‘matching’ and selection decisions should the prospective recipients be allowed to make? What information about donors should they be given?
  • Is it acceptable to ‘buy and sell’ gametes? And is that any different morally from arrangements in which women are offered heavily discounted fertility treatment services in return for some of their eggs?

Such questions are the subject of this entry.

Before proceeding, however, two matters of definition and scope should be noted.

First, this entry focuses on the donation of human gametes for reproductive purposes, as opposed to for research. The rationale for this is that most of the interesting ethical and philosophical issues here concern, in one way or another, the moral and social relations between the donors, parents (recipients), and children created, and these do not generally arise in the research context. The main exception to this is section 4 (Payment) where similar questions of consent, exploitation, and harm have been raised in both research and treatment contexts (Baylis & McLeod 2007).

Second, there is the question of what counts as (reproductive) gamete donation. At least for the purposes of this entry, we intend the term ‘gamete donation’ to apply to those situations in which –

  1. A (the donor) voluntarily provides B (the recipient or recipients) with gametes (paid or otherwise); and
  2. A expects that and/or intends that B will use those gametes to create C (a child or some children); and
  3. Both A and B expect that and/or intend that A will not become a social or legal parent of C.

1. The Rights and Duties of Gamete Donors

The rights and responsibilities that attach to parenthood are generally understood to be very weighty. Consequently, determining whether or not gamete donors are parents is a question that has attracted much attention. But even if gamete donors are not parents in the deeper ethical sense, they may still have considerable rights and obligations towards their biological offspring. While there is considerable overlap here with the parenthood literature (see the entry on parenthood and procreation) questions about parenthood in the context of gamete donation have garnered much specific attention. In what follows we will examine three distinctive questions that have emerged: (1) Are gamete donors parents? (2) Can parental responsibilities be transferred to others? (3) Do gamete providers acquire any non-parental obligations?

1.1 Arguments in Favour of Gamete Donor Parenthood

A common starting point for the claim that gamete donors acquire parental responsibilities is to highlight the strong intuitions we have about parenthood in cases other than gamete donation. Normally we think that those who wilfully engage in procreative acts acquire parental obligations if children are created as a result. This is true even when procreation is unintended, due to faulty contraception for example. The strength of this intuition is used as motivation for adopting a causal view of parental obligations. On such views, creating offspring in the right kind of way is sufficient for the acquisition of parental responsibilities. Those who think that gamete donors have parental obligations proceed by arguing that the most plausible causal accounts of parenthood must include gamete donors (Nelson 1999; Fuscaldo 2006; Blustein 1997).

For instance, Nelson argues that our common-sense understanding of moral responsibility is what best explains our intuitions about parenthood following unintentional procreation. On the common-sense view, individuals are morally responsible for the consequences of their free actions when (1) their actions are sufficient to bring about those consequences, and (2) their actions are causally proximate to the consequence in question. Gamete donors satisfy these conditions. Nelson further argues that gamete donors’ causal involvement in creating children does not significantly depart from that of unintentional parents (at least not in morally relevant respects) and therefore consistency demands that gamete donors be ascribed parental responsibilities as well (Nelson 1999, 2014).

Another route is to argue that reproduction is a special kind of case, and that special rules apply when determining what moral responsibilities arise for reproducers. Consider for example what David Benatar (1999) calls ‘reproductive autonomy’. Benatar argues that individuals’ reproductive autonomy both entitles them to make reproductive decisions, and requires them to take responsibility for the consequences of those decisions. He argues that this is a special feature of our ability to reproduce that is not fully reducible to genetics or mere causality, and results in a presumptive duty to parent the children created from our gametes. This, he argues, best explains why parental responsibilities arise in accidental pregnancy cases. Though in some circumstances the presumptive duty to parent one’s genetic children may be overridden, this is not the case for most instances of gamete provision (Benatar 1999).

One worry about Benatar’s argument is that it relies heavily on stipulating that unique moral features attach to reproduction, and so risks begging the question. Rivka Weinberg (2008) offers an argument for a similar conclusion, but on more general grounds. Weinberg argues that when individuals exercise control over materials that pose grave risks to others (what she calls ‘hazardous materials’) they are liable for the consequences that arise, regardless of the precautions they take. For instance, the owner of a pet lion is liable for damage done by the lion regardless of the precautions the owner takes to keep the lion contained. Calling this the “Hazmat Theory”, Weinberg argues that it applies to gametes because their use can have morally weighty consequences for third parties – namely the children that may result from the union of gametes. Consequently, Weinberg argues that gamete providers are obliged to care for the children that result from the voluntary use of their gametes (Weinberg 2008).

Importantly, none of the preceding arguments rely on genetic relatedness as grounds for parenthood. It is not the genetic similarity between gamete donors and their biological offspring that is doing the work, but rather considerations about the kind of thing gametes are (things that can create people) and how gamete donors use them.

David Velleman (2005, 2008), however, does argue that being parented by close genetic relations is of great importance to the wellbeing of children, and that for this reason we ought to be sceptical of the ease with which society permits the separation of social parenthood from biological parenthood.

1.2 Arguments Against Gamete Donor Parenthood

Those who argue that gamete donation does not result in parental responsibilities find fault with causal accounts of parenthood. One prominent move is the ‘too many parents’ objection. The core of this objection is the claim that causal theorists have no principled way to distinguish members of the causal chain who acquire parental responsibilities from those who ought not be ascribed such responsibilities. As a result, causal accounts ascribe parenthood to too many people.

For instance, Tim Bayne (2003) argues that both Benatar and Nelson are committed to including biological grandparents and great grandparents etc. amongst those who acquire parental responsibilities for donor-conceived children. Bayne thinks Benatar is committed to this conclusion because subsequent generations are the result of an individuals’ exercise of reproductive autonomy. He thinks that Nelson is committed to this conclusion because biological grandparents and great grandparents are necessary causes of their donor-conceived children, and so satisfy Nelson’s criteria for parenthood.

It is however unclear whether Bayne’s criticism is apt. Nelson’s account does rely on causal proximity, but he explicitly rejects the view that merely being a necessary part of a causal chain that results in the creation of a child is sufficient for parenthood (Nelson 1991, 53). The actions of intervening agents plausibly restricts the scope of individuals who are causally proximate.

And Benatar’s view does not ascribe obligations for all the downstream consequences of one’s exercise of reproductive autonomy. Indeed, autonomous control over the use of particular gametes is an important feature of Benatar’s account. Grandparents and great grandparents do not normally possess autonomous control over the use of their offspring’s gametes, and so would not normally be parents on this view.

Jason Hanna (2019) advances a better version of the objection. Hanna argues that medical professionals do exercise control over gametes and are proximate causes of the children created through their use. After all, medical professionals often perform the critical steps necessary for conception. Indeed, in many cases medical professionals are more causally proximate and exercise more control over the creation of children than gamete donors. Consistency thus demands that at least some of the medical professionals involved in gamete donation be ascribed parenthood. According to Hanna, the most promising way for causal theorists to escape this reductio is to accept that causal responsibilities do not extend to cases in which: (a) one individual acts for the sake of another in an employee/employer type relationship and (b) that individual has reasonable assurances that the employer will ensure that any obligations arising from their actions will be fulfilled. This move has intuitive appeal. We do not think that an employee whose assigned task produces pollutants has a special responsibility to clean up those pollutants if her employer fails to do so as promised. Hanna notes that this limit on the scope of causal responsibility insulates gamete donors from weighty obligations because gamete donors provide services for commissioning parents in something like an employee/employer relationship.

