First published Sun Jan 5, 2003; substantive revision Wed Nov 2, 2022

Federalism is the theory or advocacy of federal principles for dividing powers between member units and common institutions. Unlike in a unitary state, sovereignty in federal political orders is non-centralized, often constitutionally, between at least two levels so that units at each level have final authority and can be self governing in some issue area. Citizens thus have political obligations to, or have their rights secured by, two authorities. The division of power between the member unit and center may vary, typically the center has powers regarding defense and foreign policy, but member units may also have international roles. The decision-making bodies of member units may also participate in central decision-making bodies. Much recent philosophical attention is spurred by renewed political interest in federalism and backlashes against particular instances, coupled with empirical findings concerning the requisite and legitimate basis for stability and trust among citizens in federal political orders. Philosophical contributions have addressed the dilemmas and opportunities facing Canada, Australia, Europe, Russia, Iraq, Nepal, Ethiopia and Nigeria, to mention just a few areas where federal arrangements are seen as interesting solutions to accommodate differences among populations divided by ethnic or cultural cleavages yet seeking a common, often democratic, political order.

1. Taxonomy

Much valuable scholarship explicates the central terms ‘federalism’, ‘federation’ and ‘federal systems’ (cf. Wheare 1964, King 1982, Elazar 1987, Elazar 1987a, Riker 1993, Watts 1998).

A federal political order is here taken to be “the genus of political organization that is marked by the combination of shared rule and self-rule” (Watts 1998, 120). Federalism is the descriptive theory or normative advocacy of such an order, including principles for dividing final authority between member units and the common institutions.

A federation is one species of such a federal order; other species are unions, confederations, leagues and decentralised unions—and hybrids such as the present European Union (Elazar 1987, Watts 1998). A federation in this sense involves a territorial division of power between constituent units—sometimes called ‘provinces’, ‘cantons’, possibly ‘cities’, or confusingly ‘states’—and a common government. This division of power is typically entrenched in a constitution which neither a member unit nor the common government can alter unilaterally. The member unit and the common government both have direct effect on the citizenry—the common government operates “on the individual citizens composing the nation” (Federalist Paper 39)—and the authorities of both are directly elected (Watts 1998, 121). In comparison, decentralized authority in unitary states can typically be revoked by the central legislature at will. Many multilevel forms of governance may also be revised by units at one level without consent by bodies at other levels. Such entrenchments notwithstanding, some centralization often occurs owing to the constitutional interpretations by a federal level court in charge of settling conflicts regarding the scopes of final legislative and/or judicial authority.

In contrast, ‘confederation’ has come to mean a political order with a weaker center than a federation, often dependent on the constituent units (Watts 1998, 121). Typically, in a confederation a) member units may legally exit, b) the center only exercises authority delegated by member units, c) the center is subject to member unit veto on many issues, d) center decisions bind member units but not citizens directly, e) the center lacks an independent fiscal or electoral base, and/or f) the member units do not cede authority permanently to the center. Confederations are often based on agreements for specific tasks, and the common government may be completely exercised by delegates of the member unit governments. Thus many would count as confederations the North American states during 1776–1787, Switzerland 1291–1847, and the present European Union—though it has several elements typical of federations.

In symmetric (con)federations the member units have the same bundles of powers, while in asymmetric (con)federations such as Russia, Canada, the European Union, Spain, or India the bundles may be different among member units; some member units may for instance have special rights regarding language or culture. Some asymmetric arrangements involve one smaller state and a larger, where the smaller partakes in governing the larger while retaining sovereignty on some issues (Elazar 1987, Watts 1998).

A helpful categorisation among federal arrangements concerns the relationship between the central unit, member units and individuals. If the decisions made centrally do not involve member units at all, we may speak of separate (split or compact) federalism. Some issues may be the responsibility of the central unit, others belonging to the member units, where citizens vote their representatives directly to both bodies (U.S. Constitution Art. II Section 1; cf. Dahl 2001). Federations can involve member units in central decision-making in at least two different ways in various forms of interlocking (or cooperative) federalism. Member unit representatives can participate within central bodies—in cabinets or legislatures—(collective agency compositional arrangement). Or they constitute one central body that interacts with other central bodies, for instance where member unit government representatives form an Upper House with power to veto or postpone decisions by majority or qualified majority vote (divided agency/relational arrangements). These legal arrangements give rise to varieties of multi-level governance: continuous negotiations among authorities at different territorial levels (Marks 1993, Hooghe and Marks 2003, Scharpf 1983). Responsiveness to individuals may benefit from interlocking federalism, but often at the cost of transparency and accountability.

Several authors identify two quite distinct processes that lead to a federal political order (Friedrich 1968, Buchanan 1995, Stepan 1999 and others). Independent states may aggregate by ceding or pooling sovereign powers in certain domains for the sake of goods otherwise unattainable, such as security or economic prosperity. Such coming together federal political orders are typically arranged to constrain the center and prevent majorities from overriding a member unit. Examples include the present USA, Canada, Switzerland, and Australia. Holding together federal political orders develop from unitary states, as governments devolve authority to alleviate threats of unrest or secession by territorially clustered minorities. Such federal political orders often grant some member units particular domains of sovereignty e.g. over language and cultural rights in an asymmetric federation, while maintaining broad scope of action for the central government and majorities. Examples include India, Belgium and Spain.

In addition to territorially organized federal political orders, other interesting alternatives to unitary states occur when non-territorial member units are constituted by groups sharing ethnic, religious or other characteristics. These systems are sometimes referred to as ‘non-territorial’ federations. Karl Renner and Otto Bauer explored such arrangements for geographically dispersed cultural minorities, allowing them some cultural and “personal” autonomy without territorial self rule (Bauer 1903; Renner 1907; Bottomore and Goode 1978; cf. Tamir 1993 and Nimni 2005). Consociations consist of somewhat insulated groups in member units who in addition are represented in central institutions often governing by unanimity rather than by majority (Lijphart 1977).