Elizabeth Brake advances another challenge to causal views of parenthood. Brake (2005, 2010) argues that we are mistaken to think that being causally involved in creating offspring suffices for acquiring parental responsibilities. According to Brake, many of the social practices that causal theorists appeal to, like child maintenance obligations in accidental pregnancy cases, are in fact mistaken. Brake argues that instead, we ought to be voluntarists about parenthood. This does mean that those who cause children to exist are free from obligations altogether. Brake argues that we ought to distinguish between what she calls ‘procreative costs’ and the more demanding obligations of parenthood. While causal actors may be responsible for procreative costs, they certainly do not have parental responsibilities. More will be said about Brake’s procreative costs in section 1.4

1.3 The Transferability of Parental Responsibilities

One way we might sidestep concerns about the parental status of gamete donors is to argue that parental responsibilities can be transferred to others. If such transfers are possible then presumably gamete donors do so when they make their gametes available to others. That such transfers are at least sometimes possible is a view that is held by many (O’Neill 1979; Bayne 2003; Fuscaldo 2006; Benatar 1999). Those who defend the transferability of parental responsibilities argue that parents often transfer some of their responsibilities to others, such as school teachers, nannies, and doctors. So long as gamete donors have reason to believe that those to whom the responsibilities are transferred will do an adequate job, such transfers are unproblematic. On this view, we ought to treat gamete donation as a comprehensive transfer of responsibilities that is no different in kind from these other commonplace transfers of responsibility. However, accepting the transferability of parental responsibilities does not imply that current practice is morally permissible. We might think that many gamete donors fail to take the necessary steps to ensure that their biological offspring will be adequately reared (Benatar 1999).

The transferability of parental responsibilities is however controversial. Many argue that the move from some transfers of responsibility to the complete abdication of parental responsibility is too quick (Velleman 2008; Weinberg 2008; Nelson 1991; Brandt 2016). For instance, Velleman (2008) argues that while adoption is acceptable when there is no other means to provide a child with an adequate life, this should not be confused with the intentional creation of children whose social link to their genetic parents will be severed. Because Velleman believes that preserving the social connection between children and genetic parents is important for the wellbeing of children, he argues that, unless there is pressing reason to do otherwise, children ought to be parented by their genetic progenitors.

Weinberg (2008) argues that parental responsibilities cannot be transferred in full because certain kinds of intimate responsibilities can only be fulfilled by particular individuals: individuals in the right intimate relationship. For instance, parents cannot transfer the obligation to celebrate their children’s achievements to others by having strangers attend their children’s music recitals or award ceremonies. Weinberg thinks that gamete donors have a responsibility to love their children and that the responsibility to love a particular person is paradigmatic of the kind that cannot be transferred. Consequently, at least some parental responsibilities are not transferable.

Brandt (2006) disputes the claim that partial transfers of parental responsibilities are commonplace. When a responsibility is delegated but not transferred, the individual delegating the responsibility must still ensure that the responsibility is fulfilled. For instance, parents have a duty to ensure that their children are in fact receiving proper education from their teachers, and must take corrective measures if this is not the case. The duty to educate is thus delegated to teachers, but not transferred to them. In general, the examples offered to show that partial transfers of parental responsibility are commonplace tend to be in fact examples of delegation. This undermines the claim that a complete transfer of parental responsibility is merely an extension of already accepted practices because it is delegation that is the norm, not transfer.

1.4 Non-Parental Responsibilities

Even if gamete donors are not parents, they may still have substantial obligations towards their offspring. Bayne (2003) argues that gamete donors have the responsibility to prevent certain kinds of lives from coming about. For instance, they may be obliged to refrain from creating children with severe congenital diseases that would result in a ‘life not worth living’. Many authors (Bayne 2003; Archard 2010; Porter 2014; Fuscaldo 2006; O’Neill 1979, Brandt 2016) also think that gamete donors must take steps to ensure that their offspring will be parented in at least a minimally acceptable manner.

While the preceding responsibilities concern pre-conditions for the permissible transfer of gametes, there might also be donor responsibilities that extend into the lives of donor-conceived offspring. For instance, as noted above, Brake (2005, 2010) argues that gamete donors might have an ongoing duty to ensure that their biological offspring receive a minimum level of care (she calls these ‘procreative costs’), but that this should not be confused with parental responsibilities, which are more intimate and more morally weighty in nature. Likewise Brake, Porter (2012, 2014) and Brandt (2016, 2020) similarly argue that gamete donors must continue to take steps to ensure that their offspring have a decent life, though they are not necessarily obligated to parent their offspring themselves.

There are reasons to think that these responsibilities do not go far enough. For instance Prusak (2011) argues that the gap between Brake’s ‘procreative costs’ and parental responsibility is not as pronounced as it initially appears. Consequently, for all practical purposes gamete donors have responsibilities edging on full blown parenthood. Conversely, arguments originating in the abortion literature imply that gamete donors need only ensure that their offspring have lives worth living. For a discussion of these arguments and a response see Brandt (2020).

Another kind of non-parental obligation that gamete donors might have is to remain open to the possibility of forming relationships with their biological offspring, though this openness does not entail an obligation to in fact form such relationships (Little 1999; Kolodny 2010).

1.5 Offspring Limits

In addition to obligations that focus on the wellbeing of potential offspring and the competence of intending parents, another question is whether there ought to be limits on the number of offspring that can be created from a single gamete provider. This question is most significant in sperm provision because of the relative ease of creating large numbers of children from the gametes provided by a single individual. Three major justifications have been offered for offspring limits: the risk of accidental consanguineous relationships, the likelihood of convoluted social relationships with kin, and general social discomfort with large offspring numbers (Wright 2016). While the last might not be a plausible justification on its own, it is worth mentioning because in practice such concerns have had an influential role on imposed offspring limits (Deech 1998; Warnock Report 1984).

Limiting offspring numbers in order to reduce the likelihood of accidental consanguineous relationships between offspring of the same donor was initially proposed by individuals concerned about possible risks of congenital disease (Curie-Cohen 1980). Recent work has attempted to quantify these risks (De Boer et al. 1995; Wang et al. 2007). While the increased risk of congenital disease resulting from unintentional consanguinity is dependent on the size of the population served by a sperm bank, the risk is lower than might be initially thought. For instance, Dutch models suggest that an offspring limit of up to 25 would not result in any significant increased risk, given their particular demographic makeup (De Boer et al. 1995). However, there is also the risk of psychological harm for individuals that discover they have unwittingly entered into a consanguineous relationship, given the associated social taboos (Wright 2016). Furthermore, there may be legal complications if an accidental consanguineous marriage is discovered after the fact (Cahn 2009a). One way to mitigate these risks without imposing offspring limits would be to increase openness in gamete provision, including actively informing individuals about the identity of their genetic siblings. However, even in the absence of such measures there is little agreement about how the risks associated with consanguinity should be translated into offspring limits, especially given the broad reproductive freedom individuals are generally afforded (Wright 2016; HFEA 2011).

The main worry in relation to social relationships with kin is that initiating and maintaining relationships with progenitors and/or genetic siblings is made much more challenging if there are large numbers to accommodate. The extent to which this justifies offspring limits will depend on the importance placed on such relationships and, as noted previously, there is much disagreement about this. Furthermore, some empirical research into kin relationships following gamete provision has found that having large numbers of genetic siblings is not necessarily an impediment to the formation of meaningful relationships (Freeman, Jadva, & Slutsky 2016).

2. Donor Anonymity

There is general agreement that it is permissible for donor-conceived individuals to have information about and contact with their genetic progenitors. However, gamete donation arrangements in which there is an expectation that donors remain anonymous are more contentious.

Advocates of children’s rights to access identifying information about their donors generally appeal to harms that might arise in the absence of such information, and/or a purported fundamental right to information about one’s genetic origins (Ravitsky 2010, 2012; Velleman 2005, 2008; McGee, Brakeman, and Gurmankin 2001; Blyth and Farrand 2004). Possible harms considered include psychological distress, damaged familial relationships, reduced self-knowledge, and incomplete or incorrect medical records. Those who favour permitting anonymous donation argue that it is a mistake to place a great deal of importance on genetic origins, and question both the severity of the harms caused by anonymous donation and whether the existence of such harms constitutes a decisive argument against donor-anonymity (Melo-Martín 2014; Haslanger 2009).

The philosophical debate takes place within a background of changing legal norms governing donor anonymity (Clark 2011; Frith 2001; Bernstein 2010). While maintaining donor anonymity was once common practice (and is mandatory in certain jurisdictions, such as France) there has been a strong trend towards enshrining in law donor-conceived children’s rights to access identifying information about their donor, at least once they reach the age of majority (Clark 2011; Frith 2001; Bernstein 2010; Brunet and Kunstmann 2013).

2.1 Psychological Distress and Self-Knowledge

One reason for prohibiting anonymous gamete donation is the distress that advocates of disclosure claim many donor-conceived children suffer as a consequence of the absence of identifying information about their biological progenitors. This distress is sometimes referred to as ‘genealogical bewilderment’, a term originally coined in reference to the distress experienced by adoptees, and its symptoms are said to include difficulty developing a personal identity that feels genuine, anguish about not knowing the identity of one’s genetic relations, and an obsession with trying to find out information about one’s genetic relations (Sants 1964; Cahn 2009b). Advocates of the right to know point to both scientific studies and general social observations, such as the rise of services to help donor-conceived individuals find their biological relations, as evidence of the severity of this harm (McWhinnie 2001; Frith 2001; Ravitsky 2010).

A related argument is that donor-conceived individuals are denied an important good if they are not given access to detailed information about their biological relations. More than simply satisfying curiosity, some argue that knowledge about one’s biological relations (especially through contact) is important for self-knowledge (Velleman 2005, 2008). On this view, while a name and biographical details may not replace being reared by biological relations, they do at least provide donor-conceived individuals with some information, and make contact later in life possible.

However, both these arguments have been challenged on empirical and philosophical grounds. While some studies do indeed show that a subset of donor-conceived individuals suffer psychological distress from not knowing the identity of their progenitors, others show that such distress is not common, and is not particularly severe when it does arise (Melo-Martín 2014; Haslanger 2009). Studies also show that early disclosure helps children incorporate the fact that they were donor-conceived into their identity and sense of self, thus helping donor-conceived children avoid some of psychological harms associated with genealogical bewilderment (Golombok et. al. 2002). Advocates of the permissibility of donor anonymity thus argue that there is no clear evidence that donor anonymity is likely to result in severe harm to offspring. If anything, the evidence suggests that we should have a policy of early disclosure.

Furthermore, some argue that any psychological harm that does arise is likely socially constructed. As evidence, they point to studies showing that individuals who are unaware that they were donor-conceived do no worse than their peers when it comes to psychological wellbeing (Melo-Martín 2014; Haslanger 2009). Consequently, they argue that any psychological harms experienced by donor-conceived individuals arise in virtue of the social importance placed on biological ties rather than any ‘necessary’ deficit arising from being reared by individuals who are not genetic relations. Similar arguments have also been raised in response to Velleman’s views regarding the value of contact with genetic relations for self-knowledge (Haslanger 2009).

If the psychological harms arising from donor-anonymity are socially constructed, then prohibiting anonymous gamete donation may exacerbate the harms suffered by donor-conceived children. This is because such a prohibition could further reify the importance of biological ties (sometimes referred to as ‘biologism’), which is what gives rise to the harm in the first place (Melo-Martín 2014; Leighton 2014; Haslanger 2009). By signalling the importance of biological ties, prohibiting donor anonymity might further stigmatize those raised by non-biological parents.

However, that a harm is socially constructed does not make it any less real, or less in need of redress. This results in a difficult bind for those who agree that the harms are socially constructed. They are left having to balance the interests of donor-conceived offspring with the broader social goal of eliminating unjust socially constructed harms. The best way to go about doing so is unclear (Haslanger 2009).

2.2 Medical Records

Another reason offered for prohibiting anonymous gamete donation is that it prevents donor-conceived individuals from making health decisions informed by family medical history. If individuals are not informed about being donor-conceived, they risk making medical decisions on the incorrect assumption that their social family’s medical background reflects their own. And even if such individuals are informed that they are donor-conceived, they still suffer from an absence of medical information that is generally available to others (Ravitsky 2012). While it is true that medical information could be provided at the time of donation in a manner that preserves the anonymity of the donor, some argue that, as our understanding of congenital disease changes, new information is likely to become relevant (Leighton 2014; McGee, Brakeman, & Gurmankin 2001). Additionally, certain relevant medical conditions might only become apparent long after the donation. While a system could be put in place for donors to update their medical information, some argue that such a system would likely be too cumbersome for donor-conceived individuals to receive the medical information they need in a timely fashion (McGee, Brakeman, & Gurmankin 2001).

However, those who defend the permissibility of donor anonymity argue that the value of medical history is overstated, and will become less important as we move towards personalized medicine (Melo-Martín 2014). In fact, in a report recommending against permitting donor anonymity, the UK’s Nuffield Council on Bioethics stated that medical interests alone were not sufficient grounds for prohibiting donor anonymity (Nuffield Council on Bioethics 2013).

2.3 Family Cohesion

Another argument against donor anonymity is that secrecy about origins has the potential to damage the relationships between donor-conceived children and their social parents, especially in cases where the social parent(s) know the identity of the gamete donor(s) Some argue that the strain of having to ‘keep the secret’ is a cause of stress for social parents, and that this stress has a negative impact on familial wellbeing (Landau 1998). A potentially more significant source of family tension is accidental disclosure, especially when donor-conceived children are older. In this latter case, several harms might arise, and may be greatly exacerbated if children were not aware that they were donor-conceived. Children might develop feelings of distrust towards their social parents, and may have difficulty incorporating facts about their genetic history into their personal identity (Turner & Coyle 2000).

While harms caused by both secrecy and accidental disclosure can be mitigated to some extent without making identifiable information available, by simply disclosing to children at a young age that they are donor-conceived for example, some argue that more openness is better for familial unity, and that providing children with an opportunity to find out the identity of their donors (even if that is delayed until they are older) is usually best (Nuffield Council on Bioethics 2009).