2. History of Federalism

A wide-spread interest among political philosophers in topics concerning the centralised nation state have fuelled attention to historical contributions on unitary sovereignty. However, we can also identify a steady stream of contributions to the philosophy of federalism, also by those more well known for their arguments concerning centralised power (cf. Karmis and Norman 2005 for such readings). Much of the Western literature on federalism has focused on the unit of states. To underscore this bias, consider first some non-Western practices and theories of federal features.

2.1 Some global perspectives

We find federal modes of political organisation on many continents, and contributions to theories about federalism in written sources across philosophical traditions. A range of philosophical contributions underscore that federal perspectives can apply to a wide range of units other than the sovereign states central in European and U.S. thought.

The tribal organisation of the Māori in what is now New Zealand included family groups (whanau), who would work together and collaborate for defense as a clan (hapū). The tribe (iwi) would in turn operate as a federation among several hapū for common defense (Ballara 1998, 19).

Several extinct African societies had federal elements. Edward Wamala describes what we recognise as federal features in pre-14th century Ganda society, in what later became the kingdom of the Baganda, now part of Uganda. The power structures between the chief (ssabataka) and heads of tribes (mutaka) was one of primus inter pares. The tribes enjoyed immunity, in that the higher units should no usurp the responsibilities of the lower units of power but only promote the well-being of the lower units (Wamala 2004: 436–437)

Nahua (Aztek) culture illustrates multi-level federalism: Tlaxilacalli - badly translated and understood as “neighbourhoods” - would submit to the authority of the sovereign local polity, or altepetl, which then scaled up to autonomous mega-provinces (huei altepetl) and finally to the entire empire. At each level, submission was traded for autonomy, undercutting any attempt at direct centralising rule (Johnson 2017). In the 1428 triple alliance for military purposes among the three city-states (altepeme) of Tenochtitlan, Texcoco and Totoquihuatzin, each of these rules over their dependent altepetl without interference by the other two (Lockhart 1992).

The Confucian political philosopher Mencius (379–298 BC) laid out a three level ‘familial’ order (Chan 2003). The family had primary responsibility for those unable to care for themselves, and rulers should be the parents of the people. (Mencius 2003, 1B.13). When the family could not assist, the community network should provide support. Only when the community was unable would what we might call the state have an obligation to aid.

We find expressions of federalism in the third pillar of Islam: Obligatory charity in the form of zakat provided to certain needy persons outside one’s own household (Qur’an 9: 103). Every able Muslim must provide a fixed proportion of their net wealth—2.5%—to support others in need. The role of the state may vary when it comes to assess, collect and distribute zakat. In some states, the collection or distribution of zakat is the responsibility of civil society organisations or mosques. In other states, it is the government’s responsibility to either ensure that zakat is managed if Muslims fail to pay; or the whole system may be managed by the state (Bilo and Mechado 2018).

The sub-Saharan philosophy of Ubuntu has federal features that have also contributed to legal theory. The term ‘Ubuntu’ stems from the Nguni phrase “Umuntu ngumuntu ngabantu” meaning a person is a person through other persons. Ubuntu emphasises the harmonious relationships between persons as constitutive of the individual, underscoring compassion and commitment to one another’s growth (Mbiti 1969, Gädeke 2019, Metz 2011). The task of governments at various territorial levels is to promote harmonious flourishing and community of the constituent parts (Shutte 2001). Ubuntu was included in the epilogue of the 1993 Interim Constitution of South Africa, but not explicitly in its 1996 Constitution.

The confederacy among five (later six) Haudenosaunee (Iroquois) nations dates back to between the 12th and 15th century. The oral constitution—The Great Law of Peace—specified that each nation elected delegates, or sachems, who dealt with internal affairs. The confederacy’s Grand Council could not interfere with the internal affairs of each tribe, but would discuss particular matters of common concern such as war, peace, and treaty making. The Haudenosaunee practice of granting the member units immunity apparently influenced Benjamin Franklin’s and others’ call for a union among the English colonies (Fenton 1998). Iris Marion Young explored this tradition to develop a theory of federalism that would secure immunity and redress power imbalances (Young 2000; Levy 2008).

2.2 Western contributions

Aristotle (384–322 BC) provides an early Western example of federal thought, where some of the member units are not political. The tasks of households and villages is to secure individuals’ necessities of life. The city-state (polis) is a self-sufficient community of such households, clans and villages, for protection and fulfilment (Politics, III.9, 1280b).

Several of the early European contributors to federalist thought explored the rationale and weaknesses of centralised states as they emerged and developed in the 17th and 18th century. Johannes Althusius (1557–1630) is often regarded as the father of modern federalist thought. He argued in Politica Methodice Digesta (Althusius 1603) for autonomy of his city Emden, both against its Lutheran provincial Lord and against the Catholic Emperor. Althusius was strongly influenced by French Huguenots and Calvinism. As a permanent minority in several states, Calvinists developed a doctrine of resistance as the right and duty of “natural leaders” to resist tyranny. Orthodox Calvinists insisted on sovereignty in the social circles subordinate only to God’s laws. The French Protestant Huguenots developed a theory of legitimacy further, presented 1579 by an author with the telling pseudonym “Junius Brutus” in Vindiciae Contra Tyrannos. The people, regarded as a corporate body in territorial hierarchical communities, has a God-granted right to resist rulers without rightful claim. Rejecting theocracy, Althusius developed a non-sectarian, non-religious contractualist political theory of federations that prohibited state intervention even for purposes of promoting the right faith. Accommodation of dissent and diversity prevailed over any interest in subordinating political powers to religion or vice versa.