Those who favour permitting anonymous gamete donation argue that, at best, the evidence suggests a slight improvement in familial wellbeing when information about a donor is provided along with disclosure about the method of their conception. Families in which children do not have access to identifying information about their donors still report good home-life and have positive relationships with their parents (Melo-Martín 2014). Thus, while non-disclosure might not be optimal, it is probably not so harmful that it falls outside of the domain of parental discretion. Furthermore, if the harms are socially constructed, as some have argued is the case in genealogical bewilderment, then we may have additional reasons for concluding that the harms to family cohesion do not justify prohibiting anonymous donation, since doing so would only further contribute to biologism (Melo-Martín 2014).

2.4 Fundamental Rights

The arguments against donor anonymity considered thus far focus on harms that might arise as a result of the practice. Another kind of argument is that individuals have a fundamental right to knowledge about their origins. In the legal literature, some have argued that the UN’s Declaration on The Rights of The Child and the European Convention on Human Rights establishes individuals’ rights to information about the circumstances of their conception, including information about their progenitors (Blyth & Farrand 2004). Apart from appeals to such declarations of rights, some attempts have been made to motivate recognition of a fundamental right to know via appeal to other fundamental goods.

One strategy is to tie the right to know to the right to an identity. Here the argument is that individuals require genuine facts about their biological history in order to develop a proper personal identity (Ravitsky 2010). However, one response is that while children have a right to an identity, they do not have a right to a particular kind of identity, such as one based primarily on historical biological ties (Allen 1996). Another route is to argue that children have a right to be respected, and that hiding facts about their origins is a form of deception that we ought not permit (Freeman 1996). However, deception about origins is only a severe form of disrespect if we think that biological ties are important in the first place, and thus this argument risks begging the question.

2.5 Policy Argument from Analogy to Adoption

Offspring’s ability to access adoption records have oscillated quite substantially over the past century and a half, even within the same jurisdiction (Samuels 2000). More recently, regulatory structures have shifted in favour of providing adoptees with a legal right to access identifying information about their progenitors (Besson 2007, Hildebrand 1999). In such jurisdictions, some have argued that, because gamete donation is sufficiently similar to adoption, regulatory consistency demands that anonymous gamete donation be prohibited as well (Pratten v. British Columbia (Attorney General) 2012 BCCA 480; Chisholm 2012; Cahn 2009c – see Other Internet Resources). While this parity argument only goes so far in the absence of philosophical justification for prohibiting anonymous adoption (mere consistency could conversely be achieved by permitting anonymous adoption) it does give pause to examine the relevant similarities between the two practices.

The core of the parity argument is that in both adoption and gamete donation, children are reared by individuals other than their genetic progenitors. If we think that access to information about genetic progenitors is important enough to be elevated to the status of a right in adoption, then we ought to extend the same right to donor-conceived individuals as well.

In response, Leighton has argues that there are important disanalogies between adoption and gamete donation such that there may be no inconsistency in prohibiting anonymity in one case but not the other (Leighton 2014). For instance, adoptees are generally relinquished by their initial parent(s), and are often not raised by either of their genetic parents. In the case of gamete donation there is no similar relinquishing of parenthood, and often one of the genetic parents is also a social parent. These differences may very well result in divergences in the experiences of adoptees and donor-conceived individuals. For instance, adoptees might feel abandoned by their initial parents, and be curious about why they were relinquished, something that is unlikely to be the case in gamete donation. Furthermore, Leighton argues that since adoption has a history of stigmatization in the West while gamete donation has no such history, there is good reason to think that the psychological impact of anonymous adoption on adoptees will be different from the psychological impact of anonymous gamete donation on donor-conceived individuals (Leighton 2014).

While simply demonstrating that there are relevant disanalogies between adoption and gamete donation does not show that anonymity is permissible in the latter case but not the former, it does show that it is not outright inconsistent to have different policies governing anonymity for each.

3. Donor Matching and Selection

Recipients of donated gametes often wish to have some say in what their donor is ‘like’. The characteristics made available to inform donor selection decisions differ greatly dependent on both the countries and clinics in which such choices are made. However, such information tends to include medical, morphological, and biographical information similar to that found on dating websites, such as hair colour, eye colour, ethnicity, educational attainment, job type, hobbies, and religion.

Few commentators suggest that recipient-parents should be barred completely from accessing information about prospective donors, but neither is it generally assumed that they should be afforded unfettered liberty to choose their donors’ characteristics. Thus, the debate in this area tends to focus on where the line between morally acceptable and unacceptable selection practices lies.

3.1 Motivations Underlying Donor Selection

Three main categories of motivation underlie donor selection decisions.

The first is selection against donors posing a threat to the physical wellbeing of pregnant women. This form of selection is ubiquitous such that the barring of donors with sexually transmissible diseases such as HIV, hepatitis B and syphilis is mandated by national and international guidelines on gamete donation (see, for example HFE Act 2008: s. T52 – see Other Internet Resources). This motivation for selection is widely seen as morally unproblematic and will, for this reason, be largely ignored here.

The second and third categories of motivation, termed here, selection for ‘matching’ and selection for ‘design’ are, unlike the first, based on parental and/or societal preferences or values. In practice, most donor selection decisions will fall into both categories, but a theoretical distinction is nonetheless made between the two in the philosophical literature.

Selection for ‘matching’ is performed with the aim of creating a child who bears a similarity to the recipient parents. Thus, gamete donors are selected (or deselected) by reference to the extent to which their physical (and sometimes social and psychological) characteristics match those of recipient parents (Quiroga, 2017). As Braverman and Frith (2014) note, the aim of this practice is often:

to enable secrecy and concealment of gamete donation. This practice incorporates a popular knowledge of genetics and enables the child to ‘pass’ as a naturally conceived child. This is an attempt to avoid overt ‘difference’ between child and couple and when a good match is achieved the donor disappears from view. (Braverman & Frith 2014: 135)

There may however, be aims other than secrecy and concealment. These may have their basis in concerns regarding compatibility (wanting our children to be ‘like us’ and to ‘fit in’) (Ruddick 2000; Wong 2017), premised on physical or psychological desire (we often choose our reproductive partners because they possess characteristics that please us), or even with the aim of avoiding offence – a member of a couple may be offended if his/her partner prefers a donor with characteristics markedly different from his/her own (Pennings 2000). Importantly, matching motivations are distinguished from other motivations for selection as they are limited only to desires to select for donors with characteristics possessed by one/both intended social parents and should be based only in a desire to attain resemblance between parent and child.

Selection motivated by design, however, is performed with the aim of creating a child with characteristics which may or may not be possessed by the recipient parents but which are, nonetheless, deemed by them (and/or society) to be desirable (and often advantageous). Such selection may thus be performed with several aims in mind. These include but are not limited to desires to increase the life prospects of one’s children by preventing the birth of children with disadvantageous or without advantageous characteristics, to satisfy preferences for a particular ‘kind of child’, or with the eugenic aim of improving the gene pool through the selection of donors deemed to possess ‘superior’ heritable traits.