Since humans are fundamentally dependent on others for the reliable provision of requirements of a comfortable and holy life, we require communities and associations that are both instrumentally and intrinsically important for supporting [subsidia] our needs. Althusius, like Aristotle, included non-political units in his federal theory. Families, guilds, cities, provinces, states and other associations owe their legitimacy and claims to political power to their various roles in enabling a holy life, rather than to individuals’ interest in autonomy. Each association claims autonomy within its own sphere against intervention by other associations. Borrowing a term originally used for the alliance between God and men, Althusius holds that associations enter into secular agreements—pactum foederis—to live together in mutual benevolence.

Several early contributors explored what we may now regard as various species of federal political orders, partly with an eye to resolving inter-state conflicts.

Ludolph Hugo (ca. 1630–1704) was the first to distinguish confederations based on alliances, decentralized unitary states such as the Roman Empire, and federations, characterized by ‘double governments’ with territorial division of powers, in De Statu Regionum Germanie (1661) (cf. Elazar 1998; Riley 1976).

A recurring concern was tensions between federalism and conceptions of sovereignty. Samuel Pufendorf (1632–1684) maintained that sovereign states could at most “agree to intertwine for all time” in a confederation deciding by unanimity. Move to majority rule turned the legal order into an ‘irregular system’ closer to a state. If sovereignty is a unique site of final and independent authority, federations are no more than voluntary treaties among fundamentally independent states, argued Emmerik Vattel (1714–1767). Later thinkers challenged this understanding of sovereignty, in debates continuing to this day concerning the European Union. (MacCormick 1999, Schütze 2009).

In The Spirit of Laws (1748) Charles de Secondat, Baron de Montesquieu (1689–1755) argued for confederal arrangements as combining the best of small and large political units, without the disadvantages of either. On the one hand they could provide the advantages of small states such as republican participation and liberty understood as non-domination—that is, security against abuse of power. At the same time confederal orders secure the benefits of larger states such as military security, without the risks of small and large states. A ‘confederate republic’ with separation of powers allows sufficient homogeneity and identification within sufficiently small member units. The member units in turn pool powers sufficient to secure external security, reserving the right to secede (Book 9, 1). Member units serve as checks on each other, since other member units may intervene to quell insurrection and power abuse in one member unit. These themes reoccur in later contributions, up to and including discussions concerning the European Union (cf. Levy 2004, 2005, 2007).

David Hume (1711–1776) disagreed with Montesquieu that smaller size is better. Instead, “in a large democracy … there is compass and room enough to refine the democracy.” In “Idea of a Perfect Commonwealth” (Hume 1752) Hume recommended a federal arrangement for deliberation of laws involving both member unit and central legislatures. Member units enjoy several powers and partake in central decisions, but their laws and court judgments can always be overruled by the central bodies, hence it seems that Hume’s model is not federal as the term is used here. He held that such a numerous and geographically large system would do better than small cities in preventing decisions based on “intrigue, prejudice or passion” against the public interest.

Several 18th century peace plans for Europe recommended confederal arrangements. The 1713 Peace Plan of Abbé Charles de Saint-Pierre (1658–1743) would allow intervention in member units to quell rebellion and wars on non-members to force them to join an established confederation, and required unanimity for changes to the agreement.

Jean-Jacques Rousseau (1712–1778) presented and critiqued Saint-Pierre’s proposal, listing several conditions including that all major powers must be members, that the joint legislation must be binding, that the joint forces must be stronger than any single state, and that secession must be illegal. Again, unanimity was required for changes to the agreement.

Immanuel Kant (1724–1804) defended a confederation for peace in On Perpetual Peace (1796). His Second Definite Article of a Perpetual Peace holds that the right of nations shall be based on a pacific federation among free states rather than a peace treaty or an international state: “This federation does not aim to acquire any power like that of a state, but merely to preserve and secure the freedom of each state in itself, along with that of the other confederated states, although this does not mean that they need to submit to public laws and to a coercive power which enforces them, as do men in a state of nature.”

The discussions surrounding the U.S. Constitutional Convention of 1787 marks a clear development in federal thought, also as regards the tensions between unitary sovereignty and divided authority. One central feature is that federations were seen as uniting not only member units as in confederations, but also the citizenry directly.

The Articles of Confederation of 1781 among the 13 American states fighting British rule had established a center too weak for law enforcement, defense and for securing interstate commerce. What has become known as the U.S. Constitutional Convention met May 25–September 17, 1787. It was explicitly restricted to revise the Articles, but ended up recommending more fundamental changes. The proposed constitution prompted widespread debate and arguments addressing the benefits and risks of federalism versus confederal arrangements, leading eventually to the Constitution that took effect in 1789.

The “Anti-federalists” were fearful of undue centralization. They worried that the powers of central authorities were not sufficiently constrained e.g., by a bill of rights (John DeWitt 1787) that was eventually ratified in 1791. They also feared that the center might gradually usurp the member units’ powers. Citing Montesquieu, another pseudonymous ‘Brutus’ doubted whether a republic of such geographical size with so many inhabitants with conflicting interests could avoid tyranny and would allow common deliberation and decision based on local knowledge (Brutus (Robert Yates?) 1787).

In The Federalist Papers, James Madison (1751–1836), Alexander Hamilton (1755–1804) and John Jay (1745–1829) argued vigorously for the suggested model of interlocking federal arrangements (Federalist 10, 45, 51, 62). Madison and Hamilton agreed with Hume that the risk of tyranny by passionate majorities was reduced in larger republics where member units of shared interest could and would check each other: “A rage for paper money, for an abolition of debts, for an equal division of property, or for any improper or wicked project, will be less likely to pervade the whole body of the Union than a particular member of it.” (Federalist 10). Splitting sovereignty between member unit and center would also protect individuals’ rights against abuse by authorities at either level, or so believed Hamilton, quoting Montesquieu at length to this effect (Federalist 9).

Noting the problems of allocating powers correctly, Madison supported placing some authority with member units since they would be best fit to address “local circumstances and lesser interests” otherwise neglected by the center (Federalist 37).

Madison and Hamilton urged centralized powers of defense and interstate commerce (Federalist 11, 23), and argued for the need to solve coordination and assurance problems of partial compliance, through two new means: Centralized enforcement and direct applicability of central decisions to individuals (Federalist 16, also noted by Tocqueville 1835–40). They were wary of granting member units veto power typical of confederal arrangements, since that would render the center weak and cause “tedious delays; continual negotiation and intrigue; contemptible compromises of the public good.” (Madison and Hamilton, Federalist 22; and cf. 20).

They were particularly concerned to address worries of undue centralization, arguing that such worries should be addressed not by constraining the extent of power in the relevant fields, such as defense, but instead by the composition of the central authority (Federalist 31). They also claimed that the people would maintain stronger “affection, esteem, and reverence” towards the member unit government owing to its public visibility in the day-to-day administration of criminal and civil justice (Federalist 17).

John Stuart Mill (1806–1873), in chapter 17 of Considerations on Representative Government (1861), recommended federations among “portions of mankind” not disposed to live under a common government, to prevent wars among themselves and protect against aggression. He would also allow the center sufficient powers so as to ensure all benefits of union—including powers to prevent frontier duties to facilitate commerce. He listed three necessary conditions for a federation: sufficient mutual sympathy “of race, language, religion, and, above all, of political institutions, as conducing most to a feeling of identity of political interest”; no member unit so powerful as to not require union for defense nor tempt unduly to secession; and rough equality of strength among member units to prevent internal domination by one or two. Mill also claimed among the benefits of federations that they reduce the number of weak states hence reduce temptation to aggression, ending wars and restrictions on commence among member units; and that federations are less aggressive, only using their power defensively. Further benefits from federations—and from decentralized authority in general—might include learning from ‘experiments in living’.

Pierre-Joseph Proudhon (1809–1865), in Du Principe fédératif (1863) defended federalism as the best way to retain individual liberty within ‘natural’ communities such as families and guilds who enter pacts among themselves for necessary and specific purposes. The state is only one of several non-sovereign agents in charge of coordinating, without final authority.

While Proudhon was wary of centralisation, authors such as Harold Laski warned of ‘The Obsolesence of Federalism’ (1939). The important problems, such as those wrought by ‘giant capitalism,’ require more centralised responses than federal arrangements can muster.

Philosophical reflections on federalism were invigorated during and after the Second World War, for several reasons. Altiero Spinelli and Ernesto Rossi called for a European federal state in the Ventotene Manifesto, published 1944. They condemned totalitarian, centralised states and the never ending conflicts among them. Instead there should be enough shared control over military and economic power, yet “each State will retain the autonomy it needs for a plastic articulation and development of political life according to the particular characteristics of the various peoples.” Many explain and justify the European Union along precisely these lines, while others are more critical.

Hannah Arendt (1906–1975) traced both totalitarianism and industrialized mass murder to flaws in the sovereign nation-state model. Skeptical both of liberal internationalism and political realism, she instead urged a Republican federal model or ideal type wherein “the federated units mutually check and control their powers” (Arendt 1972).

The exit of colonial powers also left multi-ethnic states that required creative solutions to combine self rule and shared rule (Karmis and Norman 2005). In addition, globalisation has prompted not only integration and harmonisation, but also—partly in response—explorations of ways to still maintain some local self rule (Watts 1998).

Developments of the European Union and backlash against its particular forms of political and legal integration is one major cause of renewed attention to the philosophy of federalism. Recent philosophical discussions have addressed several issues, including centrally the reasons for federalism, and attention to the sources of stability and instability; the legitimate division of power between member unit and center; distributive justice, challenges to received democratic theory, and concerns about the politics of recognition.

3. Reasons for Federalism

Many arguments for federalism have traditionally been put in terms of promoting various forms of liberty in the form of non-domination, immunity or enhanced opportunity sets (Elazar 1987a). When considering reasons offered in the literature for federal political orders, many appear to be in favor of decentralization without requiring constitutional entrenchment of split authority. Two sets of arguments can be distinguished: Arguments favoring federal orders compared with secession and completely independent sovereign states; and arguments supporting federal arrangements rather than a (further) centralized unitary state. They occur in different forms and from different starting points, in defense of ‘coming together’ federalism, and in favor of ‘holding together’ federalism.

3.1 Reasons for a federal order rather than separate states or secession

There are several suggested reasons for a federal order rather than separate states or secession.

  • Federations can facilitate some objectives of sovereign states, such as credible commitments, certain kinds of coordination to secure ‘public goods’ of various sorts, and to control externalities that affect other parties, by transferring some powers to a common body. Since cooperation in some areas can ‘spill over’ and create demands for further coordination in other sectors, federations often exhibit creeping centralisation. Note that several of these objectives require getting the allocation of competences and veto points right within the federal order. For some complex common objectives such as environmental problems, federal features otherwise risk becoming part of the problem (Adler 2005, Dalmazzone 2006).
  • Federations may foster peace, in the senses of preventing wars and preventing fears of war, in several ways. States can join a (con)federation to become jointly powerful enough to dissuade external aggressors, and/or to prevent aggressive and preemptive wars among themselves. The European federalists Altieri Spinelli, Ernesto Rossi and Eugenio Colorni argued the latter in the 1941 Ventotene Manifesto: Only a European federation could prevent war between totalitarian, aggressive states. Such arguments assume, of course, that the (con)federation will not become more aggressive than each state separately, a point Mill argued.

  • Federations can promote economic prosperity by removing internal barriers to trade, through economies of scale, by establishing and maintaining inter-member unit trade agreements, or by becoming a sufficiently large global player to affect international trade regimes (for the latter regarding the EU, cf. Keohane and Nye 2001, 260).