Of these two categories, a desire for matching is generally thought to be less morally problematic than a desire for design, since desires for familial resemblance, secrecy (within limits), and to avoid offence are often considered relatively benign. This is not, however, to say that no critical work has been done on this topic as shall be seen in subsection 3.3 which looks to the question of whether race-based matching and selection practices are morally permissible.

Design-based motivations for selection, however, have been the subject of a great deal more debate. This discussion largely mirrors (or is subsumed by) many of the discussions had regarding the ethics of selective reproductive technologies, such as pre-implantation and pre-natal genetic diagnosis, and such topics as sex selection and human enhancement (see the entries on pregnancy, birth & medicine, and eugenics). For, although in the context of gamete donor selection there are no embryos or fetuses involved, nor genetic manipulation performed, there has been much focus on questions of:

  • Whether it might be obligatory for recipient parents and/or clinics to select against ‘disadvantageous’ genetic characteristics in their future offspring via donor selection.
  • Whether selection for/against certain characteristics may be impermissible on grounds that it explicitly or implicitly expresses misinformed or ‘ugly’ and discriminatory attitudes towards existing persons with ‘deselected’ characteristics.
  • Whether the desire to influence children’s genetic constitutions through gamete donor selection represents troubling parental attitudes which may be contrary to common conceptions of the good parent and parental virtues such as ‘unconditional love’ and ‘openness to the unbidden’

With this in mind, throughout the following subsections such debates will be explored in turn.

3.2 Selection against Disability and Disadvantage

The desire to have a child free from disability and disease is often considered the least contentious ground for gamete donor selection. Parents and prospective parents, after-all, tend to want the best for their children and diseases and disabilities can make the attainment of a ‘good life’ harder. Given this, and the fact that donor selection, unlike other forms of selective reproduction, raises few thorny questions regarding women’s rights over their own bodies and the moral permissibility of abortion or the destruction of embryos, the dominant position among philosophers regarding gamete selection for the purpose of disability avoidance is one of permissiveness (see for example: Robertson 1994; Glover et al. 1989; Glover 2006; Strong 1997; Bennett 2001; Wilkinson 2010). Robertson (1994) sums up this view well when he states:

The desire not to have a child with serious defects is not itself immoral, and actions to avoid such a reproductive outcome should be respected as an important aspect of procreative liberty. The question then is what means to achieve that goal are acceptable … Preconception selection by voluntary selection of mates or gametes raises the fewest problems … Concern with the genetic fitness of a mate may not be romantic but it is rational if one is concerned about the health of spouse and offspring. Mate selection should thus be left to the individual. Similarly, the selection of a gamete donor should be left to the couple that needs this service. (Roberson 1994: 154)

Some go further, arguing that donor selection for the purpose of disability-avoidance is not merely permissible but, in certain circumstances, obligatory (see, for example: Savulescu 2001; Savulescu & Kahane 2009; Harris 1985, 2002; Buchanan et al 2000; Glover 1989; Glover 2006). Discussions regarding this matter have tended to focus less on gamete donor selection and more on the selection of embryos and fetuses through pre-implantation and pre-natal genetic diagnosis. However, as Holm and Bennett (2014) and Williams (2017) note, arguments suggesting a moral obligation to select against disability in these contexts apply to gamete donor selection too.

Indeed, that this is the case can be seen clearly in the negative media reaction and public outrage directed towards a deaf couple who, after deliberately conceiving a deaf child in the early 2000s via the use of a 5th generation deaf sperm donor, were vilified by the tabloid media and condemned by the US National Association of the Deaf. (For interesting and insightful commentaries on this case see Savulescu 2002; Spriggs 2002; Fahmy 2011.) It can also be seen in the fact that many countries require that clinics screen out potential donors for heritable diseases prior to their inclusion on the donor register. A notable example of this is the UK’s Human Fertilisation and Embryology Act which, since 2008, has included a clause prohibiting the selection of gamete donors and embryos

that are known to have a gene, chromosome, or mitochondrion abnormality involving a significant risk that a person with the abnormality will have or develop: (a) a serious physical or mental disability, (b) a serious illness, or (c) another serious medical condition. (HFE Act 2008, s. 14(4)(9) – see Other Internet Resources)

Yet on what grounds might such an obligation be based? Some suggest that a moral basis for such an obligation may be found by focusing on the interests of and/or the rights of the children that will result from our procreative decisions (see Davis 2001 for a rights-focused approach). Arguments falling into this category thus focus on person-affecting reasons, picking out the harms or limits to opportunity associated with certain disabilities as providing good reason to select against donors with traits liable to result in such harms and limits to opportunity. Such an approach is intuitive. However, given the conclusions of the Non-Identity Problem (see the entry on the non-identity problem), many question the logic of appeals to the interests of the child created in all but cases of the most severe disabilities. For, as it is generally held that a life with a disease or disability is better than no life at all, and selection decisions alter who it is that comes to exist rather than the prospects of determinate future persons, a focus on the interests of future children cannot ground such an obligation (Bennett 2009; Parfit 1984; Parker 2007; Robertson 1994).

Others suggest that although the objects of our procreative efforts may not be harmed by being born with a disability, prospective parents may nevertheless have good moral reason to select against disability in their offspring on the basis of other considerations. These include appeals to the interests of others whose interests may be affected by our reproductive decisions such as existing children and other dependents (Roberts 2009) and taxpayers in countries with socialized medical and welfare systems (Heyd 1995; Fahmy 2011; Rakowski 2002; Williams 2017); appeals to the claim that to fail to take reasonable steps to prevent disability in one’s future children is contrary to common conceptions of the good parent (Steinbock & McClamrock 1994); and to the suggestion that that those who fail to avoid disability in their offspring act wrongly as they deliberately or negligently choose to create a state of affairs that is strictly worse (in terms of some particular value such as happiness/preference satisfaction) than the state of affairs that could have been created had they chosen differently (Harris 1985; Parfit 1984; Glover 1989; Glover 2006). (See the entry on eugenics for a more detailed treatment and criticisms of different arguments in support of an obligation to select against disability.)

Such arguments have, however, been criticized on a number of grounds. Some suggest that parental obligations to their offspring cannot be so strong as to ground an obligation to select against disability (Williams 2017); others claim that “complex concepts such as the good life, the best life, and human flourishing, are not reducible to simple elements or constituent parts which might be identified by the testing of embryos [and selection of sperm donors]” (Parker 2007: 281); and others still question the link between disability and low levels of welfare (Barker & Wilson, 2019) and/or claim that appealing to impersonal harms devalues those with disabilities by suggesting that their lives are worth less than those without disabilities (Asch 2003; Bennett 2009). Yet, while many authors suggest that there cannot be an obligation to select against disability, it is often held that prospective parents should still be at liberty to select against disability in their offspring on the basis of personal preferences.