  • Federal arrangements may protect individuals against political authorities by constraining state sovereignty, placing some powers with the center. By entrusting the center with authority to intervene in member units, the federal arrangements can protect minorities’ human rights against member unit authorities (Federalist, Watts 1999). Such arguments assume, of course, that abuse by the center is less likely.

  • Federal arrangements may enhance the political influence of formerly sovereign governments, both by facilitating coordination, and—particularly for small states—by giving these member units influence or even veto over policy making, rather than remaining mere policy takers.

  • Federal political orders can be preferred as the appropriate form of nested organizations, for instance in ‘organic’ conceptions of the political and social order. The federation may promote cooperation, justice or other values among and within member units as well as among and within their constituent units, for instance by monitoring, legislating, enforcing or funding agreements, human rights, immunity from interference, or development. Starting with the family, each larger unit responsible for facilitating the flourishing of member units and securing common goods beyond their reach without a common authority. Such arguments have been offered by such otherwise divergent authors as Althusius, the Catholic traditions of subsidiarity as expressed by popes Leo XIII (1891) and Pius XI (1931), and Proudhon.

3.2 Reasons to prefer federal orders over a unitary state

There are several arguments that may apply in favor of federal orders over a unitary state. Among the challenges for some of these arguments is how to allocate authority when there are conflicting claims to provide different benefits for partly overlapping groups; and how to construct overrides in cases of emergencies such as pandemics (Steytler 2021). Who has the power to decide what are exceptions is important, even if we may disagree with Schmitt that it defines who is sovereign (Schmitt 1985).

  • Federal arrangements may protect against central authorities by securing immunity and non-domination for minority groups or nations. Constitutional allocation of powers to a member unit protects individuals from the center, while interlocking arrangements provide influence on central decisions via member unit bodies (Madison, Hume, Goodin 1996). Member units may thus check central authorities and prevent undue action contrary to the will of minorities: “A great democracy must either sacrifice self-government to unity or preserve it by federalism. The coexistence of several nations under the same State is a test, as well as the best security of its freedom … The combination of different nations in one State is as necessary a condition of civilized life as the combination of men in society” (Acton 1907, 277).

  • More specifically, federal arrangements can accommodate minority nations who aspire to self determination, political expressions of their sense of shared identity and belonging, and the preservation of their culture, language or religion (Carla 2012). Such autonomy and immunity arrangements are clearly preferable to the political conflicts that might result from such groups’ attempts at secession. Central authorities may respond with human rights abuses, civil wars or ethnic cleansing to prevent such secessionist movements.

  • Federal orders may increase the opportunities for citizen participation in public decision-making; through deliberation and offices in both member unit and central bodies that ensures character formation through political participation among more citizens (Mill 1861, ch. 15).

  • Federal orders may facilitate learning by fostering alternative solutions to similar problems and sharing lessons from such a laboratory of ‘experiments in living’ (Rose-Ackerman 1980).

  • Federations may facilitate efficient preference maximization more generally, as formalized in the literature on economic and fiscal federalism—though many such arguments support decentralization rather than federalism proper. Research on ‘fiscal federalism’ addresses the optimal allocation of authority, typically recommending central redistribution but local provision of public goods. Federal arrangements may allow more optimal matching of the authority to create public goods to specific affected subsets of the populations. If individuals’ preferences vary systematically by territory according to external or internal parameters such as geography or shared tastes and values, federal—or decentralized—arrangements that allow local variation may be well suited for several reasons. Local decisions prevent overload of centralised decision-making, and local decision-makers may also have a better grasp of affected preferences and alternatives, making for better service than would be provided by a central government that tends to ignore local preference variations (Smith 1776, 680). Granting powers to population subsets that share preferences regarding public services may also increase efficiency by allowing these subsets to create such ‘internalities’ and ‘club goods’ at costs borne only by them (Musgrave 1959, 179–80, Olson 1969, Oates’ 1972 ‘Decentralization Theorem’).

  • Federal arrangements can also shelter territorially based groups with preferences that diverge from the majority population, such as ethnic or cultural minorities, so that they are not subject to majority decisions severely or systematically contrary to their preferences. Non-unitary arrangements may thus minimize coercion and be responsive to as many citizens as possible (Mill 1861 ch. 15, Elazar 1968; Lijphart 1999). Such considerations of economic efficiency and majority decisions may favor federal solutions, with “only indivisibilities, economies of scale, externalities, and strategic requirements … acceptable as efficiency arguments in favor of allocating powers to higher levels of government” (Padou-Schioppa 1995, 155).

  • Federal arrangements may not only protect existing clusters of individuals with shared values or preferences, but may also promote mobility and hence territorial clustering of individuals with similar preferences. Member unit autonomy to experiment may foster competition for individuals who are free to move where their preferences are best met. Such mobility towards member units with like-minded individuals may add to the benefits of local autonomy over the provision of public services—absent economies of scale and externalities (Tiebout 1956, Buchanan 2001)—though the result may be that those with costly needs and who are less mobile are left worse off.

4. Further Philosophical Issues

Much recent attention has focused on philosophical issues arising from empirical findings concerning federalism (for an overview of such empirical research, cf. Burris 2015), and has been spurred by quite different dilemmas facing—inter alia—Canada, Australia, Nepal, Ethiopia, several European states and the European Union.

4.1 Sovereignty or federalism

The tensions between sovereignty and federalism still pose puzzles, reflected in ‘international’ and ‘national’ understandings of the latter (Schütze 2009). If sovereignty is a unique site of final and independent authority, federal orders cannot be sovereign, since no one has the ‘last word’ on all political matters (Friedrich 1968), and “authority and power are dispersed among a network of arenas” (Elazar 1994, xiii). Another tradition, including Madison (Federalist Paper 39), and more recently Beaud (2009) and Schütze (2009), seeks to square the circle allowing dual sovereignty. Several contributions to the political and legal theory of the European Union resolve these issues in different directions (Bellamy 2019; Schütze 2020).