Among a number of authors associated with the disability rights movement however, a different claim is made. For, such authors suggest that not only can there be no moral obligation to select against disability, parental preferences to screen out disabled donors are morally problematic for two reasons. The first regards the messages that such preferences send about and towards persons living with disabilities, ones which may be seen as discriminatory and offensive: “express[ing] a hurtful attitude about and a hurtful message to people who live with [disabilities]” (Parens & Asch 1999: S2). The second is that the desire to select against disabling genetic traits is based on misinformation regarding both the severity and true nature of disability. In terms of severity, for example, it has been widely reported that persons with disabilities tend to report good quality of life despite the fact that most (non-disabled) observers suggest the opposite (for work on the disability paradox see Albrecht & Devlieger 1999). Regarding the true nature of disability, it is claimed that contrary to the views of many, who hold that disability is inherently disadvantageous, many (and, for those who take an extreme approach, all) of the harms associated with disability are socially constructed. That is, they are often not the result of failures in functioning but society’s failing to account for everyone when designing physical, economic, and social institutions (Glackin 2010). Thus, it is suggested that as disability is often not a feature intrinsic to those who suffer it, to attempt to prevent disability by preventing the existence of persons with disabilities is very much akin to attempts to prevent sexism or racism by preventing the births of black people and women: an inappropriate response to a social problem (Asch 2003).

Taken to extremes, however, social constructivism is often viewed as irredeemably flawed by the academic community and a great number of able bodied and disabled persons alike. Robert Kitcher expresses this well when he notes that if we take a wholly social constructivist view

attempts to decrease the incidence of Tay-Sachs will be no different from Northern Indian sex selection or from anticipated future efforts to cure lesbians. (Kitcher 1996: 215)

(See the entries on parenthood and procreation & eugenics for more in depth discussion of the suggestion that there may be a moral obligation to select against disability in our offspring and the entry disability: definitions, models, experience for more information on models of disability.)

3.3 Characteristics Related to ‘Race’

Questions and concerns have also been raised regarding the appropriateness of selection on the basis of characteristics related to ‘race’, such as skin, eye, and hair colour. Had gamete donor selection been well known in the 1980s when discussion raged concerning whether trans-racial adoption practices constituted a step in the right direction towards the social ideal of colour-blindness, a form of racial and cultural genocide, or something in between the two, one might have expected to see similar discussions regarding donor selection. This, however, has not been the case and instead, the philosophical literature on race-based selection has tended to focus on the question of whether selection of race-based characteristics is appropriate at all.

For the most part, this focus is due to contemporary debates regarding the question of whether the concept of race is philosophically and scientifically defensible. Thus, work suggesting the removal of racial identifiers on donor catalogues seems to owe a great deal to authors such as K. Anthony Appiah (1995, 1996) and Naomi Zack (1993, 2002) who both deny that race is a coherent concept and recommend discarding it entirely (see the entry on race).

Fogg-Davis (2001), for example, suggests that both the practice of reproducing race through assisted reproduction and selecting donors on the basis of different race-linked characteristics are problematic as they raise two major linked ethical issues:

one is the harm that racial stereotyping causes to individuals, and the second is the public awareness that racial stereotyping is an accepted feature of this largely unregulated market.

She suggests that those who use racial classification to inform donor selection decisions are communicating that

race is heritable and relevant to their vision of family structure … that a person’s gametes are transmitters of racial meaning that can and should be selectively transmitted to their child through the use of reproductive technologies. (Fogg-Davis 2001: 18)

Harris (1998) too questions the legitimacy of the desire to match donors to recipient parents on the basis of race-linked characteristics such as skin tone, and hair and eye colour. He notes:

Why do so many people firmly believe that children should be like their parents, particularly in terms of their general colour and racial characteristics? It is difficult not to view this desire, and attempts to implement it, as a form of ‘ethnic cleansing.’ It smacks very much of the pressure that so many societies and cultures have put upon their members not to ‘marry out’ or to put it more bluntly, not to mate with somebody of another tribe or race. (Harris 1998: 21)

Others suggest, however, that there is “no evidence to suggest that racial prejudice accounts for why sperm banks sort sperm donors according to race or why many prospective parents hope for a child of a particular race.” (Fox 2009: 1860) Such authors hold instead that racial preferences in gamete donation are more likely to stem from a desire to replicate the family structure of the biological family, to avoid deficient access to racial culture and consciousness (Maung 2019:114), to increase their children’s prospects in unjust social contexts (Savulescu & Kahane 2009), or premised on a desire “to make the donor invisible and to conform the new-founded family to the ideal of the natural family” (Pennings 2000: 508). As Wong (2017) notes: “recipient parents who choose not to prioritise matching … may embark on a project of queering heteronormative family structures and place great trust in both their own children and changing social attitudes to reduce stigma and generate acceptance for non-traditional families.” (Wong 2017:77).

Given such considerations, it has been argued that although race-based selection should not be condemned in all cases it is important to “soften the prominence of race in donor selection by taking measures to frustrate wholesale filtering of sperm donors on the basis of race” (Fox 2009: 1893). Others still note that those who desire to select for race-linked characteristics for these ‘less objectionable’ reasons must still consider the wider consequences of doing so. Maung (2019), for example, suggests that while a desire to respect the rights of marginalised communities to maintain their ethnic identities, and to ensure that donor conceived children from historically subjugated ethnic groups develop a positive ethnic identity, and reap the benefits of belonging to a community with a rich shared history, such concerns should be “counterbalanced by the concern about capitulating to the racialist assumptions that enabled that subjugation in the first place” (Maung 2019:115). Berkowitz & Snyder (1998), Agar (2004) and Marway (2018) make similar points when considering the question of race-based selection of offspring. They suggest that while the aim of increasing the life prospects of one’s children in racist and homophobic societies by selecting for heterosexual and light skinned offspring is not objectionable, such practices should not be permitted. For, not only would such selection collude with prejudice, constituting an inappropriate response to a social problem, but it would likely also undermine attempts to change racist and homophobic social attitudes and practices.

3.4 Parental Virtues, Expectations, and Openness to the Unbidden

Gamete donor selection may also be motivated by a desire to parent a ‘particular kind of child’ such as where a music lover seeks out a concert pianist in order to increase the likelihood that the future child will possess such talents, or where a couple seek out gamete donors with genius level IQ in order to increase the likelihood of rearing an academically gifted child (as with the couples who purchased sperm in the 1990s from the ‘repository of germinal choice’) (Plotz 2006) .

Such cases raise a different kind of concern about whether selection, when performed in order to satisfy these kinds of preferences, encourages and facilitates the development of ethically troubling attitudes on the part of prospective parents.

This concern has been expressed in various different ways. Some, for example, suggest that selection motivated by such desires is incompatible with parental virtues such as ‘acceptingness’ (McDougall 2007), ‘openness to the unbidden’ (Sandel 2007), and ‘unconditional love’ (Herrisone-Kelly 2007). Those who take this view hold onto the traditional notion of the child as a gift and correspondingly suggest that parents ought to care, not about the traits that their children possess, but about developing a loving relationship with and raising whatever child they receive. Others take a more Kantian line, suggesting that such parents are wrongfully instrumentalising their children: treating them as a means of fulfilling parental hopes and dreams rather than as entities who, once born, exist for their own sake (Davis 1997).

Yet the suggestion that a selective mentality is incompatible with important parental virtues or problematically instrumentalises one’s future children has been the subject of some debate. Authors such as Ruddick (2000) and Green (2008), challenge the ‘maternalist assumption’ that parents

who want a child should accept and welcome any child they happen to receive, prepared to appreciate the child’s developing individuality, however different from their own. (Ruddick 2000: 102)

They hold instead that other conceptions of parenthood can, provided they are not taken to extremes, be perfectly adaptive, and crucially, do not require parents to refrain from all attempts to shape the characteristics of their prospective children. They suggest that parents should rightly be viewed as both guardians of the children’s future interests, and ‘gardeners’ who may shape and raise children in line with their own preferences and priorities.

Others question whether the virtues of the prospective parent are the same as those of an existing parent. For, although some hold that a desire to have a hand in the characteristics of one’s future children is part of a broader desire to parent and thus requires “committing oneself to acting and evaluating one’s actions and decisions in light of the project of parenthood” (Vehmas 2001: 439), others argue that a desire to select is not incompatible with such a commitment. Kamm argues, for example, that a distinction can be made between ‘caring to have’ a particular child and ‘caring about’ one’s future children once born and suggests that there is little reason to assume that the desire to seek out certain attributes in one’s children is incompatible with parental virtues or common conceptions of the good parent. She notes

one can know that one will care about someone just as much whether or not she has certain traits and yet care to have someone that has, rather than lacks such traits. (Kamm 2009: 113)

This is echoed by Wilkinson who, discussing a hypothetical example of two prospective parents who seek to ensure the birth of a blue eyed child and agree that they will put it up for adoption after birth should it not possess such characteristics, notes

it is not the desire to select that violates the principle of unconditional love [or other parental virtues], but rather the plan to reject the child if it does not live up to expectations … it is entirely possible to want to select characteristics while not having this problematic attitude of rejection. (Wilkinson 2010: 29)

Some suggest, however, that although selection is not necessarily morally problematic, we should still be concerned that a selective mentality may be a precursor of conditional, as opposed to unconditional, love once the child is born, or to unrealistic expectations and feelings of entitlement. Thus, the suggestion here is that people who go to great lengths and incur great expense in procuring what are, for them, the ‘perfect’ gametes, may be more likely to reject or otherwise mistreat their children should they fail to develop the ‘right’ capacities and interests (see, for example: Kass 2003; Sandel 2007). Again, however, it is not at all clear that the link between a selective mentality in reproduction and overzealous and unforgiving parenting styles is a necessary one, as the majority of parents are not liable to be so naïve as to “presume to know what they are getting simply because they had a hand in selecting some of their child’s genetic features” (Fahmy 2011: 7), or indeed that gamete donor selection is as likely as other more expensive and effective forms of selective reproduction (such as genetic engineering) to produce such problematic expectations and attitudes.

4. Payment

Should gamete providers be paid? If so, should such payments be limited to compensation (possibly including compensation for time and inconvenience)? Or is incentivising or rewarding providers also morally acceptable?

In favour of payment, the main reason cited is increased supply, thus enabling recipients to have children that they wouldn’t otherwise have had—or, where scarcity per se is not an issue, giving recipients more choice. In addition, supporters of payment cite justice (gamete providers deserve to be rewarded) and autonomy (providers and recipients should be allowed to contract with each other as they see fit). Finally, pragmatic arguments are sometimes offered, such as the cost of prohibition or the possibility of its leading to an unregulated ‘black’ or ‘grey’ market in gametes. (Resnick 2001; Steinbock 2004; Wilkinson 2013)

4.1 Familiar Arguments from Other Contexts

Some of the arguments and issues concerning payment for gametes closely resemble ones arising in other areas such as organ sales, sex work, and commercial surrogacy (see the entries on exploitation, feminist perspectives on reproduction and the family, feminist perspectives on sex markets, parenthood and procreation, and the sale of human organs). We deal with these briefly here before moving on to consider in greater detail some of the more distinctive issues raised by paying gamete providers. The focus here is on gametes for clinical use in human reproduction, rather than gametes for research purposes, although many of the same issues also arise in a research setting.

4.1.1. Harm and/or Risk to Donors

One of the most obvious issues is harm or risk to the providers (Resnick 2001; Steinbock 2004).

In the case of sperm, the physical risks of donating are negligible, but concerns have been raised about psychosocial risks, especially if one man is permitted to generate numerous offspring. What happens, for example, if a single sperm donor produces hundreds of children and a significant proportion of those contact him years later? That could have a significant impact on the man’s life (and on the welfare of the children, discussed below). One way of containing this risk would be to limit donor offspring numbers; another would be to allow donor anonymity, although that may be objectionable on other grounds (see our earlier discussions of donor anonymity and donor offspring limits).

Producing hundreds of children is unlikely to be a problem for egg donors but, unlike sperm donors, these women do face non-negligible physical risks: notably OHSS (Ovarian Hyper Stimulation Syndrome).

As with the organ sale debate, though, it is not clear why the existence of these risks constitutes an objection to payment, as opposed to an objection to the whole practice of gamete donation (paid or otherwise) since the risks don’t increase as a result of payment (Wilkinson 2013). In response to this, in the case of sperm donation, it could be argued that the scenario where one man produces hundreds of children is much more likely to happen if payment is allowed, as some men seek to become ‘professional sperm donors’. As has been noted, however, it should be possible to neutralise this risk by enforcing donor offspring limits.

4.1.2. Consent, Exploitation, and Inducements

Another set of issues is the negative effect that payments, or payments above a certain level, are supposed to have on the quality of consent—a concern that is closely linked to worries about exploitation. Financial incentives, it is argued, encourage people to do things that they would not otherwise do, encourage them to do things that are harmful, and make their actions, consents, and decisions less likely to be autonomous and voluntary (Resnick 2001; Steinbock 2004; Wilkinson 2013). These arguments are more often directed at paid egg donation than paid sperm donation, because the direct physical risks and the sums of money involved for eggs tend to be much greater. Thus, people have been concerned that vulnerable young egg donors might be lured into the egg market and then exploited by clinics, egg banks, or recipients. These concerns structurally parallel ones that people often have about commercial surrogacy and sex work.

Arguments of this kind are dealt with in much more detail in the entries on Exploitation, Feminist Perspectives on Sex Markets, Parenthood and Procreation, Informed Consent, and The Sale of Human Organs. For the present, we simply note that, while the possibility of defective consent and exploitation must be taken seriously in any system of paid gamete donation, there seems no reason in principle why paying for gametes must be exploitative, nor why it cannot be validly consented to. Provided that the payment-levels are fair, and that the provider’s situation, mental capacities, and access to information are all sufficiently favourable, it is hard to see why—in common with other financial transactions—gamete provision can’t be validly consensual and non-exploitative.

4.1.3. Commercialisation and Selection

Finally, we note here that there is a connection between remuneration arrangements and selection practices (discussed above). In particular, one objection to allowing payment—or at least to the unfettered commercialisation of gametes—is that it may encourage a market in which particular traits can, for those willing to pay a high price, be aggressively selected for. For example, in the USA, young attractive white female egg donors attending ‘Ivy League’ universities can command a higher fee for their eggs than other donors—and anyone who is willing to pay can have access to those eggs. So, anyone who regards selection practices like this as problematic may also regard the commercialisation of gametes as problematic inasmuch as it underpins and enables fine-grained selection by ‘gamete consumers’ to take place.

4.2 Payment and the Welfare of the Child

We turn now to some of the more ‘distinctive’ issues relating to paying gamete donors. The first of these is the welfare of the child created. While this issue is ‘distinctive’ inasmuch as it applies only in the reproductive sphere (and so not to, for example, organ sale) it does arise in other reproductive areas, notably commercial surrogacy (Harris 2000).