4.2 Issues of Constitutional and Institutional Design

Federal political orders require attention to several constitutional and other institutional issues. The great variation and how the features interact require careful comparative studies to understand their impact on law and politics (Palermo and Kössler 2017). The design of federal orders raise peculiar and intriguing issues of normative political theory (Watts 1998; Norman 2006).

  • Composition: How to determine the boundaries of the member units, e.g., along geographical, ethnic or cultural lines; whether establishment of new member units from old should require constitutional changes, whether to allow secession and if so how, etc.

  • Distribution of Power: The allocation of legislative, executive, judicial and constitution-amending power between the member units and the central institutions. In asymmetric arrangements some of these may differ among member units.

  • Power Sharing: The form of influence by member units in central decision-making bodies within the interlocking political systems.

These tasks must be resolved taking due account of several important considerations noted below.

4.3 Sources of Stability

As political orders go, federal political arrangements pose peculiar problems concerning stability and trust. Federations tend to drift toward disintegration in the form of secession, or toward centralization in the direction of a unitary state.

Such instability should come as no surprise given the tensions typically giving rise to federal political orders in the first place, such as tensions between majority and minority national communities in multinational federations. Federal political orders are therefore often marked by a high level of ‘constitutional contestation’. The details of their constitutions and other institutions may affect these conflicts and their outcomes in drastic ways. Political parties often disagree on constitutional issues regarding the appropriate areas of member unit autonomy, the forms of cooperation and how to prevent fragmentation. Such sampling bias among states that federalize to hold together makes it difficult to assess often heard claims that federal responses such as granting some local autonomy perpetuate cleavages and fuel rather than quell secessionist movements. Some nevertheless argue that democratic, interlocking federations alleviate such tendencies (Simeon 1998, Simeon and Conway 2001, Linz 1997; cf. McKay 2001, Filippov, Ordeshook and Shvetsova 2004).

Many authors note that the challenges of stability must be addressed not only by institutional design, but also by ensuring that citizens have an ‘overarching loyalty’ or ‘federal spirit’ to the federation as whole in addition to loyalty toward their own member unit (Franck 1968, Linz 1997, Burgess 2012). The legitimate bases, content and division of such a public dual allegiance are central topics of political philosophies of federalism (Norman 1995a, Choudhry 2001). Some accept (limited) appeals to considerations such as shared history, practices, culture, or ethnicity for delineating member units and placing certain powers with them, even if such ‘communitarian’ features are regarded as more problematic bases for (unitary) political orders (Kymlicka 1995, Habermas 1996, 500). Debates about the existence of a ‘European demos’ and the need for a common ‘European identity’ merit more careful scrutiny (Habermas 1992). The appropriate consideration that voters and their member unit politicians should give to the interests of others in the federation in interlocking arrangements must be clarified if the notion of citizen of two commonwealths is to be coherent and durable. Several of these challenges are especially acute for ‘ethnic federalism’ when the member units are delineated along ethnic lines: Any ‘internal minorities’ of other ethnicity risk persecution, the prospects of an overarching loyalty are dimmer, and ethnic nationalism may fuel secessionist movements (Selassie 2003)

4.4 Division of Power

Another and related central philosophical topic is the critical assessment of alleged grounds for federal arrangements in general, and the division of power between member units and central bodies in particular, indicated in the preceding sections. Recent contributions include Knop et al. 1995, Kymlicka 2001, Kymlicka and Norman 2000, Nicolaidis and Howse 2001, Norman 2006. Among the important issues, especially due to the risks of instability, are:

  • How the powers should be allocated, given that they should be used—but may be abused—by political entrepreneurs at several levels to affect their claims. The concerns about stability require careful attention to the impact of these powers on the ability to create and maintain ‘dual loyalties’ among the citizenry.

  • How to ensure that neither member units nor the central authorities overstep their jurisdiction. As Mill noted, “the power to decide between them in any case of dispute should not reside in either of the governments, or in any functionary subject to it, but in an umpire independent of both.” (1861) Such a court must be sufficiently independent, yet not utterly unaccountable. Many scholars seem to detect a centralising tendency among such courts (Watts 1998).

  • How to maintain sufficient democratic control over central bodies when these are composed by representatives of the executive branch of member units? The chains of accountability may be too long for adequate responsiveness. This is part of the core concerns about a ‘democratic deficit’ in the European Union (Watts 1998, Føllesdal and Hix 2006).

  • Who shall have the authority to revise the constitutionally embedded division of power? Some hold that a significant shift in national sovereignty occurs when such changes may occur without the unanimity characteristic of treaties.

The “Principle of Subsidiarity” has often been used to guide the decisions about allocation of power. This principle has recently received attention owing to its inclusion in European Union treaties. It holds that authority should rest with the member units unless allocating them to a central unit would ensure higher comparative efficiency or effectiveness in achieving certain goals. This principle can be specified in several ways, for instance concerning which units are included, which goals are to be achieved, and who has the authority to apply it. The principle has multiple pedigrees, and came to recent political prominence largely through its role in quelling fears of centralization in Europe—a contested role which the principle has not quite filled (Fleiner and Schmitt 1996, Burgess and Gagnon 1993, Føllesdal 1998).