The main worry here is that when donor-conceived children find out that money is what primarily motivated the donor then, in some cases, this will have adverse psychological effects; in the most extreme case, they may come to feel that they were ‘bought’ (HFEA 2011). What follows from this possibility, however, is unclear.

To start with, there are empirical questions about how many donor-conceived people will feel this way and about how severe their negative feelings (if any) are. Not all donor-conceived people have negative feelings about donor motives and financial reward; some may not care what their donors’ motives were. So, if this concern is going to ground an ethical argument against paying donors, a solid evidence base will be needed to underpin its empirical premises.

Similarly, there is a set of questions not so much about what donors’ actual motives are, but about what they write on their donation papers, and about how and when information is conveyed to their offspring. One view is that, for the sake of the welfare of the child, it would be better for donors to ‘tell a story’ (even if not wholly accurate) that donor-conceived children will find more palatable than the bare truth that the donor simply needed money. Another is that if donor-conceived children are communicated with appropriately, honestly, and sensitively, and at an early stage then any problems associated with donor motives will be minimal (Nuffield Council on Bioethics 2013).

Still, let’s allow (at least for the sake of argument) that these problems are insurmountable: that—whatever we do—a significant number of donor-conceived children will be substantially harmed by the knowledge that their donors were paid. What follows from this?

First, we should note that this area is subject to the implications of the Non-Identity Problem (Parfit 1984). In particular, given that (let’s assume) many paid sperm donors would not have donated but for the money, it is plausible to supposed that children who suffer psychological harm when they find out about their donors would not have existed if there hadn’t been payments. Therefore, for standard reasons relating to the Non-identity Problem, they may not be harmed by the practice of payment—or at least not in the usual comparative harm-to-interests sense (worse off than they would otherwise have been). (See the entry on the non-identity problem.) So, while there may still be a child welfare argument against payment, it must rely not on harm-avoidance but rather on impersonal welfare considerations.

Given this, a lot hinges on whether payment is required to ensure an adequate supply of donor gametes. If it is not (if, for example, the reasons for paying people are quite trivial ones, such as administrative convenience, or even allowing recipients more choice) then the fact that payment will adversely affect the welfare of donor-conceived children does looks like a good (albeit prima facie) reason to prefer altruistic donation. Imagine that we have a choice between creating a population of donor-conceived children using paid donors or a different but equally large population using altruistic donors. If (as we’re allowing) the latter will have a higher quality of life then there is a strong ‘impersonal’ reason, other things being equal, to prefer the latter: altruistic donation. Things look rather different though if the choice is instead between a population of donor-conceived children using paid donors or a different and significantly smaller population, for then it would be necessary to ‘trade off’ a higher average quality of life against both (a) the fact that there are fewer lives overall and (b) any harm done to prospective parents who are denied the opportunity to raise a donor-conceived child. Any such moral calculation will be complex and this goes to show that, in cases where payment is required to secure an adequate supply of gametes, this is not obviously wrong (all things considered) even if there are detrimental effects on donor-conceived people’s quality of life (Wilkinson 2016).

4.3 Egg Sharing

Some countries (notably the United Kingdom) either prohibit or strictly limit payments to egg donors but allow an exception whereby ‘egg sharers’ (women who are themselves undergoing infertility treatment and wish to donate in return for reduced fees) can receive unlimited benefits-in-kind in the form of cut-price infertility treatment services. The UK, for example, limits payments to egg donors to £750 (approx. US$900) and yet egg sharers can have their own treatment costs reduced by many thousands of pounds (HFEA 2017: guidance note 13).

This raises the question of whether ethically egg sharing is preferable to egg selling and, if so, why—along with the closely related question of whether egg sharing should be treated more favourably in law and professional regulation (Blyth & Golding 2008).

The main reason offered in favour of egg sharing is that ‘sharers’ are exposed to less additional harm and/or risk than donors (paid or otherwise), since they are already undergoing most of the required interventions as part of ongoing treatment. It is supposed to follow from this that incentivising egg sharing (other things being equal) is less morally problematic than incentivising egg donation: either because of the putative wrongness of encouraging people to take ‘excessive’ risks, or because financial incentives may vitiate consent to those risks (Wilkinson 2013).

This does seem like a sound prima facie reason to prefer egg sharing although several caveats must be noted. First, some special types of risk may apply to egg sharers: for example, older women who don’t have many viable eggs left might reduce their chances of having a child by giving away ‘surplus’ eggs (Scott, Williams, Ehrich, & Farsides 2012). Second, and similarly, concerns about consent may apply just as forcefully to egg sharers as to egg sellers, especially if some of these are ‘desperate’ to have a child and egg sharing is their only way of paying for infertility treatment services (Blyth & Golding 2008). Thirdly, as already mentioned, this argument—if it worked—would show egg sharing to be superior not only to paid donation but also to altruistic donation, since the additional risks are the same whether paid or not (Wilkinson 2013).

A different kind of reason for treating egg sharing more favourably than egg selling is based on the idea that egg sharers’ motives will typically by morally preferable to those of egg sellers. In particular, it has been claimed that whereas egg sellers are typically motivated by the desire for money, egg sharers act partly out of a sense of solidarity with potential recipients—in particular because both the sharer and the recipient are in similar positions. Both need, or want, infertility treatment services in order to have a child (HFEA 2011; Prainsack & Buyx 2011).

However, whether this really justifies the differential treatment of benefits-in-kind (treatment services) and monetary reward is far from clear. One reason for doubt is that, as the HFEA notes:

What is known about donor motivation … is that it is multifaceted. People make decisions for a range of reasons, and competent adults are capable of assessing the relative benefits, burdens and likely impact of a range of options available to them. An incentive to donate does not necessarily mean people will do so purely because of that incentive. Indeed, the literature suggests that both donors and sharers have mixed motives for donating. (HFEA 2011: section 2, 4.4 [p. 8])

This suggests that, in relation to solidarity, there is no categorical difference between payment and benefits-in-kind. While some egg sharers may be motivated mainly by feelings of solidarity, others may be more interested simply in saving money. Conversely, while some paid donors would be ‘in it just for the money’, others (perhaps those whose close friends or relatives have fertility problems, or who have experienced health problems of their own) could be moved to donate because of feelings of solidarity (the fact that they are financially rewarded notwithstanding). As such, it is by no means obvious that all egg sharers are motivated by feelings of solidarity, or that all paid donors would fail to have this feeling. Indeed, it is by no means obvious even that most egg sharers are motivated by feelings of solidarity and there is empirical evidence suggesting that the number of sharers significantly decreases when state funded treatment is made widely available (Pennings 2009).

Finally, and more fundamentally, even if donations motivated by altruism or solidarity were morally preferable to more self-interested ones (donations motivated purely by the desire for money, for example) it would not necessarily follow that the latter are wrong or should be prohibited. For, it may just be that the former are supererogatory: that while paid donation is merely permissible, unpaid donation is an act of generosity or solidarity that goes beyond what is morally permitted or required (Wilkinson & Garrard 1996).


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This work was supported by the Wellcome Trust [097897/Z/11/Z].

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