4.5 Distributive Justice

Regarding distributive justice, federal political orders must manage tensions between ensuring member unit autonomy and securing the requisite redistribution within and among the member units. Indeed, the Federalists regarded federal arrangements as an important safeguard against “the equal division of property” (Federalist 10). The political scientists Linz and Stepan may be seen as finding support for the Federalists’ hypothesis: Compared to unitary states in the OECD, the ‘coming together’ federations tend to have higher child poverty rate in solo mother households and a higher percentage of population over-sixty living in poverty. Linz and Stepan explain this inequality as stemming from the ‘demos constraining’ arrangements of these federations, seeking to protect individuals and member units from central authorities, combined with a weak party system. By comparison, the Constitution of Germany (not a ‘coming together’ federation) explicitly requires equalization of living conditions among the member units (Art. 72.2). Presbey argues that ethnic federalism further exacerbates unfair distribution of resources among individuals of different ethnic groups in Africa (Presbey 2003). Normative arguments may also support some distributive significance of federal arrangements, for instance owing to trade-offs between member unit autonomy and redistributive claims among member units (Føllesdal 2001), or the relevance of a shared ‘identity‘ (Grégoire and Jewkes 2015, de Schutter 2011). A central normative issue is to what extent a shared culture and bonds among citizens within a historically sovereign state reduce the claims on redistribution among the member units.

4.6 Democratic Theory

Federalism may increase citizens’ control over matters important to them but also raises several challenges to democratic theory, especially as developed for unitary states. Federal arrangements are often more complex, thereby challenging standards of transparency, accountability and public deliberation (Habermas 2001). The restricted political agendas of each center of authority also require defense (Dahl 1983; Braybrooke 1983). One of several sets of issues concern the standing of member units. Challenging puzzles concern federal orders where some or all units are not internally democratic (for further issues, cf., Norman 2006, 144–150).

The power that member units wield in federations often restricts or violates majority rule, in ways that merit careful scrutiny. Democratic theory has long been concerned with how to prevent domination of minorities, and many federal political orders do so by granting member units some influence over common decisions. Federal political orders typically influence individuals’ political influence by skewing their voting weight in favor of citizens of small member units, or by granting member unit representatives veto rights on central decisions. Minorities thus exercise control in apparent violation of principles of political equality and one-person-one-vote—more so when member units are of different size. These features raises fundamental normative questions concerning why member units should matter for the allocation of political power among individuals who live in different member units. Some of these puzzles are addressed in terms of ‘demoicracy’, especially regarding the European Union (van Parijs 1997, Nicolaidis 2012, Schütze 2020). Thus theorists disagree about whether every EU member state should maintain sovereignty in the sense of enjoying a veto for all decisions (Bellamy 2019, Cheneval et al 2015).

4.7 Politics of Recognition

Many federal political orders accommodate minority groups in two ways discussed above: both through a division of power, and by granting them influence over common decisions. These measures of identity politics can be valuable ways to give public acknowledgment and recognition to groups and their members, sometimes on the very basis of previous domination. But identity politics also create challenges (Gutman 1994), especially in federal arrangements that face greater risks of instability and must maintain citizens’ dual political loyalties. Self-government arrangements may threaten the federal political order: “demands for self-government reflect a desire to weaken the bonds with the larger community and, indeed, question its very nature, authority and permanence” (Kymlicka and Norman 1994, 375). The emphasis on “recognition and institutionalization of difference could undermine the conditions that make a sense of common identification and thus mutuality possible” (Carens 2000, 193).

Federations are often thought to be sui generis, one-of-a-kind deviations from the ideal-type unitary sovereign state familiar from the Westphalian world order. Indeed, every federation may well be federal in its very own way, and not easy to summarize and assess as an ideal-type political order. Yet the phenomenon of non-unitary sovereignty is not new, and federal accommodation of differences may well be better than the alternatives. When and why this is so has long been the subject of philosophical, theoretical and normative analysis and reflection. Such public arguments may themselves contribute to develop the overarching loyalty required among citizens of stable, legitimate federations, who must understand themselves as members of two commonwealths.




Several of the historical writings—those marked ‘*’ below and others—are reprinted in part or full in Theories of Federalism: A Reader, Dimitrios Karmis and Wayne Norman (eds.), New York: Palgrave, 2005.

  • Brutus, Junius (Philippe Duplessis-Mornay?), 1579, Vindiciae contra tyrannos, George Garnett (transl. and ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1994.
  • *Althusius, Johannes, 1603, Politica Methodice Digesta, Frederick S. Carney (transl.), Daniel J. Elazar (introd.), Indianapolis: Liberty Press, 1995.
  • Arendt, Hannah, 1972, “Thoughts on Politics and Revolution,” in Crises of the Republic, New York: Harcourt Brace, 199–233.
  • Hugo, Ludolph, 1661, De Statu Regionum Germaniae. Helmstadt: Sumptibus Hammianis.
  • Saint-Pierre, Abbé Charles, 1713, Projet pour rendre la paix perpêtuelle en Europe (Project to make peace perpetual in Europe), Paris: Fayard, 1986.
  • *Montesquieu, Baron de, 1748, The Spirit of Laws, Amherst, NY: Prometheus Books, 2002.
  • *Rousseau, Jean-Jacques, 1761, A Lasting Peace Through the Federation of Europe, C.E. Vaughan (trans.), London: Constable, 1917.
  • *–––, 1761, “Summary and Critique of Abbé Saint-Pierre’s Project for Perpetual Peace,” in Grace G. Roosevelt (ed.), Reading Rousseau in the Nuclear Age, Philadelphia: Temple University Press, 1990.
  • Hume, David, 1752, “Idea of a Perfect Commonwealth,” in T.H. Green and T.H. Grose (eds.), Essays moral, political and literary, London: Longmans, Green, 1882
  • Smith, Adam, 1776, An Inquiry into the Nature and Causes of the Wealth of Nations, London: Dent, 1954.
  • Storing, Herbert, and Murray Dry (eds.), 1981, The Complete Anti-Federalist (7 Volumes), Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • *Hamilton, Alexander, James Madison, and John Jay, 1787–88, The Federalist Papers, Jacob E. Cooke (ed.), Middletown, CT: Wesleyan University Press, 1961.
  • Kant, Immanuel, 1784, “An Answer to the Question: ‘What Is Enlightenment?’” in Hans Reiss (ed.), Kant’s Political Writings, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1970, 54–60.
  • *–––, 1796, “Perpetual Peace: A Philosophical Sketch,” in Hans Reiss (ed.), Kant’s Political Writings, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1970, 93–130.
  • *de Tocqueville, Alexis, 1835–40, Democracy in America, P. Bradley (ed.), New York: Vintage, 1945 [Text available online].
  • *Mill, John Stuart, 1861, Considerations on Representative Government, New York: Liberal Arts Press, 1958 [Text available online].
  • *Proudhon, Pierre Joseph, 1863, Du Principe Federatif, J.-L. Puech and Th. Ruyssen (eds.), Paris: M. Riviere, 1959.
  • Leo XIII, 1891, “Rerum Novarum,” in The Papal Encyclicals 1903–1939, Raleigh: Mcgrath, 1981.
  • Renner, Karl, 1899, Staat und Nation, Vienna. Reprinted as “State and Nation” in Ephraim Nimni (ed.), National Cultural Autonomy and Its Contemporary Critics, London: Routledge, 2005, 64–82.
  • Pius XI, 1931. “Quadragesimo Anno,” in The Papal Encyclicals 1903–1939, Raleigh: Mcgrath, 1981.
  • *Spinelli, Altiero, and Ernesto Rossi, 1944, Il manifesto di Ventotene (The Ventotene Manifesto), Naples: Guida, 1982; reprinted in Karmis and Norman 2005. [Text available online]
  • Vattel, Emmerich, 1758 (2008), “The Law of Nations (Le Droit Des Gens),” in The Classics of International Law, edited by Bela Kapossy and Richard Whatmore, Indianapolis: Liberty Fund.

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Publius: The Journal of Federalism, regularly publishes philosophical articles.


  • Bakvis, Herman, and William M. Chandler (eds.), 1987, Federalism and the Role of the State, Toronto: Toronto University Press.
  • Bottomore, Tom and Patrick Goode (eds.), 1978, Austro-Marxism, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Burgess, Michael, and Alain G. Gagnon (eds.), 1993, Comparative Federalism and Federation: Competing Traditions and Future Directions, London: Harvester Wheatsheaf.
  • –––, 2010, Federal Democracies, Abingdon: Routledge.
  • Fleiner, Thomas, and Nicolas Schmitt (eds.), 1996, Towards European Constitution: Europe and Federal Experiences, Fribourg: Institute of Federalism.
  • Fleming, James E., and Jacob T. Levy (eds.), 2014, Federalism and Subsidiarity, Nomos (Volume 55), New York: New York University Press.
  • Franck, Thomas M. (ed.), 1968, Why Federations Fail: An Inquiry into the Requisites for Successful Federalism, New York: New York University Press.
  • Gagnon, Alain-G., and James Tully (eds.), 2001, Multinational Democracies, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Gaudreault-DesBiens, Jean-François, and Fabien Gélinas (eds.), 2005, The States and Moods of Federalism: Governance, Identity and Methodology—Le Fédéralisme Dans Tous Ses États : Gouvernance, Identité Et Méthodologie Quebec: Éditions Yvon Blais.
  • Grégoire, Jean-Francois, and Michael Jewkes, (eds.), 2015, Recognition and Redistribution in Multinational Federations, Leuven: Leuven University Press.
  • Gutmann, Amy (ed.), 1994, Multiculturalism: Examining the Politics of Recognition, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Härtel, Ines (ed.), 2012, Handbuch Föderalismus: – Föderalismus als Demokratische Rechtsordnung und Rechtskultur in Deutschland, Europa und der Welt, 4 volumes, Berlin: Springer.
  • Heidemann, Dietmar, and Katja Stoppenbrink (eds.), 2016, Join, or Die: Philosophical Foundations of Federalism, Berlin: De Gruyter.
  • Karmis, Dimitrios, and Wayne Norman (eds.), 2005, Theories of Federalism: A Reader, New York: Palgrave.
  • Kincaid, John (ed.), 2011, Federalism, 4 Vols., Sage Library of Political Science London.
  • Knop, Karen, Sylvia Ostry, Richard Simeon and Katherine Swinton (eds.), 1995, Rethinking Federalism: Citizens, Markets and Governments in a Changing World, Vancouver: University of British Columbia Press.
  • Kymlicka, Will, and Wayne Norman (eds.), 2000, Citizenship in Diverse Societies, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Nicolaidis, Kalypso, and Robert Howse (eds.), 2001, The Federal Vision: Legitimacy and Levels of Governance in the US and the EU, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Nimni, Ephraim (ed.), 2005, National-Cultural Autonomy and its Contemporary Critics, Milton Park: Routledge.
  • Steytler, Nico (ed.) 2021. Comparative federalism and Covid-19: Combating the Pandemic, Routledge.
  • Trechsel, Alexander (ed.), 2006, Towards a Federal Europe, London: Routledge.
  • Tushnet, Mark (ed.), 1990, Comparative Constitutional Federalism: Europe and America, New York: Greenwood Press.
  • Ward, Ann, and Lee Ward (eds.), 2009, The Ashgate Research Companion to Federalism. Farnham: Ashgate.

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Other Internet Resources


This entry has benefited from suggestions by Andrea Carla, Federica Cittadino, Philippe Crignon, Dorothea Gädeke, Douglas Klusmeyer, Silje Langvatn, Petra Malfertheiner, Thaddeus Metz, Francesco Palermo, Antoinette Scherz, Robert Schütze, and Katja Stoppenbrink, and from exchanges at a Conference on Federalism 2022 at EHESS, Paris, and at the Eurac institutes for minority rights and for federalism, Bolzano, 2022.

Copyright © 2022 by
Andreas Follesdal <andreas@follesdal.net>

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